The term “Renaissance skepticism” refers to a diverse range of approaches to the problem of knowledge that were inspired by the revitalization of Ancient Greek Skepticism in fifteenth through sixteenth century Europe. Much like its ancient counterpart, Renaissance skepticism refers to a wide array of epistemological positions rather than a single doctrine or unified school of thought. These various positions can be unified to the extent that they share an emphasis on the epistemic limitations of human beings and offer the suspension of judgment as a response to those limits.
The defining feature of Renaissance skepticism (as opposed to its ancient counterpart) is that many of its representative figures deployed skeptical strategies in response to religious questions, especially dilemmas concerning the criterion of religious truth. Whereas some Renaissance thinkers viewed skepticism as a threat to religious orthodoxy, others viewed skepticism as a powerful strategy to be adopted in Christian apologetics.
Philosophers who are typically associated with Renaissance skepticism include Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola, Michel de Montaigne, Pierre Charron, and Francisco Sanches. Beyond philosophy, the revitalization of skepticism in Renaissance Europe can also be seen through the writings of religious thinkers such as Martin Luther, Sebastian Castellio, and Desiderius Erasmus; pedagogical reformers such as Omer Talon and Petrus Ramus; and philologists such as Henri Estienne and Gentian Hervet. This article provides an overview of the revitalization of skepticism in Renaissance Philosophy through the principal figures and themes associated with this movement.
Table of Contents
- The Ancient Sources of Renaissance Skepticism
- The Transmission of Ancient Skepticism into the Renaissance
- Popkin’s Narrative of the History of Renaissance Skepticism
- Medieval Skepticism and Anti-Skepticism
- Renaissance Skepticism Pre-1562: Skepticism before the Publication of Sextus Empiricus
- Renaissance Skepticism Post-1562: The Publication of Sextus Empiricus
- Late Renaissance Skepticism: Montaigne, Charron, and Sanches
- The Influence of Renaissance Skepticism
- References and Further Reading
Ancient Greek skepticism is traditionally divided into two distinct strains: “Academic skepticism” and “Pyrrhonian skepticism.” Both types of skepticism had a considerable influence on Renaissance philosophy albeit at different times and places. The term “Academic skepticism” refers to the various positions adopted by different members of Plato’s Academy in its “middle” and “late” periods. Figures such as Arcesilaus (c. 318-243 B.C.E.), Carneades (c. 213-129 B.C.E.), Clitomachus (187-110 B.C.E.), Antiochus (c. 130-c. 68 B.C.E.), Philo of Larissa (c. 159/8– c. 84/3 B.C.E.), and Cicero (106-43 B.C.E.) are associated with Academic skepticism. The term “Pyrrhonian skepticism” refers to an approach adopted by a later group of philosophers who sought to revive a more radical form of skepticism that they associated with Pyrrho (c. 365-270 B.C.E.). Figures associated with Pyrrhonian skepticism include Aenesidemus in the first century B.C.E., and Sextus Empiricus in the second century C.E.
Both strains of ancient skepticism share an emphasis on the epistemic limitations of human beings and recommend the suspension of assent in the absence of knowledge. Both varieties of skepticism advance their arguments in response to dogmatism, although they differ in their specific opponents. The Academic skeptics direct their arguments primarily in response to Stoic epistemology, particularly the theory of cognitive impressions. In contrast, the Pyrrhonian skeptics direct their arguments in response to Academic skepticism as well as other ancient schools of thought.
One key distinction between the two strains of ancient skepticism can be found in their differing stances on the nature and scope of the suspension of assent. Arcesilaus, for example, maintains the radical view that nothing can be known with certainty. In response to the absence of knowledge, he recommends the suspension of assent. In response to the Stoic objection that the suspension of judgment impedes all rational and moral activity, Arcesilaus offers a practical criterion, “the reasonable” (to eulogon), as a guide to conduct in the absence of knowledge. Arcesilaus’ student Carneades presents yet another kind of practical criterion, “the persuasive” (to pithanon), as a guide for life in the absence of knowledge. In response to the inactivity charge of the Stoics, he maintains that in the absence of knowledge, we can still be guided by convincing or plausible impressions.
Philo offers a “mitigated” interpretation of Academic skepticism. His mitigated skepticism consists in the view that an inquirer can offer tentative approval to “convincing” or “plausible” impressions that survive skeptical scrutiny. Cicero discusses Philo’s mitigated interpretation of Academic skepticism in his Academica, translating Carneades’ practical criterion as “probabile” and “veri simile.” Cicero gives this practical criterion a “constructive” interpretation. In other words, he proposes that probability and verisimilitude can bring the inquirer to ever closer approximations of the truth. Admittedly, the question of whether Academic skeptics such as Cicero, Carneades, and Arcesilaus are “fallibilists” who put forth minimally positive views, or “dialectical” skeptics who only advance their arguments to draw out the unacceptable positions of their opponents, is a subject of considerable scholarly debate. For further discussion of this issue, see Ancient Greek Skepticism.
The Pyrrhonian skeptics introduce a more radical approach to the suspension of assent in the absence of knowledge. They offer this approach in response to what they perceive to be dogmatic in the Academic position. Aenesidemus, for example, interprets the Academic view that “nothing can be known” as a form of “negative dogmatism.” That is, he views this position as a positive and therefore insufficiently skeptical claim about the impossibility of knowledge. As an alternative, Aenesidemus endeavors to “determine nothing.” In other words, he seeks to neither assert nor deny anything unconditionally. Sextus Empiricus, another representative figure of Pyrrhonian skepticism, offers another alternative to the allegedly incomplete skepticism of the Academics. In the absence of an adequate criterion of knowledge, Sextus practices the suspension of assent (epoché). Although the Academics also practice the suspension of assent, Sextus extends its scope. He recommends the suspension of assent not only regarding positive knowledge claims, but also regarding the skeptical thesis that nothing can be known.
In fourteenth to mid-sixteenth century Europe, the writings of Augustine, Cicero, Diogenes Laertius, Galen, and Plutarch served as the primary sources on Ancient skepticism. The writings of Sextus Empiricus were not widely available until 1562 when they were published in Latin by Henri Estienne. Due to the limited availability of Sextus Empiricus in the first half of the sixteenth century, philosophical discussions of skepticism were largely constrained to the Academic skeptical tradition, with very few exceptions. It was only in the latter half of the sixteenth century that Renaissance discussions of skepticism began to center around Pyrrhonism. For this reason, this article divides Renaissance skepticism into two distinct periods: pre-1562 and post-1562.
Throughout the Renaissance, the distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism was neither clearly nor consistently delineated. Before the publication of Sextus Empiricus in the 1560s, many authors were unaware of Pyrrhonian skepticism, often treating “skepticism” and “Academic skepticism” as synonyms. Those who were aware of the difference did not always consistently distinguish between the two strains. Following the publication of Sextus Empiricus, many thinkers began to use the terms “Pyrrhonism” and “skepticism” interchangeably. For some, this was in apparent acceptance of Sextus’ view that the Academic skeptics are negative dogmatists rather than genuine skeptics. For others, this was due to a more syncretic interpretation of the skeptical tradition, according to which there is common ground between the various strains.
Scholarly debate surrounding the revitalization of ancient skepticism in the Renaissance has been largely shaped by Richard Popkin’s History of Scepticism, first published in 1960, and expanded and revised in 1979 and 2003. This section presents Popkin’s influential account of the history of skepticism, addressing both its merits and limitations.
The central thesis of Popkin’s History of Scepticism is that the revitalization of Pyrrhonian skepticism in Renaissance Europe instigated a crisis of doubt concerning the human capacity for knowledge. According to Popkin, this skeptical crisis had a significant impact on the development of early modern philosophy. On Popkin’s account, the battles over theological authority in the wake of the Protestant Reformation set the initial scene for this skeptical crisis of doubt. This crisis of uncertainty was brought into full force following the popularization of Pyrrhonian skepticism among figures such as Michel de Montaigne.
While influential, Popkin’s narrative of the history of skepticism in early modernity has drawn criticism from many angles. One common charge is that Popkin exaggerated the impact of Pyrrhonian skepticism at the expense of Academic skepticism and other sources and testimonia such as Augustine, Plutarch, Plato, and Galen. Another common criticism is that he overstated the extent to which skepticism was forgotten throughout late Antiquity and the Middle Ages and only recovered in the Renaissance. This section provides an overview of these two main criticisms.
Charles Schmitt’s 1972 study of the reception of Cicero’s Academica in Renaissance Europe demonstrates that the impact of Academic skepticism on Renaissance thought was considerable. Schmitt argues that although the Academica was one of Cicero’s more obscure works throughout the Latin Middle Ages, it witnessed increased visibility and popularity throughout the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries. By the sixteenth century, Cicero’s Academica had become the topic of numerous commentaries, such as those by Johannes Rosa (1571) and Pedro de Valencia (1596) (for an analysis of these commentaries, see Schmitt 1972). Not only that, but the Academica became an object of critique among scholars such as Giulio Castellani (Schmitt 1972). Although Schmitt ultimately concedes that the impact of Academic skepticism on Renaissance thought was minimal in comparison to that of Pyrrhonism, nevertheless, he maintains that it was not as marginal as Popkin had initially suggested (Schmitt 1972; 1983). Over the past few decades, scholars such as José Raimundo Maia Neto have studied the impact of Academic skepticism further, arguing that its influence on early modern philosophy was substantial (Maia Neto, 1997; 2013; 2017; see also Smith and Charles eds. 2017 for further discussion of the impact of Academic skepticism on early modern philosophy).
