Religious Epistemology

Belief in God, or some form of transcendent Real, has been assumed in virtually every culture throughout human history. The issue of the reasonableness or rationality of belief in God or particular beliefs about God typically arises when a religion is confronted with religious competitors or the rise of atheism or agnosticism. In the West, belief in God was assumed in the dominant Jewish, Christian and Islamic religions. God, in this tradition, is the omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good and all-loving Creator of the universe (such a doctrine is sometimes called ‘bare theism’). This article considers the following epistemological issues: reasonableness of belief in the Judeo-Christian-Muslim God (“God,” for short), the nature of reason, the claim that belief in God is not rational, defenses that it is rational, and approaches that recommend groundless belief in God or philosophical fideism.

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

Table of Contents

  1. Reason/Rationality
  2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God
  3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God
    1. Theistic Evidentialism
    2. Sociological Digression
    3. Moral Analogy
    4. Reformed Epistemology
    5. Religious Experience
    6. Internalism/Externalism
    7. The Rational Stance
    8. Objections to Reformed Epistemology
  4. Groundless Believing
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Reason/Rationality

Reason is a fallible human tool for discovering truth or grasping reality. Although reason aims at the truth, it may fall short. In addition, rationality is more a matter of how one believes than what one believes. For example, one might irrationally believe something that is true: suppose one believed that the center of the earth is molten metal because one believes that he or she travels there every night (while it’s cool). And one might rationally believe what is false: it was rational for most people twenty centuries ago to believe that the earth is flat. And finally, rationality is person and situation specific: what is rational for one person at a particular socio-historical time and place might not be rational for another person at a different time and place; or, for that matter, what is rational for a person in the same time and place may be irrational for another person in the same time and place. This has relevance for a discussion of belief in God because “the rationality of religious belief” is typically discussed abstractly, independent of any particular believer and often believed to be settled once and for all either positively or negatively (say, by Aquinas or Hume respectively). The proper question should be, “Is belief in God rational for this person in that time and place?”

Rationality is a normative property possessed by a belief or a believer (although I’ve given reasons in the previous paragraph to suggest that rationality applies more properly to believers than to beliefs). Just precisely what this normative property is is a matter of great dispute. Some believe that we have intellectual duties (for example, to acquire true beliefs and avoid false beliefs, or to believe only on the basis of evidence or argument). Some deny that we have intellectual duties because, by and large, beliefs are not something we freely choose (e.g., look outside at a tree, consider the tree and try to choose not to believe that there’s a tree there; or, close your eyes and if you believe in God, decide not to believe or vice versa and now decide to believe in God again). Since we only have duties when we are free to fulfill or to not fulfill them (“Ought implies can”), we cannot have intellectual duties if we aren’t free to directly choose our beliefs. So, the normative property espoused by such thinkers might be intellectual permissibility rather than intellectual duty.

Since the time of the Enlightenment, reason has assumed a huge role for (valid or strong) inference: rationality is often a matter of assembling available (often empirical, typically propositional) evidence and assessing its deductive or inductive support for other beliefs; although some beliefs may and must be accepted without inference, the vast majority of beliefs or, more precisely, the vast majority of philosophical, scientific, ethical, theological and even common-sensical beliefs rationally require the support of evidence or argument. This view of reason is often taken ahistorically: rationality is simply a matter of timeless and non-person indexed propositional evidence and its logical bearing on the conclusion. If it can be shown that an argument is invalid or weak, belief in its conclusion would be irrational for every person in every time and place. This violates the viable intuition that rationality is person- and situation- specific. Although one argument for belief in God might be invalid, there might be other arguments that support belief in God. Or, supposing all of the propositional evidence for God’s existence is deficient, a person may have religious experience as the grounds of her belief in God.

Following Thomas Reid, we shall argue that ‘rationality’ in many of the aforementioned important cases need not, indeed cannot, require (valid or strong) inference. Our rational cognitive faculties include a wide variety of belief-producing mechanisms, few of which could or should pass the test of inference. We will let this view, and its significance for belief in God, emerge as the discussion proceeds.

2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God

Belief in God is considered irrational for two primary reasons: lack of evidence and evidence to the contrary (usually the problem of evil, which won’t be discussed in this essay). Note that both of these positions reject the rationality of belief in God on the basis of an inference. Bertrand Russell was once asked, if he were to come before God, what he would say to God. Russell replied, “Not enough evidence God, not enough evidence.” Following Alvin Plantinga, we will call the claim that belief in God lacks evidence and is thus irrational the evidentialist objection to belief in God.

