Proper Functionalism

‘Proper Functionalism’ refers to a family of epistemological views according to which whether a belief (or some other doxastic state) was formed by way of properly functioning cognitive faculties plays a crucial role in whether it has a certain kind of positive epistemic status (such as being an item of knowledge, or a justified belief). Alvin Plantinga’s proper functionalist theory of knowledge has been the most prominent among these theories. Michael Bergmann’s (2006) proper functionalist theory of justification has also been the focus of much discussion. But proper functionalist theories of other epistemic properties have also been developed. Richard Otte (1987) and Alvin Plantinga (1993b: Chapter 9) offer proper functionalist theories of epistemic probability, for example. Nicholas Wolterstorff (2010) defends a proper functionalist theory of epistemic oughts. And Peter Graham (2010) develops a proper functionalist theory of epistemic entitlement. Since Plantinga’s theory of knowledge and Bergmann’s theory of justification are the most widely known and most discussed proper functionalist views, and because they share many features with other proper functionalist theories, this article focuses primarily on them—what can be said in their favor, the challenges they face, the ways in which they might be defended, and how they compare with some of their closest rivals.

Table of Contents

  1. Plantinga’s Proper Functionalist Theory of Knowledge
    1. Motivations of Plantinga’s Theory
    2. The Content of Plantinga’s Theory
    3. Swampman
    4. Gettier Cases
  2. Bergmann’s Proper Functionalist Theory of Justification
    1. Some Advantages of Bergmann’s Theory
    2. Some Objections to Bergmann’s Theory
  3. Rival Theories
    1. Proper Functionalism and Phenomenal Conservatism
    2. Proper Functionalism and Virtue Epistemology
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Plantinga’s Proper Functionalist Theory of Knowledge

This article begins with a discussion of Alvin Plantinga’s proper functionalist theory of knowledge. As Plantinga himself frames matters, he takes himself to be giving a proper functionalist theory of a property he calls “warrant,” where warrant is whatever precisely it is which makes the difference between knowledge and mere true belief.

a. Motivations of Plantinga’s Theory

A theory of warrant is subject to Gettier-style counterexamples if a belief can meet all the conditions the theory specifies as jointly sufficient for knowledge, but meet them merely by accident (in a manner that precludes that beliefs being an item of knowledge). Plantinga argues that any theory that fails to construe a proper function condition as necessary for warrant is subject to counterexamples of this sort. This is so whether the theory emphasizes the believer’s internal states as most relevant to whether her belief has warrant, external factors, or both of these.

By way of illustration, Plantinga (1993b: 31-37) adopts a scenario originally introduced by Roderick Chisholm, who attributes it to Alexius Meinong. The scenario envisions an aging forest ranger living in the mountains, with a set of wind chimes hanging from a bough. The ranger is unaware of the fact that his hearing has been degenerating of late, and it has gotten to the point where he can no longer hear the chimes. He is also unaware that he is occasionally subject to small auditory hallucinations in which he appears to hear the wind-chime. On one occasion, he is thus appeared to and comes to believe that the wind is blowing. As it happens, the wind is blowing and causing the ringing of the chimes. Even if we stipulate that all is going well with this belief from the ranger’s own internal perspective, it is clear nonetheless that his belief lacks warrant. The reason his belief lacks warrant, Plantinga maintains, results from the fact that it is due to cognitive malfunction.

One might question whether this explanation is correct, however, on the ground that certain cognitively external environmental conditions are also amiss in this case. In particular, the case is one in which there is no reliable connection between the ranger’s appearing to hear the wind-chime and the wind’s blowing. And one might think that it is primarily for this reason that the ranger’s beliefs lack warrant. This thought might push one toward bypassing proper functionalism and endorsing a reliabilist theory of warrant instead (that is, an account according to which a belief having warrant is primarily a matter of it being formed or sustained in a way that involves a reliable connection to the truth). But Plantinga also argues that any reliabilist theory which does not incorporate a proper function condition is also subject to Gettier-style counterexamples.

Plantinga (1993a: 195-198, 205-207) takes this to be illustrated by The Case of the Epistemically Serendipitous Brain Lesion. Imagine Sam has a brain lesion, one that engenders cognitive processes which mostly result in false beliefs. One process the lesion engenders, however, is a process that results in the belief that one has a brain lesion. This particular process is highly reliable (it always results in one’s having a true belief). But clearly the belief that results is not a matter of knowledge. What explains why this is so, Plantinga maintains, is that the belief in question (though formed by a truth-reliable process) is not the result of cognitive proper function. Accordingly, Plantinga concludes that any reliabilist account of warrant must be augmented with a proper function condition.

Kenneth Boyce and Alvin Plantinga (2012: 127-128) have emphasized that there may be an even stronger lesson to be drawn from these cases. Once these cases are on the table, one can imagine variations of them in which different combinations of internal and external conditions (other than proper function ones) are met, but in which the belief in question lacks warrant because it ends up being true merely by accident. Furthermore, Boyce and Plantinga contend that in these cases it seems that part of what explains why these are cases in which the beliefs are true merely by accident (in a way that precludes their being items of knowledge) is that they were not formed in a manner specified by cognitive proper function; that is, the way they get at the truth is accidental from the perspective of the cognitive design plan. If that is correct, however, then (as Boyce and Plantinga point out), there is reason to believe that the notion of cognitive proper function is centrally involved in the notion of non-accidentally that any adequate analysis of warrant must capture.

b. The Content of Plantinga’s Theory

Examples of the sort discussed above are used by Plantinga to motivate the claim that cognitive proper function is necessary for warrant. Plantinga (1993b: 21-24) also maintains that the relevant notion of proper function presupposes that of a design plan—something that specifies the manner in which a thing is supposed to function in various circumstances. As Plantinga conceives of it, a design plan may be modeled as a set of ordered triples, where each triple specifies a circumstance, a response, and a purpose or function. One need not initially take this notion of a design plan to involve conscious design or purpose. The notion of a design plan at issue here is whatever notion is presupposed by talk of proper function for biological systems (as when a physician determines that a human heart is functioning the way it is supposed to on account of its pumping at 70 beats per minute). Plantinga himself gives a theistic account of this notion, but other proper functionalists, such as Ruth Millikan (1984) and Peter Graham (2012), have offered naturalistic, evolutionary accounts.