Popkin’s “rediscovery” narrative has also been challenged, specifically the idea that Pyrrhonism was largely forgotten throughout Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages only to be rediscovered in the Renaissance. One notable example is Luciano Floridi’s study on the transmission of Sextus Empiricus, which documents the availability of manuscripts throughout late antiquity and the Middle Ages. Floridi shows that although Sextus was admittedly obscure throughout Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages, he was not quite as unknown as Popkin had initially supposed (Floridi 2002).
Increased scholarly attention to medieval discussions of skepticism has shown further limitations to Popkin’s rediscovery narrative (Perler 2006; Lagerlund ed. 2010; Lagerlund 2020). Although neither strain of ancient Greek skepticism was particularly influential in the Latin Middle Ages, discussions of skeptical challenges and rehearsals of skeptical arguments occurred in entirely new contexts such as debates regarding God’s power, the contingency of creation, and the limits of human knowledge in relation to the divine (Funkenstein 1987). Although most medieval discussions of skepticism were critical, such as that of Henry of Ghent, who drew on Augustine’s Contra Academicos in his attack on skeptical epistemology, some were sympathetic, such as that of John of Salisbury, who discussed the New Academy in a favorable light, and adopted elements of Cicero’s and Philo of Larissa’s probabilism in his own epistemology (Schmitt 1972; see also Grellard 2013 for a discussion of John of Salisbury’s probabilism). The following section provides an overview of medieval treatments of skepticism.
Philosophers typically associated with medieval skepticism and anti-skepticism include John of Salisbury, Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus, Nicolas of Autrecourt, and John Buridan, among others. Although not all of these thinkers engaged directly with ancient Greek skepticism, they still responded to epistemological challenges that can be called “skeptical” in a broader sense.
John of Salisbury (1115-1180) was one of the first philosophers of the Latin Middle Ages to discuss Academic skepticism in any significant detail and to openly embrace certain views associated with the New Academy. In the Prologue to the Metalogicon, for example, John associates his own methodology with Academic probabilism. He writes, “[b]eing an Academician in matters that are doubtful to a wise man, I cannot swear to the truth of what I say. Whether such propositions be true or false, I am content with probable certitude” (ML 6). Similarly, in the Prologue to the Policraticus, John writes that “[i]n philosophy, I am a devotee of Academic dispute, which measures by reason that which presents itself as more probable. I am not ashamed of the declarations of the Academics, so that I do not recede from their footprints in matters about which wise men have doubts” (PC 7). John associates Academic methodology with epistemic modesty toward claims that have not been conclusively demonstrated and combines this humility with an openness toward the possibility of truth.
Although John associates his own methodology with Academic probabilism, he stipulates very clear limits to his skepticism. He restricts his skeptical doubt to the inferences derived from ordinary experience, maintaining that these inferences should be affirmed as probable rather than necessary. Although John believes that it is reasonable to doubt the inferences derived from ordinary experience, he maintains that we can still affirm the truth of what can be known rationally. He argues, for example, that we cannot doubt the certainty of God’s existence, the principle of non-contradiction, or the certainty of mathematical and logical inferences (PC 153-156).
In the thirteenth century, both Henry of Ghent (c. 1217-1293) and John Duns Scotus (1265/1266-1308) were concerned with establishing the possibility of knowledge in opposition to skeptical challenges (for a discussion of their positions in relation to skepticism, see Lagerlund 2020). Henry’s Summa begins by posing the question of whether we can know anything at all. Henry attempts to guarantee the possibility of knowledge through a theory of divine illumination he attributes to Augustine. John Duns Scotus discusses and rejects Henry’s divine illumination theory of knowledge, arguing that the natural intellect is indeed capable of achieving certainty through its own powers. Like Henry, Scotus develops his theory of knowledge in response to a skeptical challenge to the possibility of knowledge (Lagerlund 2020). In contrast to Henry, Scotus maintains that the natural intellect can achieve certitude regarding certain kinds of knowledge, such as analytic truths and conclusions derived from them, thus requiring no assistance through divine illumination.
In early fourteenth century Latin philosophy, a new type of skeptical argument, namely the “divine deception” argument, began to emerge (Lagerlund 2020). The divine deception argument, made famous much later by Descartes, explores the possibility that God is deceiving us, thus threatening the very possibility of knowledge. Philosophers such as Nicholas of Autrecourt and John Buridan developed epistemologies that could respond to the threat to the possibility of knowledge posed by this type of skeptical argument (Lagerlund 2020). Nicholas offers an infallibilist and foundationalist epistemology whereas Buridan offers a fallibilist one (Lagerlund 2020).
Nicholas of Autrecourt (c. 1300-c. 1350) entertains and engages with skeptical challenges in his Letters to Bernard of Arezzo. In these letters, Nicholas draws out what he takes to be unacceptable implications of Bernard’s epistemology. Nicolas takes Bernard’s position to entail an extreme and untenable form of skepticism about the external world and even of one’s own mental acts (Lagerlund 2020). In response to this hyperbolic skepticism, Nicholas develops a positive account of knowledge, offering what Lagerlund calls a “defense of infallible knowledge” (Lagerlund 2020). Nicholas’ epistemology is “infallibilist” insofar as he maintains that the principle of noncontradiction and everything that can be resolved into this principle is immune to skeptical doubt. This infallibilist epistemology is tailored to respond to the skeptical challenge of divine deception.
Nicholas’s approach to skepticism sets a very high bar for the possibility of knowledge. This exceedingly high standard of knowledge is challenged by John Buridan (c. 1295-1361). Like Nicholas, Buridan also develops an epistemology that can withstand the skeptical challenge of divine deception. Unlike Nicholas, the epistemology he develops is a “fallibilist” one (Lagerlund 2020). As Jack Zupko argues, Buridan’s strategy against the skeptical challenges entertained by Nicholas is to show that it is unreasonable to accept the excessively high criterion of knowledge presupposed by the hypothesis of divine deception (Zupko 1993). As Zupko shows, Buridan’s response to the divine deception argument entertained by Nicholas is to “acknowledge it, and then to ignore it” (Zukpo 1993). Instead, Buridan develops a fallibilist epistemology in which knowledge admits of degrees which correspond to three distinct levels of “evidentness” (Lagerlund 2020).
Throughout the Latin Middle Ages skepticism did not disappear to the extent that Popkin suggests. Nevertheless, although many medieval philosophers deal with skeptical challenges to the possibility of knowledge, and develop epistemologies tailored to withstand skeptical attack, their approaches to these issues are not always shaped by Ancient Greek skepticism. In the Renaissance, this began to change due to the increasing availability of classical texts. The next section discusses Renaissance treatments of skepticism both before and after the publication of Sextus Empiricus.
In Renaissance Europe, philosophical treatments of skepticism began to change as Cicero’s Academica witnessed increased popularity and Sextus Empiricus’ works were translated into Latin. This section discusses how Renaissance thinkers approached the issue of skepticism (both directly and indirectly) from the early sixteenth century up until the 1562 publication of Sextus Empiricus by Henri Estienne. Due to the limited availability of Sextus Empiricus in Renaissance Europe, most discussions of skepticism prior to 1562 draw primarily on the Academic skeptical tradition. One notable exception is Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola.
Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469-1533) is the earliest Renaissance thinker associated with Pyrrhonian skepticism. His Examination of the Vanity of the Doctrines of the Gentiles and of the Truth of the Christian Teaching (1520) is often acknowledged as the first use of Pyrrhonism in Christian apologetics (Popkin 2003). Although Sextus Empiricus was not widely available in Pico’s time, he had access to a manuscript that was housed in Florence (Popkin 2003).
In the Examination of the Vanity of the Doctrines of the Gentiles and of the Truth of the Christian Teaching, Pico deploys skeptical strategies toward both positive and negative ends. His negative aim is to undermine the authority of Aristotle among Christian theologians and to discredit the syncretic appropriation of ancient pagan authors among humanists such as his uncle, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola. Pico’s more positive aim is to support the doctrines of Christianity by demonstrating that revelation is the only genuine source of certitude (Schmitt 1967; Popkin 2003). Pico subjects the various schools of ancient philosophy to skeptical scrutiny in order to demonstrate their fundamental incertitude (Schmitt 1967; Popkin 2003). In so doing, he seeks to reveal the special character of divinely revealed knowledge.
Although Pico uses skeptical strategies to attack the knowledge claims advanced by ancient pagan philosophers, he maintains that the truths revealed in Scripture are immune to skeptical attack. One reason for this is that he understands the principles of faith to be drawn directly from God rather than through any natural capacity such as reason or the senses. Since Pyrrhonian arguments target reason and the senses as criteria of knowledge, they do not apply to the truths revealed in Scripture. Not only does Pico maintain that Pyrrhonian arguments are incapable of threatening the certainty of revelation, he also suggests that this Pyrrhonian attack on natural knowledge has the positive potential to assist Christian faith.
