Plotinus (204—270 C.E.)
Plotinus is considered to be the founder of Neoplatonism. Taking his lead from his reading of Plato, Plotinus developed a complex spiritual cosmology involving three foundational elements: the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul. It is from the productive unity of these three Beings that all existence emanates, according to Plotinus. The principal of emanation is not simply causal, but also contemplative. In his system, Plotinus raises intellectual contemplation to the status of a productive principle; and it is by virtue of contemplation that all existents are said to be united as a single, all-pervasive reality. In this sense, Plotinus is not a strict pantheist, yet his system does not permit the notion of creatio ex nihilo (creation out of nothingness). In addition to his cosmology, Plotinus also developed a unique theory of sense-perception and knowledge, based on the idea that the mind plays an active role in shaping or ordering the objects of its perception, rather than passively receiving the data of sense experience (in this sense, Plotinus may be said to have anticipated the phenomenological theories of Husserl). Plotinus’ doctrine that the soul is composed of a higher and a lower part — the higher part being unchangeable and divine (and aloof from the lower part, yet providing the lower part with life), while the lower part is the seat of the personality (and hence the passions and vices) — led him to neglect an ethics of the individual human being in favor of a mystical or soteric doctrine of the soul’s ascent to union with its higher part. The philosophy of Plotinus is represented in the complete collection of his treatises, collected and edited by his student Porphyry into six books of nine treatises each. For this reason they have come down to us under the title of the Enneads.
Table of Contents
- Life and Work
- Metaphysics and Cosmology
- Psychology and Epistemology
- References and Further Reading
Plotinus was born in 204 C.E. in Egypt, the exact location of which is unknown. In his mid-twenties Plotinus gravitated to Alexandria, where he attended the lectures of various philosophers, not finding satisfaction with any until he discovered the teacher Ammonius Saccas. He remained with Ammonius until 242, at which time he joined up with the Emperor Gordian on an expedition to Persia, for the purpose, it seems, of engaging the famed philosophers of that country in the pursuit of wisdom. The expedition never met its destination, for the Emperor was assassinated in Mesopotamia, and Plotinus returned to Rome to set up a school of philosophy. By this time, Plotinus had reached his fortieth year. He taught in Rome for twenty years before the arrival of Porphyry, who was destined to become his most famous pupil, as well as his biographer and editor. It was at this time that Plotinus, urged by Porphyry, began to collect his treatises into systematic form, and to compose new ones. These treatises were most likely composed from the material gathered from Plotinus’ lectures and debates with his students. The students and attendants of Plotinus’ lectures must have varied greatly in philosophical outlook and doctrine, for the Enneads are filled with refutations and corrections of the positions of Peripatetics, Stoics, Epicureans, Gnostics, and Astrologers. Although Plotinus appealed to Plato as the ultimate authority on all things philosophical, he was known to have criticized the master himself (cf. Ennead IV.8.1). We should not make the mistake of interpreting Plotinus as nothing more than a commentator on Plato, albeit a brilliant one. He was an original and profound thinker in his own right, who borrowed and re-worked all that he found useful from earlier thinkers, and even from his opponents, in order to construct the grand dialectical system presented (although in not quite systematic form) in his treatises. The great thinker died in solitude at Campania in 270 C.E.
The Enneads are the complete treatises of Plotinus, edited by his student, Porphyry. Plotinus wrote these treatises in a crabbed and difficult Greek, and his failing eyesight rendered his penmanship oftentimes barely intelligible. We owe a great debt to Porphyry, for persisting in the patient and careful preservation of these writings. Porphyry divided the treatises of his master into six books of nine treatises each, sometimes arbitrarily dividing a longer work into several separate works in order to fulfill his numerical plan. The standard citation of the Enneads follows Porphyry’s division into book, treatise, and chapter. Hence ‘IV.8.1’ refers to book (or Ennead) four, treatise eight, chapter one.
Plotinus is not a metaphysical thinker in the strict sense of the term. He is often referred to as a ‘mystical’ thinker, but even this designation fails to express the philosophical rigor of his thought. Jacques Derrida has remarked that the system of Plotinus represents the “closure of metaphysics” as well as the “transgression” of metaphysical thought itself (1973: p. 128 note). The cause for such a remark is that, in order to maintain the strict unity of his cosmology (which must be understood in the ‘spiritual’ or noetic sense, in addition to the traditional physical sense of ‘cosmos’) Plotinus emphasizes the displacement or deferral of presence, refusing to locate either the beginning (arkhe) or the end (telos) of existents at any determinate point in the ‘chain of emanations’ — the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul — that is the expression of his cosmological theory; for to predicate presence of his highest principle would imply, for Plotinus, that this principle is but another being among beings, even if it is superior to all beings by virtue of its status as their ‘begetter’. Plotinus demands that the highest principle or existent be supremely self-sufficient, disinterested, impassive, etc. However, this highest principle must still, somehow, have a part in the generation of the Cosmos. It is this tension between Plotinus’ somewhat religious demand that pure unity and self-presence be the highest form of existence in his cosmology, and the philosophical necessity of accounting for the multiplicity among existents, that animates and lends an excessive complexity and determined rigor to his thought.
Since Being and Life itself, for Plotinus, is characterized by a dialectical return to origins, a process of overcoming the ‘strictures’ of multiplicity, a theory of the primacy of contemplation (theoria) over against any traditional theories of physically causal beginnings, like what is found in the Pre-Socratic thinkers, and especially in Aristotle‘s notion of the ‘prime mover,’ becomes necessary. Plotinus proceeds by setting himself in opposition to these earlier thinkers, and comes to align himself, more or less, with the thought of Plato. However, Plotinus employs allegory in his interpretation of Plato’s Dialogues; and this leads him to a highly personal reading of the creation myth in the Timaeus (27c ff.), which serves to bolster his often excessively introspective philosophizing. Plotinus maintains that the power of the Demiurge (‘craftsman’ of the cosmos), in Plato’s myth, is derived not from any inherent creative capacity, but rather from the power of contemplation, and the creative insight it provides (see Enneads IV.8.1-2; III.8.7-8). According to Plotinus, the Demiurge does not actually create anything; what he does is govern the purely passive nature of matter, which is pure passivity itself, by imposing a sensible form (an image of the intelligible forms contained as thoughts within the mind of the Demiurge) upon it. The form (eidos) which is the arkhe or generative or productive principle of all beings, establishes its presence in the physical or sensible realm not through any act, but by virtue of the expressive contemplation of the Demiurge, who is to be identified with the Intelligence or Mind (Nous) in Plotinus’ system. Yet this Intelligence cannot be referred to as the primordial source of all existents (although it does hold the place, in Plotinus’ cosmology, of first principle), for it, itself, subsists only insofar as it contemplates a prior — this supreme prior is, according to Plotinus, the One, which is neither being nor essence, but the source, or rather, the possibility of all existence (see Ennead V.2.1). In this capacity, the One is not even a beginning, nor even an end, for it is simply the disinterested orientational ‘stanchion’ that permits all beings to recognize themselves as somehow other than a supreme ‘I’. Indeed, for Plotinus, the Soul is the ‘We’ (Ennead I.1.7), that is, the separated yet communicable likeness (homoiotai) of existents to the Mind or Intelligence that contemplates the One. This highest level of contemplation — the Intelligence contemplating the One — gives birth to the forms (eide), which serve as the referential, contemplative basis of all further existents. The simultaneous inexhaustibility of the One as a generative power, coupled with its elusive and disinterested transcendence, makes the positing of any determinate source or point of origin of existence, in the context of Plotinus’ thought, impossible. So the transgression of metaphysical thought, in Plotinus’ system, owes its achievement to his grand concept of the One.
