Charles Sanders Peirce (1839—1914)

peirceC.S. Peirce was a scientist and philosopher best known as the earliest proponent of pragmatism. An influential thinker and polymath, Peirce is among the greatest of American minds. His thought was a seminal influence upon William James, his life long friend, and upon John Dewey, his one-time student. James and Dewey went on to popularize pragmatism thereby achieving what Peirce’s inability to gain lasting academic employment prevented him from doing.

Pragmatism takes the meaning of a concept to depend upon its practical bearings. The upshot of this maxim is that a concept is meaningless if it has no practical or experiential effect on the way we conduct our lives or inquiries. Similarly, within Peirce’s theory of inquiry, the scientific method is the only means through which to fix belief, eradicate doubt and progress towards a final steady state of knowledge.

Although Peirce applied scientific principles to philosophy, his understanding and admiration of Kant also colored his work. Peirce was analytic and scientific, devoted to logical and scientific rigor, and an architectonic philosopher in the mold of Kant or Aristotle. His best-known theories, pragmatism and the account of inquiry, are both scientific and experimental but form part of a broad architectonic scheme. Long considered an eccentric figure whose contribution to pragmatism was to provide its name and whose importance was as an influence upon James and Dewey, Peirce’s significance in his own right is now largely accepted.

Table of Contents

  1. Peirce’s Life
  2. Peirce’s Works and Influence
  3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Peirce’s Life

Charles Sanders Peirce was born September 10th, 1839, in Cambridge, MA to Benjamin Peirce, the brilliant Harvard mathematician and astronomer, and Sarah Hunt Mills, the daughter of Senator Elijah Hunt Mills. Peirce led a privileged early life; parental indulgences meant his father refused to discipline his children for fear of suppressing their individuality. Further, the academic and intellectual climate of the family home meant intellectual dignitaries were frequent visitors to the Peirce household. These visitors included mathematicians and men of science, poets, lawyers and politicians. This environment saw young Charles Peirce’s precocious intellect readily indulged.

Peirce was the second of five children and four talented brothers, one of whom, James Mills Peirce (his elder brother), followed their father to a mathematics professorship at Harvard. Another brother, Herbert Henry Davis Peirce, carved out a distinguished career in the Foreign Service whilst Peirce’s youngest brother, Benjamin Mills Peirce, showed promise as an engineer but died young. The talent of the Peirce brothers, and particularly Charles, stems in large part from the colossal intellect and influence of their father.

Benjamin Peirce was instrumental in the development of American Sciences in the 19th Century through his own intellectual achievements and by lobbying Washington for funds. He was influential in the creation of Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School and in the foundation of a National Academy of the Sciences. A further role, which was to prove important in Charles Peirce’s life, was Peirce Senior’s influential position in the U.S Coastal and Geodetic Survey from 1852 until his death in 1880. Benjamin Peirce provided a mighty role model, guiding the prodigious development of the young Peirce’s intellect through heuristic teaching. This gave Peirce a love of science and commitment to rigorous inquiry from a young age.

The influence of Benjamin Peirce on Charles’ intellect and, through refusing discipline, his fierce independence of spirit, is immense. The devotion to mathematical thoroughness and love of science colored Peirce’s endeavors for the rest of his life. Further, Peirce’s free spirited independence of mind undoubtedly contributed to the stubbornness and arrogance that surfaced in moments of adversity to compound the professional difficulties that he continually faced.

Despite some problems in school due to Peirce’s unsettled behavior, he graduated from Harvard in 1859. Peirce remained consistently in the lower quarter of his class but his indifference to the work and disdain at the intellectual requirements asked of him seem to be the cause of his poor performance. He remained at Harvard as a resident for a further year receiving a Master of Arts degree. Further, in 1863, he graduated from Harvard’s Lawrence Scientific School with the first Bachelor of Science degree awarded Summa cum Laude.

By 1863, with his education complete and having secured employment with the U.S Coastal Survey, Peirce’s marriage to Harriet Melusina Fay, a feminist campaigner of good Cambridge patrician stock, appeared to lay the foundation for a fruitful career and stable life. Peirce’s star began to burn brightly and in 1865 he delivered a lecture series at Harvard and gave the Lowell Institute Lectures a year later at age twenty-six. He published early well-received responses to Kant’s system of categories in 1867 and to Descartes account of knowledge, science and doubt in 1868.

