Presocratic philosophers are the Western thinkers preceding Socrates (c. 469-c. 399 B.C.E.) but including some thinkers who were roughly contemporary with Socrates, such as Protagoras (c. 490-c. 420 B.C.E.). The application of the term “philosophy” to the Presocratics is somewhat anachronistic, but is certainly different from how many people currently think of philosophy. The Presocratics were interested in a wide variety of topics, especially in what we now think of as natural science rather than philosophy. These early thinkers often sought naturalistic explanations and causes for physical phenomena. For example, the earliest group of Presocratics, the Milesians, each proposed some material element ¾ water, air, the “boundless,” as the basic stuff either forming the foundation of, or constituting, everything in the cosmos.
Such an emphasis on physical explanations marked a break with more traditional ways of thinking that indicated the gods as primary causes. The Presocratics, in most cases, did not entirely abandon theistic or religious notions, but they characteristically posed challenges to traditional ways of thinking. Xenophanes of Colophon, for example, thought that most concepts of the gods were superficial, since they often amount to mere anthropomorphizing. Heraclitus understood sets of contraries, such as day-night, winter-summer, and war-peace to be gods (or God), while Protagoras claimed not to be able to know whether or not the gods exist. The foundation of Presocratic thought is the preference and esteem given to rational thought and argumentation over mythologizing. This movement towards rationality and argumentation would pave the way for the course Western thought.
Table of Contents
- On “Presocratic” and the Sources
- The Milesians
- Pythagoras and Pythagoreanism
- Eleatic Philosophy
- Philosophies of Mixture
- The Atomists
- Diogenes of Apollonia
- The Sophists and Anonymous Sophistic Texts
- References and Further Reading
Difficulties are perhaps inevitable any time we lump a group of variegated thinkers under one name. The so-called “Presocratic philosophers” were a group of different thinkers hailing from different places at different times, many who of whom thought about different things. To call them all “Presocratic” thinkers can seem too sweepingly broad and inaccurate, or insensitive to the differences between each of the thinkers. Even, and perhaps especially, where there are similarities, “Presocratic” seems unsatisfactory. For, where the thought of different people deals with similar ideas, a specific name seems appropriate for that group of people. This happens in Presocratic philosophy (for example, the Milesians), but those specific names are treated merely as species of the larger genus that we call “Presocratic philosophy.”
There are also historical difficulties with the term. For example, the atomist Democritus—traditionally considered to be a Presocratic—is supposed to have been approximately contemporary with Socrates. Continuing on with the use of the term then, should be a tentative and careful endeavor. Whatever the case, these thinkers set Western philosophy on its path.
We have no complete writings from any of the Presocratics, and from some, nothing at all. Our sources, then, are primarily twofold: fragments and testimonia. The fragments are purported bits of the thinkers’ actual words. These might be fragments of books that they wrote, or simply recorded sayings. In any case, there are no surviving complete works from the Presocratics. Moreover, it is important to remember that there are no original compositions—of any length or degree of completeness—available. Neither, for that matter, are any originals available from Plato or Aristotle. In the pre-printing press days, scribes copied whatever editions of books and other written works they had available to them. We have texts that have been copied many times over. This means that, even with the fragments, we can never be sure whether or not the words we are reading correspond exactly to the original ideas that the Presocratics expressed.
The ancient testimonies come to us from several sources, each having its own agenda and degree of reliability. Both Plato and Aristotle explicitly name many of the Presocratics, sometimes discussing their supposed ideas at length. We must recognize that both Plato and Aristotle almost certainly treated Presocratic thought in light of their own respective philosophical agendas. Therefore, the information we get from them about the Presocratics is likely skewed and sometimes arrantly false. Plato wrote philosophical-literary dialogues, and likely needed to represent the Presocratics in his own peculiar ways to meet the needs of the dialogues. Aristotle, who wrote in the treatise style to which we are more accustomed today, also references the Presocratics in the context of his own philosophy. Aristotle would set out to write on a particular topic (for example, physics), and would survey the ideas of his predecessors on that same topic. In doing so, he at times agreed with their positions, and often disagreed with them. We have to beware, especially where Aristotle disagreed with his predecessors, of a possible (and possibly intentional) straw-man technique that Aristotle might have employed to advance his own position. Thus, while the accounts of Plato and Aristotle can be useful, we should read them cautiously.
While it might be inaccurate to call them a school of thinkers, the Milesian philosophers do have connections that are not merely geographical. Hailing from Miletus in Ionia (modern day Turkey), Thales, Anaximander, and Anaximenes each broke with the poetic and mythological tradition handed down by Hesiod and Homer. With what little we know about the Milesians, we do not consider them philosophers in the same way that we consider Plato, Aristotle, and their successors philosophers. Much of what we know about them suggests that they were protoscientists, concerned with cosmogony, which wasthe generation of the cosmos; and cosmology, the study of or inquiry into the nature of the cosmos. Their cosmogonies and cosmologies are oriented primarily by naturalistic explanations, descriptions, and conjectures, rather than traditional mythology. In other words, the Milesians ostensibly sought to explain the cosmos on its own terms, rather than pointing to the gods as the causes or progenitors of all natural phenomena.
The geographical placement of Miletus is noteworthy. It is not unlikely that someone like Thales, for example, travelled to Egypt and perhaps to Babylon. Indeed, there is great evidence to suggest that the Babylonians, in some fashion or another, contributed significantly to ancient Greek knowledge of astronomy and mathematics. This is important to keep in mind when considering Presocratic discoveries in astronomy, mathematics, and other fields. There is scant evidence to suggest that this or that Presocratic thinker was the sole inventor or discoverer in any particular scientific finding or field.
Typically considered to be the first philosopher in the history of Western philosophy, Thales (c. 624-c. 545 B.C.E.) is a figure surrounded by legend and anecdotes. The historian Herodotus says that Thales proposed a single congress for Ionia, effectively centralizing the governmental powers, and making Ionia a single state (Graham 23). In a Lydian military campaign, he is supposed to have diverted the Halys river so that the Lydian military could safely cross in the absence of bridges (Graham 25). Aristotle relays another story, claiming to show us how Thales defended himself and philosophers against claim that philosophers are useless. Through astronomy, Thales was purportedly able to predict a good olive harvest for a particular year. That winter, he bid on the region’s olive presses, and since no one bid against him (they apparently found his prediction incredible), he put down only a small sum. “When harvest time came and everyone needed the presses right away, he charged whatever he wished and made a good deal of money—thus demonstrating that it is easy for philosophers to get rich if they wish, but that is not what they care about” (Graham 25). Plato relates the humorous story that Thales fell into a well while stargazing. “A Thracian servant girl with a sense of humor…made fun of him for being so eager to find out what was in the sky that he was not aware of what was in front of him right at his feet” (Graham 25). Thus, this might be the first anecdote of the impractical and incompetent philosopher who proves himself practically competent, but ultimately unconcerned with worldly affairs.
While we have no way of knowing whether or not any of these stories square with the facts, they paint a picture of Thales as a practical and theoretical wise man—a picture that attracted the eyes of most ancient authorities. He is said to have predicted a solar eclipse in 585, helping the Ionians in battle, since he informed them of the coming darkness, and the enemy was, literally, left in the dark (Graham 23). It is also reported that Thales was highly influential in his work in geometry, if not being entirely responsible for introducing it to Greece from Egypt. Indeed, he is supposed to have discovered that two triangles sharing a side and having equal adjacent angles are congruent (Graham 35), that a circle is bisected by its diameter (Graham 33), and that angles at the base of two isosceles triangles are equal (Graham 35).
Perhaps because of Thales, Milesian philosophy has running through it a taste for the first principles or beginnings of the cosmos. Thales supposed the principle or source (arche) of all things to be water. Aristotle guesses some reasons why Thales might have believed this (Graham 29). First, all things seem to derive nourishment from moisture. Next, heat seems to come from or carry with it some sort of moisture. Finally, the seeds of all things have a moist nature, and water is the source of growth for many moist and living things. Some assert that Thales held water to be a component of all things, but there is no evidence in the testimony for this interpretation. It is much more likely, rather, that Thales held water to be a primal source for all things—perhaps the sine qua non of the world.
It is unclear just how far we are to take Thales here, or precisely how, or if, water plays a role in every cosmological phenomenon. While Thales did turn to naturalistic explanations of the cosmos, he did not abandon belief in the gods. He was supposed to have thought that “all things are full of gods,” and that water is pervaded by a divine power, which also moves the water (Graham 35). If all things either are water, or can ultimately be traced in some way to water, water itself becomes divine—it is the life of the universe, and thus all things are in some way divine. Moreover, if water is more or less connected with some particular thing in the cosmos, then it would stand to reason that some things are more or less divine. As Aetius testifies, “Thales said that God is the mind of the world, and the totality is at once animate and full of deities. And a divine power pervades the elemental moisture and moves it” (Graham 35)). Thales, then, did not abandon theology in favor of naturalism, but rather radically modified it.
