Charles Sanders Peirce: Architectonic Philosophy

peirceThe subject matter of architectonic is the structure of all human knowledge. The purpose of providing an architectonic scheme is to classify different types of knowledge and explain the relationships that exist between these classifications. The architectonic system of C. S. Peirce (1839-1914) divides knowledge according to it status as a “science” and then explains the interrelation of these different scientific disciplines. His belief was that philosophy must be placed within this systematic account of knowledge as science. Peirce adopts his architectonic ambitions of structuring all knowledge, and organizing philosophy within it, from his great philosophical hero, Kant. This systematizing approach became crucial for Peirce in his later work. However, his belief in a structured philosophy related systematically to all other scientific disciplines was important to him throughout his philosophical life.

Table of Contents

  1. The Architectonic System
  2. Mathematics and Philosophy
  3. Philosophy
    1. Phenomenology
    2. The Normative Sciences
      1. Aesthetics and Ethics
      2. Logic
    3. Metaphysics
  4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Architectonic System

In later work, Peirce began to organize and systematize his philosophy in terms of its relation to other areas of knowledge. More crucially for his philosophy, though, this enabled him to make explicit the structure and interrelation of different areas of his philosophical thought. In work like his 1902 Carnegie Institute Application, letters to friends, and more conventional writings, Peirce placed his philosophy within a hierarchical classification of sciences. Within this systematization of sciences, “science” is a broad term meaning any organization of human knowledge. The result is that disciplines like history, biographical study and art criticism count as “science.” The sheer number of sciences involved in Peirce’s classification, then, meant that he needed to sub-divide them further. The basis of Peirce’s sub-divisions is not altogether clear or straightforward, but he seems to count Philosophy as a “formal science of discovery.” What Peirce means by this is that Philosophy is concerned with discovering the formal or necessary conditions for the objects with which it concerns itself. Whether this is an accurate classification of philosophy is hard to say, but the idea is that philosophy shares some formal (i.e. quest for necessary conditions) concerns with mathematics and shares a concern for discovering knowledge with the empirical or physical sciences, like chemistry or physics; hence philosophy is a “formal science of discovery.” The hierarchical classification of sciences in relation to philosophy and the hierarchical structure of philosophy itself, then, looks, roughly, as follows:



which consists of:

a) Phenomenology

b) Normative Science

which consists of:



iii) LOGIC

which consists of:

a) Philosophical Grammar

b) Critical Logic

c) Methodeutic

c) Metaphysics

Figure 1

In creating a systematized classification of science, Peirce hoped to make the connection between different areas of his thought clear, not only to others, but also to himself. If Peirce was able to see how his pragmatism, say, was related to other areas of his philosophy, and how his philosophy in general related to other sciences, he might be able to gain insights into the theory of pragmatism as a consequence. Peirce was, however, aware that a systematic classification of sciences is, to some extent, an abstraction that simplifies the relations between sciences. For the most part, though, he found that it accurately represented his thoughts on philosophy and was a useful tool for organizing his theories.

As suggested already, the sciences and philosophy are organized in a hierarchical fashion. So, from Figure 1., we can see that Mathematics is super-ordinate to philosophy, and philosophy super-ordinate to the physical sciences. Similar relations of super and sub-ordinacy also exist within philosophy and within particular branches of philosophy. The first thing to clarify is that the sub-ordinacy of philosophy to mathematics, or metaphysics to phenomenology, is not sub-ordinacy in the sense of embeddedness, i.e., philosophy is not a sub-branch of mathematics. Of course, embedded sub-ordinacy does occur in Peirce’s classification where, for instance, aesthetics is a sub-branch of Normative Science, just as ethics and logic are. However, ethics and logic are not sub-branches of aesthetics, even though they are sub-ordinate to it. So, what is the nature of the non-embedded sub-ordinacy of, say, philosophy to mathematics?