His research in geodesy and gravimetrics at the U.S. Coastal Survey gained him international respect and, through European research tours, enabled him to make contact with British and European logicians. During an early research tour of Europe, Peirce’s work on Boolean logic and relatives gained him respect and attention from the British Logicians W.S. Jevons and Augustus De Morgan. In 1867, The Academy of Arts and Science elected Peirce as a member and The National Academy of Sciences followed suit in 1877. Peirce also began extra work at the Harvard Observatory in 1869 and published a book from his research there, the 1878 Photometric Researches.

Other work in Philosophy saw Peirce begin the now legendary Metaphysical Club in 1872 with, amongst others, William James. He also published his best-known body of work, The Popular Science Monthly series, in 1877 and 1878. This included “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” a continuation of his earlier anti-Cartesian thoughts and the first developed statements of his theories of inquiry and pragmatism. By 1879, Peirce obtained an academic appointment at Johns Hopkins University, teaching logic for the philosophy department. Here he continued to make strides in logic, developing a theory of relatives and quantifiers (independently of Frege). He published this work with his student O.H. Mitchell in the 1883 Studies in Logic. This volume contained a range of collaborative papers from Peirce and his JHU students.

All looked well for Peirce by the early 1880’s, and with the promise of tenure at Johns Hopkins he felt he could commit himself to a life pursuing his greatest love, logic. However, the beginnings of Peirce’s downfall were already stirring during this early successful period. Peirce’s work for the U.S. Coastal Survey and Harvard Observatory had led to tensions with the President of the Harvard Corporation, C.W. Elliot, about pay. Also, Peirce’s rise through the ranks of the Coastal Survey was partly nepotistic and at the expense of other men who expected to take the positions he gained. Further, the death of Benjamin Peirce in 1880 left Peirce without his most powerful backer in the Coastal Survey.

This need not have mattered had the Johns Hopkins appointment gone smoothly but earlier occurrences had also damaged this opportunity. Peirce had separated from his wife in 1876 and openly liased with a French mistress. Peirce’s wife had long suspected him of extra-marital affairs, even with the wives of his Coastal Survey colleagues, but the public nature of this particular liaison proved too much for her and she left him. Peirce lived openly with his mistress during the period from separation in 1876 to divorce in 1883 when he and his mistress married, seven days after the decree fini.

The affair itself need not have caused excessive moral consternation, but the indecorous manner in which it was conducted resulted in outrage: both the patrician families of Cambridge, and academic establishment of Harvard and Johns Hopkins were appalled. The President of JHU, Daniel Coit Gilman, withdrew renewal of all contracts in Philosophy, and later reinstated all positions but that of Peirce, thereby “resigning” Peirce from his post. Peirce had lost the only academic position he was ever to hold. His problems continued to mount.

The Coastal Survey, now his only means of income, was subject to government audit after accusations of wide spread financial impropriety. Although subsequent reports exonerated Peirce, the new climate led him into difficulties with work, and his inclination to complete it. By 1891 Peirce had left his only secure means of income at the Coastal Survey and, living on a Pennsylvanian farm purchased from inheritance in 1888, he retreated to a life of hardship and academic isolation with his now frail and consumptive second wife, Juliette.

Despite repeated efforts by friends to find him work, Peirce’s poor reputation consistently saw him rejected. Such was Peirce’s low standing that a lecture series organized by William James and Josiah Royce in 1898 (initially in the hope that it might open a door to a position at Harvard) took place in a private home in Cambridge. It seems that fear of Peirce’s potential to corrupt the morals of the young led the Harvard Corporation to refuse permission for Peirce to lecture on campus. Later lectures at Harvard in 1903 did take place on campus after the Corporation had softened its stance, but the academic establishment, particularly at Harvard, never came to accept or forgive Peirce.

Lecture series, such as those organized by James and Royce, along with hack writing for dictionaries and popular magazines, were Peirce’s main philosophical outlet and primary source of income. Attempts to secure money from the Carnegie Institution to fund a full statement of his philosophical system in 1902 failed and between the 1890’s and his death from cancer in April 1914, Peirce lived in a state of penury struggling to find an outlet for his work. Some important publications appeared in The Monist during the 1890’s and again in1907 following a brief renewal of interest in his work. This was due in large part to James’ acknowledgment of his role in founding pragmatism. However, Peirce’s published work petered out into a series of rejections and incomplete projects and although he did not stop writing until his death, he failed to publish a mature account of his philosophy whilst alive. Peirce died lost and unappreciated by all but a few of his American contemporaries.