Pico’s use of Pyrrhonism presents a case of what would later become common throughout the Reformation and Counter-Reformation, namely the deployment of Pyrrhonian skeptical strategies towards non-skeptical Christian ends. Pico did not subject the doctrines of Christianity to skeptical attack. Instead, he deployed Pyrrhonism in a highly circumscribed context, namely as an instrument for detaching Christianity from ancient pagan philosophy and defending the certitude of Christian Revelation (see Copenhaver 1992 for a discussion of Pico’s detachment of Christianity from ancient philosophy).
As Popkin argues, skeptical dilemmas such as the Problem of the Criterion appear both directly and indirectly in Reformation-era debates concerning the standard of religious truth. The “problem of the criterion” is the issue of how to justify a standard of truth and settle disputes over this standard without engaging in circular reasoning. According to Popkin, this skeptical problem of the criterion entered into religious debates when Reformers challenged the authority of the Pope on matters of religious truth and endeavored to replace this criterion with individual conscience and personal interpretation of Scripture (Popkin 2003).
Popkin draws on the controversy between Martin Luther (1483-1546) and Desiderius Erasmus (1466-1536) on the freedom of the will as one example of how the skeptical problem of the criterion figured indirectly into debates concerning the criterion of religious truth (Popkin 2003). In On Free Will (1524), Erasmus attacks Luther’s treatment of free will and predestination on the grounds that it treats obscure questions that exceed the scope of human understanding (Popkin 2003; Maia Neto 2017). Erasmus offers a loosely skeptical response, proposing that we accept our epistemic limitations and rely on the authority of the Catholic Church to settle questions such as those posed by Luther (Popkin 2003; Maia Neto 2017). Luther’s response to Erasmus, entitled The Bondage of the Will (1525), argues against Erasmus’ skeptical emphasis on the epistemic limitations of human beings and acquiescence to tradition in response to those limits. Luther argues instead that a true Christian must have inner certainty regarding religious knowledge (Popkin 2003).
Sebastian Castellio (1515/29-1563), another reformer, takes a more moderate approach to the compatibility between faith and epistemic modesty in his On the Art of Doubting and Concerning Heretics (1554). In Castellio’s stance, Popkin identifies yet another approach to the skeptical problem of the criterion (Popkin 2003). Like Erasmus, Castellio emphasizes the epistemic limitations of human beings and the resultant difficulty of settling obscure theological disputes. In contrast to Erasmus, Castellio does not take these epistemic limitations to require submission to the authority of the Catholic Church. In contrast to Luther, Castellio does not stipulate inner certainty as a requirement for genuine Christian faith. Instead, Castellio argues that human beings can still draw “reasonable” conclusions based on judgment and experience rather than either the authority of tradition or the authority of inner certitude (Popkin 2003; Maia Neto 2017).
Academic skepticism had a major impact in mid-sixteenth century France through the pedagogical reforms proposed by Petrus Ramus (1515-1572) and his student Omer Talon (c. 1510-1562) (Schmitt 1972). Ramus developed a Ciceronian and anti-Scholastic model of education that sought to bring together dialectic with rhetoric. Although Ramus expressed enthusiastic admiration for Cicero, he never explicitly identified his pedagogical reforms with Academic skepticism and his association with it was always indirect.
Omer Talon had a direct and explicit connection to Academic skepticism, publishing an edition of the Academica Posteriora in 1547, and an expanded and revised version which included the Lucullus in 1550. Talon included a detailed introductory essay and commentary that Schmitt has called the “first serious study of the Academica to appear in print” (Schmitt 1972). Talon’s introductory essay explicitly aligns Ramus’ pedagogical reforms with the philosophical methodology of Academic skepticism. He presents Academic methodology as an alternative to Scholastic models of education, defending its potential to cultivate intellectual freedom.
Talon adopts the Academic method of argument in utramque partem, or the examination of both sides of the issue, as his preferred pedagogical model. Cicero also claims this as his preferred method, maintaining that it is the best way to establish probable views in the absence of certain knowledge through necessary causes (Tusculan Disputations II.9). Although this method is typically associated with Cicero and Academic skepticism, Talon attributes it to Aristotle as well, who discusses this method in Topics I-II, 100a-101b (Maia Neto 2017). Despite the Aristotelian origins of the method of argument in utramque partem, it was not popular among the Scholastic philosophers of Talon’s time (Maia Neto 2017).
Talon’s use of skepticism is constructive rather than dialectical, insofar as he interprets the Academic model of argument in utramque partem as a positive tool for the pursuit of probable beliefs, rather than as a negative strategy for the elimination of beliefs. Specifically, he presents it as a method for the acquisition of probable knowledge in the absence of certain cognition through necessary causes. Following Cicero, Talon maintains that in a scenario where such knowledge is impossible, the inquirer can still establish the most probable view and attain by degrees a closer and closer approximation of the truth.
Talon’s main defense of Academic skepticism hinges on the idea of intellectual freedom (Schmitt 1972). He follows Cicero’s view that the Academic skeptics are “freer and less hampered” than the other ancient schools of thought because they explore all views without offering unqualified assent to any one of them (see Cicero’s Acad. II.3, 8). Like Cicero, Talon maintains that probable views can be found in all philosophical positions, including Platonism, Aristotelianism, Stoicism, and Epicureanism. To establish the most probable view, the inquirer should freely examine all positions without offering unqualified assent to any one of them.
Talon’s syncretism is another distinctive feature of his appropriation of Ciceronian skepticism. His syncretism consists in his presentation of Academic skepticism as harmonious with Socratic, Platonic, and even at times, Aristotelian philosophy. Throughout his introductory essay, Talon makes a point of demonstrating that Academic skepticism has an ancient precedent with Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, and even some earlier Pre-Socratic philosophers. He takes great care to clear Academic skepticism of common charges such as negative dogmatism, presenting it in a more positive light that emphasizes its common ground with other philosophical schools. Talon places particular emphasis on Socratic learned ignorance and commitment to inquiry as central to skeptical inquiry.
The impact of Academic skepticism in mid-sixteenth-century France can also be seen through the emergence of several anti-skeptical works. Ramus’ and Talon’s proposed pedagogical reforms were controversial for many reasons, one of which was the problem of skepticism. Pierre Galland (1510-1559), one of Ramus’ colleagues at the Collège de France, launched a fierce attack on the role of skepticism in these proposed reforms (for a detailed discussion of Galland’s critique, see Schmitt 1972). Galland’s main concern was that Ramus’ and Talon’s pedagogical reforms threatened to undermine philosophy and Christianity alike (Schmitt 1972). He argues that a skeptical attack on the authority of reason would eventually lead to an attack on all authority, including theological authority (Schmitt 1972).
Another example of anti-skepticism can be seen in a work by Guy de Brués entitled Dialogues contre les nouveaux académiciens (1557) (for a discussion of de Brués, see Schmitt 1972; see also Morphos’ commentary to his 1953 translation). In this work, Brués advances an extended attack on Academic skepticism through a dialogue between four figures associated with the Pléiade circle: Pierre de Ronsard, Jean-Antoine de Baïf, Guillaume Aubert, and Jean Nicot. In his dedicatory epistle to the Cardinal of Lorraine, Brués states that the goal of his anti-skeptical dialogue is to prevent the youth from being corrupted by the idea that “all things are a matter of opinion,” an idea he attributes to the New Academy. He argues that skepticism will lead the youth to distain the authority of religion, God, their superiors, justice, and the sciences. Much like that of Galland, Brués’ critique of skepticism centers on the threat of relativism and the rejection of universal standards (Schmitt 1972).
In 1562, the Calvinist printer and classical philologist Henri Estienne (Henricus Stephanus) (c. 1528-1598) published the first Latin translation and commentary on Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Skepticism. This publication of Sextus’ works into Latin reshaped Renaissance discussions of skepticism. In 1569, Estienne printed an expanded edition of Sextus’ works that included a translation and introductory essay on Adversus Mathematicos by the Catholic counter-reformer, Gentian Hervet (1499-1584). This edition also included a translation of Diogenes Laertius’ Life of Pyrrho, and a translation of Galen’s anti-skeptical work, The Best Method of Teaching, by Erasmus. In contrast to the numerous editions and commentaries on the Academica that were available throughout the sixteenth century, Estienne’s editions were the only editions of Sextus’ works that were widely available in the sixteenth century. A Greek edition was not printed until 1621.
Estienne and Hervet both include substantial prefaces with their translations (for a discussion of these prefaces, see Popkin 2003; for a translation and discussion of Estienne’s preface, see Naya 2001). In each preface, the translator comments on the philosophical value of Sextus and states his goals in making Pyrrhonism available to a wider audience. Both prefaces treat the question of whether and how Pyrrhonism can be used in Christian apologetics, and both respond to the common objection that Pyrrhonism poses a threat to Christianity. Although Estienne was a Calvinist, and Hervet was an ardent Counter-Reformer, both offer a similar position on the compatibility of Christianity with Pyrrhonism. Both agree that Pyrrhonism is a powerful resource for undermining confidence in natural reason and affirming the special character of revelation. Although Estienne and Hervet were not philosophers, their framing of skepticism and its significance for religious debates had an impact on how philosophers took up these issues, especially given that these were the only editions of Sextus that were widely available in the sixteenth century.
