Perspectivism in Science

Perspectivism, or perspectival realism, has been discussed in philosophy for many centuries, but as a view about science, it is a twenty-first-century topic. Although it has taken many forms and even though there is no agreed definition, perspectivism at its heart uses a visual metaphor to help us understand the scope and character of scientific knowledge. Several interrelated issues are surrounding this one central feature of perspectivism. It is typically an epistemic position, although debates about its scope have touched upon metaphysics as well. Modeling, realism, representation, pluralism, and justification are some of the main issues in the philosophy of science that are connected with perspectivism.

Defenders of this view aspire to develop an account of science that has a kind of realist flavor, but typically without the epistemic inaccessibility often accompanying realism. To do this, perspectivists often try, in various ways, to resist social constructivism (sometimes construed by its opponents as endorsing the social dependence of scientific knowledge). The strategy is to endorse a mind-independent world that our theories track, while at the same time accommodating the historical, experimental, and modeling contexts of scientific knowledge on the other. Perspectival realism, therefore, has a realist element as well as a perspective-dependent element, where perspective-dependence is meant to acknowledge the importance of those contexts. The visual metaphor speaks to both of these elements because the character of a visual experience depends upon contributions from human sense organs as well as the environment (in the form of light rays). We can think of the human contribution that affects scientific knowledge as taking two forms: one associated with a historical study of science and the other associated with variation across the contemporary sciences.

This article explores the different ways that defenders of perspectivism have attempted to make use of the visual metaphor to develop a coherent account of realism while also overcoming criticisms. The article examines the visual metaphor and the general philosophical problems motivating perspectivism. Chief among these motivations is model pluralism. Next, the article details how Ronald Giere—the first philosopher in contemporary times to apply the metaphor to science—motivates a representational version of perspectivism. His account has inspired criticism and alternative applications of the metaphor and hence different ways of conceiving perspectivism. The rest of this article explores those criticisms and how philosophers have attempted to reconceive perspectivism more fruitfully and in some cases without relying so heavily on representation.

Table of Contents

  1. Philosophical Problems Motivating Perspectivism
  2. Philosophical Inspirations
  3. Representational and Other Forms of Perspectivism
    1. Representational Perspectivism
    2. Other Versions of Perspectivism based on Representation
    3. Arguments in Favor of Representational Perspectivism
      1. Two Arguments for Perspectivism
      2. Is Giere’s Perspectivism a Kind of Realism?
    4. Other Forms of Perspectivism
  4. Criticisms of Perspectivism
    1. Perspectivism as Dispositional Realism
    2. Inconsistent Models and Perspectivism as Instrumentalism
    3. Suitability of the Perspective Metaphor
  5. Defenses of Perspectivism
    1. Overcoming the Problem of Inconsistent Models
    2. Perspectivism and Modality
      1. Modality and Inconsistent Models
      2. Perspectival Truth
  6. Ontological Commitments of Perspectivism
  7. Constructive Empiricism and Perspectivism
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Philosophical Problems Motivating Perspectivism

In visual experience, the human contribution involves the visual system. In applying this metaphor to scientific knowledge, there are a few ways to think about how that knowledge is human-based and what it means for there to be a human contribution. There are two ways in which the literature on perspectivism emphasizes human contribution. Massimi writes of these:

(1) Our scientific knowledge is historically situated, that is, it is the inevitable product of the historical period to which those scientific representations, modeling practices, data gathering, and scientific theories belong. [Diachronic]


(2) Our scientific knowledge is culturally situated, that is, it is the inevitable product of the prevailing cultural tradition in which those scientific representations, modeling practices, data gathering, and scientific theories were formulated [Synchronic] (Massimi in Saatsi, 2017, page 164).

“Culturally situated” here does not mean Western Science or nationally affiliated (as in British or Indian Science). Rather, it refers to the particular scientific enterprise, such as phylogeny, ecosystem ecology, or classical field theory, though it may refer to other parts of scientific practice or theory at courser or finer resolution. These perspectival elements are meant to be concessions to anti-realism that still allow the perspectivist to retain a form of realism. Exactly what sorts of threats realism should confront via perspectivism depends upon the perspectival account.

Strong forms of realism and of anti-realism both face substantial challenges and at the same time offer different insights about scientific knowledge. By taking a middle ground perspectivism, its defenders hope, one might take on board the best the anti-realist has to offer while also committing to key realist commitments. Those commitments, as Psillos (1999, Introduction) defines them, are these:

(1) Metaphysical. There is a mind- and theory-independent world.

(2) Epistemic. We can have justified true beliefs about the mind-independent world.

(3) Semantic. Our scientific terms (and theories) track this

the mind-independent world through reference.

The most ambitious perspectivist will want to endorse all three of these while at the same time acknowledging that scientific knowledge is human-dependent in some way (which is the concession to anti-realism). To say scientific knowledge is dependent upon humans typically might mean one of two things

(1) Our scientific knowledge is historically situated. This is a diachronic version that takes an interest in how science has and has not changed over time.

(2) Our scientific knowledge is situated within different areas of contemporary science, whether it is within different practices, disciplines, families of models, or in some other unit of science. This is a synchronic version of perspectivism.

The synchronic character of scientific knowledge is often one of the central issues motivating debates about perspectivism. The worry perspectivists are responding to is that model pluralism could put pressure on realism as traditionally conceived. As Rueger notes (2020), the realist wants to say that the success of the best theories of science should lead us to treat those theories as true in a metaphysically and epistemically robust sense: success is our guide to a mind-independent reality. One trouble with this realist motivation is that there are several successful scientific theories, but they do not seem to offer the same description of reality; in fact, many theories and models appear to be contradictory. Unless nature is also contradictory, the realist needs a story about the plurality of successful theories, models, and explanations we see in the sciences. This is the problem of inconsistent models. Perspectival realism aspires to address this problem without retreating too far from that mind-independent position; hence, realism motivates perspectivists who take seriously the pluralism of successful theories or models.

This is not the only reason to be a perspectivist. Thinking about perspectivism diachronically may give some resources for acknowledging the success of past science and the historical path that modern science has taken. The thought here is that scientific knowledge emerges within particular contexts and is always evaluated within them. There is no view from outside of our epistemic contexts that allows us to evaluate knowledge independently of the practices that use it. This is a problem of knowledge generation and knowledge evaluation and is sometimes called the God’s-eye-view problem (2006, page 15). Realists often treat truth as epistemically unavailable (see Psillos (1999, Introduction)). Instead, they argue we must use success as a proxy for justifying our knowledge of a mind-independent world. But the trouble here is that what counts as successful is historically situated and many past theories that once seemed successful have been abandoned. The realist, therefore, needs a story about the connection between truth and success if we are to imagine that we can make claims about a mind-independent world and at the same time understand the success of past science. Perspectivism aspires to tell this story in such a way that is historically sensitive and not just instrumentalist.

Different philosophers take different realist commitments more or less seriously. The first contemporary take on scientific perspectivism, which Ronald Giere defends, is committed to both synchronic and diachronic versions, but he has been criticized for not clearly committing to the realist tenets as they are traditionally construed. Other authors, as we will see, try to have stronger endorsements of these tenets with more traditional realist interpretations. The upshot, if they are successful, is to have an epistemically accessible interpretation of science, that is, a view of scientific knowledge that is modest enough to achieve, but still robust (in some realist sense).