The roots of evidentialism may be found in the Enlightenment demand that all beliefs be subjected to the searching criticism of reason; if a belief cannot survive the scrutiny of reason, it is irrational. Kant’s charge is clear: “Dare to use your own reason.” Given increasing awareness of religious options, Hobbes would ask: “If one prophet deceive another, what certainty is there of knowing the will of God, by any other way than that of reason?” Although the Enlightenment elevation of Reason would come to be associated with a corresponding rejection of rational religious belief, many of the great Enlightenment thinkers were themselves theists (including, for example, Kant and Hobbes).

The evidentialist objection may be formalized as follows:

(1) Belief in God is rational only if there is sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(2) There is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(3) Therefore, belief in God is irrational.

The evidentialist objection is not offered as a disproof of the existence of God—that is, the conclusion is not “God does not exist.” Rather the conclusion is, even if God were to exist, it would not be reasonable to believe in God. According to the evidentialist objection, rational belief in God hinges on the success of theistic arguments. Prominent evidentialist objectors include David Hume, W. K. Clifford, J. L. Mackie, Bertrand Russell and Michael Scriven. This view is probably held by a large majority of contemporary Western philosophers. Ironically, in most areas of philosophy and life, most philosophers are not (indeed could not be) evidentialists. We shall treat this claim shortly.

The claim that there is not sufficient evidence for belief in God is usually based on a negative assessment of the success of theistic proofs or arguments. Following Hume and Kant, the standard arguments for the existence of God—cosmological, teleological and ontological—are judged to be defective in one respect or another.

The claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument is usually rooted in a view of the structure of knowledge that has come to be known as ‘classical foundationalism.’ Classical foundationalists take a pyramid or a house as metaphors for their conceptions of knowledge or rationality. A secure house or pyramid must have secure foundations sufficient to carry the weight of each floor of the house and the roof. A solid, enduring house has a secure foundation with each of the subsequent floors properly attached to that foundation. Ultimately, the foundation carries the weight of the house. In a classical foundationalist conception of knowledge, the foundational beliefs must likewise be secure, enduring and adequate to bear “the weight” of all of the non-foundational or higher-level beliefs. These foundational beliefs are characterized in such a manner to ensure that knowledge is built on a foundation of certitudes (following Descartes). The candidates for these foundational certitudes vary from thinker to thinker but, broadly speaking, reduce to three: if a belief is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible, it is a proper candidate for inclusion among the foundations of rational belief.

What sorts of beliefs are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible? A self-evident belief is one that, upon understanding it, you see it to be true. While this definition is probably not self-evident, let’s proceed to understand it by way of example. Read the following fairly quickly:

(4) When equals are added to equals you get equals.

Do you think (4) is true? False? Not sure? Let me explain it. When equals (2 and 1+1) are added to equals (2 and 1+1) you get equals (4). Or, to make this clear 2 + 2 = 1 + 1 + 1 + 1. Now that you understand (4), you see it to be true. I didn’t argue for (4), I simply helped you to understand it, and upon understanding it, you saw it to be true. That is, (4) is self-evident. Typical self-evident beliefs include the laws of logic and arithmetic and some metaphysical principles like “An object can’t be red all over and blue all over at the same time.” A proposition is evident to the senses in case it is properly acquired by the use of one’s five senses. These sorts of propositions include “The grass is green,” “The sky is blue,” “Honey tastes sweet,” and “I hear a mourning dove.” Some epistemologists exclude propositions that are evident to the senses from the foundations of knowledge because of their lack of certainty [the sky may be colorless as a piece of glass but simply refracts blue light waves; we may be sampling artificial (and not real) honey; or someone may be blowing a bird whistle; etc.]. In order to ensure certainty, some have shifted to incorrigibility as the criterion of foundational beliefs. Incorrigible beliefs are first-person psychological states (seeming or appearance beliefs) about which I cannot be wrong. For example, I might be mistaken about the color of the grass or sky but I cannot be mistaken about the following: “The grass seems green to me” or “The sky appears to me to be blue.” I might be mistaken about the color of grass, and so such a belief is not certain for me, but I can’t be wrong about what the color of grass seems to be to me.