Henri Estienne’s preface to Sextus’ Outlines combines the loosely skeptical “praise of folly” genre popularized by Erasmus with a fideistic agenda resembling that of Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola. Estienne begins with a series of jokes, playfully presenting the Outlines as a kind of joke book. It begins as a dialogue between the translator and his friend, Henri Mesmes, in which the one Henri inquires upon the nature and value of skepticism, and the other Henri offers responses that parody the traditional Pyrrhonian formulae.
When asked about the nature and value of skepticism, Estienne recounts the “tragicomic” story of his own “divine and miraculous metamorphosis” into a skeptic. Drawing on conventional Renaissance representations of melancholy, Estienne recounts a time when he suffered from quartan fever, a disease associated with an excess of black bile. This melancholy prevented him from pursuing his translation work. One day, Estienne wandered into his library with his eyes closed out of fear that the mere sight of books would sicken him, and fortuitously came across his old notes for a translation of Sextus Empiricus. While reading the Outlines, Estienne began to laugh at Sextus’ skeptical attack on the pretensions of reason. Estienne’s laughter counterbalanced his melancholy, allowing him to return to his translation work afresh.
Estienne discusses the “sympathy” between his illness and its skeptical cure, describing an “antiperistasis” in which his excess of learning was counterbalanced by its opposite (namely skepticism). Much to his surprise, this skeptical cure had the fortuitous result of reconciling him with his scholarly work, albeit on new terms. Estienne’s encounter with skepticism allowed him to return to the study of classical texts by reframing his understanding of the proper relationship between philosophy and religion.
In the second half of his preface, Estienne turns to the question of whether skepticism poses a threat to Christianity. Anticipating the common objection that skepticism leads to impiety and atheism, he replies that it is the dogmatist rather than the skeptic who poses a genuine threat to Christianity and is at greater risk of falling into atheism. Whereas skeptics are content to follow local customs and tradition, dogmatists endeavor to measure the world according to their reason and natural faculties.
In the final paragraphs of the preface, Estienne addresses his reasons for publishing the first Latin translation of Sextus Empiricus. Returning to the themes of illness discussed at the beginning of the preface, he remarks that his goal is a therapeutic one. That is, his aim is to cure the learned of the “impiety they have contracted by contact with ancient dogmatic philosophers” and to relieve those with an excessive reverence for philosophy. Here, Estienne presents skepticism as a cure for the pride of the learned, playing on the ancient medical idea that health is a humoral balance that can be restored by counterbalancing one excess with another.
Finally, Estienne responds to the common objection that skepticism is an anti-philosophical method that will destroy the possibility of establishing any kind of truth. Estienne argues that this skeptical critique does not pertain to religious truths revealed in Scripture. He suggests instead that a skeptical attack on natural knowledge will only serve to reaffirm the prerogative of faith. Much like his predecessor, Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola, Estienne envisions Pyrrhonism as a tool to be used toward non-skeptical religious ends. He presents Pyrrhonian skepticism both as a therapy to disabuse the learned of their overconfidence in natural reason, and as a tool for affirming the special character of the truths revealed in Scripture.
Gentian Hervet’s 1569 preface to Sextus’ Adversus Mathematicos is more somber in tone than Estienne’s and places a more transparent emphasis on the use of Sextus in Christian apologetics. Hervet frames his interest in skepticism in terms of his desire to uphold the doctrines of Christianity, voicing explicit approval for the project of Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola. Hervet adds a new dimension to his appropriation of Pyrrhonism, presenting it as a tool for combatting the Reformation, and not only as a means of loosening the grip of ancient philosophy on Christianity.
Much like Estienne’s preface, Hervet’s preface begins with a brief history of his encounter with Sextus. He reports that he fortuitously stumbled across the manuscript in the Cardinal of Lorraine’s library when in need of a diversion. He recounts the great pleasure he took in reading Adversus Mathematicos, noting its particular success at demonstrating that no human knowledge is immune to attack. Like Estienne, Hervet argues that a skeptical critique of natural reason can help reinforce the special character of the truths revealed in Scripture. In contrast to Estienne, Hervet emphasizes the potential of Pyrrhonian arguments for undermining the Reformation.
Within his preface, Hervet discusses the value of Pyrrhonism for resolving religious controversies concerning the rule of faith. He raises the problem of the criterion in the context of religious authority, condemning the Reformers for taking their natural faculties as the criterion of religious truth, and for rejecting the authority of tradition (that is, the Catholic Church). He suggests that there is a fundamental incommensurability between our natural faculties and the nature of the divine, and thus that the effort to measure the divine based on one’s own natural faculties is fundamentally misguided. Hervet expresses hope that Pyrrhonism might persuade the Reformers to return to Catholicism, presumably due to the Pyrrhonian emphasis on acquiescence to tradition in the absence of certainty.
Hervet’s preface also discusses the potential utility of Pyrrhonism in Christian pedagogy. Anticipating the common objection that skepticism will corrupt the morals of the youth and lead them to challenge the authority of Christianity, Hervet argues instead that the skeptical method of argument in utramque partem—a method he mistakenly attributes to the Pyrrhonians rather than to the Academics—will eventually lead an inquirer closer and closer to the truth of Christianity. Far from undercutting faith, Hervet proposes that skeptical inquiry will ultimately support it. Specifically, he argues that the method of argument in utramque partem can help the student distinguish the ‘verisimile,’ or the truth-like from the truth itself.
Hervet borrows this vocabulary of verisimilitude from Cicero, who translates Carneades’ practical criterion, to pithanon, as veri simile and probabile. Although within this context, Hervet is ostensibly discussing the merits of Pyrrhonian methodology and not Academic methodology, his description of the goals of argument in utramque partem conflate Pyrrhonism with Academic Skepticism. Whereas the Academic practice of arguing both sides of every issue aims at the discovery of the most probable view, at least in certain cases and on certain interpretations, the Pyrrhonian practice of pitting opposing arguments against each other aims at equipollence.
The most influential philosophers associated with Renaissance skepticism are Michel de Montaigne, Pierre Charron, and Francisco Sanches. Unlike their predecessors whose appropriations of ancient skepticism were largely subordinated to religious ends, these thinkers drew on skeptical strategies to address a wider range of philosophical questions and themes in areas ranging from epistemology to practical philosophy.
The most famous thinker associated with Renaissance skepticism is the French essayist and philosopher Michel de Montaigne (1533-1592). His Essays, first published in 1580, and expanded and revised up until his death, draw extensively on both Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism among many other ancient and medieval sources. Throughout the Essays, Montaigne treats a great number of skeptical themes including the diversity of human custom and opinion, the inconsistency of human actions and judgment, the relativity of sense-perception to the perceiver, and the problem of the criterion.
The precise nature and scope of Montaigne’s skepticism is a topic of considerable scholarly debate. Some have located Montaigne’s inspiration in the Pyrrhonian skeptical tradition (Popkin 2003; Brahami 1997). Others have noted how Cicero’s Academica serves as one of Montaigne’s most frequently cited skeptical sources (Limbrick 1977; Eva 2013; Prat 2017). Still others have maintained that the philosophical character of Montaigne’s thought is not reducible to skepticism (Hartle 2003; 2005; Sève 2007). The following sections present a range of different views on the sources, nature, and scope of Montaigne’s skepticism, considering the merits and limitations of each.
Among commentators, Montaigne is primarily associated with Pyrrhonian skepticism. In large part, this is due to Richard Popkin’s influential account of the central role that Montaigne played in the transmission of Pyrrhonian skepticism into early modernity. On Popkin’s account, Montaigne played a pivotal role in the revitalization of skepticism by applying Pyrrhonian strategies in a broader epistemological context than the one envisioned by his predecessors and contemporaries (Popkin 2003). Whereas earlier Renaissance thinkers used Pyrrhonian arguments to debate questions concerning the criterion of religious truth, Montaigne applies Pyrrhonian arguments to all domains of human understanding, thus launching what Popkin has termed the “Pyrrhonian crisis” of Early Modern Europe (Popkin 2003).
Popkin’s concept of the “Pyrrhonian crisis” is deeply indebted to Pierre Villey’s influential account of a personal “Pyrrhonian crisis” that Montaigne allegedly underwent while reading Sextus Empiricus. According to Villey, Montaigne’s intellectual development maps onto roughly three stages corresponding to the three books of the Essays: the earlier chapters exhibit an austere Stoicism, the middle chapters exhibit a Pyrrhonian crisis of uncertainty, and the final chapters exhibit an embrace of Epicurean naturalism (Villey 1908). Admittedly, most Montaigne scholars have rejected Villey’s three-stage developmental account for a variety of reasons. Some have rejected the idea that Montaigne’s skepticism was the result of a personal “Pyrrhonian crisis,” preferring to assess his skepticism on a more philosophical rather than psychological level. Others have questioned whether the Essays developed according to three clearly defined stages at all, pointing to evidence that Montaigne’s engagement with Skepticism, Stoicism, and Epicureanism extends beyond the confines of each book.
