Ayn Rand (1905—1982)

Ayn Rand was a major intellectual of the twentieth century. Born in Russia in 1905 and educated there, she immigrated to the United States after graduating from university. Upon becoming proficient in English and establishing herself as a writer of fiction, she became well-known as a passionate advocate of a philosophy she called Objectivism. This philosophy is in the Aristotelian tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon metaphysical naturalism, empirical reason in epistemology, and self-realization in ethics. Her political philosophy is in the classical liberal tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon individualism, the constitutional protection of individual rights to life, liberty, and property, and limited government. She wrote both technical and popular works of philosophy, and she presented her philosophy in both fictional and nonfictional forms. Her philosophy has influenced several generations of academics and public intellectuals, and has had widespread popular appeal.

Regarding human nature, Rand said, “Man is a being of self-made soul.” Rand believes human beings are not born in sin or with destructive desires; nor do they necessarily acquire them in the course of growing to maturity. Instead one is born morally tabula rasa (a blank slate), and through one’s choices and actions one acquires one’s character traits and habits. Having chronic desires to steal, rape, or kill others is the result of mistaken development and the acquisition of bad habits, just as are chronic laziness or the habit of eating too much junk food. And just as one is not born lazy but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of vigor or sloth, so also one is not born antisocial but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of cooperativeness or conflict.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Rand’s Ethical Theory: Rational Egoism
  3. Reason and Ethics
  4. Criticisms of Rand’s Ethics
  5. Conflicts of Interest
  6. Rand’s Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Ayn Rand’s life was often as colorful as those of her heroes in her best-selling novels The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged. Rand first made her name as a novelist, publishing We the Living (1936), The Fountainhead (1943), and her magnum opus Atlas Shrugged (1957). These philosophical novels embodied themes she subsequently developed in nonfiction form in a series of essays and books written in the 1960s and 1970s.

Born in St. Petersburg, Russia, on February 2, 1905, Rand was raised in a middle-class family. As a child, she loved storytelling, and at age nine she decided to become a writer. In school she showed academic promise, particularly in mathematics. Her family was devastated by the communist revolution of 1917, both by the social upheavals that the revolution and the ensuing civil war brought and by her father’s pharmacy being confiscated by the Soviets. The family moved to the Crimea to recover financially and to escape the harshness of life the revolution brought to St. Petersburg. They later returned to Petrograd (the new name given to St. Petersburg by the Soviets), where Rand was to attend university.

At the University of Petrograd, Rand concentrated her studies on history, with secondary focuses on philosophy and literature. At university, she was repelled by the dominance of communist ideas and strong-arm tactics that suppressed free inquiry and discussion. As a youth, she had been repelled by the communists’ political program, and now an adult, she was also more fully aware of the destructive effects that the revolution had had on Russian society more broadly.

Having studied American history and politics at university, and having long been an admirer of Western plays, music, and movies, she became an admirer of American individualism, vigor, and optimism, seeing them as the opposites of Russian collectivism, decay, and gloom. Not believing, however, that she would be free under the Soviet system to write the kinds of books she wanted to write, she resolved to leave Russia and go to America.

Rand graduated from the University of Petrograd in 1924. She then enrolled at the State Institute for Cinema Arts in order to study screenwriting. In 1925, she finally received permission from the Soviet authorities to leave the country in order to visit relatives in the United States. Officially, her visit was to be brief; Rand, however, had already decided not to return to the Soviet Union.

After several stops in western European cities, Rand arrived in New York City in February 1926. From New York, she traveled on to Chicago, Illinois, where she spent the next six months living with relatives, learning English, and developing ideas for stories and movies. She had decided to become a screenwriter, and, having received an extension to her visa, she left for Hollywood, California.

On Rand’s second day in Hollywood, an event occurred that was worthy of her fiction. She was spotted by Cecil B. DeMille, one of Hollywood’s leading directors, while she was standing at the gate of his studio. She had recognized him as he was passing by in his car, and he had noticed her staring at him. He stopped to ask why she was staring, and Rand explained that she had recently arrived from Russia, that she had long been passionate about Hollywood movies, and that she dreamed of being a screenwriter. DeMille was then working on “The King of Kings,” and gave her a ride to his movie set and signed her on as an extra. During her second week at DeMille’s studio, another significant event occurred: Rand met Frank O’Connor, a young actor also working as an extra. Rand and O’Connor were married in 1929, and they remained married for fifty years until his death in 1979.

Rand worked for DeMille as a reader of scripts and struggled financially while working on her own writing. She also held a variety of non-writing jobs until in 1932 she was able to sell her first screenplay, “Red Pawn,” to Universal Studios. Also in 1932 her first stage play, “Night of January 16th,” was produced in Hollywood and later on Broadway.

Rand had been working for years on her first significant novel, We the Living, and finished it in 1933. However, for several years it was rejected by various publishers, until in 1936 it was published by Macmillan in the U.S. and Cassell in England. Rand described We the Living as the most autobiographical of her novels, its theme being the brutality of life under communist rule in Russia. We the Living did not receive a positive reaction from American reviewers and intellectuals. It was published in the 1930s, a decade sometimes called the “Red Decade,” during which American intellectuals were often pro-communist and respectful and admiring of the Soviet experiment.

Rand’s next major project was The Fountainhead, which she had begun to work on in 1935. While the theme of We the Living was political, the theme of The Fountainhead was ethical, focusing on individualist themes of independence and integrity. The novel’s hero, the architect Howard Roark, is Rand’s first embodiment of her ideal man, the man who lives on a principled and heroic scale of achievement.

As with We the Living, Rand had difficulties getting The Fountainhead published. Twelve publishers rejected it before it was published by Bobbs-Merrill in 1943. Again not well received by reviewers and intellectuals, the novel nonetheless became a best seller, primarily through word-of-mouth recommendation. The Fountainhead made Rand famous as an exponent of individualist ideas, and its continuing to sell well brought her financial security. Warner Brothers produced a movie version of the novel in 1949, starring Gary Cooper and Patricia Neal, for which Rand wrote the screenplay.

In 1946, Rand began work on her most ambitious novel, Atlas Shrugged. At the time, she was working part-time as a screenwriter for producer Hal Wallis. In 1951, she and her husband moved to New York City, where she began to work full-time on Atlas. Published by Random House in 1957, Atlas Shrugged is her most complete expression of her literary and philosophical vision. Dramatized in the form of a mystery about a man who stopped the motor of the world, the plot and characters embody the political and ethical themes first developed in We the Living and The Fountainhead and integrates them into a comprehensive philosophy including metaphysics, epistemology, economics, and the psychology of love and sex.

Atlas Shrugged was an immediate best seller and Rand’s last work of fiction. Her novels had expressed philosophical themes, although Rand considered herself primarily a novelist and only secondarily a philosopher. The creation of plots and characters and the dramatization of achievements and conflicts were her central purposes in writing fiction, rather than presenting an abstracted and didactic set of philosophical theses.

The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged, however, had attracted to Rand many readers who were strongly interested in the philosophical ideas the novels embodied and in pursuing them further. Among the earliest of those with whom Rand became associated and who later became prominent were psychologist Nathaniel Branden and economist Alan Greenspan, later Chairman of the Federal Reserve. Her interactions with these and several other key individuals were partly responsible for Rand’s turning from fiction to nonfiction writing in order to develop her philosophy more systematically.

From 1962 until 1976, Rand wrote and lectured on her philosophy, now named “Objectivism.” Her essays during this period were mostly published in a series of periodicals: The Objectivist Newsletter, published from 1962 to 1965; the larger periodical The Objectivist, published from 1966 to 1971; and then The Ayn Rand Letter, published from 1971 to 1976. The essays written for these periodicals form the core material for a series of nine nonfiction books published during Rand’s lifetime. These books develop Rand’s philosophy in all its major categories and apply it to cultural issues. Perhaps the most significant of these books are The Virtue of Selfishness, which develops her ethical theory, Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal, devoted to political and economic theory, Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology, a systematic presentation of her theory of concepts, and The Romantic Manifesto, a theory of aesthetics.

During the 1960s, Rand’s most significant professional relationship was with Nathaniel Branden. Branden, author of The Psychology of Self-Esteem and later known as a leader in the self-esteem movement in psychology, wrote many essays on philosophical and psychological topics that were published in Rand’s books and periodicals. He was the founder and head of the Nathaniel Branden Institute, the leading Objectivist institution of the 1960s. Based in New York City, the Nathaniel Branden Institute published with Rand’s sanction numerous periodicals and pamphlets and sponsored many lectures in New York that were then distributed on tape around the United States and the rest of the world. The rapid growth of the Nathaniel Branden Institute and the Objectivist movement came to a halt in 1968 when, for both professional and personal reasons, Rand and Branden parted ways.

Rand continued to write and lecture consistently until she stopped publishing The Ayn Rand Letter in 1976. Thereafter she wrote and lectured less as her husband’s health declined, leading to his death in 1979, and as her own health began to decline. Rand died on March 6, 1982, in her New York City apartment.

2. Rand’s Ethical Theory: Rational Egoism

The provocative title of Ayn Rand’s The Virtue of Selfishness matches an equally provocative thesis about ethics. Traditional ethics has always been suspicious of self-interest, praising acts that are selfless in intent and calling amoral or immoral acts that are motivated by self-interest. A self-interested person, on the traditional view, will not consider the interests of others and so will slight or harm those interests in the pursuit of his own.

Rand’s view is that the exact opposite is true: Self-interest, properly understood, is the standard of morality and selflessness is the deepest immorality.

Self-interest rightly understood, according to Rand, is to see oneself as an end in oneself. That is to say that one’s own life and happiness are one’s highest values, and that one does not exist as a servant or slave to the interests of others. Nor do others exist as servants or slaves to one’s own interests. Each person’s own life and happiness are their ultimate ends. Self-interest rightly understood also entails self-responsibility: One’s life is one’s own, and so is the responsibility for sustaining and enhancing it. It is up to each of us to determine what values our lives require, how best to achieve those values, and to act to achieve those values.

Rand’s ethic of self-interest is integral to her advocacy of classical liberalism. Classical liberalism, more often called “libertarianism” in the twentieth century, is the view that individuals should be free to pursue their own interests. This implies, politically, that governments should be limited to protecting each individual’s freedom to do so. In other words, the moral legitimacy of self-interest implies that individuals have rights to their lives, their liberties, their property, and the pursuit of their own happiness, and that the purpose of government is to protect those rights. Economically, leaving individuals free to pursue their own interests implies in turn that only a capitalist or free market economic system is moral: Free individuals will use their time, money, and other property as they see fit, and will interact and trade voluntarily with others to mutual advantage.

3. Reason and Ethics

Fundamentally, the means by which humans live is reason. Our capacity for reason is what enables us to survive and flourish. We are not born knowing what is good for us; that is learned. Nor are we born knowing how to achieve what is good for us; that too is learned. It is by reason that we learn what is food and what is poison, what animals are useful or dangerous to us, how to make tools, what forms of social organization are fruitful, and so on.

Thus, Rand advocates rational self-interest: One’s interests are not whatever one happens to feel like; rather it is by reason that one identifies what is in one’s interest and what is not. By the use of reason one takes into account all of the factors one can identify, projects the consequences of potential courses of action, and adopts principled policies of action.

The principled policies a person should adopt are called virtues. A virtue is an acquired character trait; it results from identifying a policy as good and committing to acting consistently in terms of that policy.

One such virtue is rationality: Having identified the use of reason as fundamentally good, the virtue of rationality is being committed to acting in accordance with reason. Another virtue is productiveness: Given that the values one needs to survive must be produced, the virtue of productiveness is being committed to producing those values. Another is honesty: Given that facts are facts and that one’s life depends on knowing and acting in accordance with the facts, the virtue of honesty is being committed to awareness of the facts.

Independence and integrity are also core virtues for Rand’s account of self-interest. Given that one must think and act by one’s own efforts, being committed to the policy of independent action is a virtue. And given that one must both identify what is in one’s interests and act to achieve it, the virtue of integrity is a policy of being committed to acting on the basis of one’s beliefs. The opposite policy of believing one thing and doing another is of course the vice of hypocrisy; hypocrisy is a policy of self-destruction, on Rand’s view.

Justice is another core self-interested virtue: Justice, on Rand’s account, means a policy of judging people, including oneself, according to their value and acting accordingly. The opposite policy of giving to people more or less than they deserve is injustice. The final virtue on Rand’s list of core virtues is pride, the policy of “moral ambitiousness,” in Rand’s words. This means a policy of being committed to making oneself be the best one can be, of shaping one’s character to the highest level possible.

The moral person, in summary, on Rand’s account, is someone who acts and is committed to acting in their best self-interest. It is by living the morality of self-interest that one survives, flourishes, and achieves happiness.

4. Criticisms of Rand’s Ethics

Every aspect of Rand’s philosophy is subject to lively criticism and debate, but her normative views are the ones most focused upon.

From the broadly defined conservative right, the main criticisms are (a) that Rand’s metaphysical naturalism involves an atheism that undercuts religious metaphysics, (b) that her strong emphasis upon empirical data and reason undercut epistemologies based on faith and tradition, and (c) that her normative individualism undercuts the commands of duty, obligation and selflessness that are necessary for achieving social values. From the left, again defined broadly, the main criticisms are (a) that Rand’s individualism atomistically isolates each of us from genuine society, (b) that her advocacy of free markets enables strong-versus-weak exploitation, and in left-postmodern critique (c) that her philosophical fundamentals commit her to an untenable foundationalism and absolutism.

Here we will focus only on the arguments over Rand’s account of self-interest, which is currently a minority position and subject to strong criticism from both the philosophical left and the philosophical right.

The contrasting view of self-interest typically pits it against morality, holding that one is moral only to the extent that one sacrifices one’s self-interest for the sake of others or, more moderately, to the extent one acts primarily with regard to the interests of others. For example, standard versions of morality will hold that one is moral to the extent one sets aside one’s own interests in order to serve God, or the weak and the poor, or society as a whole. On these accounts, the interests of God, the poor, or society as a whole are held to be of greater moral significance than one’s own, and so accordingly one’s interests should be sacrificed when necessary. These ethics of selflessness thus believe that one should see oneself fundamentally as a servant, as existing to serve the interests of others, not one’s own. “Selfless service to others” or “selfless sacrifice” are stock phrases indicating these accounts’ view of appropriate motivation and action.

One core difference between Rand’s self-interest view and the selfless view can be seen in the reason why most advocates of selflessness think self-interest is dangerous: conflicts of interest.

5. Conflicts of Interest

Most traditional ethics take conflicts of interest to be fundamental to the human condition, and take ethics to be the solution: Basic ethical principles are to tell us whose interests should be sacrificed in order to resolve the conflicts. If there is, for example, a fundamental conflict between what God wants and what humans naturally want, then religious ethics will make fundamental the principle that human wants should be sacrificed for God’s. If there is a fundamental conflict between what society needs and what individuals want, then some versions of secular ethics will make fundamental the principle that the individual’s wants should be sacrificed for society’s.

Taking conflicts of interest to be fundamental almost always stems from one of two beliefs: that human nature is fundamentally destructive or that economic resources are scarce. If human nature is fundamentally destructive, then humans are naturally in conflict with each other. Many ethical philosophies start from this premise—for example, Plato’s myth of Gyges, Jewish and Christian accounts of original sin, and Freud’s account of the id. If what individuals naturally want to do to each other is rape, steal, and kill, then in order to have society these individual desires need to be sacrificed. Consequently, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to suppress their natural desires so that society can exist. In other words, self-interest is the enemy, and must be sacrificed for others.

If economic resources are scarce, then there is not enough to go around. This scarcity then puts human beings in fundamental conflict with each other: For one individual’s need to be satisfied, another’s must be sacrificed. Many ethical philosophies begin with this premise. For example, Thomas Malthus’s theory that population growth outstrips growth in the food supply falls into this category. Karl Marx’s account of capitalist society is that brutal competition leads to the exploitation of some by others. Garrett Hardin’s famous use of the lifeboat analogy asks us to imagine that society is like a lifeboat with more people than its resources can support. And so, in order to solve the problem of destructive competition the lack of resources leads us to, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to sacrifice their interests in obtaining more, or even some, so that others may obtain more or some and society can exist peacefully. In other words, in a situation of scarcity, self-interest is the enemy and must be sacrificed for others.

Rand rejects both the scarce resources and destructive human nature premises. Human beings are not born in sin or with destructive desires; nor do they necessarily acquire them in the course of growing to maturity. Instead one is born morally tabula rasa (“blank slate”), and through one’s choices and actions one acquires one’s character traits and habits. As Rand phrased it, “Man is a being of self-made soul.” Having chronic desires to steal, rape, or kill others is the result of mistaken development and the acquisition of bad habits, just as are chronic laziness or the habit of eating too much junk food. And just as one is not born lazy but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of vigor or sloth, one is not born antisocial but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of cooperativeness or conflict.

Nor are resources scarce, according to Rand, in any fundamental way. By the use of reason, humans can discover new resources and how to use existing resources more efficiently, including recycling where appropriate and making productive processes more efficient. Humans have, for example, continually discovered and developed new energy resources, from animals to wood to coal to oil to nuclear fission to solar panels; and there is no end in sight to this process. At any given moment, the available resources are a fixed amount, but over time the stock of resources are and have been constantly expanding.

Because humans are rational they can produce an ever-expanding number of goods, and so human interests do not fundamentally conflict with each other. Instead, Rand holds that the exact opposite is true: Since humans can and should be productive, human interests are deeply in harmony with each other. For example, my producing more corn is in harmony with your producing more peas, for by our both being productive and trading with each other we are both better off. It is to your interest that I be successful in producing more corn, just as it is to my interest that you be successful in producing more peas.

Conflicts of interest do exist within a narrower scope. For example, in the immediate present available resources are more fixed, and so competition for those resources results, and competition produces winners and losers. Economic competition, however, is a broader form of cooperation, a social way to allocate resources without resorting to physical force and violence. By competition, resources are allocated efficiently and peacefully, and in the long run more resources are produced. Thus, a competitive economic system is in the self-interest of all of us.

Accordingly, Rand argues that her ethic of self-interest is the basis for personal happiness and free and prosperous societies.

6. Rand’s Influence

The impact of Rand’s ideas is difficult to measure, but it has been large. All her books were still in print as of 2017, had sold more than thirty million copies, and continued to sell approximately one million copies each year. A survey jointly conducted by the Library of Congress and the Book of the Month Club early in the 1990s asked readers to name the book that had most influenced their lives: Atlas Shrugged was second only to the Bible. Excerpts from Rand’s works are regularly reprinted in college textbooks and anthologies, and several volumes have been published posthumously containing her early writings, journals, and letters. As an outsider with iconoclastic views, Rand’s influence within the academic world has been limited, though university press books and scholarly articles about her work continue to be published regularly. Outside the academic world are several institutes founded by those influenced by Rand. Noteworthy among these are the Cato Institute, based in Washington, D.C., the leading libertarian think tank. Rand, along with Nobel Prize-winners Friedrich Hayek and Milton Friedman, was highly instrumental in attracting generations of individuals to the libertarian movement. Also noteworthy are the Ayn Rand Institute, founded in 1985 by philosopher Leonard Peikoff and entrepreneur Edward Snider and based in California, and The Atlas Society, founded in 1990 by philosopher David Kelley and based in Washington, D.C.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Rand, Ayn. Atlas Shrugged. Random House, 1957.
    • Rand’s magnum opus of fiction.
  • Rand, Ayn. Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal. New American Library, 1967.
    • A collection of twenty of Rand’s essays on politics, history, and economics. Also includes two essays by psychologist Nathaniel Branden, three by economist Alan Greenspan, and one by historian Robert Hessen.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Fountainhead. Bobbs-Merrill, 1943.
    • The novel of individualism, independence, and integrity that made Rand famous.
  • Rand, Ayn. Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology. New American Library, 1979.
    • Rand’s theory of concept-formation. Includes an essay by philosopher Leonard Peikoff on the analytic/synthetic distinction.
  • Rand, Ayn. Philosophy: Who Needs It. Bobbs-Merrill, 1982.
    • A collection of Rand’s essays on the nature and significance of philosophy, including her critiques of other thinkers such as Kant, Aristotle, Rawls, and Skinner.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Romantic Manifesto. World Publishing, 1969. Paperback edition: New American Library, 1971.
    • A collection of Rand’s essays on philosophy of art and aesthetics.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Virtue of Selfishness. New American Library, 1964.
    • A collection of fourteen of Rand’s essays on ethics. Also includes five essays by psychologist Nathaniel Branden.
  • Rand, Ayn. We the Living. Macmillan, 1936.
    • Rand’s first novel, set in the Soviet Union in the years following the Russian Revolution.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Badhwar, Neera, and Long, Roderick T. “Ayn Rand,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 2010/2016.
    • Two philosophers present an overview of Rand’s life and work in the major areas of philosophy, with special attention to several major disagreements among philosophers working within Objectivism.
  • Binswanger, Harry. The Biological Basis of Teleological Concepts. Los Angeles, CA: A.R.I. Press, 1990.
    • Written by a philosopher, this is a scholarly work focused on the connection between biology and the concepts at the roots of ethics.
  • Branden, Nathaniel. The Vision of Ayn Rand: The Basic Principles of Objectivism. Cobden Press, 2009.
    • A comprehensive overview of Rand’s philosophy based on the lecture series presented under Rand’s auspices in the 1960s.
  • Branden, Nathaniel, and Branden, Barbara. Who Is Ayn Rand? New York: Random House, 1962.
    • This book contains essays on Objectivism’s moral philosophy, its connection to psychological theory, and a literary study of Rand’s novel methods. It contains an additional biographical essay, tracing Rand’s life from birth up until her mid-50s.
  • Burns, Jennifer. Goddess of the Market: Ayn Rand and the American Right. Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Written by a historian, a scholarly discussion of Rand’s ambiguous relationship with free market, libertarian, and conservative movements.
  • Gotthelf, Allan and Salmieri, Gregory. A Companion to Ayn Rand. Wiley-Blackwell, 2016.
    • The editors have compiled a series of scholarly entries on all of the major elements of Rand’s philosophy.
  • Gotthelf, Allan and Lennox, James. Concepts and Their Role in Knowledge. University of Pittsburgh Press, 2013.
    • Ten philosophers debate Rand’s epistemology, with focused articles on her theories of perception, concepts, and scientific method.
  • Gotthelf, Allan and Lennox, James. Metaethics, Egoism, and Virtue: Studies in Ayn Rand’s Normative Theory. University of Pittsburgh Press, 2010.
    • Eight philosophers debate Rand’s ethical theory.
  • Hessen, Robert. In Defense of the Corporation. Stanford, CA: Hoover Institution, 1979.
    • An economic historian, Hessen argues and defends from an Objectivist perspective the moral and legal status of the corporate form of business organizations.
  • Hicks, Stephen. “Ayn Rand and Contemporary Business Ethics.” Journal of Accounting, Ethics, and Public Policy 3:1, 2003.
    • A philosopher explores the implications of Rand’s ethics for the foundations of business ethics.
  • Hicks, Stephen. “Egoism in Nietzsche and Ayn Rand.” Journal of Ayn Rand Studies 10:2, 2009.
    • A philosopher compares and contrasts the positions that underlie Nietzsche’s and Rand’s theses on egoism and altruism.
  • Kelley, David. The Evidence of the Senses. Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University Press, 1986.
    • Written by a philosopher working within the Objectivist tradition, this scholarly work in epistemology focuses on the foundational role the senses play in human knowledge.
  • Mayhew, Robert. Ayn Rand’s Marginalia. New Milford, CT: Second Renaissance Books, 1995.
    • This volume contains Rand’s critical comments on over twenty thinkers, including Friedrich Hayek, C. S. Lewis, and Immanuel Kant. Edited by a philosopher, the volume contains facsimiles of the original texts with Rand’s comments on facing pages.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. The Ominous Parallels: The End of Freedom in America. New York: Stein & Day, 1982.
    • A scholarly work in the philosophy of history, arguing Objectivism’s theses about the role of philosophical ideas in history and applying them to explaining the rise of National Socialism.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. New York: Dutton, 1991.
    • This is the first comprehensive overview of all aspects of Objectivist philosophy, written by the philosopher closest to Rand during her lifetime.
  • Rasmussen, Douglas and Douglas Den Uyl, editors. The Philosophic Thought of Ayn Rand. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1984.
    • A collection of scholarly essays by philosophers, defending and criticizing various aspects of Objectivism’s metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and politics.
  • Reisman, George. Capitalism: A Treatise on Economics. Ottawa, IL: Jameson Books, 1996.
    • A scholarly work by an economist, developing free-market capitalist economic theory, especially that coming out of the Austrian tradition, and connecting it to Objectivist philosophy.
  • Sciabarra, Chris Matthew. Ayn Rand, The Russian Radical. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1995.
    • A work in history of philosophy, this book attempts to trace the influence upon Rand’s thinking of dialectical approaches to philosophy prevalent in 19th century Europe and Russia. Also an introduction and overview of the major branches of Objectivist philosophy.
  • Smith, Tara. Ayn Rand’s Normative Ethics: The Virtuous Egoist. Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • A scholarly work by a philosopher on Rand’s meta-ethics and its application in normative ethics.
  • Wilkinson, Will, editor. “What’s Living and Dead in Ayn Rand’s Moral and Political Thought?” Cato Unbound, 2010.
    • Four professors of philosophy—Douglas B. Rasmussen, Michael Huemer, Neera K. Badhwar, and Roderick T. Long—discuss and debate the current state of Rand scholarship.
  • Zwolinski, Matthew. “Is Ayn Rand Right about Rights?” Learn Liberty, April 2017.
    • A philosophy professor argues that Rand’s theory of individual rights is subject to three major criticisms.


Author Information

Stephen R. C. Hicks
Email: shicks@rockford.edu
Rockford University
U. S. A.