Anaximander (c. 610-c. 545 B.C.E.) followed in Thales’ footsteps (he might have been Thales’ student) by applying his astronomical knowledge to practical life on earth. He was supposed to have invented the gnomon, a simple sundial (Graham 49). He may have introduced the knowledge of the solstices and equinox to the Greeks, as well as the twelve-hour division of the day—knowledge he probably gained from the Babylonians (Graham 49). He travelled extensively, gaining first-hand geographical knowledge. Indeed, he was supposed to have drawn a map of the earth as he knew it (Graham 49).
Like Thales, Anaximander also posited a source for the cosmos, which he called the boundless (apeiron). That he did not, like Thales, choose a typical element (earth, air, water, or fire), shows that his thinking had moved beyond the more possibly evident sources of being. He might have thought that, since the other elements seem more or less to change into one another, there must be some source beyond all these—a kind of background upon or source from which all these changes happen. Indeed, this everlasting principle gave rise to the cosmos by generating hot and cold, each of which “separated off” from the boundless. How it is that this separation took place is unclear, but we might presume that it happened via the natural force of the boundless. The universe, though, is a continual play of elements separating and combining. In poetic fashion, Anaximander says that the boundless is the source of beings, and that into which they perish, “according to what must be: for they give recompense and pay restitution to each other for their injustice according to the ordering of time” (F1).
In the generation of the cosmos as we know it now, human beings came to be from other animals. While it would be inaccurate to call Anaximander the father of the theory of evolution, the history of that theory should at least make mention of his name. Anaximander thought that human beings could not have been at their origin the way that they are now. That is, they must have arisen from some other animals, since human beings need longer stretches of time for nurture than other animals. They could not have survived, he reasons, without the generative help of other animals (Graham 57). He thought that human beings arose from or were at least akin to fish (Graham 59). Beyond this, humans seem to have needed moisture and heat for their generation. More specifically, humans originated with moisture in some sort of shell, and eventually matured, moved onto land, “and survived in a different form for a short while” (Graham 63). What evidence Anaximander might have had to support these claims we can only guess, but his willingness to explain the world on its own terms, without recourse to divine generation or intervention (although he might well have considered the boundless to be divine), is the mark of a new way of thinking.
If our dates are approximate, Anaximenes (c.546-c.528/5 B.C.E.) could have had no direct philosophical contact with Anaximander. However, the conceptual link between them is undeniable. Like Anaximander, Anaximenes thought that there was something boundless that underlies all other things. Unlike Anaximander, Anaximenes made this boundless thing something definite—air. For Anaximander, hot and cold separated off from the boundless, and these generated other natural phenomena (Graham 79). For Anaximenes, air itself becomes other natural phenomena through condensation and rarefaction. Rarefied air becomes fire. When it is condensed, it becomes water, and when it is condensed further, it becomes earth and other earthy things, like stones (Graham 79). This then gives rise to all other life forms. Furthermore, air itself is divine. Both Cicero and Aetius report that, for Anaximenes, air is God (Graham 87). Air, then, changes into the basic elements, and from these we get all other natural phenomena. This means that ostensibly qualitative properties of things, for example, hot-cold, hard-soft, and so forth, are reducible to quantitative properties (McKirahan 51). Since air is boundless, it does not have a beginning or end, but is in a constant state of flux. Air is the morphological thread binding all things together.
A rather convenient psychological takeaway from Anaximenes’ theory is that the soul (psychê), traditionally considered to be breath, is itself airy (Graham 87). So, the individual human soul is in some way divine since each human being partakes of air. Again, it is remarkable that Anaximines, like his fellow Milesians, did not have recourse to Homeric or Hesiodic mythology to explain the world. The Milesians arguably stand at the beginning, at least as the testimony and scant textual evidence has it, of a distinct way of thinking that we consider to be scientific, however primitive it may be. Despite this inclination toward naturalistic explanations of the world, they considered the gods to be thoroughly infused with their world. With the Milesians comes a radical shift in thought. The radical nature of their thinking does not depend upon a rejection of all divinity, but a reformation in the way we think about it. This leads us to Xenophanes, who first explicitly formulated a critique of traditional ways of thinking about divinity.
Xenophanes (c. 570-c. 478 B.C.E.) was from Colophon, north of Miletus in Ionia. He did not remain in Colophon, but travelled around Greece reciting his poetry, finally settling in modern day Sicily. Since his views were expressed poetically, it is at times difficult to know how to interpret them. Thus, we should keep in mind that, while we have more fragmentary material from Xenophanes than all of the Milesians taken together, the way in which his views were expressed, and the fragmentary nature of our sources, prevents us from being certain about what exactly he meant. What exposure he might have had to Milesian thought we do not know. Like the Milesians, however, he challenged traditional theological views, but in a new way. Even his social views seem to have been at odds with the ancient Greek sensibilities. For example, he renounces the glorification and honorific status of athletes, saying that wisdom should be preferred (F2).
Unlike the Milesians (or the evidence we have of them), Xenophanes directly and explicitly challenged Homeric and Hesiodic mythology. “It is good,” says Hesiod, “to hold the gods in high esteem,” rather than portraying them in “raging battles, which are worthless” (F2). More explicitly, “Homer and Hesiod have attributed to the gods all things that are blameworthy and disgraceful for human beings: stealing, committing adultery, deceiving each other” (F17). At the root of this poor depiction of the gods is the human tendency towards anthropomorphizing the gods. “But mortals think gods are begotten, and have the clothing, voice and body of mortals” (F19), despite the fact that God is unlike mortals in body and thought. Indeed, Xenophanes famously proclaims that if other animals (cattle, lions, and so forth) were able to draw the gods, they would depict the gods with bodies like their own (F20). Beyond this, all things come to be from earth (F27), not the gods, although it is unclear whence the earth came. The reasoning seems to be that God transcends all of our efforts to make him like us. If everyone paints different pictures of divinity, and many people do, then it is unlikely that God fits into any of those frames. So, holding “the gods in high esteem” at least entails something negative, that is, that we take care not to portray them as super humans.
We have seen what the gods are not, but what is God or the gods? It is unclear whether or not Xenophanes was a theological monist or pluralist, but he seems at least to hint at either one God only, or one God above all others. “One God, greatest among gods and men…” (F23) could mean that there is one God only, despite the fact that mortals talk about a plurality of Gods, or that there is one God who is greater than all the rest. This God, in his entirety, sees, thinks, hears, and shakes all things by the thought of his mind (F24-F25). He remains, unmoving, in the same place (F26). If God is in some place, does this not mean that he is embodied? This is unclear, but Aristotle claims that Xenophanes thought of God as spherical, presumably based upon the picture of uniformity portrayed in the preceding fragments (Graham 113). We might also wonder whether or not this depiction of God, too, is in some way anthropomorphizing. How do we know that God has a mind, or that he hears, sees, and thinks? Xenophanes does not present us with answers to these questions. Whatever the case, Xenophanes’ God is unlike any previous conceptions of divinity, and seems to have set in motion a long tradition of critical and rational theology.
Ultimately, we can never know the full and simple truth about the gods or anything else. Even if we successfully describe events in our world, we cannot claim knowledge about such things; for, “opinion is wrought over all” (F35). This, however, apparently does not prevent us, through an effort of seeking, from understanding things better. If Xenophanes is a skeptic, therefore, his skepticism is pliable and open-ended. By rejecting dogmas, Xenophanes is willing to make rational conjectures about God.
Ancient thought was left with such a strong presence and legacy of Pythagorean influence, and yet little is known with certainty about Pythagoras of Samos (c. 570-c. 490 B.C.E.). A great deal of legend surrounds the life of Pythagoras. Scholars generally agree that Pythagoras left Samos for Croton, where he enjoyed political esteem as a ruler. His political success, however, was not his philosophical legacy, but instead the almost religious following that developed in his name (perhaps because of his political success). He developed a following that continued long past his death, on down to Philolaus of Croton (c. 470-c. 399 B.C.E.), a Pythagorean from whom we may gain some insight into Pythagoreanism. Whether or not the Pythagoreans followed a particular doctrine is up for debate, but it is clear that, with Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans, a new way of thinking was born in ancient philosophy, and had a significant impact on Platonic thought.
Many know Pythagoras for his eponymous theorem—the square of the hypotenuse of a right triangle is equal to the sum of the squares of the adjacent sides. Whether Pythagoras himself invented the theorem, or whether he or someone else brought it back from Egypt, is unknown. He was accorded almost godlike status among his followers, some saying that there are three classes of rational beings: the gods, human beings, and beings like Pythagoras (Graham 921). He was said to have a golden thigh, to have been hailed by name by the river Cosas, and to have been seen simultaneously in both Metapontum and Croton (Graham 919). Empedocles sung his praises by saying that Pythagoras could, by the power of his mind, behold all things “for ten or even twenty generations of men” (Graham 917).
One doctrine that scholars confidently attribute to Pythagoras and his followers is the transmigration of souls. The soul, for Pythagoras, finds its immortality by cycling through all living beings in a 3,000-year cycle, until it returns to a human being (Graham 915). Indeed, Xenophanes tells the story of Pythagoras walking by a puppy who was being beaten. Pythagoras cried out that the beating should cease, because he recognized the soul of a friend in the puppy’s howl (Graham 919). Another Pythagorean view seems not to have restricted a life cycle to souls, but widened the scope to all things, such that there is nothing completely new, since everything has happened before and will happen again (Graham 919). What exactly the Pythagorean psychology entails for a Pythagorean lifestyle is unclear, but we pause to consider some of the typical characteristics reported of and by Pythagoreans.