Scholars typically draw on Montaigne’s longest and most overtly philosophical chapter, the “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” as evidence for his Pyrrhonism. Here, Montaigne provides an explicit discussion of Pyrrhonian skepticism, voicing sympathetic approval for the Pyrrhonians’ intellectual freedom and commitment to inquiry in the absence of certitude. In a detailed description of ancient skepticism, Montaigne explicitly commends the Pyrrhonians in opposition to the Academic and dogmatic schools of ancient philosophy. Within this context, Montaigne voices approval for the Pyrrhonians, arguing that the Academics maintain the allegedly inconsistent view that knowledge is both unattainable and that some opinions are more probable than others. Within this description, Montaigne commends the Pyrrhonians both for remaining agnostic on whether knowledge is possible and for committing to inquiry in the absence of knowledge.
Since the “Apology” is the longest and most overtly philosophical chapter of the Essays, many scholars, such as Popkin, have treated the “Apology” as a summation of Montaigne’s thought. They have also treated Montaigne’s sympathetic exposition of Pyrrhonism as an expression of the author’s personal sympathies (Popkin 2003). Although scholars generally agree that “Apology” is heavily influenced by Pyrrhonism, its precise role is a matter of considerable debate. The main reasons have to do with the essay’s format and context.
As for the issue of context, the “Apology” was likely written at the request of the Catholic princess, Marguerite of Valois, to defend the Natural Theology of Raymond Sebond (1385-1436), a Catalan theologian whose work Montaigne translated in 1569. Montaigne’s defense of Sebond is (at least in part) intended to support Marguerite’s specific concerns in defending her Catholic faith against the Reformers (Maia Neto 2013; 2017).
As for the issue of format, the “Apology” is loosely structured as a disputed question rather than as a direct articulation of the author’s own position (Hartle 2003). In the manner of a disputed question, Montaigne defends Sebond’s Natural Theology against two principal objections, offering responses to each objection that are tailored to the views of each specific objector. For this reason, the statements that Montaigne makes within this essay cannot easily be removed from their context and taken to represent the author’s own voice in any unqualified sense (Hartle 2003; Maia Neto 2017).
Within the “Apology,” Montaigne ostensibly sets out to defend Sebond’s view that the articles of faith can be demonstrated through natural reason. The first objection he frames is that Christians should not support their faith with natural reason because faith has a supernatural origin in Divine grace (II: 12, F 321; VS 440). The second objection is that Sebond’s arguments fail to demonstrate the doctrines they allege to support (II: 12, F 327; VS 448). The first objection hinges on a dispute about the meaning of faith, and the second objection hinges on a dispute concerning the strength of Sebond’s arguments. Montaigne responds to both objections, conceding and rejecting aspects of each. In response to the first objection, Montaigne concedes that the foundation of faith is indeed Divine grace but denies the objector’s conclusion that faith has no need of rational support (II: 12, F 321; VS 441). In response to the second objection, Montaigne presents a Pyrrhonian critique of the power of reason to demonstrate anything conclusively—not only in domain of religious dogma, but in any domain of human understanding (II: 12, F 327-418; VS 448-557).
It is in the context of this second objection that Montaigne provides his detailed and sympathetic presentation of Pyrrhonism. Montaigne’s response to the second objection begins with a long critique of reason (II: 12, F 370-418; VS 500-557). Drawing on the first of Sextus’ modes, Montaigne presents an extended discussion of animal behavior to undermine human presumption about the power of reason. Following Sextus, Montaigne compares the different behaviors of animals to show that we have no suitable criterion for preferring our own impressions over those of the allegedly inferior animals. Drawing on the second mode, Montaigne points to the diversity of human opinion as a critique of the power of reason to arrive at universal truth. Montaigne places special emphasis on the diversity of opinion in the context of philosophy: despite centuries of philosophical inquiry, no theory has yielded universal assent. Finally, Montaigne attacks reason on the grounds of its utility, arguing that knowledge has failed to bring happiness and moral improvement to human beings.
Following this critique of reason, Montaigne turns to an explicit discussion of Pyrrhonian skepticism, paraphrasing the opening of Sextus’ Outlines (II: 12, F 371; VS 501). Identifying three possible approaches to philosophical inquiry, he writes that investigation will end in the discovery of truth, the denial that it can be found, or in the continuation of the search. Following Sextus, Montaigne frames these approaches as dogmatism, negative dogmatism, and Pyrrhonism. In contrast to the two alternative dogmatisms that assert either that they have attained the truth, or that it cannot be found, Montaigne commends the Pyrrhonists for committing to the search in the absence of knowledge.
Montaigne devotes the next few paragraphs to a detailed description of Pyrrhonian strategies (II:12 F 372; VS 502-3). He provides a sympathetic consideration of Pyrrhonian strategies in contrast to dogmatism and the New Academy (II: 12, F 374; VS 505). He concludes by commending Pyrrhonism for its utility in a religious context, writing that: “There is nothing in man’s invention that has so much verisimilitude and usefulness [as Pyrrhonism]. It presents man naked and empty, acknowledging his natural weakness, fit to receive from above some outside power; stripped of human knowledge in himself, annihilating his judgment to make room for faith” (II:12, F 375; VS 506). By undermining the pretenses of reason, Pyrrhonism prepares human beings for the dispensation of Divine grace.
This connection Montaigne draws between the Pyrrhonian critique of reason and the embrace of faith in the absence of any rational grounds for adjudicating religious disputes, has led to his related reputation as a “skeptical fideist” (for a discussion of Montaigne’s skeptical fideism, see Popkin 2003 and Brahami 1997. For the view that Montaigne is not a fideist, see Hartle 2003; 2013). Those who interpret Montaigne as a “skeptical fideist” often take his exposition of Pyrrhonism and its utility in a Christian context as an expression of Montaigne’s personal view on the limited role of reason in the context of faith (Popkin 2003).
Others, however, have argued that Montaigne’s endorsement of Pyrrhonism and its utility in a religious context cannot be taken as a simple expression of Montaigne’s own position (see, for example, Hartle 2003 and 2013. See also Maia Neto, 2017). In the context of the “Apology” as a whole, Montaigne’s endorsement of Pyrrhonism and its utility in a religious context is part of a response to the second objection to Sebond. In his response to the second objection, Montaigne is arguing on the basis of the assumptions of Sebond’s opponents. He counters the conclusion that Sebond’s arguments fail to adequately demonstrate religious dogma by showing that all rational demonstrations (and not just Sebond’s specific effort to demonstrate the Articles of Faith) are similarly doomed.
Further evidence that suggests that Montaigne’s endorsement of Pyrrhonism ought to be understood as a qualified one can be found in his address to the intended recipient of the essay. Following his detailed exposition of Pyrrhonism and its potential to assist a fideistic version of Catholicism, Montaigne addresses an unnamed person as the intended recipient of his defense of Sebond (II: 12 F 419; VS 558). This addressee is typically assumed to be Princess Marguerite of Valois (Maia Neto 2013; 2017). In Montaigne’s address to the princess, he qualifies his sympathetic presentation of Pyrrhonism in ambivalent terms, calling it a “final fencer’s trick” and a “desperate stroke” that should only be used “reservedly,” and even then, only as a last resort (II: 12, F 419; VS 558). Montaigne urges the Princess to avoid Pyrrhonist arguments and continue to rely on traditional arguments to defend Sebond’s natural theology against the Reformers. Montaigne warns the Princess of the consequences of undermining reason in defense of her Catholic faith (II: 12, F 420; VS 559).
Following this warning to the Princess, Montaigne returns to some further consequences of the Pyrrhonian critique of reason and the senses. He returns to Pyrrhonian themes, such as the relativity of sense-perception to the perceiver, challenging the idea that the senses can serve as an adequate criterion of knowledge. Borrowing from the third mode, Montaigne argues that 1.) if we were lacking in certain senses, we would have a different picture of the world, and 2.) we might perceive additional qualities to those that we perceive through our existing faculties. He raises further challenges to the senses using the first and second mode, pointing to 1.) the lack of perceptual agreement between humans and animals, and 2.) the lack of perceptual agreement between different human beings (II:12, F 443-54).
After Montaigne’s reformulation of the skeptical modes, he turns to a reformulation of the problem of the criterion: “To judge the appearances that we receive of objects, we would need a judicatory instrument; to verify this instrument, we need a demonstration; to verify the demonstration, an instrument: there we are in a circle” (II:12 F 454; VS 600-01). If the senses cannot serve as a criterion of truth, Montaigne then asks whether reason can, but concludes that demonstration leads to an infinite regress (II: 12, F 454; VS 601).
The suspension of assent is the traditional skeptical response to the absence of an adequate criterion of knowledge. This can be done either in the manner of certain Academics by provisionally approving of likely appearances, or in the manner of the Pyrrhonians by suspending assent while permitting oneself to be non-dogmatically guided by appearances. Montaigne expresses reservations toward both solutions. In response to the Academic solution, he raises the Augustinian objection that we have no criterion for selecting certain appearances as likelier than others, a problem that introduces yet another infinite regress (II: 12, F 455; VS 601). In response to the Pyrrhonian solution, he expresses reservations about acquiescence to changeable custom. He concludes that “[t]hus nothing certain can be established about one thing by another, both the judging and the judged being in continual change and motion” (II: 12 F 455; VS 601).