The ‘concept’ of the One is not, properly speaking, a concept at all, since it is never explicitly defined by Plotinus, yet it is nevertheless the foundation and grandest expression of his philosophy. Plotinus does make it clear that no words can do justice to the power of the One; even the name, ‘the One,’ is inadequate, for naming already implies discursive knowledge, and since discursive knowledge divides or separates its objects in order to make them intelligible, the One cannot be known through the process of discursive reasoning (Ennead VI.9.4). Knowledge of the One is achieved through the experience of its ‘power’ (dunamis) and its nature, which is to provide a ‘foundation’ (arkhe) and location (topos) for all existents (VI.9.6). The ‘power’ of the One is not a power in the sense of physical or even mental action; the power of the One, as Plotinus speaks of it, is to be understood as the only adequate description of the ‘manifestation’ of a supreme principle that, by its very nature, transcends all predication and discursive understanding. This ‘power,’ then, is capable of being experienced, or known, only through contemplation (theoria), or the purely intellectual ‘vision’ of the source of all things. The One transcends all beings, and is not itself a being, precisely because all beings owe their existence and subsistence to their eternal contemplation of the dynamic manifestation(s) of the One. The One can be said to be the ‘source’ of all existents only insofar as every existent naturally and (therefore) imperfectly contemplates the various aspects of the One, as they are extended throughout the cosmos, in the form of either sensible or intelligible objects or existents. The perfect contemplation of the One, however, must not be understood as a return to a primal source; for the One is not, strictly speaking, a source or a cause, but rather the eternally present possibility — or active making-possible — of all existence, of Being (V.2.1). According to Plotinus, the unmediated vision of the ‘generative power’ of the One, to which existents are led by the Intelligence (V.9.2), results in an ecstatic dance of inspiration, not in a satiated torpor (VI.9.8); for it is the nature of the One to impart fecundity to existents — that is to say: the One, in its regal, indifferent capacity as undiminishable potentiality of Being, permits both rapt contemplation and ecstatic, creative extension. These twin poles, this ‘stanchion,’ is the manifested framework of existence which the One produces, effortlessly (V.1.6). The One, itself, is best understood as the center about which the ‘stanchion,’ the framework of the cosmos, is erected (VI.9.8). This ‘stanchion’ or framework is the result of the contemplative activity of the Intelligence.
The One cannot, strictly speaking, be referred to as a source or a cause, since these terms imply movement or activity, and the One, being totally self-sufficient, has no need of acting in a creative capacity (VI.9.8). Yet Plotinus still maintains that the One somehow ’emanates’ or ‘radiates’ existents. This is accomplished because the One effortlessly “‘overflows’ and its excess begets an other than itself” (V.2.1, tr. O’Brien 1964) — this ‘other’ is the Intelligence (Nous), the source of the realm of multiplicity, of Being. However, the question immediately arises as to why the One, being so perfect and self-sufficient, should have any need or even any ‘ability’ to emanate or generate anything other than itself. In attempting to answer this question, Plotinus finds it necessary to appeal, not to reason, but to the non-discursive, intuitive faculty of the soul; this he does by calling for a sort of prayer, an invocation of the deity, that will permit the soul to lift itself up to the unmediated, direct, and intimate contemplation of that which exceeds it (V.1.6). When the soul is thus prepared for the acceptance of the revelation of the One, a very simple truth manifests itself: that what, from our vantage-point, may appear as an act of emanation on the part of the One, is really the effect, the necessary life-giving supplement, of the disinterested self-sufficiency that both belongs to and is the One. “In turning toward itself The One sees. It is this seeing that constitutes The Intelligence” (V.1.7, tr. O’Brien). Therefore, since the One accomplishes the generation or emanation of multiplicity, or Being, by simply persisting in its state of eternal self-presence and impassivity, it cannot be properly called a ‘first principle,’ since it is at once beyond number, and that which makes possible all number or order (cf. V.1.5).
Since the One is self-sufficient, isolated by virtue of its pure self-presence, and completely impassive, it cannot properly be referred to as an ‘object’ of contemplation — not even for the Intelligence. What the Intelligence contemplates is not, properly speaking, the One Itself, but rather the generative power that emanates, effortlessly, from the One, which is beyond all Being and Essence (epikeina tes ousias) (cf. V.2.1). It has been stated above that the One cannot properly be referred to as a first principle, since it has no need to divide itself or produce a multiplicity in any manner whatsoever, since the One is purely self-contained. This leads Plotinus to posit a secondary existent or emanation of the One, the Intelligence or Mind (Nous) which is the result of the One’s direct ‘vision’ of itself (V.1.7). This allows Plotinus to maintain, within his cosmological schema, a power of pure unity or presence — the One — that is nevertheless never purely present, except as a trace in the form of the power it manifests, which is known through contemplation. Pure power and self-presence, for Plotinus, cannot reside in a being capable of generative action, for it is a main tenet of Plotinus’ system that the truly perfect existent cannot create or generate anything, since this would imply a lack on the part of that existent. Therefore, in order to account for the generation of the cosmos, Plotinus had to locate his first principle at some indeterminate point outside of the One and yet firmly united with it; this first principle, of course, is the Intelligence, which contains both unity and multiplicity, identity and difference — in other words, a self-presence that is capable of being divided into manifestable and productive forms or ‘intelligences’ (logoi spermatikoi) without, thereby, losing its unity. The reason that the Intelligence, which is the truly productive ‘first principle’ (proton arkhon) in Plotinus’ system, can generate existents and yet remain fully present to itself and at rest, is because the self-presence and nature of the Intelligence is derived from the One, which gives of itself infinitely, and without diminishing itself in any way. Furthermore, since every being or existent within Plotinus’ Cosmos owes its nature as existent to a power that is prior to it, and which it contemplates, every existent owes its being to that which stands over it, in the capacity of life-giving power. Keeping this in mind, it is difficult, if not impossible, to speak of presence in the context of Plotinus’ philosophy; rather, we must speak of varying degrees or grades of contemplation, all of which refer back to the pure trace of infinite power that is the One.