2. Philosophical Inspirations

Although distinct from their philosophical predecessors, some of the views discussed in this article have been influenced by Kant, Kuhn, Feyerabend, Sosa, Nietzsche, American pragmatists, and others. Some of that inspiration is vague and the similarity between a historical figure’s views and contemporary perspectivism may be a similarity only in spirit. Although they do not describe their views as perspectival, several philosophers are particularly important for the groundwork that has made an interest in the middle ground that perspectivists seek an attractive ground. Kuhn (1962), Putnam (1981), and Hacking (2002) are particularly noteworthy for their interests in science, in truth, and in rationality – interests that revolve in various ways around the attempt to transcend the dichotomy between realism and antirealism, or even between objectivity and subjectivity. We can see their influence at work in contemporary perspectivism, though the labels and indeed crucial elements of these various accounts differ. Kant, Sosa, and to an extent Kuhn are implicitly inspirations for Massimi’s views (see 2014[a]; 2015[a]).Though some of the crucial philosophical predecessors do not defend accounts they would call perspectival, there is some contemporary work that attempts to more rigorously interpret those historical figures in perspectival terms. The most explicitly discussed influences are Kuhn and Feyerabend (Giere, 2016; Giere, 2013; Giere, 2009). Ronald Giere argues that the latter develops a form of perspectivism, but with minimal realism. He describes how Feyerabend uses theater and perspective painting to show by analogy that science compares constructions with other constructions, but never with reality directly (2001, pages 103ff). Although this shares with Giere’s perspectivism the idea that scientists build things (models) that they then compare with other things they have built (models of data), Giere thinks Feyerabend strays much further from realism than Giere’s account. Giere has not given an argument for distinguishing his account from Feyerabend’s, however, and admits that he has simply avoided offering a view of truth (2016, pages 137-138). So, although Giere aspires to be a realist, the argument establishing that his account is a realist account is missing. Feyerabend does not have this aspiration; the difference between their accounts may amount to a difference in their vision for science, not the arguments they give in defense of their views.

Giere also likens Kuhn to a perspectival realist. The main differences Giere identifies are (1) that Kuhn tends to think of paradigms in terms of semantics (instead of models, see (2013, page 54) and (2) Kuhn in many places is deeply concerned with truth and metaphysics; scientific revolutions and world change are profoundly connected to metaphysics and yet this is not a topic Giere addresses in much detail.

Pragmatism may also share some crucial similarities to some forms of perspectivism, especially those forms, such as Giere’s or Mitchell’s, that appeal heavily to the aims of scientists. Brown offers a comparison here (2009). He shows that American pragmatists, especially Peirce and Dewey, provide a more detailed account of scientific aims and how those aims feature in and structure scientific inquiry. Perspectivists (he explicitly directs his remarks at Giere’s views) could benefit from an examination of this more detailed and contextualized view of scientific aims.

3. Representational and Other Forms of Perspectivism

The first application of perspectivism to science comes from Giere (2006). His account is based on representation. Mitchell (2020) and Teller (2020) are also interested in defending perspectivist accounts for broadly similar reasons. The next section examines these representation-based accounts before turning to other characterizations of perspectivism. After, there is a section examining the motivation for representation

a. Representational Perspectivism

In his work (2006), Giere argues science should be understood in terms of a hierarchy of models and that modeling works a lot like human vision, hence the perspective metaphor (see pages 60-61 in particular). Models and representation are key features of his account, a kind representational account. His views do not leave much room for elements of science that are not model-based. It is unclear whether this is because he thought these elements were just part of modeling practice or whether he just considered them less important than modeling practice. Giere’s examples and arguments mostly involve contemporary science, so he is most concerned with synchronically understanding perspectivism, but in places, he takes some interest in applying perspectivism to an understanding of the history of science (see for example 2016; 2013).

Giere argues vision, scientific instruments, and scientific models are all representational, selective, constructed, and all give rise to a product that is jointly determined by a human and an environmental element. In the case of human vision, our visual experience is the product of what the world is like and what our visual system is like (Giere, 2006, chapter 1). Similarly, our scientific models are the product of our modeling practices and what the world that we model is like.

His views turn on an analogy between scientific observation and regular, everyday observation because scientific instruments are selective the way vision is (Giere, 2006, chapter 2). These are analogous to scientific theorizing because theorizing also involves selecting specific features of the environment and then building models that represent those specific features (Giere, 2006, chapter 3).

Selectivity is crucial for making this comparison between vision and science. Human vision is sensitive to specific wavelengths of light while other creatures or even machines are sensitive to other specific wavelengths. Depending on what visual apparatus one has, one will experience different pictures or visual images. These images are still images of a real and external world, but their character does not solely depend upon the external world, it also depends upon the visual system we are considering. Similarly, models selectively represent different features of the world, and which features one selects will determine what model to build out of many different possible models. Depending on what sort of model one wants to build, one will make different An especially salient illustration Giere uses is brain imaging (2006, page 49ff). CAT (Computer Assisted Tomography) scans and PET (Positron Emission Tomography) scans are two common methods for scanning the human brain. The CAT scan uses a series of X-ray photographs to provide an image of the brain that tells us some of its structural properties. Technicians can alternatively use a PET scan, which uses gamma rays to detect neural activity in different parts of the brain. The activity can then be graphed in images that give us some of the functional, instead of structural, properties of the brain. These two methods of scanning are sensitive to different stimuli (X-rays and gamma rays), allowing scientists to build different images and conclusions about the brain. Depending upon what one’s interests are, one will choose a particular kind of scanning.

Representation lies at the heart of the perspectival metaphor, explains how models are epistemically valuable, and supplants truth as a basis for assessing scientific knowledge claims. Giere calls this an agent-based account of scientific representation and says “an agent represents features of the world for specific purposes (Giere, 2006; Giere, 2010, pages 60–61).”

The representing that the agent does involves some kind of similarity relation between representation and target (Giere, 2006, pages 63–67). In what way they are similar depends upon the specific purposes that the scientists using the representation have. Any model and any real-world phenomenon may have several similar features, but what makes a particular model represent a particular target is the act of using the model to represent specific features. Similarity comes in degrees and how similar is similar enough is also determined by how scientists use models.

Similarity supplants truth. Rather than claim that a successful model is true, or true of a target, Giere thinks we are only entitled to say that the model is similar (for present purposes) to the target in the relevant respects. He argues for this claim by appealing to scientific practice. For any given model, it will fail to be a perfect fit with the target system and scientists only ever specify certain similarities. Claiming the model is true is a metaphysically more committing claim that goes beyond what scientists do and what science can offer. To make the more metaphysically robust claim, we would need a model that fits the world perfectly in every respect and we have no such model.

b. Other Versions of Perspectivism based on Representation

Teller and Mitchell defend versions of perspectivism and representation features importantly in both of their accounts, just as it did for Giere’s. Teller (2020) argues that traditional forms of realism fail to capture the representational features of scientific terms. Truth, as traditionally conceived, therefore cannot feature in a realist analysis of science. Instead, he argues that we should endorse approximate truth within well-defined contexts and that this can be called perspectivism. Representation features importantly in his account because it is the representational part of science that realism fails to capture and that gives him the argument in favor of partial truth within constrained contexts. Scientific theories and terms do have a connection to the actual world, but that representational relationship is not as rigid as the reference often associated with realism.

The upshot of this account is that we can ascribe truth to scientific claims, but we must specify concerning what a given claim is true. That is, a claim is not true absolutely, but true concerning the aims or intentions of scientists within specific contexts. Truth is approximate because we need to specify what the context is when determining whether a claim is true and even with that specification, the truth is still only true in degrees (2020, pages 58-59). The hope is that this notion of truth allows perspectivism to be a position principally about our representations (and hence it is just epistemic) and not about ontology. Therefore, there is a mind-independent, single world toward which our scientific theories and terms are directed.

Mitchell defends a perspectival account directed at the epistemology of science (2020). Her writings on perspectivism build directly upon her earlier work developing integrative pluralism (1992; 2002; 2003; 2009; 2017). She also argues it is the selectivity of model representation that makes science, especially scientific modeling, perspectival. Despite the emphasis on models and representation, her account is radically unlike Giere’s. She does not conclude that knowledge is situated within perspectives qua models but instead argues that different perspectives (models) can be integrated, and the result of this integration is knowledge of the natural world. Integration is necessary because any model is incomplete and therefore gives us accurate but partial knowledge of the target that it selectively represents.