This claim that “nothing certain can be established about one thing by another,” is the conclusion to Montaigne’s response to the second objection. To recall, the second objection was that Sebond’s arguments fail to prove what he set out to demonstrate, namely the Articles of Faith. The Pyrrhonian response to the second objection is that reason is incapable of establishing anything conclusive at all, not only in matters of religious truth but in any domain of human understanding. Montaigne concludes his response to the second objection with the idea that the only knowledge we can attain would have to be through the assistance of divine grace. This conclusion to the essay is often taken as additional evidence for Montaigne’s “skeptical fideism” (Popkin 2003).
Again, whether this conclusion should serve as evidence that Montaigne is personally committed to Pyrrhonism or to skeptical fideism depends on whether we interpret his response to the objections to Sebond as dialectical. That is, it depends on whether we view Montaigne’s arguments as responses he generates on the basis of the assumptions of his opponents—assumptions to which he is not personally committed—in order to generate a contradiction or some other conclusion deemed unacceptable by his opponents.
When taken as a dialectical strategy, however, Montaigne’s use of skepticism still shares much in common with Pyrrhonism understood as a “practice” and “way of life.” For this reason, one might still conclude that although Montaigne’s endorsements of Pyrrhonism within the “Apology” do not necessarily represent the author’s own voice, the methodology and argumentative strategies he adopts within the “Apology” do indeed share much in common with the practice of Pyrrhonism.
Although most discussions of Montaigne’s skepticism focus on the “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” this is hardly the sole example of his use of Pyrrhonian strategies. In chapters such as “Of cannibals” and “Of custom and not easily changing an accepted law,” Montaigne adopts the Pyrrhonian mode concerning the diversity of custom to challenge his culture’s unexamined claims to moral superiority. In chapters such as “We taste nothing pure,” he adopts the modes concerning the relativity of sense-perception to the perceiver to challenge the authority and objectivity of the senses. In chapters such as “That it is folly to measure the true and the false by our own capacity” and “Of cripples,” Montaigne adopts skeptical arguments to arrive at the suspension of judgment concerning matters such as knowledge of causes and the possibility of miracles and other supernatural events.
In the domain of practical philosophy, Montaigne borrows from the Pyrrhonian tradition yet again, often recommending behavior that resembles the Pyrrhonian skeptic’s fourfold observances. In the absence of an adequate criterion of knowledge, the Pyrrhonian skeptics live in accordance with four guidelines that they claim to follow “non-dogmatically” (PH 1.11). These observances include the guidance of nature; the necessity of feelings; local customs and law; and instruction in the arts (PH 1.11). Montaigne frequently recommends conformity to similar observances. In “Of custom and not easily changing an accepted law,” for example, he recommends obedience to custom, and criticizes the presumption of those who endeavor to change it. In many cases, Montaigne’s recommendation to obey custom in the absence of knowledge extends to matters of religion. This is yet another reason why Montaigne’s affinities with Pyrrhonian skepticism are often associated with “fideism.” On the “skeptical fideist” interpretation, Montaigne’s obedience to Catholicism is due to the skeptical acquiescence to custom (Popkin 2003; Brahami 1997). The question of Montaigne’s religious convictions as well as his alleged “fideism” is a matter of considerable debate (see, for example, Hartle 2003; 2013).
Although most commentators focus on the Pyrrhonian sources of Montaigne’s skepticism, some scholars have emphasized the influence of Academic skepticism on Montaigne’s thought (see, for example, Limbrick 1977; Eva 2013; Prat 2017; and Maia Neto 2017). One reason to emphasize this role is that Cicero’s Academica was Montaigne’s most frequently quoted skeptical source (Limbrick 1977). Another reason has to do with the philosophical form and content of the Essays, especially Montaigne’s emphasis on the formation of judgment (as opposed to the suspension of judgment and elimination of beliefs) and his emphasis on intellectual freedom from authority as the defining result of skeptical doubt.
We can find one example of Cicero’s influence on Montaigne’s skepticism in his detailed exposition of skepticism in the “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” Here Montaigne weighs the relative merits of the dogmatic and skeptical approaches to assent, embedding two direct quotations from Cicero’s Academica (II:12, F 373; VS 504). Following Cicero’s distinction characterized in Academica 2.8, Montaigne articulates the value of suspending judgment in terms of intellectual freedom (II:12, F 373; VS 504). Although within this context, Montaigne is admittedly discussing the value of Pyrrhonian skepticism, he borrows Cicero’s language and emphasis on intellectual freedom as the defining result of the epoché (for a discussion of Montaigne’s blending of Academic and Pyrrhonian references, see Limbrick 1977; Eva 2013; and Prat 2017).
Although these passages in the “Apology” provide evidence for the influence of Cicero’s Academica on Montaigne’s skepticism, they also admittedly provide evidence for a critical view of the New Academy. As discussed above, within this exposition of skepticism, Montaigne voices explicit approval for the Pyrrhonians over the Academics. Although his characterizations of skepticism borrow significantly from Cicero, he uses these descriptions to present the Pyrrhonians in a more favorable light. Whether these statements should be taken as representative of Montaigne’s own voice, or whether they are part of a dialectical strategy, is discussed above.
Beyond the “Apology for Sebond,” we can see further examples of Montaigne’s debt to Academic skepticism. In contrast to the Pyrrhonian emphasis on the elimination of beliefs, Montaigne adopts skeptical strategies in ways that appear to accommodate the limited possession of beliefs. In this respect, Montaigne’s skepticism resembles the “mitigated” skepticism attributed to Cicero, whose “probabilism” permits the acquisition of tentative beliefs on a provisional basis (see Academica 2.7-9).
One example of the influence of Cicero’s mitigated skepticism can be seen in Montaigne’s discussion of education in chapter I: 26, “Of the education of children.” Given the prominent role of Cicero’s Academica in pedagogical debates in sixteenth century France, this context is hardly surprising (see discussion of Omer Talon above). Throughout “Of the education of children,” Montaigne articulates the goal of education as the formation of individual judgment and the cultivation of intellectual freedom (I: 26, F 111; VS 151). Montaigne recommends a practice that closely resembles the Academic method of argument in utramque partem as a means of attaining intellectual freedom. He recommends that the student weigh the relative merits of all schools of thought, lending provisional assent to the conclusions that appear most probable. The student should be presented with as wide a range of views as possible in the effort to carefully examine the pros and cons of each (I: 26, F 111; VS 151). The student should resist unqualified assent to any doctrine before a thorough exploration of the variety of available positions.
Montaigne presents this exercise of exploring all available positions as a means to attaining a free judgment (I: 26, F 111; VS 151). Through this emphasis on the freedom of judgment, Montaigne’s discussion of the nature and goals of education has clear resonances with that of his contemporary, Omer Talon. Like Talon, Montaigne presents skeptical strategies as a positive tool for cultivating intellectual freedom from authority rather than as a negative strategy for undermining unqualified assent to dogmatic knowledge claims. This emphasis on intellectual freedom and the freedom of judgment resonates more clearly with Ciceronian skepticism than with Pyrrhonism.
Montaigne’s appropriation of Academic skeptical strategies extends beyond his discussions of pedagogy. Beyond the essay “Of the education of children,” Montaigne emphasizes the formation of judgment as a goal of his essay project, often referring to his Essays as the “essays of his judgment” (see II. 17, F 495; VS 653; II: 10, F 296; VS 407; and I: 50, F 219; VS 301-302.) In “Of Democritus and Heraclitus,” for example, Montaigne writes: “Judgement is a tool to use on all subjects and comes in everywhere. Therefore in the essays [essais] that I make of it here, I use every sort of occasion. If it is a subject I do not understand at all, even on that I essay [je l’essaye] my judgment” (I: 50, F 219; VS 301-302). Rather than containing a finished product, or set of conclusions, the Essays embody the very activity of testing or “essaying” judgment (see La Charité 1968 and Foglia 2011 for the role of judgment in Montaigne’s thought).
Throughout the Essays, Montaigne tests or “essays” his judgment on a wide range of topics, attempting to explore these topics from all possible directions. At times he entertains the evidence for and against any given position in a manner that resembles the Academic method of argument in utramque partem. At other times, his method resembles the Pyrrhonian practice of counterbalancing opposing arguments, appearances, and beliefs. Although the “method” of the Essays shares aspects of both skeptical traditions, where it appears closer to Ciceronian skepticism is in Montaigne’s apparent acceptance of certain positive beliefs. Like Cicero, Montaigne appears to hold some beliefs that he accepts on a tentative and provisional basis. In this respect, his skepticism is closer to Cicero’s “mitigated” skepticism than to Sextus’ more radical skepticism that aspires to a life without beliefs.
Although the precise character and extent of Montaigne’s skepticism remain a topic of considerable scholarly debate, most commentators would likely agree on at least some version of the following points: Montaigne was deeply influenced by ancient skepticism and incorporates elements of this tradition into his own thought. Whatever the precise nature of this influence, Montaigne appropriates aspects of ancient skepticism in an original way that goes beyond what was envisioned by its ancient proponents. Montaigne’s essay form, for example, is just one way that he appropriates skeptical strategies toward new ends.
After Montaigne, Pierre Charron (1541-1643) is one of the most influential figures of Renaissance skepticism. Charron was a close friend and follower of Montaigne. He draws heavily on Montaigne and the Academic skeptical tradition in his major work, Of Wisdom (1601, 1604). According to Maia Neto, Charron’s Of Wisdom was “the single most influential book in French philosophy during the first half of the seventeenth century” (Maia Neto 2017).
In Of Wisdom, Charron expounds what he takes to be the core of Montaigne’s thought. He does so through a method and model of knowledge adopted from Academic skepticism. Charron’s indebtedness to the Academic skeptical tradition can be seen in his emphasis on intellectual freedom from authority and his idea that wisdom consists in the avoidance of error. Following certain Academic skeptics, Charron maintains that truth is not fully accessible to human beings (Maia Neto 2017). Instead, he argues that the truth is only fully available to God. Despite the inaccessibility of truth to human beings, Charron proposes that through the proper use of reason, we can nonetheless avoid error. In Charron’s view, it is the avoidance of error rather than the establishment of a positive body of knowledge that constitutes genuine wisdom. In this respect, he develops what Maia Neto calls a “critical rationalism not unlike that held earlier by Omer Talon and by Karl Popper in the twentieth century” (Maia Neto 2017).
Along with Montaigne and Charron, the Iberian physician and philosopher Francisco Sanches (1551-1623) is one of the most notable thinkers associated with Renaissance skepticism. His skeptical treatise, That Nothing is Known (1581), sets out a detailed critique of Aristotelian epistemology drawing on familiar skeptical lines of attack. Sanches’ use of skepticism stands out from many of his predecessors and contemporaries insofar as he applies it to epistemological issues rather than strictly religious ones.
In That Nothing is Known, Sanches targets the Scholastic concept of scientia, or knowledge through necessary causes. Throughout this work, Sanches mobilizes skeptical arguments to attack several Aristotelian ideas, including the idea that particulars can be explained through universals (TNK 174-179) and the idea that the syllogism can generate new knowledge (TNK 181-182). Based on these critiques, Sanches concludes that the Aristotelian concept of scientia results in an infinite regress and is therefore impossible (TNK 195-196). We cannot have scientia of first principles or of any conclusions derived from first principles (TNK 199). It is in this sense that Sanches argues for the skeptical thesis suggested by his title.
Much like that of Montaigne, the precise character of Sanches’ skepticism is a topic of considerable debate. Some scholars maintain that Sanches’ skepticism was inspired by Pyrrhonism. This interpretation was first advanced by Pierre Bayle, who refers to Sanches as a “Pyrrhonian” skeptic in his 1697 Dictionary entry (Limbrick 1988; Popkin 2003). This interpretation finds support in Sanches’ use of skeptical arguments against sense perception as a criterion of knowledge, a strategy resembling the Pyrrhonian modes. One issue with this interpretation, however, is that many thinkers of Bayle’s time used the terms “Pyrrhonism” and “skepticism” interchangeably. Another issue with this interpretation is that there is no conclusive evidence that Sanches read Sextus Empiricus (Limbrick 1988).
For this reason, many scholars maintain that Sanches drew inspiration from Academic skepticism instead (Limbrick 1988; Popkin 2003). This interpretation finds support in the title of Sanches’ work—a clear reference to the skeptical thesis attributed to Arcesilaus. As further evidence of Sanches’ affinities with the New Academy, scholars often point to a letter to the mathematician Clavius (Limbrick 1988; Popkin 2003). In this letter, Sanches uses skeptical arguments to challenge the certainty of mathematical knowledge. He even signs his name as “Carneades philosophus,” explicitly associating himself with a famous representative of Academic skepticism.
Still others have argued that the Galenic medical tradition serves as another source of inspiration for Sanches’ skepticism. Elaine Limbrick, for example, shows that Sanches’ medical training was particularly influential for his skepticism and epistemology in general (Limbrick 1988). She argues that Galen’s emphasis on empirical observation and experiment was fundamental to Sanches’ rejection of Aristotelianism and his effort to develop a new scientific methodology (Limbrick 1988).
Although Sanches uses skeptical strategies in his attack on Aristotelian epistemology, he was not himself a thoroughgoing skeptic. Although Sanches concludes that the Aristotelian concept of scientia is impossible, he does not therefore conclude that all knowledge is impossible. One indication of this is that throughout That Nothing is Known, Sanches refers to other works, one of which deals with methodology, and another of which deals with the acquisition of positive knowledge of the natural world (TNK 290). Sanches appears to have intended these works to explain what knowledge might look like—specifically knowledge of the natural world—in the absence of scientia. Unfortunately, the fate of Sanches’ additional works on the positive acquisition of knowledge remains unknown. They were either lost or never published.
Although we can conclude that Sanches never intended That Nothing is Known to serve as a final statement on his own epistemology, we can only speculate as to what his positive epistemology might have looked like. Since Sanches uses skeptical arguments to undermine the Aristotelian conception of knowledge and pave the way for a different approach to knowledge of the natural world, Popkin and many others have characterized his skepticism as “mitigated” and “constructive” (Popkin 2003). Popkin goes further to argue that Sanches’ theory of knowledge would have been “experimental” and “fallibilist” (Popkin 2003). In this view, although Sanches uses skeptical strategies to undermine the Aristotelian conception of scientia, his ultimate goal is not to undermine the possibility of knowledge as such, but to show that in the absence of scientia, a more modest kind of fallible knowledge is nonetheless possible.
Renaissance skepticism had a considerable impact on the development of seventeenth century European philosophy. Thinkers ranging from Descartes to Bacon developed their philosophical systems in response to the skeptical challenges (Popkin 2003). A close friend of Montaigne’s, Marie Le Jars de Gournay (1565-1645), for example, draws on skeptical arguments in her Equality of Men and Women (1641). In this work, Gournay deploys traditional skeptical strategies to draw out the logically unacceptable conclusions of arguments for gender inequality (O’Neill 2007). François La Mothe Le Vayer (1588-1672), often associated with the “free-thinking” movement in seventeenth century France, also deploys skeptical strategies in his attacks on superstition (Popkin 2003; Giocanti 2001). Pierre Gassendi (1592-1665), known for his revival of Epicureanism, adopts skeptical challenges to Aristotelianism in his Exercises Against the Aristotelians (1624) and draws on the probabilism of the New Academy in his experimental and fallibilist approach to science (Popkin 2003). René Descartes (1596-1650) takes a methodical and hyperbolic form of skeptical doubt as the starting point in his effort to establish knowledge on secure foundations. Although Descartes uses skeptical strategies, he only does so in an instrumental sense, that is, as a tool for establishing a model of scientific knowledge that can withstand skeptical attack. Much like Descartes, Blaise Pascal (1623-1662) was both influenced by skeptics such as Montaigne and deeply critical of them. Although he arguably embraced a version of fideism that shared much in common with thinkers such as Charron and Montaigne, he also attacks these thinkers for their skepticism.
Much like Renaissance skepticism, post-Renaissance treatments of skepticism represent a diverse set of philosophical preoccupations rather than a unified school of thought. To the extent that a central distinction between Renaissance and post-Renaissance skepticism can be identified, it could be said that most Renaissance skeptics place a greater emphasis on debates concerning the criterion of religious truth, whereas most post-Renaissance skeptics place a greater emphasis on the application of skeptical arguments to epistemological considerations. Moreover, most Renaissance skeptics, much like their ancient counterparts, are explicitly concerned with the practical implications of skepticism. In other words, many of the representative figures of Renaissance skepticism are concerned not only with identifying our epistemic limitations, but with living well in response to those limits.
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- Castellio, Sebastien. Concerning Heretics. Trans. and ed. Roland H. Bainton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1935. English translation.
- Castellio, Sebastien. De Arte Dubitandi et confidendi Ignorandi et Sciendi. Ed. Elisabeth Feist Hirsch. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1981.
- Charron, Pierre, De la Sagesse, Corpus des Oeuvres de Philosophie en Langue Français, revised by B. de Negroni, Paris: Fayard, 1986.
- Cicero, Marcus Tullius. Academica and De Natura Deorum. Loeb Classical Library, trans. H.
- Rackham, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1933.
- Erasmus, Desiderius, and Martin Luther, translated by Ernst F. Winter. Discourse on Free Will. Milestones of Thought. New York: Continuum, 1997.
- English translation of Erasmus’ Free Will and Luther’s Bondage of the Will.
- Henry of Ghent, “Can a Human Being Know Anything?” and “Can a Human Being Know Anything Without Divine Illumination?” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowledge. Edited and translated by R. Pasnau, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 93-135.
- John Buridan, “John Buridan on Scientific Knowledge,” in Medieval Philosophy: Essential Readings with Commentary, G. Klima (ed.), Blackwell, 2007, pp. 143-150.
- John Duns Scotus, Philosophical Writings, ed. and trans. Allan B. Walter, Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Co., 1987.
- John of Salisbury, The Metalogicon of John of Salisbury, trans. with an introduction by Daniel McGarry, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1955.
- The translation used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “ML” followed by page number.
- John of Salisbury, Policraticus: Of the Frivolities of Courtiers and the Footprints of Philosophers, ed. C.J. Nederman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
- The translation used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “PC” followed by page number.
- Montaigne, Michel de. Les Essais. Ed. Pierre Villey and V.-L. Saulnier. 3 vols., 2nd ed. Paris : Presses Universitaires de France. 1992.
- The French edition used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “VS” followed by page number.
- Montaigne, Michel de. Œuvres complètes. Ed. Albert Thibaudet and Maurice Rat. Paris: Gallimard, Bibliothèque de la Pléiade, 1962.
- Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Essays of Montaigne. Translated by Donald M. Frame. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1943.
- The English translation used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “F” followed by page number.
- Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Works of Montaigne: Essays, Travel Journal, Letters. Trans. Donald Frame. Stanford, Calif.: Stanford University Press, 1967.
- Naya, Emmanuel. “Traduire les Hypotyposes pyrrhoniennes : Henri Estienne entre la fièvre quarte et la folie chrétienne.” In Le Scepticisme Au XVIe Et Au XVIIe Siècle. Ed.
- Moreau, Pierre-François. Bibliothèque Albin Michel Des Idées. Paris: A. Michel, 2001.
- Includes a French translation of Henri Estienne’s introductory essay to his translation of Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Skepticism.
- Nicholas of Autrecourt, His Correspondence with Master Giles and Bernard of Arezzo: A Critical Edition and English Translation by L.M. de Rijk, Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
- Popkin, Richard H., and José Raimundo Maia Neto. Skepticism: An Anthology. Amherst, N.Y.: Prometheus Books, 2007.
- Includes an English translation of Hervet’s introductory essay to his translation of Sextus’ Adversus Mathematicos, and excerpts from Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola’s Examination of the Vanity of the Doctrines of the Gentiles and of the Truth of the Christian Teaching (1520) among other sources.
- Sanches, Francisco, That Nothing Is Known = (Quod Nihil Scitur), introduction, notes, and bibliography by Elaine Limbrick, and text established, annotated, and translated by D. F. S. Thomson. Cambridge; New York: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
- Critical edition with an extensive introduction. Latin text and English translation. The English translation is parenthetically cited above as “TNK” followed by page number.
- Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Loeb Classical Library, trans. R.G. Bury, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1933.
- Sextus Empiricus, Adversus Mathematicos, Loeb Classical Library, trans. R.G. Bury, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1935.
- Omer Talon’s Commentary on Cicero’s Academica (begins on p. 107): Available as a facsimile in Œuvres diverses ([Reproduction en facsimilé]) / Pierre de La Ramée, Omer Talon ; publiées par Nicolas Bergeron: 1577: https://gallica.bnf.fr/ark:/12148/bpt6k4597n/f119.item.r=Omer%20Talon%20(1510-1562).
- Estienne and Hervet’s introductions to their translations of Sextus Empiricus from the 1569 edition available in facsimile. Hervet’s introduction begins on the second unpaginated page, and Estienne’s introduction begins on p. 400: https://gallica.bnf.fr/ark:/12148/bpt6k109336w.r=estienne%20hervet?rk=21459;2.
- Brahami, Frédéric. Le scepticisme de Montaigne. Paris : Presses Universitaires de France, 1997.
- Brush, Craig B. Montaigne and Bayle: Variations on the Theme of Skepticism. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966.
- Carraud, Vincent, and J.-L. Marion, eds. Montaigne: scepticisme, métaphysique, théologie. Paris : Presses Universitaires de France, 2004.
- La Charité, Raymond C. The Concept of Judgment in Montaigne. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1968.
- Copenhaver, B. P., & Schmitt, C. B., Renaissance Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
- Eva, Luiz, “Montaigne et les Academica de Cicéron,” Astérion, 11, 2013.
- Floridi, Luciano. Sextus Empiricus: The Transmission and Recovery of Pyrrhonism. American Classical Studies. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.
- Foglia, Marc. Montaigne, pédagogue du jugement. Paris : Classiques Garnier, 2011.
- Friedrich, Hugo. Montaigne. Edited by Philippe Desan. Translated by Dawn Eng. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991.
- Funkenstein, Amos. “Scholasticism, Scepticism, and Secular Theology,” in R. Popkin and C. Schmitt (eds.), Scepticism from the Renaissance to the Enlightenment, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz. 1987 : 45-54.
- Giocanti, Sylvia. Penser l’irrésolution : Montaigne, Pascal, La Mothe Le Vayer: Trois itinéraires sceptiques. Paris: Honoré Champion, 2001.
- Grellard, Christophe. Jean de Salisbury et la renaissance médévale du scepticisme, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2013.
- Hartle, Ann. Michel de Montaigne: Accidental Philosopher. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
- Hartle, Ann. “Montaigne and Skepticism” in The Cambridge Companion to Montaigne, ed. Langer, Ullrich. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
- Hartle, Ann. Montaigne and the Origins of Modern Philosophy. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2013.
- Lagerlund, Henrik. Rethinking the History of Skepticism: The Missing Medieval Background. Studien Und Texte Zur Geistesgeschichte Des Mittelalters; Bd. 103. Leiden ; Boston: Brill, 2010.
- Lagerlund, Henrik. Skepticism in Philosophy, a Comprehensive Historical Introduction. New York : Routledge, 2020.
- Larmore, Charles. “Un scepticisme sans tranquillité: Montaigne et ses modèles antiques.” In Montaigne: scepticisme, métaphysique, théologie, edited by V. Carraud and J.- L. Marion, 15-31. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2004.
- Limbrick, Elaine, “Was Montaigne Really a Pyrrhonian?” Bibliothèque d’Humanisme et Renaissance 39, no. 1 (1977): 67-80.
- Maia Neto, José Raimundo. “Academic Skepticism in Early Modern Philosophy.” Journal of the History of Ideas 58, no. 2 (1997): 199-220.
- Maia Neto, José Raimundo & Richard H. Popkin (ed.), Skepticism in Renaissance and Post-Renaissance Thought: New Interpretations. Humanity Books, 2004.
- Maia Neto, José Raimundo “Le probabilisme académicien dans le scepticisme français de Montaigne à Descartes” Revue Philosophique De La France Et De L’Étranger 203, no.4 (2013): 467-84.
- Maia Neto, José Raimundo. “Scepticism” in Lagerlund, Henrik, and Benjamin Hill eds. Routledge Companion to Sixteenth Century Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2017.
- Naya, Emmanuel. “Renaissance Pyrrhonism, a Relative Phenomenon,” In Maia Neto J.R., Paganini G. (eds) Renaissance Scepticisms. International Archives of the History of Ideas, vol 199. Dordrecht: Springer, 2009.
- O’Neill, Eileen. “Justifying the Inclusion of Women in Our Histories of Philosophy: The Case of Marie de Gournay.” In The Blackwell Guide to Feminist Philosophy (eds L.M. Alcoff and E.F. Kittay), 2007.
- Paganini, G., & Maia Neto, J. R., eds., Renaissance Scepticisms. International Archives of the History of Ideas, vol 199. Dordrecht: Springer, 2009.
- Paganinni, Gianni. Skepsis. Le débat des moderns sur le scepticisme. Montaigne – Le Vayer – Campanella – Hobbes – Descartes – Bayle. Paris: J. Vrin, 2008.
- Perler, Dominik. Zweifel und Gewissheit: Skeptische Debatten im Mittelalter. Frankfurt am Main: Klosterman, 2006.
- Popkin, R. H., The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Prat, Sebastien. “La réception des Académiques dans les Essais: une manière voisine et inavouée de faire usage du doute sceptique” in Academic Scepticism in Early Modern Philosophy, eds. Smith, Plínio J., and Sébastien Charles Archives Internationales D’histoire des Idées; 221. Cham, Switzerland: Springer, 2017: 25-43.
- Schiffman, Zachary S. “Montaigne and the Rise of Skepticism in Early Modern Europe: A Reappraisal,” Journal of the History of Ideas, Vol. 45, No. 4 (Oct. – Dec. 1984).
- Smith, Plínio J., and Sébastien Charles. Academic Scepticism in Early Modern Philosophy. Archives Internationales D’histoire des Idées; 221. Cham, Switzerland: Springer, 2017.
- Schmitt, C. B., Gianfrancesco Pico Della Mirandola (1469–1533) and His Critique of Aristotle. The Hague: Nijhoff, 1967.
- Schmitt, C. B., Cicero Scepticus: A Study of the Influence of the Academica in the Renaissance. The Hague: Nijhoff, 1972.
- Schmitt, C.B., “The Rediscovery of Ancient Skepticism in Modern Times,” in Myles Burnyeat, ed., The Skeptical Tradition. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1983: 226-37.
- Sève, Bernard. Montaigne: Des Règles Pour L’esprit. Philosophie D’aujourd’hui. Paris: PUF, 2007.
- Villey, Pierre. Les Sources & L’évolution Des Essais De Montaigne. 1908. Reprint, Paris: Hachette & Cie, 1933.
- Zupko, Jack “Buridan and Skepticism.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 31 (2), (1993): 191-221.
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