Non-embedded sub-ordinacy is more a notion of linear priority than topical subsumption. This is because Peirce is organizing sciences in a fashion popularized by Auguste Comte in the nineteenth century, whereby super-ordinate sciences provide general laws or principles for sub-ordinate sciences which provide concrete, realized cases of those general principles. Super-ordinacy, then, is meant to be linear priority in terms of prior provision of general principles, and sub-ordinacy, the posterior realization of those general principles. A contrived example of how this works may go something as follows:

Psychology provides general principles that suggest that the emotional states of human beings are manipulable through sound, i.e., human emotion is susceptible to auditory suggestion. Using that principle, musicians can discover that musical arrangements in minor keys, particularly D minor, invoke sadness amongst listeners. Wagner, for instance, discovered that all chords have a corresponding chord which “resolves” the sequence, leaving the listener satisfied. By consistently refusing to “resolve” chords in his music, Wagner was able to induce tension and anxiety amongst his listeners wherever he wished to do so. These cases of actual musical practice provide concrete, confirming phenomena of the general psychological principle. Psychology, then, is super-ordinate to music, in the sense that it provides general principles for musical practice.

Applied to the hierarchy in figure 1., mathematics provides general laws, which Peirce often calls guiding or leading principles, for philosophy. Philosophy, in turn, provides concrete or confirming cases of those laws. Similar relations exist within philosophy itself, and between philosophy and the empirical sciences. Peirce is not always forthcoming with explicit examples of guiding principles, but, as we shall examine in more detail below, in the case of philosophy and its super-ordinate science, mathematics, he gives us a good indication of what he has in mind.

2. Mathematics and Philosophy

Peirce divides mathematics into three areas that correspond roughly to discrete mathematics, mathematics of the infinite, and mathematical or formal logic. We now think of Peirce’s groundbreaking work in mathematical logic as belonging to logic proper rather than being a branch of mathematics. More important though is the role of mathematics as the provider of guiding principles for subsequent sciences, and particularly philosophy. Following his father, Peirce treated mathematics as “the science which draws necessary conclusions.” What Peirce means is that mathematics is free from existential concerns about its constructs. In this sense, it is hypothetical and abstract. Peirce, for instance, states that mathematics “makes constructions in the imagination according to abstract precepts, and then observes these imaginary objects, finding in them relations of parts not specified in the precept of construction.” What Peirce means is that mathematics creates hypothetical constructions, i.e., constructions which are abstracted and not necessarily actual, and then derives logically necessary connections between them and about them. These “necessary conclusions” about mathematical constructs provide general laws or principles for deriving logically necessary connections between and about all constructs, imaginary or actual. In short, the kinds of reasoning employed in mathematics provide general rules of reasoning, and function as principles to guide our reasoning in subsequent science, particularly philosophy.

For example, we can see the provision of guiding or leading principles from mathematics through the following story about irrational numbers. An irrational number is a number which cannot be expressed as the ratio of two integers. That is, the irrational number is a non-terminating, non-repeating decimal. How did our number systems develop to include numbers other than rational integers? One thought is that Pythagoras realized that there necessarily exists no pair of rational integers such that one can be expressed as the twice the square of the other. The way he came to this conclusion is by noting that in a square whose sides measure one unit in length, the diagonal measures neither one unit nor two units. Consequently, there must exist some other kind of non-rational number which enables us to explain the length of a square’s diagonal in relation to its sides. Now, the way in which Pythagoras came about this conclusion was to note certain features about some diagram (of a square), abstract important features from that particular case, and draw a more general conclusion. These methods of abstraction and generalization are precisely the kind of thing that Peirce has in mind when he says that mathematics, as a super-ordinate science, provides guiding principles for philosophy.