The Intelligence (Nous) is the true first principle — the determinate, referential ‘foundation’ (arkhe) — of all existents; for it is not a self-sufficient entity like the One, but rather possesses the ability or capacity to contemplate both the One, as its prior, as well as its own thoughts, which Plotinus identifies with the Platonic Ideas or Forms (eide). The purpose or act of the Intelligence is twofold: to contemplate the ‘power’ (dunamis) of the One, which the Intelligence recognizes as its source, and to meditate upon the thoughts that are eternally present to it, and which constitute its very being. The Intelligence is distinct from the One insofar as its act is not strictly its own (or an expression of self-sufficiency as the ‘act’ of self-reflection is for the One) but rather results in the principle of order and relation that is Being — for the Intelligence and Being are identical (V.9.8). The Intelligence may be understood as the storehouse of potential being(s), but only if every potential being is also recognized as an eternal and unchangeable thought in the Divine Mind (Nous). As Plotinus maintains, the Intelligence is an independent existent, requiring nothing outside of itself for subsistence; invoking Parmenides, Plotinus states that “to think and to be are one and the same” (V.9.5; Parmenides, fragment 3). The being of the Intelligence is its thought, and the thought of the Intelligence is Being. It is no accident that Plotinus also refers to the Intelligence as God (theos) or the Demiurge (I.1.8), for the Intelligence, by virtue of its primal duality — contemplating both the One and its own thought — is capable of acting as a determinate source and point of contemplative reference for all beings. In this sense, the Intelligence may be said to produce creative or constitutive action, which is the provenance of the Soul.
Since the purpose or act of the Intelligence is twofold (as described above), that which comprises the being or essence of the Intelligence must be of a similar nature. That which the Intelligence contemplates, and by virtue of which it maintains its existence, is the One in the capacity of overflowing power or impassive source. This power or effortless expression of the One, which is, in the strictest sense, the Intelligence itself, is manifested as a coherency of thoughts or perfect intellectual objects that the Intelligence contemplates eternally and fully, and by virtue of which it persists in Being — these are the Ideas (eide). The Ideas reside in the Intelligence as objects of contemplation. Plotinus states that: “No Idea is different from The Intelligence but is itself an intelligence” (V.9.8, tr. O’Brien). Without in any way impairing the unity of his concept of the Intelligence, Plotinus is able to locate both permanence and eternality, and the necessary fecundity of Being, at the level of Divinity. He accomplishes this by introducing the notion that the self-identity of each Idea, its indistinguishability from Intelligence itself, makes of each Idea at once a pure and complete existent, as well as a potentiality or ‘seed’ capable of further extending itself into actualization as an entity distinct from the Intelligence (cf. V.9.14). Borrowing the Stoic term logos spermatikos or ‘seminal reason,’ Plotinus elaborates his theory that every determinate existent is produced or generated through the contemplation by its prior of a higher source, as we have seen that the One, in viewing itself, produces the Intelligence; and so, through the contemplation of the One via the Ideas, the Intelligence produces the logoi spermatikoi (‘seminal reasons’) that will serve as the productive power or essence of the Soul, which is the active or generative principle within Being (cf. V.9.6-7).
Being, for Plotinus, is not some abstract, amorphous pseudo-concept that is somehow pre-supposed by all thinking. In the context of Plotinus’ cosmological schema, Being is given a determined and prominent place, even if it is not given, explicitly, a definition; though he does relate it to the One, by saying that the One is not Being, but “being’s begetter” (V.2.1). Although Being does not, for Plotinus, pre-suppose thought, it does pre-suppose and make possible all ‘re-active’ or causal generation. Being is necessarily fecund — that is to say, it generates or actualizes all beings, insofar as all beings are contained, as potentialities, in the ‘rational seeds’ which are the results of the thought or contemplation of the Intelligence. Being differentiates the unified thought of the Intelligence — that is, makes it repeatable and meaningful for those existents which must proceed from the Intelligence as the Intelligence proceeds from the One. Being is the principle of relation and distinguishability amongst the Ideas, or rather, it is that rational principle which makes them logoi spermatikoi. However, Being is not simply the productive capacity of Difference; it is also the source of independence and self-sameness of all existents proceeding from the Intelligence; the productive unity accomplished through the rational or dialectical synthesis of the Dyad — of the Same (tauton) and the Different (heteron) (cf. V.1.4-5). We may best understand Being, in the context of Plotinus’ thought, by saying that it differentiates and makes indeterminate the Ideas belonging to the Intelligence, only in order to return these divided or differentiated ideas, now logoi spermatikoi, to Sameness or Unity. It is the process of returning the divided and differentiated ideas to their original place in the chain of emanation that constitutes Life or temporal existence. The existence thus produced by or through Being, and called Life, is a mode of intellectual existence characterized by discursive thought, or that manner of thinking which divides the objects of thought in order to categorize them and make them knowable through the relational process of categorization or ‘orderly differentiation’. The existents that owe their life to the process of Being are capable of knowing individual existents only as they relate to one another, and not as they relate to themselves (in the capacity of ‘self-sameness’). This is discursive knowledge, and is an imperfect image of the pure knowledge of the Intelligence, which knows all beings in their essence or ‘self-sameness’ — that is, as they are purely present to the Mind, without the articulative mediation of Difference.
The power of the One, as explained above, is to provide a foundation (arkhe) and location (topos) for all existents (VI.9.6). The foundation provided by the One is the Intelligence. The location in which the cosmos takes objective shape and determinate, physical form, is the Soul (cf. IV.3.9). Since the Intelligence, through its contemplation of the One and reflection on its own contents, the Ideas (eide), is both one and many, the Soul is both contemplative and active: it contemplates the Intelligence, its prior in the ‘chain of existents,’ and also extends itself, through acting upon or actualizing its own thoughts (the logoi spermatikoi), into the darkness or indeterminacy of multiplicity or Difference (which is to be identified in this sense with Matter); and by so doing, the Soul comes to generate a separate, material cosmos that is the living image of the spiritual or noetic Cosmos contained as a unified thought within the Intelligence (cp. Plato, Timaeus 37d). The Soul, like the Intelligence, is a unified existent, in spite of its dual capacity as contemplator and actor. The purely contemplative part of the Soul, which remains in constant contact with the Intelligence, is referred to by Plotinus as the ‘higher part’ of the Soul, while that part which actively descends into the changeable (or sensible) realm in order to govern and directly craft the Cosmos, is the ‘lower part,’ which assumes a state of division as it enters, out of necessity, material bodies. It is at the level of the Soul that the drama of existence unfolds; the Soul, through coming into contact with its inferior, that is, matter or pure passivity, is temporarily corrupted, and forgets the fact that it is one of the Intelligibles, owing its existence to the Intelligence, as its prior, and ultimately, to the power of the One. It may be said that the Soul is the ‘shepherd’ or ‘cultivator’ of the logoi spermatikoi, insofar as the Soul’s task is to conduct the differentiated ideas from the state of fecund multiplicity that is Being, through the drama of Life, and at last, to return these ideas to their primal state or divine status as thoughts within the Intelligence. Plotinus, holding to his principle that one cannot act without being affected by that which one acts upon, declares that the Soul, in its lower part, undergoes the drama of existence, suffers, forgets, falls into vice, etc., while the higher part remains unaffected, and persists in governing, without flaw, the Cosmos, while ensuring that all individual, embodied souls return, eventually, to their divine and true state within the Intelligible Realm. Moreover, since every embodied soul forgets, to some extent, its origin in the Divine Realm, the drama of return consists of three distinct steps: the cultivation of Virtue, which reminds the soul of the divine Beauty; the practice of Dialectic, which instructs or informs the soul concerning its priors and the true nature of existence; and finally, Contemplation, which is the proper act and mode of existence of the soul.
