Religious Pluralism

Religious pluralism, broadly construed, is a response to the diversity of religious beliefs, practices, and traditions that exist both in the contemporary world and throughout history. The terms “pluralism” and “pluralist” can, depending on context or intended use, signify anything from the mere fact of religious diversity to a particular kind of philosophical or theological approach to such diversity, one usually characterized by humility regarding the level of truth and effectiveness of one’s own religion, as well as the goals of respectful dialogue and mutual understanding with other traditions. The term “diversity” refers here to the phenomenal fact of the variety of religious beliefs, practices, and traditions. The terms “pluralism” and “pluralist” refer to one form of response to such diversity.

Philosophical and theological treatments of religious diversity have generally adopted different attitudes and different methods insofar as their respective disciplinary commitments differ. Since theological accounts tend explicitly to be grounded in the faith commitments that characterize particular religious traditions (or at least larger sets of traditions, such as Christianity or the “Abrahamic” religions), they often explore how members of a given faith ought to regard the beliefs and practices of other traditions. Philosophical accounts, by contrast, often tend to adopt a more or less disinterested attitude and instead evaluate, for example, the epistemological or ethical issues raised by religious diversity; this is especially true within the analytic tradition, which raises questions about the justification of conflicting religious beliefs that have received much attention in analytic literature. Although this article’s examination largely focuses on philosophical positions, despite their methodological and perspectival differences theological and philosophical accounts inform and influence each other.

As with many other philosophical topics, there are also significant differences between the way religious diversity is treated as a topic by analytic and continental philosophers. In general, it has been taken up more directly and explicitly in analytic philosophy since the 1980s, though religious diversity has also featured as an important, if secondary, theme in much continental philosophy of religion (as well as continental social, political, and ethical philosophy). Therefore, after introducing some basic terminology and exploring treatments of religious diversity in the history of modern philosophy, this article explores analytic and continental approaches in separate sections. Significant feminist discussions of religious diversity have emerged in both analytic and continental philosophy; these will be treated their own section. In addition, sections are devoted to contributions from both process philosophy and liberation theology.

The phenomenon of religious diversity occurs not only between particular religious traditions but also within them. Approaches to inter-religious and intra-religious difference are therefore explicitly treated as distinct by some philosophers of religion, while others argue that they should not be treated differently. The present article opts for the latter position, except in cases where there is an obvious reason to do otherwise.

Table of Contents

  1. Categories of Responses to Diversity
  2. Historical Influences
    1. Kant
    2. Schleiermacher
    3. Hegel
    4. James
  3. Analytic Approaches
    1. Epistemic Conflict
    2. Religious Language and Apologetics
    3. John Hick: the Pluralistic Hypothesis
    4. Criticisms of Hick
  4. Continental Approaches
    1. Hermeneutics and Religious Truth
    2. Hospitality
  5. Contributions from Feminism
  6. Process Philosophy
  7. Liberation Perspectives
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Categories of Responses to Diversity

There are a number of different ways that philosophers and theologians have grouped various accounts of religious diversity. One of the most commonly adopted strategies – and the one that will be used in the following discussion – is the threefold division first introduced by Alan Race (1983): exclusivist, inclusivist, and pluralist. Exclusivist positions maintain that only one set of belief claims or practices can ultimately be true or correct (in most cases, those of the one holding the position). A Christian exclusivist would therefore hold that the beliefs of non-Christians (and perhaps even Christians of other denominations) are in some way flawed, if not wholly false; or that non-Christian religious practices are not ultimately efficacious – at least, to the extent that non-Christian beliefs and practices depart from or conflict with those defended by the Christian exclusivist.

Pluralist positions, in contrast, argue that more than one set of beliefs or practices can be, at least partially and perhaps wholly, true or correct simultaneously – or, that all beliefs intended to be understood in a realist fashion are false. Inclusivist positions occupy a middle ground between exclusivism and pluralism, insofar as they recognize the possibility that more than one religious tradition can contain elements that are true or efficacious, while at the same time hold that only one tradition expresses ultimate religious truth most completely. As McKim (2012) expresses it, inclusivists grant that many (perhaps all) religious traditions do well in regards to truth or salvation, but that one tradition does better than others by more accurately describing objects of belief or mechanisms of salvation. A Christian inclusivist might claim that those who live good lives but remain non-Christians may still achieve salvation, but that such salvation is nevertheless still achieved through Jesus Christ. Inclusivism thus may be understood as a more charitable variety of exclusivism, though exclusivists can also treat it as pluralism by another name. In addition, it is worth noting that exclusivist, inclusivist, or pluralist arguments about beliefs are sometimes presented separately from those about salvific practice and that consequently one approach to diversity of belief does not necessarily imply the same approach to diversity of practice, or vice versa.

There remain a few other possible positions outside of exclusivism, inclusivism, and pluralism that are worth mentioning briefly, though two of these are not commonly treated as sophisticated options in philosophical discussions of religious diversity. The first of these two is relativism: the view that the truth of beliefs or the efficacy of practices are wholly dependent on the perspective of the religious individual and her cultural environment. In contrast to the pluralist position, that of the relativist seems necessarily to imply an anti-realist theory of religious truth, which would deflate the significance of religious pluralism as a philosophical and theological issue since religious truth claims could only be upheld or defeated within the context of their own traditions. The second, which would have similar consequences, is the position that no positive religious beliefs are true in any sense, even the relativist ones, and no religious practices are efficacious (at least not according to their own terms). In this case, which may be termed strong anti-realism, religious diversity remains at most a sociological, psychological, or historical topic. It is perhaps not surprising, then, that serious philosophical approaches to religious diversity tend not to adopt either of these positions but rather to treat diverse religious traditions as at least possibly having some positive relationship to an ultimate reality. Another position, that of skepticism, seems to entertain this possibility insofar as it concedes that some set of religious claims may be true. However, since this position contends that, given the extent of religious diversity and disagreement, no one is ever justified in making such claims, this position will not be considered in detail here (for a contemporary defense of the skeptical position, see Feldman 2007).

2. Historical Influences

What is today called philosophy of religion appears early in the history of Western philosophy – arguably as far back as Plato’s Euthyphro, wherein Socrates questions the title character as to whether the nature of piety follows on the will of the gods or vice versa. However, most early accounts of religion either ignore religious diversity or do not treat it as an issue worthy of genuine consideration. Pre-modern sources that do treat religious diversity seriously tend to adopt exclusivist positions, though applying this label to such accounts is somewhat anachronistic. Even the use of “religion” as a term that signifies one particular tradition of beliefs and practices among others was not common before modernity.

Once religions began to be considered as such alongside each other, though, positions approaching pluralism soon appeared. In the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, works by figures such as Spinoza, Locke, Hume, and Voltaire presented rational and naturalistic interpretations of religion and argued for religious toleration. Though these accounts focused largely on Christianity (and to a lesser extent Judaism), they laid the foundation for future pluralist approaches to religion. Though not the only important precursors of pluralism in the post-Enlightenment age, four influential approaches worth examining here are those of Immanuel Kant, Friedrich Schleiermacher, G.W.F. Hegel, and William James. In each, the diversity of traditions is seen not simply as contingent but as in some sense unavoidable, either because of humanity’s inherent limitations or because of the nature of history.

a. Kant

Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of religion serves as an important touchstone in the development of religious pluralism if for no other reason than for its strong influence on John Hick, whose pluralist position is one of the most significant of contemporary responses to religious diversity (see below). Kant does not offer an argument for religious pluralism especially, but such a position emerges as a consequence of his account of rational religion and the distinction he makes between it and particular religious traditions. In his Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason (1793), he argues that authentic religion is purely rational; specifically, it is grounded in a human being’s moral capacity. Humans ultimately cannot know God’s nature, or even whether or not God exists (as he argues in the Critique of Pure Reason), but the idea of God can and should nevertheless serve as a morally regulative ideal. Similarly, Kant argues that while the existing religions and their respective sets of particular beliefs and practices can often be beneficial for the moral progress of their communities, the rational ideal is an “invisible church” made up of persons able to live autonomously moral lives. Thus, Kant makes the following claim: “There is only one (true) religion; but there can be many kinds of faith.—One may say, further, that in the various churches, set apart from each other because of the difference in their kinds of faith, one and the same true religion may nonetheless be found” (2009: 118). According to this view, multiple religious traditions (or “churches”) may exhibit, to greater or lesser degrees, the purported true essence of religion as long as they promote a morality that agrees with the dictates of practical reason. However, Kant also argues that in the progress of humanity toward greater enlightenment, these various traditions will be discarded as the purely rational religion Kant advocates becomes more fully realized. It is worth noting that he privileges Christianity (specifically, Protestant Christianity) as the paradigmatic historical faith, the tradition which, according to his argument, most fully manifests the moral core of religion.

b. Schleiermacher

Schleiermacher is in agreement with Kant in the argument that the essential core of religion lies deeper than the diverse forms of belief and practice that make up the various religious traditions. Neither Kant nor Schleiermacher accept the idea that religion is fundamentally a matter of adherence to a particular set of dogmatic claims, or that religion, properly so-called, even puts forward any metaphysical claims at all. Schleiermacher goes further though, asserting that morality is no more a part of the essence of religion than metaphysics. In his Speeches on Religion, Schleiermacher explains that religion is primarily a matter of intuition or feeling, with the entire universe as its object. Later, in his systematic theological work, he famously identifies the feeling that characterizes religion as one of “absolute dependence” – that is, the feeling that one’s very existence depends on something that, in some way or other, transcends oneself. For Schleiermacher, then, religion is first and foremost a matter for the individual, and he does not discount the possibility that one could live a highly religious life without belonging to a particular religious tradition. However, he also concedes that consciousness of religious feeling is, in most cases, best developed within a community, and that within such communities the religious intuition is always accompanied by metaphysical claims, moral prescriptions, ritual practices, and so forth. These outward forms of religion, in turn, serve to shape the way that individuals understand and articulate their own religious feelings. Given that the historical forms of religion emerge from individuals’ subjective experiences – and given that Schleiermacher holds the object of these experiences to be both all-encompassing and infinite – a wide variety of religious traditions is inevitable. Indeed, he goes so far as to argue that the diversity of traditions is necessary for the task of representing the infinite within the limitations of forms comprehensible to humans. Thus, while he also accords a privileged place to Christianity among other religions, Schleiermacher provides the framework for a type of pluralism grounded in the idea of a universal form of intuition that discounts the importance of metaphysical and moral claims in the foundation of religion.

c. Hegel

Hegel goes much further than Kant or Schleiermacher toward constructing a comprehensive and systematic philosophy of religion, particularly in offering both a general concept of religion and a detailed account of how diverse historical traditions manifest the basic religious essence. Hegel criticizes Kant for relegating God to the status of a regulative ideal, and he criticizes Schleiermacher for resting his concept of religion on subjective feeling. The main significance of Hegel’s approach, though, is its contention that the rational concept of religion and the historical phenomena of religious traditions cannot be understood separately; the latter give being to the former and make it intelligible. Indeed, he argues that the diverse concrete forms of religion are neither unavoidable deviations from an ideal form nor contingent responses to the infinite. The different forms religion has taken throughout history are determinate steps along the path of the self-manifestation of both the concept of religion and its object (that is, God). On the one hand, this means that the details of diverse forms of religion are of not only historical but also conceptual significance, considering that each religion gives humans insight into absolute spirit in its own way. On the other hand, Hegel’s insistence on the unfolding of spirit throughout the history of religions as a progressive movement leads him to a hierarchical model in which older forms are superseded by newer ones, with Christianity taking the privileged place of the “consummate” religion. In addition, Hegel maintains that religion as such can only offer a representation of the truth of absolute spirit, whereas it is philosophy’s task to proceed from this representation to complete knowledge. Much like Schleiermacher, Hegel’s attention to religious phenomena in their historical particularity is an important precursor to pluralist approaches, but the privileged status he reserves for Christianity as the most fully developed religion in terms of both belief content and practice evinces a degree of exclusivism in his approach.

d. James

James’s most direct and significant contributions to philosophy of religion come from his “The Will to Believe” and The Varieties of Religious Experience – the second of which having the greater influence on the development of religious pluralism during the twentieth century. In the series of lectures that make up this book, James largely brackets out any considerations as to the truth content of religious claims regarding the ultimate nature of reality or as to the various rituals, practices, and institutions that constitute the diverse religious traditions. Instead, as the title suggests, he focuses on the religious experiences of individual humans. James examines these experiences according to only a few basic categories, the most important distinction being that between “the healthy-minded” and “the sick soul.” Throughout his examination, James maintains that the individual’s personal experience lies at the core of religion and that rituals, doctrines, and traditions are thus secondary or inessential. His approach bears some similarity to Schleiermacher’s to the extent that it focuses on personal feeling, but it departs from the earlier approach in that it rejects the idea that there is a single “religious sentiment.” James also explicitly states that the concept of religion that he puts to use is one he has pragmatically adopted to suit the needs of his present study, and that it does not necessarily represent the actuality of religious phenomena in a comprehensive way. The few speculations James offers about the nature of ultimate reality toward which religious experiences point suggest a relatively pluralist attitude toward the diversity of religions, according to which none could claim a monopoly on genuine experience of the divine nor be excluded from it. Together with his later writings on pragmatism and pluralistic metaphysics, James serves as important touchstone for later theories of religious pluralism – especially those emerging from process philosophy (see below).

3. Analytic Approaches

Accounts of religious pluralism within the broadly construed analytic philosophy of religion tend to focus on the diversity of conflicting belief claims as the primary issue at stake. This emphasis has led some philosophers to concern themselves with religious diversity solely in terms of conflicting claims (for example, Basinger [2002] explicitly addresses diversity as “epistemic peer conflict”), while others also include treatments of variety in practice or moral norms. The present examination will address first the perspective in which the epistemology of religious belief claims is central, and second that which focuses on the semantics of belief claims. In both cases, the literature is extensive and contains sometimes highly nuanced discussions of specific issues. What follows are, therefore, only brief surveys of major trends, roughly sketched, of work in these two general areas. This section will then proceed to a more detailed examination of John Hick’s influential pluralist position, as well as some of the criticisms this position has received.

a. Epistemic Conflict

It is an undeniable fact of religious diversity that many traditions offer various accounts of the nature of both mundane and supramundane reality, of the ultimate ends of human beings, and of the ways to achieve those ends. The claims offered by different traditions, as well as the sometimes unarticulated assumptions about matters of ultimate concern, can (and do) seem to conflict with each other, and one possible approach to religious diversity is to treat this conflict as real, genuine, and significant. Treating epistemic conflict as real means not assuming that it only seems to arise because of lack of clarity or universality in the terminology of various traditions; treating it as genuine means admitting that equally sincere and knowledgeable adherents of different traditions may uphold conflicting claims, while treating it as significant means that such conflict constitutes a problem – perhaps the central problem – that any philosophical response to religious diversity must address in order not to ignore or misrepresent the challenge of religious diversity itself.

Possible responses to the epistemological issues raised by religious diversity include exclusivist and inclusivist as well as pluralist perspectives. Exclusivist arguments maintain that, in the case of conflicting claims about, for instance, the intrinsic nature of divine reality, no more than one non-contradictory set of claims can be correct. Thus, the exclusivist may hold that all the claims made by her own tradition are true and consequently that all conflicting claims made by other traditions are false. Inclusivist approaches argue that while only one set of claims is wholly true (or one set of claims is more true than others), claims made by other traditions may be true partially, selectively, or to a lesser extent. The distinction between this perspective and that of exclusivism often has to do only with the degree to which multiple religions’ claims can be conceded at least partly as true  – hence the suggestion that inclusivism may be more properly named “soft exclusivism” (Basinger 2002: 5).

The exclusivist, in order to maintain her belief claims, may simply choose not to recognize or respond to the fact of religious diversity at all. However, many philosophers of religion agree that anyone who is sincerely interested in maximizing the truth and minimizing the error of her belief claims is prima facie obligated to address significant epistemic conflict, at least in part by assessing the strength or justification of her own beliefs. It remains a debated point whether or not the existence of multiple conflicting belief claims necessarily decreases such justification; positions on this question range from outright denial of the possibility of justified religious belief in cases of epistemic conflict (cf. Schellenberg 1994) to the argument that justification in such instances is at most only slightly diminished (cf. Alston 1988). In most cases of diverse religious beliefs, it seems that there is no objective evidence or set of criteria that would allow for straightforward adjudication between conflicting belief claims. If this is the case, then the exclusivist would need to provide other grounds for justifying her commitment to the correctness of her own beliefs or to the incorrectness of others’ beliefs (and some defenders of religious exclusivism argue that this is possible). Given that the exclusivist already holds the beliefs that she does, though, epistemic conflicts with others’ beliefs do not necessarily provide sufficient reason for her to give up or modify her beliefs. Alvin Plantinga argues that the assessment and consequent modification or abandonment of some or all of one’s beliefs would be required in cases where conflicting religious beliefs are on epistemic par with one’s own. However, he maintains that such epistemic parity need not ever be obtained – that is, a Christian may reasonably believe that others’ beliefs with which her own beliefs conflict do not achieve significant epistemic parity (Plantinga 1995, p. 203-5; Plantinga’s argument is discussed at more length below).

It is also unclear that every belief one holds may reasonably be assessed in light of the conflicting claims of others. Some beliefs may serve a foundational role in the total belief system of an individual or community, in which case its epistemic status is somewhat different than other beliefs. Especially if it is granted that religious beliefs are often not subject to evidential justification, it may be the case that beliefs cannot be assessed except on the basis of other, more foundational beliefs. There would thus be a set of beliefs in any belief system that cannot meaningfully be subject to doubt or assessment in light of conflicting claims belonging to other systems. Jerome Gellman calls these “rock bottom beliefs,” arguing that their foundational status excuses those who hold them from the obligation to assess them even when faced with others’ conflicting beliefs (Gellman 1993). He goes on to argue that even if rock bottom beliefs are subject to assessment, a believer is obligated to assess them only when she loses confidence in them in the face of other, competing beliefs (Gellman 2000).

William Alston, similarly to Plantinga, also accepts that certain religious beliefs can be foundational, yet he does not agree that this renders them immune from assessment or revision. On the contrary, Alston takes religious diversity as one of the most serious challenges to the justification of a particular religious tradition’s beliefs. Nevertheless, he maintains that exclusivism with regard to one’s belief remains rational in practice precisely because of the lack of common ground between believers of different traditions. He argues that the absence of proof for the superiority of a Christian’s beliefs (or their grounds) over others’ need not diminish the justification of those beliefs, since one would have no way of knowing what such proof would entail even in principle (Alston 1988, p. 443). In fact, Alston goes on to claim, “In the absence of any external reason for supposing that one of the competing practices is more accurate than my own, the only rational course for me to take is to sit tight with the practice of which I am a master and which serves me so well in guiding my activity in the world” (1988, p. 444). Philip Quinn agrees with Alston that “sitting tight” is a rational option (and that practical self-support counts toward this option being rational), but contends that it is not the only rational option. Quinn holds that internal revision of one’s core beliefs in ways that would make them more reliable “if some refined pluralistic hypothesis were true” is also a rational option (Quinn 2006, p. 298).

Naturally, pluralists advocate a significantly different approach to the issue of epistemic assessment of beliefs. If there exists real conflict between beliefs held by different religious traditions, conflict which cannot be resolved by appeal to evidence or to a universal set of justificatory criteria, then the pluralist may conclude that no one set of beliefs can reasonably be held as preferable to others. A strong form of this position is simply the skeptical argument, which maintains that judgment must be suspended on belief claims that remain unresolved in this way such that an exclusivist would be required to give up her commitment to them (cf. Feldman 2007; Kitcher 2011). A less extreme version of the position, however, may admit that the lack of criteria by which to resolve conflicting belief claims does put the beliefs of different traditions on equal epistemological footing, but that this does not necessarily require that believers suspend or give up their beliefs. What it requires is rather that beliefs that are in conflict with others’ (equally justified) beliefs be held with less confidence. Such a pluralist response to epistemic conflict emphasizes awareness of the fact of diversity, humility regarding the level of justification of one’s own beliefs, and openness to the possibility that beliefs other than one’s own may turn out to be correct. While an exclusivist may also acknowledge that epistemic conflict may lead her to reduce her confidence in her beliefs, the pluralist position goes further in asserting that no one tradition’s beliefs are more or less justified than other tradition’s beliefs. It acknowledges that most religious believers are likely to hold on to the set of beliefs (and to engage in the practices) with which they are most familiar given their historical and cultural backgrounds, and it posits that, given the absence of strong arguments to the contrary, they are justified in doing so. The difference between this position and that of the exclusivist (for example, Alston) is that this justification does not extend to the second-order belief that one’s own beliefs are rationally preferable to other conflicting beliefs. This is the direction in which Quinn (2006) gestures when he argues that there is more than one rational option for the believer in the face of a variety of conflicting claims.

b. Religious Language and Apologetics

Arguments for the assessment of religious belief claims in instances of epistemic conflict tend to presuppose that the meaning of such claims as well as the evaluation criteria applied to them are to some extent mutually understandable – even if it is conceded that there are no strictly universal criteria by which to resolve conflicts between belief claims. However, another position advanced by some philosophers of religion is that belief claims from different religious traditions cannot be assessed for their relative strength because particular claims cannot retain their meaning outside the context of the whole system of beliefs in which they belong. This position can be understood as a version of Wittgenstein’s approach to statements about religious belief, in which he suggests that individuals holding conflicting belief claims may be operating within different cultural-linguistic frameworks, exemplified by the idea of “language games”. In this case, they would have no shared frame of reference according to which the conflict could be resolved. It may not even be accurate to say that an epistemic conflict actually exists, rather than simply a difference in linguistic practice. What is called for, then, is not assessment and justification of belief claims in epistemic terms – where different claims’ truth, likelihood, or reasonableness is evaluated – but merely examination of the use and practical consequences of statements about belief in the lives of those who offer them.

If one accepts this approach to religious language, there are significant consequences. One is that it would be meaningless to speak of the truth or falsity of an entire belief system, because the truth of belief claims could only be assessed according to the internal grammar of this or that system. Another is that an individual’s commitment to one system of belief rather than another would be more or less arbitrary – in most cases, it would be wholly dependent on accidents of birth. It also seems that adopting this approach may commit one to adopting one of the positions that were set aside at the beginning of this article: that is to say, religious relativism, strong anti-realism, or religious skepticism. The relativist would conclude that, if belief claims are justified only based on the semantic criteria provided by their particular religious cultural-linguistic frameworks, then claims from different frameworks simply cannot be meaningfully compared. The strong anti-realist would go a step further, arguing that religious belief claims thus cannot refer to content beyond their cultural discursive context, while the skeptic would hold that the cultural-linguistic delimitation of the meaning of belief claims prevents us from knowing whether or not such claims accurately refer to extra-linguistic reality. Each of these positions exhibits the tendency of the cultural-linguistic approach to religious language, which is to minimize the importance of whatever cognitive content there may be in such language.

Critics of this approach argue that it does not accurately represent the attitudes of religious individuals toward the meaning and status of the particular claims they make or the ways in which they use religious language generally. Statements like “Jesus Christ is divine” or “Atman is Brahman” seem in most cases not only to fit into a larger system of religious linguistic use but also to describe a state of affairs the reality of which the utterer of the statement believes in. Even if one were to take such statements merely as expressive of certain subjective attitudes or existential commitments on the part of the person who utters them, one could argue that the adoption of such attitudes or commitments on the part of the speaker presupposes that she also believes the statements to be cognitively true. Otherwise, the attitude that she expresses in them would be arbitrary or unwarranted.

If one maintains, contrary or in addition to the cultural-linguistic model, that at least some religious statements do express actual truth claims and that some of these claims conflict with each other, then the question returns as to whether such conflicts need to be resolved and, if so, how. One of the most significant responses to this issue made in terms of the logic of religious language is that of Paul J. Griffiths, who argues that the incompatibility of certain doctrinal statements belonging to diverse religious traditions creates the obligation that representatives of these traditions engage in inter-religious apologetics (1991, p. 3). Griffiths calls this the principle of the necessity of inter-religious apologetics (NOIA). It proceeds from the initial presuppositions that statements that seem to make claims about ultimate religious truth do so, that arguments for believing such claims can intelligibly be made to those who do not believe them, and that to admit that others’ beliefs conflict with mine and subsequently to try to persuade others to accept the truth of my claims is to show respect for the sincerity and rationality of others. Griffiths divided the enterprise of inter-religious apologetics into two categories: “negative apologetics” aims to defend the plausibility of belief claims against outside criticism, while the goal of “positive apologetics” is to argue for the superiority of one tradition’s set of belief claims over that of others. He maintains that the NOIA principle enjoins representatives of religious communities to engage in both forms of apologetics, insofar as the interest in maximizing truth that is evident in making statements of doctrine entails both internal self-evaluation and external correction. Griffiths argues that the imperative of the NOIA principle is both epistemic, insofar as religious communities have a responsibility to justify and defend the content of their claims against challenges posed by conflicting claims, and ethical, insofar as assent to certain belief claims is often understood by religious communities to be a necessary condition of salvation (1991, p.15).

To a certain extent, Griffiths’ advocacy of apologetics commits him to exclusivism. Adherence to the NOIA principle implies not only that there is a real referent to which some belief claims point but also that, when claims conflict, one claim is likely to be more accurate in its description of reality than others. If this were not the case, it would be difficult to defend the necessity of positive apologetics, and perhaps negative apologetics as well. However, a commitment to the importance of apologetic dialogue as Griffiths proposes it is not necessarily equivalent to strict exclusivism, especially the variety that would allow the exclusivist to retain confidence in the superiority of her own position without assessing them in a religiously diverse context. That Griffiths advocates not only recognizing the fact of religious diversity but indeed engaging with a variety of conflicting claims via respectful argument – thereby entertaining the possibility that such claims might be partly or wholly true – suggests his position may be better understood as a form of inclusivism.

c. John Hick: the Pluralistic Hypothesis

The pluralist position advanced by John Hick has been and continues to be one of the most, if not the single most, significant and influential philosophical approaches to religious pluralism. It has garnered both considerable praise and considerable criticism from a variety of fronts. After outlining the main features of Hick’s arguments, we will also examine a few of the most substantial criticisms they have received.

Hick begins from the position that the world as it appears is ambiguous with regard to religion – that is, there is no inherent epistemological obstacle to experiencing and interpreting the world from the point of view of one religion rather than another, or indeed from a non-religious perspective (2004, p. 124). From here, he proceeds to his central claim that diverse religious traditions have emerged as various finite, historical responses to a single transcendent, ultimate, divine reality. The diversity of traditions (and the belief claims they contain) is a product of the diversity of religious experiences among individuals and groups throughout history, and the various interpretations given to these experiences. Hick’s claim that diverse interpretations are responses to a single transcendent Real draws on the Kantian distinction between noumenon and phenomenon; that is, the Real is epistemologically unavailable to human beings in itself, but we can nevertheless experience it “as the range of gods and absolutes which the phenomenology of religion reports” (2004, p. 242). Thus, Hick argues that no single description or set of descriptions applied to the Real from within the realm of human experience can apply literally to the Real (2004, p. 246). Nevertheless, the Real remains the final referent of the ontological claims made by the different religious traditions, even though such claims can at best only partially approximate the real truth of divine reality. Hick understands the multiple claims from diverse religious traditions that the object of their respective beliefs is ultimately unsayable and incomprehensible as supportive of his argument. As for the content of particular belief claims, Hick understands the personal deities of those traditions that posit them (for example, Yahweh, Viṣnu, Amida) as personae of the Real, explicitly invoking the connotation of a theatrical mask in the Latin word persona. Alongside these, he recognizes impersonae of the Real: concepts such as Brahman, nirvana, and Tao that represent ultimate reality in a non-personal way. Since the ideas in both of these categories arise from our experience of phenomenal reality, none of them can adequately describe the Real as it is in itself. The only way that humans can describe the Real directly is by using formal language such as “ultimate truth” or “ground of experience” (2004, p. 246).

In light of his epistemological arguments, Hick claims that all religious understandings of the Real are on equal footing insofar as they can only offer limited, phenomenal representations of transcendent truth. This position, which he calls the “pluralistic hypothesis,” brings together elements of several philosophical perspectives on religion into a complex whole. At the phenomenal, historical level in which humans live and religious traditions emerge, Hick advances the view that meaning is constituted largely by practice (linguistic and otherwise) within the contexts of particular cultures. Thus, the justification of belief claims rests on the relation of various practical commitments within a certain tradition or culture, and evaluation of or comparison between claims of distinct cultures appears problematic at best. This aspect of Hick’s position seems to rely heavily on the cultural-linguistic model of religion that places little importance on any cognitive content that belief claims may carry. However, Hick also maintains that the content of religious belief claims necessarily implies the believer’s sincerity in supposing that such claims actually refer to the transcendent reality that they purport to describe. That is, Hick maintains that the belief claims of the various historical religions have traditionally been articulated in ways that imply a realist perspective (2004, p. 176). Hick’s response to this issue is to posit that the referent of religious belief claims is ultimately real, but that any claims or knowledge about it must necessarily be historically and culturally mediated. If this is the case, then, as the pluralist hypothesis maintains, each religious tradition has some grounds for holding to its own beliefs and practices while no one tradition has grounds for claiming an exclusive or privileged status.

Hick claims that the pluralist hypothesis is more reasonable than either anti-realism or exclusivism given the broad extent and wide diversity of religious experiences and traditions. In response to religious anti-realism, Hick argues it is at least no less plausible to postulate a real, transcendent referent for religious belief claims than it is to reject such a reality in favor of a purely naturalistic explanation. Furthermore, he argues (drawing on William James) that a religious individual’s basic trust in her own experience is rationally justified, given the fundamental ambiguity of the world as it appears (2004, p. 228). In response to exclusivism, Hick maintains that adopting an exclusivist stance toward the justifiability of beliefs is not rationally defensible (2004, p.235). Even if it were the case that only one religious tradition correctly represented the Real, it would not be possible for humans to know this with any certainty. However, Hick is clear that this is not a case of merely epistemological uncertainty; because the Real positively transcends all human description, no one way of describing can even possibly be true (2004, p. xx).

The moral and soteriological content of diverse religious traditions is also an important focus of Hick’s argument. He posits that, in various ways, all the major religious traditions that emerged from the “axial age” understand the salvation from or transformation of the present world as a central aspect of the human relation to the Real (2004, p. 300). The ability to bring about such a transformation, as well as to promote a generally moral way of life, is perhaps the only common method by which one can evaluate diverse religious traditions. Thus, despite the various concrete paths to such an end proposed by the world’s major religious traditions, Hick affirms that the soteriological process at work in them is essentially the same. Furthermore, he points to what he sees as a broad consensus regarding basic moral claims among religious traditions to advocate the equal validity of diverse traditions with respect to their soteriological claims. Similarly to his argument regarding the ontological claims of various traditions, Hick does not ignore the fact that the details of both moral and soteriological prescriptions of these traditions often not only differ but conflict with each other. Nevertheless, he maintains that their overall moral themes generally agree and that their soteriological visions depict in various ways a path of transformation from self-centeredness to “Reality-centeredness.” The logic of this aspect of his position is also similar to the ontological-epistemological aspect insofar as no phenomenal experience can provide humans with certainty about the true effectiveness of any one soteriological path (2004, p. 337). In principle, such knowledge can only be attained when salvation is achieved; according to Hick, such a point would be the proverbial mountain peak at which the various upward paths converge.

d. Criticisms of Hick

Hick’s version of pluralism has garnered a wide variety of critical responses since it was first proposed; nearly every aspect of his argument has encountered some kind of challenge. This discussion will cover some of the most significant criticisms leveled from others in the analytic tradition (broadly construed), but other criticisms will be mentioned briefly in subsequent sections where appropriate.

Some of Hick’s critics argue that his claim that the same process of transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness is at work in each of the world’s major religious traditions is not a valid interpretation of the different forms of diverse religions’ soteriological paths. While, from the point of view of philosophical or sociological studies, there may be structural similarities between the ultimate aims of different religious traditions, it is more difficult to take the further step (to which Hick seems committed) of positing that these aims are essentially the same (cf. Hick 2004, p. xxvi). Furthermore, it seems a crucial part of many religions’ self-understanding that their beliefs and practices are uniquely suited to achieving a true salvation not offered by other traditions. This is an issue, of course, with which any pluralist approach must contend, but Hick’s critics maintain that his argument does not address it more clearly than other possible perspectives (for example, Plantinga 2000, p. 56ff.). In order to maintain the identity of soteriological paths across religions, Hick seems forced to minimize or ignore differences while translating important concepts out of their native terms into ones that members of particular traditions may not accept.

Among the criticisms of the soteriological aspect of Hick’s perspective, one of the most radical is that offered by S. Mark Heim. Heim argues that Hick’s position rests on two basic assumptions: the unity of the Real and the convergence of soteriological aims toward a single religious end (2006, p. 23). The first, says Heim, rests largely on Hick’s interpretation and acceptance of a Kantian distinction between the noumenal and phenomenal – a distinction that, Heim points out, is not always easily reconcilable with particular religious claims. The second assumption, argues Heim, undermines Hick’s concession that religious diversity does truly exist, since the unity of the soteriological process would render non-soteriological (that is, purely dogmatic) differences ultimately insignificant unless they inhibit this process for the religious individual. However, Heim explains that Hick seems to deny that such impediment is even possible in principle, so that any salvific human effort (even of a non-religious variety) participates in the same soteriological process (2006, p. 28).

Heim’s alternative – what he calls a “more pluralistic hypothesis” – combines a modified inclusivism with the concession of the possibility of a real plurality of ultimate ends. The former part of his argument holds that the concrete claims of diverse traditions regarding avenues for salvation ought to be acknowledged in their particularity and on their own terms, and that the sincerity of their adherents’ commitments to such claims is significant. The latter part of Heim’s argument, however, rests on an epistemological humility regarding one’s possible knowledge of eschatological reality and acceptance of the notion that such reality may in itself be plural. This puts Heim’s position in close proximity to that of process philosophical approaches (see below).

Criticisms of the epistemological and ontological aspects of Hick’s argument proceed in a vein similar to those of the soteriological aspects. Some claim that Hick’s hypothesis does not provide adequate support for the claim that the world is religiously ambiguous and that one is thus justified not only in treating one’s religious experience or belief as valid but also, perhaps, in treating it as superior to conflicting beliefs. Plantinga, for instance, does not concede that awareness of religious diversity necessarily calls for alteration of one’s previously held beliefs, though it might invite new reflection on them. Against Hick (and others), he defends a version of exclusivism, which he defines minimally as holding that “the tenets or some of the tenets of one religion—Christianity, let’s say—are in fact true” and that “any proposition, including other religious beliefs, that are incompatible with those tenets are false” (Plantinga 1995, p. 194). However, this minimal definition of exclusivism is not necessarily that which stands in need of defense since it could include non-culpable ignorance of others’ actual conflicting beliefs, so Plantinga narrows his version of exclusivism to include sticking to one’s beliefs despite awareness of other religions, acknowledgment that they contain examples of genuine piety, and belief that one does not have a conclusive rational argument that proves the truth of one’s own beliefs (1995, p. 196). He recognizes that challenges to this version of exclusivism are made on moral and epistemological grounds, and attempts to defend it against both by showing that, in one way or another, these challenges ultimately undermine themselves. If the moral argument is that exclusivism is arrogant, then Plantinga claims that either this argument itself is also arrogant (that is, that one ought to withhold belief from beliefs that contradict those of others) or that it lacks grounds (1995, p. 200). Plantinga breaks down the epistemological challenge to exclusivism into those centered on justification, on rationality, and on warrant. His defense in each case remains largely the same: either the pluralist position succumbs to the same criticism that it levels against exclusivism, or it cannot provide sufficient grounds for its own reasoning. Ultimately, he contends that religious diversity itself can prove neither the falsity nor the lack of warrant of particular beliefs – though it may tend to reduce confidence in belief (1995, p. 214). At the same time, though, Plantinga suggests that awareness of and reflection of diversity can also serve to strengthen the exclusivist’s conviction.

Plantinga also levels a challenge to the logical consistency of Hick’s position, contending that it would be nonsensical to suggest that the Real cannot have either of two strictly contrary properties (similar to the criticism made by Rowe [1999, p. 146]). As Plantinga puts it, the Real “could hardly be neither a tricycle nor a non-tricycle, nor do I think that Hick would want to suggest that it could” (2000, p. 45). However, Hick replies that he does indeed mean to suggest that the Real is “neither a tricycle nor a non-tricycle,” neither green nor non-green, and so forth, both because these sorts of concepts cannot apply either positively or negatively to the Real and because they are not religiously relevant. Hick finds Plantinga’s argument unacceptable because, when translated from an irrelevant concept (tricycle or non-tricycle) to a religiously relevant one (for example, personal or non-personal), it forces an exclusivist choice between different conceptions of the Real – a choice that seems to have no stronger support than personal preference or cultural background (Hick 2004, p. xxii).

Another, more recent epistemological criticism of Hick’s position takes aim at precisely this point: namely, his contention that to a significant extent our religious beliefs are contingent products of factors such as where and when we were born, and that this contingency poses a problem for claims to religious knowledge and, particularly, exclusivism (Hick 2004, p. 2). Tomas Bogardus argues that the inferences from contingency to pluralism or skepticism in this argument are invalid. He specifies, first, that the problem of the contingency of belief is only a significant problem if it deals with “only unreflective religious belief, belief formed genuinely, for example, on the basis of passive receipt of testimony during childhood” (Bogardus 2013, p. 378). Reflective belief must escape this problem, since otherwise pluralism (which is itself a reflective position) would be subject to the contingency objection. Bogardus then further specifies that Hick’s (and others’) contingency-based objections seem to target the “safety” of beliefs – that is, if a person had been born elsewhere than she was and used the same method to form her beliefs as she actually has, then (in light of her actual beliefs) she might have believed falsely. Bogardus reads the contingency objection as inferring from this statement that religious beliefs are, in fact, not formed safely, and therefore they do not constitute knowledge (2013, p. 380). Yet, he maintains that these inferences are invalid because, in the first place, “[t]he fact that something might have happened which would have rendered my faculties unsafe does not entail that my faculties are actually unsafe,” and, in the second place, because safety is not necessary for knowledge (2013, p. 381-2). After offering a similar criticism of the version that makes the contingency objection a question not of safety but of accidentality, Bogardus departs from his criticism of Hick to consider the issue of epistemic symmetry between conflicting beliefs held for contingent reasons (cf. Kitcher 2011). However, he maintains that this version of the contingency objection is either self-defeating or else excuses reflective belief. He concludes with the suggestion that even the unreflective believers specifically targeted by the narrow version of the contingency objection that he has considered may be excused due to non-culpable ignorance (2013: 391).

These epistemological challenges are distinct from, but related to, the issue of Hick’s ontology: the central claim that there is one ultimate, noumenal Real to which the different religions address in a variety of ways. Critics charge that it is difficult to maintain that all religious representations of ultimate reality refer to the same Real given not simply the wide variety of different actual representations but particularly those elements of them that seem to be incompatible or contradictory (cf. Rowe 1999). On this point, it is not obvious why Hick maintains the unity of the Real rather than positing a plurality of ultimate referents to match the plurality of ways it is signified; Mavrodes (1995) goes so far as to describe Hick’s position as actually polytheistic. In addition, if the Real is as epistemologically inaccessible as Hick maintains, then explaining how religious concepts can refer to it at all becomes problematic (cf. Plantinga 2000). Hick’s responses to these and other related criticisms are by and large pragmatic, appealing to a principle of global religious irenicism or claiming that his hypothesis is offered as a “‘best explanation,’ not an iron dogma” (Hick 2004, pgs. xxii, xxvii).

4. Continental Approaches

Treatments of religious pluralism in continental philosophy of religion tend not to focus on epistemological or ontological issues, but rather on the ethical and political aspects of diversity. To the degree that the potential truth of religious claims is discussed in these contexts, it tends to be in hermeneutic perspectives that focus on the history of texts in various traditions – or on various traditions approached as texts – and that aim to bring these traditions into constructive dialogues with each other. In addition, the concept of hospitality has become a prominent theme in discussions of both textual interpretation and interreligious ethics. The present discussion will examine the hermeneutic model and the theme of hospitality separately, though it will become clear that there is significant overlap between these two.

a. Hermeneutics and Religious Truth

Hermeneutic approaches to religious diversity take seriously both the deep divergences between different religious traditions and the idea that diverse religions’ claims to truth should be taken seriously as such. Drawing on the work of Heidegger, Ricoeur, and especially Gadamer, advocates of what may be termed “hermeneutical pluralism” attempt to understand interreligious encounters according to the models provided by textual interpretation and interpersonal conversation. Gadamer argues that a text to be interpreted makes a demand on the interpreter in that it presents itself as holding claims to truth that can only be adequately judged, affirmed, or denied after a careful reading in which the interpreter, to some extent, adopts the same questions as those that the text itself addresses (2002, p. 369). Similarly, one must acknowledge in another person the possibility of her knowing and speaking truth if one is to be able to engage in any meaningful conversation. In both cases, the relationship between the interpreter and the interpreted is asymmetrical: the truth claims of the person or text to be interpreted (and the questions to which they relate) should be understood as the measure against which one’s interpretations are judged. It is this focus on interpretation as a model for understanding that gives this approach the designation “hermeneutical.” And it is the claim that an effective understanding of a text, person, or tradition depends on one being open to the possibility of truth outside one’s own familiar tradition or worldview and on one being able to place one’s own position not only on par with but even “below” that of the other (insofar as the other, which takes the place of the text to be interpreted, serves as the standard against which interpretations are measured) that makes this approach a pluralist one.

Gadamer uses the term “horizon” to designate the position from which the interpreter approaches the text (or other object of interpretation). One’s horizon is constituted by one’s present phenomenal and conceptual environment as well as the history that has shaped this present and the particular ways in which one is open toward future possibilities. Thus, one’s horizon includes all presuppositions that one brings into new encounters, presuppositions that one can recognize but never completely escape (2002, p. 302). The work of interpretation involves engaging with an other whose horizon is different, sometimes drastically so, from one’s own. Openness to others does not rest on attaining an objective point of view free from prejudices; this sort of abandonment of one’s own horizon would be impossible. Instead, the openness that Gadamer advocates is a willingness to let our presuppositions and perspectives alter as a result of an interpretive or dialogical encounter, a process he calls the fusion of horizons.

In the application of hermeneutic philosophy to religious diversity, religious traditions or their respective exemplary texts are taken as representative of different horizons. The issue, then, is how to join these horizons effectively, and what the resulting new horizon will look like. First, one can make the argument that if one has even rudimentary knowledge of a tradition beside one’s own, then the fusion of horizons has already begun. Any relation between two or more religious traditions means that at some point the respective horizons of the different traditions overlap. The task would then be to map out these overlaps by way of discourse with members of different traditions or interpretation of their religious texts. For example, insofar as Jewish, Christian, and Muslim traditions share a common set of basic theological concepts (for example, strict monotheism) or scriptural figures (for example, Adam, Noah, and Abraham), these commonalities could be and often are used as frameworks for interreligious dialogue in the present. In the process of interpretation and discourse, relations could be extended and new points of contact developed, so that a more extensive fusion of religious horizons can be achieved.

Since the term “horizon” signifies one’s present perspective and particularly since it includes the presuppositions on the basis of which one begins an interpretive encounter, to a certain extent one’s criteria for the judgment of truth claims (including one’s own) are shaped by one’s current horizon. Therefore, openness to an encounter with another tradition from which a new horizon might emerge entails openness not only to the revision of specific presuppositions but also to the possibility of reassessing one’s criteria for judgment. Interpretation or dialogue across different religious traditions would then include openness both to the possibility that the other’s traditions contain elements of truth not available within one’s own tradition and to the possibility that engagement with such truth might affect one’s understanding of truth in general. Depending on the hermeneutical approach taken and the arguments on which it is based, perspectives that advocate such dialogue are often correctly characterized as pluralist (though more inclusivist positions are not ruled out).

Advocacy of this openness to the revisability of basic epistemological criteria is based on the assumption, which many pluralist accounts of religion share with hermeneutics generally, that present standards of judgment are always subject to adjustment or augmentation in the future. This assumption goes along with the claim that there is in principle no end to the hermeneutic process; interpretation is continually producing new understandings of its objects and new horizons (that is, new contexts of understanding) that can subsequently become starting points for future attempts at dialogue and expansions of mutual understanding between different perspectives. Since hermeneutics denies the possibility of objective access to truth, or truth that is free from a particular perspective, every mutual understanding achieved by diverse religious traditions will necessarily be provisional and subject to later reinvestigation. This is, however, not to be considered an unfortunate limitation but rather an opportunity for further constructive engagement. Only in particular historical encounters can new horizons of understanding and experience be forged; the hermeneutical philosopher of religious pluralism seeks out new possibilities for dialogue through which to partly reappraise the merit of former interpretations.

Regarding the question of whether or not diverse claims and interpretations point beyond themselves to a higher universal truth, the hermeneutical approach to pluralism may lead to different conclusions. One possibility would affirm that there is such a universal truth, resulting in pluralism not unlike that of Hick. This seems to be the approach that follows most closely from Gadamer’s claims about the nature of language, insofar as he maintains that the diversity of languages nevertheless expresses a basic universal relationship to the world. One could then say that all of the various religious traditions, and the diversity of representations of reality found within them, express the same ultimate truth from their different horizons. On the other hand, it is also possible to argue on Gadamerian grounds that what is productive and valuable in interreligious discourse is precisely the encounter with the other as other, and that appeals to a higher unity undermine this. According to this view, when beliefs and practices belonging to different traditions seem to refer to different ultimate realities, it may be preferable either to hold that they really do so or to avoid the question of a possible transcendent unity of religious truth entirely. The former position makes the issue of ongoing interpretation and judgment of conflicting truth claims particularly significant, while the latter is sometimes more pragmatic but also potentially less productive. Merold Westphal, for example, argues against something like the latter view, claiming that it precludes meaningful dialogue with religious others by eliminating even the possibility of cognitive conflict (1999, p. 3). His defense of a modest form of theological exclusivism that has been uncoupled from political and cultural imperialism may serve as a helpful point of contact between analytic and continental approaches to religious diversity, especially insofar as he advocates the consideration of epistemological issues and of the cognitive content of belief claims in addressing the ethical concerns at the root of many forms of pluralism.

b. Hospitality

Hospitality to others has become a central theme in continental philosophy of religion, as well as in continental ethical and political philosophy more broadly. Understood as an ethical demand, the idea of hospitality prescribes that one should offer one’s home, food, and other resources to the needs of others – particularly those who do not share one’s nationality, culture, language, or religion. This idea carries with it a demand to respect the other in her difference, and thus has been taken up as a productive concept in terms of which to articulate a pluralist approach to religious diversity. In addition to its conceptual resources, it has also traditionally been recognized as an important virtue in many different religions and cultures, thus making it a helpful starting point for dialogue. Philosophers who discuss the ethics of hospitality also recognize certain inherent tensions in the concept that make it difficult to translate into a concrete practice.

As discussed in the work of Ricoeur (2010) and Derrida (2002), among others, hospitality appears to be something that in principle can never be fully offered. Being hospitable in the most complete sense means anticipating the appearance of the other, understanding her needs and wants, and ultimately being able to turn over anything and everything within one’s control to the other. This raises a few problems, one of which is that the ability to successfully anticipate the appearance and needs of the other seems to undermine her very otherness – what marks the other as other is surely, at least in part, one’s lack of knowledge about her. If one attempts to make up for this lack of knowledge by encountering the other not on her own terms but on one’s own, however, this also undermines the otherness of the other by not paying sufficient attention to her difference. Another problem is that the other to whom one is called to be hospitable can appear as a threat insofar as one’s hospitality to the other, when carried to its furthest point, displaces one from one’s own position of control and puts one at the mercy of the other. The host, in her obligation to the needs of the guest, becomes in a sense the guest of the guest – and the possibility is always present that the other will treat one inhospitably or even violently.

Pluralist accounts that think in terms of hospitality must thus deal with at least two related issues: how to address the seeming impossibility of adequately fulfilling the requirement that one be hospitable to the religious other as other, and how to be respectful and welcoming of the religious other even while recognizing the risks inherent in doing so. Specifically, religious communities must recognize both an obligation toward engagement with those from different religious traditions and the impossibility of achieving a complete understanding of religious others. In addition, hospitality demands that religious communities open themselves up to religious others even if their own communities or beliefs are threatened in the process.

Ricoeur connects hospitality to a hermeneutic theory of translation, arguing that the impossibility of being perfectly hospitable mirrors the impossibility of translating a text from one language to another without any loss or distortion of meaning. In each case, he argues that this impossibility suggests that we should not aim for the ideal of perfection but rather accept that every instance of hospitality, just like every translation, will be risky, limited, and contingent (2010, p. 38). Accepting such a fact may be difficult, especially insofar as it seems to suggest failure to achieve the goals toward which hospitality is oriented. However, Ricoeur maintains that fixation on perfect, complete hospitality is counterproductive and that achieving it, if it were possible, would actually result in the erasure of the difference between oneself and the other (cf. Kearney & Taylor 2011, p. 17). Instead, the limitations inherent in any attempt at hospitality produce a situation in which creative exchange between two individuals, communities, texts, or traditions happens without either subsuming one into another or synthesizing both into a third that erases the initial identities. Because there is no absolute perspective against which to measure the particular perspectives of the various religious traditions, their particularities must be respected as fundamental – that is, there is no prior “common ground” against which the relative value or truth of particular differences can be measured. Interreligious encounter offers the opportunity to engage in a process of translation in which the parties involved learn both about others and about themselves by constructing a context in which their differences and limitations are emphasized.

While his account of hospitality agrees with Ricoeur’s in a number of respects, Derrida does not see the ideal of perfect hospitality as something that should be abandoned because of its impossibility. Drawing on the ethical philosophy of Levinas, Derrida (2000) argues that the other makes an infinite ethical demand that one is never able to answer adequately, but that this inability is precisely what drives the continual concrete effort of hospitable practice. Making a conceptual distinction between the “conditional hospitality” that dictates practical action and the “absolute hospitality” that this action can never achieve, he claims that the inescapable gap between the two not only motivates us to continue to act in conditionally hospitable ways but also to strive toward making our actions and dispositions ever more hospitable. In the context of religious pluralism, this means that one must recognize not only that every attempt to understand and welcome the religious other is necessarily inadequate but also that one has a responsibility to try to be more understanding, more welcoming, and more accepting of the religious difference as such (cf. Derrida 2002). Importantly for Derrida, it also entails a recognition that one stands in a similar relation to the other as one does to the divine. Recalling again the thought of Levinas (1989), Derrida stresses that “every other is wholly other,” and the religious individual or community bears the same obligation to the religious other as it does to God (Derrida 2008, p. 78).

5. Contributions from Feminism

Feminist theology and philosophy of religion has, perhaps surprisingly, turned its attention to religious pluralism only recently. Feminist scholars have long emphasized the need for greater diversity in both analytic and continental discussions, but this has often meant gender, ethnic, and socio-economic diversity rather than religious diversity. To the extent that feminist perspectives have been applied specifically to religious pluralism, though, arguments have emphasized the degree to which particular religions have been taken as homogeneous traditions without internal diversity (Gross 2002, p. 60). A similar criticism has been levied against representations of femininity in certain pluralist discussions of religion – for instance, in Hick’s discussions of feminist theological critiques of traditional Christianity (Hick 2004, pg. 52; cf. xxxviii). In either case, one can observe a skepticism concerning understandings of both religions and women as possessing relatively stable or universal identities, as such conceptions provide adequate pictures neither of historical realities nor of the full range of belief claims (and their implications). Indeed, they can often serve to conceal the roles, concerns, beliefs, and practices of not only women but also other power minorities within traditions. Insofar as they share a critical stance toward male-dominated traditions of thinking about religion generally and diversity specifically, feminist approaches to religious diversity may serve as points of contact between analytic and continental discussions.

The arguments that have emerged recently for explicitly feminist varieties of religious pluralism – or, conversely, for explicitly pluralist approaches to feminist theology – offer a variety of reasons to support the claim that feminism and religious pluralism are natural allies. For instance, many feminist philosophers and theologians argue that special attention needs to be paid not only to the experiences of people with diverse gender, ethnic, national, and economic identities, but also particularly to those whose experiences have traditionally been ignored or underrepresented within Western philosophical and theological traditions (cf. Gross 2002; Kwok 2002). If emphasizing the importance of such diversity is already a feminist value, then it stands to reason that inclusion of experiences from members of diverse religious traditions should also be valued. Furthermore, concepts, practices, and experiences arising from non-Western traditions may deserve special attention since they have traditionally been given less consideration in Western philosophical and theological discourse.

In addition, many feminist theologians take it as a central aim to find alternative scriptural sources or minority practices that can be used to critique, augment, or replace traditions that have historically excluded or undervalued women. This same inquiry into alternative sources and interpretations leads feminist theology toward interreligious dialogue, out of both the spirit of openness to difference and that of solidarity (Ruether 1987, p. 147). By extending the scope of critical feminist investigations across diverse religious traditions, the possibilities for finding constructive resources may be broadened (Gross 2002, p. 63). For example, many non-Christian traditions include devotions to goddesses, or (as discussed above) non-personal representations of the divine. Such practices and concepts can be helpful in critiquing the traditional masculine bias in Christianity, provided that the Christian theologian adopts a pluralist attitude toward other religious ideas. Of course, this is not to say that non-Christian traditions do not also contain patriarchal elements, and it is likewise the task of the feminist pluralist to analyze these critically (cf. Ruether 1987). Nevertheless, the main goal of much feminist theology and philosophy of religion is criticism and reinterpretation of one’s own tradition. In the context of religious diversity, this criticism would include not only fostering greater appreciation of the concepts and practices of other traditions as such, but, particularly, adopting a charitable attitude when approaching elements of other traditions that may at first glance seem anti-feminist. For example, norms of female dress that may seem heavily modest or the practice of arranged marriage may appear to limit women’s individual freedom, but upon further study could be seen as protecting women from sexual objectification (Gross 2002, p. 69).

Another important feminist contribution to religious pluralism is the critique of conceptions of particular religious traditions as possessing single, uniform identities. Perhaps the most direct and substantial of such critiques is offered by Jeannine Hill Fletcher (2005), who argues that describing religious traditions according to their specific differences and then identifying their members according to such distinctions is misleading in several ways. For one, this approach ignores the internal diversity of religious traditions; members of the same religion differ from one another in gender, ethnicity, profession, nationality, wealth, and so forth, and these differences may lead to drastically different experiences of the “same” tradition. Also, the religious identity of a single individual or community always intersects various other identities, all of which are informed by social, cultural, and geographical locations and particular experiences and behaviors. Perhaps most importantly for her understanding of religious pluralism, Fletcher also contends that such intersectional religious identities are always hybrid, by which she means that all identities are formed in relation with multiple other identities. Because of this, no identity is absolutely distinct and no difference completely precludes any communication and understanding. Dialogue and mutual understanding between members of diverse religious traditions is possible because, in the complex mesh of relationships out of which different religious identities emerge, possibilities already exist for building solidarity with one another. Furthermore, the particular points of contact and the character of the mutual understanding and solidarity that result from interreligious discourse cannot be determined beforehand, because one cannot know before actually engaging with the other what similarities and differences one will encounter. Thus, from Fletcher’s perspective, feminist approaches to religious pluralism must be characterized by attention to the details of concrete engagements between individuals or communities, rather than abstract conceptions of religious identities.

6. Process Philosophy

One important approach to religious pluralism that is not covered in the discussions of analytic and continental perspectives above is that of process philosophy. Drawing primarily on the work of Alfred North Whitehead and Charles Hartshorne, process philosophies of religion highlight the potential for novelty and creativity in the world. Since it is constitutive of process philosophy to hold that becoming and change are ontologically fundamental, process philosophers of religion tend to reinterpret, downplay, or deny the idea of an immutable divine reality. Process approaches also emphasize complexity and difference as inherent aspects of all levels of reality, so a pluralist approach to religious diversity would seem to follow naturally from their metaphysical commitments.

Another commitment that serves a central role for many process philosophers is the commitment to the naturalistic worldview of modern science. This is not to be equated with a strict positivism in which hard scientific inquiry is the only route to knowledge, but rather with the attitude that supernatural explanations that run counter to the presuppositions and conclusions of scientific knowledge—that is, explanations that depend on the interruption of natural causal processes by a deity or other supernatural force – should be abandoned as untenable. Griffin argues that although such naturalism is often combined with atheism and ontological materialism, it is not a necessary relation (2005, p. 13). Accepting such naturalism as part of the basis for a pluralist approach to religious diversity may create difficulties for process positions, though, insofar as one cannot presume it to be a shared assumption of various contemporary religious perspectives. On the other hand, it provides an ontologically minimalist and relatively objective framework from which members of different religious traditions can, at least in principle, begin dialogue. It can also serve as the basis for an argument for epistemic humility in a similar vein to that of Hick – though with crucially different ontological claims.

In both Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis and process pluralism, ontological claims, religious experience, and devotional practices are understood to have a real referent. The first distinction between these two positions, though, is that in the former the Real is posited as a single ultimate referent while in the latter different claims or representations can be taken to have distinct ultimate referents. John Cobb, for instance, argues especially that personal and impersonal representations of the divine are difficult to reconcile as simply different concepts of the same noumenal reality, and attempting such a reconciliation would end up revealing very little about either tradition from which the concepts emerge or the Real to which they point (cf. Griffin 2005, p. 47). Instead, Cobb posits that ultimate reality must in itself be unimaginably complex. The various perspectives on this reality found among diverse religious traditions are then not only different ways of representing the same ultimate truth, but indeed distinct ways of representing different aspects of the complex totality of this truth. Impersonal representations signify one basic aspect of the Real, while personal representations signify a fundamentally different basic aspect.

Cobb’s claim rests on a broader metaphysical hypothesis that involves a plurality of ultimate realities, or at least ultimate aspects of reality: a personal deity or supreme being to which personal representations of the ultimate refer, an impersonal creativity to which impersonal representations refer, and the universe itself understood as the totality of all finite beings, to which nature-centered religious traditions refer. Given this basic plurality, the different concepts and experiences found in different religious traditions can be taken to be equally valid while retaining even those differences that appear to be mutually contradictory. In order to reconcile such contradictions, conflicting claims can be understood essentially as answers to different questions about the nature of reality (Griffin 2005, p. 48). If this is the case, then claims that at first seem conflicting can be reinterpreted as complementary. The work of pluralistic dialogue would be synthetic, placing claims from different traditions alongside each other to attempt a deeper understanding of the multiform nature of the ultimate.

The aim of such a synthetic approach, though, would not be to construct a new perspective that would incorporate claims from various religious traditions into a larger system, but rather to provide a context in which members of one tradition can both learn about and appreciate the value of other traditions and meaningfully reflect on their own beliefs. Between religions that focus on the same ultimate reality (for instance, the Abrahamic traditions, theistic Indian traditions, and others that posit personal deities), pluralistic dialogue may primarily motivate reflection on and purification of one’s own concepts. Between religions that focus on different ultimates (as in Buddhist-Christian dialogue, the example to which much of Cobb’s work is devoted), dialogue may serve to broaden and enrich the perspective of each participant.

While process approaches tend toward the kind of deep pluralism examined so far, there are exceptions. The differences have to do in large part with the way that one’s ontological commitments are articulated. Cobb’s position is grounded in a Whiteheadian metaphysics that affirms plurality and complexity all the way down; however, Schubert Ogden proposes a position that, ontologically speaking, more closely resembles Hick’s in that Ogden affirms that ultimate reality must be conceived as singular. Following Hartshorne more closely than Whitehead, Ogden maintains that ultimate reality must in itself have a single structure, and he identifies this primarily with the Christian concept of God (1992, p. 47). Proceeding from this basis, it is still possible to affirm the possibility of a plurality of valid religious perspectives, insofar as complete knowledge of the ultimate structure of reality lies beyond the grasp of human experience. However, it seems to be more difficult to proceed to affirmation of the actuality of such pluralism, unless that affirmation takes the general form of Hick’s hypothesis. Alternatively – and this is the position that Ogden seems to support – a process philosophy that posits a singular ultimate reality may support an epistemological pluralism (that is, a rejection of the idea that one can know that there is not more than one valid religious perspective) joined with a broader religious inclusivism in which only that within others’ traditions which is “substantially” consonant with one’s own religious commitments is recognized as true (Ogden 1992, p. 102).

7. Liberation Perspectives

Liberation theology, which advocates a religious duty to aid those who are poor or suffering other forms of inequality and oppression, has had a significant influence on recent discussions of pluralism. The struggle against oppression can be seen as providing an enterprise in which members of diverse religious traditions can come together in solidarity. Paul F. Knitter, whose work serves as a prominent theological synthesis of liberation and pluralist perspectives, argues that engaging in interreligious dialogue is part and parcel of the ethical responsibility at the heart of liberation theology. He maintains not only that any liberation theology ought to be pluralistic, but also that any adequate theory of religious pluralism ought to include an ethical dimension oriented toward the goal of resisting injustice and oppression.

Knitter claims that, if members of diverse religions are interested (as they should be) in encountering each other in dialogue and resolving their conflicts, this can only be done on the basis of some common ground. Yet in contrast to a position such as Hick’s, which posits a common noumenal reality toward which different religious traditions are oriented but which none can definitively represent, Knitter thinks this common ground needs to be neither transcendent nor already existing. In fact, the most meaningful interreligious encounters can spring from constructing shared responses to particular situations. What is necessary is that such responses react to experiences or phenomena that are more or less universal, and suffering is just such a universal phenomenon. It provides a common cause with which diverse religious traditions are concerned and towards which they can come together to craft a common agenda. Particular instances of suffering will, of course, differ from each other in their causes and effects; likewise, the practical details of work to alleviate suffering will almost necessarily be fleshed out differently by different religions, at different times and in different places. Nevertheless, Knitter maintains that suffering itself is a cross-cultural and universal phenomenon and should thus serve as the reference point for a practical religious pluralism. Confronting suffering will naturally give rise to solidarity, and pluralist respect and understanding can emerge from there.

Knitter does not limit his argument only to confrontations with suffering that fall within the scope of human ethics or politics. He extends his claim to encompass the entire earth, insofar as this is the shared horizon within which not only humans but all creatures coexist. Earth not only serves as a common physical location for all religious traditions, but it also provides these traditions with what Knitter calls a “common cosmological story” (1995, p. 119). That is, the earth is the focal point for our modern scientific knowledge of the cosmos, and this knowledge has become so all-encompassing that it now unavoidably places the entirety of creation alongside humanity in its narrative. On this basis, Knitter makes a case that different religious traditions share an ecological responsibility and that awareness of this shared responsibility, as it continues to emerge, can also serve as a basis for mutual understanding.

A few possible criticisms of Knitter’s liberationist view are worth mentioning. First, while it may be difficult to dispute that suffering in some form or other is actually a universal phenomenon, it is not apparent that the particular forms of suffering that arise in particular circumstances bear enough commonality to ground the kind of deep, cross-cultural, and interreligious solidarity that Knitter maintains they will. At least, it seems to be going too far to claim that such solidarity will arise automatically. Similarly, while it may be reasonable to presuppose that religious communities will respond to suffering in solidarity with those who suffer (or to prescribe that they should do so), this certainly is not and has not been the case universally. One can all too easily point out the many instances of one religious community suffering at the hands of another. Even in cases where members of multiple religions agree that a particular instance of suffering ought to be alleviated, it is conceivable different religions will respond to the same instance of suffering in different, conflicting ways. While some form of justice is a central value in most religious traditions, the ways in which such a value is understood and practiced can vary considerably. By basing a pluralist approach on solidarity in response to suffering, one runs the risk of not giving sufficient attention to the diversity of actual forms justice can take. As Heim points out, treating others as we would like to be treated does not necessarily equate to treating others as they would like to be treated, and it is not obvious that there is an objective standard by which one’s response to suffering can be evaluated (2006, p. 96). It would then perhaps benefit advocates of the liberationist version of pluralism to posit that even justice is a concept capable of critical examination and reinterpretation in the context of interreligious dialogue (Suchocki 1987, p. 159).

With regard to Knitter’s appeal to a common cosmological story, it is unclear to what degree such a narrative is actually held in common, especially among diverse religions. While cosmological narratives grounded in broadly accepted scientific knowledge are certainly widely accepted, there just as certainly remain communities of those who reject such narratives – in many cases, precisely for reasons having to do with religious belief and practice. If it is still the case that some religious traditions do tell largely different stories about the world, it seems problematic to take it as given that “the earth” or “the universe” forms the basis for a common cosmological narrative. Knitter’s optimism regarding an emerging awareness of a shared ecological responsibility might thus be premature.

One possible way of addressing these concerns is to build a liberationist approach to pluralism on the basis solely of particular, concrete struggles rather than the idea of a universal struggle against suffering in general. In a particular situation, the needs of an oppressed group can be addressed on their own terms, and the responses offered by religious communities already involved in the situation can serve as a starting point for fighting injustice and working toward liberation. Of course, this is only a starting point, since the responses of communities already engaged may be found wanting either by those who are suffering or by other communities who enter the struggle later. A pluralist approach would maintain that such involvement by religious outsiders be held open as a possibility; this is the function of the liberationist appeal to solidarity in struggle. The religious outsider may be motivated to work on behalf of the oppressed by commitments that differ from those of the oppressed, though, and the pluralist would hold that these differences ought to be respected. At the same time, the situation of the particular struggle provides a concrete context within which members of different religious communities can achieve better understanding of each other in their difference from each other. Any solidarity and mutual respect achieved would, in this account, be contingent and perhaps not easily transposable to other particular contexts – though this remains as a possibility.

8. Conclusion

Religious pluralism, understood as a broad category of philosophical and theological responses to religious diversity, aims to account for this diversity as a positive phenomenon and to articulate ways that religious differences can be celebrated and conflicts mitigated, explained, or at least reasonably discussed. Pluralist positions can vary according to one’s understanding of religion (for example, whether it is taken primarily to consist of epistemic content, culturally constructed discursive practices, or salvation-oriented behavior), as well as according to one’s ultimate goal in articulating a position (for example, clarifying philosophical concepts of religion, or effecting social and political change such as in liberation theology). While there are significant differences in pluralist approaches evident in analytic and continental philosophy, there is also significant overlap in the content of arguments belonging to these traditions.

Major nineteenth and early twentieth century accounts of religion provide important precursors to religious pluralism, though they are largely not pluralist according to the strict sense of the term but rather exclusivist or inclusivist. Religious pluralism as a distinct philosophical and theological position has emerged more recently, and in its various forms it both draws on and is critical of these earlier accounts. Pluralism, of course, continues to be debated. It faces external challenges from exclusivists and inclusivists as well as religious anti-realists and relativists, and its various arguments are contested internally by those who argue that it concedes too much or that it has not yet become pluralist enough.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William. “Religious Diversity and the Perceptual Knowledge of God.” Faith and Philosophy 5.4 (1988): 433-448.
    • Offers an exclusivist argument that it is not irrational to continue to form and hold socially established religious beliefs (that is, those belonging to this or that religious tradition), even though the fact of religious diversity (particularly epistemic conflict) may decrease confidence in one’s beliefs.
  • Alston, William. Perceiving God: the Epistemology of Religious Belief. Ithaca, NY: Cornell UP, 1993.
    • A detailed (and significant) examination of the perception of God and the way in which such perception can provide grounds for religious belief. Alston’s response to the problem of diversity as laid out in his earlier article is included here, in the context of a more thorough discussion of its epistemological presuppositions.
  • Basinger, David. Religious Diversity: A Philosophical Assessment. Burlington, VT: Ashgate, 2002.
    • An overview and critical analysis of a variety of issues and perspectives regarding religious diversity understood primarily as epistemic conflict.
  • Bogardus, Tomas. “The Problem of Contingency for Religious Belief.” Faith and Philosophy 30.4 (2013): 371-392.
    • A criticism of the argument (particularly as advanced by John Hick and Philip Kitcher) that many religious beliefs are held due to contingent factors irrelevant to the truth or warrant of the beliefs. Bogardus attempts to show that several common forms of this argument rely on invalid logical inferences.
  • Byrne, Peter. Prolegomena to Religious Pluralism: Reference and Realism in Religion. New York: St. Martin’s, 1995.
    • Covers ontological, epistemological, and semantic aspects of religious pluralism, arguing that pluralism is plausible given a realist account of religious language.
  • Dean, Thomas, ed. Religious Pluralism and Truth: Essays on Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion. Albany: SUNY, 1995.
    • Contains essays addressing religious diversity and pluralism from a variety of perspectives, discussing questions of truth criteria, dialogue, and interpretation. Several essays take up the hermeneutic model of pluralism.
  • Derrida, Jacques. “Hospitality.” Acts of Religion. New York: Routledge, 2002.
    • Provides a sustained deconstructive account of hospitality as it relates to religion, with a lengthy analysis of the inter-religious work of Louis Massignon.
  • Derrida, Jacques. The Gift of Death. 2nd ed. Chicago: U of Chicago P, 2008.
  • Derrida, Jacques and Anne Dufourmantelle. Of Hospitality. Stanford, CA: Stanford UP, 2000.
    • Contains a deconstructive account of hospitality broadly construed, as well as more specifically in political and legal contexts, with reference to Kant.
  • Esack, Farid. Qur’an, Liberation, and Pluralism. Rockport, MA: Oneworld Publications, 1997.
    • A liberation-theological account of pluralism from a Muslim point of view, set in the context of the South African struggle against apartheid.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Reasonable Religious Disagreements.” Philosophers without God. Ed. Louise M. Antony. New York: Oxford UP, 2007.
    • A defense of the skeptical view that, in light of the diversity of conflicting religious belief claims, no one is justified in holding any set of such beliefs as true.
  • Fletcher, Jeannine Hill. Monopoly on Salvation? A Feminist Approach to Religious Pluralism. New York: Continuum, 2005.
    • A feminist theological perspective on religious pluralism, emphasizing the intersectionality and hybridity of religious identities.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. 2nd revised ed. New York: Continuum, 2002.
    • The classic foundational text for twentieth-century hermeneutic philosophy.
  • Gellman, Jerome. “Religious Diversity and the Epistemic Justification of Religious Belief.” Faith and Philosophy 10.3 (1993): 345-364.
    • A defense of an exclusivist position concerning “evidence-free” belief in the face of religious diversity, on the basis of the foundational nature of at least some religious beliefs.
  • Gellman, Jerome. “In Defence of a Contented Religious Exclusivism.” Religious Studies 36.4 (2000): 401-417.
    • An extension and further defense of Gellman’s exclusivist position against more recent criticisms.
  • Griffin, David Ray, ed. Deep Religious Pluralism. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox, 2005.
    • A collection of essays articulating process approaches to religious pluralism, including contributions by and about John Cobb.
  • Griffiths, Paul J. An Apology for Apologetics. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis, 1991.
    • An argument that religious pluralism implies obligations for both “negative” and “positive” apologetic arguments concerning one’s own religious commitments.
  • Gross, Rita M. “Feminist Theology as Theology of Religions.” The Cambridge Companion to Feminist Theology. Ed. Susan Frank Parsons. New York: Cambridge UP, 2002.
    • An argument that feminist theology ought to incorporate more religious diversity and that pluralist philosophy and theology ought to engage more with feminist perspectives.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Ed. Peter C. Hodgson. 3 vols. New York: Oxford UP, 2007.
    • Hegel’s monumental treatment of the concept and history of religion; this edition gathers three versions of his lectures, given in 1824, 1827, and 1831. Volume one focuses on the concept of religion, volume two on the various forms it has taken historically, and volume three on what Hegel calls the “Consummate Religion” (that is, Christianity).
  • Heim, S. Mark. Salvations: Truth and Difference in Religion. Mayknoll, NY: Orbis, 2006.
    • A criticism of the versions of pluralism offered by Hick, Knitter, and Wilfred Cantwell Smith, and a pluralist account that posits a diversity of ultimate religious ends.
  • Hick, John. An Interpretation of Religion. 2nd ed. New Haven, CT: Yale UP, 2004.
    • Hick’s classic account of the “pluralistic hypothesis;” his introduction to the second edition contains responses to some of the criticisms his arguments have received.
  • Hick, John and Paul F. Knitter, eds. The Myth of Christian Uniqueness. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis, 1987.
    • An important early collection of essays by Christian theologians advocating pluralistic approaches to religious diversity.
  • James, William. The Varieties of Religious Experience. New York: Routledge, 2002.
    • The influential account of religion in terms of diverse personal experiences and emotions.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason. Trans. Werner S. Pluhar. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2009.
    • Kant’s classic formulation of religion as properly concerning human morality, positing religious diversity as historically inevitable but nevertheless inessential.
  • Kearney, Richard and James Taylor, eds. Hosting the Stranger: Between Religions. New York: Continuum, 2011.
    • A collection of essays approaching religious pluralism in terms of hospitality, from a variety of religious traditions.
  • Kitcher, Philip. “Challenges for Secularism.” The Joys of Secularism. Ed. George Levine. Princeton, NJ: Princeton UP, 2011.
    • An argument for the necessity of developing secularism as a positive doctrine and way of life, which posits that the primary challenge secularism makes against religious belief is the argument from the epistemic symmetry of conflicting beliefs.
  • Knitter, Paul F. One Earth, Many Religions. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis, 1995.
    • A significant liberation-theological approach to religious pluralism from a Christian perspective.
  • Kwok, Pui-Lan. “Feminist Theology as Intercultural Discourse.” The Cambridge Companion to Feminist Theology. Ed. Susan Frank Parsons. New York: Cambridge UP, 2002.
    • A review of the ways that feminist theology has been influenced both by the particular experiences of women in diverse cultures and by dialogue among these cultures. The chapter also offers a critique of Eurocentric tendencies in feminist theology and a plea for greater attention to injustices exacerbated by globalization.
  • Levinas, Emmanuel. “Ethics as First Philosophy.” The Levinas Reader. Ed. Seán Hand. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell, 1989.
    • A summary of Levinas’s central philosophical argument, which aims to reorient earlier phenomenological and hermeneutic positions (particularly those of Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger) towards greater concern for ethics.
  • Lindbeck, George A. The Nature of Doctrine. Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox, 1984.
    • An influential account of religion and theology that articulates two distinct models: the experiential-expressive and the cultural-linguistic. Chapter three deals particularly with the issue of religious diversity.
  • Mavrodes, George I. “Polytheism.” The Rationality of Belief and the Plurality of Faith: Essays in Honor of William P. Alston. Ed. Thomas D. Senor. Ithaca, NY: Cornell UP, 1995.
    • A critical reading of Hick’s “pluralistic hypothesis” that argues that this hypothesis demonstrates a “descriptive polytheism,” despite Hick’s positing the unity of the Real.
  • McKim, Robert. On Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford UP, 2012.
    • An examination and critical appraisal of a variety of approaches to religious diversity, focusing on epistemological and soteriological concerns and ultimately advocating a version of inclusivism.
  • Ogden, Schubert M. Is There Only One True Religion or Are There Many? Dallas: SMU P, 1992.
    • A process-theological account of pluralism that challenges the idea, put forward by other process thinkers, that ultimate reality must be plural in order for religious pluralism to be a tenable position.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “Pluralism: A Defense of Religious Exclusivism.” The Rationality of Belief and the Plurality of Faith: Essays in Honor of William P. Alston. Ed. Thomas D. Senor. Ithaca, NY: Cornell UP, 1995.
    • As the title suggests, a defense of a version of exclusivism against charges that it is either epistemologically or morally objectionable.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford UP, 2000.
    • An important and extensive epistemological examination of the idea of warrant: that is, that quality of a belief that is accorded to it due the proper function of cognitive faculties. The book includes consideration of possible “defeaters” of theistic (and specifically Christian) belief, including religious diversity. Plantinga maintains that a version of exclusivism remains tenable even given such diversity.
  • Quinn, Philip L. “Toward Thinner Theologies: Hick and Alston on Religious Diversity.” Essays in the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Oxford UP, 2006.
    • Provides critical but mostly positive accounts of Hick’s and Alston’s respective positions, arguing that a revised version of Hick’s hypothesis ought to be considered as rational within the framework of Alston’s approach.
  • Quinn, Philip L. and Kevin Meeker, eds. The Philosophical Challenge of Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford UP, 2000.
    • A wide-ranging collection of (mostly analytic-philosophical) essays that presents a variety of exclusivist, inclusivist, and pluralist accounts of religious diversity.
  • Race, Alan. Christians and Religious Pluralism. London: SCM P, 1983.
    • The Christian theological account of pluralism that introduced the categories of exclusivism, inclusivism, and pluralism.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. “Religious Belief: the Difficult Path of the Religious.” Passion for the Possible. Eds. Brian Treanor and Henry Isaac Venema. New York: Fordham UP, 2010.
    • One version of Ricoeur’s account of interreligious dialogue as translation.
  • Rowe, William. “Religious Pluralism.” Religious Studies 35.2 (1999): 139-150.
    • A criticism of Hick’s “pluralistic hypothesis” focused on Hick’s claim that, given pairs of contradictory properties, the Real in itself does not possess either one.
  • Ruether, Rosemary Radford. “Feminism and Jewish-Christian Dialogue.” The Myth of Christian Uniqueness. Ed. John Hick and Paul F. Knitter. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis, 1987.
    • An examination of possibilities for feminist pluralism in the context of, on the one hand, Jewish-Christian dialogue and, on the other hand, particular feminist criticisms of each of these two traditions.
  • Runzo, Joseph. “God, Commitment, and Other Faiths: Pluralism vs. Relativism.” Faith and Philosophy 5.4 (1988): 343-364.
    • An articulation and defense of religious relativism as an alternative to pluralism.
  • Schellenberg, J. L. “Religious Experience and Religious Diversity: a Reply to Alston.” Religious Studies 30.2 (1994): 151-159.
    • An argument that Alston’s response to the problem of diversity is unsuccessful and that, in cases of significant epistemic conflict, justification for religious belief is removed.
  • Schleiermacher, Friedrich. On Religion: Speeches to its Cultured Despisers. Ed. Richard Crouter. New York: Cambridge UP, 1996.
    • The influential account of religion that distinguishes it from both metaphysics and morality, and grounds it in an individual intuition of the absolute. The fifth and last speech concerns religious diversity; Schleiermacher argues that such diversity is necessary.
  • Suchocki, Marjorie Hewitt. “In Search of Justice: Religious Pluralism from a Feminist Perspective.” The Myth of Christian Uniqueness. Ed. John Hick and Paul F. Knitter. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis, 1987.
    • An argument that feminist theology, out of its commitment to work against oppression, must affirm a pluralist perspective. The author draws on liberation theology to posit justice as the foundation on which interreligious dialogue can happen.
  • Tracy, David. Dialogue with the Other: the Inter-Religious Dialogue. Grand Rapids, MI: W. B. Eerdmans, 1991.
    • A hermeneutical approach to religious pluralism primarily from a Christian point of view, though it incorporates perspectives from other traditions.
  • Westphal, Merold. “The Politics of Religious Pluralism.” The Proceedings of the Twentieth World Congress of Philosophy 4 (1999): 1-8.
    • A brief critique of the pluralist approach to religious diversity, which argues that ethical and political norms found in religious traditions – particularly the commitment to non-violence – can help dissociate the cognitive content of religious belief claims from “religiously sanctioned” violence.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology, and Religious Belief. Berkeley, CA: U of California P, 1966.
    • Wittgenstein’s lectures on religious belief have been influential on positions that argue that religious diversity is not primarily an epistemic or cognitive matter, especially the cultural-linguistic model favored by Lindbeck and the aspect of Hick’s argument that focuses on practice rather than belief.


Author Information

Michael Barnes Norton
University of Arkansas at Little Rock
U. S. A.