There are still, however, questions about where and which models can be integrated. Some of the criticisms leveled against Giere’s perspectivism may apply here, especially Morrison’s example of the atomic nucleus models, which she argues show that the inconsistency between some models is quite deep and that the incompatibility cannot readily be accounted for for using the selectivity of representation. It is an open question whether these kinds of examples pose a serious problem for integrative pluralism and associated forms of representation.

c. Arguments in Favor of Representational Perspectivism

Having examined key elements of the representational version of perspectivism, this section examines arguments in favor of this position. The discussion focuses on Giere because his arguments are the most influential and the most closely related views (such as those of Mitchell and Teller) find them persuasive.

There is one main argument in Giere for perspectivism and one minor argument that he uses more implicitly. The main argument, leaning on the visual metaphor, is that modeling practices, and subsequently the knowledge we get from them, are irreducibly selective, partial, and hence perspectival. He makes this argument in two stages: an instrument and then a theory stage.

i. Two Arguments for Perspectivism

In the first stage, Giere presumes that science is based upon observation and that contemporary science relies upon instruments for its observations. Because instruments are responsive to limited stimulus, just as vision is, instruments are perspectival in the same way that vision is perspectival (2006, Chapter 3). There are several key claims here.

(1) Science is built upon observation

(2) Observations in contemporary science requires instruments

(3) Vision is only sensitive to a limited range of stimuli

(4) Any instrument is also only sensitive to a limited range of stimuli

(5) Different detection systems (either instruments or visual systems) offer different “perspectives” on the same object in the virtue of their different sensitivities.

(6) Instruments and observation are perspectival in the same way vision is.

There is little argument in favor of 1, perhaps because it appears to be an innocuous, vague commitment to empiricism. Claim 2 also is unsupported, except that it can perhaps be intuitively seen by considering examples; it seems uncontroversial that much of modern science cannot rely solely on human vision because the subjects are either very small (molecules, atoms, DNA) or very large and distant (galaxies, stars, black holes, and so forth). To observe these things requires instruments. Giere does support claim 3 with an extensive discussion of how vision works (2006, Chapter 2) and claim 4 with case studies, such as the Compton Gamma Ray Observatory, which has a telescope that is only sensitive to gamma rays within a specific energy range (2006, pages 45-48).

In the second stage of the main argument, Giere extends the reasoning about instruments to theories (2006, Chapter 4). He argues that theories are models or sets of models, that scientists use to represent parts of the world. Theories are an extension of vision and instruments because models represent selectively, just as vision and instruments represent selectively.

The more minor argument emerges from considering examples of models that appear to be inconsistent with one another because they appear to ascribe incompatible properties to the same target, but at the same time, two or more such models may be equally valuable in some way, such as the different ways of scanning and modeling the brain. These different types of scans attribute different properties to the brain that seem to be inconsistent, but they are valuable for addressing different kinds of problems and tell us about different aspects of the brain. Other authors give greater credence to this argument.

Giere claims there are upshots to his account (briefly canvassed in (2006, pages 13-15). For one, he can accommodate the constructivist insight that science irreducibly involves a human contribution and that the products of science depend heavily upon this creative and constructive effort. If that is correct, he might be able to do justice to the history of science and the contextual nature of human knowledge, thus avoiding the problem of presupposing a God’s-eye view. Briefly, this problem concerns believing we can transcend human limitations and arrive at infallible and true claims about the world (cf. with objective realism 2006, pages 4 ff.). On the other hand, he thinks he has serious realist commitments that give us a picture of science as a reliable, empirically supported, and authoritative source of knowledge that is safe from serious skepticism. He does not defend those realist commitments explicitly.

ii. Is Giere’s Perspectivism a Kind of Realism?

The answer is not straightforward. Although Giere claims that models do represent the actual, real, mind-independent world, many of his other claims are not compatible with realism. This section explains how Giere’s views fit with the realist commitments to semantics, epistemology, and metaphysics.

The first tenet was metaphysical: there is a mind-independent world. Giere’s views do not conflict with this. Models represent features of this world and what this world is like is independent of modeling practice. So Giere can endorse this one. However, he is not explicit about his metaphysical commitments and if he thought that ontology was perspective relative (or if that relativity is entailed by his other claims), then he could not endorse the metaphysical requirement realists have. He does claim that models are never directly compared with the world, but merely with less abstract models (2006, page 68). Given this epistemic limitation, it is unclear how one could know whether one’s models were models of the real world. It is therefore unclear how Giere could be able to endorse the metaphysical realist tenet, even if it is compatible with his account in principle.

The second tenet, that we can have justified true beliefs about that external world, is less straightforward based on Giere’s writings. On the one hand, models as Giere construes them do represent the world and they allow us to have beliefs about it. So far this seems like a commitment he could endorse.  However, Giere also claims that we should think of the success of our models in terms of similarity, not in terms of truth (2006, pages 64-65). Furthermore, Giere claims that if we do make claims about what is true, those claims are only true within a perspective, perhaps best understood as modeling practice (2006, page 81). These considerations strongly suggest that perspectivists should be committed to a claim being true, or not, relative to scientific practice. If truth depends upon practice, then it depends upon what models scientists build and what purposes they have in building and using models. Truth then appears to depend upon the actions of scientists and their purposes. Put this way, it appears very hard to reconcile Giere’s views with the epistemic commitment realists typically require. See Massimi (2018a, page 349) for the relativity of truth and this interpretation of Giere’s perspectivism.

It is doubtful that Giere wants to endorse the third realist tenet: our best successful scientific terms (or theories or models) track the mind-independent world through reference. This may not be a problem, however, because Giere uses the representation to link our models to the actual world and representation may just be able to do the same work as reference. Like reference, representation allows for a kind of correspondence between the world and our structures (whether they be language structures or model structures). Perhaps unlike reference, there is a lot of flexibility in Giere’s account of representation. A model can be more or less similar, depending upon the scientist’s purposes.  However, the representation does establish a direct link between the world and the model, even if that link lacks the kind of precision that we might associate with reference. Whether this lack of precision prevents Giere from endorsing the last realist tenet may depend upon what account of reference we endorse and what level of precision realists require. Further work would be needed to address these issues. Teller (Teller, 2020) argues that reference also fails to have very high levels of precision, just as models do. Indeed, Giere elsewhere (2016, page 140) hints that linguistic analyses of science, especially those that appeal to reference, are unlikely to work. He suggests such a project may very well be “logically impossible.” If we accept this view of reference, then perspectivists could probably endorse the third realist tenet in a different form, a form that analyzes how our theories track the world in terms of a kind of flexible and contextual correspondence (either representational or reference-based).

Giere’s defense of perspectivism is realist in spirit and is in principle compatible with realist metaphysics, but it is not a full form of realism because of important deviations. Given that Giere claimed to be developing an account that fell somewhere between realism and constructivism, this may be a satisfactory outcome, though much more work would be needed to spell out more specifically where and how Giere’s views depart from or align with, realism.

d. Other Forms of Perspectivism

The term “perspectivism” implies visual media which in turn suggests that representation is going to be important for a perspectival analysis. However, some versions of perspectivism do not take representation to be what makes science distinctly perspectival. Some of these accounts, as we will see, are in part motivated by the difficulties that representational perspectivism faces. Massimi (for example 2012; 2018b) argues it is the modality of the knowledge gained from modeling that makes science perspectival. Chang (2020) argues it is the epistemic aims that provide the perspectival element in science. Danks (2020) also takes epistemic aims to be an important part of what makes science perspectival because aims structure the way scientists exercise their conceptual capacities, which gives rise to alternative conceptual systems. Rueger (2005; 2020) argues perspectivism should be understood more metaphysically, particularly in terms of relational properties. Section 5 will examine these views further after considering criticisms leveled against perspectivism, particularly Giere’s version thereof.