3. Philosophy

Philosophy is divided into three orders: phenomenology, or the science of how things appear to us; the normative sciences, which study how we ought to act; and metaphysics, the study of what is real. Philosophy takes from mathematics the principles of drawing necessary consequences from hypotheses. Further, the three branches of philosophy have hierarchical relationships. Phenomenology uses the principles of mathematics and theorizes on the necessary qualities that all phenomena must have. After this, the normative and metaphysical sciences use, reflect and provide concrete cases of these phenomenological findings.

Similar divisions occur within the branches of philosophy but the most interesting of these is the division within normative science between aesthetics, ethics and logic. Logic within normative science is conceived as semiotics, or the study of signs, and is strongly epistemological in its concern with the structure of knowledge and understanding. As the hierarchy suggests, logic is dependent upon ethics and ethics upon aesthetics. All of these are dependent upon the principles of phenomenology and, more broadly still, upon mathematics. Further, they are all super-ordinate to metaphysics. This is largely because metaphysics concerns itself with the reality and place within nature of these objects. Metaphysics, as the science of what is real, is most similar to the physical sciences and is in many ways meant to be a bridging discipline between philosophy and natural science. As should be clear, the hierarchy moves from abstract disciplines to those whose study involves phenomena that are more concrete.

We know how the three philosophical sub-disciplines are meant to relate to each other in terms of the hierarchy. However, we have yet to examine Peirce’s theories of phenomenology, normative science, and metaphysics in any detail. In the following sections, though, we shall examine each of the three sub-disciplines, and in the case of normative science its sub-sub-disciplines, and look a little more closely at what Peirce take these topics to concern.

a. Phenomenology

The first and most abstract of philosophy’s sub-disciplines is phenomenology. For Peirce, phenomenology is the science of appearances and is abstract in the sense that its subject matter is still general and hypothetical, just as the constructs of mathematics are. However, whereas the general hypothetical subject of mathematics and mathematical reasoning is any theoretical construct, for phenomenology the constructs are those of experience, considered in generalized terms.

In his discussion of phenomenology, Peirce divides all our experience into three general, universal categories and names them firstness, secondness, and thirdness. Peirce’s categories are notoriously hard to understand. Indeed, Peirce thought it to be a science which we could only gain a hazy grasp of until we discovered the categories for ourselves in the course of our own experiences. The major problem with the categories, though, is that they are general and therefore difficult to explain in readily comprehensible terms. The best way to understand the categories, then, is to look at concrete examples that, in some way, exemplify firstness, secondness, or thirdness.

Peirce usually attempts to explain firstness, in general terms, as quality or feeling. It is perhaps more intuitive to grasp firstness this way: think of William James, Charles Peirce and Karl Marx; they all share the quality of being bearded. Let us abstract “beardedness” from this group of men and, when we consider that abstraction in and of itself, we are considering a firstness which those philosophers all share. Of course, the general concept of firstness is purer than this; “beardedness” is just an exemplification of it. Another example might come from Wittgenstein’s discussion in the Philosophical Investigations of how we attend to shapes and colors of some objects. When I try to observe the shape of a vase, in separation from its color, size, etc., by squinting my eyes and tilting my head, I am attempting to observe a firstness of that object.

Resistance, existence or otherness, are all examples of secondness. Peirce often uses the scholastic concept of haecceity, or “thisness,” to explain our experience of secondness. The idea is that when we experience some thing, we experience it as separate from other phenomena and as a brute thing of existence. It is this brute confrontational singularity that a thing experienced must have that Peirce thinks exemplifies secondness. It is our experience of an object as a thing separate to others within the universe that is an experience of secondness. A rather strange example might prove helpful in coming to understand what our experience of secondness might be like. Some historical commentaries of the first landings of the Spanish Conquistadors in South America report how the natives were in awe of these strange four-legged, two-armed, two headed God-like creatures. It seems that the Spanish rode ashore on horse back. Having never seen horses or white men before (let alone white men riding horses), the natives assumed that this was one creature. This seems like a rather strange case, but it perhaps provides a startling example of how we must re-organize our understanding when our experience fails to distinguish two instances of secondness. Of course, the minute the Conquistadors dismounted, the natives experienced the invader as separate to his horse, thereby experiencing his secondness.