While Plantinga (1993b: 46) takes cognitive proper function to be necessary for warrant, he does not take it to be sufficient (or even nearly sufficient). Other conditions must also be satisfied. To a rough, first approximation, Plantinga takes a belief to be warranted if and only if it satisfies the following four conditions:

(1) The belief in question is formed by way of cognitive faculties that are properly functioning.

(2) The cognitive faculties in question are aimed at the production of true beliefs.

(3) The design plan is a good one. That is, when a belief is formed by way of truth-aimed cognitive proper function in the sort of environment for which the cognitive faculties in question were designed, there is a high objective probability that the resulting belief is true.

(4) The belief is formed in the sort of environment for which the cognitive faculties in question were designed.

While Plantinga adds various nuances, these four conditions serve to capture the main outlines of his view.

Many objections have been raised to Plantinga’s theory. Two of the most prominent among them are considered below. The first amounts to an objection to the claim that Plantinga’s four conditions are necessary for warrant. The second amounts to an objection to the claim that they are sufficient. For a sampling of other objections, one would do well to examine the collection of essays on Plantinga’s theory of warrant edited by Jonathan L. Kvanvig (1996).

c. Swampman

Some have argued that there are counterexamples to Plantinga’s theory involving beings who have warranted beliefs but who nevertheless fail to exhibit cognitive proper function. The most well-known version of this objection comes from Ernest Sosa (1993), who adapts a scenario originally proposed by Donald Davidson, and uses it against proper functionalism. In that scenario, Davidson is standing next to a swamp when lightning strikes a nearby dead tree, thereby obliterating Davidson. Simultaneously, by sheer accident, the lightning also causes the molecules of the tree to arrange themselves into a perfect duplicate of Davidson as he was at the time of his demise. The Davidson duplicate—this “Swampman”—leaves the swamp, acting and talking as if it were Davidson, having all the same intrinsic properties that Davidson would have had, had he left the swamp without having his unfortunate encounter. According to Sosa, “it … seems logically possible for … Swampman to have warranted beliefs not long after creation if not right away” (p. 54). Yet, not being the product of intentional design, and not having any evolutionary history, it would seem that Swampman has no design plan. And so we have what appears to be a counterexample to proper functionalism.

There are various responses to the Swampman objection. Plantinga (1993c: 206-208) and Graham (2012: 466-467) have each argued, albeit for different reasons, that it is doubtful the Swampman scenario is metaphysically possible. They have also suggested, again for different reasons, that if this scenario is possible, perhaps Swampman can acquire conditions for proper functioning without natural selection or intentional design. See Plantinga (1993c: 78) and Graham (2014). Bergmann (2006: 147-149) has argued that we are intuitively inclined to assign positive epistemic status to Swampman’s beliefs only to the extent we are inclined to think that his beliefs are fitting responses to the inputs he receives. And we are inclined to think that Swampman’s beliefs are fitting, argues Bergmann, only to the extent we are inclined to think of those responses as exhibiting cognitive proper function. Boyce and Plantinga (2012: 130-131) have suggested that since it is merely by accident that Swampman is forming his beliefs reliably, we can think of this case as a Gettier scenario (or at least, relevantly analogous to one), and thereby deny that Swampman’s beliefs have warrant). For a similar response, see (McNabb 2015).

Since then, Kenneth Boyce and Andrew Moon (2015) have argued that the Swampman objection relies on a false intuition concerning the conditions under which the belief of one creature has warrant if the belief of another, similar creature does. According to them, the central intuition that motivates our intuitive reaction to the Swampman case may be stated as follows:

(CI) If a belief B is warranted for a subject S and another subject S* comes to hold B in the same way that S came to hold B in a relevantly similar environment to the one in which S came to hold B, then B is warranted for S*.

They argue that it is CI, in conjunction with the stipulation that Swampman forms his beliefs in the same way that an ordinary human being would (an ordinary human being to whom we would be inclined to attribute knowledge), that explains our tendency to regard Swampman as having warranted beliefs. Boyce and Moon then go on to argue that CI is subject to counterexamples, and that this undercuts the force of the Swampman objection. See Section 3b for further discussion of their argument.

d. Gettier Cases

Plantinga has conceded that his theory, as he originally formulated it, is subject to Gettier-style counterexamples. In 2000, Plantinga formulated this counterexample:

I own a Chevrolet van, drive to Notre Dame on a football Saturday, and unthinkingly park in one of the many places reserved for the football coach. Naturally, his minions tow my van away and, as befits such lèse majesté, destroy it. By a splendid piece of good luck, however, I have won the Varsity Club’s Win-a-Chevrolet-Van contest, although I haven’t yet heard the good news. You ask me what sort of automobile I own; I reply, both honestly and truthfully, “A Chevrolet van.” My belief that I own such a van is true, but ‘just by accident’ (more accurately, it is only by accident that I happen to form a true belief); hence it does not constitute knowledge. All of the non-environmental conditions for warrant, furthermore, are met. It also looks as if the environmental condition is met: after all, isn’t the cognitive environment here on earth and in South Bend just the one for which our faculties were designed?

Clearly Plantinga’s belief (though true) is not an item of knowledge in this case and thus lacks warrant. So Plantinga’s original four conditions are not jointly sufficient for warrant. Something else must be added. But what?

According to Plantinga, what the original account requires is an addition to the environmental condition. More specifically, the problem in the above case is that while the global environment that Plantinga is in is the one for which his faculties were designed, his more local environment is epistemically misleading. So in order to deal with this counterexample, Plantinga proposes adding a resolution condition. This condition involves a distinction between two different kinds of environment, what Plantinga refers to as the “maxi-environment” and what he refers to as the “mini-environment.” The maxi-environment, Plantinga stipulates, is the kind of global environment in which we live here on earth, the kind of environment for which our cognitive faculties were designed (or to which they were adapted). The mini-environment, by contrast, is a much more specific state of affairs, one that includes, for a given exercise of one’s cognitive faculties E resulting in a belief B, all of the epistemically relevant circumstances obtaining when B is formed (though diminished with respect to whether B is true).