The Soul, in its highest part, remains essentially and eternally a being in the Divine, Intelligible Realm. Yet the lower (or active), governing part of the Soul, while remaining, in its essence, a divine being and identical to the Highest Soul, nevertheless, through its act, falls into forgetfulness of its prior, and comes to attach itself to the phenomena of the realm of change, that is, of Matter. This level at which the Soul becomes fragmented into individual, embodied souls, is Nature (phusis). Since the purpose of the soul is to maintain order in the material realm, and since the essence of the soul is one with the Highest Soul, there will necessarily persist in the material realm a type of order (doxa) that is a pale reflection of the Order (logos) persisting in the Intelligible Realm. It is this secondary or derived order (doxa) that gives rise to what Plotinus calls the “civic virtues” (aretas politikas) (I.2.1). The “civic virtues” may also be called the ‘natural virtues’ (aretas phusikas) (I.3.6), since they are attainable and recognizable by reflection upon human nature, without any explicit reference to the Divine. These ‘lesser’ virtues are possible, and attainable, even by the soul that has forgotten its origin within the Divine, for they are merely the result of the imitation of virtuous men — that is, the imitation of the Nature of the Divine Soul, as it is actualized in living existents, yet not realizing that it is such. There is nothing wrong, Plotinus tells us, with imitating noble men, but only if this imitation is understood for what it is: a preparation for the attainment of the true Virtue that is “likeness to God as far as possible” (cf. I.1.2; and Plato, Theaetetus 176b). Plotinus makes it clear that the one who possesses the civic virtues does not necessarily possess the Divine Virtue, but the one who possesses the latter will necessarily possess the former (I.2.7). Those who imitate virtuous men, for example, the heroes of old, like Achilles, and take pride in this virtue, run the risk of mistaking the merely human for the Divine, and therefore committing the sin of hubris. Furthermore, the one who mistakes the human for the Divine virtue remains firmly fixed in the realm of opinion (doxa), and is unable to rise to true knowledge of the Intelligible Realm, which is also knowledge of one’s true self. The exercise of the civic virtues makes one just, courageous, well-tempered, etc. — that is, the civic virtues result in sophrosune, or a well-ordered and cultivated mind. It is easy to see, however, that this virtue is simply the ability to remain, to an extent, unaffected by the negative intrusions upon the soul of the affections of material existence. The highest Virtue consists, on the other hand, not in a rearguard defense, as it were, against the attack of violent emotions and disruptive desires, but rather in a positively active and engaged effort to regain one’s forgotten divinity (I.2.6). The highest virtue, then, is the preparation for the exercise of Dialectic, which is the tool of divine ordering wielded by the individual soul.
Dialectic is the tool wielded by the individual soul as it seeks to attain the unifying knowledge of the Divinity; but dialectic is not, for that matter, simply a tool. It is also the most valuable part of philosophy (I.3.5), for it places all things in an intelligible order, by and through which they may be known as they are, without the contaminating diversity characteristic of the sensible realm, which is the result of the necessary manifestation of discursive knowledge — language. We may best understand dialectic, as Plotinus conceives it, as the process of gradual extraction, from the ordered multiplicity of language, of a unifying principle conducive to contemplation. The soul accomplishes this by alternating “between synthesis and analysis until it has gone through the entire domain of the intelligible and has arrived at the principle” (I.3.4, tr. O’Brien). This is to say, on the one hand, that dialectic dissolves the tension of differentiation that makes each existent a separate entity, and therefore something existing apart from the Intelligence; and, on the other hand, that dialectic is the final flourish of discursive reasoning, which, by ‘analyzing the synthesis,’ comes to a full realization of itself as the principle of order among all that exists — that is, a recognition of the essential unity of the Soul (cf. IV.1). The individual soul accomplishes this ultimate act by placing itself in the space of thinking that is “beyond being” (epekeina tou ontos) (I.3.5). At this point, the soul is truly capable of living a life as a being that is “at one and the same time … debtor to what is above and … benefactor to what is below” (IV.8.7, tr. O’Brien). This the soul accomplishes through the purely intellectual ‘act’ of Contemplation.
Once the individual soul has, through its own act of will — externalized through dialectic — freed itself from the influence of Being, and has arrived at a knowledge of itself as the ordering principle of the cosmos, it has united its act and its thought in one supreme ordering principle (logos) which derives its power from Contemplation (theoria). In one sense, contemplation is simply a vision of the things that are — a viewing of existence. However, for Plotinus, contemplation is the single ‘thread’ uniting all existents, for contemplation, on the part of any given individual existent, is at the same time knowledge of self, of subordinate, and of prior. Contemplation is the ‘power’ uniting the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul in a single all-productive intellectual force to which all existents owe their life. ‘Vision’ (theoria), for Plotinus, whether intellectual or physical, implies not simply possession of the viewed object in or by the mind, but also an empowerment, given by the object of vision to the one who has viewed it. Therefore, through the ‘act’ of contemplation the soul becomes capable of simultaneously knowing its prior (the source of its power, the Intelligence) and, of course, of ordering or imparting life to that which falls below the soul in the order of existence. The extent to which Plotinus identifies contemplation with a creative or vivifying act is expressed most forcefully in his comment that: “since the supreme realities devote themselves to contemplation, all other beings must aspire to it, too, because the origin of all things is their end as well” (III.8.7, tr. O’Brien). This means that even brute action is a form of contemplation, for even the most vulgar or base act has, at its base and as its cause, the impulse to contemplate the greater. Since Plotinus recognizes no strict principle of cause and effect in his cosmology, he is forced, as it were, to posit a strictly intellectual process — contemplation — as a force capable of producing the necessary tension amongst beings in order for there to be at once a sort of hierarchy and, also, a unity within the cosmos. The tension, of course, is always between knower and known, and manifests itself in the form of a ‘fall’ that is also a forgetting of source, which requires remedy. The remedy is, as we have seen, the exercise of virtue and dialectic (also, see above). For once the soul has walked the ways of discursive knowledge, and accomplished, via dialectic, the necessary unification, it (the soul) becomes the sole principle of order within the realm of changeable entities, and, through the fragile synthesis of differentiation and unity accomplished by dialectic, and actualized in contemplation, holds the cosmos together in a bond of purely intellectual dependence, as of thinker to thought. The tension that makes all of this possible is the simple presence of the pure passivity that is Matter.
