Pluralist Theories of Truth

Truth pluralism (or ‘alethic’ pluralism) is a view about the nature of truth. Broadly speaking, the thought behind the view is that truth may require different treatments for different kinds of subject matter. In particular, there is the prospect for it to be consistent to conceive of truth in a realist manner for discourse about the material world, while maintaining an anti-realist notion of truth for discourse about subjects that are perhaps more mind-dependent in character, such as discourse about ethics or comedy. Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism. The literature on truth pluralism is expanding rapidly; new avenues of research on the subject are constantly being explored. This article introduces the central motivations, frameworks, and problems for the view which have preoccupied much of the discussion to date in contemporary analytic philosophy. Part 1 gives a brief history of some of the main inspirations behind the views outlined in contemporary debates. Part 2 goes through some preliminary issues. Part 3 outlines one of the main motivations for truth pluralism. Part 4 details the main formulations of the view that have been offered, and discusses the problems each formulation faces. Finally, Part 5 discusses some concerns about the general approach of the view.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism
  2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries
  3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism
  4. Forms of Truth Pluralism
    1. Simple Alethic Pluralism
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    2. One Concept Many Properties
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    3. Second-Order Functionalism
    4. Manifestation Functionalism
    5. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism
  5. General Issues
    1. The Problem of Domain Individuation
    2. The Demandingness Objection
    3. Problems with Platitudes
    4. The Deflationary Challenge
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism

The majority of this article is focused on a contemporary debate in analytical philosophy, but, of course, debates about the nature of truth are long-established in the history of philosophy, and in a variety of philosophical traditions. Some of the more prominent theories are correspondence theories, coherence theories, pragmatist theories, identity theories, and deflationary theories, and there are of course a number of different varieties of each of these views (for more information on these theories, see the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on Truth).

Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism (though he himself disliked the name), which is outlined most prominently in his collection of lectures entitled Pragmatism, first published in 1907. James himself took true beliefs to be those beliefs that served some useful purpose, but recognised that there are many different ways that beliefs can be useful, often depending on the kinds of things the beliefs were about, with observational beliefs, moral beliefs, and mathematical beliefs, being just a few examples. Moreover, James noted that what made these different kinds of beliefs useful might vary from case to case. For instance, for observational beliefs we might think that their utility is established by their being verified, for mathematical beliefs by being capable of being proved, and for moral beliefs by cohering with other moral beliefs we have. Thus, although James held the general pragmatist thesis that for a belief to be true is for it to be useful:

Our account of truth is an account of truths in the plural…having only this quality in common: that they pay. (James 1975: 104)

He also held that there were various different ways in which beliefs could be useful:

To copy a reality is, indeed, one way of agreeing with it, but it is by no means essential. (James 1975: 102)

The spirit of James’s approach was built on in the mid-20th Century by Michael Dummett, who, in his famous 1959 essay ‘Truth’, very much echoed James when he wrote:

The question is not whether [“true” and “false”] are in practice applied to ethical statements, but whether, if they are so applied, the point of doing so would be the same as the point of applying them to statements of other kinds, and, if not, in what ways it would be different. (Dummett 1978: 3)

Perhaps the first explicit statement of the kind of pluralism found in contemporary debates is given by Alan White in his 1957 essay, “Truth as Appraisal”. Like James, White held that there is some unity to the use of the word true, but he instead holds that this unity is supplied by the term’s use as a term of appraisal, as a way to commend a particular statement. White held a ‘dual-aspect’ theory of truth, which held that this appraisal-aspect is combined with a descriptive aspect, which states the criteria for establishing when the term ‘true’ is used correctly. White then argued that these criteria vary according to the subject matter of the statement, holding that different ‘theories’ of truth, such as correspondence theory and coherence theory are apt to give the criteria for the correct use of ‘true’ in different cases.

With the rise of deflationary theories of truth in the mid to late 20th Century, James and White’s observations received perhaps less attention than they deserved. The general project of truth pluralism was revitalized, however, by the publication of Crispin Wright’s 1992 book Truth and Objectivity, which aimed to place a broadly pluralist account of truth at the heart of a new method of understanding debates about realism and anti-realism. Wright’s book had significant influence in a number of different areas of philosophy, and provoked considerable debate. In the 21st Century, Michael P. Lynch, along with Crispin Wright, has further developed the project of truth pluralism, and his 2009 book Truth as One and Many is the most comprehensive single study of truth pluralism and its potential implications to date. As we will see below, there are many different ways to understand the exact specification of truth pluralism, but before we approach these it will be useful to try to get to the heart of what drives each of these views, and to clarify some of the terminology commonly used.

2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries

The basic idea behind all forms of truth pluralism is that the analysis of truth may require different treatment for different kinds of subject matter. This idea is normally spelled out using the notion of a domain of discourse (or region of thought). This is a formalization of the idea that human thought and discourse can be about a large number of different subjects. For instance, we may debate about whether a particular joke is funny, whether an action is morally wrong, whether the earth goes around the sun, or whether there is a largest prime number. The thought is that these debates concern very different things, and this needs to be taken into account when we come to analyse the claims made in them.

The truth pluralist draws upon these intuitive distinctions when it comes to the matter of investigating the nature of truth. As we will see below, truth pluralists have reason to think that there are important things to be said about the nature of truth, but typically – at least at some stage of the theory – hold that the question of what needs to be said is addressed on a domain-by-domain basis. That is, they are unhappy with the thought that we can give an account of the nature of truth without taking into account the subject-matter of the claims of which truth is predicated. A full account of the nature of truth, on the pluralist view, will need to look at truth in a specific domain, as opposed to (or as well as) what constitutes truth per se.

