Ralph Cudworth (1617—1688)

CudworthRalph Cudworth was an English philosopher and theologian, representative of a seventeenth century movement known as the Cambridge Platonists.  These were the first English philosophers to publish primarily in their native tongue, and to use Plato as a core influence.  Three of Cudworth’s works: The True Intellectual System of the Universe, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality, and A Treatise on Freewill together constitute the most complete available exposition of the Platonist world-view.

The Platonist School formed as a response to the intellectual crisis following the Calvinist victory in the English Civil Wars.  The Calvinists believed that human intellect was useless for understanding God’s will.  Only revelation was acceptable. With the death of Charles I, and the failure of traditional authority, several factions of Calvinism sought to define the new order that would replace the old order according to their own revelations. Without any mediating authority, or grounds to negotiate compromise, violence was often the result.

The Platonists constructed a natural theology supporting the concept of free will, and opposing the materialism of Thomas Hobbes. To its members, there was no natural divide between philosophy and theology.  Reason could, therefore, sort out rival theological and ethical claims without the violence that had troubled their generation.

To support this agenda, Cudworth devoted himself to developing a model of the universe, based on a vast body of both ancient and contemporary sources.  His ontology was based upon Neoplatonism, and involved a World-Soul he called “Plastic Nature.”  His epistemology was an amended Platonism, where the “Essences” that served as the standards of rationality, ordering both the mind and the universe, were innate to God.  In order to support the concept that people have free will, he developed a modern-sounding psychology derived from Epictetus’s Stoic psychology.  With this theory he attacked the concepts of materialism, voluntarism, and determinism.

The Cambridge School was primarily a reactionary assembly, and they largely dissolved when the Restoration of the Monarchy provided a political resolution to their generation’s concerns.  However, Cudworth exerted a subtle influence on later generations.  Through his daughter Damaris, his ideas helped to shape the philosophies of John Locke and Gottfried Leibniz, among others.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Publications
    1. Sermons
    2. The True Intellectual System of the Universe
    3. Posthumous works
  3. The Cambridge Platonists
    1. Calvinist Doctrines
    2. Platonist Responses
    3. Sources and Influences
  4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work
    1. The Essences and Rational Theology
    2. Ontology
      1. The Necessity of Dualism
      2. Atomic Materialism
      3. “Stratonical” Materialism
      4. Plastic Nature
    3. Epistemology
      1. Knowledge as Propositional
      2. The Essences in Epistemology
      3. Plastic Nature in Epistemology
      4. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology
    4. Free Will
      1. The Hegemonikon
      2. God’s Choice
      3. Human Choice
  5. Cudworth’s Influence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography


Ralph Cudworth was born in Aller, Somerset, in 1617.  His father was Ralph Cudworth, the Rector of Aller, a Fellow of Emmanuel College, Cambridge, and a former chaplain to King James I.  His mother, Mary Machell Cudworth, had been a nurse for James’s elder son, Henry.  Cudworth Senior died in 1624, and Mary Cudworth then married Doctor John Stoughton who replaced him as Rector of Aller.  Stoughton also saw to young Ralph’s home schooling.

In 1632, Cudworth enrolled in Emmanuel.  He received a Bachelor of Arts in 1635 and a Masters of Arts in 1639.  He was also elected a Fellow of Emmanuel, at this time, and began to serve as a tutor.  Cudworth earned a Bachelors of Divinity in 1646 and a Doctorate in Divinity in 1651.  During this time, he also became a friend of Benjamin Whichcote, the founder of the philosophical and theological movement known as The Cambridge Platonists.

During the English Civil Wars, Cudworth’s sympathies were with Parliament.  In 1644, representatives of Parliament appointed Cudworth to serve as the Master of Clair Hall, replacing a monarchist who had been ejected from that post.  In the next year, he was named Regius Professor in Hebrew.  From 1650 to 1654, he also served as the rector of North Cadbury, Somerset, which operated under the authority of Emmanuel College.  In 1654, Cudworth left both Clair Hall and the rectory to become the master of Christ’s College, Cambridge.