Matter, for Plotinus, may be understood as an eternally receptive substratum (hupokeimenon), in and by which all determinate existents receive their form (cf. II.4.4). Since Matter is completely passive, it is capable of receiving any and all forms, and is therefore the principle of differentiation among existents. According to Plotinus, there are two types of Matter — the intelligible and the sensible. The intelligible type is identified as the palette upon which the various colors and hues of intelligible Being are made visible or presented, while the sensible type is the ‘space of the possible,’ the excessively fecund ‘darkness’ or depth of indeterminacy into which the soul shines its vivifying light. Matter, then, is the ground or fundament of Being, insofar as the entities within the Intelligence (the logoi spermatikoi) depend upon this defining or delimiting principle for their articulation or actualization into determinate and independent intelligences; and even in the sensible realm, where the soul achieves its ultimate end in the ‘exhaustion’ that is brute activity — the final and lowest form of contemplation (cf. III.8.2) — Matter is that which receives and, in a passive sense, ‘gives form to’ the act. Since every existent, as Plotinus tells us, must produce another, in a succession of dependence and derivation (IV.8.6) which finally ends, simultaneously, in the passivity and formlessness of Matter, and the desperation of the physical act, as opposed to purely intellectual contemplation (although, it must be noted, even brute activity is a form of contemplation, as described above), Matter, and the result of its reception of action, is not inherently evil, but is only so in relation to the soul, and the extent to which the soul becomes bound to Matter through its act (I.8.14). Plotinus also maintains, in keeping with Platonic doctrine, that any sensible thing is an image of its true and eternal counterpart in the Intelligible Realm. Therefore, the sensible matter in the cosmos is but an image of the purely intellectual Matter existing or persisting, as noetic substratum, within the Intelligence (nous). Since this is the case, the confusion into which the soul is thrown by its contact with pure passivity is not eternal or irremediable, but rather a necessary and final step in the drama of Life, for once the soul has experienced the ‘chaotic passivity’ of material existence, it will yearn ever more intensely for union with its prior, and the pure contemplation that constitutes its true existence (IV.8.5).
The Soul’s act, as we have seen (above), is dual — it both contemplates its prior, and acts, in a generative or, more properly, a governing capacity. For the soul that remains in contact with its prior, that is, with the highest part of the Soul, the ordering of material existence is accomplished through an effortless governing of indeterminacy, which Plotinus likens to a light shining into and illuminating a dark space (cf. I.8.14); however, for the soul that becomes sundered, through forgetfulness, from its prior, there is no longer an ordering act, but a generative or productive act — this is the beginning of physical existence, which Plotinus recognizes as nothing more than a misplaced desire for the Good (cf. III.5.1). The soul that finds its fulfillment in physical generation is the soul that has lost its power to govern its inferior while remaining in touch with the source of its power, through the act of contemplation. But that is not all: the soul that seeks its end in the means of generation and production is also the soul that becomes affected by what it has produced — this is the source of unhappiness, of hatred, indeed, of Evil (kakon). For when the soul is devoid of any referential or orientational source — any claim to rulership over matter — it becomes the slave to that over which it should rule, by divine right, as it were. And since Matter is pure impassivity, the depth or darkness capable of receiving all form and of being illuminated by the light of the soul, of reason (logos), when the soul comes under the sway of Matter, through its tragic forgetting of its source, it becomes like this substratum — it is affected by any and every emotion or event that comes its way, and all but loses its divinity. Evil, then, is at once a subjective or ‘psychic’ event, and an ontological condition, insofar as the soul is the only existent capable of experiencing evil, and is also, in its highest form, the ruler or ordering principle of the material cosmos. In spite of all this, however, Evil is not, for Plotinus, a meaningless plague upon the soul. He makes it clear that the soul, insofar as it must rule over Matter, must also take on certain characteristics of that Matter in order to subdue it (I.8.8). The onto-theological problem of the source of Evil, and any theodicy required by placing the source of Evil within the godhead, is avoided by Plotinus, for he makes it clear that Evil affects only the soul, as it carries out its ordering activity within the realm of change and decay that is the countenance of Matter. Since the soul is, necessarily, both contemplative and active, it is also capable of falling, through weakness or the ‘contradiction’ of its dual functions, into entrapment or confusion amidst the chaos of pure passivity that is Matter. Evil, however, is not irremediable, since it is merely the result of privation (the soul’s privation, through forgetfulness, of its prior); and so Evil is remedied by the soul’s experience of Love.
Plotinus speaks of Love in a manner that is more ‘cosmic’ than what we normally associate with that term. Love (eros), for Plotinus, is an ontological condition, experienced by the soul that has forgotten its true status as divine governor of the material realm and now longs for its true condition. Drawing on Plato, Plotinus reminds us that Love (Eros) is the child of Poverty (Penia) and Possession (Poros) (cf. Plato, Symposium 203b-c), since the soul that has become too intimately engaged with the material realm, and has forgotten its source, is experiencing a sort of ‘poverty of being,’ and longs to possess that which it has ‘lost’. This amounts to a spiritual desire, an ‘existential longing,’ although the result of this desire is not always the ‘instant salvation’ or turnabout that Plotinus recognizes as the ideal (the epistrophe described in Ennead IV.8.4, for example); oftentimes the soul expresses its desire through physical generation or reproduction. This is, for Plotinus, but a pale and inadequate reflection or imitation of the generative power available to the soul through contemplation. Now Plotinus does not state that human affection or even carnal love is an evil in itself — it is only an evil when the soul recognizes it as the only expression or end (telos) of its desire (III.5.1). The true or noble desire or love is for pure beauty, i.e., the intelligible Beauty (noetos kalon) made known by contemplation (theoria). Since this Beauty is unchangeable, and the source of all earthly or material, i.e., mutable, beauty, the soul will find true happiness (eudaimonia) when it attains an unmediated vision (theoria) of Beauty. Once the soul attains not only perception of this beauty (which comes to it only through the senses) but true knowledge of the source of Beauty, it will recognize itself as identical with the highest Soul, and will discover that its embodiment and contact with matter was a necessary expression of the Being of the Intelligence, since, as Plotinus clearly states, as long as there is a possibility for the existence and engendering of further beings, the Soul must continue to act and bring forth existents (cf. IV.8.3-4) — even if this means a temporary lapse into evil on the part of the individual or ‘fragmented’ souls that actively shape and govern matter. However, it must be kept in mind that even the soul’s return to recognition of its true state, and the resultant happiness it experiences, are not merely episodes in the inner life of an individual existent, but rather cosmic events in themselves, insofar as the activities and experiences of the souls in the material realm contribute directly to the maintenance of the cosmos. It is the individual soul’s capacity to align itself with material existence, and through its experiences to shape and provide an image of eternity for this purely passive substance, that constitutes Nature (phusis). The soul’s turnabout or epistrophe, while being the occasion of its happiness, reached through the desire that is Love, is not to be understood as an apokatastasis or ‘restoration’ of a fragmented cosmos. Rather, we must understand this process of the Soul’s fragmentation into individual souls, its resultant experiences of evil and love, and its eventual attainment of happiness, as a necessary and eternal movement taking place at the final point of emanation of the power that is the One, manifested in the Intelligence, and activated, generatively, at the level of Soul.