Before moving on to the motivations for truth pluralism, and the various forms of the view, it is worth briefly pausing to note some distinctions which are important in the truth pluralism literature. These distinctions are between the truth predicate, the truth concept, and the truth property. The truth predicate, typically taking the form ‘is true’ is the linguistic entity appended to certain sentences, as in “‘snow is white” is true’. One who competently uses the words ‘true’ and ‘truth’ can be said to possess the concept of truth, and an analysis of the concept of truth will aim to uncover what those conditions of competent use consist in. The property of truth is what is ascribed by the truth predicate.

To get clearer on these distinctions, consider the following analogy with water (this analogy is originally due to Alston (1996), and is also emphasised by Wright (2001) and Lynch (2009)). We have the predicate ‘is water’, which we use to say of a certain substance that it is water (for example, ‘the liquid in the bottle is water’). We also have the concept of water, that any competent user of the term ‘water’ understands (for example, that water is a clear, colourless, tasteless liquid, that it comes out of taps, and runs through rivers and streams). We also have the property of being water, which is what the stuff that corresponds to the concept, and is referred to by the predicate, consists in. Scientific discoveries have deemed the property of water to be identical to the property of being H2O, and this tells us what the nature of water is. In the water case, then, the system works as follows. We have the water predicate, which is used to ascribe a particular property – being water – to particular substances. Competent users of the water predicate will be said to possess the concept of water, and this concept demarcates a kind of worldly substance. The property of water captures the essence of this worldly substance (H­2O). Note also that it is not a condition on competent users of the concept that they be aware of the nature of the property (as indeed was not the case before the discovery of water as H2O): possessing the concept does not necessarily require possessing knowledge of the essence of the property.

Most of the investigations into the nature of truth concern the essence of the truth property. However, as we will see, in the story of truth pluralism, the concept of truth has an important role to play. (For more on the concept/property distinction in this context, and how the nature of the truth property may not be transparent from the truth concept, see Alston 2002.)

It is also worth saying a little about truth-bearers before we progress. There are a number of different things that philosophers have taken to be the bearers of truth, with beliefs, statements, sentences, utterances of sentences, and propositions to be perhaps the most prominent examples. One form of truth pluralism would perhaps be a view which held that all of these potential bearers are genuine truth-bearers, and that there are different kinds of truth appropriate to each bearer. This would be an interesting kind of truth pluralism, though it is not a view which seems to necessarily share the same motivations as the views discussed here. For the purposes of this article, we will follow the majority of truth pluralists in holding that it is propositions that are the primary bearers of truth, and when we speak of sentences, utterances, or beliefs as being true it is in the sense that they express a proposition that is true.

3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism

Correspondence theories of truth may appear to be intuitively attractive: they promise to make truth a matter of a relation between linguistic or mental entities and the separate objects and properties that they purport to represent. However, subscribing to such a view about truth for a particular domain of discourse carries with it significant metaphysical commitments: in other words, it can be thought of as implying that there are mind-independent facts of the matter which our statements, thoughts or beliefs map onto. This has posed particular problems about employing the notion of truth in the moral domain, for example, where the idea of there being mind-independent facts of the matter causes a degree of uneasiness (see, for example, Mackie 1977). It also causes problems in the mathematical domain, where we might be more comfortable thinking that there are mind-independent facts of the matter, but, due to the abstract nature of the facts involved, the notion of ‘mapping onto’ these facts seems misguided. Thoughts along these lines have been expressed by Lynch (2009) as what he calls the ‘Scope Problem’, which suggests that each existing ‘robust’ theory of truth (such as correspondence and coherence theories) is limited to accounting only for the truth of claims of a certain type. (See Dodd 2012 and Edwards 2011b for further discussion of the strength of the Scope Problem.)

It is tempting to respond to this uneasiness by denying that truth is applicable in these problematic domains, and adopting ‘expressivist’ or ‘fictionalist’ views of the subject matter instead, for example. However, pulling in the opposite direction is the attractive view of minimal truth-aptness. This is the thought that a domain of discourse can sustain a notion of truth in virtue of meeting very basic standards of syntactic discipline (see, for example, Boghossian 1990, Wright 1992), allowing them to express propositions which are, in turn, apt for truth. The basic idea is that a domain will qualify as being syntactically disciplined if its component sentences can be used as the antecedents of conditionals, be negated, and feature as the targets of propositional attitude statements. In addition to these features, if a domain is syntactically disciplined then there is a distinction between seeming to be right and being right, along with the intelligibility of speakers saying ‘I used to think that p but now I realize I was mistaken’. Moral discourse, for example, plausibly meets these standards. We often say things like ‘I used to think that eating meat was morally wrong, but now I realize I was mistaken’, or ‘I wonder whether abortion is morally wrong’. We can also note that moral sentences, such as ‘murder is wrong’, can feature as the antecedents of conditionals, such as ‘if murder is wrong, then those that murder will be punished’, or be negated, as in ‘it is not the case that murder is right’, which – on the terms of the view – are further hallmarks of sentences which express truth-apt propositions. Consequently, it is not so clear that we can give up on truth in these domains. But that seems to lead us back into an implausible realism, and herein lies the problem.