Letting ‘MBE’ denote the cognitive mini-environment with respect to B and E (which Plantinga says may contain as large a fragment of the actual world as one likes, up to whether B is true), Plantinga maintains that the needed resolution condition may be stated as follows:

(RC) A belief B produced by an exercise of cognitive powers has warrant sufficient for knowledge only if MBE (the mini-environment with respect to B and E) is favorable for E.

This, of course, raises the question of just what it is for a mini-environment to be “favorable.” Plantinga has, in the past, offered various proposals for what favorableness consists in that he has subsequently admitted to be unsatisfactory. A proposal is found in Boyce and Plantinga (2012: 134). For other proposals, see Crisp (2000) and Chignell (2003).

2. Bergmann’s Proper Functionalist Theory of Justification

Plantinga’s theory of warrant is not the only kind of proper functionalist theory. Proper functionalist theories of other epistemic concepts have also been developed. Noteworthy among these is Michael Bergmann’s proper functionalist theory of epistemic justification. The kind of epistemic justification that Bergmann (2006: 4-5) is interested in is doxastic justification. The having of this property is frequently (though not universally) held to be a necessary condition for a belief being an item of knowledge. In fact, it is often held that a belief having this property, in conjunction with its being non-accidentally true (in a way that rules out Gettier cases), is not only necessary, but also sufficient, for its being an item of knowledge.

A major divide in the literature occurs between those philosophers who are “externalists” about this kind of justification and those who are “internalists” about it. Just how this divide should be characterized is itself a matter of dispute. But for present purposes, we may characterize internalists about justification as being committed (at least) to the view that whether a belief is justified depends entirely on which mental states that belief is based upon (in such a way that necessarily, any two believers who are exactly alike in terms of their mental states and in terms of which of those mental states their beliefs are based upon are also alike in terms of which of their beliefs are justified). Externalists, by contrast, maintain that whether a belief is justified may depend on other factors.

It should be noted, however, that Bergmann (2006: chapter 3) divides up the territory a bit differently, though not in a way that impacts the current discussion. He takes it to be a necessary condition for a view of justification to count as “internalist” that it include an awareness requirement (that is, that it require, in order for a belief to be justified, that the believing subject is actually or potentially aware of some justification-contributor to that belief). The characterization of internalism given here, by contrast, includes no such requirement (and is similar to the characterization of a view of justification that Bergmann calls “mentalism,” one which he takes to be distinct from both externalism and internalism).

As Bergmann (2006: 3-7) points out, it is not always clear that philosophers who appear to dispute the nature of justification are actually disagreeing with one another. That is because it is plausible that epistemologists sometimes use the term ‘justification’ in different ways. He notes, for example, that some epistemologists use this term to pick out a subjective notion, one that it is satisfied by a belief provided that the subject is blameless in holding it. Others, by contrast, he observes, use the term to pick out a more objective notion, one according to which a belief is justified only if it is fitting with respect to the believer’s evidence or other epistemically relevant inputs. It is this objective notion of justification in which Bergmann is interested (see also pp. 111-113). He takes it to be a conceptually open question as whether this kind of justification is necessary for knowledge (though he thinks it is). And he also takes some disputes between self-avowed externalists (like himself) and self-avowed internalists (such as Richard Feldman and Earl Conee) to involve a genuine disagreement concerning the nature of this kind of justification.

Bergmann argues that the right way to analyze this kind of justification is in terms of proper function. More specifically, Bergmann’s (2006: 132-137) theory of epistemic justification takes the first of Plantinga’s three conditions (leaving out the fourth, environmental condition) to be necessary for a belief to be justified. Bergmann also takes the first three of Plantinga’s conditions, in conjunction with the condition that the subject does not take the relevant belief to be defeated, to be sufficient for a belief being justified. The motivations for this view are perhaps best appreciated by looking to its purported advantages.

a. Some Advantages of Bergmann’s Theory

Epistemic justification of the kind Bergmann has in mind has some puzzling features. On the one hand, it involves some notion of truth-aptness. In particular, there would appear to be some important, non-trivial, connection between a belief being justified and it being objectively likely to be true. At the very least, it would be a significant cost for a theory of justification to deny this. But which ways of forming and sustaining beliefs result in a high proportion of true beliefs depends on what sort of environment one is in. Our tending to believe that occluded objects still exist, for example, results in a high proportion of true beliefs in our environment, but it is easy to imagine environments in which this would not be the case. These considerations push in the direction of regarding what makes for epistemic justification a contingent matter, one that depends on the sort of environment one inhabits.

On the other hand, justification is a normative concept, the satisfaction of which does not appear to depend on the sort of environment in which one is located. This aspect of justification is made especially vivid by “The New Evil Demon Problem”, originally put forward by Keith Lehrer and Stewart Cohen (1983), as a problem for reliabilist theories of justification. Consider a population of beings, just like ourselves, who form their beliefs in response to experience in just the ways that we do, but who (unlike us) are victims of a Cartesian demon who renders their belief-forming processes unreliable. From many reliabilist theories of justification, it follows that these beings have far fewer justified beliefs than we do (since most of their beliefs are not formed in a truth-reliable manner). But this seems false. These beings are in an epistemically bad situation, to be sure, but they are still forming their beliefs in ways that are appropriate given their experiences because their beliefs are at least justified.