Pythagoreans were famous for their silence (Graham 911). Their teachings were transmitted cryptically, and it is unclear how strict of a doctrine the followers were demanded to observe. Some are reported to have refrained from eating or handling beans, either because they resemble genitals or the gates of Hades. Some were commanded not to sacrifice a white rooster, since white symbolized purity and goodness, and because roosters are sacred to Men, and thus roosters announce the sunrise in the morning (Graham 923). There were also the akousmatikoi (things heard), which were expressed in three categories: what something is, what the most x is (for example, what is the wisest?), and what one should or should not do (e.g abstention from beans or sacrificing white cocks). The Oracle at Delphi was said to be the tetractys and, therefore, harmony, which satisfies the first set of akousmatikoi. Number is said to be the wisest, with giving names to things coming in second for wisdom (Graham 923).
Plato and Aristotle tended to associate the holiness and wisdom of number—and along with this, harmony and music—with the Pythagoreans (Graham 499). For example, the decad was sacred. The tetractys shows us the holiness of the number ten.
Here, we can see a relationship among numbers, all of which leads us to a figure. There is the one, which begets plurality (two). When we add three and four to these, there is the sum of ten, which signifies the composition of the cosmos (Graham 499). There were nine visible heavenly bodies, and so the Pythagoreans posited a tenth body, counter-earth, to balance out the cosmos. The tetractys also gives us the ratios of harmony: 1:2, 2:3, and 3:4, or the octave, the fifth, and the fourth, respectively (McKirahan 92). The universe is harmony, and Philolaus considered the soul also to be a harmony (Graham 505). Thus, at least for Philolaus, the soul could be considered to be a type of microcosm.
Perhaps more basic than number, at least for Philolaus, are the concepts of the limited and unlimited. Nothing in the cosmos can be without limit (F1), including knowledge (F4). Imagine if nothing were limited, but matter were just an enormous heap or morass. Next, suppose that you are somehow able to gain a perspective of this morass (to do so, there must be some limit that gives you that perspective!). Presumably, nothing at all could be known, at least not with any degree of precision, the most careful observation notwithstanding. Additionally, all known things have number, and number is classed in two kinds: odd and even (F6). Number, too, can be seen here as a kind of limiter. Each thing is one, and thus separate from other things.
There is evidence to suggest that some Pythagoreans gave credence to a list of opposites in addition to limit-unlimited and odd-even: one-plurality, right-left, male-female, rest-motion, straight-bent, light-dark, good-evil, square-oblong. The left side of each of these binaries would be organized in one column, while the right side would be organized in a parallel column. Although it is unclear how, these columns of opposites somehow give us insight into the basic stuff of the cosmos and of being. Notice also that there are ten pairs of opposites. Limit-unlimited and odd-even are listed first, and these give rise to the rest of the cosmos (McKirahan 97). Thus, the Pythagoreans saw a universe whose nature is numerical, but also one in the tension of harmony, and similar to Heraclitus, the tension of opposites.
Just south of Colophon in Ionia was Ephesus, where yet more new philosophical blood was circulating. Heraclitus (c. 540-c. 480 B.C.E.) stands out in ancient Greek philosophy not only with respect to his ideas, but also with respect to how those ideas were expressed. His aphoristic style is rife with wordplay and conceptual ambiguities. Heraclitus was getting at what he saw as a reality composed of contraries—a reality, too, whose continual process of change is precisely what keeps it at rest. Such a unique style of thought and expression seems to have sprung forth from a life just as unique, and perhaps even contrarian. While we often do well to proceed cautiously with Diogenes Laertius’ accounts of the philosophers, his account of Heraclitus is telling, and fits with Heraclitus’ sometimes scathing thought. Diogenes Laertius calls him “conceited” and “haughty,” citing as evidence Heraclitus’ denunciation of Hesiod, Pythagoras, Xenophanes, and Hecataeus as people who have learned much (literally, polymaths), but understand little. Diogenes Laertius says that Heraclitus “studied with no one, but asserted he inquired of himself and learned everything by himself” (Graham 139). Indeed, when reading Heraclitus, one can easily imagine a loner whose originality of thought was closely linked with, if not born from, that solitude.
He is often critical of the ignorance—that is, the lack of genuine understanding—of the majority of human beings. He speaks of a logos (translatable as “word,” “reason,” “rationality,” “language,” “ratio,” and so forth) that most human beings do not understand, neither before nor after they hear it. Many people are asleep, despite being awake. “Having heard without comprehension, they are like the deaf; this saying bears witness to them: present they are absent” (F6). Pronouncing a sentiment further echoed in Plato and Aristotle, Heraclitus says, “the many are base, while the few are noble” (F12). Most people do not observe the world carefully enough, and few attain a true understanding of it. There is in Heraclitus a distinction between having much information under one’s belt, and understanding how all of it fits together, what it all means, that is, its overall significance.
One might wonder whether or not God, for Heraclitus, is synonymous with reality, so that a real understanding of the universe is an understanding of what is sacred. God is “day night, winter summer, war peace, satiety hunger…” (F103). Fire plays a significant role in his picture of the cosmos. No God or man created the cosmos, but it always was, is, and will be fire. At times it seems as though fire, for Heraclitus, is a primary element from which all things come and to which they return. At others, his comments on fire could easily be seen metaphorically. What is fire? It is at once “need and satiety.” This back and forth, or better yet, this tension and distension is characteristic of life and reality—a reality that cannot function without contraries, such as war and strife. “A road up and down is one and the same” (F38). Whether one travels up the road or down it, the road is the same road. “On those stepping into rivers staying the same other and other waters flow” (F39). In his Cratylus, Plato quotes Heraclitus, via the mouthpiece of Cratylus, as saying that “you could not step twice into the same river,” comparing this to the way everything in life is in constant flux (Graham 158). This, according to Aristotle, supposedly drove Cratylus to the extreme of never saying anything for fear that the words would attempt to freeze a reality that is always fluid, and so, Cratylus merely pointed (Graham 183). Whether or not this is a fair interpretation of Heraclitus, we can see that change plays a central role in his thought. Yet, Heraclitus recognizes that “changing it rests” (F52). So, the cosmos and all things that make it up are what they are through the tension and distention of time and becoming. The river is what it is by being what it is not. Fire, or the ever burning cosmos, is at war with itself, and yet at peace—it is constantly wanting fuel to keep burning, and yet it burns and is satisfied.
Three important thinkers fall under the category of Eleatic thought: Parmenides, Zeno, and Melissus. The latter was not from Elea as the former two were, but his thought directly inherits the monism typical of Parmenides and Zeno. Thus, Melissus will be treated in this section after Parmenides and Zeno.
If it is true that for Heraclitus life thrives and even finds stillness in its continuous movement and change, then for Parmenides (c. 515-c. 450 B.C.E.) life is at a standstill. Haling from Elea (a Greek colony in modern day Italy), and the father of Eleatic philosophy, Parmenides was a pivotal figure in Presocratic thought, and one of the most influential of the Presocratics in determining the course of Western philosophy. According to McKirahan, Parmenides is the inventor of metaphysics (157)—the inquiry into the nature of being or reality. While the tenets of his thought have their home in poetry, they are expressed with the force of logic. The Parmenidean logic of being thus sparked a long lineage of inquiry into the nature of being and thinking.
Parmenides’ poem moves in three parts: a sort of foreword (proemium), a section on Truth, and a section on Opinion (the way of mortals). The narrator of the poem describes allegorically a journey in a chariot, led speedily along by mares, but guided by maidens from the House of Night. He was led to the threshold of the paths of Night and Day, where Justice holds the keys that open the door to each. The maidens persuaded Justice, with gentle words, to open the door between Night and Day, whereupon the travellers were greeted by a goddess, who claims to teach the only paths for thought: “the one: that it is and that it is not possible not to be, is the path of Persuasion (for she attends on Truth); the other: that it is not and that it is right it should not be, this I declare to you is an utterly inscrutable track, for neither could you know what is not (for it cannot be accomplished), nor could you declare it” (F2). The “inscrutable” track is the path of mortals (Opinion), while the former is the path of Truth. Curiously, the goddess urges the sojourner to learn both, claiming that “it is right for you to learn all things.” The goddess suggests that, although the path of Opinion is ultimately wrong-headed, it is nevertheless wise to understand why such a path is one to which many so often cling.
The first path is the path of being. The Greek word esti(n) is the third person singular of the verb to be. It need not express a subject, and does not in Parmenides’ poem. We therefore import the English word “it” into the translation for smooth English. There is much debate about the way Parmenides uses to be in his poem, but the possibilities are these. First, he might have used esti in an existential sense, that is, that something simply exists (for example, Spot exists). Second, he might have meant esti in the predicative sense, for example, “the t-shirt is red.” Third, esti could take a sense of identity, as in, “A=B.” Fourth is the veridical sense, or, “it is true that X.” Finally, there could be some combination of some or all of these senses of esti (Sedley 114-115 and McKirahan, 160-163). Whatever the case, Parmenides does seem to have in mind the whole—all of being. As soon as we differentiate among types of beings, we have entered into the way of Opinion or plurality.
The right way of thinking is to think of what-is, and the wrong way is to think both what-is and what-is-not. The latter is wrong, and the goddess forbids it, simply because non-being is not. In other words, there is no non-being, so properly speaking, it cannot be thought—there is nothing there to think. We can think only what is and, presumably, since thinking is a type of being, “thinking and being are the same” (F3). It is only our long entrenched habits of sensation that mislead us into thinking down the wrong path. We are, as it were, “two-headed” and helpless in our ignorant journey down the path of Opinion, and we mistakenly think that being and non-being are the same.
The goddess names several characteristics of what-is. It is ungenerated and imperishable, whole and one, unperturbed, complete, completely present (without past or future), and continuous. Parmenides makes use of the Principle of Sufficient Reason to say that there is no sufficient reason for being, or what-is, to have been generated at this time or that (McKirahan 167). If at one time it came to be, that means that at one time it was not, which is impossible. It cannot not be, that is, what-is is necessary. Moreover, what-is is motionless, since motion would involve non-being, that is, changing in place or in quality requires going from what is to what is not. It is therefore the same all around and held within a limit, “which confines it round about” (F8.31). Parmenides goes so far as to compare it to a ball, maintaining balance and equal tension in all directions from the center out. It is thus complete. Is it problematic to have being bounded by a limit? Would this not mean that there is something outside being, effectively making what is outside its limits non-being? Apparently, we are to remain resolute in thinking of the sphere as complete and as all being, even though we mortals sometimes mistakenly divide it up, or conceive it as something inside a container.
Now the goddess presents the way of Opinion. She claims that her words about this way will be illusory or deceptive, meaning that the subject matter itself produces the deception. Mortals claim that there is both being and non-being. We observe the world with our senses, and put too much faith in these rather than in reason, which tells us that there is only one true way—being. Oddly, our interpretations of Parmenides become even more obscured when we reach this section. The reader is tempted to believe that Parmenides himself gave at least some degree of credence to mortal opinion. Indeed, we are told that Parmenides considered the earth and fire to be the sources of all that it is. Aristotle says that Parmenides does this in order to explain why, for reason, there is only one eternal being, while for the senses, there is a plurality of beings. Parmenides classified the hot, then, as what-is, and the cold as non-being (Graham 221).
Parmenides must in some way account for the fact that most human beings hold fast to the information that the senses provide. If most of us are in error, it is a subtle and elusive one. Since, by habit, we are so easily convinced of the truth of the senses, Parmenides attempts to explain why this is, and also attempts to give us a more intelligible account of the sensible world. The information we have does not present a clear picture of Parmenides’ vision of the cosmos, but it does give us some ideas of its nature. The hot is responsible for separation, and the cold is responsible for coalescence. Beyond this, Parmenides seems to have been a rather serious astronomer, whose astronomical theory in some important ways prefigures modern astronomy. He may have been the first Greek—the Babylonians already being privy to it—to have claimed the morning and evening star to be the same thing (Graham 225). He also claimed that the moon’s light is a reflection of the sun’s light. He may even have thought that the earth was spherical (Graham 241). Again, the earth, like being, has no reason to move this way or that, due to its equilibrium.
We see in Parmenides a reverence for reason. Even his cosmology is based upon reason rather than the senses alone. In a time before telescopes or any other sophisticated observational technology, Parmenides had to move beyond the evidence of the senses alone to determine that the morning and evening star is the same, and that the moon reflects the sun’s light. To all appearances, the moon somehow generates its own light. Parmenides, however, moved beyond appearances to explain appearances. For this very reason there is also tension in Parmenides’ thought. No matter how much faith we put in reason, and no matter how much we deny the evidence of the senses, the sensory world still convincingly thrusts itself upon us, and demands our thought, attention, and understanding. Perhaps in the end this understanding of the natural world, which to all appearances is a mixture of being and non-being, shows us a unified, eternal and simple being.
Zeno (c. 490-c. 430 B.C.E.), also a native of Elea, was Parmenides’ student and possibly his boyfriend (homosexuality in ancient Greek culture was fairly common—among intellectuals, the student performed favors in order to receive the teacher’s wisdom). As Daniel Graham says, “Parmenides argues for monism, Zeno argues against pluralism” (Graham 245). That is, Zeno seems to have composed a text wherein he claims to show the absurdity of accepting that there is a plurality of beings. He uses arguments, often in a reductio ad absurdum form, to prove positively that there cannot be plurality, and negatively (or by an implied inference), that the only possibility is that what-is is one. Beyond this, he argued against motion and against place. Suffice to say, Zeno’s paradoxes have since his day provided problems for philosophers and mathematicians alike. Let us examine some of Zeno’s arguments.
Many of Zeno’s arguments can be dizzying. One argument contains an important claim upon which many other arguments have their foundation. There might have been an argument for this claim, but there is none extant (Graham 267). For the sake of clarity, Graham’s summary of this initial claim (claim (a) below) and following arguments will be quoted:
(a) If there are many things, no one has size because it is one and the same as itself.
(b) If each of the many did not have size, it would not exist, for if it were added to or subtracted from something, it would make no difference to that thing.
(c) If there are many things, each must have size and solidity, and hence each must have parts with size and solidity, and similarly each of these parts must have parts.
(d) Hence, if there are many things, they must be both small and large; so small as to have no size, and so large as to be unlimited (infinite). (267)
The set of arguments (b)-(d) is aiming to disprove plurality. These arguments seem somehow to be based upon (a), which seems to be the conclusion of an argument for which we have no premises. At the least, we can see here, if only obscurely, Zeno’s efforts to deny pluralism.
An argument from Plato’s Parmenides goes like this. If there are many things, then each thing will be both like and unlike, and so a contradiction ensues (F1). For example, body X will be like bodies Y and Z in that all three are bodies taking up space. Yet, each of the three will be unlike the other since, let us suppose, X is red, Y is blue, and Z is green. Thus, X is both like and unlike Y and Z. If this is all there was to Zeno’s argument, as Plato presents it (perhaps simply for the dramatic purposes of the dialogue), then it is not a contradiction, since each body is like and unlike the other in different respects (McKirahan 182).
Zeno shows that if we attempt to count a plurality, we also end up with an absurdity. If there are is a plurality, then there would be neither more nor less than the number that they are. Thus, there would be a finite number of things. On the other hand, if there is a plurality, then the number would be infinite, because there is always something else between existing things, and something else between those, and something else between those, ad infinitum. Thus, if there were a plurality of things, then that plurality
would be both infinite and finite in number, which is absurd (F4).
A central argument, at least in what we have available of Zeno’s work, is what the ancients called the argument from dichotomy. There are two versions of this argument. In the first, we suppose that what-is is divisible, and then we end up with two absurdities. If it is divisible, it will be divided down into a an infinite number of finite parts, or it will be divided so much that nothing at all is left over. The first option is less clear. Zeno probably has in mind that an infinite number of finite parts would go to make up something that is infinitely great in size when taken as a whole (as above). The second option is clearly absurd. Therefore, being or what-is is one and indivisible (Graham 259).
The idea of infinite divisibility plays a key role in many of Zeno’s arguments. For example, let us look at his arguments against motion. It is impossible for a body in motion to traverse, say, a distance of twenty feet. In order to do so, the body must first arrive at the halfway point, or ten feet. But in order to arrive there, the body in motion must travel five feet. But in order to arrive there, the body must travel two and a half feet, ad infinitum. Since, then, space is infinitely divisible, but we have only a finite time to traverse it, it cannot be done. Presumably, one could not even begin a journey at all. Aristotle criticized this argument by saying that there are two senses of “infinite” with reference to magnitudes: there is infinite divisibility and infinity with reference to extremes (Graham 261). We cannot get through an infinite quantity in a finite time, but one can get through an infinitely divisible space, because time is also infinitely divisible. If there is a parallel between the divisibility of space and time, then we can cross an infinitely divisible span of space, because there will be a bit of time measuring each bit of the motion in which to do it.
Similar to this argument is the Achilles argument. Swift-footed Achilles will never be able to catch up with the slowest runner, assuming the runner started at some point ahead of Achilles, because Achilles must first reach the place where the slow runner began. This means that the slow runner will already be a bit beyond where he began. Once Achilles progresses to the next place, the slow runner is already beyond that point, too. Thus, motion seems absurd.
Again, an arrow flying from point A to point B is actually not in motion. At each moment in its apparent flight, it occupies a place equal to its size. If something occupies a place equal to itself, it must be at rest, since nothing can be in a place equal to itself while in motion. Thus, the arrow is not actually in flight, but at rest in its place. Aristotle’s criticism here is that Zeno assumes time to be composed of indivisible moments or “nows.” Now the arrow is here, and now it is here, and now it is here, and so on. The other assumption of Zeno’s argument is that something is only in a place when it is at rest. He also argues against place, however, by saying that if something is in a place, then that place must be in a place, and that place must be in a place, ad infinitum. Thus, if everything is in a place, then there would be infinite places of those places, and this is absurd (Graham 261).
The most conceptually difficult argument is the Stadium or Moving Rows paradox. Suppose there is a set of bodies at one end of a racetrack and one at another. They will both move in opposite directions at equal speeds and will thereby run past one another. They will both pass by a third set of stationary bodies equal in size to the racing bodies. The Stadium paradox is often illustrated in the following way.
The Bs and Cs are in motion, while the As are stationary. The Bs and Cs are moving at an equal and constant rate of speed. Since their starting point is the middle A, so to speak, it should take the Bs and Cs twice as long to bypass each other as it takes them to bypass the As. That is, the rightmost B must move past only one A, while it must move past two Cs, and the leftmost C must move past two Bs, but only one A. The Cs and Bs have therefore moved across both a longer and a shorter distance at the same time; thus the contradiction (Graham 263). Aristotle, however, says that this reasoning is fallacious since the Bs and Cs are in motion. Since they are in motion, and moving at an equal speed, it will take them half as long to move past each other as it does to pass a stationary A (Graham 263). Some commentators, thinking that Zeno could not possibly have made such an egregious error, suppose that Zeno might have intended for each body in the row to be atomic, i.e., indivisible. If this were the case, then a B cannot move past only half of an A or a C (since they are indivisible), but must move past the whole body at once. Thus, Zeno’s paradox would remain intact, although we have no textual evidence that this is what Zeno had in mind (McKirahan 192).
The final paradox is the millet seed paradox, which is either given to us in an incomplete way, or is simply fallacious. If a bushel of millet seeds dropped, it will make a sound. If this is true, then one millet seed when dropped should also make a sound, and one ten thousandth of a part should as well. But this does not happen. As it is, there are two problems with this argument. On the surface, we do not know what Zeno meant to prove from this. Logically, the argument commits the fallacy of division. Just because the whole (the bushel) makes a sound when dropped, we cannot conclude that any given part (one ten thousandth of a seed) will as well (Graham 265). Whatever the case, the overall picture of Zeno is of his fight against plurality and motion for the sake of monism.
We know little about Melissus’ life except that he was an admiral and organized a battle against the Athenians (c. 441 B.C.E.). Philosophically, he clearly defends Parmenidean monism, although he does differ from Parmenides on at least two counts: the temporality of what-is, and whether or not what-is is unlimited or limited. He also differs from Zeno by laying out a clear thesis defending the unity of being.
Melissus sets out a system of concomitant and sequential arguments. First, what-is, or being, cannot have come from nothing. Nor could being have come to be from what-is, because this would mean that being already was. Likewise, and perhaps inversely to the first principle, being cannot become non-being. It therefore cannot perish. So, being, or what-is, is everlasting. Next, since it is everlasting—it does not come to be or perish—it has no limits set upon it, and so it is unlimited (apeiron). From this, we can see that being is one. If it were two or more, then each would be limited by the other. This leads us to see that what-is must be the same as itself, and therefore cannot be subject to the throes and flux of rearranging, pain, or any other sort of passion. Closely related to this, what-is must be motionless, since motion is a type of change. Similarly, there is no void, since the void would be nothing. This is another reason why what-is cannot move. To move, there must be emptiness or void, but since void cannot exist, we are left with fullness, that is, being is a plenum (Graham 467).
What is Melissus’ answer to the objection that we clearly observe with our senses flux and change in the world? He claims that there is only one thing that follows from his thesis. If there really is earth, fire, different types of metals, and so forth, then they must be like the one or what-is—they must each be as we first perceive them to be, for example, this here is fire, and that there is earth, and nothing else. However, when we think we see something hot becoming cold, then we simply have not observed correctly. “For they would not change if they were real, but they would remain just such as each appeared to be” (F8). Melissus does not explain what it is about our observation that goes awry. How is it that we make mistakes like thinking that we have observed a metal corroding? Melissus has no satisfactory answer to this question. If, he says, we observe correctly—if what we observe is real—it cannot change. He wants to hang on to an idea of reality where the elements, at least, remain. If we see fire, then there is always fire, despite this particular blaze burning out. Although this or that fire may be extinguished, fire is not extinguished.
Anaxagoras and Empedocles are alike in at least two ways: first, they adhere to the Eleatic principle that being is necessary, that is, it is impossible for being not to be; second, and related to this Eleatic principle, being cannot be generated, nor can it perish, and thus all being is a continual process of mixture and separation.
Anaxagoras of Clazomenae (c. 500-c. 428 B.C.E.) had what was, up until that time, the most unique perspective on the nature of matter and the causes of its generation and corruption. Closely predating Plato (Anaxagoras died around the time that Plato was born), Anaxagoras left his impression upon Plato and Aristotle, although they were both ultimately dissatisfied with his cosmology (Graham 309-313). He seems to have been almost exclusively concerned with cosmology and the true nature of all that is around us. In fact, some ancient authorities have even called him an atheist (Graham 305). This might be due to his purely naturalistic explanations of the world. He thought, for instance, that the sun, moon, and other heavenly bodies were fiery stones rather than divinities (Graham 297). He is also thought to have explained—more or less correctly—the phenomenon of hail (Graham 303). As we shall see, Anaxagoras called upon his senses to do their work, but also his mind to look beyond what could be seen into the causes for all things.
Before the cosmos was as it is now, it was nothing but a great mixture—everything was in everything. The mixture was so thoroughgoing that no part of it was recognizable, due to the smallness of each thing, and not even any colors were perceptible. He considered matter to be infinitely divisible. That is, because it is impossible for being not to be, there is never a smallest part, but there is always a smaller. If the parts of the great mixture were not infinitely divisible, then we would be left with a smallest part. Since the smallest part could not become smaller, any attempt at dividing it again would presumably obliterate it. The infinitely divisible parts seem to have at least been mixtures of elemental or basic stuffs—earth, wet and dry, hot and cold, and “seeds” (sperma). The nature of these seeds is unclear. They might have been simply the germ of generation or small bits of elemental things. At any rate, these seeds and all other things were mixed together prior to separation (F1-F5).
The separation of the thoroughgoing mixture was generated by a high-speed centrifugal spin (F7). It was the force and speed of the spinning that caused the separating off of each being from the other. However, this separation was not a complete purification or isolation of parts. In fact, beings in the world as we know it, says Anaxagoras, are still mixtures (F8). Everything is still in everything. The difference is that the separating force generated recognizable and individuated beings. So why, then, does gold appear to us as gold and not, say, bone, since everything is in everything? A gold coin is considered to be gold because it has more gold than anything else. The predominant bits, in other words, make up the being as we know it (McKirahan 213). The question of how something small, like a gold coin, could ever hold bits of everything in it goes unanswered in our existing information of Anaxagoras.
The processes of mixture and separation are unceasing. Generation, says Anaxagoras, is mixing, and what appears to be perishing is really separation (F11). This has profound implications for what we consider to be human mortality. Under Anaxagoras’ cooperating principles of mixture and separation, what appears to be change into non-being (death) is impossible. We might surmise that what we call death is nothing more than a separation of these parts (this particular human body) and a mixture back into those parts (the earth). Likewise, a birth cannot be a creation out of nothing. The birth began as a mixture of seeds, which themselves were presumably already mixtures of other things. What comes to be cannot come from what is not. So, generation relies upon what already is. The Anaxagorean world, then, is a continuous play of being. Like the Eleatics, Anaxagoras relies upon the idea that what-is cannot possibly not be, that is, being is necessary. Also like the Eleatics, the senses, for Anaxagoras, do not give us an exhaustively accurate picture of reality—we must rely upon reason to make sense of the world. The difference between Anaxagoras and the Eleatics, however, is that Anaxagoras allows for change and natural processes to take place, without reducing these processes to sensory illusions.
There is one important player in this continuous play of being yet to be mentioned: mind (nous). Although mind can be in some things, nothing else can be in it—mind is unmixed. We recall that, for Anaxagoras, everything is mixed with everything. There is some portion of everything in anything that we identify. Thus, if anything at all were mixed with mind, then everything would be mixed with mind. This mixture would obstruct mind’s ability to rule all else. Mind is in control, and is responsible for having started the spinning of the great mixture, such that individual beings were generated in the process of separation. Everlasting mind—the most pure and fine of all things—is responsible for ordering the world. Thus, Anaxagoras’ world is not a chaotic process of mixture and separation; rather, the processes of mixture and separation are ordered by mind, which is unmixed.
Anaxagoras left his mark on the thought of both Plato and Aristotle, whose critiques of Anaxagoras are similar. In Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates recounts in brief his intellectual history, citing his excitement over his discovery of Anaxagoras’ thought. He was most excited about mind as an ultimate cause of all. Yet, Socrates complains, Anaxagoras made very little use of mind to explain what was best for each of the heavenly bodies in their motions, or the good of anything else. That is, Socrates seems to have wanted some explanation as to why it is good for all things to be as they are (Graham 309-311). Aristotle, too, complains that Anaxagoras makes only minimal use of his principle of mind. It becomes, as it were, a deus ex machina, that is, whenever Anaxagoras was unable to give any other explanation for the cause of a given event, he fell back upon mind (Graham 311-313). It is possible, as always, that both Plato and Aristotle resort here to a straw man of sorts in order to advance their own positions. Indeed, we have seen that Anaxagoras’ principle of mind set the great mixture into motion, and then ordered the cosmos as we know it. This is no insignificant feat.
We have an extensive poem from Empedocles of Acragas (near Sicily). He lived from 495-435 B.C.E., overlapping with Anaxagoras and Socrates. Much legend surrounds his life, and it is of course difficult to distinguish fact from fiction. He was a philosophical adherent to a Parmenidean principle of being, that is, what-is cannot not be (Graham 333). Politically, he was an advocate for democracy (Graham 335). Religiously, he seems to have been a Pythagorean, advocating a particular diet (F146-147) and endorsing the doctrine of the transmigration of souls (F124). He was reportedly a physician with a penchant for magic and prophecy. He was supposed to have kept alive a woman who neither breathed nor ate for thirty days (Graham 333). He was reportedly a self-proclaimed god, wearing purple robes, bronze shoes, and a gold wreath. To show his divinity, we are told that he leapt into the volcano at Mount Etna, purifying himself of his body (Graham 337). Legend notwithstanding, we have a substantial amount of his poetry, even if it is at times cryptic.
At its most basic, the cosmos consists of a total of four elements or “roots,” plus two forces that are responsible for combining and separating these elements (F9). Empedocles was the first to name the four elements as earth, air, fire, and water. Love is the force that brings these elements, and the things generated from them, together, while Strife rends them (Graham 347). Empedocles, in Fragment 20 for example, repeatedly refers to a ceaseless cycle of unity from plurality (a movement of Love), and plurality from unity (a movement of Strife). While the names Empedocles uses for these forces might seem to us to carry moral overtones (Love as good and Strife as bad), they appear to be morally neutral for Empedocles—Love and Strife are simply the natural forces that guide the ceaseless motion of being.
Reminiscent of Anxagoras’ mixture, Love holds all things together in perfect unity when it reigns supreme. As Strife begins to hold sway, the unity is pulled apart, presumably producing the sorts of singular beings we see all around us now. Empedocles makes clear, however, that these cycles are not cycles of production out of nothing or perishing into nothing (F11). What-is, or being, never ceases to be, and something cannot come from nothing, nor can anything utterly perish into nothing. Human beings are simply mistaken when we claim that this is how the world works. Empedocles claims to employ the language of birth and death only as a matter of convention, recognizing that the truth is always at hand (F12). Love and Strife are not only responsible for the unification and pluralization of the elements and all things, but they are at play in the world as we know it now. Through an everlasting play of alteration, some things are repelled by one another through Strife, and others are brought together through Love. Some things are fitted for blending, and others are prone to separation (F23). Empedocles likens this to painters mixing colors, some more and some less, in order to create a painting (F24). Likewise, Love and Strife (the painters) bring together and pull apart the primeval elements. Everything that was, is, and will be owes its being to the play of Love and Strife.
How the process of mixture and separation happens is unclear. Empedocles tells us that there is a vortex. When Love is at the middle of the vortex, all things are unified—all things come from their respective places to join together in Love. All the while, Strife is retreating to the outside of the vortex. When Strife gains the strength to do its work, then there is the separation of the elements. First air (or aether) was separated off, then fire, earth separated off next, and then water gushed forth from earth as a result of the pressure of the heavenly rotations. When everything is in complete separation, nothing of our world is recognizable. We are, presumably, now living in a world wherein Love and Strife are both at work, with neither one dominating (McKirahan 269-270).
Despite the predominance of his macrocosmic metaphysics in the surviving works and fragments, Empedocles did reason on the microcosmic and physical level. Different kinds of flesh seem to have been generated from different blends of the four elements (Graham 381). For human beings, perception and intelligence are keener in those whose elements are mixed more equally. Perception and intelligence, in fact, seem proportionate to one another—the more perceptive a being, the more intelligent the being (Graham 403). Moreover, thought seems to be a function of blood circulation, and Empedocles identifies the area around the heart as the area for thought (F115). There may also be a connection here with his theory of respiration. Inhalation occurs when blood retreats from tubes (presumably in the nose) and air fills those tubes. Blood rushing back into the tubes forces the air out (F78). Perception itself seems to occur when certain “effluences” from the perceived thing flow through the medium (air or water, for example) and into the pores of the sense organs. One sense cannot sense the object of another sense because the size and nature of the pores will not allow it. For example, the eyes seem to contain light or fire, and let in a certain amount of light. The ears, however, receive sound when the air outside moves and strikes the inner ear causing an echo (Graham 401).
Sometimes Empedocles describes himself as a fugitive from the gods (F8), and sometimes as himself a god who speaks the truth: “When I come to other flourishing cities I am revered by them, men and women alike” (F120). And again, “But why do I urge these things, as if doing some great deed, if I am superior to mortal men who perish many times?” (F121). At times, it seems he is a fallen god, and that humankind is for the most part fallen from divinity (F8). He seems to have advocated some type of transmigration of souls (F124), with reincarnation being based upon the purity of one’s life (Graham 415). Whether or not dietary and spiritual purity will result in salvation or re-divination is unclear. It does seem, however, that physical and spiritual purity, and intellectual prowess brings us closest to divinity. After a “fast from wickedness” (F150), “they become prophets, singers of hymns, physicians, and leaders among men on earth; afterwards they blossom as gods foremost in honors” (F153). Through it all, Love and Strife dominate and dictate the cycles of being.
Ancient atomism began a legacy in philosophical and scientific thought, and this legacy was revived and significantly evolved in modern philosophy. In contemporary times, the atom is not the smallest particle. Etymologically, however, atomos is that which is uncut or indivisible. The ancient atomists, Leucippus and Democritus (c. 5th century B.C.E.), were concerned with the smallest particles in nature that make up reality—particles that are both indivisible and invisible. They were to some degree responding to Parmenides and Zeno by indicating atoms as indivisible sources of motion, while Parmenides and Zeno considered the world to be indivisible and motionless. Since we have very little from his teacher, Leucippus, the focus here will be on Democritus’ thought.
Despite the fact that Democritus was supposed to have been a prolific writer (we are told that he wrote approximately seventy books), we now have very little of his writing on atomism (Graham 521-525). What seems clear, however, is that Democritus thought that reality is made up of the full and the empty (void). The full is what-is, and the void is what-is-not (F4). Curiously, however, Democritus said that what-is is no more than what-is-not, that is, they have the same ontological status—each is as real as the other. We might interpret this, along with Aristotle, as meaning that there is body (the full), and there is void, and neither has any higher degree of being than the other. That the void is, is as much an ontological fact as the being of the plenum (Graham 525).
Atoms—the most compact and the only indivisible bodies in nature—are infinite in number, and they constantly move through an infinite void. In fact, motion would be impossible, says Democritus, without the void. If there were no void, the atoms would have nothing through which to move. Atoms take on a variety, perhaps an infinite variety, of shapes. Some are round, others are hooked, and yet others are jagged. They often collide with one another, and often bounce off of one another. Sometimes, though, the shapes of the colliding atoms are amenable to one another, and they come together to form the matter that we identify as the sensible world (F5). This combination, too, would be impossible without the void. Atoms need a background (emptiness) out of which they are able to combine (Graham 531). Atoms then stay together until some larger environmental force breaks them apart, at which point they resume their constant motion (F5). Why certain atoms come together to form a world seems up to chance, and yet many worlds have been, are, and will be formed by atomic collision and coalescence (Graham 551). Once a world is formed, however, all things happen by necessity—the causal laws of nature dictate the course of the natural world (Graham 551-553).
Figure, order, and position (or orientation) serve as the basic marks of distinction among atoms and the things that are (F4). Leucippus and Democritus seem to have identified these distinguishing marks as contour, contact, and turning (or rotation), respectively. These three determine which atoms combine to form elemental bodies like fire and water. It is important to note, however, that atoms themselves are immutable. The sensible world is generated from their combination, and things perish when some force causes the dispersal of the atoms.
Atoms are also responsible for sense perception and thought. Atoms of particular shapes are responsible for particular tastes, for example, round atoms are responsible for sweet tastes, while sour flavors consist of rough and angled atoms (Graham 581). Touch works similarly. Sight, hearing, and smell, however, are in some sense reducible to touch. Sensed objects always have effluences (Graham 585). We can see a tree, for example, because the tree’s atomic form somehow flows from it and makes contact with the atoms making up the eye, and the image of the tree is therefore carried into the eye. This might raise the problem of how effluences from large objects (for example, buildings) can fit into an object as small as the eye, but it could be that the effluences are somehow condensed before entering the eye (McKirahan 332). Democritus’ view of perception has important consequences for his epistemology.
If what we perceive are effluences of things, we do not perceive the things themselves; thus, we cannot know things as they are in themselves, but only as they appear to us (Graham 624). The truth is that there are atoms and void, all else is opinion and convention. It was said above that certain types of atoms are responsible for certain types of tastes, but even here convention and relativity have the final word. When certain atoms from certain objects come into contact with the atoms of different perceivers, what is sweet to one person might taste bitter to another. “By convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color, but in reality atoms and void” (F32a). More precisely, we thoroughly understand very little, “but we perceive what changes in relation to the disposition of the body as things enter or resist” (F33). Even the human soul is a certain configuration and balance of atoms, and the best we can do is think, even if we cannot know much. In this way, Democritus is seen to be influential for Skepticism (Graham 516), but he is not a thoroughgoing skeptic since he claims that atoms and void can be known.
While we have scant direct access to Democritus’ physical theory, we have an abundance of his own words regarding ethics. Most of his ethical thought comes to us in pithy aphorisms, with a central theme of contentment and freedom from disturbance. Well-being is founded upon contentment and being undisturbed, and these are attained by doing what is truly beneficial for oneself (Graham 633-635). The measure of what is beneficial is pleasure and pain, or joy and sorrow (F150b). It is clear, however, that Democritus does not condone sensual hedonism. In other words, there seems to be a loftier standard for what counts as pleasurable or joyful. “Those who get pleasure from the belly, when they exceed what is appropriate in food, drink, or sex, all find their pleasures are brief and short-lived, lasting only as long as they are eating or drinking, and their pains many” (F149). Constantly and excessively seeking pleasure in the flesh leads only to pain. By contrast, “reason is accustomed to take joys from itself” (F154). So, it is intellectual pleasure that is truly beneficial, and is the best measure of the best sort of life.
Reminiscent of Heraclitus, Democritus says that the best sort of person sees greater value in thinking than in polymathy (F203), and greater value in good action than in words about goodness (F267-F268). Fools leave things to chance (F105), while the wise person thinks, learns, and plans according to intelligence (F93). Interestingly, there is here a juncture of Democritus’ physical thought and his ethics. If the soul is a configuration of atoms, then teaching, learning, thought, and wisdom can help to refigure the soul and free us from the tyranny of chance (Vlastos 55-57). Pleasure and pain figure significantly into Democritean ethics, but it is pleasure of a higher sort that is constitutive of a good life. Reigning in one’s desires is not sufficient for the best sort of life. “Goodness is not just avoiding wrongdoing but avoiding even the desire for it” (F83). Seeking sensual pleasures leads to a disordered and painful life, while seeking the pleasures of wisdom and understanding furnish us with a harmonious and cheerful life.
Scholars do not know about Diogenes’ life. He might have been active in the middle or late fifth century (McKirahan 346). We do know, however, that he resurrected material monism. Like Anaximenes, he posited air as the primary element. Unlike the records and fragments that we have of Anaximenes, Diogenes makes explicit the reason why there must be an essential and common element. “My view, in general, is that all existing things are altered from the same thing and are the same thing” (F2). Evidently, based upon the purported introduction to his text—assuming that what was just quoted immediately succeeds the introduction—Diogenes takes this to be an indisputable starting part (F1). If everything in the cosmos were different, having no nature in common, then nothing would be able to mix with anything else, for example, no plant would be able to grow from the earth. Thus, apparent difference in being is only a variation on the same type of being. The whole cosmos is a constant alteration of one being.
Why must this common or basic being be air? Animals, including human beings, cannot live without respiration, that is, air is essential for life. Following a traditional view, Diogenes considers air to be the soul or life of animals. When respiration ceases, life (the soul) leaves the body (F6). Soul, life, and air are treated synonymously in this context (F10). Moreover, air is also responsible for intelligence (F5). Again, when one ceases to breathe, one is no longer intelligent. As intelligence, air “steers and controls all things;” therefore, air seems to be “God, and to reach everywhere, to arrange all things, and to be present in everything” (F5). Everything partakes of air, but nothing partakes of air in quite the same way, “but air itself and intelligence have many forms” (F5). Sometimes air is “warmer or colder, drier or moister, and more stationary or more lively in motion, and many other differentiations are present in it, including countless differentiations of flavor and color” (F5). The differentiations of air range from the most obvious, to those so subtle we can scarcely imagine.
Diogenes tells us that no two differentiated things can become exactly like one another without becoming the same. “Nothing…of those things that are differentiated one from another is able to become exactly like the other without becoming the same” (F5). In other words, no two things can be identical and simultaneously be distinct from one another. If two or more things are identical, then they are not distinct, but the same thing, and we have no way of distinguishing between them. There are many differences among beings in the cosmos; yet, the underlying nature remains the same. This allows for varying degrees of life and intelligence among beings. Therefore, there is no reason to lump Diogenes in with the traditional and shortsighted view that only human beings have intelligence. Other beings might have intelligence as well, but to varying degrees. Air allows for the eternal being of the cosmos, the differentiation and intelligence of all things.
As with the terms “cynic” and “stoic,” our modern usage of “sophistry” comes to us from a school of thought, which took its course in approximately fifth century Greece. Again, as with “cynic” and “stoic,” the current connotations of “sophistry” are not without their roots in the historical group of thinkers called Sophists. Yet, as we cannot reduce the thought of the Cynics and Stoics to mere cynicism or apathy, we cannot reduce the thought of the Sophists to mere sophistry. As we have seen, it has been tempting to read the Presocratics through the lens of Plato’s and Aristotle’s thought, and this is no less the case with the Sophists. In fact, two of Plato’s dialogues are named after Sophists, Protagoras and Gorgias, and one is called simply, The Sophist. Beyond this, typical themes of Sophistic thought often make their way into Plato’s work, not the least of which are the similarities between Socrates and the Sophists (an issue explicitly addressed in the Apology and elsewhere). Thus, the Sophists had no small influence on fifth century Greece and Greek thought.
Broadly, the Sophists were a group of itinerant teachers who charged fees to teach on a variety of subjects, with rhetoric as the preeminent subject in their curriculum. A common characteristic among many, but perhaps not all, Sophists seems to have been an emphasis upon arguing for both opposing sides of a case. Thus, these argumentative and rhetorical skills could be useful in law courts and political contexts. However, these sorts of skills also tended to earn many Sophists their reputation as moral and epistemological relativists, which for some was tantamount to intellectual fraud.
One of the earliest and most famous Sophists was Protagoras (c. 490-c. 420 B.C.E.). Only a handful of fragments of his thought exist, and the bulk of the remaining information about him found in Plato’s dialogues should be read cautiously. He is most famous for the apparently relativistic statement that human beings are “the measure of all things, of things that are that they are, of things that are not that they are not” (F1b). Plato, at least for the purposes of the Protagoras, reads individual relativism out of this statement. For example, if the pool of water feels cold to Henry, then it is in fact cold for Henry, while it might appear warm, and therefore be warm for Jennifer. This example portrays perceptual relativism, but the same could go for ethics as well, that is, if X seems good to Henry, then X is good for him, but it might be bad in Jennifer’s judgment. The problem with this view, however, is that if all things are relative to the observer/judge, then the idea that all things are relative is itself relative to the person who asserts it. The idea of communication is then rendered incoherent.
On the other hand, Protagoras’ statement could be interpreted as species-relative. That is, the question of whether and how things are, and whether and how things are not, is a question that has meaning (ostensibly) only for human beings. Thus, all knowledge is relative to us as human beings, and therefore limited by our being and our capabilities. This reading seems to square with the other of Protagoras’ most famous statements: “Concerning the gods, I cannot ascertain whether they exist or whether they do not, or what form they have; for there are many obstacles to knowing, including the obscurity of the question and the brevity of human life” (F3). It is implied here that knowledge is possible, but that it is difficult to attain, and that it is impossible to attain when the question is whether or not the gods exist. We can also see here that human finitude is a limit not only upon human life but also upon knowledge. Thus, if there is knowledge, it is for human beings, but it is obscure and fragile.
Not far behind Protagoras was Gorgias (c. 485-c. 380 B.C.E.). Perhaps flashier than Protagoras when it came to rhetoric and speech making, Gorgias is known for his sophisticated and poetic style. He is known also for extemporaneous speeches, taking audience suggestions for possible topics upon which he would speak at length. His most well-known work is On Nature, Or On What-Is-Not wherein he, contrary to Eleatic philosophy, sets out to show that neither being nor non-being is, and that even if there were anything, it could be neither known nor spoken. It is unclear whether this work was in jest or in earnest. If it is the former, then it was likely an exercise in argumentation as much as it was a gibe at the Eleatics. If it was in earnest, then Gorgias could be seen as an advocate for extreme skepticism, relativism, or perhaps even nihilism (Graham 725).
On Nature can be summarized as follows. If there is anything, it is either exclusively what-is or what-is-not, or both what-is and what-is-not are. Gorgias then eliminates each of these possibilities, beginning with what-is-not (non-being). If non-being were, then there is a contradiction—it would simultaneously both be and not be. Moreover, if non-being were, then being (what-is) would not be, but then non-being would have the property of being, and being would have the property of non-being, which is absurd. Neither, however, is there being (what-is). If being were, it would have to be everlasting, generated, or both. If it were everlasting, it must have always been, and thus would be unlimited. But if it were unlimited, it would not exist anywhere, since for anything to be, it must be in some place, and this place must be different from that which is in it. Being cannot be generated, because if it were, it would have come to be from something that is (being), or from something that is not (non-being). If the former were the case, the being already was and did not need to be generated. If the latter case, then non-being would have caused being, which would be absurd. Finally, being both everlasting and generated would be a contradiction, since if it were everlasting, it could not have been generated, and vice versa (Graham 741-743).
Moreover, even if there were anything, then it could not be thought or known. In order for being to be the object of thought, then being must be, because if there is no being to be thought, it cannot be thought (Graham 743). Yet, if objects of thought were the same as what-is, then whatever we happen to think (unicorns, centaurs, and so forth) would be, but this is absurd (Graham 745). In addition, if objects of thought were things that are, then we would not be able to think of anything that is not, but since we can think of things that are not (unicorns, centaurs, and so forth), objects of thought cannot be tantamount to things that are.
Finally, even if we could think what-is, we would not be able to communicate it. We perceive objects that are different from us, for example, a table, a song, or a scent. We perceive these things by the respective senses, that is, sight, sound, and smell. We communicate by speech, but speech is not the same thing as what is perceived. “That by which we communicate is speech, but speech is not the subsisting and existing things themselves” (Graham 745). Thus, when we talk about the table, the song, or a particular scent, we do not communicate those very things to each other, but rather we communicate words. Just as, therefore, a sight cannot become a sound and vice versa, a perceived thing cannot become speech and vice versa. Again, whether this was all a mere jocular exercise in argumentation or an earnest stab at truth is unknown. If, however, it was the latter, then we seem to be left speechless in a world that is impossible to understand.
Very little is known about Antiphon the Sophist. He seems to have been known for courtroom speeches, dream interpretation, and claiming to heal depression (Graham 789). His views on justice and law are perhaps most salient in the extant fragments. Justice amounts to obeying the laws of the city in which one is a resident, but doing so only when others are present to witness it. When alone, it is better to value “the works of nature. The works of law are factitious, whereas those of nature are necessary” (F46a). The debate between law/custom (nomos) and nature (phusis) was a central theme of philosophical and sophistic thought in ancient Greece. To what degree is law natural? Is morality simply law and custom, or is it natural? Antiphon set law in opposition to nature, although it is unclear what he means by “the works of nature.” Antiphon could be interpreted as an advocate for hedonism. Indeed, things that bring pleasure, he claims, are truly advantageous and beneficial, thus following the course of nature. Things that bring pain, on the other hand, are not advantageous (F46a).
If we do read Antiphon as a hedonist, it would have to be a tempered hedonism that distinguishes between good and bad pleasures. He belittles the pleasures of sexual intercourse, claiming that such pleasures “do not travel alone, but in the company of sorrows and pains” (F51). He also looks with a critical eye towards money making, warning against miserliness. He recounts the story of a man whose hidden store of money was stolen. “His friend told him not to worry, but to put a stone in the same place where the money had been and imagine that he still had the money and he had not lost it. ‘For even when you had it, you did not use it at all; hence, do not feel deprived of it even now’” (F57). The lesson here seems to be that if one is going to make money, then one should use that money, for money stored away becomes superfluous. He also warns against doing evil to one’s neighbor, since this will necessarily incur evil for the perpetrator (F61). Moreover, “nothing is worse for men than a lack of discipline,” so we should raise our children well, and when they grow up, great changes will not overwhelm them (F64). So if we are to read Antiphon as a hedonist, then it is a hedonism that works towards what is truly advantageous for oneself—a hedonism tempered by practical wisdom.
Prodicus of Ceos (c. 465-c. 395 B.C.E.), like most Sophists, worked as teacher and rhetorician. Like Protagoras, he presented a challenge to theistic thinking, but took this challenge further. The Greeks and Egyptians tend to consider all beneficial things to be gods. “Sun, moon, rivers, springs, and in general everything that benefits our life the ancients considered gods on account of the benefit accruing from them, just as the Egyptians make the Nile a god…” (F3c). This, of course, is not enough evidence to suggest that Prodicus was an atheist (although that word was broader for the ancients than for us, referring to those who hold no belief in gods, and to those who hold unorthodox beliefs in the gods), but it certainly represents a challenge to common theistic notions that the gods are independent of our judgments about them.
Plato portrays Prodicus as a specialist in correct diction. In the Cratylus, Socrates says,
The study of words is not a minor undertaking. If I had heard Prodicus’ fifty-drachma lecture, which provides the student complete instruction on this subject, as he himself advertises, nothing would keep me from telling you straightaway the whole truth about correct diction. But alas I have not heard it, but only the one-drachma lecture. (Graham 847)
This humorous passage is typical of Plato’s emphasis on the Sophist’s method of charging large sums of money for instruction. In fact, in the Hippias Major Plato says of Prodicus that “it is amazing how much money he took in by putting on demonstrations and instructing the young men” (Graham 843). As Graham points out, however, “The ability to make fine discriminations of words is important to rhetoric, and we should remind ourselves that there were no dictionaries in the classical age, and treatises such as Prodicus wrote were the first essays in lexicography and diction” (860). Thus, while Plato treat Prodicus with more respect than other Sophists, we should be aware that his agenda is in part to contrast Prodicus with Socrates, who claimed to teach nothing and to charge nothing for his discussions (compare with the Apology), and that Prodicus’ thought might have been far more important that Plato considered it to be.
Two anonymous texts called the Anonymous Iamblichi and the Dissoi Logoi represent different ends of the spectrum of sophistic thought. The Anonymous Iamblichi is primarily an ethical work, dealing with reputation, virtue, and law. It exhorts the audience toward an education in virtue from an early age, because “a long time’s familiarity with a thing at length strengthens the practice, while a short time is not able to accomplish this” (Graham 865). Such a life requires self-control, especially an indifference to money, “by which everyone is corrupted” (Graham 867). The love for money is, for most people, merely a symptom of their fear, that is, fear of death, disease, old age, and so forth. These things can presumably be held at bay, so the masses think, by money. Rivalries and competition with others are also motives for greed. Thus, law is needed to ensure that money remains a good for the entire community, and moreover so that the community does not fall into dissolution. Lawlessness and greed beget tyranny. Thus, virtue and law are intimately connected.
The Dissoi Logoi, or Twofold Arguments, is a sophistic exercise in arguing for the relativity of things like good and bad, right and wrong, the just and the unjust, truth and falsity, and so forth. What is good in one situation might be bad in another, or good for one person, but bad for another. For example, “sickness is bad for the sick, but good for the physicians. Further, death is bad for those who die, but good for undertakers and makers of tombs” (Graham 879). The relativity of right and wrong to cultural sensibilities is also emphasized. “For example, it is right among the Spartans for girls to exercise naked and appear in public in clothing without sleeves and blouses; but it is wrong to the Ionians” (Graham 883). Again, “Among the Thracians it is a mark of beauty for girls to have tattoos; for everyone else tattoos are a punishment for a crime” (Graham 883). The problem with cultural relativism is that, when taken to its extreme, we cannot claim that certain activities are universally wrong or right, but only wrong or right relative to each culture. Thus, we may see that the arguments in the text are generally bad, but we have no reason to believe that they were meant to be good. The Dissoi Logoi might be emblematic of sophistical exercises at the time, but not necessarily of the more sophisticated of the Sophists.
From Thales to the Sophists, we see much variation in thought, as well as in the style and presentation of those different ways of thinking. Yet, we also see common threads running throughout Presocratic thought. On one hand, there is a tendency to think of the cosmos on its own terms. This new way of thinking often takes its course away from the confines of traditional, theocentric thought. Yet, on the other hand, many of these thinkers reformulated and reconceived God, the gods, and divinity. There is also a push towards ethics and thinking about human affairs and the best sorts of ways for human beings to live. Behind it all—the backdrop, as it were—is a preference for free, rational thought.
The lists of primary and secondary sources are very abbreviated. The secondary sources are generally accessible for non-specialists, and a good starting place for further research into the Presocratics. Some of these books also have extensive lists of references for further reading.
- Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker: Griechisch und Deutsch. Berlin: Weidmannsche Buchhandlung, 1910. Print.
- This is the first and most traditionally used collection of Presocratic fragments and testimonies. This edition has the fragments in Greek with German translations. The book is no longer in print, and while it is often still cited in most scholarship, it is not the work cited in this article.
- Graham, Daniel W. The Texts of Early Greek Philosophy: The Complete Fragments and Selected Testimonies of the Major Presocratics. 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- This is the first collection of the Presocratic fragments and testimonies published with the original Greek and its corresponding English translations. It is the work cited in this text. Graham offers a short commentary on the fragments, as well as references for further reading for each thinker. He has organized by topic the fragments for each thinker, and labels the fragments with an F, followed by the number of the fragment. That is how the fragments have been cited in this article. Testimonies, as well as Graham’s commentary, are cited by page numbers.
- Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London and New York: Routledge, 1982.
- A classic work with interpretations of the Presocratics.
- Burnet, John. Early Greek Philosophy. London: A&C. Black Ltd., 1930.
- Another classic work with interpretations of the Presocratics.
- Long, A.A. ed. The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
- A collection of sixteen essays by some of the foremost scholars on Presocratic thought. The essays are generally accessible, but some are more appropriate for specialists in the field.
- McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates: An Introduction with Texts and Commentaries. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
- This is a very good book for non-specialists and specialists alike interested in further commentary on the Presocratics. The book contains most fragments for most thinkers and reasonable explanations and interpretations of each. There is also a helpful chapter at the end of the book on the nomos-phusis debate. The text includes a fairly extensive section for suggestions for further reading.
- Vlastos, Gregory. “Ethics and Physics in Democritus.” Philosophical Review, vol. 2, 578-592, 1994.
- This article is technical, but offers insight into the connection between Democritean physics and ethics, and was cited in the current overview.
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