Judged a political moderate, Cudworth retained his position at Christ’s College upon the restoration of the monarchy, in 1660.  Sheldon, the Bishop of London, named him the Vicar of Ashwell, Hetford in 1662.  He was also given the Prebendry of Gloucester in 1678.   He died on June 26, 1688, at Cambridge, and was buried in the chapel at Christ’s College.

After becoming master of Christ’s College, Cudworth married Damaris Craddock Andrews.  They had two sons, John, and Charles, and one daughter, Damaris.  John and Charles Cudworth both died before their father.  Damaris Cudworth survived, and would anonymously author two philosophic works of her own: A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, and Occasional Thoughts. She also wrote the first biography of John Locke, with whom she was a close friend and correspondent.  She also wrote to Gottfried Leibniz, with whom she debated the merits of both her father’s works, and of Locke’s.

2. Publications

a. Sermons

Cudworth’s publications include theological texts such as A Discourse Concerning the True Notion of the Lords Supper (1642), and The Union of Christ and the Church, (1642).  He also published various sermons, including A Sermon before the House of Commons (1647).  As with most Platonists a good deal of his philosophical theories are expressed through published transcriptions of their sermons. This made them the first philosophers to express their theories primarily in English.  Cudworth would also write more conventional philosophical arguments to support their program.

b. The True Intellectual System of the Universe

His philosophical work is dominated by The True Intellectual System of the Universe: the First Part wherein All the Reason and Philosophy of Atheism is Confuted and Its Impossibility Demonstrated (1678). The System was supposed to be an exhaustive, three-part presentation of his entire Platonist world-view.  In his first volume he would attack atheism, most particularly as interpreted by Hobbes.  Thus, this work would also be arguing against Materialism.  The second volume would attack Voluntarism, as was accepted by John Calvin.  In the third, he would directly argue against the fatalism accepted by both Calvin and Hobbes.

However, the first volume of the System became controversial upon publication.  Some saw a crypto-atheism in Cudworth’s didactic style.  He first stipulated what he saw as all of the arguments for materialism and atheism, and then, after outlining his general philosophic positions, showed how that system answered all of these arguments.  Many found his initial arguments more compelling than his later responses.  This led some to wonder if this was not the intent.  Others disputed interpretations of Christian doctrine expressed in the System.  In response to these problems, Cudworth chose to suspend the project.

c. Posthumous works

Cudworth’s posthumous publications include A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (1731), and A Treatise on Freewill (1838). These are based upon surviving manuscripts of the projected continuation of the True System. In 1733, his True Intellectual System was translated to Latin and published in France by J. L. von Mosheim as Systema intellectuale hujus Universi, seu de veris Naturae originibus, correcting several Greek translations in the original, and introducing the work to a Continental audience.

3. The Cambridge Platonists

Cudworth was nominally a Calvinist, but he was not orthodox.  As a member of the Platonist movement, he rejected significant elements of the Calvinist theology.

a. Calvinist Doctrines

Orthodox Calvinists are voluntarists.  To them, God is primarily omnipotent, and nothing, not even logic, can restrain Him.  If He chose to make a man a married bachelor, for example, that would be easily within His power.  This meant that all of His activities are merely to be the absurd assertions of the universe’s unique existentialist subject.

As a consequence, Calvinists are also Enthusiasts, to whom all theological knowledge came to man through divine revelation.  Man’s rational powers, bound to logic, are simply useless with reference to God.  Believing that theology is the only acceptable grounding for ethics, this implies, to Calvinists that ethical standards are similarly dependent on divine fiat and revelation.

In addition, Calvinists were Fatalists, rejecting the concept of human free will.  If free will existed, they would argue, an individual would have more power over their own actions than had God.  This would compromise God’s absolute power.  Human actions would also be contingent, and thus, unpredictable.  This would compromise His omniscience.  Neither compromise was acceptable to the Calvinists, so they restricted all agency to the omnipotence of the Supreme Being.

Finally, Calvinism taught that, as a result of Original Sin, man’s nature was totally depraved, and irremediable through human efforts.  Unable to control his fate, man was wholly dependent on God for his moral status.  Neither his reason, nor his will could improve his character.

b. Platonist Responses

The Cambridge Platonists unanimously rejected all of these positions. Cudworth called them “the theory of the arbitrary deity.”(Ralph Cudworth, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, II.529.)  Their goal was to vindicate the power of the human intellect, and human moral responsibility.  To do otherwise, in their eyes, rendered any conception of God’s wisdom and goodness meaningless.

Instead, they supported a natural theology which could prove the existence of God, and the superiority of Christianity.  Beyond these basic points, disputes between individuals with different beliefs could and should be settled with debate, when this was possible.  When this method failed to produce a definitive resolution, they argued, differences between belief systems should be tolerated in the spirit of humility.  If humanity really needed to understand something, God, as a rational and benevolent entity, would allow it the information required to develop an understanding.  Thus, all people who make an honest effort to understand God, should and, in fact, did, come up with the same basic theological positions.  Education and rational persuasion are the only methods required to correct differences that exist between good people on fundamental matters.  Because man’s theological and ethical deliberations were capable of yielding some results, he must be, at least to the limited extent that his finite reasoning faculty allows, capable of taking some remedial steps towards his own salvation.

This position is formally known as “Latitudinarianism.” It would dominate Cudworth’s writings and sermons, beginning with A Sermon before the House of Commons.  The largest segment of the True System amounts to an attempted historical demonstration of Latitudinarianism.  There, he seeks to prove that all great thinkers in history were believers in God who agreed on the basic points of Christian doctrine.  He conducts an encyclopedic review of the history of philosophy, as he knew it, to garner support for this point.

Unfortunately, these historical digressions are more efforts at myth-making than legitimate arguments.  In order to demonstrate the reasonableness of Christianity, the author rewrites philosophic history to show that as many ancient philosophers as possible were, in some sense, Christian.  He also expands the borders of Christian doctrine so as to accommodate as many diverse philosophies as possible within it.  Both philosophy and Christian doctrine suffer some violence in this process.  As a result, after the System’s publication, several readers accused Cudworth of some form heresy, generally Tritheism, or Arianism.

c. Sources and Influences

The Cambridge Platonists’ primary intellectual resource was, obviously, Plato.  The Cambridge Platonists would be the first English philosophers to use him so prominently in their works.  However, their understanding of Plato was mediated by St. Augustine’s Neoplatonism.  Thus, they tended to confuse Plato’s beliefs with that of Plotinus.  Aristotle and the Stoics were also among their major influences.

Platonists also felt the influence of their contemporaries.  They particularly appreciated the rationalism of both Hobbes and René Descartes.  But, Descartes was a voluntarist.  At the same time, his theory of innate ideas seemed, to the Platonists, to lead to psychological determinism analogous to his mechanistic conception of material actions.  This paradoxically left it with what Cudworth called a “tang of the atheistic mechanistic humour.”(True System, I.283)  On the other hand, Hobbes’s rationalism led him to determinism, materialism, moral relativism, and, it seemed, atheism.  The Platonists could not accept either option.

Cudworth, in particular, was very historically-minded.  He tried to incorporate as many historic philosophers as possible into his arguments.  He seems to have believed that all of his contemporaries’ philosophical positions were passed down from some ancient thinker.  This skewed his understanding of contemporary thinkers, such as Thomas Hobbes, who seemed, to Cudworth, nothing more than a contemporary follower of Democritus.

4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work

a. The Essences and Rational Theology

To Cudworth, in a universe where God’s omnipotence trumped His omniscience, there would be no final truths for Him to know. “Truth and falsehood would be only names.  Neither would there be any more certainty in the knowledge of God, himself.” (True System, III. 539)  So, he concluded, if God is omniscient, as Christian doctrine dictates, then there must be eternal truths to know, which are invulnerable to His power.

To be eternal, at least in the sense intended in Platonic Theism that Cudworth espouses, these truths would have to be self-justifying, logically necessary principles, and not mere conditional facts.  Cudworth called them the “Essences.”  They are his equivalent of Plato’s Forms.  To Cudworth, such eternal principles “do not exist without us…but in the mind, itself.”(True System, III. 622)  Human minds cannot directly bear such entities, because they, themselves, are not eternal: “of that which is in constant change nothing may be affirmed as constantly true.”(True System, III. 627; quoting Aristotle, Metaphysics, 4.5)  The principles must exist within a mind that is also eternal.  The only such mind is God’s.  And so, Cudworth concludes, logically necessary principles exist as natural configurations of God’s mind.  They do not exist above Him, but as a self-disciplining element of His divine psychology.

With God’s mind disciplined by the logic of the Essences, He and His works must always be rational.  This means that, to the extent allowed by finite human capacities, rational deliberation can, with confidence, develop sound opinions concerning God, and His works.  Revelation, although possible, in such a theory, is not necessary for theological or ethical judgments.  Moreover, revealed theological truths must be reasonable, so disputes between revelations may be solved through sufficient rational analysis.  If man cannot resolve such a dispute, it must be because his rational powers are insufficient to the task, and so, his proper attitude towards the issue should be one of humility, not violent intolerance.

Cudworth also uses these Essences as a Design Argument for the existence of God.  If the human mind can understand the universe, at least to some extent, through reason, he contends, then necessary logical principles must guide the universe.  But necessary logical principles must be eternal truths.  Eternal truths that can only exist contained within an eternal mind.  This mind, by virtue of such containment, would know, and direct, the universe.  Thus, because man can use reason to gain knowledge of the universe, there is a rational God.

b. Ontology

i. The Necessity of Dualism

Cudworth’s Ontology is the primary focus of The True System. He begins it by gathering all of the various forms of atheism and reduces them to two general types, each founded on a different form of materialism.  The first is atomism.  It holds that matter consists of individual particles, each of which is incapable of initiating motion its own.  Cudworth calls the other “Stratonical” materialism, after Strato Lampsacus, the third director of the Lyceum.  It allows matter to initiate action, claiming that the universe is a single, self-organizing, but non-conscious entity.  In keeping with his Latitudinarian beliefs, Cudworth is willing to adopt each of these theories, up to a point.

But, Cudworth defines matter as being necessarily non-conscious.  As the universe is active, and the logical order of the universe implies, to Cudworth, the existence of an eternal logical mind, it seems obvious that matter cannot account for the entire universe.  Cudworth address, and rejects, the possibility that consciousness comes into existence as an emergent property.  Citing the Neoplatonic doctrine that “an effect cannot be superior to its cause”(True System, III.81) and the logical principle that “nothing comes from nothing,”(True System, II.67) he argues that it is clearly absurd and paradoxical that such things come from a substance that does not itself demonstrate any potential for either property.  Therefore, either line of thought goes astray when it leads to materialism and atheism.

ii. Atomic Materialism

Cudworth supports the conception that matter is made of atomic particles, but holds that this belief and atheism are fundamentally incompatible.  To him, matter is an essentially passive entity.  Therefore, the atomic motion which accounts for all mechanical action is as a reaction to an outside stimulus.  But this stimulus cannot be material, or else we are left with a vicious cycle.  Following Thomas Aquinas’s Cosmological Argument, this cycle can only be broken by having in an unmoved mover operating somewhere in the causal history of an event.  Only God has such a resume.  And so, Cudworth concludes, atomists must not be materialists.  They must be dualists who believe in an eternal God, if they are to be logically consistent.

Having established this, to his satisfaction, Cudworth turns to myth-making.  He advances a history of atomic theory that he shared with his friend, fellow Cambridge Platonist, Henry More.  Democritus, he claims, was not the first atomist, but merely the first atheistic atomist.  Atomism was, in fact, taught by Moses, and was brought to Greece by Pythagoras.  From him, it was supposedly passed down to Plato, Aristotle, Plutarch and others.  Leucippus and Democritus evidently took this original philosophy and corrupted it into atheism.

iii. “Stratonical” Materialism

“Stratonical” materialism is a variation of Plato’s Organicism. It agrees with Plato that the universe is a single, self-organizing, entity, but stipulates that this principle is wholly unconscious and material.  Instead it grants matter the ability to initiate action.

Cudworth rejects this adaptation of Plato.  To him, it is impossible for an entity to operate in a logical, orderly manner, without both the regulation of the Essences to establish what logic and order are, and some sort of consciousness to access these principles.  There are clearly apparent, and logically predictable, patterns in the objects, and actions of the universe.  Therefore, logic and the Essences exist.

But, the Essences are phenomena of the mind of God, existing nowhere else.  So, there must be more than even activist matter in the universe.  There must be a God, and matter must have some connection to God, in order to operate in accord with the Essences, which are mental phenomena.  There must be some sort of connector between matter and spirit.  This connector would, indeed, bind the universe, in one sense, into a single entity, but not on the purely material level of atoms.

iv. Plastic Nature

Cudworth believes that this connection is provided by a form of World Soul.  He finds ancient authority to support this conception, and much more successfully than he did in reference to atomism.  This disciplining force is clearly related to the World Soul described in the Plato’s Timaeus, and in the Stoic tradition. It is also an interpretation of Plotinus’s Third Hypostasis.  Such a world-soul does indeed bind the universe into one entity, but not through mere matter.

However, the greatest influence behind Cudworth’s conception of this force was Henry More.  Originally a follower of Descartes, More eventually opposed Cartesian ontology, because due to the general Platonist distaste for mechanism.  To replace this theory, he developed his conception of “the Natural Spirit,” or “the Hylarchic Principle.”  This principle traced the causal history of events through the interaction of matter with spirit, instead of through interactions between two or more material objects, while maintaining deterministic causality for material events.  Cudworth took this idea, and called it “Plastic Nature.”

More suggested that matter and spirit both exist in space.  When an atom of matter coexists with spirit, within the same space, they become, “bound by the law of fate.”(True System, III.674)  The result is Plastic Nature.  When the active spiritual element of plastic moves in accord with the logic of the Essences, it carries the passive material atom on which it has overlaid with it, resulting in a physical event.

This overlay renders the spiritual element of Plastic Nature unconscious.  Its motion is not deliberative, but analogous to the body’s autonomic system.  Nevertheless, all spiritual actions are defined by logical principles.  So, the activities of plastic nature are rational, determined, and predictable through the exercise of reason.  This allows animals, plants, and un-living nature to behave in an orderly manner, though all three lack native intelligence.

Still, the full scope of the Essences cannot be apprehended or enacted by an unconscious hybrid like Plastic Nature.  Some of them, such as the rational principles which imply moral standards, are too subtle.  So, Plastic Nature sometimes operates amorally, or even self-destructively, as when moths seek the sun, and fly into a flame; or rain falls on the just and the unjust alike.  God might be aware of the fall of every sparrow, but he need not directly conspire in the event.  Neither need He be found responsible for the death of moths, or the democracy of the weather.  Such events are attributed to the autonomic system of the universe, operating according to a crude apprehension of the true logical order found in God’s mind.  Contemplation of this true order requires the use of a fully conscious mind, without material contamination.

c. Epistemology

i. Knowledge as Propositional

Cudworth’s epistemology is based on the understanding that all knowledge is propositional. Beliefs that cannot be expressed in a proposition, such as “All men are mortal,” are not “known.”  Thus, the elements of a logical proposition—quantifiers, subjects, predicates and copulas–must be somehow present in the mind as a precondition of knowledge.  However, none of these things are determinable by the senses.  Both subjects and predicates are universals, such as “men” and “mortal.” Quantifiers, like “all,” and copulas such as “are,” are logical relations.  Senses only have contact with individual objects and properties as they exist relative to the observer.  Therefore, propositional knowledge is not empirical in nature.  It is a judgment arising from an active intellect already possessed with some logical capacities.

As God has knowledge, these universals must also be known to Him.  They must also be the models of his creations and the rational determinants of His acts.  They must be, in short, the Essences.

ii. The Essences in Epistemology

Humans do not have the direct access to these ideas that God enjoys. Cudworth is uncomfortable with the idea that humans might have innate ideas of the Essences.  Such theories as Descartes’ imply, to him, a form of epistemic determinism with the human mind pre-programmed to know certain truths, which have inevitable logical implications.  To Cudworth, who believes that both theology and ethics were developed through human reason, instead of revelation, epistemological determinism would imply an ethical determinism, where man is bound to come to a particular conclusion in either field.  This would make human moral and epistemic error hard to explain.

Because God is perfect, a kind of determinism as to the accuracy of His knowledge and moral decisions is essential to His nature, at least in cases where one belief or option is actually better than the others.  His ideas are innate.  But, to fill what Cudworth saw as our proper role in the order of things, humans must possess a useful, but less accurate, method of developing a consciousness of the same Essences.

iii. Plastic Nature in Epistemology

The senses do have a significant epistemological role in this method.  They stimulate the rational faculties of the mind.  The physical senses, guided by Plastic Nature, react to a sense-stimulation and draw information into the mind.  But all that the senses alone can detect would be “a thing which affects our sense in respect of figure or color.”(True System, III.584)  The determination that these properties are conjoined to an object, and that the same properties are universals, capable of manifesting simultaneously in multiple objects and locations, are rational judgments.  “(The mind)… exerts ‘conceptions’…upon our perceptions” (Ibid.) so that we might know objects.

Moreover, these conceptions must represent objective, universal principles.  If they did not exist as objective and universal entities, then knowledge would be of a purely relativistic and subjective nature.  They would be “phantasms” which we would not be able to communicate with one another, because we would each exist in a different epistemological universe.  They would also be irredeemably vague, because they are without any disciplining principle, except our own will, which is in flux.  And, finally, we would be unable to infer anything from them, because they are all particular.

To Cudworth and the Platonists, this ordering role is filled by Plastic Nature.  In addition to operating material events in accord with logic, Plastic Nature is also responsible for the autonomic elements of human behavior.  Cudworth ascribes dreams, and all other operations of what we call the unconscious mind to Plastic Nature manifest in the human mind.  Included in these, Cudworth holds, are the most basic projection of order onto our perceptions, so that we can be capable of logical deliberation.

According to Cudworth, when our eyes are stimulated by seeing a white object, or a black object, Plastic Nature instinctively abstracts the notions of Whiteness or Blackness from these experiences, and submits these concepts to the conscious mind.  The same is true for all basic universals.  Now the mind has something to reason about, and may detect logical relations among them these basic Essences.  Cudworth lists these relations as “Cause, Effect, Means, End, Order, Proportion, Similitude, Dissimilitude, Equality, Inequality, Aptitude, Inaptitude, Symmetry, Asymmetry, Whole, Part, Genus, Species, and the like.”(True System, III.586)  Propositions, and thus, knowledge, become possible.

Knowing objects, we also come to see corporate entities made up of several particular individuals “which, though sometimes locally discontinued, yet are joined together by…relations…,” and, “all conspiring into one thing imperceptible by sense…yet…not mere figments.” Conceptions, of such things as a nation, are an example of such a “totem.”  “(The development of such ideas)…proceeds merely from the intuitive power and the activity of the mind” which provides just those relations which allow that abstraction to be possible.”(Ibid. 593)


…a house, or a palace is not only stone, brick, mortar, timber, iron, glass, heaped together…it is made up of relative… notions it being a certain disposition of those materials into a ‘totem’ consisting of several parts, rooms, stairs, passages, doors, chimneys, windows, convenient for habitation, and fit for several functions among men….this logical form which is the passive stamp or print of intellectuality upon it. (Ibid. 594)

At this point, the spiritual, conscious element of the mind can also infer the existence of Essences which are not directly represented in experience.  The ideas that the mind has already developed logically imply these new ideas.  Examples of such ideas are: “Wisdom, Folly, Prudence, Imprudence, Knowledge, Ignorance, Verity, Falsity, Virtue, Vice, Honesty, Dishonesty, Justice, Injustice, Volition, Cognition, and Sense, Itself.”(Ibid. 586)  Ethics and Mathematics are also products of this process.  From our perception of universal order among material things, the mind may develop rational arguments for the existence of God.

As the disciplining of natural activities and of human thought are directly analogous functions of Plastic Nature, and are regulated by the same Essences, the logic of the human mind is always analogous to the natural order in the universe.  Where the Essences are represented in dumb matter by the laws of nature, they are represented in spirit by the activities in our mind which generate conceptions of those Essences.  Therefore, skepticism regarding the accuracy of human beliefs, as is manifest in Descartes’s “Evil Genius” thought experiment, is unjustified at this basic level.  The logic of our minds and the rationality of the universe are both emanations from the same source, and mirror each other.

iv. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology

However, after Plastic Nature has communicated the basic universals to the conscious mind, humans require more and more, at increasingly great levels of sophistication to develop these higher conceptions, unlike God, to whom they are innate. This opens the possibility of confusion or error.  For example, the conscious mind might simultaneously receive a message from its automatic epistemological processes, telling it that there is water on the horizon, and a second message from the reasoning spirit that this is a mirage.  When this occurs the problem has defeated our basic epistemological system, and the mind must choose which alternative to believe, settling the question with another faculty, the Will.

d. Free Will

Cudworth’s conception of the nature of the will is expressed in A Treatise on Freewill.  It is somewhat eccentric by the standard of his contemporaries.  To them, the human mind seems to be more the arena where will, intellect and the various passions constantly vie for power over the individual.  To Cudworth, it is far more orderly and integrated.

i. The Hegemonikon

He follows the Stoics, especially Epictetus and Iamblicus, in describing the mind as a “hegemonikon,” a conjunction of imagination, logic, passion and impulse.  According to Cudworth, the mind receives impulses from the reason, the body, and the instinctive drives of Plastic Nature in the way of a central repository.  Then it orders them, so that the whole can act as one coherent being.  It is the man …that understands, and the man that wills, as it is the man who walks, and the man that speaks or talks….”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 25)…not merely the will, which is a product, not a component of the man.  This concept allowed for a recovery of the connection between body and mind, lost in Descartes’s dualism.  In effect, it posits what we might call the “personality” as a multi-leveled emergent locus of physical, conscious, and unconscious forces out of which psychological activity arises.

Will is the faculty which brings order to these mixed signals.  Plastic Nature links it to the most basic Essences.  These include the Essence of the Good.  So, included in its make-up is “the instinct to do good.”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 4)  It tries to come up with the best internal order for the mind.  So, in cases where the intellect receives confused or mixed signals, the hegemonikon chooses which alternative to accept.  It is “free,” but it is not arbitrary.  It tries to arrive at the objectively right answer, but the very fact that it has been invoked means that there is no overwhelming influence determining which option to accept.

ii. God’s Choice

In some cases even the intellect of God is defeated, and is unable to discern which of a set of alternatives is better.  This is because Cudworth believes in a variety of Molina’s middle knowledge. To Cudworth, it is quite possible for two or more contradictory alternatives to really have equally forceful intellectual value.  Thus, there is no rational cause to prefer one option to the other.  In order to enact, or believe, one or the other option, the active intellect of God must have the ability to will an alternative without the guidance of predetermination.  So, God makes choices, when all of His alternatives are equally justified.  Fortunately, in God’s case, this only occurs when the alternatives actually are equally valid, so either option turns out to be perfectly right and good.

iii. Human Choice

Humans have a similar power.  But, due to the failings of our human epistemological method, sometimes we err.  In such cases, we only believe that the alternatives are all equally good, and engage the will, when the intellect alone should be enough to determine the appropriate alternative. When this happens, we might make the wrong choice, believing in the lesser truth, or performing the lesser act.  And so, moral and intellectual error enters the picture.  We are responsible for these errors because the balance of intellectual influences which required our will to act as a tie-breaker also eliminates the possibility for a predetermined solution.  We are the determining factor responsible for the action, event or belief produced.

5. Cudworth’s Influence

The Cambridge Platonists faded rather quickly from the English intellectual scene.  Most of the problems they attempted to solve were simply no longer of moment when the Restoration of the Monarchy forced a retreat of Calvinism. Also, Cudworth’s own vast erudition and the originality of his psychology were also lost in his bulky, inelegant style, controversial implications, and tendency towards mythmaking.
In 1703, Georges-Louis Le Clerc drew new attention to Cudworth, by publishing excerpts from the System.  This initiated a long debate between himself and Pierre Bayle over whether a belief in Plastic Nature could lead to atheism.  It also renewed interest in Cudworth and would eventually lead to the posthumous publications, and re-publications of his works.
Still, Cudworth’s philosophic influence is, for the most part, felt indirectly.  Damaris Cudworth Masham was a close friend to John Locke, and a correspondent with Gottfried Leibniz, whom she encouraged to publish.  Thus, parallels between Cudworth’s theories, and Locke’s seem to be no coincidence.  John Locke’s shares Cudworth’s conception of human free will, and his epistemological theory also adopts a model of the mind as an integrated collection of powers, faculties and modes.  Similarly, it may be observed that there are points of comparison between Cudworth’s conception of Plastic Nature, and Leibniz’s Theory of Pre-established Harmony.  Unfortunately, there has yet to be a complete study made of these connections.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Cragg, Gerald R. (ed.) 1968. The Cambridge Platonists. Oxford
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1731. A Treatise on Eternal and Unalterable Morality. London
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1996,  A Treatise on Free Will. Cambridge
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1678, The True Intellectual System of the Universe. 3 vols. London
  • Patrides, C.A. 1969. The Cambridge Platonists. Cambridge

b. Secondary Sources

  • Birch, Thomas “An Account of the Life and Writings of R. Cudworth, D.D.” in Cudworth, Works, 4 vols. (Oxford, 1829), 1, 7-37.
  • Carter, Benjamin. “Ralph Cudworth and the theological origins of consciousness,” in History of the Human Sciences July 2010 vol. 23 no. 3 29-47
  • Gysi, Lydia. Platonism and Cartesianism in the Philosophy of Cudworth (1962).
  • Lahteenmaki, Vili.  2010. “Cudworth on Types of Consciousness.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 18 (1):9-34.
  • Mijuskovic, Ben Lazare. The Achilles of Rationalist Arguments. The Simplicity, Unity, and Identity of Thought and Soul from the Cambridge Platonists to Kant: A Study in the History of an Argument (International Archives of the History of ideas, Series Minor 13). The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974.
  • Muirhead, John H. The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy (1931). New York
  • Osborne, Catherine. ‘Ralph Cudworth’s The True Intellectual System of the Universe and the Presocratic Philosophers’, in Oliver Primavesi and Katharina Luchner (eds) The Presocratics from the Latin Middle Ages to Hermann Diels (Steiner Verlag 2011)
  • Passmore, John Arthur. Ralph Cudworth: An Interpretation, University Press, University of Michigan (1951).
  • Rodney, Joel M. “A Godly Atomist in 17th-Century England: Ralph Cudworth,” The Historian 32 (1970), 243-9.
  • Tulloch, J. “Rational Theology and Christian Philosophy in England in the Seventeenth Century,” reprint of 2nd ed., 2 vols. (New York, 1972), 2, 193-302. BR756 T919 Dictionary of National Biography (repr., London: Oxford University Press, 1949-1950), 5, 271-2. Biographia Britannica, 2nd ed. (London, 1778-93), 4, 544-9.


Author Information

Charles M. Richards
Email: Charles_Richards@tulsacc.edu
Tulsa Community College, Rogers State University
U. S. A.