Bergmann’s theory of epistemic justification nicely combines these puzzling features. First, it accommodates the intuition that inhabitants of a demon world, who are like us, and who form their beliefs in response to experience in the same ways we do, have the same proportion of justified beliefs. For, as Bergmann (2006: 141-143) notes, his theory entails that provided these beings have a cognitive design plan comparable to ours and are properly functioning, many of their beliefs are justified, even though their ways of forming beliefs are, for the most part, unreliable. This analysis also, as Bergmann points out, accommodates the intuition that justification is importantly and non-trivially connected with truth-aptness. For, insofar as the beings living in a demon world fulfill Bergmann’s conditions for justification, the manner in which they form their beliefs would be truth-apt if they were placed in the environment for which their cognitive faculties were designed. Finally, since different design plans may be tailored to different kinds of environments, Bergmann’s theory accommodates the possibility that what makes for justification is a contingent matter, one that depends on the kind of environment for which the creatures at issue are situated.

b. Some Objections to Bergmann’s Theory

Like Plantinga’s theory, Bergmann’s faces the objection that it is subject to counterexamples involving creatures like Swampman. There is no need, though, to rehearse the various responses that might be given to this objection here (since many of them will be the same or similar to those described in Section 1c). As a theory of justification, however, Bergmann’s view also faces other objections, ones which are not (or not as obviously) applicable to a theory of warrant.

Todd. R. Long (2012: 264-265) questions, for example, whether Bergmann’s theory does in fact do a better job than alternative views in handling the New Evil Demon Problem. He grants that Bergmann’s view does accommodate the intuition that demon-world victims with the same design plan as ours do in fact have justified beliefs (in the same proportions that we do). But he notes that Bergmann’s view also entails that the same cannot be said for demon-world victims who are mentally indistinguishable from ourselves but whose ways of forming beliefs run contrary to their design plan. And Long maintains that to deny that beliefs of demon-world victims in the latter situation are justified also runs contrary to our intuitions. Bergmann (2006: 150), however, anticipates an objection like this. He suggests that there is an analogy between Swampman and the demon victims in such a scenario; accordingly, he adapts his reply to the former so as to apply it to the latter.

Another kind of objection to a proper functionalist theory of justification involves cases in which the design plan specifies ways of belief formation that appear to be objectively bad in some way, in spite of the fact that this component of the design plan is successfully aimed at truth. Long (2012) and Tucker (2014b) each present variations of this objection directed specifically against Bergmann’s view. There are also precedents found among objections to Plantinga’s theory of warrant (see for example Feldman 1993: 44). There are at least two kinds of cases of this sort. The following discussion will make reference to cases described by Tucker, who provides examples of each kind.

In the first kind of case, the design plan specifies coming to hold a belief on the basis of what appears to be an objectively bad form of reasoning. Tucker (2014b: 3321-3322) presents a case, for instance, in which a design plan specifies coming to hold a certain belief on the basis of the fallacy of denying the antecedent. As Tucker points out, even though denying the antecedent is, from a logical point of view, an objectively bad form of reasoning, there are circumstances in which reasoning that way is reliable. So there is no reason in principle why a good, truth-aimed design plan could not specify forming a belief in that way, under the right conditions. Even so, it is counterintuitive to think that a belief formed by way of committing a logical fallacy could be justified (at least in the absence of having any further basis).

In the second kind of case, the design plan specifies coming to hold a belief on the basis of an input that intuitively fails to provide any kind of epistemic support for that belief. Tucker (pp. 3318-3319) presents an example, for instance, in which a person comes to believe Gödel’s incompleteness theorem solely on the basis of his belief that his students hate a particular type of beer. Since Gödel’s incompleteness theorem is a necessary truth, there is no question that this belief-forming process is reliable. So there is no reason in principle why a good, truth-aimed design plan could not specify that a belief be formed in this way. Even so, it seems wrong to say that someone could come to be justified in believing Gödel’s incompleteness theorem solely on the basis of that belief.

This is a formidable objection. But there may be things that can be said on the proper functionalist’s behalf. Consider once again the first kind of case, a case that involves coming to hold a belief in the basis of formally bad reasoning. Some things that have been said in defense of reliabilism might also be of use to the proper functionalist here. Alvin Goldman (2002: 146-153), for example, points to research on the part of cognitive psychologists (such as Amos Tversky and Daniel Kahneman) indicating that human beings tend to rely on heuristics when engaged in probabilistic reasoning. As is now well known, these heuristics make people prone to commit elementary probabilistic fallacies. The conclusion that some psychologists have drawn is that these findings indicate that human beings are terrible at probabilistic reasoning. But as Goldman notes, other psychologists have drawn a more optimistic conclusion.

Goldman points to the work of a group of evolutionary psychologists (led by Gerd Gigerenzer, Leda Cosmides, and John Tooby) who argue that, given the limited information and computational power with which organisms must contend, an inference mechanism can be advantageous if it (in Goldman’s words) “often draws accurate conclusions about real-world environments, and does so quickly and with little computational effort” (p. 152). The heuristics humans rely on in probabilistic reasoning, some of these psychologists maintain, are mechanisms of just that sort. If that is the case, then perhaps human beings often do come to hold justified beliefs by way of these mechanisms after all, in spite of the fact that they are formally suspect. And if that is so, then perhaps other kinds of beings might come to form justified beliefs on the basis of kinds of reasoning that (from a purely logical point of view) are formally suspect, but nonetheless reliable in the environments for which their cognitive faculties were designed.

Now consider the second kind of case, the case in which the design plan specifies coming to hold a belief on the basis of an input that intuitively fails to provide any kind of epistemic support for that belief. Why is it exactly (concerning Tucker’s example) that we are inclined to deny that a person’s belief that his students dislike of a particular type of beer could justify the belief that Gödel’s incompleteness theorem is true? Perhaps it is because there does not appear to be any interesting logical connection between the content of the latter belief and the belief on which it is based. But a similar observation concerning the relationship between our sense experiences and the content of our perceptual beliefs is part of what motivates Bergmann’s proper functionalist theory.

As Bergmann (2006: 119) points out, “Thomas Reid emphasized that there does not seem to be any logical connection between our sense experiences and the content of the beliefs based on them.” Bergmann notes, for example, that “the tactile sensations we experience when touching a hard surface seem to have no logical relation to (nor do they resemble) the content of the hardness beliefs they prompt.” Because this is so, Bergmann argues that the evidential support relations that hold between various sensory experiences and the beliefs formed in response to them cannot be explained in terms of necessary connections. But this prompts the question as to what does explain these support relations. Bergmann (2006: 130-131) argues that proper functionalism provides a good answer to this question. The connections are to be explained by way of which belief-forming responses to sensory inputs are specified by the cognitive design plan.