One final statement must be made, before we exit this section on Plotinus’ Metaphysics and Cosmology, concerning the status of Nature in this schema. Nature, for Plotinus, is not a separate power or principle of Life that may be understood independently of the Soul and its relation to Matter. Also, since the reader of this article may find it odd that I would choose to discuss ‘Love and Happiness’ in the context of a general metaphysics, let it be stated clearly that the Highest Soul, and all the individual souls, form a single, indivisible entity, The Soul (psuche) (IV.1.1), and that all which affects the individual souls in the material realm is a direct and necessary outgrowth of the Being of the Intelligible Cosmos (I.1.8). Therefore, it follows that Nature, in Plotinus’ system, is only correctly understood when it is viewed as the result of the collective experience of each and every individual soul, which Plotinus refers to as the ‘We’ (emeis) (I.1.7) — an experience, moreover, which is the direct result of the souls fragmentation into bodies in order to govern and shape Matter. For Matter, as Plotinus tells us, is such that the divine Soul cannot enter into contact with it without taking on certain of its qualities; and since it is of the nature of the Highest Soul to remain in contemplative contact with the Intelligence, it cannot descend, as a whole, into the depths of material differentiation. So the Soul divides itself, as it were, between pure contemplation and generative or governing act — it is the movement or moment of the soul’s act that results in the differentiation of the active part of Soul into bodies. It must be understood, however, that this differentiation does not constitute a separate Soul, for as we have already seen, the nature and essence of all intelligible beings deriving from the One is twofold — for the Intelligence, it is the ability to know or contemplate the power of the One, and to reflect upon that knowledge; for the Soul it is to contemplate the Intelligence, and to give active form to the ideas derived from that contemplation. The second part of the Soul’s nature or essence involves governing Matter, and therefore becoming an entity at once contemplative and unified, and active and divided. So when Plotinus speaks of the ‘lower soul,’ he is not speaking of Nature, but rather of that ability or capacity of the Soul to be affected by its actions. Since contemplation, for Plotinus, can be both purely noetic and accomplished in repose, and ‘physical’ and carried out in a state of external effort, so reflection can be both noetic and physical or affective. Nature, then, is to be understood as the Soul reflecting upon the active or physical part of its eternal contemplation. The discussion of Plotinus’ psychological and epistemological theories, which now follows, must be read as a reflection upon the experiences of the Soul, in its capacity or state as fragmented and active unity.
Plotinus’ contributions to the philosophical understanding of the individual psyche, of personality and sense-perception, and the essential question of how we come to know what we know, cannot be properly understood or appreciated apart from his cosmological and metaphysical theories. However, the Enneads do contain more than a few treatises and passages that deal explicitly with what we today would refer to as psychology and epistemology. Plotinus is usually spurred on in such investigations by three over-arching questions and difficulties: (1) how the immaterial soul comes to be united with a material body, (2) whether all souls are one, and (3) whether the higher part of the soul is to be held responsible for the misdeeds of the lower part. Plotinus responds to the first difficulty by employing a metaphor. The Soul, he tells us, is like an eternal and pure light whose single ray comes to be refracted through a prism; this prism is matter. The result of this refraction is that the single ray is ‘fragmented’ into various and multi-colored rays, which give the appearance of being unique and separate rays of light, but yet owe their source to the single pure ray of light that has come to illumine the formerly dark ‘prism’ of matter.
If the single ray of light were to remain the same, or rather, if it were to refuse to illuminate matter, its power would be limited. Although Plotinus insists that all souls are one by virtue of owing their being to a single source, they do become divided amongst bodies out of necessity — for that which is pure and perfectly impassive cannot unite with pure passivity (matter) and still remain itself. Therefore, the Higher Soul agrees, as it were, to illuminate matter, which has everything to gain and nothing to lose by the union, being wholly incapable of engendering anything on its own. Yet it must be remembered that for Plotinus the Higher Soul is capable of giving its light to matter without in any way becoming diminished, since the Soul owes its own being to the Intelligence which it contemplates eternally and effortlessly. The individual souls — the ‘fragmented rays of light’ — though their source is purely impassive, and hence not responsible for any misdeeds they may perform, or any misfortunes that may befalls them in their incarnation, must, themselves, take on certain characteristics of matter in order to illuminate it, or as Plotinus also says, to govern it. One of these characteristics is a certain level of passivity, or the ability to be affected by the turbulence of matter as it groans and labors under the vivifying power of the soul, as though in the pangs of childbirth (cf. Plato, Letter II. 313a). This is the beginning of the individual soul’s personality, for it is at this point that the soul is capable of experiencing such emotions like anger, fear, passion, love, etc. This individual soul now comes to be spoken of by Plotinus as if it were a separate entity by. However, it must be remembered that even the individual and unique soul, in its community (koinon) with a material body, never becomes fully divided from its eternal and unchanging source. This union of a unique, individual soul (which owes its being to its eternal source) with a material body is called by Plotinus the living being (zoon). The living being remains, always, a contemplative being, for it owes its existence to a prior, intelligible principle; but the mode of contemplation on the part of the living being is divided into three distinct stages, rising from a lesser to a greater level of intelligible ordering. These stages are: (1) pathos, or the immediate disturbance undergone by the soul through the vicissitudes of its union with matter, (2) the moment at which the disturbance becomes an object of intelligible apprehension (antilepsis), and (3) the moment at which the intelligible object (tupon) becomes perceived through the reasoning faculty (dianoia) of the soul, and duly ordered or judged (krinein). Plotinus call this three-fold structure, in its unity, sense- perception (aisthesis).
We may best understand Plotinus’ theory of perception by describing it as a ‘creation’ of intelligible objects, or forms, from the raw material (hule) provided by the corporeal realm of sensation. The individual souls then use these created objects as tools by which to order or govern the turbulent realm of vivified matter. The problem arises when the soul is forced to think ‘through’ or with the aid of these constructed images of the forms (eide), these ‘types’ (tupoi). This is the manner of discursive reasoning that Plotinus calls dianoia, and which consists in an act of understanding that owes its knowledge (episteme) to objects external to the mind, which the mind, through sense-perception, has come to ‘grasp’ (lepsis). Now since the objects which the mind comes to ‘grasp’ are the product of a soul that has mingled, to a certain extent, with matter, or passivity, the knowledge gained by dianoia can only be opinion (doxa). The opinion may indeed be a correct one, but if it is not subject to the judgment of the higher part of the soul, it cannot properly be called true knowledge (alethes gnosis). Furthermore, the reliance on the products of sense-perception and on dianoia may lead the soul to error and to forgetfulness of its true status as one with its source, the Higher Soul. And although even the soul that falls the furthest into error and forgetfulness is still, potentially, one with the Higher Soul, it will be subject to judgment and punishment after death, which takes the form, for Plotinus, of reincarnation. The soul’s salvation consists of bringing its mind back into line with the reasoning power (logos) of its source, which it also is — the Soul. All order in the physical cosmos proceeds from the power of the Soul, and the existence of individual souls is simply the manner in which the Soul exercises its governing power over the realm of passive nature. When the individual soul forgets this primal reality or truth — that it is the principle of order and reason in the cosmos — it will look to the products of sense-perception for its knowledge, and will ultimately allow itself to be shaped by its experiences, instead of using its experiences as tools for shaping the cosmos.