Now let us return to belief in God. Why do evidentialists hold (1), the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument? This is typically because they subscribe to classical foundationalism. A belief can be held without argument or evidence only if it is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Belief in God is not self-evident—it is not such that upon understanding the notion of God, you see that God exists. For example, Bertrand Russell understands the proposition “God exists” but does not see it to be true. So, belief in God is not a good candidate for self-evidence. Belief in God is not evident to the senses because God, by definition, transcends the sensory world. God cannot be seen, heard, touched, tasted or smelled. When people make claims such as “God spoke to me” or “I touched God,” they are using “spoke” and “touched” in a metaphorical sense, not a literal sense; literally, God is beyond the senses. So God’s existence is not evident to the senses. And finally, a person might be wrong about God’s existence and so belief in God cannot be incorrigible. Of course, “it seems to me that God exists” could be incorrigible but God’s seeming existence is a long way from God’s existence!

So, belief in God is neither self-evident, evident to the senses, nor incorrigible. Therefore, belief in God, according to classical foundationalism, cannot properly be included among the foundations of one’s rational beliefs. And, if it is not part of the foundations, it must be adequately supported by the foundational beliefs—that is, belief in God must be held on the basis of other beliefs and so must be argued to, not from. According to classical foundationalism, belief in God is not rational unless it is supported by evidence or argument. Classical foundationalism, as assumed in the Enlightenment, elevated theistic arguments to a status never held before in the history of Western thought. Although previous thinkers would develop theistic arguments, they seldom assumed that they were necessary for rational belief in God. After the period of the Enlightenment, thinkers in the grips of classical foundationalism would now hold belief in God up to the demand of rigorous proof.

3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God

There are two main strategies theists employ when responding to the evidentialist objection to belief in God. The first strategy is to argue against the second premise, the claim that there is insufficient evidence for the existence of God. The second strategy is to argue against the first premise, the claim that belief in God is rational only if it is supported by sufficient evidence.

a. Theistic Evidentialism

Consider first the claim that there is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God. This view has been historically rejected by Aristotle, Augustine, Anselm, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, John Locke, William Paley and C. S. Peirce, to name but a few. But suppose we all agreed that the arguments offered by Aristotle and others for the existence of God were badly flawed. (“We know better now.”) Does that imply that earlier theists were irrational? Does the evidence have to support, in some timeless way—irrespective of any particular person—belief in God? Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, et al., were brilliant people doing the best they could with the most sophisticated belief-set available to them and judged, on the basis of their best lights, that the evidence supported belief in God. Are they nonetheless irrational? For example, suppose that, ignorant of the principle of inertia, Aquinas believed that God must be actively involved in the continual motion of the planets. That is, suppose that, using the best physics of his day, Aquinas believed in the scientific necessity of belief in God. According to his best lights, Aquinas thought that the evidence clearly supported belief in God. Would Aquinas be irrational? Evidentialist objectors might concede that Aquinas was not irrational, in spite of his bad arguments and, therefore, might not view rationality as being timeless. But, they would argue, it is no longer reasonable for anyone to believe in God because now we all see or should see that the evidence is clearly insufficient to support the conclusion that God exists. (This ‘we’ tends toward the princely philosophical.)

Some theists reject this conclusion, judging that there is adequate evidence to support God’s existence. Rejecting the idea that theistic arguments died along with Kant and Hume, these thinkers offer new evidence or refashion the old evidence for the existence of God. William Lane Craig (Craig and Smith 1993), for example, has developed a new version of the old Islamic Kalaam cosmological argument for the existence of God. This argument attempts to demonstrate the impossibility that time could have proceeded infinitely into the past so the universe must have had a beginning in time. In addition, both physicists and philosophers have argued that the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmological constants to permit human life is best explained by God’s intelligent superintendence. And some argue that irreducibly complex biological phenomena such as cells or kidneys could not have arisen by chance. Robert Merrihew Adams (1987) has revived moral arguments for the existence of God. Alvin Plantinga (1993b) has argued that naturalism and evolution are self-refuting. William Alston (1991) has defended religious experience as a source of justified belief in the existence of God. In addition, theistic arguments have been developed that are based on the existence of flavors, colors and beauty. And some thinkers, such as Richard Swinburne (1979, 1984), contend that the cumulative forces of these various kinds of evidence mutually reinforce the likelihood of God’s existence. Thus, there is an ample lot defending the claim that belief in God is rational based on the evidence (and an equal and opposite force opposing them). So the project of securing belief in God on the basis of evidence or argument is ongoing.

Many theists, then, concur with the evidentialist demand for evidence and seek to meet that demand by offering arguments that support the existence of God. Of course, these arguments have been widely criticized by atheistic evidentialists. But for better or for worse, many theistic philosophers have hitched the rationality of belief in God to the wagon of evidence.

Now suppose, as is the case, that the majority of philosophers believes that these attempts to prove God’s existence are feeble failures. Would that perforce make religious believers irrational? If one, by the best of one’s lights, judges that God exists given the carefully considered evidence, is one nonetheless irrational if the majority of the philosophical community happen to disagree? These questions suggest that judgments of rationality and irrationality are difficult to make. And, it suggests that rationality and irrationality may be more complicated than classical foundationalism assumes.

b. Sociological Digression

Very few philosophical positions (and this is an understatement) enjoy the kind of evidential support that classical foundationalism demands of belief in God; yet most of these are treated as rational. No philosophical position—belief in other minds, belief in the external world, the correspondence theory of truth or Quine’s indeterminacy of translation thesis—is properly based on beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Indeed, we may question whether there is a single philosophical position that has been so amply justified (or could be). Why is belief in God held to a higher evidential standard than other philosophical beliefs? Some suggest that this demand is simply arbitrary at best or intellectually imperialist at worst.

c. Moral Analogy

Consider your moral beliefs. None of these beliefs will be self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Now suppose you hold a moral belief that is not the philosophical fashion these days. Would you be irrational if the majority of contemporary philosophers disagreed with you? Perhaps you’d be irrational if moral beliefs contrary to yours could be established on the basis of widely known arguments from premises that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. But there may be no such arguments in the history of moral theory. Moral beliefs are not well-justified on the basis of argument or evidence in the classical foundationalist sense (or probably in any sense of “well-justified”). So, the fact that the majority of contemporary philosophers reject your moral beliefs (or belief in God for that matter) may have little or no bearing on the rationality of your beliefs. The sociological digression and moral analogy suggest that the philosophical emphasis on argument, certainty, and consensus for rationality might be misguided.

d. Reformed Epistemology

Let us now turn to those who reject the first premise of the evidentialist objection to belief in God, the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument. Recent thinkers such as Alvin Plantinga, Nicholas Wolterstorff and William Alston, in their so called Reformed Epistemology, have argued that belief in God does not require the support of evidence or argument in order for it to be rational (cf. Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983). In so doing, they reject the evidentialist objector’s assumptions about rationality.

Reformed epistemologists argue that the first problem with the evidentialist objection is that the universal demand for evidence simply cannot be met in a large number of cases with the cognitive equipment that we have. No one has ever been able to offer proofs for the existence of other persons, inductive beliefs (e.g., that the sun will rise in the future), or the reality of the past (perhaps, as Bertrand Russell cloyingly puzzled, we were created five minutes ago with our memories intact) that satisfy classical foundationalist requirements for proof. So, according to classical foundationalism, belief in the past and inductive beliefs about the future are irrational. This list could be extended indefinitely.

There is also a limit to the things that human beings can prove. If we were required to prove everything, there would be an infinite regress of provings. There must be some truths that we can just accept and reason from. Thus, we can’t help but trust our cognitive faculties. Moreover, it seems that we will reach the limit of proof very quickly if, as classical foundationalism insists, the basis for inference includes only beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. For these reasons, reformed epistemologists doubt that classical foundationalists are correct in claiming that the proper starting point of reason is self-evidence, evidence to the senses, and incorrigibility.

A second criticism of classical foundationalism, first offered by Plantinga, is that it is self-referentially inconsistent. That is, classical foundationalism must be rejected by its own account. Recall classical foundationalism (CF):

A proposition p is rational if and only if p is self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible or if p can be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible.

Consider CF itself. Is it rational, given its own conditions, to accept classical foundationalism? Classical foundationalism is not self-evident: upon understanding it many people believe it false. If one can understand a proposition and reject it, that proposition cannot be self-evident. CF is also not a sensory proposition—one doesn’t see, taste, smell, touch or hear it. So, classical foundationalism is not evident to the senses. And even if one should accept classical foundationalism, one might be wrong; so classical foundationalism is not incorrigible. Since classical foundationalism is neither self-evident, evident to the senses nor incorrigible, it can only be rationally maintained if it can be inferred from propositions that (ultimately) are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. Is that possible? Consider a representative set of evidential propositions, E, that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible:

Evidence (E):


    • When equals are added to equals you get equals.
    • 2 + 2 = 4
    • Grass is green.
    • The sky is blue.
    • Grass seems green to me.
    • The sky appears to me to be blue.


Limiting yourself to propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, you can expand this list as exhaustively as you like. We have enough in E to make our case. Given E as evidence, can CF be inferred? Is E adequate evidence for CF? It’s hard to imagine how it could be. Indeed all of the propositions in E are irrelevant to the truth of CF. E simply cannot logically support CF. So, CF is not self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, nor can CF be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. So, CF, by its own account, is irrational. If CF were true, it would be irrational to accept it. Better simply to reject it!

Thomas Reid (1710-1796), whom Plantinga and Wolterstorff follow, was an early critic of classical foundationalism. Reid argued that we have been outfitted with a host of cognitive faculties that produce beliefs that we can reason from (the foundations of believings). Plantinga calls these basic beliefs. The kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason to is a small subset of the kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason from. The latter must be accepted without the aid of proof. In most cases we must rely on our intellectual equipment to produce beliefs in the appropriate circumstances, without evidence or argument. For example, we simply find ourselves believing in other persons. A person is a center of self-conscious thoughts and feelings and first-person experience. While we can see a human face or a body, we can’t see another’s thoughts or feelings. Consider a person, Emily, whose leg is poked with a needle. We can see Emily recoil and her face screw up, and we can hear her yelp. So we can see Emily’s pain-behavior, but we cannot see her pain. The experience of pain is just the sort of inner experience that is typical of persons. For all we can know from Emily’s pain-behavior, she might be a cleverly constructed automaton (like Data of Star Trek fame or an exact human replica all the way down to the neurons). Or, for all we know, Emily might be a person just like us with the characteristic interior life and experience of persons. The point is, you can’t tell, just from Emily’s pain behavior, if she has any inner experience of pain. So you can’t tell by the things to which you have evidential access if Emily is a person. No one has ever been able to develop a successful argument to prove that there are other persons. So if classical foundationalism were true, it would not be reasonable to believe in the existence of other persons. But surely there are other persons whose existence it is reasonable to accept. So much the worse for classical foundationalism, Reidians say. Similar problems arise for classical foundationalism concerning beliefs in the past, the future, and the external world. No justification-conferring inference is or could be involved. Yet, the Reidian claims, we are perfectly within our epistemic rights in holding these basic beliefs. Thus, we should conclude that these beliefs are properly basic (that is, non-inferential but justified beliefs) and should reject classical foundationalism’s claim to the contrary.

Granting that a great many of our important beliefs are non-inferential, could one reasonably find oneself believing in God without evidence or argument? ‘Evidence’ is to be understood here as most evidentialists understand it, namely as the kind of propositional evidence one might find in a theistic argument and not the kind of experiential evidence typically thought to ground religious belief. Could belief in God be properly basic?

There are at least two reasons to believe that it might be rational for a person to accept belief in God without the support of an argument. The first is a parity argument. We must, by our nature, accept the deliverances of our cognitive faculties, including those that produce beliefs in the external world, other persons, that the future will be like the past, the reality of the past, and what other people tell us—just to name a few. For the sake of parity, we should trust the deliverances of the faculty that produces in us belief in the divine (what Plantinga (2000), following John Calvin, calls the sensus divinitatus, the sense of the divine). Of course, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. The second reason is that belief in God is more like belief in a person than belief in a scientific hypothesis. Human relations demand trust, commitment, and faith. If belief in God is more like belief in other persons than belief in atoms, then the trust that is appropriate to persons will be appropriate to God. William James offers a similar argument in “The Will to Believe.”

Reformed epistemologists hold that one can reasonably believe in God—immediately and basically—without the support of an argument. One’s properly functioning cognitive faculties can produce belief in God in the appropriate circumstances with or without argument or evidence.

e. Religious Experience

Although Plantinga contends that belief in God does not require the support of propositional evidence or argument (like a theistic proof) in order to be rational, he does contend that belief in God is not groundless. According to Plantinga, belief in God is grounded in characteristic religious experiences such as beholding the divine majesty on the top of a mountain or the divine creativity when noticing the articulate beauty of the flower. Other sorts of alleged religious experiences involve a sense of guilt (and forgiveness), despair, the inner testimony of the Holy Spirit, or direct contact with the divine (mysticism). The experience of many believers is so vivid that they describe it with sensory metaphors: they claim to see, hear or be touched by God.

It is important to note that people who believe on the basis of religious experience do not typically construe their belief in God as based on an argument (any more than belief in other persons is based on an argument). They believe they have seen or heard God directly and find themselves overwhelmed by belief in God. Religious experience is typically taken as self-authenticating. In good Reidian fashion, one might simply take it that one has a cognitive faculty that can be trusted when it produces belief in God when induced by the appropriate experiences; that is, one is permitted to trust one’s initial alleged religious experience as veridical, just as one must trust that others of one’s cognitive faculties are veridical. (It should be noted that Reid himself does not make this claim. He believes that God’s existence can and should be supported by argument.) Richard Swinburne alleges that it is also reasonable to trust what others tell us unless and until we have good reason to believe otherwise. So, it would be reasonable for someone who did not have a religious experience to trust the veridicality of someone who did claim to have a religious experience. That is, it would be reasonable for everyone, not just the subject of the alleged religious experience, to believe in God on the basis of that alleged religious experience.

Some philosophers reject religious experience as a proper ground for religious belief. While not denying that some people have had powerful, so-called mystical experiences, they deny that one can reliably infer from that experience that the source or cause of that experience was God. Even the most enthusiastic mystics contend that some mystical experiences are illusory. So, how does one sort out the veridical from the illusory without begging the question? And if other evidence must be brought in to assess the validity of religious experience, is not then religious belief based more on that evidence than on the immediate experience? William Alston (1991) responds to these sorts of challenges by noting that perceptual experience, which is seldom questioned, is afflicted with precisely the same problems. Yet we do not take perceptual beliefs to be suspect. Alston argues that if religious experiences and the beliefs they produce relevantly resemble perceptual experiences and the beliefs they produce, then we should not hold beliefs based upon religious experience to be suspect either.

f. Internalism/Externalism

Some of the most important issues concerning the rationality of religious belief are framed in terms of the distinction between internalism and externalism in epistemology. Philosophers who are internalists with respect to rationality argue that we can tell, from the inside so to speak, if our beliefs are rationally justified. The language used by the classical foundationalist to describe basic beliefs is thoroughly internalist. ‘Self-evident’ and ‘evident to the senses’ are suggestive of beliefs that have a certain inner, compelling and unquestionable luminosity; one can simply inspect one’s beliefs and “see” if they are evident in the appropriate respects. And since deductive inference transfers rational justification from lower levels to higher levels, by carefully checking the inferential relations among one’s beliefs, one can see this luminosity passing from basic to non-basic beliefs. So internalists believe that rationality is something that can be discerned by the mental inspection of one’s own beliefs, items to which one has direct cognitive access.

Plantinga, on the other hand, argues that modern foundationalism has misunderstood the nature of rational justification. Plantinga calls the special property that turns true belief into knowledge “warrant.” According to Plantinga, a belief has warrant for one if and only if that belief is produced by one’s properly functioning cognitive faculties in circumstances to which those faculties are designed to apply; in addition, those faculties must be designed for the purpose of producing true beliefs. So, for instance, my belief that ‘there is a computer screen in front of me’ is warranted only if it is produced by my properly functioning perceptual faculties (and not by weariness or dreaming), if no one is tricking me, say, by having removed my computer and replaced it with an exact painting of my computer (thereby messing up my cognitive environment), and if my perceptual faculties have been designed (by God) for the purpose of producing true beliefs. Only if all of these conditions are satisfied is my belief that there is a computer screen in front of me warranted.

Note the portions of Plantinga’s definition which are not within one’s internal or direct purview: whether or not one’s faculties are functioning properly, whether or not one’s faculties are designed by God, whether or not one’s faculties are designed for the production of true beliefs, whether or not one is using one’s faculties in the environment intended for their use (one might be seeing a mirage and taking it for real). According to Plantinga’s externalism we cannot acquire warrant simply by attending to our beliefs. Warranted belief (knowledge) depends on circumstances external to the believing agent and so is not entirely up to us. Warrant depends crucially upon whether or not conditions that are not under our direct rational purview or conscious control are satisfied. If externalism is correct, then classical foundationalism has completely misunderstood the nature of epistemic warrant.

g. The Rational Stance

Because of the possibility of error, those who accept belief in God as a basic belief should nonetheless be concerned with evidence for and against belief in God. Following Reid, Reformed epistemologists contend that belief begins with trust (not suspicion, as the evidentialist apparently claims). Beliefs are, in their terms, innocent until proven guilty rather than guilty until proven innocent. In order to grasp reality, we must use and trust our cognitive faculties or capacities. But we also know that we get things wrong. The deliverances of our cognitive faculties are not infallible. Reid, Plantinga and Wolterstorff are keenly aware of human fallibility and recognize the need for a deliberative (reasoning) faculty that helps us adjudicate apparent conflicts among beliefs delivered innocently by our cognitive faculties. Reid’s general approach to rational belief is this: trust the beliefs produced by your cognitive faculties in the appropriate circumstances, unless you have good reason to reject them.

Let’s press the problem of error. As shown by widespread disagreement, our cognitive faculties seem less reliable in matters of fundamental human concern such as the nature of morality, the nature of persons, social and political thought, and belief in God. Given that rationality is truth-aimed, Reformed epistemologists should be willing to do two things to make the attainment of that goal more likely. First, they ought to seek, as best they can, supporting evidence for immediately produced beliefs of fundamental human concern. Because evidence is truth-conducive, it can lend credence to a basic belief. It doesn’t follow that basic beliefs about morality, God, etc. are irrational until such evidence is adduced; but perhaps one’s epistemic status on these matters can be improved by obtaining confirming evidence. This would make Reformed epistemology a paradigmatic example of the Augustinian view of faith and reason: fides quaerens intellectum (faith seeking understanding). Second, they ought to be open to contrary evidence to root out false beliefs. Given the likelihood that they could be wrong about these matters, they ought not close themselves off to the possibility of epistemic correction. If Reformed epistemologists are sincere truth-seekers, they should take the following stance:

The Rational Stance: Trust the deliverances of reason, seek supporting evidence, and be open to contrary evidence.

According to Reformed epistemology, evidence may not be required for belief in God to be rational. But, given the problem of error, it should nonetheless continue to play an important role in the life of the believer. Fides quaerens intellectum.

h. Objections to Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology has been rejected for three primary reasons. First, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. Second, some philosophers argue that Reformed epistemology is too latitudinarian, permitting the rational acceptability of virtually any belief. Gary Gutting calls this ‘the Great Pumpkin Objection’ because Charlie Brown could have written a defense of the sensus pumpkinus that is parallel to Plantinga’s defense of the sensus divinitatus. Finally, Reformed epistemology has been rejected because it has been perceived to be a form of fideism. Fideism is the view that belief in God should be held in the absence of or even in opposition to reason. According to this traditional definition of fideism, Reformed epistemology does not count as a form of fideism because it goes to great lengths to show that belief in God is rational. However, if one defines fideism as the view that belief in God may be rightly held in the absence of evidence or argument, then Reformed epistemology will be a kind of fideism.

4. Groundless Believing

With their emphasis on reason, very few philosophers aspire to fideism. Nonetheless, some major thinkers have denied that reason plays any significant role in the life of the religious believer. Tertullian’s rhetorical question, “What has Jerusalem to do with Athens?”, is meant to elicit the view that faith (the Jerusalem of Jesus) has little or nothing to do with reason (the Athens of Socrates, Plato and Aristotle). Tertullian would go on to say, “I believe because it’s absurd.” Pascal (1623-1662), Kierkegaard (1813-1855) and followers of Wittgenstein (late 20th C.) have all been accused of fideism (which is the philosophical equivalent of calling a US citizen a “commie” in the 1950s). Let us consider their positions.

Pascal’s wager brings costs and benefits into the analysis of the rationality of religious belief. Given the possibility that God exists and that the unbeliever will be punished with eternal damnation and the believer rewarded with eternal bliss, Pascal argues that it is rational to wager that God exists. Using a rational, prudential decision procedure he asks us to consider placing a bet on God’s existence. If one bets on God, then either God exists and one enjoys an eternity of bliss or God does not exist and one loses very little. On the other hand, if one bets against God and wins, one gains very little, but if one loses that bet, then the one will suffer in hell forever. Prudence demands that one should believe in God’s existence. Pascal concludes: “Wager, then, that God exists.”

Pascal’s wager has been widely criticized, but we shall only consider here the relevance of the wager to Pascal’s view of faith and reason. The wager is just one of his many tools for shocking people into caring about their eternal destinies. After arguing that our desires affect our abilities to discern the truth, he tries to get our desires appropriately oriented toward the truth. The wager can stimulate the desire to seek the truth about God and, after one’s desires are changed, the ability to judge the evidences for Christianity properly. So, in spite of the prominence of the wager and its apparent disregard for evidence, Pascal appears to be a kind of evidentialist after all (but not a classical foundationalist).

Søren Kierkegaard’s emphasis on the role of inwardness or subjective appropriation has played a role in his being understood as a fideist. His reaction against both rationalism and dogmatism led him to view faith as a certain madness, a “leap” one makes beyond what is reasonable (a leap into the absurd). Some philosophers argue that Kierkegaard is simply emphasizing that faith is more than rational assent to the truth of a proposition, involving more fundamentally the passionate commitment of the heart.

Finally, followers of the enigmatic Ludwig Wittgenstein have defended the groundlessness of belief in God, a view that has been called “Wittgensteinian fideism.” Wittgenstein’s later works both noticed and affirmed the tremendous variety of our beliefs that are not held because of reasons—such beliefs are, according to Wittgenstein, groundless. Many of Wittgenstein’s most prominent students are religious believers, some of whom took his general insights into the structure of human belief and applied them to religious belief. Norman Malcolm, for example, favorably compares belief in God to the belief that things don’t vanish into thin air. Both are part of the untested and untestable framework of human belief. These frameworks form the system of beliefs within which testing of other beliefs can take place. While we can justify beliefs within the framework, we cannot justify the framework itself. The giving of reasons must come to an end. And then we believe, groundlessly.

5. Conclusion

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

In Western European countries, religious belief has waned since the time of the Enlightenment. Yet there are counter trends. Today over 90% of Americans profess belief in a higher power. In China, after decades of institutionally enforced atheism, religious belief is dramatically on the rise. And even though religious belief has waned among professional Anglo-American philosophers since the Enlightenment, many prominent Anglo-American philosophers are theists. What conclusions can be drawn from these sociological observations? That Reason will eventually triumph over superstition as all countries eventually follow Western Europe’s lead? That irrational religious belief is so stubbornly tenacious that Reason is incapable of wiping it out? That the natural tendency to believe in God is overlaid by various forms of sin (such as greed in the West or wicked Communism in the East)? That once the evidence is made clear to a deprived peoples, rational belief in God will flourish? Of course, these sociological facts are irrelevant to discussions of rational belief in God. Yet they are relevant to this: the persistence of religious belief in various contexts will continue to spur discussions of and developments in the epistemology of the religious for succeeding generations.

See also the article “Religious Disagreement.”

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord and Robert Merrihew Adams, eds. The Problem of Evil. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Alston, William. Perceiving God. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
  • Brockelman, Paul T. Cosmology and Creation: The Spiritual Significance of Contemporary Cosmology. New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Clark, Kelly James. Return to Reason: A Critique of Enlightenment Evidentialism and a Defense of Reason and Belief in God. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1990.
  • Craig, William Lane, and Quentin Smith. Theism, Atheism, and Big Bang Cosmology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Davis, Stephen. God, Reason and Theistic Proofs. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Gutting, Gary. Religious Belief and Religious Skepticism. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
  • Helm, Paul. Faith and Understanding. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. New York: Routledge, 1779/1991.
  • Huxley, T. H. Agnosticism and Christianity, and Other Essays. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1931/1992.
  • Jordan, Jeff, ed. Gambling on God, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1994.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin. Arguing for Atheism: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Routledge, 1996.
  • Murray, Michael, ed. Reason for the Hope Within. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1999.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, and Nicholas Wolterstorff, eds. Faith and Rationality: Reason and Belief in God. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1983.
  • Plantinga, Alvin.. Warrant: The Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Why I Am Not a Christian, and Other Essays on Religion and Related Subjects. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1957. Swinburne, Richard. The Existence of God. New York: Clarendon Press, 1979.
  • Swinburne, Richard. Faith and Reason. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Wainwright, William. Reason and the Heart: A Prolegomenon to a Critique of Passional Reason. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Reason within the Bounds of Religion. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1976.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Zagzebski, Linda, ed. Rational Faith: Catholic Responses to Reformed Epistemology. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.

Author Information

Kelly James Clark
Calvin College
U. S. A.