Our experiences of mediation, intelligibility or understanding are examples of thirdness. When we place some experience within the structure of our understanding, when we assimilate an experience, we are experiencing thirdness. In many ways, thirdness is similar to the Hegelian notion of “synthesis” and captures the notions of development and growth. When we experience thirdness, we experience some sense of bringing phenomena into order with our knowledge. Principle exemplifiers of thirdness, then, are phenomena like laws, habits, conventions, reason, etc. Extending our previous example of the Conquistador, when the native saw him dismounted and experienced him as separate from his horse, he might also have come to understand that this stranger was, in fact, a man. This experience of understanding how this phenomenon fits into the world is, according to Peirce, meant to be an experience of thirdness.

The three categories are present in all experience but to differing degrees. Consequently, an experience of a quality like redness has firstness, secondness and thirdness; but it has firstness to a greater extent and so exemplifies that category. To see this, we should at least be clear that, as a quality, “redness” is a firstness just as “beardedness” is. However, our experience of the “redness” as existing means that it has secondness. Otherwise, we would be unable to experience it. And the fact that we are able to understand our experience of “redness” as just such an experience, means that it must also have an element of thirdness, otherwise we would be unable to assimilate that experience. So, our experience of “redness” has all three categories to some extent. However, the actual qualitative aspects of the experience, the very reason we call this an experience of “redness,” are what predominate, and this is why we classify “redness” as a first, even though all of the categories are present to some extent.

Furthermore, despite the abstract nature of phenomenology, i.e., the hypothetical status of its constructs, it is not at odds with Peirce’s scientific and experiential approach. As suggested earlier, Peirce maintains that phenomenology is something that we each must carry out and confirm for ourselves in our own experience. So, despite the initially abstract and theoretical appearance of phenomenology, it remains grounded in practice.

Finally, the universal categories are ever present in Peirce’s work. In some respects, the categories are already present in the antecedent science of mathematics where Peirce describes them in terms of relations. The mathematical equivalent of firstness is one-place relational predicates like, “x is bearded”; of secondness is two-place relational predicates like, “x is the barber of y”; and of thirdness is three-place relational predicates like “x shaves y with z.” The explanation of the categories in terms of relational predicates is an early attempt to explain firstness, secondness and thirdness on Peirce’s part and as such should not be taken as reflecting upon the phenomenological account we are looking at here. It is, however, instructive to see one of Peirce’s alternative attempts at explaining the universal categories. The phenomenological derivation of the categories that we are looking at here is a later development in Peirce’s work, and reflects thought about categories that Peirce had always harbored, and is crucial to his systematic vision of philosophy.

b. The Normative Sciences

The normative sciences study the norms of worldly interaction. As Phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of experience, the normative sciences prescribe our response to those experiences. Further, there are three sub-areas within the normative sciences: aesthetics, ethics and logic. Aesthetics is the most abstract of the three normative sciences and provides foundational aims for the other prescriptive disciplines. Ethics explores these aims in relation to conduct, and logic explores those aims in relation to reasoning, a particular form of conduct.

i. Aesthetics and Ethics

Peirce’s theories of aesthetics and ethics are not well developed. In many respects, Peirce self-consciously developed them for his system in order to provide foundations for logic. Consequently, his theories of aesthetics and ethics do not look too much like traditional theories. They are aesthetical and ethical in the sense of being theories of what is unconditionally admirable, and what is of value in human conduct, but they are not systematic or extensive. The two disciplines hold the usual hierarchical relations, with the super-ordinate science of aesthetics providing a general, guiding principle for its sub-ordinate science ethics, which in turn provides realized cases of that principle.

The only guiding principle from aesthetics to ethics that Peirce hints at is what he calls the “ultimate aesthetic ideal.” The ultimate aesthetic ideal is, for Peirce, the growth of reason or rationality. He calls this the “growth of concrete reasonableness.” For instance, the discovery that our galaxy is heliocentric and not geocentric marks a growth in concrete reasonableness, i.e., an increase in our grasp upon reality. Ethics, then, must take this general aesthetic ideal of the unconditionally admirable and ask, “What is admirable in the way of human conduct?” This makes ethics, for Peirce, a question of what kind of conduct is likely to see the growth of reason or rationality. The right action will take us towards achieving the aesthetic ideal, the wrong action will not.

Right conduct, then, is conduct that is self-controlled and deliberate. Further, it is self-controlled and deliberate in an attempt to achieve the aesthetic ideal. What is more, this self-controlled conduct is not simply about action for the individual in isolation; it is also about setting a precedent and providing an example for a community. For instance, I decide that I will never act without reflection upon rumors. I try, through self-controlled and deliberate response, to reflect upon the content and plausibility of the rumors I hear and to find out whether they are truthful or not. Only when I have done this do I act. Here is a case of adopting a particular kind of conduct with the aim of seeing the world become a more reasoned and rational place. However, when I die, my contribution to concrete reasonableness passes with me, unless I can spread this deliberate conduct further. This is precisely what Peirce thinks our ethical conduct should do; not by being purely about individual conduct, but by contributing habits, tendencies and general principles in conduct that others can see and adopt. Our contribution to achieving the aesthetic ideal, then, is not just the adoption of self-controlled conduct, but also establishing such conduct as a communal habit or convention. The growth of concrete reasonableness requires more than just action; it requires continued action.

Peirce has very little more to say about aesthetics and ethics. It appears the notions of the ultimate aesthetic ideal and what is unconditionally admirable in the way of human conduct are only interesting to Peirce as general guiding principles for the sub-ordinate discipline of logic.

ii. Logic

The third of the normative sciences, logic, takes the aim of aesthetics and the principles of ethics and applies them to reasoning. Logic, then, is self-controlled reasoning aimed at the growth of concrete reasonableness. It is as a form of conduct that logic takes a sub-ordinate position to ethics in the philosophical hierarchy.

Logic itself has three branches: Philosophical Grammar, Critical Logic and Methodeutic. Philosophical Grammar, often called Speculative Grammar, is a theoretical explanation and exploration of the nature of signs. This is the area within the hierarchy for Peirce’s famous theory of Semiotics. It is located within logic conceived as the self-controlled conduct of reasoning because Peirce takes all thought, and so all reasoning, to occur through the use of signs. Philosophical Grammar, then, studies the nature of the basic phenomena of reasoning: signs. Signs are essentially triadic phenomena on Peirce’s account, consisting of a sign vehicle, an object and an interpretant or interpreting thought which takes the sign to stand for its object. For instance, a fever is a sign of illness, which I understand as requiring treatment with medicine. The fever is the sign, the illness is its object, and my understanding of this connection is the interpretant. Peirce continually developed complex classifications for signs depending on the inter-relation between the sign, the object and the interpretant.

In many ways, we can see the sign as a concrete case of a general principle from phenomenology, which tells us that each experience will have firstness, secondness and thirdness. Indeed, Peirce sees the sign-vehicle as a firstness, the object as a secondness and the interpretant as a thirdness. However, after 1903, Peirce did not press this reflection of the phenomenological categories in his semiotic too far, even though he remained convinced that it existed.

The second branch of logic is Critical Logic, which studies types of argument. However, Peirce discusses more than just deductive arguments or reasoning within this branch of logic. He also includes discussion of inductive and abductive reasoning. Inductive reasoning, for Peirce, is quantitative reasoning and bears close resemblance to statistical analysis. On Peirce’s analysis, induction is reasoning or argument to a general rule for a population based upon a sample from it. For instance, my sample of the metals in coins leads me to conclude that the pennies in current circulation have approximately 30% copper content. I have induced a general rule about the copper content of all pennies from a random sample of, say, 5% of the pennies in circulation. The more sampling I do the more accurate my general rule will become.