4. Criticisms of Perspectivism

Perspectivism aspires to be a middle-of-the-road account that has realist commitments, but which at the same time accommodates the contextual nature of human knowledge. We saw that there was some ambiguity in Giere’s commitments to realism, but that this may not be a problem given the aim of the project. However, two main criticisms cast doubt on whether perspectivism is a unique position that occupies this middle space. Those criticisms pull in opposite directions. One claims that perspectivism is a form of more traditional realism; the other claims that perspectivism just amounts to instrumentalism.

There is also a third criticism that endorses many of perspectivism’s features but denies that the metaphor of a perspective appropriately captures the relevant features of scientific practice. These criticisms are directed at Giere’s views in particular but might apply to any perspectival account based upon representation. These criticisms do not necessarily apply to other forms of perspectivism, though they might.

a. Perspectivism as Dispositional Realism

One charge against perspectivism is that it collapses into a more traditional form of realism, such as dispositional realism.  Chakravartty argues this case by undermining the support that he sees perspectivism receiving from three arguments: the argument from detection, from inconsistency, and from reference. These are primarily, but not exclusively, synchronic concerns. Some issues, such as reference, Chakravartty examines with a historical, and thus diachronic, lens. As the first step in this project of reducing perspectivism to realism, Chakravartty argues we can interpret the perspectival thesis in one of two ways, which are:

We have knowledge of perspectival facts only because non-perspectival facts are beyond our epistemic grasp.

We have knowledge of perspectival facts only because there are no non-perspectival facts to be known (2010, page 407).

The first interpretation is epistemic. It claims what we can know and what we cannot know. Perspectivism under this reading is simply claiming that we can only know things based on the models we make, everything else is beyond our epistemic ability because models are the only means by which we come to have knowledge. The claim that all facts are perspectival does not indicate knowledge is limited on its own. This is because a knowledge limit implies that there is a candidate for knowledge, but because of human nature (or cognition, scientific methods, what have you), we cannot grasp that candidate for knowledge, that is, there are facts we cannot grasp. This is the first interpretation. The second interpretation, however, indicates that there is nothing beyond that which we can know and that there is, therefore, no constraint on knowledge: we can know all the facts, it just turns out that all facts are perspectival. This second reading offers an ontological claim and is an alternative reading of the perspectival view of science, as Chakravartty interprets it. The perspectivist imagines that one or both theses are supported by three different arguments.

The detection argument is that different instruments or experiments are sensitive to a limited range of stimuli and therefore only capture part of a real-world phenomenon; instruments are limited and partial detectors. Different instruments that are sensitive to different stimuli give different perspectives on the same phenomenon. The human visual system, to return to Giere’s example, is like an instrument and is only sensitive to certain wavelengths of light. Other life forms have different visual systems and are sensitive to different wavelengths of light. This consideration of how instruments work appears to suggest that all we can know, via instrumentation, is perspectival (the epistemic thesis listed above). This consideration may also suggest that because we cannot make claims about things beyond our epistemic capacities, that we have no reason to suppose that there are non-perspectival facts to be known (the ontological thesis listed above). The perspectivist hopes, at least, to find support in the limited detection afforded by instruments.  Chakravartty argues (Chakravartty, 2010, section 2) that these considerations about how instruments work are still entirely compatible with robust realism. The fact that a detector has limited sensitivity does not need to suggest that a phenomenon does not have other causal features. This is why we use a variety of instruments so that we can understand the complexity of phenomena that are not fully captured by any one instrument. The incompleteness of an instrument’s detection does not require any concessions to anti-realism. So Chakravartty attempts to undermine the support perspectivists seek in representation, especially the selectivity and partiality of scientific instruments, experiments, and models.

The second argument the perspectivist appeals to is the inconsistency argument. Different models offer incompatible descriptions of the same target and if two or more such models are successful, realism is threatened (the problem of inconsistent models). The perspectivist can then say that different models offer different perspectives on the target phenomenon. Chakravartty defuses this argument by suggesting that we think of the models as ascribing different relational properties, rather than straightforward intrinsic properties (Chakravartty, 2010, section 3). Different models capture different non-perspectival dispositional properties, but the same phenomenon can have a variety of relational properties and if that is correct, we also have no need to make any concessions to anti-realism. Salt, for example, has the property of dissolving in water. But of course, salt does not always dissolve in water. The water must be in the right state, such as being unsaturated and being at the right temperature. This shows that salt does not have perspectival properties; the fact that salt sometimes dissolves in water and sometimes does not is not a perspectival fact. What this instead shows is that the property in question is more like a disposition whereby salt always has the disposition to dissolve in water, but whether it in fact does so depends upon having the correct context.

The final argument, about reference, is based on considering the history of science. The idea here is that past sciences had different technical terms or used the same technical terms with different meanings compared with contemporary science. Despite these differences, past science was met with success. The perspectival conclusion is that past science offered a different perspective on the world. Chakravartty attributes this view to Kuhn, especially the later Kuhn (Kuhn, 1990; Kuhn, 1977). Although Kuhn was not a perspectivist, Giere has interpreted him in that light (2013). The past two arguments were synchronic, but this is a diachronic form for supporting perspectivism.  Chakravartty interprets this Kuhnian-perspectival hybrid view as committed to the idea that the ontology of the world is causally dependent upon the scientific theories we endorse (2010, page 411). Consequently, whenever theories change, the world literally changes. He finds this view too metaphysically incoherent to take seriously. Whether this is really the right way to interpret Kuhn and Giere is another question (see Hoyningen-Huene (1993) for a thorough examination of Kuhn’s metaphysics). Nevertheless, if one were to take this interpretation of perspectivism seriously, then perspectivism, according to Chakravartty, would be a version of ontological relativity and that would just be a form of anti-realism, not any kind of realism.

These arguments, especially the first two that Chakravartty examines, are brought to bear against a version of perspectivism that appeals to perspectival facts. Such facts do not feature in Giere’s original view and perspectivists may offer a rejoinder here if it turns out that perspectival facts are not a necessary part of perspectivism. Nevertheless, Chakravartty has given several arguments suggesting that a realist, especially a dispositional realist, can accept most of the perspectivist’s claims about the nature of instrumentation and modeling. If his arguments succeed, Chakravartty will have shown that perspectivism is unable to walk the line between realism and anti-realism and instead collapses into a more robust and traditional form of realism, especially dispositional realism.

b. Inconsistent Models and Perspectivism as Instrumentalism

Giere used model pluralism to motivate his version of perspectivism. Model pluralism also proves stimulating for other, epistemic-focused accounts of perspectivism (Rice, Massimi, Mitchell, and others). However, when a plurality of models with the same target conflict with one another, it seems less obvious that model pluralism can be compatible with realism. This is the problem of inconsistent models and it may suggest that perspectivism is just instrumentalism.

Inconsistent models are those that have the same target (represent the same thing), but which ascribe to the target different properties that are incompatible with one another (Chakravartty, 2010; Mitchell, 2009; Weisberg, 2007; Longino, 2013; Morrison, 2015; Weisberg, 2012; Morrison, 2011). So, two models are inconsistent when 1) they have the same target, but 2) describe the target in incompatible ways. If models give us knowledge, inconsistency poses a problem; how can a target have incompatible properties, presuming the various models representing it are successful?