However, one may well point out that this is not such a problem, as there is already a plausible, and popular, theory of truth which explains how these kinds of claims are truth-apt, and without any unwanted metaphysical baggage: so-called ‘deflationary’ theories of truth (see, for example, Horwich 1998, Field 1994, and Stoljar and Damnjanovic 2010 for an overview of deflationary theories). The deflationist insists that the truth predicate exists just to perform certain logical functions, such as the endorsement of a proposition, or generalisation over a potentially infinite number of propositions. Deflationary theories of truth thus typically focus on the use of the truth predicate, and the possession of the truth concept, as opposed to the truth property. (See Devitt 2001 for a good discussion of the project undertaken by deflationists.) Deflationism though may be able to give us the resources to explain how all of the classes of sentences we are considering can be true, but it does so at the cost of being unable to use truth as an explanatory resource when attempting to understand other concepts, and requires revision to some of our basic thoughts that connect truth to other concepts of philosophical interest (for discussion see, for example, Lynch 2004a, Davidson 1999, Field 1986). There are also concerns that deflationism is an internally unstable view, outlined in Wright’s (1992) ‘inflationary argument’ (for further discussion see Horwich 1996 and 1998, Rumfitt 1995, van Cleve 1996, Kölbel 1997 and Miller 2001). I will not go into these problems in depth here, but suffice to say that deflationism does not offer a problem-free solution to the problem under discussion.

The truth pluralist agrees with the deflationist that all of the domains we have considered contain sentences that are capable of expressing true propositions. However, the truth pluralist does not think, like the deflationist, that this is the end of the matter. There is a story to tell about the nature of truth, the pluralist thinks, but this story will not always be the same. According to the truth pluralist, there will be a property in virtue of which the propositions expressed by sentences in a particular domain of discourse will be true, but this property will change depending on the domain we are considering. In other words, although the notion of truth as correspondence to the facts might fit our domain of discourse about the material world, a different notion of truth – perhaps one with less metaphysical baggage, constructed out of coherence, or justification or warrant (for example Wright’s notion of ‘superassertibility’ – see Wright 1992) – may fit the domains in which the correspondence notion looks problematic. Consequently, truth pluralism offers a treatment of truth which allows for a wide range of beliefs, sentences and the like to be true, although holding onto the idea that there are interesting things to say about truth.

There are thus initially two constraints on all truth pluralist theories. They must:

(1) Adequately explain how truth is to be analysed differently in different domains of discourse, and

(2) Ensure that truth is held to be robust enough to avoid the criticisms of deflationism.

With these motivations in mind, we will now examine some of the specific formulations of the view. Note that the versions I will be looking at will be those that hold that there are roles for different types of properties, such as correspondence and coherence, to play in the different accounts of truth in different domains, but there are also views of a pluralist persuasion which hold that truth is always correspondence, with there being different kinds of correspondence (for example Horgan 2001, Sher 2004).

4. Forms of Truth Pluralism

a. Simple Alethic Pluralism

The first option is a view which Lynch calls ‘Simple Alethic Pluralism’ (SAP) (Lynch does not hold the view, and it is unclear whether anyone ever has – though some attribute the view to Wright’s (1992) formulation of truth pluralism, which speaks of a plurality of truth predicates. Wright has since clarified his position – see below). Recalling the differences between concept and property noted above, this view holds that there are different concepts of truth in different domains of discourse. That is, that the concept of truth in discourse about the material world is identified with the concept of corresponding to fact, and the concept of truth in arithmetic is identified with the concept of coherence. Associated with each of these concepts will be their corresponding predicates and properties, so, if the concept of truth changes from domain to domain, the content of the truth predicate and the nature of the truth property will also change from domain to domain. On this view, then, there are different concepts, predicates and properties associated with the word ‘true’ in different domains of discourse.

Returning to the two dimensions of meaning that we discussed earlier, SAP holds that the meaning of ‘true’ varies from domain to domain at both the level of concept and property. It varies at the level of concept as different concepts are associated with ‘true’ in different domains, and it varies at the level of property as different properties are associated with the different concepts in different domains. One implication of this view, then, is that – at least on the two dimensions of meaning discussed – there is no domain-invariant meaning of ‘true’: the meaning of the predicate always depends on the subject-matter to which it is attributed, and is thus multiply ambiguous.

We will now turn to discuss the main problems for the SAP formulation of truth pluralism.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)

On the SAP view, truth (both as predicate and property) is tied to specific domains of discourse. However, as Tappolet (1997) pointed out, our reasoning frequently mixes statements from different domains. Consider the following example:

(1) This cat is wet

(2) This cat is funny

Therefore, this cat is wet and funny

Validity of arguments is traditionally understood as necessary preservation of truth, but how could we understand the validity of this argument on the SAP view? To make the point explicit, let us use the truth predicates from different domains:

(1*) ‘This cat is wet’ is truem

(2*) ‘This cat is funny’ is truec

Therefore, ‘this cat is wet and funny’ is true?

Disregarding for the moment the issue of what truth predicate applies to the conclusion (see the problem of mixed compounds below), this reformulation of the argument is invalid as different truth predicates are applied to each premise and conclusion, thus rendering the argument guilty of the fallacy of equivocation. Appeal to properties will not help either, as different truth properties correspond to each different truth predicate, thus ensuring that no single property is preserved across the inference (see below and Pedersen 2006 for detailed further discussion of the different aspects of this problem).

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)

Now consider compound claims, like conjunctions or disjunctions. Tappolet (2000) observes that we often make compounds of claims from different domains of discourse, such as the already mentioned ‘this cat is wet and funny’. (Williamson 1994 makes a similar point.) We have already noted that there is some puzzlement over what truth predicate could apply to this conjunction, but, more worryingly, Tappolet states, is that there is a basic statement about conjunctions, namely that a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true. If different truth predicates apply to the conjunction and to the conjuncts, then principles like this look under threat, once more from concerns about equivocation. These principles seem to require a general truth predicate, but SAP can provide none.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

One of the main motivations for moving beyond deflationism is to accommodate the thought that truth constitutes a norm of inquiry. It seems on the face of it as though SAP can accommodate this thought as there are different truth properties in different domains of discourse. However, Lynch (2006) argues that we need to read this constraint as the need for truth to constitute a single general norm of inquiry. All SAP would give us is lots of different norms (truth-in-ethics, truth-in-mathematics, and so forth) which would provide different norms for different domains of discourse, as opposed to a single general norm that all assertions (regardless of domain) aim at. If Lynch’s argument is correct, then, SAP has trouble accommodating the normative dimension of truth.

iv. Generalizations

One common use of the truth predicate is to make general claims, such as ‘Everything Socrates said is true’. This effectively allows us to endorse everything Socrates said without having to re-assert everything he did say. But how could we understand this usage on the SAP view? In particular, what truth predicate appears in the statement? For instance, suppose that Socrates remarks on a wide variety of subjects, from the weather to what is morally good to the axioms of set theory. All of these claims would seemingly be subject to different truth predicates, so how is a general claim like ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ even expressible without the aid of a general truth predicate?

b. The One Concept Many Properties View (OCMP)

The second option, due to Crispin Wright (1992, 2001, 2003), holds that there is a single concept of truth, held fixed across domains, and different truth properties which satisfy this concept in different domains. This view aims to hold one aspect of the meaning of the predicate ‘true’ fixed across domains – namely the concept associated with ‘true’ – although accommodating diversity of content by holding that there are different properties of truth in different domains, identified by their ability to (locally) satisfy the truth concept.

On this view, the content of the concept of truth is specified by a list of ‘platitudes’ about truth, which are taken to be truths about truth, knowable a priori, which specify the features that truth is taken to necessarily have, often by reference to connections between truth and other closely related concepts. Some candidate platitudes are as follows:

Transparency. That to assert a proposition is to present it as true and, more generally, that any attitude to a proposition is an attitude to its truth – that to believe, doubt, or fear, for example, that p is to believe, doubt, or fear that p is true.

(E). <p> is true iff p. (Note: ‘<p>’ here and below stands for ‘the proposition that p’, following Horwich’s (1998) notation.)

Embedding. A proposition’s aptitude for truth is preserved under a variety of operations – in particular, truth-apt propositions have negations, conjunctions, disjunctions, and so forth, which are likewise truth-apt.

Straight-talking. A true proposition ‘tells it like it is’, in some way.

Contrast. A proposition may be true but not justified, or justified but not true.

Stability. If a proposition is ever true, then it always is, so that whatever may, at any particular time, be truly asserted may – perhaps by appropriate transformations of mood, or tense – be truly asserted at any time.

Absoluteness. Truth is absolute – there is, strictly, no such thing as a proposition’s being more or less true; propositions are completely true if true at all.

The basic idea is that a complete list of truth platitudes will characterise the concept of truth exhaustively. This concept will be associated with the truth predicate in all of its relevant uses, regardless of the subject-matter of which it is attributed. One dimension of the meaning of ‘true’ is thus held fixed: the concept of truth with which the predicate is associated.

The aspect of meaning of ‘true’ which varies on this view is the property associated with ‘true’. What this property is will vary from one domain to the next. For example, the truth property for the empirical domain might well be correspondence, and the truth property for the mathematical domain might be coherence. Thus, at the level of property, there is variation in the nature of truth, but not variation at the level of concept.

According to Wright, a property’s ability to be considered a truth property is dependent on its ability to satisfy the following procedure. First of all, occurrences of the term ‘true’ are replaced with the name of the candidate property (so, for example, in the case of correspondence, the Contrast platitude would become “A proposition may correspond to the facts but not be justified, and vice versa”). If truth is preserved by these reformulations (that is, if all the platitudes remain true when rewritten), then, according to Wright, the property in question has the pedigree to be considered a truth property.

The method here can be compared with the methods employed by functionalists in the philosophy of mind (for example, Lewis 1972, Kim 1998) in that properties such as correspondence realize the role set out by the truth platitudes, as, for instance, c-fibers firing realize the role set out by our folk concept of pain. However, it is contentious whether Wright’s view should be understood along those lines (Lynch 2006, 2009, for example, interprets OCMP in this way, but Wright (2011) resists this interpretation).

OCMP gives us a single truth predicate, but not a single truth property. How might this help it avoid the problems posed for SAP? Not much, on first glance, but, as I will note, there has been more effort to defend OCMP than SAP on these fronts.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)

As we have a single truth predicate, the meaning of which is fixed by a single truth concept, the charge of equivocation when it comes to mixed inferences may be circumvented. However, there is still the more pressing issue of truth preservation to address. Remember that we noted that it is widely held that validity is necessary preservation of truth across an inference. This way of putting it sounds distinctly like there is a single property (truth) preserved from premises to conclusion. However, note that there is no single property of truth on the OCMP view, so different truth properties will be possessed by premises from different domains of discourse. The problem now kicks in at the level of properties: how to explain preservation of truth across mixed inferences when there is no single truth property.

Responses to this form of the problem have been offered by Beall (2000), who argues that the pluralist should adopt a conception of validity favoured by many-valued logics, and Pedersen (2006) who explores the possibility of using plural quantification. Cotnoir (2012) offers an algebraic account of how an OCMP pluralist can account for the validity of mixed inferences.

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)

The initial statement of the problem only seems to affect SAP, as it is a challenge to understand the phrase ‘a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true’ in the absence of a general truth predicate. As SAP is the only view which lacks a single truth predicate, it only seems to affect this view and not the others: all the other views can hold that it is the same predicate in both uses. However, there is a deeper challenge which is not averted by this response. That is to explain in what way the conjunction is true, and this can kick in just as well at the level of properties. On the OCMP view, the challenge will be to explain what truth property the mixed conjunction has. On the other views, it will be a challenge to explain which lower level property the mixed conjunction has which explains why it has the general truth property.

One route to explore is to observe that the truth of a compound is, in some sense, supervenient on its components, and to try to construct a truth (or lower level) property out of this idea. This option is explored by Edwards (2008, 2009), who, defending the OCMP view, suggests that we can understand the truth property for compounds as being the property of satisfying the rules for compounds laid out by the preferred system of logic. This option could also be extended to the other views (bar SAP) which could hold that this is the relevant lower level property for compounds that explains why they have the general truth property. This option is discussed by Cotnoir (2009), and rejected by Lynch (2009), who prefers to think of the truth of compounds as instances of truth “self-manifesting”, as a consequence of its being grounded in the truth of the components. See Lynch 2009 Chapter 5 for further discussion of this idea.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

The norm of inquiry problem seems to hold in its original form (indeed, it was originally pressed by Lynch against the OCMP view). Again, there is no general property possessed by all truths, but, if truth is to be considered a general norm of inquiry, then there needs to be a general truth property capable of grounding this norm. Insofar as OCMP cannot allow for this, it falls prey to the objection.

iv. Generalizations

The matter of generalizations is again subtle. Equipped with a general truth predicate the puzzlement over what predicate appears in the sentence ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ disappears. But, again, one may think that the problem kicks in at the level of properties. We could read the sentence as attributing a property to all the things Socrates said – the property of truth. But, we cannot take this statement at face-value on the OCMP view, as, in this case, there is no general truth property that is possessed by all the things Socrates said.

However, OCMP may have a response to this problem which draws on the solution to the problem of mixed conjunctions. If OCMP interprets ‘everything Socrates said is true’ as a long conjunction of all the things Socrates said, then perhaps it can analyze that conjunction in much the same way as the mixed conjunction discussed above. Alternatively, as Wright 2012 explores, OCMP may prefer to instead say that the same style of solution may be adopted for generalizations themselves. That is, a generalization is true just in case all of the propositions that fall under the scope of that generalization are themselves true in their appropriate ways.

The remaining views which we will discuss all allow for a general truth property, as well as a general truth predicate. As a result they seem, on the face of it, to avoid the problem of mixed inferences, norm of inquiry, generalization and mixed compounds problems, and, as a result, I will not discuss each problem in turn for each view. However, as we will see below, the norm of inquiry problem still has relevance in some cases. Also, as hinted above, there are issues over whether the mixed compounds problem will still affect these views, which are explored further in Lynch 2009 and Edwards 2008.

c. Second-Order Functionalism (SOF)

Lynch (2001a, 2004, 2006) proposes to think of truth as a functional concept. A functional concept describes the role that anything that falls under the concept must play, but it is intended to stay reasonably neutral on the issue of what it is that realizes that role. This idea originated in the philosophy of mind by way of giving a method of systematizing particular causal roles of particular mental phenomena, but Lynch extends the idea to systematize the non-causal, perhaps normative, role of truth in our cognitive lives. Lynch’s method of constructing the functional role of the concept of truth begins, like Wright’s, with the collection of a number of platitudes about truth, which locate truth on the conceptual map, linking it with the related concepts of fact, proposition and belief. Lynch’s platitudes are:

The proposition that p is true if and only if p.

The proposition that p is false if and only if it is not the case that p.

Propositions are the bearers of truth and falsity.

Every proposition has a negation.

A proposition can be justified but not true, and true but not justified. (Lynch 2001a: 730)

These platitudes form a structure which will provide a complete account of the role truth is taken to play. This structure takes the form of a ‘network analysis’ (the term is due to Smith 1994). That is, once we have our full list of platitudes, we first rewrite them slightly, replacing simple instances of ‘is true’ with ‘has the property of being true’, so that, instead of, say ‘The proposition that p is true if and only if p.’, we have ‘The proposition that p has the property of being true if and only if p.’ We then make a conjunction of all the platitudes we have collected, and replace all of the alethic concepts in the platitudes with variables. What we end up with is a condition which is billed to give us the exact specification of the ‘job description’ for truth, its ‘functional role’. (For more on this process see Lynch 2001a, and also Smith 1994 and Jackson 1998.)

This process yields a functional definition of truth, as it gives us the precise features that a property must have if it is to be regarded as realizing the truth role: it must be related to a number of other properties in the required way. As noted before, these features may be exhibited by different properties in different domains of discourse, and SOF allows for this, as, provided a property discharges the functional role set out in the network analysis, it counts as the realizer of the truth role in that particular domain of discourse.

So far, it may not seem as though there is a great deal distinguishing SOF from OCMP, but the main point of difference becomes apparent when SOF says a bit more about the truth property. Functionalists in general, according to Lynch, have two options when characterizing the truth property: they can either hold that truth is a second-order property – the property of having a property that plays the specified role – or hold – in each domain – that truth is a first-order property, that is, the property that plays that certain role in that domain. The truth property could thus be taken to be either the second-order property of possessing some property that plays the truth role, or, in each domain, the property that actually plays that role in a particular domain of discourse. SOF plumps for the former, and, as a result, the truth property is to be thought of as a second-order functional role property, not as a realizer property. There is a single second-order role property, and a plurality of realizer properties across discourses, and the truth property is to be identified with the former.


There is thus a property that all truths have in common on the SOF view. All truths will have the property of having a property that plays the truth role. As the truth property is to be identified with this second-order property, as opposed to the first-order realizer property, all truths will be true in virtue of having this second-order property, whatever their individual realizer properties are.

There are two main problems that SOF faces. The first concerns the ‘robustness’ of second-order properties. Remember that truth, considered here as a second-order property, needs to be robust enough to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry. However, one might think that the robust properties here are the first-order properties, like correspondence and coherence, as opposed to the property of having one of those properties, which seems to be a thinner, less complex property. If so, SOF provides us with a truth property which is not fit to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry, and thus fails to move the view significantly beyond OCMP (for concerns like these about second-order properties in general, see Kim 1998). The second, related, problem (raised in Lynch 2009) is that it is questionable whether the second-order truth property will satisfy the truth platitudes. Remember that to be a truth-realizing property, on a functionalist view, a property has to exhibit the features set out in the truth platitudes. The first-order properties must do this, and this is how they are identified in their domains, but does the general second-order property exhibit these features? Lynch argues not, and thus the view is unstable: it offers as a truth property a property which fails to meet its own standards for being considered a truth property.

d. Manifestation Functionalism

In Lynch 2009, Lynch presents a significant revision of his earlier proposal. Lynch maintains the central role afforded to the list of platitudes about truth, holding that the concept of truth is captured by the following (slightly different) list:

Objectivity: The belief that p is true if, and only if, with respect to the belief that p, things are as they are believed to be.

Warrant Independence: Some beliefs can be true but not warranted and some can be warranted without being true.

Norm of Belief: It is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is true.

End of Inquiry: Other things being equal, true beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry. (Lynch 2009: 8-12)

According to MF, we ought to take the truth platitudes (or the ‘truish features’ in Lynch’s words) to specify the nature of the truth property, as well as the nature of the truth concept:

the functionalist…can claim that there is a single property and concept of truth. The property being true (or the property of truth) is the property that has the truish features essentially or which plays the truth-role as such. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF does not disregard the ‘domain-specific’ properties, such as correspondence and superassertibility, but MF does not want to identify truth with these properties, rather that truth is manifested in these properties:

this approach allows the functionalist to claim that truth is, as it were, immanent in ontologically distinct properties. Let us say that where property F is immanent in or manifested by property M, it is a priori that F’s essential features are a subset of M’s features. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF thus requires that the truth features – as expressed in the characterisation of the truth property – are a subset of the features of the particular domain-specific properties. That is, each of the properties that, in Lynch’s terms, ‘manifest’ truth in a domain, must contain the truth property as a proper part. So, for example, for superassertibility to manifest truth in a domain, it would have to be part of the features of superassertibility that the belief that p is superassertible if, and only if, things are as they are believed to be; that some beliefs can be superassertible but not warranted and some can be warranted without being superassertible; that it is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is superassertible; and that, other things being equal, superassertible beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry.

A key issue for this view is the metaphysics of manifestation. Lynch claims that the metaphysics of manifestation are similar to the metaphysics of the determinate/determinable relation. A classic example of this relation is the relation between being coloured and being red. There is an asymmetry between these properties: if something is red, then, necessarily, it is coloured, whereas if something is coloured it is not necessarily red. Being red, we might say, is one way of being coloured. One way of putting this point is to say that being red is a determinate of the more general determinable, being coloured. According MF, something similar occurs in the case of truth, where properties such as correspondence and superassertibility are different ways of being true. (However, Lynch does not want to say that the manifestation relation as it occurs in the case of truth is the same as the determinate/determinable relation: see Lynch 2009: 75 for details.)

Perhaps the most pressing objection, due to Wright (2012), concerns the ability of properties such as correspondence and superassertibility to manifest truth on the terms of Lynch’s view. Recall that Lynch holds that the truth-manifesting properties contain the essential features of truth as a proper part of their own features. But, Wright argues, if Lynch’s view in general is correct, then surely one of the essential features of truth is that truth is manifested in, for example, correspondence and superassertibility. However, now it looks difficult for those properties to manifest truth, for it cannot be that correspondence and superassertibility are themselves manifested in correspondence and superassertibility. But, if this cannot be the case, then they cannot manifest truth, for they do not possess one of the essential features of truth. Lynch (2012) attempts to respond to this problem, and Wright (2012) also considers his response.

As was the case with SOF, there has also been discussion of how far MF progresses beyond deflationism, and, in particular, whether the property MF identifies with truth – the property that has the truish features essentially – is a property which is as robust as Lynch claims it to be. This issue is discussed in detail in Jarvis 2012, Edwards 2012 and Pedersen and Edwards 2011.

e. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism

In addition to the proposals put forward by Crispin Wright and Michael Lynch, there are also a couple of emerging views in the recent literature. The first is the ‘disjunctivist’ proposal offered by Pedersen (2010) and Pedersen and C.D. Wright (2012). The basic idea behind this view is to take the basic structure of OCMP, and add an additional property that will serve as a general truth property. This property will be a disjunctive property which contains each of the domain-specific truth properties as disjuncts.

Pedersen expresses the domain-specific truth properties (of which correspondence to reality and superassertibility are examples) as properties Tl … Tn. His thought is that the existence of a further property can immediately be inferred, a ‘universal’ notion of truth – TU – defined in the following way:

(∀p)(TU (p) ↔ Tl(p) v … v Tn(p))

This states that if we have properties Tl … Tn, we can immediately infer the existence of a further property, TU, by noting that a proposition (p) has TU just when it has one of Tl … Tn. The thought is that this property, TU, has the pedigree to be considered a truth property (it is taken to be possessed by all and only truths, after all). We can call this proposal ‘disjunctivism’, as the single truth property is taken to be a disjunctive property.

The main challenge for disjunctivism is to show that the disjunctive truth property has the necessary credentials to be considered the truth property. In particular, it faces concerns that a disjunctive property is not ‘robust’ enough to meet the requirements of being a substantive norm of inquiry, and also that, as with SOF, it fails to guarantee exhibition of the features laid out in the truth platitudes. Disjunctive proposals are defended from these concerns by Pedersen and Wright (2012a) and Edwards (2012).

The second emerging view is offered by Edwards (2011a, 2012b), which draws upon Dummett’s (1978) analogy between truth and winning. Just as winning is the aim of playing a game, truth is the aim of assertion and belief. It is evident that what it takes to win differs from game to game, but there is good reason to think that winning qua property has a significant degree of constancy. The thought is that the property of being a winner is a property that one can get in a variety of different ways, and that the rules of each game establish a property the possession of which determines the possession of the property of being a winner. Thus, in each game, we get biconditionals of the form:

(Bx) When playing game x: one wins (has the property of winning) iff one possesses property F.

The thought is that this structure can be applied to the truth case. Take it that truth qua property is exhaustively accounted for by the list of platitudes about truth. We can then, for each domain, construct biconditionals of the following form:

(Bdx) In domain of discourse x: <p> is true (has the property of truth) iff <p> has property F.

There will be an order of determination on the biconditionals which reflects the explanatory primacy of the right-to-left direction. That is, in the material world domain, for example, it is because <p> corresponds to the facts that <p> is true, and not because <p> is true that <p> corresponds to the facts. It is in virtue of the order of determination on these biconditionals that we can say that the properties in question determine truth in their respective domains.

The structure of simple determination pluralism is thus as follows. Truth is given as the property that is exhaustively described by the truth platitudes. This property is the property possessed by all true propositions, regardless of domain. This allows the view to avoid the problem with SOF, as the truth property necessarily exhibits the truth features. Moreover, for each domain there will be a property that determines possession of the truth property, and these properties are held fully distinct from the truth property itself. This allows simple determination pluralism to avoid some of the problems with MF as truth itself is not considered to be manifested in the domain-specific properties. The relationship between the truth-determining properties and truth is underwritten by the order of determination on the biconditionals of the form (Bdx).

A key issue for simple determination pluralism is the specification of the relationship between the domain-specific truth-determining properties and the truth property itself. There is also the matter of how exactly the truth-determining properties are identified, and the provenance of the (Bdx) biconditionals. These issues are explored in Edwards 2011a and 2011c, and in Wright 2012.

5. General Issues

These are some of the main formulations of truth pluralism that are currently available. Evidently, the intricacies of each view are more complex than I have been able to outline here, and the reader is directed to the relevant references for more on the structure and motivations for each view. I hope, though, that it is clear that the term ‘truth pluralism’ covers a variety of different proposals which, although they share a certain general approach to truth, differ on the details.

Each proposal, then, faces specific challenges of its own, but there are also some concerns about the general project which all pluralists will need to address. I will close by briefly noting three such concerns.

a. The Problem of Domain Individuation

Truth pluralism seemingly rests on the idea that natural language can be separated into different domains of discourse. Note that this rough separation of thought and talk into different domains is not solely the work of truth pluralists, it is perhaps a separation that is subscribed to, though a lot less explicitly, by a number of different kinds of theorists. The very fact that philosophy itself is separated into different areas corresponding to these divisions might be one example: moral philosophy is taken to concern different subject matter to aesthetics, and philosophy of mathematics different to the philosophy of science. Also, those who take particular positions in these areas may be implicitly subscribing to such distinctions. One who claims to be an expressivist about moral discourse, for example, will need to be able to demarcate what is moral discourse and what is not. Likewise, one who is a fictionalist about mathematics needs some distinction between what are mathematical statements, and what are not.

However, one might think that pluralism is committed to this idea in a particularly acute way. For instance, some of the views above use the notion of a domain as a parameter when it comes to platitude satisfaction. For example, on the OCMP view, truth properties do not satisfy the truth platitudes simpliciter, they satisfy them in a specific domain. Identifying precisely what a domain of discourse is, and how, exactly, they are to be individuated is an issue which has been at the forefronts of the minds of those sceptical of the pluralist project since its inception (see, for example, Williamson 1994), and, at present, one might think that more needs to be done to ease these concerns.

b. The Demandingness Objection

The supposed benefit of being able to use different theories of truth in different domains may be considered a problem when one considers what that entails, namely that a truth pluralist is committed to defending the use of a particular theory of truth in each domain. This worry is particularly acute when one considers that there is no generally accepted version of any of the theories of truth usually cited as examples. For instance, although it may seem a benefit that truth pluralism allows correspondence theory a limited scope, it is worth noting that there is general scepticism over whether there is a satisfactory formulation of the correspondence theory to start with. The same may well be true of coherence theory. Truth pluralism thus inherits the problems with formulating each of the different theories of truth it wants to use in each of its domains. This makes it a very demanding view to defend: not only does it have to find a structure that works, it has to outline and defend each account of truth in each domain. This point is developed by C.D. Wright (2011).

c. Problems with Platitudes

All of the pluralist views I have discussed involve the notion of platitudes at some stage in the theory. As is also clear, different formulations favour slightly different platitudes. This disagreement might make us worry about the use of the term ‘platitude’, which seems to signify some uncontroversial, even obvious, principle. However, although the platitudes in each case are taken to stem from some intuitive thoughts about truth, the eventual formulations may be open to dispute (see Wright 2003: 271, and also Nolan 2009 for more on platitudes), so we should think of them as refined conceptual truths, perhaps, as opposed to simple obvious, uncontroversial, statements. Nevertheless, one might be concerned that there are no platitudes about truth: no principles that are entitled to this status. This is backed up by the fact that most (if not all) of the platitudes cited by truth pluralists have been questioned (C.D. Wright 2005 argues this point, and Lynch 2005 responds).

Usually the scepticism comes from one of two fronts: either from those who think the platitude in question is false, or from those who think the platitude in question is not about truth, and can thus be explained away without committing one to any attitude about the nature of truth. Deflationists about truth often use this second strategy, with Paul Horwich being one prominent example with his discussion of the ‘Norm of Belief’ platitude (see Horwich 1998, 2010). Wolfgang Künne (2003: Chapter 5) gives an example of the first kind of scepticism, arguing that Wright’s ‘Stability’ platitude is false. There are also concerns that even the (in)famous ‘(E)’ platitude is up for grabs, coming from those who wish to admit truth-value gaps, and those who think that the schema leads to paradox (though note that these particular concerns would affect deflationary theories just as much as pluralist theories, given their reliance on the instances of (E)).

Although, as we have seen, disagreement over a platitude does not immediately rule it out as a platitude, there are still issues over the truth of a platitude which need to be taken seriously. Even if pluralists claim that the platitudes are rough formulations approximating some conceptual truth that would be reached when appropriately refined, there is still room for scepticism.

d. The Deflationary Challenge

Throughout contemporary debates on truth pluralism, lurking in the shadows has been the challenge from deflationary theories of truth. In particular, there is an underlying puzzlement as to why we need to go beyond deflationism into pluralism. After all, deflationism and pluralism share some of the same motivations in that they are both dissatisfied with traditional ‘monist’ accounts of truth, yet the deflationary account seemingly offers a far simpler solution to this dissatisfaction, without a lot of the problems for pluralism we have discussed above. The basic worry seems to be: why bring in all of these complications when we can get by with far less? This challenge is compounded by the influence of deflationary theories of truth in current debates, with many holding that deflationism ought to be considered the default view of truth (see, for example, Field 1994, Armour-Garb Beall 2000, and Dodd 2012). As noted above, this challenge has not been ignored by pluralists, with Wright (1992) and Lynch (2009: Chapter 6) building arguments against deflationism into the motivations for their pluralist views. However, despite this work, it is probably still fair to say that one of the central challenges facing pluralists today is to convince those in the deflationary camp that there are strong reasons to consider pluralism an attractive alternative.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Beall, J.C. 2000. On Mixed Inferences and Pluralism about Truth Predicates. The Philosophical Quarterly Vol. 50, No. 200: 380-382.
  • Boghossian, P.A. 1990. The Status of Content. The Philosophical Review, Vol. 99, No. 2: 157-184.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2009. Generic Truth and Mixed Conjunctions: Some Alternatives. Analysis, Vol. 69, No.2: 473-479.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2012. Validity for Strong Pluralists. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.
  • Davidson, D. 1999. The Folly of Trying to Define Truth. Journal of Philosophy 93, no. 6: 263-279.
  • Devitt, M. 2001. The Metaphysics of Truth. In Lynch (ed.) 2001.
  • Dodd, J. 2012. Deflationism Trumps Pluralism! In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Dummett, M. 1978. Truth. In his Truth and Other Enigmas. Oxford University Press.
  • Edwards, D. 2008. How to Solve the Problem of Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 68, No. 2: 143-149.
  • Edwards, D. 2009. Truth-Conditions and the Nature of Truth: Re-Solving Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 69, No. 4: 684-688
  • Edwards, D. 2011a. Simplifying Alethic Pluralism. The Southern Journal of Philosophy 49: 28-48.
  • Edwards, D. 2011b. Naturalness, Representation, and the Metaphysics of Truth. European Journal of Philosophy.
  • Edwards, D. 2012a. On Alethic Disjunctivism. dialectica, Vol. 66, Issue 1: 200-214.
  • Edwards, D. 2012b. Truth, Winning, and Simple Determination Pluralism. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Edwards, D. 2012c. Alethic vs Deflationary Functionalism. International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20 (1): 115-124.
  • Field, H. 1986. The Deflationary Conception of Truth. In C. Wright and G. Macdonald (eds.) Fact, Science and Morality. Blackwell, Oxford: 55-119.
  • Field, H. 1994. Deflationist Views of Meaning and Content. Mind, 103: 247-285.
  • Horgan, T. 2001. Contextual Semantics and Metaphysical Realism: Truth as Indirect Correspondence. In Lynch 2001: 67-96.
  • Horwich, P. 1996. Realism Minus Truth. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 877-881.
  • Horwich, P. 1998. Truth: Second Edition. Blackwell.
  • Horwich, P. 2010. Truth-Meaning-Reality. Oxford University Press.
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  • Kim, J. 1998. Mind in a Physical World. MIT Press.
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  • Künne, W. 2003. Conceptions of Truth. Oxford University Press.
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  • Lynch, M.P. 2001. The Nature of Truth. MIT Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2001a. A Functionalist Theory of Truth. In Lynch 2001.
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  • Lynch, M.P. 2006. ReWrighting Pluralism. The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 63-84.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2009. Truth as One and Many. Oxford University Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2012. Three Questions about Truth. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
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  • Pedersen, N. 2006. What Can the Problem of Mixed Inferences Teach Us about Alethic Pluralism? The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 102-117.
  • Pedersen, N. 2010. Stabilizing Alethic Pluralism. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 60, No. 238: 92-108.
  • Pedersen, N. and Edwards, D. 2011. Truth as One(s) and Many: On Lynch’s Alethic Functionalism. Analytic Philosophy, 52 (63): 213-30.
  • Pedersen, N. and Wright, C.D. (eds.) 2012. Truth and Pluralism: Current Debates. Oxford University Press.
  • Pedersen, N. and Wright, C.D. 2012a. Why Alethic Disjunctivism is Relatively Compelling. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
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  • Wright, C.D. 2005. On the Functionalization of Pluralist Approaches to Truth. Synthese Vol. 145, No. 1: 128.
  • Wright, C.D. 2010. Truth, Ramsification, and the Pluralist’s Revenge. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 88, No. 2, pp. 265283.
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Author Information

Douglas Edwards
Northern Institute of Philosophy, University of Aberdeen
United Kingdom