2. Peirce’s Works and Influence

During his lifetime, Peirce’s philosophy influenced, and took influence from, the work of William James. The two men where close friends and exchanged ideas for most of their adult lives. However, despite similarities and mutual influence, they strove hard to distinguish their own brand of pragmatism from each other’s. This is particularly so after James’ California Union Address where he attributed the discovery of the doctrine to Peirce and identified the early papers, “The Fixation of Belief” and “How to Make our Ideas Clear,” as the source of pragmatism. Peirce thought James too “nominalistic” in his pragmatism and too wary of logic; James thought Peirce too dense and obscure in his formulations. Nevertheless, the connections between the two founding fathers of pragmatism are clear.

Also well-acknowledged is the influence of Peirce upon John Dewey and a generation of young Johns Hopkins logic students and colleagues including: Oscar Mitchell, Fabien Franklin and Christine Ladd-Franklin. Peirce’s work at JHU had a profound effect upon his students and, although John Dewey initially found Peirce’s logic classes obscure and not like logic as he understood it, he later came to realize the importance of Peirce’s approach. Peirce’s own response to Dewey’s pragmatism was much the same as his response to James’: too “nominalistic.” Dewey, however, fully acknowledged the influence and importance of Peirce, even hailing his work as more pragmatic in spirit than that of William James.

Within the field of logic, Peirce’s greatest passion, he also exercised some influence in his own lifetime. Peirce’s development of Boolean algebra influenced the logician and mathematician Ernst Schröder, with whom Peirce exchanged correspondence and mutual admiration. The outcome of this influence is an interesting and often unacknowledged effect upon the development of modern logic: it is Peirce’s account of quantification and logical syntax that leads to twentieth century logic, not Frege’s. Of course, Frege’s work is important and predates much of Peirce’s development by five years or so, but at the time, it was all but ignored. It is from Peirce that we can trace a direct line of influence and development, through Schröder to Peano, and finally to Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica.

Beyond his work in the development of pragmatism and modern logic, Peirce identified his own ideas with that of James’ Harvard colleague, Josiah Royce. Peirce felt that of all his contemporaries, Royce’s work most closely reflected his own, and indeed, Peirce’s semiotics and metaphysics greatly influenced Royce. Royce’s respect for Peirce’s work continued with the relish that Royce displayed at the chance to edit the eighty thousand or so pages of unpublished manuscripts sold to Harvard in 1914 by Juliette Peirce, after Charles’ death. Unfortunately, Royce died in 1916, too soon to accomplish anything with the disorganized manuscripts. However, by bringing the papers to Harvard, Royce effectively secured the long-term influence of Peirce beyond his own lifetime.

The editorial task of organizing the Peirce papers did not continue smoothly after Royce’s death, but eventually passed to a young C.I. Lewis, who had already shown some appreciation of Peirce’s work in the development of logic in his 1918 publication A Survey of Symbolic Logic. Although Lewis quickly found the task of editing Peirce’s manuscripts not to his taste, his contact with them allowed him to develop answers to his own philosophical problems and much of Peirce’s systematicity is reflected in Lewis’ work. Instead, the Peirce papers that inspired both Royce and Lewis came to fruition under the joint editorship of Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss. Their editorial work culminated in six volumes of The Collected Papers of C.S. Peirce between 1931 and 1935, and for fifty years this was the most important primary source in Peirce scholarship. Hartshorne and Weiss remained interested in Peirce’s work throughout their working lives. Further, both men supervised the young Richard Rorty, which may account for some of his early favorable accounts of Peirce. Of course, Rorty later rejected the value and status of Peirce as a pragmatist.

In the late 1950’s, The Collected Papers, begun by Hartshorne and Weiss, were completed with two volumes, edited by Arthur Burks. Burks had, prior to his editorship of The Collected Papers, worked on some Peirce inspired accounts of names and indexical reference. Burks’ readings of Peirce on names and indices have recently inspired the Referential/Reflexive account of names and indexical expressions by the Stanford philosopher, John Perry.

Other than The Collected Papers and the influence that it has had, Peirce was published posthumously in 1923 in a volume called Chance, Love and Logic, edited by Morris Cohen who worked on the Harvard manuscripts to create this small volume. Along with an appendix in Ogden and Richards’ 1923, The Meaning of Meaning, based mainly on Peirce’s correspondence with his English friend, Victoria Lady Welby, Peirce exercised his most interesting and most contentious influence.