Morrison argues against a perspectival interpretation of inconsistent models (2011). This project is entirely synchronic. She shows, using a case study from nuclear physics, that perspectivism is really a form of instrumentalism. The perspectival account she accuses of instrumentalism is Giere’s and whether her criticisms apply equally to other versions is less clear. Her argument is this: the nucleus of an atom can be modeled in over two dozen different ways, most of which are incompatible with one another. Take the liquid drop model; it treats the nucleus classically, even though the model allows for successful predictions and even though scientists know the nucleus is a quantum, not classical, object (2011, page 350). Perspectivists would claim that each model offers a different perspective on the target. So, from the perspective of the liquid drop model, the nucleus is a classical object whereas from the perspective of, say, the shell model, the nucleus is a quantum object. This amounts to giving each model a realistic interpretation while also denying the possibility of comparing them. However, as Morrison points out, we know the liquid drop model cannot be right and that the nucleus is a quantum object. So the liquid drop model is instrumentally useful but cannot be given a realistic interpretation. It is unclear, according to our current best theories, why a model like the shell model, which correctly treats the nucleus as a quantum object, does not always allow for successful predictions or explanations. This case suggests that at best we can evaluate each model instrumentally, that is, assess a given model’s success based on the successful predictions scientists can use it to make. This further suggests that if we want a realistic understanding of an atomic nucleus, that is, to know its essential properties, then our scientific understanding is deficient and perspectivism does not offer a viable philosophical analysis. Morrison concludes:

In this case, perspectivism is simply a re-branded version of instrumentalism. Given that we assume there is an object called ‘‘the atomic nucleus’’ that has a particular structure and dynamics it becomes difficult to see how to interpret any of these models realistically since each is successful in accounting only for particular kinds of experimental evidence and provides very little in the way of theoretical understanding. In other words, the inference from predictive success to realism is blocked due not only to the extensive underdetermination but also the internal problems that beset each of the individual models (Morrison, 2011, page 350).

Morrison argues here that the connection that realists typically presume exists between truth and success cannot be established for her particular case study because each of the many models of the nucleus cannot be in some sense true because each has substantive problems and only affords some kinds of predictive success. So, any realism, including perspectival realism, is going to fail here.

A perspectivist like Giere might want to say, of these models of the nucleus, that each model offers a different perspective that affords different predictive success. Each model offers true claims about the nucleus, but that truth is only evaluable from within particular models. This interpretation, Morrison thinks, does not work because we think there is a phenomenon, the atomic nucleus, that has definite properties irrespective of any particular model. The various models of it that scientists use ascribe to the nucleus incompatible properties. Therefore, these various models of the nucleus cannot be given a realistic interpretation because they conflict, and conflicting models cannot tell us what the true structure of the nucleus is. How successful this criticism of perspectivism is will depend heavily upon whether one thinks that the nucleus has a definite set of properties, an assumption Giere is unlikely to endorse. It is, therefore, very unlikely that Morrison has really taken on board the central commitments that perspectivism has, namely that there is no such thing as understanding a particular phenomenon independently of some model. Her argument hinges upon this.

Nevertheless, a perspectivist may still need to more thoroughly account for why there is an intuition that phenomena do exist and have definitive properties independently of any given model. This intuition may not seem pressing when we examine different models of the same phenomenon that do not obviously conflict with one another. In such cases, it is easy to make sense of model-dependent knowledge because we might claim, as Giere does, that different models select different properties to represent. This implies that there is a single phenomenon that has a variety of properties and depending upon which we select, we get different models, even though those models have the same target.

However, if the properties associated with the different models do conflict, then the partial selectivity of models does not make as much sense and the perspectivist ought to have an explanation for what is going on in such cases. This is because the models presumably cannot just be selecting a subset of the properties a target has. The selection is impossible because no target can have inconsistent properties. Therefore, a realistic interpretation of the various models that partially represent the same target is impossible when the various models ascribe to the target inconsistent properties. Inconsistent models that are successful, therefore, seem to pose a serious threat to perspectivism, unless one were to reject the notion that a target cannot have inconsistent properties, but this would be difficult to endorse.

Inconsistent models that are successful pose a threat not just to perspectivism, but to realism more generally because most forms of realism seek to infer truth based on success. Inconsistent models seem to show that one can have success without truth and if that is correct, they strike realism at its core.

c. Suitability of the Perspective Metaphor

Chirimuuta criticizes the suitability of the metaphor of the perspective (2016). She argues that philosophers gloss over the fact that the metaphor of a perspective can be interpreted (or used) in three distinct ways, each of which offers different implications for the relationship between scientific knowledge and metaphysics. Those three features of the metaphor are partiality, interestedness, and interaction. Giere uses all three when discussing how scientists use models to represent. A given model is only selectively used to represent parts of the natural world (partiality) (2006, page 35). Which parts of the natural world a model represents is determined in part by the interests of the scientists building and using the model (interestedness) (2006, page 29). Finally, a model is able to represent because it is the product of an interaction with the natural world (interaction) (2006, pages 31-32). These are all logically distinct features of modeling, even though each plays a crucial part in Giere’s account.

Chirimuuta interprets Giere’s model-based account as endorsing all three without clearly distinguishing between them. Therefore, some criticisms of Giere are misapplied because they only target a single understanding of the perspective metaphor. She argues that making these distinctions between the various features of modeling practice would be easier by appealing to a haptic metaphor, that is, by considering touch instead of vision. This metaphor is better, she argues (2016, pages 752 ff.), because our sense of touch more obviously requires the three features listed above than does perception. Particularly important for other criticisms of Giere is the emphasis on interaction. Morrison and Chakravartty’s claims that perspectivism is just instrumentalism or realism presume that perspectivism only involves partiality or interestedness, but not interaction (2016, page 754). If we presumed that scientific modeling provides an objective mirroring or morphism of some kind, then perspectivism would look a lot like realism for some successful cases and it would look a lot like instrumentalism for cases where models do not appear to give us a kind of objective picture. But, Chirimuuta argues, this is not how models work, it is not how vision works, and it is not how touch works. The model is a result of an interaction and the interaction is not a mirroring, but a physical manipulation that changes the world in addition to allowing scientists to achieve given ends. There is a strong parallel with Chang’s active realism (2017b; 2017a) whereby realism is understood in more practical terms.

There are two worries with this proposal. One is that some kinds of modeling practice do not seem to involve the kind of interaction Chirimuuta describes (Cretu, 2020), such as some kinds of astronomy. The other problem, potentially, is that active realism and probably Chirimuuta’s haptic realism require a radical re-conception of what realism entails. How reasonable it is for us to call their views realist, therefore, will depend upon what one thinks a realist account should provide.

5. Defenses of Perspectivism

A representational form of perspectivism is ambitious. Giere, for instance, attempts, based on a theory of representation, to give an epistemic and ontological treatment of science. He hopes that in so doing, we could reject strong forms of objective realism that presupposed a God’s-eye-view as well as relativism. This is a very difficult balance to strike and the main criticisms against his view focus on the instability of walking a path between realism and relativism. The charge, his critics make, is that he might have weak realist commitments that open the door to ontological relativity or instrumentalism. At the same time, if those realist commitments are more robust, then perspectivism looks like a realist position with some interesting methodological commitments, but few new insights. Either way, philosophers would be back to square one with a dichotomy between realism and some form of anti-realism. To make perspectivism more robust, several philosophers have attempted to restrict perspectivism more sharply to the epistemology, and not the metaphysics, of science. The hope is that perspectivism so restricted can avoid the issues Giere faced while remaining true to the original project of mediating between realism and other views.

There are several ways one can attempt to restrict perspectivism to epistemology. One can do so while sharing with Giere a foundation laid in representation or one can develop perspectivism as a view about modal knowledge. These approaches are not without issues.

a. Overcoming the Problem of Inconsistent Models

Rueger (2005) and Massimi have in different ways attempted to use perspectivism to diffuse the threat to realism posed by the problem of inconsistent models. Rueger argues that in cases where different models appear to commit us to multiple and incompatible intrinsic properties to a target system, we should instead understand each model as offering a perspective. Because the properties in question are relativised to a perspective, he thinks we should understand them not as intrinsic properties as Morrison does, but as relational properties. So construed, models that appear inconsistent are not because each model ascribes different relational properties to the same target. This diffuses the problem of inconsistent models because relational properties would not conflict with one another the way intrinsic properties might. Relational properties would not conflict because they would only manifest in certain conditions.

Rueger’s approach is similar in spirit to Chakravaartty’s in that both take different models to ascribe non-intrinsic properties to target systems (in Chakravartty’s case the properties are dispositional properties). Their views can both be realist because it can be a fact of the matter whether a given target system has a property under consideration, regardless of the perspective in question. But the way we study a given property is model relative (and thus, dependent on perspective).

There is an epistemic as well as an ontological feature of this general approach to diffusing the problem of inconsistent models. The epistemic element commits us to the idea that perspectival modeling is required for the examination of properties in the actual world, that is, different properties require different modeling approaches in order for us to study them. The ontological element commits us to consider a specific class of properties as the real, actual properties. That class does not include intrinsic properties, only dispositional properties (Chakravartty) or relational properties (Rueger). The success of these accounts will of course depend upon what kinds of properties there actually are and whether we can know them. There is also a question about whether this kind of realism should be considered perspectival, that is, is there anything distinctly perspectival about this form of realism?

b. Perspectivism and Modality

The criticisms of Giere’s account suggested that a perspectival account that is ontological may not be able to walk the middle path between realism and constructivism or instrumentalism. Focusing perspectivism on the epistemology of science might allow for a middle path without the issues that Giere’s account faced. One way to do this was to build a perspectival account using the selectivity of representation. Such an approach follows Giere not only in emphasizing the representational parts of science; it also uses the same type of vision metaphor. However, there are other ways of developing this metaphor and there are other ways to develop an account of perspectivism that do not have their logical origin in representation. Massimi has developed an account of perspectivism along these lines. Although representation plays a much smaller role, models are still central.

i. Modality and Inconsistent Models

Inconsistent models are a motivation for perspectivism, but also a problem. Massimi deflates the problem they pose and argues for a perspectival interpretation (2018b) that is epistemic, but not based on representation in the way that Mitchell’s and Teller’s accounts do. The deflationary argument is this: critics of perspectivism charge that perspectivism has a weak commitment to realism because upon critical examination, perspectivism yields a version of metaphysical inconsistency if given a strong ontological reading, a version of dispositional realism if given a weaker reading (Chakravartty), or a version of instrumentalism (Morrison). Therefore, perspectivism is not a middle ground between realism and anti-realism. This criticism, Massimi argues, presumes that perspectivism should be understood as a position about representation (2018b, sections 3-4).

Her argument is that although models are about target systems, the aboutness does not stem from a mapping between elements of the model and elements of the target system. This is a key assumption underpinning representational accounts of perspectivism: there is a relation between parts of the model and selected features of the world and that relation is mapping or correspondence of some kind. Instead, the aboutness is associated with the modal knowledge we get from what she calls perspectival models (2018b, section 5).

To deflate the inconsistent modeling argument against perspectivism, it is helpful to understand how Massimi characterizes it. She suggests it is formed with two assumptions. One is the representationalist assumption (scientific models are epistemically valuable because they are used primarily to veridically represent a target system) and the other is the pluralist assumption (there is more than one model that represents the same target system) (2018b, pages 335-336). If we take these models to be veridical (and not just instrumental) then we have a problem for realism because it appears that a collection of models about the same target ascribe conflicting properties. Perspectivism was supposed to help with this issue, but as we saw from Morrison and Chakravartty, if perspectivism maintains the representationalist assumption, one seems forced to go down one of two roads. Either we need to interpret the models instrumentally to avoid inconsistently ascribing properties to a target system, or we need to endorse a very strange ontology whereby one target system can have incompatible properties (or we get dispositional realism). However, we are only forced into this choice if we commit to the representationalist assumption. Massimi argues we should do away with this assumption.

The representationalist assumption can be broken down into two, more specific commitments. One is that a model, in representing a target, offers a mapping that involves a correspondence between elements in the model and elements of the target system. It might be (indeed is likely or must be) the case that only a subset of elements have this mapping. This is consistent with thinking that models, through abstraction and idealization, are partial and selective representations of their targets.

The other commitment is that the target system is a state of affairs. We should understand these states of affairs as the ontological grounds for the success of a given model. According to this Armstrong-inspired picture, models are (approximately) true or false and what makes them true or false are states of affairs. States of affairs are composed of particulars and properties (Armstrong, 1993). Within this framework, a model is (approximately) true if the properties it ascribes to particulars are in fact properties of those particulars in the actual world. The appeal to approximately here is intended to indicate that a model may not ascribe to a particular all of the properties which it has, but if it is approximately true, then it must at least correctly ascribe a subset of those properties.

There are two problems with this picture of modeling, Massimi argues. The first is that the Armstrongian assumptions underlying representationalism are too strict and in being too strict, cannot account for falsehoods (Massimi, 2018b, pages 345–347). The second issue is that mapping is a poor criterion for distinguishing scientific from non-scientific models: too many things could count as scientific models that are just not scientific models (Massimi, 2018b, pages 347–348).

Toward building a positive account of perspectivism (2018b, section 5), Massimi argues we do away with the representationalist commitment: models do not give us knowledge by ascribing essential properties to particulars. Instead, models give us modal knowledge by allowing scientists to ascribe modal properties to particulars. She writes:

I clarify the sui generis representational nature of these perspectival models not as ‘mapping onto’ relevant partial—actual or fictional—states of affairs of the target system but instead as having a modal component. Perspectival models are still representational in that they have a representational content (i.e., they are about X). But their being about X is being about possibilities (2018b, pages 348-349).

This modal account of perspectivism does not do away with representation, but representation should not be understood as mapping, nor should it be understood as allowing for establishing truth via states of affairs. Instead, perspectivism indicates the knowledge we get from modeling is modal knowledge: knowledge about what is possible, impossible, and necessary. This knowledge applies to actual-world systems (hence there is a loose sense in which modal models are representational), but the notion of representation at play here is much weaker than accounts committed to representationalism.

Some open questions remain. What is this weaker notion of representation such that scientists can use models to make modal claims about the actual world? If this representation does not involve mapping states of affairs, what does it involve? We might also wonder what class of models this account covers. If it applies only to models that scientists use to eliminate possible explanations, then the scope is quite narrow. If it applies more generally to models that we might more intuitively think of as representation in the traditional sense (that is, as involving some kind of mapping), how do we characterize modal knowledge in such a way that the result of the analysis matches what scientists appear to be doing with their models? And finally, what kind of realism is perspectival realism?

ii. Perspectival Truth

Giere’s perspectival account took a deflationary stance, even anti-realist, stance toward truth. He argued that claims were true only within a perspective, that is, it makes no sense to ask whether a claim is true simpliciter. Instead, we can only assess the truth of a claim using the resources of specific models or families of models (2006, page 81). As we saw earlier, if one wants to develop a robust conception of perspectivism that has a realist bite, Giere’s account may feel unsatisfactory because it fails to endorse strong metaphysical commitments. Indeed, without metaphysical commitments, perspectivism may stray too close to instrumentalism. Massimi has attempted to develop a more robust conception of perspectival truth that avoids instrumentalist readings.