Abductive reasoning is similar to the inference to best explanation and provides conjectures for general rules by proffering some explanatory hypothesis based on some phenomena that we already know. A quick and simple way to grasp how Peirce thinks that abduction and induction are argument forms is to look at their structure in relation to the standard deductive syllogism. Consider the deductively valid argument: all felines are furry; all lions are felines; so all lions are furry. We can recast this to reflect the inductive form of argument like this: all lions are furry; all lions are felines; so all felines are furry. This is obviously a probabilistic argument based on sampling from a general population. We take what we know of some sample population – in this case, that lions as a sample of the general feline population are furry – and conclude that this is present in the population as a whole.

Again, we can recast the structure of the deductive argument to reflect abductive reasoning like this: all felines are furry; all lions are furry; so all lions are felines. Here we are taking two phenomena, the furriness of felines and the furriness of lions, and providing a conjecture that attempts to explain both phenomena with a single general rule.

Obviously, neither induction nor abduction are deductively valid, but Peirce still considers them to be important forms of reasoning and devotes discussion to them within the Critical Logic. Critical Logic also explains, through a discussion of how these arguments are useful, what counts as good or bad reasoning. Consequently, it further explains the purpose of the normative discipline of logic considered as a form of self-controlled conduct.

The third branch of logic is Methodeutic. Methodeutic is home to Peirce’s theories of truth and inquiry and his pragmatic maxim. It concerns the use of signs and argument to create habits and forms of conduct conducive to achieving the logical take on the aesthetic ideal, a steady state of doubt resistant beliefs. For Peirce, the aim of logic or reasoning is to achieve a settled state of belief. The growth of this steady state comes from our desire to eradicate doubt, which causes considerable consternation according to Peirce. Whenever we encounter some phenomenon that casts doubt upon a belief of ours, we feel compelled to find the cause of the recalcitrant experience and settle our beliefs once more. This leads to a steady growth in our body of recalcitrant proof beliefs. Methodeutic, then, is the study of inquiry: or growth through reasoning in action.

c. Metaphysics

The final branch of philosophy is Metaphysics, the study of what is real. As phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of our experience, and the normative sciences prescribe our response to them, Metaphysics studies whether or not the objects of experience are real.

The first thing to note about Peirce’s metaphysics is that it is still a distinctly “hands on” affair. Peirce’s metaphysics, commonly labeled “scientific metaphysics,” attempts to explain the reality of the phenomenological categories and of the methods and principles of inquiry as expounded in the normative sciences. This is all in contra-distinction to “Ontological Metaphysics,” or metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning. Peirce’s pragmatism means that he is at odds with this kind of metaphysical endeavor. Since a concept’s meaning relies upon its practical bearings, and the bulk of a priori metaphysics make no difference to practice or experience, the bulk of a priori metaphysics is meaningless. Again, this is similar to the verificationist’s anti-metaphysical arguments, but where the logical positivists take this to mean the death of metaphysics, Peirce takes this to mean that a worthwhile metaphysics must be scientific, fallible, cautiously approached, and sub-ordinate to logic.

As with the normative sciences, Peirce makes various distinctions within the branch of metaphysics. Most interesting are his discussions of the reality of his phenomenological categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness and his evolutionary cosmology. In his discussion of the reality of the phenomenological categories, Peirce returns to the subject of his first philosophical discipline, phenomenology, where he identifies the three categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness as general features of all experience. Here, in his metaphysical work, Peirce turns his discussion to the reality of these phenomenological categories. His concern is to ask whether all or any of those categories are real independently of you or I. Does thirdness, for instance, really exist? If it does, then, on Peirce’s view, “possibles” exist.