The young Cambridge philosopher and mathematician, F.P. Ramsey, knew of these early volumes, and was greatly interested by them. Ramsey clearly acknowledges the influence of Peirce in his 1926 article, “Truth and Probability,” where he claims to base certain parts of his paper upon Peirce’s work. Ramsey’s interest in Peirce is not contentious. The influence of Ramsey upon the later Wittgenstein is also widely acknowledged. However, the subject of some speculation is the influence of Peirce upon Wittgenstein, via Ramsey. There is no direct acknowledgment of Peirce by Wittgenstein, but Ramsey’s review of the Tractatus recommends Peirce’s type/token distinction to Wittgenstein, a recommendation that Wittgenstein accepted. Wittgenstein did not hide the effect of Ramsey’s advice on his later work, and although the exact nature of the advice is unknown, it is common knowledge that Ramsey thought the Tractatus could overcome its problems by moving towards pragmatism. Potentially then, Peirce can claim an indirect influence over the later Wittgenstein.

The effect of Peirce’s work, through The Collected Papers and early posthumous publications, is not merely of historical interest though. His work is in many ways still alive in contemporary debate. Within pragmatism, the work of both Susan Haack and Christopher Hookway has a distinctly Peircian flavor. Susan Haack in particular has vigorously defended Peirce’s claim to pragmatism against the anti-Peircian strain of Rorty’s new pragmatism. A further influence in contemporary debate has been the presence of Peircian views in the Philosophy of Science. Peirce’s views on science combine distinctly Popperian and Kuhnian views and Popper even names Peirce as one of the greatest of philosophers. Also within the philosophy of science, Peirce’s theories of induction and probability have influenced the work of R.B. Braithewaite. Further, Peirce’s theory of the economics of research is now coming to be understood as a potential response to problems like Hempel’s Paradox of the Ravens and Goodman’s New Puzzle of Induction.

In other areas, some modern epistemologists have embraced virtue epistemology, an attempt to conduct the theory of knowledge by defining the qualities of the knower or true believer rather than knowledge or true belief directly. Two of the leading players in this approach to epistemology, Christopher Hookway and Linda Zagzebski, both acknowledge the thought of Peirce upon their work, and as a precursor to their discipline. Also, Jaakko Hintikka and Risto Hilpinen et al. point out the debt that their long running project, to define semantic concepts like quantifiers and propositions in terms of zero-sum games, owes to Peirce’s work.

Apart from these strictly analytic influences, Peirce also exercises some influence in European philosophy. Particularly noteworthy is the influence of Peirce upon the Neo-Kantian philosophies of Karl-Otto Apel and Helmut Pape, which emphasize a more Kantian reading of Peirce’s philosophy. Perhaps most important, though, is Peirce’s influence upon Jürgen Habermas. Habermas uses and refines crucial elements of Peirce’s account of inquiry in his own political and social philosophy. Particularly central is Peirce’s notion of a community of inquirers. For Peirce, the community of inquirers is a trans-historical notion, acting as a regulative ideal for the growth of knowledge through science. Habermas adapts the Peircian notion of community in two ways. First, the regulative ideal becomes a more concrete notion ranging across actual communities and political and social dialogue occurring within them. Second, the scientific and epistemological purpose of the intersubjective community becomes a social and political purpose on Habermas’ view. Clearly, Habermas uses Peirce’s ideas in ways that move away from simple Peircian concerns. Nonetheless, Peirce’s ideas are of importance to him.

Besides these influences, the potential for further and continued involvement of Peirce’s thought in philosophical debate has grown considerably over the last few years as the tools of Peirce scholarship have entered a new period. The Collected Papers edited by Hartshorne, Weiss and Burks, have been an invaluable source for anyone interested in Peirce, but the editorial policy employed there is idiosyncratic in the way it gathers Peirce’s work together. The Collected Papers takes Peirce’s manuscripts from across a fifty-year period and edits them topically. Often, Peirce’s views from early and late work are presented together as though they are a single connected thought on some topic. This has the effect of making Peirce’s thought seem disjointed and often self-contradictory within the space of two or three passages. However, new tools are now emerging and since the early 1980’s, the reorganization of Peirce’s manuscripts in chronological order by the Peirce Edition Project has given rise to eight volumes of a projected thirty. This reorganized edition, published as The Writings of C.S. Peirce, has already led to an increased understanding of the subtle development of Peirce’s ideas. The hope is that as The Writings of C.S. Peirce continues to grow, our understanding will grow also and with this greater understanding will come increased involvement of Peirce’s ideas in contemporary debate.