The main points of this more robust conception of truth within a perspectival account are articulated in “Four Kinds of Perspectival Truth” (Massimi, 2018a). Now the general aim of such an account is to avoid antirealism, especially its constructivist forms, but at the same time avoid reliance on a God’s-eye view for evaluating science, that is, the view that we can make inferences from success to truth as though we could evaluate science from a privileged epistemic position. To achieve this, Massimi defends the idea that scientific knowledge claims can be ontologically grounded while also perspective relative. Overcoming this apparent dichotomy rests on a distinction between the context of use and context of assessment, a distinction originally motivated by MacFarlane (2005) in the context of general epistemology but adapted for problems in the philosophy of science. This view is heavily motivated by the diachronic character of perspectivism but is also relevant for the synchronic character as well. Massimi says:

Each scientific perspective—I suggest—functions then both as a context of use (for its own knowledge claims) and as a context of assessments (for evaluating the ongoing performance-adequacy of knowledge claims of other scientific perspectives). Qua contexts of use, scientific perspectives lay out truth-conditions intended as standards of performance-adequacy for their own scientific knowledge claims. Qua contexts of assessments, scientific perspectives offer standpoints from which knowledge claims of other scientific perspectives can be evaluated. [emphasis in original] (Massimi, 2018a, pages 356-357).

Two crucial concepts in this passage are the context of use and context of assessment. The context of use is straightforward; it is the context in which knowledge claims are developed or used. In using the knowledge claims, scientists are not necessarily evaluating them. Evaluation is the task of the second context (context of assessment), which gives us the means for evaluating scientific claims, both the claims used in the current perspective as well as the claims of past or different perspectives. The evaluation requires standards of performance adequacy, which amount to the truth-conditions for the scientific claims under consideration. It is this element of truth, that is, truth evaluation, that is perspective-relative, but whether a claim is true is not relative to anything. Massimi argues that:==

Knowledge claims in science are perspective-dependent when their truth-conditions (understood as rules for determining truth-values based on features of the context of use) depend on the scientific perspective in which such claims are made. Yet such knowledge claims must also be assessable from the point of view of other (subsequent or rival) scientific perspectives (2018a, page 354).
The idea here is that how we determine the truth of a given knowledge claim is perspective sensitive, that is, the rules we use for determining truth-values are dependent upon the particular modeling practices in which those claims are evaluated. At the same time, whether those claims are actually true does not depend upon the rules, nor indeed any other features, of scientific practice. So the distinction amounts to a difference between how we come to recognize a claim as true and whether that claim is in fact true. The rules we can understand as standards of performance-adequacy (2018a, page 354), which are various. They can include the traditional epistemic values as Kuhn articulated them: values, for example, such as empirical adequacy, consistency, and fruitfulness (1977, chapter 13).

But how are we to establish whether a claim is true and not merely a claim that we have assessed as true? Addressing this issue is the caveat that knowledge claims must be the kinds of claims that can be assessed from other perspectives, mentioned in the quotation above. Now, this might appear to be the thesis that a knowledge claim that is considered true in two or more perspectives is more true than a knowledge claim that is considered true in just one perspective. The problem with this thesis is that it commits us to a view from nowhere and such a perspective-free position is not only impossible according to Massimi’s account, but it is also in general unclear how one could make true evaluations from such a position anyway because we have not specified what standards of assessment we should be using.

Instead, we should understand the standards of performance-adequacy as cross-perspectival and as such, a knowledge claim must satisfy them regardless of the perspective we are using. What counts as an instance of a given standard will vary. For example, what is counted as precise for Newton will not necessarily count as precise in 21st-century high energy physics; how scientists determine what is precise depends upon the experimental tools, theoretical constraints, the questions driving research, and other features of the scientific practice. Despite these deep differences, precision is still a standard that both Newton and contemporary physicists use to evaluate scientific claims.

It is important that these standards are not relative to perspectives. Otherwise, a given perspective would license its own truth and consequently place weak constraints on what claims count as true. Instead, when scientists advance a scientific claim, it is with the hope and expectation that it will satisfy epistemic standards not only as they are currently understood in that particular context, but in future contexts as well.

6. Ontological Commitments of Perspectivism

Most of the authors discussed so far, with the possible exception of Giere, try to keep perspectivism applied only to epistemic elements of science, that is, knowledge claims and how to assess them, but not their truth. By restricting perspectivism in this way, some who defend the position hope that robust metaphysical commitments can be possible, that is, not relative or dependent upon human activity or cognition. We saw this with Massimi’s conception of perspectival truth. This was not the case, however, with Giere, who attempted to recast realism such that the very idea of strong metaphysical commitments is not tenable. His account, in all but name, is not strongly realist, even though he did not endorse antirealism. There is, however, an argument that not only Giere’s account, but perspectivism more generally cannot avoid a form of antirealism: once the door is open to epistemic forms of perspectivism, ontological perspectivism is a possible or perhaps necessary consequence.

Chang argues (Chang, 2020) that perspectivism cannot be only applied to epistemic elements of science but must also include ontology. This pushes the view firmly away from traditional characterizations of realism. He likens a perspective to a conceptual framework and argues that 1) perspectives are typically incommensurable; 2) each perspective offers its own true account of a domain (2020, page 22):

Any phenomenon of nature that we can think or talk about at all is couched in concepts, and we choose from different conceptual frameworks (as C. I. Lewis emphasized), which are liable to be incommensurable with each other. If we take “perspective” to mean a conceptual framework in this sense, then we can see that ontology itself is perspectival.

Chang’s argument here is that the only access we have to the world is via concepts and there is a plurality of conceptual systems for describing the world (multiple perspectives). There is no trans-perspectival method for deciding amongst conceptual systems. The choice of perspective is pragmatic in that it depends upon the interests of the scientists. A consequence of this is that ontological claims can only be made from within a system, and it is only within that system that the claims are true or false. Ontology, therefore, depends upon perspective.

Note, however, that the perspectival metaphor is not, at this point, doing much work. Recall that part of the metaphorical workings involved the idea that our visual experience depends in part upon what the world is like and upon our visual system. Chang is either denying, using the metaphor, that visual experience depends upon what the world is like, or (more charitably) he is denying that we can give an account of what contributes to our visual experience that is independent of that experience. Either way, we cannot clearly distinguish between what the world is contributing to science and what human cognition and activity contributes. Any account of science, even those making use of a visual metaphor, will have to confront metaphysics.

We can also interpret Danks as giving a version of perspectivism that must confront scientific ontology. He argues that our concepts are shaped by the goals of those using them and in being shaped, those concepts structure human perception and language (Danks, 2020). Initially, this seems like an epistemic position that covers human cognition and how that cognition is shaped by goals.

However, it may not be a stable position interpreted epistemically because to remain purely epistemic, one would need a method for demarcating the ontology from the epistemology, but this seems to be impossible if human perception and cognition more generally are shaped in the way Danks suggests. How could we ever be in a position to judge how our concepts and perceptions deviate from reality? For specifically perceptual cases, which are the primary examples that Danks uses, scientists have instruments that can be used to evaluate human perception in specific experimental contexts: there is a tool independent of our perceptions that allows us to make claims about some of our perceptual concepts. The approach is quite specific. Can this strategy be employed more generally to human concepts or even scientific concepts? What would be the instruments we would use to evaluate such concepts?

7. Constructive Empiricism and Perspectivism

Massimi is not the only philosopher to use perspectivism as a way of distancing our understanding of science from strongly representationalist accounts, that is, accounts that treat scientific representations as mirroring, as isomorphisms, mimeses, or some other analysis that involves veridical mapping. Van Fraassen also uses the metaphor of perspective to do this (2008), although his account is directed toward representation in general and is not directly concerned with inconsistent models, realism, and some of the other problems motivating the rest of the perspectival literature.

He argues that instrumentation, as well as theorizing, are a form of representation (2008, see in particular chapters 6 and 7), but not mimetic representation, as he calls it (2008, page 3). Instead, the act of representing situates a measured object or theoretical model in a particular epistemic context. Scientific representations are therefore indexical because they show us what an object is like from within a particular perspective (or epistemic context; he uses these expressions interchangeably in many places).

Van Fraassen continually appeals to the visual as he develops his account of representation, both as a foil as well as an inspiration. He argues that pictorial images can lead us to think that representation is a mimetic relationship. This very persuasive idea received condemnation from Goodman and van Fraassen introduces it as well as Goodman’s critique of it at the very beginning of Scientific Representation (2008, page 13). The alternative, he argues, is that a representation is an artifact that people (such as scientists) use contexts to represent an object as something else (2008, page 21). His views resemble Giere’s in a few respects; van Fraassen appeals to use, context, and agents. There are also crucial differences. Van Fraassen includes the notion of representation as (for example, the representation of the atomic nucleus as a quantum object); his account is also much more detailed and is not so tightly designed to address modeling practice. Indeed, van Fraassen is concerned with representation in general and therefore expects his account to apply not just to science, but also to art, photography, and to other forms of representation.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David M (1993). “A world of states of affairs”. In: Philosophical Perspectives 7, pp. 429–440.
  • Brown, Matthew J (2009). “Models and perspectives on stage: remarks on Giere’s scientific perspectivism”. In: Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A 40.2, pp. 213–220.
  • Chakravartty, Anjan (2010). “Perspectivism, inconsistent models, and contrastive explanation”. In: Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A 41.4, pp. 405–412.
  • Chang, Hasok (2017a). “Is Pluralism Compatible with Scientific Realism?” In: The Routledge Handbook of Scientific Realism. Ed. by Juha Saatsi. London and New York: Routledge, pp. 176–186.
  • Chang, Hasok (2017b). “pragmatist coherence as the source of truth and reality”. In: Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 117.2, pp. 103–122. issn: 14679264. doi: 10.1093/arisoc/aox004.
  • Chang, Hasok (2020). “Pragmatism, perspectivism, and the historicity of science”. In: Understanding perspectivism. Taylor and Francis, pp. 10–27.
  • Chirimuuta, Mazviita (2016). “Vision, perspectivism, and haptic realism”. In: Philosophy of Science 83.5, pp. 746–756.
  • Cretu, A (2020). “Perspectival realism”. In: Encyclopedia of Educational Philosophy and Theory. Springer, Singapore.
  • Danks, David (2020). “Safe-and-Substantive Perspectivism”. In: Understanding Perspectivism. New York: Taylor and Francis, pp. 127–140.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (2001). Conquest of abundance: A tale of abstraction versus the richness of being. University of Chicago Press.
  • Giere, Ronald N (2006). Scientific Perspectivism. University of Chicago Press.
  • Giere, Ronald N (2009). “Scientific perspectivism: behind the stage door”. In: Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A 40.2, pp. 221–223.
  • Giere, Ronald N (2010). “An agent-based conception of models and scientific representation”. In: Synthese 172.2, p. 269.
  • Giere, Ronald N (2013). “Kuhn as perspectival realist”. In: Topoi 32.1, pp. 53–57.
  • Giere, Ronald N (2016). “Feyerabend’s perspectivism”. In: Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A 57, pp. 137–141. issn: 18792510. doi: 10.1016/j.shpsa.2015.11.008.
  • Hacking, Ian (2002). “Historical Ontology”. In: In the Scope of Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science: Volume Two of the 11th International Congress of Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science, Cracow, August 1999. Ed. by Peter Gärdenfors, Jan Woleński, and Katarzyna Kijania-Placek. Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, pp. 583–600. isbn: 978-94-017-0475-5. doi: 10.1007/978-94-017-0475-5_13. url:
  • Hoyningen-Huene, Paul (1993). Reconstructing scientific revolutions: Thomas S. Kuhn’s philosophy of science. University of Chicago Press.
  • Kuhn, Thomas S (1962). The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kuhn, Thomas S (1977). The essential tension selected studies in scientific tradition and change. Chicago, Ill. ; London: University of Chicago Press. isbn: 022621723x.
  • Kuhn, Thomas S  (1990). “The Road Since Structure”. In: Biennial Meeting of the PH\hilosophy of Science Association 1990, pp. 3–13.
  • Longino, Helen E (2013). Studying human behavior: How scientists investigate aggression and sexuality. University of Chicago Press.
  • MacFarlane, John (2005). “xiv*—making sense of relative truth”. In: Proceedings of the aristotelian society (hardback). Vol. 105. 1. Wiley Online Library, pp. 305–323.
  • Massimi, Michela (2012). “Scientific Perspectivism and its Foes”. In: Philosophica 84, pp. 25–52.
  • Massimi, Michela (2014). “Natural Kinds and Naturalised Kantianism”. In: Nous 48.3, pp. 416–449.
  • Massimi, Michela (2015). “Walking the line: Kuhn between realism and relativism”. In: Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions-50 Years On. Ed. by William J. Devlin and Alisa Bokulich. Springer, pp. 135–152.
  • Massimi, Michela (2018a). “Four kinds of perspectival truth”. In: Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 96.2, pp. 342–359.
  • Massimi, Michela (2018b). “Perspectival modeling”. In: Philosophy of Science 85.3, pp. 335–359. issn: 00318248. doi: 10.1086/697745. url:
  • Mitchell, Sandra D (1992). “On pluralism and competition in evolutionary explanations”. In: American Zoologist 32.1, pp. 135–144.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D (2002). “Integrative pluralism”. In: Biology and Philosophy 17.1, pp. 55–70.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D (2003). Biological complexity and integrative pluralism. Cambridge University Press.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D (2009). Unsimple truths: Science, complexity, and policy. University of Chicago Press.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D (2020). “Understanding Perspectivism: Scientific Challenges and Methodological Prospects”. In: ed. by Michela Massimi and Casey D McCoy. Taylor and Francis, pp. 178–193.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D and Angela M Gronenborn (2017). “After Fifty Years, Why Are Protein X-ray Crystallographers Still in Business?” In: The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 68.3, pp. 703–723.
  • Morrison, Margaret (2011). “One phenomenon, many models: Inconsistency and complementarity”. In: Studies In History and Philosophy of Science Part A 42.2, pp. 342–351.
  • Morrison, Margaret (2015). Reconstructing Reality: Models, Mathematics, and Simulations. Oxford University Press.
  • Psillos, Stathis (1999). Scientific realism: How Science Tracks Truth. London and New York: Routledge.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1981). Reason, Truth and History. First. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. ISBN: 0-521-23035-7.
  • Rueger, Alexander (2005). “Perspectival models and theory unification”. In: The British journal for the philosophy of science 56.3, pp. 579–594.
  • Rueger, Alexander (2020). “Some perspective on perspectivism”. In: Metascience 29.2, pp. 193–196. issn: 1467-9981. doi: 10.1007/s11016-020-00501-7. url:
  • Saatsi, Juha (Nov. 2017). The Routledge Handbook of Scientific Realism. Ed. by Juha Saatsi. New York: Routledge, 2017. | Series: Routledge handbooks in philosophy: Routledge. isbn: 9780203712498. doi: 10.4324/9780203712498. url:
  • Teller, Paul (2020). “What is Perspectivism, and does it count as realism?” In: Understanding perspectivism. Ed. by Michela Massimi and Casey D McCoy. New York: Taylor and Francis, pp. 49–64.
  • van Fraassen, Bas (2008). Scientific Representation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Weisberg, Michael (2007). “Who is a Modeler?” In: The British journal for the philosophy of science 58.2, pp. 207–233.
  • Weisberg, Michael (2012). Simulation and similarity: Using models to understand the world. Oxford University Press.


Author Information

Franklin Jacoby
Dartmouth College
U. S. A.