To accept this motivation for proper functionalism is to accept the claim that at least some epistemic support relations hold only contingently. It is also to countenance the possibility that the epistemic support relations that hold for certain cognizers might seem utterly bizarre from the perspective of creatures like us. So, perhaps, for those who do take this motivation on board, the possibility of an agent’s coming to justifiably believe that Gödel’s incompleteness theorem is true solely on the basis of a belief concerning the beer preferences of his students no longer seems so counterintuitive. (See Bergmann (2006: 141) for a similar response to BonJour’s purported counterexamples to externalist views of justification involving reliably formed clairvoyant beliefs).

3. Rival Theories

Proper functionalist theories do not exist in a vacuum. A full appreciation of their merits or demerits requires an investigation into how well they stack up against their rivals. Two kinds of theories in particular that are often put up against proper functionalism—phenomenal conservatism and virtue epistemology. It is sometimes claimed by the proponents of these theories that they satisfy many of the same motivations as proper functionalism, while having fewer costs, as well as other advantages.

a. Proper Functionalism and Phenomenal Conservatism

At least to a first approximation, a phenomenal conservative theory of doxastic justification may be characterized as the view that a belief with the content that p is justified for an agent if it seems to the agent that p, the agent appropriately bases her belief that p on that seeming, and the agent has no defeaters for that belief. (See Phenomenal Conservatism for more details). As noted in Section 2a, proper functionalists about justification point to the apparent contingency of the connection between various experiences and the beliefs they justify as a motivation for their view. Phenomenal conservatives sometimes claim that their view does just as well at accommodating this apparent contingency while preserving the claim that there is a necessary connection between the things that justify our beliefs and the beliefs they justify. For this reason, phenomenal conservatism might be thought to do a better job than proper functionalism in accommodating the New Evil Demon intuition. Some phenomenal conservatives have also contended that it does a better job in accounting for the nature of evidential support.

Tucker (2011: 58-63) presses this point in connection with his objection (discussed in Section 2b) that proper functionalism allows for inputs which intuitively fail to provide any kind of epistemic support for a belief to justify that belief. In the example previously discussed, Tucker pointed to an instance in which a belief served as such an input. But Tucker also supplies examples in which the same seems to be true of the support relations that hold between various sensory experiences and the beliefs they are purported to justify. He notes, for example, that it is counterintuitive to think that a sensory experience associated with seeing a beautiful sunset could justify the belief that Gödel’s incompleteness theorem is true. But a design plan (presumably different from ours) might well specify that this is an appropriate belief-forming process.

Here the proper functionalist might attempt once more to press the Reidian point that in general it appears true that there is no inherent connection between our sensory experiences and the contents of the beliefs based on them. But Tucker (2011: 56-58, 61-63) suggests a way the advocate of phenomenal conservatism could account for the role that sensory experience plays in justifying our beliefs that accommodates this fact. According to Tucker, sensory experience might play a role in the justification of a certain belief by triggering a seeming with the content of that belief, it being a contingent matter which sensations trigger which seemings. Andrew Cullison (2013: 34-37) makes a similar suggestion, noting that just as two different sentences from different languages might well express the same proposition, two different kinds of cognitive apparatus associated with different species might cause seemings of the same content in response to differing kinds of phenomenology. This accommodates the Reidian point while preserving the claim that there is a necessary connection between the things that justify our beliefs (that is, our seeming states) and the beliefs they justify (via the identities of their contents).

Suppose one agrees that a phenomenal conservative view of justification does better than a proper functionalist view on these counts. This of course does not commit one to agreeing that phenomenal conservatism does better than proper functionalism over all. Bergmann (2013) argues, for example, that proper functionalists can accommodate many of the intuitions that motivate phenomenal conservatism, while also doing a better job in accommodating the intuition that some belief formations, downstream from sensory experiences, are objectively fitting responses to those experiences, whereas others are not.

Bergmann notes, for instance, that proper functionalists might adopt a model according to which, for humans (though not necessarily for all cognizers), when all goes well, a belief formed in response to a sensory experience is justified via being based on an intermediate seeming (one that is appropriately caused by the experience). He argues that this model accommodates many of the intuitions to which phenomenal conservatives appeal. But it also, he points out, allows for the possibility that there is an objective mismatch between a belief formed in response to a sensory experience and the nature of that experience, one which prevents the belief in question from being justified, even when the content of that belief matches the content of the intermediate seeming.

Bergmann describes, for example, a case in which a human cognizer, suffering from brain damage, forms the belief that she is holding a hard spherical object, in response to the olfactory sensation she experiences while smelling a lilac bush. Even if it is stipulated that she bases this belief on an intermediate seeming with the same content as her belief, it can still seem that her belief is objectively unfitting (in relation to her experience) and, for that reason, unjustified. A proper functionalist can accommodate this intuition, Bergmann claims, whereas a phenomenal conservative cannot. The proper functionalist can maintain that the reason the cognizer’s belief is objectively unfitting in this case is that, even though it is based on an appropriate intermediate seeming, it is not the appropriate response to the relevant sensation; it is not the belief her design plan specifies should result.

Relatedly, one might think that proper functionalism does better than phenomenal conservatism in accounting for the relation between justification and truth-aptness. A common objection to phenomenal conservative views is that they suffer from a “cognitive penetration” problem. In certain kinds of wishful thinking cases, for example, a seeming state might be caused by a desire; and in some such cases the believer in question will be unaware of this fact, and have no defeater for the belief in question. According to phenomenal conservatives, a belief properly based on such a seeming will still be justified. But to many this seems wrong. One explanation for why this consequence seems wrong is that it threatens to radically undermine the connection between justification and truth. A proper functionalist, by contrast, might maintain that when such cognitively penetrated seemings are produced in human beings, this is due either to cognitive malfunction or to one of the non-truth aimed facets of our cognitive design plan (either of which, according to her view, would render the belief unjustified). See Tucker (2014a) however for an argument that proper functionalists also suffer from cognitive penetration problems.

b. Proper Functionalism and Virtue Epistemology

According to John Greco (1993: 414), “the central idea of virtue epistemology is that, Gettier problems aside, knowledge is true belief which results from one’s cognitive virtues.” Similarly, Sosa (1993: 64) characterizes it as consisting of a family of theories which may be seen as “varieties of a single more fundamental option in epistemology, one which puts the explicative emphasis on truth-conducive intellectual virtues or faculties.”