What Plotinus calls the “living being” (zoon) is what we would refer to, roughly, as the human-being, or the individual possessed of a distinct personality. This being is the product of the union of the lower or active part of the soul with a corporeal body, which is in turn presided over by the Higher Soul, in its capacity as reasoning power, imparted to all individual souls through their ceaseless contemplation of their source (I.1.5-7). The “living being,” then, may be understood as a dual nature comprising a lower or physically receptive part, which is responsible for transferring to the perceptive faculty the sensations produced in the lower or ‘irrational’ part of the soul through its contact with matter (the body), and a higher or ‘rational’ part which perceives these sensations and passes judgment on them, as it were, thereby producing that lower form of knowledge called episteme in Greek, that is contrasted with the higher knowledge, gnosis, which is the sole possession of the Higher Soul. Plotinus also refers to this dual nature as the ‘We’ (emeis), for although the individual souls are in a sense divided and differentiated through their prismatic fragmentation (cf. I.1.8, IV.3.4, and IV.9.5), they remain in contact by virtue of their communal contemplation of their prior — this is the source of their unity. One must keep in mind, however, that the individual souls and the Higher Soul are not two separate orders or types of soul, nor is the “living being” a third entity derived from them. These terms are employed by Plotinus for the sole purpose of making clear the various aspects of the Soul’s governing action, which is the final stage of emanation proceeding from the Intelligence’s contemplation of the power of the One. The “living being” occupies the lowest level of rational, contemplative existence. It is the purpose of the “living being” to govern the fluctuating nature of matter by receiving its impressions, and turning them into intelligible forms for the mind of the soul to contemplate, and make use of, in its ordering of the cosmos. Now in order to receive the impressions or sensations from material existence, the soul must take on certain characteristics of matter (I.8.8-9) — the foremost characteristic being that of passivity, or the ability to undergo disruptions in one’s being, and remain affected by these disturbances. Therefore, a part of the “living being” will, of necessity, descend too far into the material or changeable realm, and will come to unite with its opposite (that is, pure passivity) to the point that it falls away from the vivifying power of the Soul, or the reasoning principle of the ‘We.’ In order to understand how this occurs, how it is remedied, and what are the consequences for the Soul and the cosmos that it governs, a few words must be said concerning sense-perception and memory.
Sense-perception, as Plotinus conceives it, may be described as the production and cultivation of images (of the forms residing in the Intelligence, and contemplated by the Soul). These images aid the soul in its act of governing the passive, and for that reason disorderly, realm of matter. The soul’s experience of bodily sensation (pathos) is an experience of something alien to it, for the soul remains always what it is: an intellectual being. However, as has already been stated, in order for the soul to govern matter, it must take on certain of matter’s characteristics. The soul accomplishes this by ‘translating’ the immediate disturbances of the body — i.e., physical pain, emotional disturbances, even physical love or lust — into intelligible realties (noeta) (cf. I.1.7). These intelligible realities are then contemplated by the soul as ‘types’ (tupoi) of the true images (eidolon) ‘produced’ through the Soul’s eternal contemplation of the Intelligence, by virtue of which the cosmos persists and subsists as a living image of the eternal Cosmos that is the Intelligible Realm. The individual souls order or govern the material realm by bringing these ‘types’ before the Higher Soul in an act of judgment (krinein), which completes the movement or moment of sense-perception (aisthesis). This perception, then, is not a passive imprinting or ‘stamping’ of a sensible image upon a receptive soul; rather, it is an action of the soul, indicative of the soul’s natural, productive power (cf. IV.6.3). This ‘power’ is indistinguishable from memory (mnemes), for it involves, as it were, a recollection, on the part of the lower soul, of certain ‘innate’ ideas, by which it is able to perceive what it perceives — and most importantly, by virtue of which it is able to know what it knows. The soul falls into error only when it ‘falls in love’ with the ‘types’ of the true images it already contains, in its higher part, and mistakes these ‘types’ for realities. When this occurs, the soul will make judgments independently of its higher part, and will fall into ‘sin’ (hamartia), that is, it will ‘miss the mark’ of right governance, which is its proper nature. Since such a ‘fallen’ soul is almost a separate being (for it has ceased to fully contemplate its ‘prior,’ or higher part), it will be subject to the ‘judgment’ of the Higher Soul, and will be forced to endure a chain of incarnations in various bodies, until it finally remembers its ‘true self,’ and turns its mind back to the contemplation of its higher part, and returns to its natural state (cf. IV.8.4). This movement is necessary for the maintenance of the cosmos, since, as Plotinus tells us, “the totality of things cannot continue limited to the intelligible so long as a succession of further existents is possible; although less perfect, they necessarily are because the prior existent necessarily is” (IV.8.3, tr. O’Brien). No soul can govern matter and remain unaffected by the contact. However, Plotinus assures us that the Highest Soul remains unaffected by the fluctuations and chaotic affections of matter, for it never ceases to productively contemplate its prior — which is to say: it never leaves its proper place. It is for this reason that even the souls that ‘fall’ remain part of the unity of the ‘We,’ for despite any forgetfulness that may occur on their part, they continue to owe their persistence in being to the presence of their higher part — the Soul (cf. IV.1 and IV.2, “On the Essence of the Soul”).
The individual souls that are disseminated throughout the cosmos, and the Soul that presides over the cosmos, are, according to Plotinus, an essential unity. This is not to say that he denies the unique existence of the individual soul, nor what we would call a personality. However, personality, for Plotinus, is something accrued, an addition of alien elements that come to be attached to the pure soul through its assimilative contact with matter (cf. IV.7.10, and cp. Plato, Republic 611b-612a). In other words, we may say that the personality is, for Plotinus, a by-product of the soul’s governance of matter — a governance that requires a certain degree of affectivity between the vivifying soul and its receptive substratum (hupokeimenon). The soul is not really ‘acted upon’ by matter, but rather receives from the matter it animates, certain unavoidable impulses (horme) which come to limit or bind (horos) the soul in such a way as to make of it a “particular being,” possessing the illusory quality of being distinct from its source, the Soul. Plotinus does, however, maintain that each “particular being” is the product, as it were, of an intelligence (a logos spermatikos), and that the essential quality of each ‘psychic manifestation’ is already inscribed as a thought with the cosmic Mind (Nous); yet he makes it clear that it is only the essence (ousia) of the individual soul that is of Intelligible origin (V.7.1-3). The peculiar qualities of each individual, derived from contact with matter, are discardable accruements that only serve to distort the true nature of the soul. It is for this reason that the notion of the ‘autonomy of the individual’ plays no part in the dialectical onto-theology of Plotinus. The sole purpose of the individual soul is to order the fluctuating representations of the material realm, through the proper exercise of sense-perception, and to remain, as far as is possible, in imperturbable contact with its prior. The lower part of the soul, the seat of the personality, is an unfortunate but necessary supplement to the Soul’s actualization of the ideas it contemplates. Through the soul’s ‘gift’ of determinate order to the pure passivity that is matter, this matter comes to ‘exist’ in a state of ever-changing receptivity, of chaotic malleability. This malleability is mirrored in and by the accrued ‘personality’ of the soul. When this personality is experienced as something more than a conduit between pure sense-perception and the act of judgment that makes the perception(s) intelligible, then the soul has fallen into forgetfulness. At this stage, the personality serves as a surrogate to the authentic existence provided by and through contemplation of the Soul.