Peirce places himself with Aristotle, Kant and the Scottish Common-sense philosopher Thomas Reid in taking all three of the phenomenological categories to be real. However, since he takes his own “three category realism” to most strongly reflect the work of John Duns Scotus, Peirce labels himself a “scholastic realist.” Peirce also characterizes other theories and philosophers depending on their own commitments to the reality of the phenomenological categories. For instance, in Peirce’s opinion, “nominalism” does not take the category of thirdness to be real. Although the term “nominalism” is more normally part of mediaeval debate on the existence (or not) of universals, Peirce uses the term to refer to any theory that seems too hardheadedly committed to the explanation of phenomena in terms of concrete existent particulars. It is for this reason that Peirce labels as nominalist any theory which does not take the real existence of laws, generalities, possibilities, etc. seriously (i.e. is not committed to the existence of thirds or thirdness). Of course, it is possible, in Peirce’s opinion, to move too far in the opposite direction. According to Peirce, Hegel’s philosophy, for instance, places too much emphasis on thirdness at the expense of the other categories. Peirce’s, own commitment to a three-category realism, though, is the source of the acute anti-nominalism which affects much of his other philosophical work.

Peirce’s cosmological metaphysics is perhaps the most interesting of his metaphysical writings. Where his general metaphysics discusses the reality of the phenomenological categories, his cosmological work studies the reality and relation to the universe of his work in the normative sciences. The cosmological metaphysics looks at the aesthetic ideal (the growth of concrete reasonableness) and its attainment through growth and habit in the universe at large. In Peirce’s cosmology, the universe grows from a state of nothingness to chaos, or all pervasive firstness. From the state of chaos, it develops to a state in which time and space exist, or a state of secondness, and from there to a state where it is governed by habit and law, i.e. a state of thirdness. The universe does this, not in a mechanistic or deterministic way, but by tending towards habit and a law-like nature through chance and spontaneous transition. This chance-like transition towards thirdness is the growth of concrete reasonableness, i.e. the attainment of the aesthetic ideal through the spontaneous development of habit.

Peirce’s evolutionary cosmology has left many commentators uneasy about its relation to the rest of his work. His development of it during his own life time led some of his friends to fear for his sanity. Indeed, Peirce’s turn towards cosmological metaphysics is often attributed to a mystical experience and crisis of faith in the 1890’s. In truth, Peirce takes his cosmological work to be the logical upshot of the normative sciences and logic, which show the nature and desirability of the growth of reason. Cosmological metaphysics merely shows how the growth of concrete reasonableness occurs in the universe at large.

4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation

Traditionally, the systematic background to Peirce’s theories of, say, pragmatism, inquiry, or the categories is ignored. This has lead to a failure to appreciate its significance to the detail of individual theories. Instead, the assessment of Peirce’s philosophy is often made on an issue by issue basis. Take, for instance, Peirce’s pragmatism. Its relation to the broader system enables Peirce to state his pragmatism and show how it need not lapse into nominalism, which is generally the outcome of pragmatic or verificationist principles. Understanding Peirce’s devout anti-nominalism requires some grasp of his system and the place of the pragmatic maxim within it.

This, of course, is not to say that Peirce’s philosophy must live and die by the systematic view. It is possible to take Peirce’s views on individual topics and find much of value in them. However, interpreting Peirce’s philosophy without any appreciation of the systematic background faces the danger of making serious mistakes about the import and intent of Peirce’s work. Returning again to the Peirce’s account of pragmatism, without the systematic background to provide some sense of Peirce’s commitment to anti-nominalism and belief in the possibility of a scientific metaphysics, his pragmatism looks like a simple forerunner of the Logical Positivist’s verification principle. Although common, such an interpretation fails to reflect the nuances of Peirce theory. Reaching a full understanding of Peirce’s work on individual topics, then, is always best achieved with an eye on the systematic background.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first widespread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2). (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce’s thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce’s Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.

Author Information:

Albert Atkin
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom