Theories of Religious Diversity

religious symbolsReligious diversity is the fact that there are significant differences in religious belief and practice. It has always been recognized by people outside the smallest and most isolated communities. But since early modern times, increasing information from travel, publishing, and emigration have forced thoughtful people to reflect more deeply on religious diversity. Roughly, pluralistic approaches to religious diversity say that, within bounds, one religion is as good as any other. In contrast, exclusivist approaches say that only one religion is uniquely valuable. Finally, inclusivist theories try to steer a middle course by agreeing with exclusivism that one religion has the most value while also agreeing with pluralism that others still have significant religious value.

What values are at issue? Literature since 1950 focuses on the truth or rationality of religious teachings, the veridicality (conformity with reality) of religious experiences, salvific efficacy (the ability to deliver whatever cure religion should provide), and alleged directedness towards one and the same ultimate religious object.

The exclusivist-inclusivist-pluralist trichotomy has become standard since the 1980s. Unfortunately, it is often used with some mix of the above values in mind, leaving it unclear exactly which values are pertinent. While this trichotomy is sometimes thought of in terms of general attitudes that a religious person may have towards other religions—approximately the attitudes of rejection, limited openness, and wide acceptance respectively—in this article they figure as theories concerning the facts of religious diversity. “Religious pluralism” in some contexts means an informed, tolerant, and appreciative or sympathetic view of the various religions. In other contexts, “religious pluralism” is a normative principle requiring that peoples of all or most religions should be treated the same.  In this article, “religious pluralism” refers to a theory about the diversity of religions. Finally, some authors use “descriptive religious pluralism” to mean what is here called “religious diversity,” calling “normative religious pluralism” views that are here called varieties of “religious pluralism.” While the trichotomy has been repeatedly challenged, it is still widely used, and can be precisely defined in various ways.

Table of Contents

  1. Facts and Theories of Religious Diversity
    1. History
    2. Theories and Associations
  2. Religious Pluralism
    1. Naive Pluralisms
    2. Core Pluralisms
    3. Hindu Pluralisms
    4. Ultimist Pluralisms
    5. Identist Pluralisms
    6. Expedient Means Pluralism
  3. Exclusivism
    1. Terminological Problems
    2. Naive Exclusivisms
    3. Christian Exclusivisms
  4. Inclusivism
    1. Terminological Problems
    2. Abrahamic Inclusivisms
    3. Buddhist Inclusivisms
    4. Plural Salvations Inclusivism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Facts and Theories of Religious Diversity

Scholars distinguish seven aspects of religious traditions: the doctrinal and philosophical, the mythic and narrative, the ethical and legal, the ritual and practical, the experiential and emotional, the social and organizational, and the material and artistic. (Smart 1996) Religious traditions differ along all these dimensions. These are the undisputed facts of religious diversity. Some authors, usually ones who wish to celebrate these facts, call them “religious pluralism,” but this entry reserves this label for a family of theories about the facts of religious diversity.

It is arguably the doctrinal and philosophical aspects of a religion which are foundational, in that the other aspects can only be understood in light of them. Particularly central to any religion’s teaching are its diagnosis of the fundamental problem facing human beings and its suggested cure, a way to positively and permanently resolve this problem. (Prothero 2010, 13-6; Yandell 1999, 16-9)

a. History

Scholarly study of a wide range of religions, and comparison and evaluation of them, was to a large extent pioneered by Christian missionaries in the nineteenth century seeking to understand those whom they sought to convert. This led to both the questioning and the defense of various “exclusivist” traditional Christian claims. (Netland 2001, 23-54) Theories of religious diversity have largely been driven by attacks on and defenses of such claims, and discussions continue within the realm of Christian theology. (Kärkkäinen 2003; Netland 2001) The most famous of these has been the view (held by some Christians) that all non-Christians are doomed to an eternity of conscious suffering in hell. (Hick 1982 ch. 2; see section 3c below)

All the theories discussed in this article are ways that (usually religious) people regard other religions, but here we discuss them abstractly, without descending much into the details of how they would be worked out in the teachings and practices of any one religion. Such would be the work of a religiously embedded and committed theology of religious diversity, not of a general philosophy of religious diversity.

b. Theories and Associations    

Many people associate any sort of pluralist theory of religious diversity with a number of arguably good qualities. These qualities include but are not limited to: being humble, reasonable, kind, broad-minded, open-minded, informed, cosmopolitan, modern, properly appreciative of difference, non-bigoted, tolerant, being opposed to proselytizing (attempts to convince those outside the religion to convert to it), anti-colonialist, and anti-imperialist. In contrast, any non-pluralist theory of religious diversity is associated with many arguably bad qualities. These negative qualities include but are not limited to: being arrogant, unreasonable, mean, narrow-minded, closed-minded, uninformed, provincial, out of date, xenophobic, bigoted, intolerant, in favor of proselytism, colonialist, and imperialist.

These, however, are mere associations; there seems to be no obvious entailments between the theories of religious diversity and the above qualities. In principle, it would seem that an exclusivist or inclusivist may have all or most of the good qualities, and one who accepts a theory of religious pluralism may have all or most of the bad qualities. These connections between theory and character – which are believed by some to provide practical arguments for or objections to various theories – need to be argued for. But it is very rare for a scholar to go beyond merely assuming or asserting some sort of causal connection between the various theories about religious diversity and the above virtues and vices.

2. Religious Pluralism

A theory of religious pluralism says that all religions of some kind are the same in some valuable respect(s). While this is compatible with some religion being the best in some other respect(s), the theorists using this label have in mind that many religions are equal regarding the central value(s) of religion. (Legenhausen 2009)

The term “religious pluralism” is almost always used for a theory asserting positive value for many or most religions. But one may talk also of “negative religious pluralism” in which most or all religions have little or no positive value and are equal in this respect. This would be the view of many naturalists, who hold that all religions are the product of human imagination, and fail to have most or all of the values claimed for them. (Byrne 2004; Feuerbach 1967)

a. Naive Pluralisms

Though naive pluralisms are not common amongst scholars in relevant fields, they are important to mention because they are entertained by many people as they begin to reflect on religious diversity.

An uninformed person, noting certain commonalities of religious belief and practice, may suppose that all religions are the same, namely, that there are no significant differences between religious traditions. This naive pluralism is refuted by accurate information on religious differences. (Prothero 2010)

A common form of negative pluralism may be called “verificationist pluralism.” This is the view that all religious claims are meaningless, and as a result are incapable of rational evaluation.  This is because they cannot be empirically verified, that is, their truth or falsity is not known by way of observational evidence.

There are three serious problems with verificationist pluralism. First, some religious claims can be empirically confirmed or disconfirmed. For example, people have empirically disconfirmed claims that Jesus will visibly return to rule the earth from Jerusalem in 1974, or that magical “ghost shirts” will protect the wearer from bullets, or that saying a certain mantra three times will protect one from highway robbers. Second, the claim that meaningfulness requires the possibility of empirical verification has little to recommend it, and is self-refuting (that is, the claim itself is not empirically verifiable). (Peterson et. al. 2013, 268-72) Third, religions differ in how much, if at all, they make empirically verifiable claims, so it is unclear that all religions will be equal in making meaningless claims.

While there are other sorts of negative naive pluralism, we shall concentrate on positive kinds here, as most of the scholarly literature focuses on those.

Some forms of naive pluralism suppose that all religions will turn out to be complementary. One idea is that all religions would turn out to be parts of one whole (either one religion or at least one conglomeration of religions). This unified consistency may be hoped for in terms of truth, or in terms of practice. With truth, the problem is that it is hard to see how the core claims of the religions could all be true. For instance, some religions teach that the ultimate reality (the most real, only real, or primary thing) is ineffable (such that no human concept can apply to it). But others teach that the ultimate reality is a perfect self, a being capable of knowledge, will, and intentional action.

What about the religions’ practices – are they all complementary? Some practices seem compatible, such as church attendance and mindfulness meditation. On the other hand, others seem to make little or no sense outside the context of the home religion, and others are simply incompatible. What sense, for instance, would it make for a Zen Buddhist to undergo the Catholic rites of confession and penance? Or what sense would it make for an Orthodox Jew, whose religion teaches him to “be fruitful and multiply,” to employ the Buddhist practice of viewing corpses at a burial ground so as to expunge the unwanted liability of sexual desire? Nor can he be fruitful and multiply while living as a celibate Buddhist monk. Dabblers and hobbyists freely stitch together unique quilts of religious beliefs and practices, but such constructions seem to make little sense once a believer has accepted any particular religion. Many religious claims will be logically incompatible with the accepted diagnosis, and many religious practices will be useless or counter-productive when it comes to getting what one believes to be the cure.

Another way in which pluralism can be naive is the common assumption that absolutely all religions are good in significant ways, for example, by improving their adherents’ lives, facilitating interaction with God, or leading to eternal salvation. However, such a person is probably only thinking of large, respectable, and historically important religions. It is not hard to find religions or “religious cults” which would not plausibly be thought of as good in the way(s) that a pluralist has in mind. For example, a religious group may function only to satisfy the desires of its founder, discourage the worship of God, encourage the sexual abuse of children, or lead to the damnation of its members.

Carefully worked out theories of religious pluralism often sound all-inclusive. However, they nearly always have at least one criterion for excluding religions as inferior in the aspect(s) they focus on. A difficulty for any pluralist theory is how to restrict the group of equally good religions without losing the appearance of being all-accepting or wholly non-judgmental. A common strategy here is to simply ignore disreputable religious traditions, only discussing the prestigious ones.

b. Core Pluralisms

An improvement upon naive pluralism acknowledges differences in all the aspects of religions, but separates peripheral from core differences. A core pluralist claims that all religions of some kind share a common core, and that this is really what matters about the religions; their equal value is found in this common core. If the core is true teachings, they’ll all be true (to some degree). If the core is veridical experiences, all religions will enable ways to perceive whatever the objects of religious experience are. If the core is salvifically effective practice, then all will be equal in that each is equally well a means to obtaining the cure. Given that any core pluralism inevitably downplays the other non-core elements of the religions, this approach has also been called “reductive pluralism.” (Legenhausen 2006)

The most influential recent proponent of a version of core pluralism has been Huston Smith. (b. 1919) In his view, the common core of religions is a tiered worldview.  This encompasses the idea that physical reality, the terrestrial plane, is contained within and controlled by a more real intermediate plane (that is, the subtle, animic, or psychic plane) which is in turn contained and controlled by the celestial plane. This celestial plane is a personal God. Beyond this is infinite, unlimited Being (also called “Absolute Truth, “the True Reality,” “the Absolute,” “God”). Given that it is ineffable, this Being is neither a god, nor the God of monotheism. It is more real than all that comes from it. The various “planes” are not distinct from it, and it is the ultimate object of all desire, and the deepest reality within each human self. Some experience this Being as if it were a god, but the most able gain a non-conceptual awareness of it in its ineffable glory. Smith holds that in former ages, and among primitive peoples now, such a worldview is near universal.  It is only modern people who are blinded by the misunderstanding that science reveals all, who have forgotten it. (Smith 1992, 2003 ch. 3) The highest level in some sense is the human “Spirit,” the deep self which underlies the self of ordinary experience. Appropriating Hindu, Buddhist, and Christian language, Smith says that this “spirit is the Atman that is Brahman, the Buddha-nature that appears when our finite selves get out of its way, my istigkeit (is-ness) which…we see is God’s is-ness.” (Smith 2003 ch. 3, 3-4)

Such an outlook, often called “the perennial philosophy” or “traditionalism,” owes much to nineteenth and twentieth century occult literature, and to neo-Platonism and its early modern revivals. (Sedgwick 2004) Like traditional religions, it too offers a diagnosis of the human condition and a cure.  It offers a fall from primordial spirituality into modern spiritual poverty, cured by adopting the outlook sketched above. Most importantly, it offers a chance to discover the deep self as Being. A muted ally in this was the influential religious scholar Mircea Eliade (1907-86), whose work focused on comparing mythologies, and on what he viewed as an important, primitive religious outlook, which separates things into the sacred and the profane.

This “perennial philosophy” appeals to many present-day people, particularly those who, like Smith, have moved from a childhood religious faith, in his case, Christianity, to a more naturalistic and, hence, atheistic outlook. Such an outlook is commonly perceived as meaningless, hopeless, and devoid of value. (Smith 2003, 2012)

Dissenters are found among historians of religion, who deny that there is and has always been a common core in all of the world’s religions. Others dissent because they accept the incompatible diagnosis and cure taught by some other religion, such as the ones found in Islam or Christianity. (Legenhausen 2002) Those who believe the ultimate reality to be a unique god object to Smith’s view that the ultimate reality is ineffable, and so not, in itself, a god. Others find it excessive that Smith accepts other traditional doctrines, such as that Plato’s Forms are not only real but alive, that in dreaming the “subtle body” leaves the body and roams free in the intermediate realm, belief in siddhis (supernatural powers gained by meditation), possession by spirits, psychic phenomena, and so on.

This sort of core pluralism was propounded by some members of the Theosophical Society such as co-founder Helena Petrovna Blavatsky (1831-91) in her widely read The Secret Doctrine (1888), and by French convert to Sufi Islam René Guénon (1886-1951) and those influenced by him, such as the eclectic Swiss-German writer Frithjof Schuon (1907-98). This sort of pluralism, following Guénon and Schuon, has been championed by Iranian philosopher Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) and English convert to Islam, Martin Lings (1909-2005) who was a biographer of Muhammad. (Legenhausen 2002)

While Smith’s view rests on belief in an impersonal Ultimate, other versions of core pluralism rest upon monotheism. Thus, the Hindu intellectual Ram Mohun Roy (1772/4-1833) held that Hinduism, Islam, and Christianity, when understood in their original, non-idolatrous and non-superstitious ways, all teach the important truths about God and humankind, enabling humans to love and serve God. Roy, however, always retained his Hindu and Brahmin identities. (Sharma 1999, ch. 2) He was what we now call a “pluralistic Hindu” (and most Hindus would add that he was also an unorthodox Hindu).

Swedish philosopher Mikael Stenmark explores what he calls the “some-are-equally-right view” about religious diversity, and discusses a version of it on which Judaism, Christianity, and Islam are held to possess equal amounts of religiously important truths. (Stenmark 2009) He does not advocate this view, but explores it as an alternative to exclusivism, inclusivism, and Hickian identist pluralism. Stenmark views it as most similar to identist pluralism (see 2e below). But Stenmark’s “some-are-equally-right view” can also be seen as a form of core pluralism, the core being truths about the one God and our need for relationship with God. On this view, “all” the religions are right to the same degree, that is, all versions of monotheism (or perhaps, ethical monotheisms, or Abrahamic monotheisms). This account is narrower than “pluralism” is usually thought to be, but it is arguably a version of it.

c. Hindu Pluralisms

The tradition now called “Hinduism” is and always has been very internally diverse. In modern times, it tries to equalize other religions in the same ways it equalizes the apparently contrary claims and practices internal to it. While elements within it have been sectarian and exclusivistic, modern Hindu thought is usually pluralistic. Furthermore, Hindu thought has shifted in modern times from a scriptural to an experiential emphasis. (Long 2011) Still, some Hindus object to various kinds of pluralism. (Morales 2008)

Within the pluralistic mainstream of Hinduism, a popular slogan is that “all religions are true,” but this may be an expression of almost any sort of positive religious pluralism. Moreover, some influential modern Hindu leaders have adopted a complicated rhetoric of “universal religion,” which often assumes some sort of religious pluralism. (Sharma 1999, ch. 6)

At bare minimum, the slogan that “all religions are true” means that all religions are in some way directed towards one Truth, where this is understood as an ultimate reality. Thus, it has been observed that identist religious pluralism (see 2e below) “is essentially a Hindu position,” and closely resembles Advaita Vendanta thought. (Long 2005) The slogan may also imply that all religions feature veridical experience of that one object, by way of a non-cognitive, immediate awareness. (Sharma 1990) This modern Hindu outlook has proven difficult to formulate in any clear way. One prominent scholar argues that the “neo-Hindu” position on religious diversity (that is, modern Hindu pluralism) is not the view that all religions are equal, one, true, or the same. Instead, it is the view that all religions are “valid,” meaning that they have some degree of (some kind of) value. (Sharma 1979) But if there is no one clear modern Hindu pluralism, it remains that various modern Indian thinkers have held to versions of core or identist pluralism.

Paradoxically, such pluralism is often expressed along with claims that Hinduism is greatly superior in various ways to other religions. (Datta 2005; Morales 2008) It has been argued that whether and how a Hindu embraces a theory of religious pluralism will depend crucially on what she takes “Hinduism” to be. (Long 2005)

d. Ultimist Pluralisms

Building on the speculative metaphysics of Alfred North Whitehead’s (1861–1947) Process and Reality (1929), and work by his student Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000), theologians John Cobb and David Ray Griffin have advocated what the latter calls “deep,” “differential,” and “complementary” pluralism – what is here described as “ultimist.” (Cooper 2006, ch. 7; Griffin 2005b)

Cobb and Griffin assume that there is no supernatural intervention (any miraculous interruption of the ordinary course of nature) by God or other beings. This, it is hoped, rules out anyone having grounds for believing any particular religion to be the uniquely best religion. (Griffin 2005a) They do, however, take seriously at least many of the unusual religious experiences people report. They hypothesize that some religious mystics really do perceive (without using ordinary sense organs) some “ultimate” (that is, something regarded as ultimate). Thus, in experiencing what they call “Emptiness” or the Dharmakaya (truth body), Mahayana Buddhists really do perceive what Cobb calls Creativity (or Being Itself), as do Advaita Vedanta Hindus when they perceive Nirguna Brahman (Brahman without qualities). Other Buddhists experience Amida Buddha, while Christians experience Christ, and Jews Yahweh, Hindus Isvara, and Muslims Allah. All such religious mystics really perceive a personal, supreme God, understood panentheistically, as being “in” the cosmos, akin to how a soul is in a body. Yet other religious mystics perceive the Cosmos, that is, the totality of finite things (the “body” of the World Soul).

These three – Creativity, God, Cosmos – are such that none could exist without the others. Further, it is really Creativity that is ultimate, and it is “embodied in” and does not exist apart from or as an object in addition to God and the Cosmos. Sometimes God and Cosmos are described as aspects of Creativity. The underlying metaphysics here is that of process philosophy, in which events are the basic or fundamental units of reality. On such a metaphysics, any apparent substance (being, entity) turns out to be one or more events or processes. Even God, the greatest concrete, actual being in this philosophy is, in the end, an all-encompassing “unity of experience,” and is to be understood as a process of “Creative-Responsive love.” (Griffin 2005b; Cooper 2006, ch. 7)

All the major religions, then, are really oriented towards, and involve the experience of some reality regarded as “ultimate” (Creativity, God, or Cosmos). It is also allowed that each major religion really does deliver the cure it claims to (for example, salvation and heaven, Nirvana, Moksha), and is entitled to operate by its own moral and epistemic values. Further, it respects and does not try to eliminate all these differences, and so makes genuine dialogue between members of the religions possible. Finally, Cobb and Griffin emphasize that this approach does not endorse any unreasonable form of relativism and, as such, allows one to remain distinctively Christian or Buddhist and so forth. They hope that each religion can, while remaining distinct, begin to construct “global” theologies, influenced by the truths and values of other religions. In all these ways, they argue that their ultimist pluralism is superior to other pluralisms.

This view has not been widely accepted because the Process theology and philosophy on which it is based has not been widely accepted.

One may object that this above proposal is counter to the equalizing spirit of pluralism. Griffin and Cobb seem to attribute the deepest insight to those who think the ultimate reality is an impersonal, indescribable non-thing. In their view, those who confess experience of Emptiness, Nirguna Brahman, or the One (of Neoplatonism) behold the ultimate reality (Creativity) as it really is, in contrast to monotheists or cosmos-focused religionists, who latch on to what are limited aspects of Creativity. But these monotheists and cosmos-worshipers each take their object to be ultimate, and would deny the existence of any further back entity or non-entity, that is, of Creativity. It would seem that that, for example, a Christian to accept this ultimist pluralism, she will have to reinterpret what many Christians will regard as a core commitment, namely, that the ultimate reality is personal. Even a Mahayana Buddhist may have a lot of adjusting to do, if she is to admit that believers in a personal God really do experience the greatest entity, and something which is not separate from Emptiness. Wouldn’t this be to attribute more reality to God than she’s willing to? And how can the ultimist pluralist demand such changes?

A similar pluralism is advanced by Japanese Zen scholar Masao Abe (1915-2006). He applies the Mahayana doctrine of the “three bodies” of the Buddha to other religions. In Mahayana Buddhism, the ultimate reality, a formless but active non-thing, is Emptiness, or the Truth Body (Dharmakaya). This in some sense manifests as, acts as, and is not different from a host of Enjoyment Bodies (Sambhogakaya), each of which is a Buddha outside of space and time, a historical Buddha now escaped from samsara and dwelling in a Buddha-realm. The historical Buddha, the man Gautama is, in this doctrine, a Transformation Body (or Apparitional Body, Nirmanakaya) of one of these, as are other Buddhas in time and space. In some sense these three are one, however, the Truth Body manifests or acts as various Enjoyment Bodies, which in turn manifest or act as various Transformation Bodies. The latter two classes of beings, but not the first, may be described as “personal.”

As to religious diversity, Abe suggests that we view the dynamic activity Emptiness (also called “Openness”) as ultimate, and as manifesting as various “Gods,” that is various monotheistic deities, and “Lords,” which are human religious teachers, whether manifestations of a god, as in the case of Jesus, or just pre-eminent servants of a god, as with Moses or Muhammad.

It is a mistake, Abe holds, to regard any god as ultimate, and monotheists must revise their understanding as above, if true inter-religious dialogue and peace are to be achievable. Equally, Advaita Vedanta Hindus must let go of their insistence on Nirguna Brahman as ultimate. It is a mistake to think that the ultimate is any substantial, self-identical thing, even an ineffable one. (Abe 1985)

Must the Mahayanist make any significant revision to accept the proposed “threefold reality” of Emptiness, gods, and lords? Presumably not, as she already believes in levels of truth and levels of reality. At the highest level there is only Emptiness, the ultimate. The gods and lords will stay at the “provisional” levels of truth and reality, the levels which a fully enlightened person, as it were, sees beyond.

Abe’s views have been criticized by other scholars as misunderstanding some other religions’ claims, and as privileging Mahayana Buddhist doctrines, insofar as he understands these doctrines as being truer than others. It can be argued that Abe is an inclusivist, maintaining that Buddhism is the best religion, rather than a true pluralist. (Burton 2010)

e. Identist Pluralisms

In much religious studies, theology, and philosophy of religion literature of the 1980s through the 2000s, the term “religious pluralism” means the theory of philosopher John Hick. (Hick 2004; Quinn and Meeker 2000) Hick’s approach is original, thorough, and informed by a broad and deep knowledge of many religions. His theory is at least superficially clear, and is rooted in his own spiritual journey. It attracted widespread discussion and criticism, and Hick has engaged in a spirited debate with all comers. It is here described as “Identist” pluralism because his theory claims that people in all the major religions interact with one and the same transcendent reality, variously called “God,” “the Real,” and “the Ultimate Reality.”

Hick viewed religious belief as rationally defensible, and held that one may be rational in trusting the veridicality of one’s religious experiences. However, he thought that it is arbitrary and indefensible to hold that only one’s own experiences or the experiences of those in one’s group are veridical, while those of people in other religions are not. Subjectively, those other people have similar grounds for belief. These ideas, and the fact that religious belief is strongly correlated with birthplace, convinced him that the facts of religious diversity pose irresolvable problems for any exclusivist or inclusivist view, leaving only some form of pluralism as a viable option. (Hick 1997)

Starting as a traditional, non-pluralistic Christian, Hick attended religious meetings and studied with people of other religions. As a result, he became convinced that basically the same thing was going on with these others religious followers as with Christians, namely, people responding in culturally conditioned but transformative ways to one and the same Real or Ultimate Reality. In his earlier writings, monotheistic concerns seem important. How could a perfect being fail to be available to all people in all the religions? Later on, Hick firmly settled on the view that this Real should be thought of as ineffable. Appropriating Immanuel Kant’s distinction between phenomena, how things appear, and noumena, things in themselves, Hick postulated that the Real is ineffable and is not directly experienced by anyone. However, he maintained that people in the religions interact with it indirectly, by way of various personae and impersonae, personal and impersonal appearances or phenomena of the Real. In other words, this Ultimate Reality, due to the various qualities of human minds, appears to various people as personae, such as God, the Trinity, Allah, Vishnu, and also as impersonae such as Emptiness, Nirvana, Nirguna Brahman, and the Dao. These objects of religious experience are mind-dependent, in that they depend for their existence, in part, on people with certain religious backgrounds. By contrast, the Real in itself, that is, the Ultimate Reality as it intrinsically is, is never experienced by anyone, but is only hypothesized as overall the most reasonable explanation of the facts of religious diversity.

Among these purported facts, for Hick, is that the great religions equally well facilitate the ethical transformation of their adherents, what Hick calls a transformation from self-centeredness to other-centeredness and Reality-centeredness. (Sometimes, however, Hick makes the weaker claim that we’re unable to pick any religion as best at effecting this transformation.) This transformation, Hick theorizes, is really the point of religion. All religions, then, are equal in that they are responses to the ineffable Ultimate Reality which equally well—or for all we can tell equally well—bring about an ethical improvement in humans, away from self-centeredness and towards other humans and the Ultimate Reality.

Hick realizes the incoherence of dubbing all religions “true,” for they have core teachings that conflict, and most religions are not shy about pointing out such conflicts. We could loosely paraphrase Hick’s view as being that all religions are false, not that all their teachings are false (for there is much ethical and practical agreement among them), but rather that their core claims about the main object of religious experience and pursuit equally contain falsehoods. Monotheists, after all, take the ultimate being to be a personal god while others, variously called ultimists, absolutists, or monists, hold the ultimate to be impersonal, such as the Dao, Emptiness, Nirguna Brahman, and so forth. These, Hick holds, are all mistaken; the Ultimate reality is neither personal nor impersonal. (Hick 1995, ch. 3) To say that it is either, Hick realizes, would be to hand an epistemic victory to either the monotheists or the absolutists (ultimists). This, he will not do.

Instead, Hick downgrades the importance of true belief to religion. Though not true, doctrines such as the Trinity or the Incarnation, he argues, may be interpreted to have “mythological truth,” that is, a tendency to influence people towards getting what Hick postulates is the cure offered by the religions, the ethical transformation described above.

Hick doesn’t argue for the salvific or cure-delivering equality of all religions. Rather, he only argues for the equality of what he calls “post-axial” religions – major religious traditions which have arisen since around 800 B.C.E. (Hick 2004, ch. 2-4; Meeker 2003)

Hick’s identist religious pluralism has been objected to as thoroughly as any recent theory in philosophy. Here we can survey only a few of the criticisms that have been made. (For others see Hick 2004, Introduction.)

Many have objected that Hick’s pluralism is not merely a theory about religions, but is itself a competitor in the field, offering a diagnosis and cure which disagrees with those of the world religions. It is hard to see, then, how his theory enables one to be, as Hick claimed to be, a “pluralistic Christian,” given that one has replaced the diagnosis and cure of Christianity with those of Hick’s pluralism. In reply, Hick urges that his claims are not themselves religious, but are rather about religious matters, and are, as such, philosophical.

Hick’s claim that no human concept applies to the Ultimate Reality has been criticized by many, who’ve pointed out that Hick applies these concepts to it: being one, being ultimate, being a partial cause of the impersonae and personae, and being ineffable. Moreover, it seems a necessary truth that if the concept personal doesn’t apply to the Real, then the concept non-personal must apply to it. (King, 2008; Rowe 1999; Yandell 1999) In response, Hick concedes that some concepts, “formal” ones, can be applied to the Real, while “substantial” ones cannot. He switches to the term “transcategorial,” points out historical versions of this thesis, and urges that the Real simply is not in the domain of entities to which concepts like personal and non-personal apply. His critics, he argues, are merely asserting without reason that there cannot be a transcategorial reality. (Hick 2000, 2004)

As to Hick’s idea that the correlation of birthplace and religious belief somehow undermines the rationality of religious belief, it has been pointed out that religious pluralism too is correlated with birthplace. In response to his claims that non-pluralistic religious believers are being arrogant, irrational, or arbitrary in believing that one religion (theirs) is the most true one, it has been pointed out that Hick too, as a religious pluralist, holds views which are inconsistent with many or most religions, seemingly preferring his own insights or experiences to theirs, which would, by Hick’s own lights, be just as arrogant, irrational, or arbitrary. (O’Connor 1999; King 2008; Bogardus 2013)

Others object that given the transcategoriality or ineffability of the Real, even with the above qualifications, there is no reason to think that interaction with the Real should be ethically beneficial, or that it should have any connection at all to any religious value. (Netland 2001)

Others object that Hick’s pluralism requires arbitrarily reinterpreting religious language non-literally, and usually as having to do with morality, contrary to what most proponents of those religions believe. (Yandell 2013)

Again, it has been objected that Hick, contrary to many religions, downgrades religious practice and belief as inessential to a religion, the only important features of a religion being that it is a response to the Ultimate Reality and that it fosters the ethical transformation noted above. Further, Hick presupposes the correctness of recent socially “liberal” ethics, for example, “sexual liberation,” and thus rules out as inessential to any religion any conflicting ethical demands. (Legenhausen 2006)

Other objections have been centered on the status of Hick’s personae. If, for example, in his view Allah, Vishnu, and Yahweh are all real and distinct, is Hick thereby committed to polytheism? Or are those gods mere fictions? (Hasker 2011) At first Hick evades the issue of polytheism by describing his theory not as a kind of “polytheism,” but rather as “poly-something.” He then suggests that two views of the personae are compatible with his theory: that they are mental projections, or that they are real, but angel- or deva– like beings, intermediaries and not really gods. Finally, Hick revises his view: the monotheistic gods people experience are mental projections in response to the Real, and not real selves, but since religious people really do encounter great selves in religious experience, we should posit personal intermediaries between humans and the Real, with whom religious people interact. Perhaps these are the angels, devas, and heavenly Buddhas of the religions, great but nonetheless finite beings. Thus Christians, for example, imagine that in prayer they interact with the ultimate, a monotheistic god, but in fact they interact with angels, and perhaps different Christians with different angels. It is a mistake, he now holds, to suppose that the personae (that is, Vishnu, Yahweh, Allah, and so on) are angel-like selves. This is not compatible with his thesis that Vishnu and others are phenomena of the Real, that is, culturally conditioned ways that the Real appears to us. (Hick 2011)

A less developed identist pluralism is explored by Peter Byrne. (1995, 2004) All the major religions are equal in that they (1) refer to and facilitate cognitive contact with a single, transcendent reality, (2) each offers a similarly moral- and eternal-oriented “cure,” and (3) each includes revisable and incomplete accounts of this transcendent reality. It has been objected that this theory is not promising because it is hard to see how we could ever have sufficient evidence for some of its claims, while others are implausible in light of the evidence we do have. (Mawson 2005)

f. Expedient Means Pluralism

Historically, Buddhist thought about other religions has almost never been pluralistic. (Burton 2010; Kiblinger 2005; and section 4c below) But in modern times, some have constructed a novel and distinctively Buddhist pluralism using the Mahayana doctrine of “expedient means” (Sanskrit: upaya). The classic discussion of this is in the Lotus Sutra (before 255 C.E.), which argues that previous versions of Buddhist teaching were mere expedient means, that is, non-truths taught because in his great wisdom, the Buddha knew that at its then immature stage, humanity would be aided only by those teachings. This was a polemic against non-Mahayana versions of Buddhist dharma (teaching). Now that the time is right, the truth may be told, that is, Mahayana doctrine, superseding the old. However, more recently, it has been argued that all religious doctrines, even Mahayana ones, are expedient means, helpful non-truths, ladders to be kicked away upon attainment of the cure, here understood as a non-cognitive awareness of the ultimate reality. (Burton 2010)

3. Exclusivism

a. Terminological Problems

The term “exclusivist” was originally a polemical term, chosen in part for its negative connotations. Some have urged that it be replaced by the more neutral terms “particularism” or “restrictivism.” (Netland 2001, 46; Kärkkäinen 2003, 80-1) This article retains the common term because it is widespread and many have adopted the label for their own theory of religious diversity.

In this article “exclusivism” about religious diversity denies any form of pluralism; it denies that all religions, or all “major ones,” are the same in some important respect. Insofar as a religion claims to possess a diagnosis of the fundamental problem facing humans and a cure, that is, a way to permanently and positively resolve this problem, it will then assume that other, incompatible diagnoses and cures are incorrect. Because of this, arguably exclusivism (or inclusivism, see section 4 below) is a default view in religious traditions. Thus, for example, the earliest Buddhist and Christian sources prominently feature staunch criticisms of various rival teachings and practices as, respectively, false and useless or harmful. (Netland 2001; Burton 2010)

Some philosophers, going against the much-discussed identist pluralism of John Hick (see 2e above) use “exclusivism” to mean reasonable and informed religious belief which is not pluralist. (O’Connor 1999) This “exclusivism” is compatible with both exclusivism and inclusivism in this article. It is difficult to make a fully clear distinction between exclusivist and inclusivist approaches. The basic idea is that the inclusivist grants more of the values in question to religions other than the single best religion – more truth, more salvific efficacy, more veridical experience of the objects of religious experience, more genuine moral transformation, and so forth.

Finally, because of their fit with many traditional religious beliefs and commitments, sometimes exclusivism and inclusivism are considered as two varieties of “confessionalism,” views on which “one religion is…true and…we must view other religions in the light of that fact.” (Byrne 2004, 203)

b. Naive Exclusivisms

An exclusivist stance is often signaled by the claim that there is “only one true religion.” Other religions, then, are “false.” A naive person may infer from this that no claim, or no central claim of any other religion is true, but all such are false. This position cannot be self-consistently maintained. Consider the claim that the cosmos was intentionally made. An informed Christian must concede that Jews and Muslims too believe this, and that they teach it as a central doctrine. Thus, if central Christian teachings are true, then so is at least one central teaching of these two rival religions.

Another naive exclusivist view which is rejected by most theorists is that all who are not full-fledged members of the best religion fail to get the cure. For example, all non-Christians go to hell, or all non-Buddhists fail to gain Nirvana, or to make progress towards it. Theorists nearly always loosen the requirement with regard to what they view as the one most true and/or most effective religion. Thus, Christian exclusivists usually allow that those who die as babies, the severely mentally handicapped, or friends of God who lived before Christian times may avoid hell and attain heaven despite their not being fully-fledged, believing and practicing Christians. (Dupuis 2001; Meeker 2003; section 3c below) Similarly, Buddhists usually allow that a person may gain positive karma, and so a better rebirth, by the practice of various other religions, helping her to advance, life by life, towards getting the cure by means of the distinctive Buddhist beliefs and practices.

While such naive exclusivist positions are rarely expounded by scholars, they frequently appear in the work of pluralists and inclusivists, held up as unfortunate, harmful, and unreasonable theories which are in urgent need of replacement.

c. Christian Exclusivisms

Early bishop Ignatius of Antioch (c. 35-107) writes that “if any follow a schismatic [that is, the founder of a religious group outside of the bishop-ruled catholic mainstream] they will not inherit the Kingdom of God.” (Letter of Ignatius to the Philadelphians 3:3) Leading catholic theologian Origen of Alexandria (c. 186-255) wrote: “outside the Church no one is saved.” (Dupuis 2001, 86-7) Yet Origen also held, at least tentatively, that eventually all rational beings will be saved.

Thus, the slogan that there is no salvation outside the church (Latin: Extra ecclesiam nulla salus) was meant to communicate at bare minimum the uniqueness of the Christian church as God’s instrument of salvation since the resurrection of Jesus. The slogan was nearly always, in the first three Christian centuries, wielded in the context of disputes with “heretical” Christian groups, the point being that one can’t be saved through membership in such groups. (Dupuis 2001, 86-9)

However, what about Jews, pagans, unbaptized babies, or people who never have a chance to hear the Christian message? After catholic Christianity became the official religion of the empire (c. 381), it was usually assumed that the message had been preached throughout the world, leaving all adult non-Christians without excuse. Thus, Augustine of Hippo (354-430) and Fulgentius of Ruspe (468-533) interpreted the slogan as implying that all non-Christians are damned, because they bear the guilt of “original sin” stemming from the sin of Adam, which has not been as it were washed away by baptism. (Dupuis 2000, 91-2)

Water baptism, from the beginning, had been the initiation rite into Christianity, but it was still unclear what church membership strictly required. Some theorized, for instance, that a “baptism of blood,” that is, martyrdom, would be enough to save unbaptized catechumens. Later theologians added a “baptism of desire,” which was either a desire to be baptized or the inclination to form such a desire, either way enough to secure saving membership in the church. In the first case, a person who is killed in an accident on her way to be baptized would nonetheless be in the church. In the second, even a virtuous pagan might be a church member. This “baptism of desire” was officially affirmed by the Roman Catholic Council of Trent in 1547.

With the split of the catholic movement into Roman Catholic and Eastern Orthodox branches, “the church” was understood in Western contexts to be specifically the Roman Catholic church. Thus, famously, in a papal bull of 1302, called by its first words Unam Sanctam (that is, “One Holy”), Pope Boniface VIII (r. 1294-1303) declared that outside the Roman Catholic church, “there is neither salvation nor remission of sins,” and “it is altogether necessary to salvation for every human creature to be subject to” the pope. (Plantinga 1999, 124-5; Neuner and Dupuis 2001, 305) Note that this might still be interpreted with or without the various non-standard ways to obtain church membership mentioned above. The context of this statement was not a discussion of the fate of non-Christians, but rather a political struggle between the pope and the king of France.

In the Decree for the Copts of the General Council of Florence (1442), a papal bull issued by pope Eugene IV (r. 1431-47), for the first time in an official Roman Catholic doctrinal document the slogan was asserted not only with respect to heretics and schismatics, but also concerning Jews and pagans. (Neuner and Dupuis 2001, 309-10) It also seems to close the door to non-standard routes to church membership, saying that “never was anyone, conceived by a man and a woman, liberated from the devil’s dominion except by faith in our Lord Jesus Christ.” (Tanner 1990, 575) Non-Catholics will “go into the everlasting fire…unless they are joined to the catholic church before the end of their lives…nobody can be saved, no matter how much he has given away in alms and even if has shed his blood in the name of Christ, unless he has persevered in the bosom and the unity of the catholic church.” (Tanner 1990, 578)

This exclusivistic or “rigorist” way of understanding the slogan, on which only the Roman Catholic church could provide the “cure” needed by all humans, was the most common Catholic stance on religious diversity until mid-nineteenth century. But some had always held on to theories about ways into the church other than water baptism, and since the European discovery of the New World it had become clear that the gospel had not been preached to the whole world, and many held that such pagans were non-culpably ignorant of the gospel. This view was affirmed by Pope Pius X (r. 1846-78) in his Singulari Quadam (1854): “outside the Apostolic Roman Church no one can be saved…On the other hand…those who live in ignorance of the true religion, if such ignorance be invincible, are not subject to any guilt in this matter before the eyes of the Lord.” (Neuner and Dupuis 2001, 311)

Nineteenth century popes condemned Enlightenment-inspired theories of religion pluralism about truth and salvation, then called “indifferentism,” it being, allegedly, indifferent which major religion one chose, since all were of equal value. At the same time, they argued that many people who are outside the one church cannot be blamed for this, and so will not be condemned by God.

Such views are consistent with exclusivism in the sense that Roman Catholic Christianity is the one divinely provided and so most effective instrument of salvation, as well as the most true religion, and the “true religion” in the sense that any claim which contradicts it official teaching is false. Letters by Pius XII (r. 1939-58) declared that a “by an unconscious desire and longing” non-Catholics may enjoy a saving relationship with the church. (Dupuis 2001, 127-9) Whether these non-Catholics are thought to be in the church by a non-standard means, or whether they are said to be not in the church “in reality” but only “in desire,” it was held that they were saved by God’s grace. (Neuner and Dupuis 2001, 329)

Since the Vatican II council (1962-5), many Catholic theologians have embraced what most philosophers will consider some form of inclusivism rather than a suitably qualified exclusivism, with a minority opting for some sort of pluralism. (On the majority inclusivism, see section 4b below.) The impetus for this change was fueled by statements from that council (their Latin titles: Lumen Gentium, Ad Gentes, Nostra Aetate, Gaudium et Spes, Heilsoptimismus), which are in various ways positive towards non-Catholics. One asserts not merely the possibility, but the actuality of salvation for those who are inculpably ignorant of the gospel but who seek God and try to follow his will as expressed through their own conscience. Another, without saying that people may be saved through membership in them, affirms various positive values in other religions, including true teachings, which serve as divinely ordained preparations for reception the gospel. Catholics are exhorted to patient, friendly dialogue with members of other religions. (Dupuis 2000, 161-5) Some Catholic theologians have seen the seeds or even the basic elements of inclusivism in these statements, while others view them as within the orbit of a suitably articulated exclusivism. (Dupuis 2000, 165-170) A key area of disagreement is whether or not these imply that a person may be saved by means of their participation in some other religion. Still other Catholic theologians have found these moves to be positive but not nearly different enough from the more pessimistic sort of exclusivism. Such theologians, prominently Hans Küng (b. 1928) and Paul Knitter (b. 1939), have formulated various pluralist theories. (Kärkkäinen 2003, 197-204, 309-17)

Protestant versions of exclusivism can be at least as strict as Augustine’s. Recently called “restrictivism,” this position insists that explicit knowledge of the gospel of Jesus Christ is necessary for salvation, and there is no hope for those who die without having heard the gospel. (McDermott and Netland 2014, 148) But these are sometimes tempered with loopholes such as: a universal chance to hear the gospel at or after death, a free pass to people who die before the “age of accountability,” or the view that less was required to be saved in pre-Christian times. Another view which is taken by Bible-oriented evangelical Protestants allows the possibility of non-Christians receiving saving grace, but is firmly agnostic as to whether this actually occurs, and if it does, how often, because of the paucity of relevant biblical statements. (McDermott and Netland 2014) Other Protestants choose forms of inclusivism similar to Rahner’s (see 4b below).

4. Inclusivism

a. Terminological Problems

On the one hand, it is difficult to consistently distinguish inclusivism from exclusivism, because the latter nearly always concedes some significant value to other religions. “Inclusivism” for some authors just means a friendlier or more open-minded exclusivism. On the other hand, many theorists want to adopt the friendly and broad-minded sounding label “pluralism” for their theory, even though they clearly hold that one religion is uniquely valuable. For example, both Christians and Buddhists have adopted religious-diversity-celebrating rhetoric while clearly denying anything described above in this article as a kind of “pluralism” about religious diversity. (Dupuis 2001; Burton 2010)

b. Abrahamic Inclusivisms

Historically, Jewish intellectuals have usually adopted an inclusivist rather than an exclusivist view about other religions. A typical Rabbinic view is that although non-Jews may be reconciled to God, and thus gain life in the world to come, by keeping a lesser covenant which God has made with them, still Jews enjoy a better covenant with God. Beginning in the late twentieth century, however, some Jewish thinkers have argued for pluralism along the lines of various Christian authors, revising traditional Jewish theology. (Cohn-Sherbok 2005)

Since the latter twentieth century many Roman Catholic theologians have explored non-exclusivist options. As explained above (section 3c) a major impetus for this has been statements issued by the latest official council (Vatican II, 1962-5). One goes so far as to say that “the Holy Spirit offers to all [humans] the possibility of being associated, in a way known to God, with the Paschal Mystery [that is, the saving death and resurrection of Jesus].” (Gaudium et Spes 22, quoted in Dupuis 2001, 162) Some Catholic theologians see the groundwork or beginning in these documents for an inclusivist theory, on which other religions have saving value.

Influential German theologian Karl Rahner (1904-84), in his essay “Christianity and the Non-Christian Religions,” argues that before people encounter Christianity, other religions may be the divinely appointed means of their salvation. Insofar as they in good conscience practice what is good in their religion, people in other religions receive God’s grace and are “anonymous Christians,” people who are being saved through Christ, though they do not realize it. All Christians believe that some were saved before Christianity, through Judaism. So too at least some other religions must still be means for salvation, though not necessarily to the same degree, for God wills the salvation of all humankind. But these lesser ways should and eventually will give way to Christianity, the truest religion, intended for all humankind. (Plantinga 1999, 288-303)

Subsequent papal statements have moved cautiously in Rahner’s direction, affirming the work of the Holy Spirit not only in the people in other religions, but also in those religions themselves, so that in the practice of what is good in those religions, people may respond to God’s grace and be saved, unbeknownst to them, by Christ. Nonetheless, the Roman Catholic church remains the unique divine instrument; no one is saved without some positive relation to it. (Dupuis 2001, 170-9; Neuner and Dupuis 2001, 350-1)

Although many traditional Protestant Christians hold some form of exclusivism, others favor an inclusivism much like Rahner’s. (Peterson et. al. 2013, 333-40) Theologically liberal Protestants most often hold on to some form of religious pluralism.

As a relative latecomer which has always acknowledged the legitimacy of previous prophets, including Abraham, Moses, and Jesus, while proclaiming its prophet to be the greatest and last, Islam has, like Judaism, tended towards inclusivist views of other religions. The traditional Islamic perspective is that while in one sense “Islam” was initiated by Muhammad (570-632 CE), “Islam” in the sense of submission to God was taught by all prior prophets, and so their followers were truly Muslims, that is, truly submitted to God. Still, given that Muhammad is the seal of the prophets, his teachings and practices should, and some day will supersede all previous ones. Recent Islamic thinkers have independently come to conclusions parallel to those of Rahner, while critiquing various pluralist theories as entailing the sin of unbelief (kufr), the rejection of Islam.

It is a matter of dispute whether certain famous Sufi Muslims such as Rumi (1207-73) and Ibn ‘Arabi (1165-1240) have held to some form of religious pluralism. (Legenhausen 2006, 2009)

c. Buddhist Inclusivisms

While there have been Buddhist teachers and movements who have been exclusivists, in general Buddhism has been inclusivist. Buddhism has long been very doctrinally diverse, and many schools of Buddhism argue that theirs is the truest teaching or the best practice, while other versions of the dharma are less true or less conducive to getting the cure, and have now been superseded. It has been typical also for Buddhist thinkers to hold that at best, the same is true of other religious traditions. (Burton 2010) On the other hand, some religions’ teachings are simply false and their practices are unhelpful; the contents of their prescribed beliefs and practices matter.

Some Buddhist texts teach that there can be a solitary Buddha (pratyekabuddha), a person who has gained enlightenment by his own efforts, independently of Buddhist teaching. Such a person is outside of the tradition, yet obtains the cure taught by the tradition. This is an inclusivist view about getting the cure, and about central religious truths. There are even cases of “Buddhists seeking to turn devotees of other religions traditions into ‘anonymous Buddhists’ who worship Buddhist deities without realizing that this is the case.” (Burton 2010, 11)

d. Plural Salvations Inclusivism

Forming his views by way of a detailed critique of various core and identist pluralist theories, Baptist theologian S. Mark Heim (b. 1950) proposes what he calls “a true religious pluralism,” which is nonetheless best understood as a version of inclusivism, as it allows its proponent to maintain the superiority of her own religion. (Heim 1995, 7)

Heim notes that pluralists like Hick insist on one true goal or “salvation” which is achieved by all the equally valuable religions, a goal which is proposed by the pluralist and which differs from those proposed by most of those religions. Heim suggests that we should instead assume that other religions both pursue and achieve real and distinct religious “salvations” (goals or ends). For instance, as an inclusivist Christian, Heim holds that Buddhists really do attain Nirvana. But doesn’t Christian tradition demand that each person eventually either achieves fellowship or union with God, or is irrevocably damned? Heim suggests that those who attain Nirvana would be, from a Christian perspective, either a subgroup of the saved or of the damned, depending on just what, metaphysically, is actually going on with such people. (Heim 1995, 163) This is consistent with the Christian thinking that the end pursued by Christians is in fact better than all others; thus, heaven is better than Nirvana. However, God has ordained Nirvana as a goal suitable for some non-Christians to both pursue and attain. In this and in a later book Heim asserts that such a plurality of ordained religious goals is implied by the doctrine of the Trinity.

It is far from clear that Heim is correct that this stance will be consistent with the claims of the “home” religion. Importantly, he construes the various religious goals as “experiences” obtaining in this life and continuing beyond. (Heim 1995, 154-5, 161) This is an important qualifier, as various religious goals clearly presuppose contrary claims. For example, in Theravada Buddhism, one must realize that there is no self, whereas in Advaita Vedanta Hinduism one must gain awareness that one’s true self is none other than the ultimate reality, Brahman. Similarly, in Christianity, one must realize that one’s self is a sinner in need of God’s grace. It is impossible that all three experiences are veridical. But Heim’s theory does not require them to be, but only that they occur and may be plausibly thought of as fulfilling to those who have them.

Heim strenuously objects to pluralist theories that they impose uniformity on the various religions. However, his theory seems to depend crucially on the existence of many human problems, each of which may be solved by participation in some religion or other. In contrast, each of the various religions claims to have discerned the one fundamental problem facing humans, namely, the problem from which other problems derive. In the terms explained above, a religion claims to have a diagnosis (section 1 above). This seems incompatible with Heim’s agnosticism about which, if any, of the diagnosed problems is the fundamental one. If a religion cures only a shallow, derivative human problem, leaving the deeper problem intact, then what it offers would not deserve the name “salvation,” for it would leave those who achieve it still in need of the cure. (Peterson et. al. 2013, 333) For instance, if Theravada Buddhism is correct that humans are trapped in the cycle of rebirth by craving and ignorance, even if one goes to a heavenly realm upon death, such as envisaged by non-Buddhist religions, one is still trapped in samsara, in this realm of suffering, albeit at a higher tier. How can a Theravada Buddhists accept that such a heavenly next life is a good and final end for non-Buddhists? Again, if a Christian diagnosis is correct, that humans are alienated from and need to be reconciled to God, yet some manage to attain Nirvana, they would still lack the cure, for it is no part of Nirvana that one is reconciled to God.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Abe, Masao. “A Dynamic Unity in Religious Pluralism: A Proposal from the Buddhist Point of View.” The Experience of Religious Diversity. Ed. John Hick and Hasan Askari. Brookfield, Connecticut: Gower Publishing Company, 1985. 167-227. Partially reprinted in Readings in Philosophy of Religion: East Meets West. Ed. Andrew Eshleman. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 2008. 395-404.
    • Presents an ultimist pluralism modeled on the Mahayana Buddhist “three bodies of the Buddha” doctrine.
  • Bogardus, Tomas. “The Problem of Contingency for Religious Belief,” Faith and Philosophy 30.4 (2013): 371-92.
    • Rebuts sophisticated arguments by Hick, Kitcher, and others, that you cannot know that some religious claim is true because had you been born in another place or time, you would not have believed that claim.
  • Burton, David. “A Buddhist Perspective.” The Oxford Handbook of Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010. 321-36.
    • Surveys Buddhist views on religious diversity.
  • Byrne, Peter. Prolegomena to Religious Pluralism: Reference and Realism in Religion. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1995.
    • Explores in depth without endorsing an identist religious pluralism.
  • Byrne, Peter. “It is not Reasonable to Believe that Only One Religion is True.” Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Religion. Ed. Michael Peterson and Raymond VanArragon. Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2004. 201-10.
    • Argues for an identist pluralism and against “confessionalism” (either inclusivism or exclusivism).
  • Cohn-Sherbok, Dan. “Judaism and Other Faiths.” The Myth of Religious Superiority: A Multifaith Exploration. Ed. Paul F. Knitter. Maryknoll, New York: Orbis Books, 2005. 119-32.
    • An overview of traditional, inclusivist Jewish views of other religions, then arguing that Jewish theology should be revised to accommodate an identist pluralism.
  • Cooper, John W. Panentheism: The Other God of the Philosophers: From Plato to the Present. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Baker Academic, 2006.
    • Chapter 7 is an accessible introduction to the metaphysics and theology of Whitehead and Hartshorne, without which the ultimist pluralism of Cobb and Griffin can’t be understood.
  • Datta, Narendra [Swami Vivekananda]. “Hinduism.” The Penguin Swami Vivekananda Reader. Ed. Makarand Paranjape. New Delhi: Penguin Books India, 2005 [1893]. 43-55.
    • One of several hit speeches given at the first World Parliament of Religions in Chicago in 1893, asserting that all religions share one object and goal, although Hinduism is more tolerant, peaceful, and flexible than other traditions.
  • de Cea, Abraham Vélez. “A Cross-cultural and Buddhist-Friendly Interpretation of the Typology Exclusivism-Inclusivism-Pluralism.” Sophia 50 (2011): 453-80.
    • An attempt to clarify and expand the common trichotomy, adding a fourth category, “pluralistic inclusivism.”
  • Dupuis, Jacques. Toward a Christian Theology of Religious Pluralism. Maryknoll, New York: Orbis Books, 2001 [1997].
    • Survey of the long evolution of Roman Catholic thought on religious diversity, arguing for an inclusivist theory.
  • Feuerbach, Ludwig. Lectures on the Essence of Religion. Translated by Ralph Manheim. New York: Harper and Row, 1967 [1851]
    • A naturalistic, humanistic, atheistic critique of belief in God as a product of human desire and imagination; a form of negative pluralism.
  • Griffin, David Ray. “Religious Pluralism: Generic, Identist, Deep.” Deep Religious Pluralism. Ed. David Ray Griffin. Louisville, Kentucky: Westminster John Knox Press, 2005a. 3-38.
    • Surveys sophisticated recent pluralist theories by Hick, Smith, Knitter, Cobb, and criticisms of these. Argues for the superiority of his own ultimist (“deep”) religious pluralism.
  • Griffin, David Ray. “John Cobb’s Whiteheadian Complementary Pluralism.” Deep Religious Pluralism. Ed. David Ray Griffin. Louisville, Kentucky: Westminster John Knox Press, 2005b. 39-66.
    • Presentation of ultimist pluralism as developed by Cobb and Griffin.
  • Hasker, William. “The Many Gods of Hick and Mavrodes,” Evidence and Religious Belief. Ed. Kelly James Clark and Raymond J. VanArragon. New York: Oxford University Press, 2011. 186-98.
    • Critical discussion of Hick’s views on the personae and impersonae of religious experience, which are supposed to be manifestations of the Ultimate Reality.
  • Heim, S. Mark. Salvations: Truth and Difference in Religion. Maryknoll, New York: Orbis, 1995.
    • Critiques various pluralistic theories as insufficiently respectful of the real differences between religions and proposes a plural salvations inclusivism.
  • Hick, John. God Has Many Names. Philadelphia: The Westminster Press, 1982 [1980].
    • A short book written at a crucial juncture in Hick’s thinking about religious diversity; probably the best place to start in understanding Hick’s views.
  • Hick, John. The Rainbow of Faiths [U.S. title: A Christian Theology of Religions: The Rainbow of Faiths]. London: SCM Press, 1995.
    • A short and popular exposition of, and development of his mature views as expounded in his 1989 An Interpretation; mostly written in the form of imagined dialogues.
  • Hick, John. “The Epistemological Challenge of Religious Pluralism.” Faith and Philosophy 14.3 (1997): 277-86. Reprinted in Hick 2010, 25-36.
    • Argues that religious exclusivism and inclusivism face devastating epistemological problems; see Hick 2010 for his exchanges with some leading Christian philosophers about this piece.
  • Hick, John. “Ineffability,” Religious Studies 36.1 (2000): 35-46. Reprinted in Hick 2010, ch. 3.
    • Replies to criticisms of the ineffability or trancategoriality of “the Real” by Rowe and Insole.
  • Hick, John. An Interpretation of Religion: Human Responses to the Transcendent, 2nd ed. New Haven, Connecticut: Yale University Press, 2004 [1989].
    • The main exposition of what is widely considered the best-developed pluralist theory (esp. ch. 14-16), espousing the practical equality of “post-axial” religions (ch. 2-4). Its long introduction summarizes his replies to many critics.
  • Hick, John, ed. Dialogues in the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Palgrave-MacMillan, 2010 [2001].
    • Reprints and continues Hick’s exchanges in the late 1990s with a number of prominent philosophers and theologians.
  • Hick, John. “Response to Hasker.” Evidence and Religious Belief. Ed. Kelly James Clark and Raymond J. VanArragon. New York: Oxford University Press, 2011. 199-201.
    • Hick clarifies his claims regarding the personae and impersonae by means of which people interact with the Ultimate Reality.
  • Ignatius of Antioch, “The Letter of Ignatius to the Philadelphians,” in The Apostolic Fathers: Greek Texts and English Translations, 3rd ed. Ed. Michael W. Holmes. Grand Rapids, Michigan: BakerAcademic, 2007. 236-47.
    • Early Christian writing, probably from the first half of the second century, in which the bishop says that followers of schismatic leaders will not be saved.
  • Kärkkäinen, Veli-Matti. An Introduction to the Theology of Religions. Biblical, Historical, and Contemporary Perspectives. Downers Grove, Illinois: InterVarsity Press, 2003.
    • Wide-ranging discussion of Christian responses to religious diversity from biblical times up till the present, valuable for its summaries of ancient, early modern, and recent theological sources.
  • King, Nathan. “Religious Diversity and its Challenges to Religious Belief.” Philosophy Compass 3/4 (2008): 830-53.
    • Lucid survey of varieties of exclusivism, inclusivism, the identist pluralism of John Hick, and epistemological difficulties arising from disagreements about religious matters.
  • Kiblinger, Kristin. Buddhist Inclusivism: Attitudes Towards Religious Others. Burlington, Vermont: Ashgate, 2005.
    • Sympathetic description and criticism of Buddhist inclusivism by a non-Buddhist scholar.
  • Legenhausen, Hajj Muhammad [Gary Carl] “Why I am not a Traditionalist.” 2002.
    • Online overview of traditionalist core pluralism and critique from the perspective of Shia Islam.
  • Legenhausen, Hajj Muhammad [Gary Carl]. “A Muslim’s Proposal: Non-Reductive Religious Pluralism.” 2006.
    • Insightful online article classifying theories of religious pluralism and arguing for what the author calls “non-reductive pluralism” (here described as an example of Abrahamic Inclusivism, 4b above) by a philosopher who is an American convert to Shia Islam.
  • Legenhausen, Hajj Muhammad [Gary Carl]. “On the Plurality of Religious Pluralisms.” International Journal of Hekmat 1 (2009): 6-42.
    • The most comprehensive classification of varieties of theories of religious pluralism.
  • Long, Jeffery D. “Anekanta Vedanta: Towards a Deep Hindu Religious Pluralism.” Deep Religious Pluralism. Ed. David Ray Griffin. Louisville, Kentucky, 2005. 130-57.
    • Exploration of ultimist (“deep”) religious pluralism by a scholar who is an American convert to Hinduism; argues that whether or not “Hinduism” is pluralistic or inclusivist depends on whether it is understood as Vedic tradition, Indian tradition, or Sanatana Dharma [eternal religion].
  • Long, Jeffery D. “Universalism in Hinduism.” Religion Compass 5/6 (2011): 214-23.
    • Survey of historical and recent pluralist theories in Hinduism (here called versions of “universalism”) and criticisms thereof.
  • Mawson, T.J. “‘Byrne’s’ religious pluralism.” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 58.1 (2005): 37-54.
    • Negative critique of the identist pluralism of Peter Byrne.
  • McDermott, Gerald and Netland, Harold. A Trinitarian Theology of Religions: An Evangelical Proposal. New York: Oxford University Press, 2014.
    • A recent evangelical Protestant version of exclusivism, embedded in a Christian theology of religions.
  • Meeker, Kevin. “Exclusivism, Pluralism, and Anarchy.” God Matters: Readings in the Philosophy of Religion. Ed. Raymond Martin and Christopher Bernard. New York: Pearson, 2003. 524-35.
    • Shows how versions of exclusivism, inclusivism, and pluralism can be viewed on a continuum, as excluding more or fewer religions; contrasts Hick’s “altruistic pluralism” with an more open-minded but less plausible “anarchic pluralism.”
  • Morales, Frank [Sri Dharma Pravartaka Acharya]. Radical Universalism: Does Hinduism Teach That All Religions Are the Same? New Delhi: Voice of India, 2008.
    • American-born Hindu teacher and scholar argues against the pluralism of Datta [Vivekananda] and Chattopadhyay [Ramakrishna] that it is: incoherent, inconsistent with the facts of religious diversity, foreign to Hinduism, relativistic, intolerant, destructive of Hinduism, and based on misinterpretations of Hindu scriptures.
  • Netland, Harold. Encountering Religious Pluralism: The Challenge to Christian Faith and Mission. Downers Grove, Illinois: InterVarsity Press, 2001.
    • A defense of Christian “particularism” (compatible with the descriptions “exclusivism” or “inclusivism” in this article) by an evangelical theologian, with summaries of earlier missionary literature and criticisms of pluralist theories.
  • Neuner, Josef and Dupuis, Jacques, eds. The Christian Faith in the Doctrinal Documents of the Catholic Church, Seventh Revised and Enlarged Edition. Bangalore: St. Peter’s Seminary, 2001.
    • Collection of Roman Catholic primary sources, including documents relating to the uniqueness of Catholicism, the idea that there is no salvation outside the church, and views on non-Catholic Christianity and non-Christian religions.
  • O’Connor, Timothy. “Religious Pluralism.” Reason for the Hope Within. Ed. Michael Murray. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Eerdmans, 1999. 165-81
    • Defends “exclusivism” (rejection of any pluralism) against arguments that it is arbitrary, arrogant, or irrational, and argues that Hickian identist pluralism is incoherent.
  • Peterson, Michael. et. al. Reason and Religious Belief, 5th ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2013.
    • Leading philosophy of religion textbook with excellent chapter (14) on pluralism, exclusivism, and inclusivism.
  • Plantinga, Cornelius, ed. Christianity and Plurality: Classic and Contemporary Readings. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 1999.
    • Collection of Christian documents concerning religious diversity, starting with the Bible and ending with a statement by Pope John Paul II.
  • Prothero, Stephen. God is Not One. The Eight Rival Religions that Run the World – and Why Their Differences Matter. New York: HarperOne, 2010.
    • Introductory overview of eight religious traditions which aims to undermine “the new orthodoxy” of naive or core pluralism.
  • Quinn, Philip L. and Kevin Meeker, eds. The Philosophical Challenge of Religious Diversity. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • Important anthology of philosophical pieces, largely consisting of attacks on and defenses of Hick’s identist pluralism.
  • Rowe, William. “Religious Pluralism.” Religious Studies 35.2 (1999): 139-50.
    • Argues that Hick’s central claim that the Ultimate Reality is ineffable is incoherent.
  • Schmidt-Leukel, Perry. “Exclusivism, Inclusivism, Pluralism: The Tripolar Typology – Clarified and Reaffirmed.” The Myth of Religious Superiority: A Multifaith Exploration. Ed. Paul F. Knitter. Maryknoll, New York: Orbis Books, 2005, 13-27.
    • Catalogues and responds to the many objections various authors have given to the standard trichotomy, and precisely defines it in terms of giving knowledge sufficient to give people the cure which religion offers.
  • Sedgwick, Mark. Against the Modern World: Traditionalism and the Secret Intellectual History of the Twentieth Century. New York: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • Intellectual history of “traditionalism” or “perennialism” (core pluralism).
  • Sharma, Arvind. “All religions are – equal? one? true? same?: a critical examination of some formulations of the Neo-Hindu position.” Philosophy East and West 29.1 (January 1979): 59-72.
    • An attempt to clarify the sort of pluralism popular in Hinduism since Datta.
  • Sharma, Arvind. A Hindu Perspective on the Philosophy of Religion. London: MacMillan, 1990.
    • Chapter 9 is a basic introduction to the pluralistic orientation of modern Hinduism, interacting with a few western scholars (W.A. Christian, W.C. Smith, and Hick).
  • Sharma, Arvind. The Concept of Universal Religion in Modern Hindu Thought. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1999.
    • Surveys the views of leading 19th and 20th century Hindu intellectuals on the theme of “universal religion,” which can be an (alleged) fact or an unrealized ideal; some versions of religious pluralism are discussed.
  • Smart, Ninian. Dimensions of the Sacred: An Anatomy of the World’s Beliefs. Berkeley, California: University of California Press, 1996.
    • Presents a seven-fold analysis of the different aspects of religious traditions.
  • Smith, Huston. Forgotten Truth: The Common Vision of the World’s Religions. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco, 1992 [1976].
    • Thorough presentation of a core pluralism, as a part of what he calls “perennial philosophy,” or “traditionalism.”
  • Smith, Huston. Beyond the Postmodern Mind: The Place of Meaning in a Global Civilization, Updated and Revised. Wheaton, Illinois: Quest Books, 2003 [1982].
    • Further exposition of Smith’s “perennial philosophy,” put in the context of his diagnoses of the historical mistakes of “Modern” and “Postmodern” thinking, and his practical suggestions for the future.
  • Smith, Huston. “No Wasted Journey: A Theological Autobiography.” The Huston Smith Reader. Ed. Huston Smith and Jeffrey Paine. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2012, 3-12.
    • Smith explains his journey from Christian to religious naturalist to eclectic seeker to perennialist core pluralist.
  • Stenmark, Mikael. “Religious Pluralism and the Some-Are-Equally-Right View.” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 2 (2009): 21-35.
    • Articulates the position named in the title as an alternative to the exclusivism-inclusivism-pluralism trichotomy, in part motivated by what he calls “the problem of emptiness” for Hick’s pluralism – roughly, that his (nearly) inconceivable Real is irrelevant to any religious concerns.
  • Tanner, Norman, ed. Decrees of the Ecumenical Councils, Volume One: Nicea I to Lateran V. Washington, D.C.: Georgetown University Press, 1990.
    • First of two volumes with the official original language texts and English translations of all twenty-one official councils recognized by the Roman Catholic church; the “Bull of union with the Copts” from the council of Florence (1442) expresses an exclusivist stance.
  • Yandell, Keith. Philosophy of Religion: A Contemporary Introduction. New York: Routledge, 1999.
    • Focuses on the differences between monotheistic religions, Advaita Vedanta Hinduism, Jainism, and Theravada Buddhism, with a thorough critique of Hick’s pluralism. (ch. 6)
  • Yandell, Keith. “Has Normative Religious Pluralism a Rationale?” Can Only One Religion Be True? Paul Knitter and Harold Netland in Dialogue Ed. Robert B. Stewart. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 2013, 163-79.
    • Spirited attack on pluralist theories as poorly motivated and inconsistent with traditional religious beliefs.


Author Information

Dale Tuggy
State University of New York at Fredonia
U. S. A.