The highest attainment of the individual soul is, for Plotinus, “likeness to God as far as is possible” (I.2.1; cf. Plato, Theaetetus 176b). This likeness is achieved through the soul’s intimate state of contemplation of its prior — the Higher Soul — which is, in fact, the individual soul in its own purified state. Now since the Soul does not come into direct contact with matter like the ‘fragmented,’ individual souls do, the purified soul will remain aloof from the disturbances of the realm of sense (pathos) and will no longer directly govern the cosmos, but leave the direct governance to those souls that still remain enmeshed in matter (cf. VI.9.7). The lower souls that descend too far into matter are those souls which experience most forcefully the dissimilative, negative affectivity of vivified matter. It is to these souls that the experience of Evil falls. For this reason, Plotinus was unable to develop a rigorous ethical system that would account for the responsibilities and moral codes of an individual living a life amidst the fluctuating realm of the senses. According to Plotinus, the soul that has descended too far into matter needs to “merely think on essential being” in order to become reunited with its higher part (IV.8.4). This seems to constitute Plotinus’ answer to any ethical questions that may have been posed to him. In fact, Plotinus develops a radical stance vis-a-vis ethics, and the problem of human suffering. In keeping with his doctrine that the higher part of the soul remains wholly unaffected by the disturbances of the sense-realm, Plotinus declares that only the lower part of the soul suffers, is subject to passions, and vices, etc. In order to drive the point home, Plotinus makes use of a striking illustration. Invoking the ancient torture device known as the Bull of Phalaris (a hollow bronze bull in which a victim was placed; the bull was then heated until it became red hot), he tells us that only the lower part of the soul will feel the torture, while the higher part remains in repose, in contemplation (I.4.13). Although Plotinus does not explicitly say so, we may assume that the soul that has reunited with its higher part will not feel the torture at all. Since the higher part of the soul is (1) the source and true state of existence of all souls, (2) cannot be affected in any way by sensible affections, and (3) since the lower soul possesses of itself the ability to free itself from the bonds of matter, all particular questions concerning ethics and morality are subsumed, in Plotinus’ system, by the single grand doctrine of the soul’s essential imperturbability. The problems plaguing the lower soul are not, for Plotinus, serious issues for philosophy. His general attitude may be summed up by a remark made in the course of one of his discussions of ‘Providence’:
“A gang of lads, morally neglected, and in that respect inferior to the intermediate class, but in good physical training, attack and overthrow another set, trained neither physically nor morally, and make off with their food and their dainty clothes. What more is called for than a laugh?” (III.2.8, tr. MacKenna).
Of course, Plotinus was no anarchist, nor was he an advocate of violence or lawlessness. Rather, he was so concerned with the welfare and the ultimate salvation of each individual soul, that he elevated philosophy — the highest pursuit of the soul — to the level of a divine act, capable of purifying each and every soul of the tainting accruements of sensual existence. Plotinus’ last words, recorded by Porphyry, more than adequately summarize the goal of his philosophy: “Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All” (Life of Plotinus 2).
- Elmer O’Brien, S. J. (1964) tr., The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
- This fine translation of the more accessible, if not always most relevant, treatises of Plotinus serves as a valuable introduction to the work of a difficult and often obscure thinker. The Introduction by O’Brien is invaluable.
- Plotinus, The Enneads, tr. Stephen MacKenna, with Introduction and Notes by John Dillon (Penguin Books: 1991).
- Stephen MacKenna’s rightly famous translation of Plotinus is more interpretive than literal, and often less clear to a modern English reader than what is to be found in O’Brien’s translation. However, before delving into the original Greek of Plotinus, one would do well to familiarize oneself with the poetic lines of MacKenna. The Penguin edition, although unfortunately abridged, contains an excellent Introduction by John Dillon, as well as a fine article by Paul Henry, S. J., “The Place of Plotinus in the History of Thought.” Also included is MacKenna’s translation of Porphyry’s Life of Plotinus.
- Plotinus, The Enneads, tr. A. H. Armstrong, including the Greek, in 7 volumes (Loeb Classical Library, Harvard-London: 1966-1968).
- This is a readily available edition of Plotinus’ Greek text. Armstrong’s translation is quite literal, but for that reason, often less than helpful in rendering the subtleties of Plotinus’ thought. For the reader who is ready to tackle Plotinus’ difficult Greek, it is recommended that she make use of the Loeb edition in conjunction with the translations of O’Brien and MacKenna, relying only marginally on Armstrong for guidance.
- Porphyry, Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, tr. Kenneth Guthrie (Phanes Press: 1988). [A translation of Pros ta noeta aphorismoi]
- This little introduction to Plotinus’ philosophy by his most famous student is highly interesting, and quite valuable for an understanding of Plotinus’ influence on later Platonists. However, as an accurate representation of Plotinus’ thought, this treatise falls short. Porphyry often develops his own unique interpretations and arguments under the guise of a commentary on Plotinus. But that is as it should be. The greatest student is often the most violently original interpreter of his master’s thought.
- Frederick Copleston, S. J. A History of Philosophy: Volume 1, Greece and Rome, Part II (Image Books: 1962).
- This history of philosophy is considered something of a classic in the field, and the section on Plotinus is well worth reading. However, Copleston’s analysis of Plotinus’ system represents the orthodox scholarly interpretation of Plotinus that has persisted up until the present day, with all its virtues and flaws. The account in the history book is no substitute for a careful study of Plotinus’ text, although it does provide useful pointers for the beginner.
- Kathleen Freeman, Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers (Harvard University Press: 1970).
- This is a complete English translation of the Fragments in Diels, Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, the standard edition of the surviving fragments of the Pre-Socratic philosophers. The study of these fragments, especially Parmenides, Heraclitus, Empedocles, and Anaxagoras, provides an essential background for the study of Plotinus.
- Jacques Derrida, Speech and Phenomena, tr. David B. Allison (Northwestern University Press: 1973).
- The essay “Form and Meaning: A Note on the Phenomenology of Language,” in this edition, literally has Plotinus written all ‘oeuvre’ it.
To understand Plotinus in the fullest fashion, don’t forget to familiarize yourself with Plato’s Symposium, Phaedrus, Phaedo, the Republic, and the Letters (esp. II and VII), not to mention Aristotle, the Stoics and the Epicureans, the Hellenistic Astrologers, the Gnostics, the Hermetic Corpus, Philo and Origen.
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