Virtue epistemology is often thought of as coming in at least two varieties. Virtue responsibilists emphasize character traits—intellectual virtues such as open-mindedness, conscientiousness, perseverance in seeking the truth, an so on. Virtue reliabilists emphasize cognitive faculties, abilities, or competencies. (See Virtue Epistemology for more details). Of these two, it is virtue reliabilism that is most akin to proper functionalism. Accordingly, virtue reliabilism serves as a closer competitor. Or rather, since Greco (1993: 414) and Sosa (1993: 64) have both classified proper functionalism as a version of virtue epistemology, perhaps it should be said that it is the non-proper-functionalist versions thereof which may be seen as close competitors. For ease of exposition, the following discussion will focus on Sosa’s development of such a version.

According to Sosa’s (2015: 10) virtue theory of knowledge, knowledge is “apt belief” where apt belief is “belief that gets it right through competence rather than luck.” More precisely, according to Sosa, an apt belief is a belief that sufficiently manifests an “epistemic competence” (that is, a competence to get at the truth) (p. 9), where “a competence is in turn understood as a disposition to succeed in a given field of aimings, these being performances with an aim, whether the aim be intentional and even conscious, or teleological and functional” (p. 2). Note the similarity to proper functionalism here. Sosa’s epistemic competences are akin to Plantinga’s truth-aimed cognitive faculties. Both involve the property of being aimed at the formation of true beliefs, and both (when all goes well) are exercised in a way that is conducive to the fulfilment of that aim.

One way in which Sosa’s epistemic competencies differ from Plantinga’s truth-aimed cognitive faculties, however, is that the former do not initially seem to presuppose any notion of a design plan. And this might make Sosa’s theory more adept at accommodating things like Swampman scenarios (see the discussion in Section 1c). Indeed, it was Sosa (1993) who made famous that objection to proper functionalism. It might also make Sosa’s view more appealing to those who are both naturalistically inclined and skeptical about the prospects for a naturalistically acceptable account of cognitive proper function.

Proper functionalists have called into question whether Sosa’s view does in fact have these advantages. Plantinga (1993c: 79) has argued, for example, that in order to handle the case of The Case of the Epistemically Serendipitous Brain Lesion (discussed in Section 1a), Sosa’s epistemic virtues must involve competencies or faculties that are subject to proper function conditions. If that is right, then, as Plantinga (p. 81) points out, Sosa’s view (developed so as not to be subject to this counterexample) becomes a variety of proper functionalism. It should be noted however that virtue epistemologists may have other ways of dealing with this case. John Greco (2010: 152) has suggested, for instance, that “in the brain lesion case, the problem is not so much a lack of health as it is a lack of cognitive integration.” “The cognitive processes associated with the brain lesion,” claims Greco, “are not sufficiently integrated with other of the person’s cognitive dispositions so as to count as being part of cognitive character.” Whether this reply is successful may turn on just what is necessary for a cognitive process to exhibit the kind of cognitive integration required. Greco (2010: 152) suggests his own, non-proper-functionalist criteria. But it is open to proper functionalists to argue that part of what is required is incorporation into one’s cognitive design plan.

Since then, Boyce and Moon (2015) argued that there are other kinds of cases that pose a challenge to the claim that a true belief manifesting a competence is sufficient for its being an item of knowledge. As noted in Section 1c, Boyce and Moon propose a counterexample to what they regard as the central intuition underlying the Swampman Objection to proper functionalism. Their counterexample employs some of the cognitive science literature on initial knowledge, which supports the claim that human beings sometimes come to know things by way of innate, unlearned cognitive responses (see for example Spelke, 1994). Drawing from this literature (as well as from Bergmann, 2006:116-121), Boyce and Moon argue that some of these innate responses are merely contingently appropriate ways of forming beliefs (where the appropriateness at issue is of a kind necessary for warrant). They argue that while these responses are appropriate for human beings, given the kind environments to which humans are adapted, the same need not have been true for other kinds of beings.

Boyce and Moon then go on to argue that these facts entail there are possible cases involving two cognitive agents, who are members of different species, coming to hold the same belief, in the same way, in the same environment, but in which that belief is warranted for one of them (on account of its resulting from a way of forming beliefs that is appropriate for members of that species) but not the other. They further argue that not only do these cases furnish counterexamples to the central intuition motivating the Swampman objection to proper functionalism, but that they also provide a challenge to alternative theories. Boyce and Moon suggest, for instance, that they afford potential counterexamples to Sosa’s theory, at least insofar as it does not recognize factors such as proper function conditions or species membership as relevant to competence possession.

Proper functionalists point to the kinds of cases alluded to above as lending support to the view that a belief having arisen by way of cognitive proper function is necessary for it to count as an item of knowledge. It should be acknowledged, however, that virtue epistemologists have pointed to other kinds of cases in which the opposite seems true. John Greco (2010: 151-153) has noted, for example, that there appear to be “cases of improper function that actually increase a person’s capacity to know.” Greco cites various cases documented by the neurologist Oliver Sacks (1970) in order to illustrate this point. “An obvious example,” says Greco, “is the story of autistic twins, who enjoyed incredible mathematical abilities associated with their autism.” Another case is that of “a man whose illness resulted in an increase in detail and vividness regarding childhood memory.” So much so, Greco notes, that when “these memories were put to use in accurate and detailed paintings of the man’s hometown in Italy…the man came to be considered an expert on the layout and appearance of that town, even though he had not visited there in decades.” Greco claims that these are cases in which “dysfunction gave rise to knowledge.”