3. The Interpretation of Peirce’s Philosophy

Peirce’s approach to philosophy is that of an established scientist; he treated philosophy as an interactive and experimental discipline. This scientific approach to Philosophy, which Peirce labeled “laboratory philosophy,” reflects important themes throughout his work. Pragmatism, for instance, takes the meaning of a concept to depend upon its practical bearings. The upshot of this maxim is that a concept is meaningless if it has no practical or experiential effect on the way we conduct our lives or inquiries. Similarly, within Peirce’s theory of inquiry, the scientific method is the only means through which to fix belief, eradicate doubt and progress towards a final steady state of knowledge.

Clearly then, Peirce is a scientifically minded philosopher, and on some readings appears to trump the Vienna positivists to a verificationist principle of meaning and scientific vision of philosophy. In other respects, though, Peirce often focuses on topics outside the remit of scientific and naturalistic philosophy. For instance, Peirce wrote extensively on issues in metaphysics where he defined universal categories of experience or phenomena, after Kant. He also constructed vast systems of signs and semiotics. Of course, all of these endeavors are colored, in some respects, by his distinctly scientific turn of mind. However, the point is that Peirce’s philosophical writings cover more than half a century and a wide range of topics.

The breadth of Peirce’s philosophical interests has lead to some difficulty in interpreting his work as a whole. How, for instance, do his metaphysical writings relate to his work on truth and inquiry? Thomas Goudge (1950) argues that Peirce’s works consist of two conflicting strands, one naturalistic and hard headedly scientific, the other metaphysical and transcendental. Others take Peirce’s work, both naturalistic and transcendental, to be part of an interrelated system. Murray Murphey (1961) argues that Peirce never quite succeeded in integrating his various philosophical themes into a unified whole and identifies four separate attempts. However, the view that a single architectonic system exists has since replaced this view. Important work by Christopher Hookway (1985), Douglas Anderson (1995) and Nathan Houser (1992) shows how fruitful this treatment of Peirce is and now constitutes the orthodox position in interpreting his work. Their view treats Peirce’s philosophy as a panoramic connected vision, containing themes, issues and areas that Peirce worked upon and moved between at various points in his life. However, treating Peirce’s work as a connected whole can prove awkward when encountering this material for the first time.

Peirce is a difficult philosopher to understand at times, his work is full of cumbersome terminology and often assumes knowledge of his other work. Often, trying to understand Peirce’s theories on individual topics is an involved task in itself; attempting to understand how it fits into a broader, interrelated, system can seem like an unwelcome complication. One approach, then, is to tackle Peirce’s work topic by topic without too much emphasis upon the interconnectedness of this work. The most common topics are Peirce’s account of truth and inquiry or his pragmatism. If the systematic nature of Peirce’s philosophy is approached at all, it is after some familiarity with individual topics has been attained. This approach is not without its merits since it makes Peirce more immediately digestible. However, it can have the effect of leaving certain important elements in Peirce’s work unappreciated. For instance, why is there an all-pervasive penchant for triads, or “threes,” in Peirce’s work? This is a common Peircian theme and is best appreciated by understanding the systematic vision that Peirce has for his philosophy.

The difficulty, then, is finding a balance between the completeness of the architectonic approach to Peirce’s work, and its related complexity. The strategy employed here is to introduce Peirce’s work through a series of entries which detail both his broader philosophical system and individual topics within it. The hope is that the reader can approach Peirce’s work topic by topic through reading the relatively self-contained entries on individual elements of his philosophy. However, the provision of an introductory entry giving an overview of Peirce’s philosophical system enables the reader to see how these individual topics hang together within his broader vision.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor).
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce’s thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Brent, J. 1993. Charles Sanders Peirce: A Life. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The definitive biography of Peirce, it takes a warts-and-all approach to Peirce’s character and life, and attempts to show the relationship between the events of his life, and his philosophical development.
  • Goudge, T. 1950. The Thought of C.S. Peirce. (Toronto: University of Toronto Press).
    • Early and important view of Peirce’s philosophy which emphasizes an unbridgeable schism between the scientific and metaphysical strands of Peirce’s work. Long superseded but still a good secondary source.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce’s Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.
  • Murphey, M. 1961. The Development of Peirce’s Philosophy. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Early work that identifies four periods and separate systems in Peirce’s work. Again, superseded by the single system interpretation of Anderson, Hookway and Houser et al.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom