Political Obligation

Why should I obey the law? Apart from the obvious prudential and self-interested reasons (to avoid punishment, loss of reputation, and so forth), is there a moral obligation to do what the law requires just because the law requires it? If the answer is yes and the mere illegality of an act renders its performance prima facie morally wrong, then I am under a political obligation. Political obligation thus refers to the moral duty of citizens to obey the laws of their state. In cases where an act or forbearance that is required by law is morally obligatory on independent grounds, political obligation simply gives the citizen an additional reason for acting accordingly. But law tends to extend beyond morality, forbidding otherwise morally innocent behavior and compelling acts and omissions that are discretionary from an independent moral point of view. In such cases, the sole source of one’s moral duty to comply with the law is his or her political obligation.

Theories of political obligation can be roughly divided into three camps: transactional accounts, natural duty, and associative theories.

Table of Contents

  1. Transactional Accounts
    1. Fairness
    2. Gratitude
    3. Consent
  2. Natural Duty
    1. Utilitarianism
    2. Rights-Protecting Institutions
  3. Associative Theories
  4. Mixed Accounts
  5. Sensitivity to Regime Type
  6. Relationship to Legitimate Authority
  7. The Weight of Political Obligation
  8. Philosophical Anarchism
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Transactional Accounts

Transactional accounts suggest that political obligation is acquired through some morally significant transaction between the citizen and his compatriots or between the citizen and his state.” Three such theories can be distinguished.

a. Fairness

A political community is a cooperative scheme that is geared towards the production of benefits for its members: security, transport, clean water, and so forth. The venture is fruitful in producing these benefits because those participating observe certain restrictions and pay their taxes. To enjoy the benefits of the scheme without submitting to its restrictions is to free-ride on the sacrifices of others, which is unfair. The demands of fairness thus yield political obligation. H.L.A Hart was among the first to articulate this account:

When a number of persons conduct any joint enterprise according to rules and thus restrict their liberty, those who have submitted to those restrictions when required have a right to a similar submission from those who have benefited by their submission. (Hart, 1955: 185)

There are some difficulties with citing fairness as the source of political obligation. Robert Nozick introduces the following thought experiment in Anarchy, State and Utopia. Suppose that a group of your neighbors invest in a public address system and decide to launch a program of public entertainment. They list the names of all of the people in the neighborhood, numbering 365 in total.

On his assigned day a person is to run the public address system, play records over it, give news bulletins, tell amusing stories he has heard, and so on. After 138 days on which each person has done his part, your day arrives. Are you obligated to take your turn? You have benefited from it… but must you answer the call when it is your turn to do so? (Nozick, 1974: 93)

The answer seems to be no. From this Nozick draws the conclusion that one does not acquire an obligation to cooperate with a scheme simply by benefiting from its labors. But examples that produce contrasting intuitions come readily to mind. Suppose that the residents of Nozick’s neighborhood vote to dig a public well, to be paid for and maintained by the members of the neighborhood, as an alternative to tap water that is dangerously polluted. One resident, who feels that the well is completely unnecessary, refuses to have anything to do with the enterprise. The others nevertheless proceed to dig the well and fund its maintenance and, after a fortnight, the dissenter begins to take water from the well. In this case, the dissenter has acquired an obligation to pitch in or to contribute his fair share.

The relevant difference between the two cases is whether the benefits are merely received or positively accepted. In Nozick’s example the benefits of the scheme are simply foisted upon all members of the neighborhood, who have no real choice over whether or not they will receive them. The benefits can be avoided, but not without great inconvenience. One would have to go to great lengths to avoid enjoying the music and entertainment being churned out through the public address system. In the latter case, the dissenter must go out of his way to retrieve water from the public well. Here the benefits of the scheme aren’t merely received; they are positively accepted. This makes all the difference. While the acceptance of a scheme’s benefits may be enough to generate an obligation of fair play, their mere receipt cannot (Simmons 1979: 125-28).

The problem with generalizing from this example is that most of the benefits provided by the state are “open” goods, the enjoyment of which simply cannot be avoided, at least not without great inconvenience. The peaceful and secure environment created by police, roads, and national defense are all cases in point. Since we cannot say that these benefits are “accepted,” it is difficult to maintain that those who enjoy them incur a political obligation of fair play by so doing. Those citizens that take advantage of the readily available but not “open” benefits that society makes available, such as emergency services upon request, may incur a duty to requite, but this cannot give us a sufficiently general account of political obligation (Simmons, 1979: 127-28).

But is “acceptance” always necessary? According to George Klosko, the “mere receipt” of a benefit fails to impose a duty to reciprocate only when the benefit in question is trivial. The force of the argument is blunted once we turn away from “discretionary” benefits that are not essential to well-being, such as entertainment, and towards “presumptive” benefits: goods that are necessary for an acceptable life such that all persons can reasonably be presumed to want them (Klosko 1987: 246). Klosko lists “physical security, protection from a hostile environment, and the satisfaction of basic bodily needs,” offering the following example to illustrate his point: A lives in a small territory surrounded by hostile territories whose leaders have made public their intention to slaughter the citizens of X. In order to defend themselves, the X-ites must band together and institute measures such as compulsory military service. A, however, finds this too burdensome and time consuming and decides not to comply. Although the mutual-protection scheme has simply sprung up around him, we feel that it is wrong for A to free ride on the sacrifices of his fellow X-ites. He must reciprocate for the safety and security that he enjoys because of their efforts (Klosko 1987: 249). From this, Klosko infers that the mere receipt of “presumptive” benefits is enough to create a duty of fair play.

But now the emphasis has shifted from the enjoyment of benefits to the importance of the goods provided. This gives us reason to suspect that considerations of fair play are not ultimately what ground political obligation on Klosko’s picture. Rather an independent imperative to help supply essential goods to one’s compatriots – a “natural duty” – may be what is doing the work (Wellman and Simmons 2005: 189-90). Natural duty theories will be considered in greater detail below.

b. Gratitude

According to this account, a citizen owes a debt of gratitude to the government for the benefits that it provides. This debt is owed regardless of whether these benefits are accepted or merely received, and the debt is repaid through obedience to law.

There are a number of obvious difficulties with this account. First, only a benefactor who makes a special effort or sacrifice is owed a debt of gratitude (Simmons 1979: 170). But public benefits are taxpayer-funded and members of government are paid handsomely for their work. As such, no sacrifice by the government is present. Our fellow citizens collectively do make sacrifices from which we benefit, but insofar as they are compelled to do so, they cannot be the objects of a debt of gratitude. Voluntary benefaction is necessary for any such debt to arise. Furthermore, gratitude is not owed for benefaction that is motivated by malice or self-interest, which means that a government is not owed obedience for services that it provides only to win votes, to improve its reputation in international circles, or for other such disqualifying reasons.

Second, even the concession that citizens owe a debt of gratitude to their government cannot salvage this account, for the content of this debt remains an open question. In other words, it is not clear that the debt must be repaid through obedience, rather than in some other way. Interjecting that this is what governments ask for in return is unsatisfactory since, as Simmons points out, “benefactors are not specially entitled to themselves specify what shall constitute a fitting return for their benefaction” (Simmons, 2002: 34).

c. Consent

On this theory, a citizen that freely consents to his government’s authority binds himself to obedience. Though few deny this, the difficulty with consent theory is identifying an action in the personal history of most individuals that might count as a valid token of consent.

Residence in a government’s territory was said to express “tacit” consent by Locke and Rousseau (Locke, 1690: ch. 8, Rousseau, 1762: IV, ii). The fatal errors of this view are well documented. For an act or omission to register consent, the agent performing it must be aware of the moral significance of what he is doing. One cannot submit to authority and be bound unknowingly (Simmons, 1979: 64). Furthermore, the agent must have the opportunity to withhold consent and doing so must not come at too great a personal cost (otherwise consent cannot be considered free and voluntary). Residence fails to meet each of these criteria. First, if occupying territory expresses consent to the authority of its government, it is safe to say that the greater bulk of citizens in any country are not aware of it. Second, the only way to withhold consent on this view is to emigrate, which is impossible for some and possible but extremely costly for others. Even if the moral significance of residence were known to all, in many cases it would still not be free and voluntary, which consent must be in order to bind – a point articulated by David Hume in “On the Social Contract:”

Can we seriously say that a poor peasant or artisan has a free choice to leave his country, when he knows no foreign language or manners, and lives from day to day, by the small wages which he acquires? (Hume, 1748)

A popular alternative token of consent is that of democratic participation or voting. Weak and strong formulations of democratic consent theory can be distinguished. According to the weak version, to vote for a candidate in a democratic election is to consent to his appointment to a position of political authority and therefore to bind oneself to obedience should that candidate’s bid for power be successful. The strong version states that by participating in a democratic election fully aware that the purpose of the procedure is to invest authority in the candidate that wins the most votes, one consents to the procedure as a way of determining who will wield political power and therefore agrees to be bound by its outcome whichever way it goes. Under this alternative, a democratically elected government is owed obedience by every citizen that partook in the election by which it was empowered.

But every democratic country contains citizens that are, for whatever reason, unable or unwilling to vote. This leaves a large portion of any democratic populace unbound by the duty to obey the law, even on the stronger formulation of democratic consent theory. By identifying voting as our token of consent, we avoid the difficulties associated with the residence account, but are left with a theory of political obligation that is insufficiently general in its scope.

2. Natural Duty

According to natural duty theories, political obligation is grounded not in a morally significant transaction that takes place between citizens and polity, but either 1) in the importance of advancing some impartial moral good, such as utility or justice; or 2) in a moral duty owed by all persons to all others regardless of their transactional history.

a. Utilitarianism

Unlike the theories previously discussed, a utilitarian account of political obligation is forward rather than backward looking, deriving political obligation from the future goods to be produced by obedience, rather than from what citizens have done in the past or what has been done for them. Utilitarianism posits that actions that maximize utility are morally required. Utility is maximized by acts that produce more (or at least as much) happiness and well-being than any alternative course of action that is open to the agent. The duty to obey the law is derived from this: since obedience produces more happiness than disobedience, one must obey.

One of the more interesting utilitarian accounts of political obligation is developed by R.M. Hare. The acts and forbearances that are required of us by law are generally acts that are conducive to the greatest happiness of the greatest number independently of their being required by law. Even in a lawless “state of nature,” the imperative to maximize utility would surely enjoin that we not burgle, assault, or murder our neighbors. But the mere fact that the law requires something generates additional utilitarian reasons for complying according to Hare. He argues that the promulgation and enforcement of a law requiring X increases or amplifies the utility of X-ing and the disutility of refusing or failing to X. There are several ways that it can do this.

First, some actions only produce good consequences when performed in coordination with others. The enforcement of law helps to bring this about. Hare offers the following example. Grant that we are each under a utilitarian obligation to observe clean habits in order to prevent the spread of typhus. Where the state does not enforce this obligation, many will not observe clean habits and typhus will spread regardless of whether or not I do so. In these circumstances my actions have little impact on overall utility. But once a corresponding law is passed and obedience is widely enforced, my failure to delouse myself jeopardizes the successful containment of the disease. The enactment and enforcement of a law thus adds to my pre-existing utilitarian obligation to observe hygiene standards by making it more likely that this will be effective in preventing the spread of typhus.

But this cannot be said for all acts and forbearances. Some seem to have the same utility whether or not they are widely enforced. In these cases, Hare appeals to more mundane considerations to support his conclusion. Laws require enforcement and their transgression demands punishment. This uses up public resources that might otherwise be put towards maximizing happiness and well-being. Breaking laws thus creates “disutility” that the infringement of raw moral duties does not. The mere illegality of an act gives us an independent utilitarian reason to refrain from it (Hare, 1989: 14).

But even if the utility of obedience is enhanced by factors such as these, there will surely still be some occasions on which disobedience would clearly produce more utility all things considered. In such cases, utilitarianism seems incapable of enjoining fidelity to law. This is a problem because, while all duties are prima facie and liable to be overridden by countervailing moral considerations, a moral requirement that gives way in the face of very slight utility gains hardly seems to be an obligation in any meaningful sense of the word (Simmons 1979: 49). Rule-utilitarianism looks more promising in this respect. On this view, what is required is conformity to rules that are justified on utilitarian grounds; that is, rules which maximize utility when complied with generally.  “Obey the law” does seem to be such a rule on the face of it. But if an alternative rule could be identified which would produce even better consequences, then it must supplant the rule “obey the law” according to rule-utilitarianism. And there does seem to be such a rule, namely; obey the law except when disobedience would certainly have better consequences. This takes us back to square one.

b. Rights-Protecting Institutions

Political obligation might alternatively be derived from the natural duties that human rights impose on us. The theory developed by Allen Buchanan in “Political Legitimacy and Democracy” (2002) will serve as an example. To show adequate respect for human rights, it is not enough to refrain from violating them. We must also do what we can to ensure that they are not violated by others, at least when we can do so without sustaining too high a personal cost. This is not a duty that we possess by virtue of having committed ourselves to protecting others. We have it “naturally,” regardless of what we have done in the past or what has been done for us. (Buchanan, 2002: 707).

Obedience helps to ensure that the state functions effectively. If the state does a credible job of protecting the human rights of its citizens, obedience helps to ensure that the human rights of one’s compatriots are protected. To refuse to obey constitutes a refusal to do what one can to protect human rights, which is a transgression of one’s natural duty. Thus, political obligation is among the moral requirements that the human rights of others naturally impose on us.

A major shortcoming of this account, and of all natural duty theories, is their inability to bind individuals to one particular political authority above all others. (This is referred to in the literature as the “problem of particularity.”) A duty to promote justice, utility, or human rights might give a citizen reason to obey and support his own state, but it equally gives him reason to support just and competent states abroad. And if utility, justice, or human rights would be better served by putting the demands of a foreign state ahead of one’s own, then this would seem to be the right thing to do. The money I spend on taxes, for example, would probably do more for justice and human rights if it were instead donated to a poor, developing country, in which case the best way to discharge my natural duty would involve tax evasion.

3. Associative Theories

According to associative accounts, a citizen is duty-bound to obey the law simply by virtue of his or her membership in a political community. In many cases, we are willing to concede that the non-voluntary occupation of a social role comes with moral duties attached. The duties of neighbors, friends, and family are all cases in point. (A daughter owes her parents honor and respect simply because she is their daughter, independently of whatever debt of gratitude she may have accrued). Likewise, political associations are “pregnant of obligation,” such that occupying the role of a “citizen” within such an association comes with its own set of duties, including a duty to obey the law (Dworkin 1986: 206). We simply misunderstand what it means to be a member of a political society if we think that political obligation needs any further justification. (McPherson 1967: 64). Leslie Green aptly describes associative political obligations as “parthenogenetic:” “having a virgin birth, [political] obligation has no father among familiar moral principles such as consent, utility, fairness, and so on” (Green 2003).

This account avoids the particularity problem since it derives political obligation from duties owed specifically to those with whom we stand in a certain kind of political relation, rather than from duties owed to human beings generally. But it is open to other kinds of objections. Even if we accept that there are associative obligations within families and between friends, we might say that the typical political association lacks morally relevant characteristics possessed by the typical family or friendship (e.g. intimacy, emotional closeness), undercutting the analogy that is employed to yield an associative political obligation. “Associativists are united in emphasizing the ‘Uncle’ in ‘Uncle Sam’” writes Wellman. “The obvious problem for this approach is that citizens are not connected to compatriots as they are to uncles” (Wellman 1997: 200).

Or we might allow that families and political associations are relevantly similar, but simply reject the notion of associative obligations. Wellman maintains that associative bonds, allegiances, and attachments may give rise to special responsibilities, but denies that these are tantamount to moral duties (Wellman 1997: 186). We are asked to consider a sibling that decides not to attend his sister’s wedding just because he would rather spend his time and money elsewhere. We may disapprove of this individual given his lack of concern for his sister’s life. But we do not feel that he has failed to do something that his sister has a right against him that he do; we do not feel that he has failed to discharge a duty (Wellman 1997: 186). His behavior is unsavory, but it is not unjust; and if familial ties do not ground special, associative obligations, neither do political associations.

4. Mixed Accounts

Mixed accounts combine elements of two or more of the theories so far discussed. A recent example is Christopher Wellman’s “Samaritan” theory, which derives political obligation from the natural duties of citizens together with their obligations of fair play.

The fist part of Wellman’s theory is not dissimilar to Buchanan’s account, which was sketched above. States depend on widespread obedience to function effectively. An effectively functioning state is necessary to protect people from the dangers inherent in the state of nature. Obedience to the state is therefore necessary to ensure that others are protected from peril. This, Wellman insists, is something that we each have a natural “Samaritan” duty to do. This is the natural duty aspect of Wellman’s account. But obviously the state does not depend on the obedience of each and every citizen 100% of the time in order to function effectively. The non-compliance of a few in the midst of general compliance does not compromise the state’s ability to protect its citizens from the dangers of the state of nature. This presents us with a problem. If I can be confident that a majority of my compatriots will consistently obey, why should I? The state will continue to fulfill its protective function regardless of what I do and no one’s safety is jeopardized by my infidelity to law. It seems that by disobeying, I am not doing anything that is inconsistent with my Samaritan duty to defend others from peril.

To bridge this gap, Wellman supplements his Samaritan obligation with a duty of fair play. Contributing one’s fair share to the achievement of the Samaritan objective – defending others from peril – requires obedience even when disobedience would seem to be inconsequential. It would be unfair to shirk one’s share of the “Samaritan chore” (Wellman 2004: 749).

The trouble with mixed accounts is that they seem prone to inherit the difficulties associated with the theories of which they are composed. Complementing a natural duty with a principle of fairness does not, for example, cause the “problem of particularity” to disappear. Rather, the problem seems to carry over and contaminate Wellman’s mixed theory. (Why do I have a duty to contribute a fair share to the “Samaritan chore” in my own community, rather than in some foreign state?) Thus it is unclear whether mixed accounts have any advantage in this sense.

5. Sensitivity to Regime Type

Whether liberal democracy is a precondition of political obligation depends on which of the above theories we apply. The gratitude account does not appear to preclude citizens owing obedience to undemocratic and tyrannical regimes. To be sure, the depth of one’s debt of gratitude depends on the extent to which he or she benefits, so it is safe to say that democratic citizens will typically owe more than authoritarian subjects by way of requital. Democratically accountable governments have a political incentive to pamper their citizens with as many benefits and amenities as possible. Furthermore, a subject that is denied the rights and liberties afforded to his democratic counterparts has less to be grateful for. Nevertheless the subjects of authoritarian governments might still enjoy substantial benefits thanks to their state – stable employment, security against crime, foreign invasion, and so forth. – and as long as they do, they owe a debt of gratitude and therefore political obligation.

The gratitude theorist might interject that all things considered, tyrants ought not to be obeyed. The injustices perpetrated by such regimes ought to be resisted even if this means failing to repay one’s debt of gratitude. But this does not deny that political obligation is owed to tyrants; it merely concedes that political obligation is prima facie and can sometimes be overridden by countervailing moral considerations. While the gratitude account can in this way be supplemented so as to avoid extending to the oppressed an all things considered duty to obey, the important point is that it cannot confine prima facie political obligation to the citizens of liberal democracies.

On the face of it, it would seem that fairness theory’s sensitivity to regime type is no different from that of the gratitude account. Insofar as democratic citizens typically receive more benefits, what constitutes a “fair share” for them to contribute in return might be more than what non-democratic citizens owe. But the latter are still bound to reciprocate for the goods that they do enjoy.

But A.J. Simmons denies that this is the case. “Fair play” obligations, he says, can only arise in a liberal democratic setting:

Only political communities which at least appear to be reasonably democratic will be candidates for a “fair play account” to begin with. For only where we can see the political workings of the society as a voluntary, cooperative venture will the principle apply. Thus, a theorist who holds that the acceptance of benefits from a cooperative scheme is the only ground of political obligation, will be forced to admit that in at least a large number of nations, no citizens have political obligations (Simmons 1979: 136-37).

The claim here is not that we are only obliged to discharge our duties of fair play if we happen to live in a democracy, but that prima facie duties of fair play cannot even arise in states that aren’t liberal democratic (Simmons 1979: 136-37). Simmons’ remarks, however, seem wrongheaded. What characteristics must a society possess in order to count as a “voluntary, cooperative venture?” Presumably, those participating would have to do so of their own free will, which is tantamount to saying that their involvement must be consensual. Now when Simmons says that a society must be a voluntary cooperative enterprise for the fairness account to have purchase, he surely cannot mean that only where every member of a society is a voluntary participant can fairness be invoked to yield political obligation. For not even liberal democracies will meet this standard. More importantly, if a society did manage to meet this standard, the fairness principle would become redundant: everybody would be under a political obligation simply by virtue of having consented to participate in the scheme. Hence Simmons can only mean that a society must contain a core enterprise that is voluntary and cooperative, made up of consenting participants, which makes benefits available to those outside the core and thus binds them to reciprocate even though they aren’t voluntary participants. But in this case he cannot plausibly maintain that it is only possible for liberal democracies to satisfy this condition, for authoritarian societies also seem to contain a core of voluntary participants cooperating and making benefits available to the rest.

Is liberal democracy necessary for political obligation on consent theory? At first glance, the answer appears to depend on the token of consent identified. Where consent is registered by voting, then clearly a society must be democratic in order for its citizens to be under a political obligation. On the other hand if consent is expressed through mere residence, it would seem that the denial of rights and liberties – free speech, democracy, and so forth – has no bearing on the issue of consent and political obligation.

But closer inspection reveals that this is mistaken. Consent is only morally binding if expressed under the right conditions, whichever form it happens to take, a point alluded to by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice: “it is generally agreed that extorted promises are void ab initio. But similarly, unjust social arrangements are themselves a kind of extortion, even violence, and consent to them does not bind” (Rawls, 1971: 343). Rawls’ conclusion is correct, but his reasoning here is faulty. The voluntariness of consent is not necessarily undermined by the injustice of the state consented to, particularly if the consenter is not himself the target of oppression. But we can plausibly raise doubts as to whether consent, however it is registered, is fully informed when given to an unjust state, which seems to be the route taken by Michael Walzer:

It is not enough that particularly striking acts of consent be free; the whole of our moral lives must be free so that we can freely prepare to consent, argue about consenting, intimate our consent to other men and women… Civil liberty of the most extensive sort is, therefore, the necessary condition of political obligation and just government. Liberty must be as extensive as the possible range of consenting action – over time and through political space – if citizens can conceivably be bound to a strict obedience (Walzer, 1970: xii).

Thus one could say that regardless of the token of consent identified, its validity is conditional upon liberal democratic institutions.

Finally, let us turn to natural duty theories. On the utilitarian account, wherever obedience would generate more happiness and well-being than disobedience, this is what morality requires. Thus if we had some reason to believe that obedience maximizes utility in democratic countries and fails to do so everywhere else, only then would the utilitarian say that democracy is a necessary condition of political obligation. However this empirical premise seems somewhat farfetched.

The natural duty to promote justice, on the other hand, extends political obligation only to the citizens of “reasonably just” states, according to Rawls, or states where each person has an equal right to the most extensive set of liberties compatible with a similar set of liberties for others. This demands stringent protection of basic human rights such as personal security, as well as of property rights, freedom of conscience, freedom of speech and association, and so on. Also, all citizens are to be afforded some kind of democratic participation. Therefore, the duty to promote justice only entails an obligation to obey liberal democracies. The subjects of other kinds of regimes might be said to have a duty to comply only when their so doing would “assist in the establishment of just arrangements” (Rawls 1971: 334), but not a general, content-independent political obligation owed to their state. Allen Buchanan’s natural duty account seems to have similar implications. On Buchanan’s theory, the duty to obey the law is grounded in the natural duty to make rights-protecting institutions available to others. It follows that “failed” states that do not competently fulfill this protective function and illiberal regimes that actually trample on human rights themselves cannot be owed obedience.

6. Relationship to Legitimate Authority

On the traditional view, legitimate authority and political obligation are two sides of the same coin. A state is “legitimate” in the sense of having a right to issue and enforce directives if and only if its citizens are under a political obligation. If citizens do not have a prima facie obligation to obey the law, their government does not have a right to promulgate and enforce it (Simmons 1979: 195).

There are, however, alternative accounts that decouple political obligation from legitimate authority. Kent Greenawalt, for example, argues that a legitimate government’s “justification right” – its right to make and enforce law – implies a duty of non-interference on the part of the citizenry, but not a duty to obey (Greenawalt, 1999). However, if what is meant by “interference” is interference with the state’s regulation of society, it is not clear that interference and disobedience can coherently be distinguished. Thomas Christiano illustrates the point with a couple of clever comparisons, the first between the state and the baseball umpire, and the second between the state and the movie director. “If a player does nothing to prevent the umpire from watching the pitches and shouting ‘ball’ or ‘strike,’ but refuses to leave the batter’s box after having been called out, he interferes with the umpires calling of the game.” Similarly if an actor on the set of a movie does not actively try to sabotage the production of the film but refuses to follow the director’s instructions, he interferes with the production of the film nevertheless. In the same way, Christiano argues, a citizen that does not attack police or make bomb threats to parliament house in order to obstruct the making of law, but that refuses to obey the law is still guilty of interfering with the state’s legal organization of society. Disobedience is interference. (Christiano, 2004)

William Edmundson avoids this difficulty by specifying that the correlate of legitimate authority is non-interference with the administration and enforcement of laws, rather than non-interference with the state’s regulation of society more broadly. Similarly Patrick Durning argues that legitimate authority corresponds to a duty not to interfere with the state’s attempts to regulate society, which amounts to a duty not to interfere with the issuing of commands and their enforcement. (Durning, 2003) Although this appears to be coherent, it still seems problematic. If we do not have a moral obligation to surrender a percentage of our earnings in tax, for example, how can we be duty-bound to stand idly by and not resist when the taxman comes to seize our money? Alternative accounts such as those put forward by Edmundson and Durning have the odd implication that one can be duty-bound not to resist the enforcement of directives that one has absolutely no moral obligation to comply with. For this reason, the traditional view, according to which legitimate authority and political obligation are correlates, remains the prevailing view.

7. The Weight of Political Obligation

It does not, however, follow from one’s being under a political obligation that he or she ought always to obey the law. Political obligation is prima facie and countervailing moral considerations always need to be taken into account when assessing the right course of action. The weight that should be ascribed to political obligation in any such judgment is, furthermore, an open question.

M.B.E Smith argues that it is negligible. A prima facie duty has considerable weight if and only if; 1) “an act which violates that obligation and fulfils no other is seriously wrong;” and 2) “violation of it will make considerably worse an act which on other grounds is already wrong” (Smith, 1973: 970). Running a stop sign when it is perfectly safe to do so and when there is nobody else around to witness and be influenced by the indiscretion, constitutes a transgression of a citizen’s political obligation. Yet it seems to be a rather trivial wrong for which censure and moral condemnation are not appropriate responses. Political obligation thus flunks the first test. As for the second test, Smith argues that the moral wrongness of an act is not at all amplified by its illegality. Rape and murder are already seriously wrong. They are not made more wrong by the fact that these actions are against the law. From this Smith concludes that political obligation is “at most of trifling weight” (Smith, 1973: 971). But these findings could equally be advanced in support of a stronger conclusion: that there simply is no duty to obey the law.

8. Philosophical Anarchism

There is today a growing consensus to the effect that no theory of political obligation succeeds. But not everybody infers from this that political obligation does not exist. After all, the source and nature of moral requirements more generally may not be adequately captured by any of our theories, but few advance this as proof that we are not bound by moral requirements. We have simply been unable to explain why we are so bound: the theorist has failed to develop a satisfactory account of what is there (or at least might be there). But there are also those for whom the theories surveyed above are exhaustive. All possible grounds of political obligation are covered by these theories, such that if political obligation cannot be derived from either consent, or fairness, or gratitude, then there is no such thing as political obligation (Simmons 1979: 192).

“Philosophical anarchism” is the term used to describe this latter position – that there is no prima facie duty to obey the law, even in a just state, (the flip- side of this being that no state is “legitimate” in the sense of enjoying a right to obedience). Two kinds of philosophical anarchism can be distinguished: A posteriori and a priori.

According to a posteriori philosophical anarchism, no existing state is legitimate or has a right to obedience, but political obligation might be owed to an authority if it satisfied certain conditions. In other words, existing states are illegitimate because of their contingent characters (Simmons 2001: 106). A proponent of this view might, for example, say that residence would generate political obligation if internal succession were allowed and if there were a widely known convention equating residence with consent, but that in so far these conditions do not obtain in any existing state, no existing state is owed obedience (Beran, 1987: 126).

A priori philosophical anarchism, by contrast, denies not only the existence, but also the possibility of a legitimate state. There cannot be a duty to obey the law on this view (Edmundson, 2004: 219, Simmons 2001: 105). Robert Paul Wolff endorses this position. Wolff argues that obedience – acting as the law requires just because the law requires it – is incompatible with the overriding duty of each individual to act in accordance with his or her own moral judgment. Differently put, obedience constitutes an abdication of moral autonomy, which is immoral. This precludes citizens from acquiring political obligation no matter what they say or do. We are necessarily free from political obligation and, accordingly, the notion of a legitimate state “must be consigned [to] the category of the round square, the married bachelor, and the unsensed sense-datum” (Wolff 1970: 71). None of this has anything to do with the contingent character of one’s government (Hopton 1998: 601).

If political obligation does not exist, what follows? Locke declares that an individual “under the exercise of a power without right” – the power of an authority without a claim to his obedience – is “at liberty to appeal to heaven” or to resort to violent resistance (Locke, 1690: II: 168). On this view, philosophical anarchism offers something of a justification for political anarchism – disobedience and resistance to the state. But one can have strong moral reasons for complying with directives issued by his government without owing any obligations to that government. A state might deserve obedience without being entitled to it. Moreover the acts and forbearances required by law are in many cases morally required independently of the law. The fact that a citizen is free from political obligation means only that the law’s demanding something of him is not in itself a morally relevant consideration for behaving accordingly. But the citizen’s pre-existing moral duties will in many (or even most) cases be sufficient to prohibit his acting contrary to the law. Thus, the absence of political obligation does not challenge our understanding of when morality demands conformity with law and non-resistance as dramatically as one might expect.

9. References and Further Reading


  • Allen, R.E., Socrates and Legal Obligation, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1980).
  • Edmundson, W.A., “State of the Art: The Duty to Obey the Law,” Legal Theory, vol. 10, (2004): 215-259.
  • Edmundson, W.A. (ed.), The Duty to Obey the Law, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1999).
  • Green, L., “Legal Obligation and Authority,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 2003.
  • Hopton, T., “Political Obligation,” in Encyclopedia of Applied Ethics, vol. 3, (San Diego: academic Press, 1998).
  • Klosko, G., Political Obligations, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005).
  • McPherson, T., Political Obligation, (London: Routledge, 1967).
  • Pateman, C., The Problem of Political Obligation: A Critique of Liberal Theory, (Cambridge: Polity Press, 1979).
  • Rousseau, J.J., The Social Contract and Discourses by Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1762), trans. G.D.H Cole, (London and Toronto: J.M. Dent and Sons, 1913).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Civil Disobedience and the Duty to Obey the Law,” in R.G. Frey and C.H. Wellman (eds.), A Companion to Applied Ethics (Blackwell Publishing, 2003).
  • Simmons, A.J., Moral Principles and Political Obligations, (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).
  • Woozley, A.D., Law and Obedience: The Arguments of Plato’s Crito, (London: Duckworth, 1979).


  • Hart, H.L.A, “Are There Any Natural Rights?” Philosophical Review 64, (April 1955).
  • Klosko, G., “Presumptive Benefit, Fairness, and Political Obligation,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 16, no. 3, (Summer 1987): 241-259.
  • Klosko, G., The Principle of Fairness and Political Obligation, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1992).
  • Nozick, R., Anarchy, State, and Utopia, (New York: Basic Books, 1974).
  • Rawls, J., A Theory of Justice, (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1971).
  • Simmons, A.J., “The Principle of Fair Play,” and “Fair Play and Political Obligation: Twenty Years Later,” both in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).


  • Klosko, G., “Political Obligation and Gratitude,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 18 (1988/89): 352-358.
  • Walker, A.D., “Obligations of Gratitude and Political Obligation,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 18, (1988/89): 359-364.
  • Walker, A.D., “Political Obligation and the Argument from Gratitude,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 17, (1987/88): 191-211.


  • Beran, H., The Consent Theory of Political Obligation, (New York: Croom Helm, 1987).
  • Hume, D., “On the Social Contract,” in A. MacIntyre (ed.), Hume’s Ethical Writings, (New York: Collier-Macmillan, 1965).
  • Jenkins, J.J., “Political Consent,” Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 20 (1970): 60-66.
  • Locke, J., The Second Treatise of Civil Government, (1690) (any edition).
  • Plamenatz, J.P., Consent, Freedom and Political Obligation, 2nd ed., (London, Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, 1968).
  • Plamenatz, J.P., Man and Society, vol. 1, (London: Longman, 1963).
  • Singer, P., Democracy and Disobedience, (New York and London: Oxford University Press, 1973).
  • Walzer, M., Obligations: Essays on Disobedience, War and Citizenship, (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1970).

Natural Duty:

  • Bentham, J., “A Fragment of Government,” in J. Bowring (ed.), The Works of Jeremy Bentham, (London: Simpkin, Marshall and Co., 1843).
  • Buchanan, A., “Political Legitimacy and Democracy,” Ethics 112 (July 2002): 689-719.
  • Hare, R.M., “Political Obligation,” in Essays on Political Morality, (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989).
  • Klosko, G., “Political Obligation and the Natural Duties of Justice,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 23, no. 3, (Summer 1994): 251-70.
  • Wellman, C.H., and A. John Simmons, Is there a Duty to Obey the Law?, (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005).

Associative theories:

  • Dworkin, R., Law’s Empire, (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, Belknap, 1986).
  • Horton, J. Political Obligation, (Houndmills, Basingstoke, Hampshire: Macmillan, 1992).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Associative Political Obligations,” in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).

Mixed accounts:

  • Wellman, C.H., “Toward a Liberal Theory of Political Obligation,” Ethics, vol. 111, no. 4, (July 2001): 735-759.
  • Klosko, G., “Multiple Principles of Political Obligation,” Political Theory 32, 6, (2004): 801-824.
  • Lefkowitz, D.A., “Legitimate Authority and the Duty of Those Subject to It: A Critique of Edmundson,” Law and Philosophy 23, (2004): 399-435.
  • Miller, D., On Nationality, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).

Relationship to legitimate authority:

  • Christiano, T., “Justice and Disagreement at the Foundations of Political Authority,” Ethics, 110 (October 1999): 165-187.
  • During, P., “Political Legitimacy and the Duty to Obey the Law,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 3, (September 2003): 373-390.
  • Edmundson, W.A., “Legitimate Authority without Political Obligation,” Law and Philosophy, 17, (1998): 43-60.
  • Greenawalt, K., “Legitimate Authority and the Duty to Obey” in William A. Edmundson (ed.), The Duty to Obey the Law, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1999).

The weight of political obligation, and philosophical anarchism:

  • Dagger, R., “Philosophical Anarchism and its Fallacies: A Review Essay,” Law and Philosophy 19, (2000): 391-406.
  • Edmundson, W.A., Three Anarchical Fallacies: An Essay on Political Authority, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Philosophical Anarchism” in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • Smith, M.B.E., “Is there a Prima Facie Obligation to Obey the Law?” Yale Law Journal, vol. 82, (April 1973): 950-976
  • Wolff, R.P., In Defense of Anarchism, (New York, Evanston and London: Harper and Row, 1970).

Author Information

Ned Dobos
Email: dobosn@unimelb.edu.au
University of Melbourne