What might a proper functionalist say in response to these scenarios? A couple of strategies are suggested by Plantinga (1993c: 74-75) in a reply to Richard Feldman (1993: 48-49). Feldman also points to these kinds of cases as creating difficulties for proper functionalism; in particular, Feldman cites the case of the autistic twins described above. As Feldman notes, these twins had the ability to “just see” (apparently without counting) that the number of matches that had fallen out of a box was 111. In his reply, Plantinga further notes that these same twins could also “just see,” it seems, whether a given six or eight digit number was prime. The first strategy Plantinga suggests for dealing with these cases is to call into question whether the individuals involved really do acquire knowledge in the scenarios described. The second is to concede (at least for the sake of argument) that they do, but argue that this is consistent with proper functionalism.

Regarding the first strategy, Plantinga notes that while the twins mentioned above can in fact reliably identify prime numbers, they lack, according to Sacks, the concept of multiplication. But if the twins lack the concept of multiplication, Plantinga argues, it is not clear that they genuinely grasp the concept of a prime number; so it is not clear that they have the relevant beliefs. Plantinga concedes, however, that this is a less plausible thing to say regarding the twins’ ability to discern the number of matches that had fallen out of a box. Here Plantinga turns to the second strategy. He concedes that while the twins’ “faculties obviously seem to malfunction in some ways,” it is doubtful that they are malfunctioning in producing the belief that there are 111 matches on the floor. Plantinga suggests that, perhaps, the twins have a different design plan than that of other human beings, and that this belief-forming tendency of theirs is subject to proper function conditions. In support of this claim, he notes that it seems possible that this remarkable ability of theirs might become damaged (in such a way that it is no longer reliable); in that case, he contends, we would be inclined to say that this ability had malfunctioned.

Another possibility open to the proper functionalists is to concede that these are cases in which cognitive malfunction enables the acquisition of knowledge, but only by way of truth-aimed proper function. If a typical human being, as a result of cognitive malfunction, suddenly found it seeming to her that she could just see that 111 matches had fallen out of a box, we might doubt that she really knows there are 111 matches. We might think that this belief, formed by way of this new-found tendency of hers, fails to count as knowledge, unless or until she has independent confirmation that the tendency is reliable. Once she does have such confirmation, we might concede that the resulting beliefs do count as knowledge, but only because she learned this to be a reliable way of getting at the truth. So perhaps, in at least some of the cases at issue, the individuals in question do acquire knowledge via belief-forming tendencies resulting from cognitive malfunction, but only by way of having learned those tendencies to be reliable. And if this learning occurs by way of cognitive processes that are in accord with proper function, these cases pose no difficulties for a proper functionalist theory.

This is perhaps not a plausible thing to say regarding all of these cases, however. It is not as plausible a thing to say regarding the individual whose illness caused him to form detailed memorial beliefs pertaining to his hometown in Italy, for example. One reason this a less plausible thing to say concerning that case is that the person in question is (presumably) forming these beliefs in response to memory phenomenology, which is an epistemically appropriate way for human beings to form beliefs downstream from experience. We would be much less likely to judge this person as having knowledge if these same beliefs arose, say, in response to the kind of phenomenology associated with a vivid daydream, unaccompanied by memorial seemings, even if the resulting beliefs should turn out to be reliably formed. So, the proper functionalist might say, if cognitive malfunction is somehow enabling the acquisition of knowledge in this case, it is not by virtue of causing the subject to respond deviantly to his experience (since, in that regard, he is responding as proper function dictates). It must, rather, be by virtue of its causing some deviation upstream from experience (that is, by virtue of its producing an abnormality in the manner in which the subject’s memorial experiences are produced). Whether this creates a significant problem for proper functionalism, furthermore, may depend on just how the malfunction in question enables knowledge.

However exactly memory information is processed, stored, and retrieved so as to generate belief-producing memorial experiences, it is plausible that the cognitive system responsible (or set of systems responsible) has different functions associated with it. One of these functions is to generate experiences that reliably produce true beliefs. But no doubt there are other functions associated with this system that do not pertain to that goal (indeed, some may even be in tension with it). It is plausible, for instance, that some of those functions pertain to filtering information as it comes in, either by preventing some of that information from being stored in the first place, discarding some of that information after it has been stored, or preventing some of it from being encoded in the relevant experiences. The purpose of this filtration process might not be to secure the production of true beliefs, but to prevent various kinds of information overload, or to highlight important items information at the expense of discarding others. Plausibly, what occurs in the case at issue is that a malfunction results in the suppression of these kinds of functions, leaving various other truth-aimed functions associated with the production of the relevant memorial experiences intact.

This consideration suggests yet another possible strategy the proper functionalist might have for dealing with these kinds of cases. Yes, she might grant, some of these are cases in which cognitive malfunction enables knowledge, but not by way of interfering with truth-aimed cognitive proper function (at least not with respect to the process that issued in the relevant beliefs). In at least some of these cases, the malfunction enables knowledge by preventing various non-truth-aimed aspects of cognitive proper function from interfering with or dampening various truth-aimed aspects (or perhaps by preventing some truth-aimed aspects of cognitive proper function from interfering with or dampening various other truth-aimed aspects). The consequence is that certain truth-aimed aspects of cognitive proper function result in various items of knowledge they would not have otherwise produced. So even though these are cases in which cognitive malfunction enables knowledge, the proper functionalist might say, they are not counterexamples to the claim that knowledge itself must come by way of truth-aimed cognitive proper function. Or, she might insist, to the extent to which it is unclear that these purported items of knowledge come by way of truth-aimed cognitive proper function, it is also unclear that we should count them as genuine items of knowledge.

It should pointed out that many virtue theories of knowledge also quite naturally lend themselves to virtue theories of justification. As Sosa (2007: 22-23) points out, for instance, an agent can manifest skill in a performance even when that performance fails to achieve its aim or achieves it merely by luck. An archer might take a skillful shot (to use one of Sosa’s frequent analogies), for instance, while still missing the target (or hitting it only by luck) on account of erratic wind conditions. Similarly, a believer might manifest her skill at coming to hold true beliefs while nonetheless getting it wrong (or getting it right only by luck) on account of being in an epistemically bad environment. Under these circumstances, the belief in question may be said (in Sosa’s terminology) to be “adroit” but not “apt” (p. 23). A belief that is adroit, according to Sosa, may be said to be justified (in one good sense at least) even if it is not an item of knowledge (BonJour and Sosa: 2003: 157).

A Sosa (2015: 26-27) himself is well aware, the having of a skill presupposes something like a normal environment. As Sosa points out, we do not say that a person lacks driving skill merely because she is disposed to perform poorly on an icy road in the midst of a snowstorm. What matters is whether she is disposed to perform well under ordinary driving conditions. Similarly, what matters for whether an agent is skilled at coming to hold true beliefs is whether she is capable of doing so in a certain kind of environment. But which sort of environment is the relevant one? According to Bergmann, this question points to an area in which a proper functionalist theory of justification has the advantage.

As Bergmann (2006: 142-143) notes, in a 1991 work  Sosa takes justification to be relativized to an environment. The person in the demon world has justified beliefs relative to our environment, according to this view, but not relative to her own. Similarly, the beliefs of alien cognizers who have radically different methods of belief formation than we do (ones that are adapted to their own environment) may have beliefs that are justified relative to their environment but not relative to ours. Bergmann argues however that our ordinary concept of justification does not appear to be relativized in this way.

In later work, as Bergmann also points out, in 2003 Sosa  holds that there are two different senses in which a belief might be said to be justified. A belief is “adroit-justified” if the method by which it is formed is reliable in the actual world, and “apt-justified” if the method by which it is formed is reliable in the subject’s world. As Bergmann notes, however, this view does not account for our intuition that there is a single sense in which our beliefs, the alien cognizers’ beliefs, and the demon victims’ beliefs are all justified.

Proper functionalism, by contrast, Bergmann maintains, has no difficulty accommodating these intuitions, since it holds that the relevant environment is the one specified by the design plan (which is the same between us and the demon victims but different for the alien cognizers). Whether Bergmann points to a genuine advantage of his theory over Sosa’s in this regard has, however, been disputed. Markie (2009: 374-377) argues, for example, that Bergmann’s own theory faces disadvantages akin to those he attributes to Sosa’s.

As with most disputed views, the extent to which one is drawn to proper functionalist theories will depend in large measure on which intuitions one has, the relative weight one assigns to them, one’s assessment of how well the theories in question accommodate those intuitions, and whether their rivals do any better. And here one’s mileage may vary. But it is a safe bet that proper functionalist theories will continue to serve as serious contenders for the foreseeable future.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Bergmann, Michael. 2006. Justification Without Awareness: A Defense of Epistemic Externalism (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Bergmann, Michael. 2013. “Externalist Justification and the Role of Seemings” Philosophical Studies 166: 163-184.
  • BonJour, Laurence and Sosa, Ernest. 2003. Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues (Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing).
  • Boyce, Kenneth and Plantinga, Alvin. 2012. “Proper Functionalism” The Continuum Companion to Epistemology, ed. Andrew Cullison (London: Continuum International Publishing Group).
  • Boyce, Kenneth and Moon, Andrew. 2015. “In Defense of Proper Functionalism: Cognitive Science Takes on Swampman,” Synthese Online First: DOI 10.1007/s11229-015-0899-6. article/10.1007/s11229-015-0899-6.
  • Crisp, Thomas M. “Gettier and Plantinga’s Revised Account of Warrant” Analysis 60: 42-50.
  • Chignell, Andrew. 2003. “Accidentally True Belief and Warrant” Synthese 137: 445-458.
  • Cullison, Andrew. 2013. “Seemings and Semantics” Seemings and Justification, ed. Chris Tucker (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Feldman, Richard. 1993. “Proper Functionalism” Nous 27: 34-50.
  • Goldman, Alvin “The Sciences and Epistemology” The Oxford Handbook of Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Graham, Peter. 2012. “Epistemic Entitlement” Nous 46: 449-482.
  • Graham, Peter. 2014. “Warrant, Functions, History” Naturalizing Epistemic Virtue, eds. Abrol Fairweather and Owen Flanagan (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Greco, John. 1993. “Virtues and Vices of Virtue Epistemology” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23: 413-432.
  • Greco, John. 2010. Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue-Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. (ed.). 1996 Warrant in Contemporary Epistemology: Essay’s in Honor of Plantinga’s Theory of Knowledge (London: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers).
  • Lehrer, Keith, and Cohen, Stewart. 1983. “Justification, Truth, and Coherence” Synthese 55: 191-207.
  • Long, Todd R. 2012. “Mentalist Evidentialism Vindicated (and a Super-Blooper Epistemic Design Problem for Proper Function justification)” Philosophical Studies 157: 251-266.
  • Markie, Peter. 2009. “Justification and Awareness” Philosophical Studies 146: 361-377.
  • McNabb, Tyler Dalton. 2015. “Warranted Religion: Answering Objections to Alvin Plantinga’s Epistemology” Religious Studies 51: 477-495.
  • Millikan, Ruth. 1984. “Naturalist Reflections on Knowledge” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 4:  315-334.
  • Otte, Richard. 1987. “A Theistic Conception of Probability” Faith and Philosophy 4: 427-447.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993a. Warrant: The Current Debate (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993b. Warrant and Proper Function (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993c. “Why We Need Proper Function” Nous 27: 66-82.
  • Spelke, Elizabeth. 1994. “Initial Knowledge: Six Suggestions” Cognition 50: 431-445.
  • Sacks, Oliver. 1970. The Man Who Mistook His Wife for a Hat (New York: HarperCollins).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1993. “Proper Functionalism and Virtue Epistemology” Nous 27: 51-65.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Vol. 1 (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2015. Judgement and Agency (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Tucker, Chris. 2011. “Phenomenal Conservatism and Evidentialism” Evidence and Religious Belief, eds. Kelly James Clark and Raymond J. VanArragon (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Tucker, Chris. 2014a. “If Dogmatists Have a Problem with Cognitive Penetration, You Do Too” Dialectica 68: 35-62.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2014b. “On What Inferentially Justifies What: The Vices of Reliabilism and Proper Functionalism,” Synthese 191: 3311-3328.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. 2010. “Ought to Believe—Two Concepts” Practices of Belief: Selected Essays, Vol. 2, ed. Terence Cuneo (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).


Author Information

Kenneth Boyce
University of Missouri
U. S. A.