We evaluate people and groups as responsible or not, depending on how seriously they take their responsibilities. Often we do this informally, via moral judgment. Sometimes we do this formally, for instance in legal judgment. This article considers mainly moral responsibility, and focuses largely upon individuals. Later sections also comment on the relation between legal and moral responsibility, and on the responsibility of collectives.

The article discusses four different areas of individual moral responsibility: (1) Responsible agency, whereby a person is regarded as a normal moral agent; (2) Retrospective responsibility, when a person is judged for her actions, for instance, in being blamed or punished; (3) Prospective responsibility, for instance, the responsibilities attaching to a particular role; and (4) Responsibility as a virtue, when we praise a person as being responsible. Philosophical discussion of responsibility has focused largely on (1) and (2). The article points out that a wider view of responsibility helps explore some connections between moral and legal responsibility, and between individual and collective responsibility. It also enables us to relate responsibility to its original philosophical use, which was in political thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Individual Responsibility
    1. Moral Agency
    2. Retrospective Responsibility
    3. Prospective Responsibility
    4. Responsibility as a Virtue
  3. Moral versus Legal Responsibility
  4. Collective Responsibility
    1. The Agency of Groups
    2. Retrospective Responsibility of Collectives
    3. Prospective Responsibilities of Groups
    4. Responsibility as a Group
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The word “responsibility” is surprisingly modern. It is also, as Paul Ricoeur has observed, “not really well-established within the philosophical tradition” (2000: 11). This is reflected in the fact that we can locate two rather different philosophical approaches to responsibility.

The original philosophical usage of “responsibility” was political (see McKeon, 1957). This reflected the origin of the word. In all modern European languages, “responsibility” only finds a home toward the end of the eighteenth century. This is within debates about representative government, that is, government which is responsible to the people. In the etymology of “responsibility,” the Oxford English Dictionary cites the debates on the U.S. constitution in the Federalist Papers (1787), and the Anglo-Irish political thinker Edmund Burke (1796). When John Stuart Mill writes of responsibility, in the middle of the nineteenth century, again his concern is not with free will, but with the principles of representative government. At the end of the nineteenth century, the most notable thinker to speak of responsibility is Max Weber, who propounds an ethics of responsibility (Verantwortungsethik) for the politician. For Weber, the vocation of politics demands a calm attention to the facts of the situation and the consequences of actions – and not to lofty or abstract principles.

So far as responsibility has a place in eighteenth and nineteenth century thought, then, this is in political contexts, where the concern is with responsible action and the principles of representative government. In twentieth century philosophy, on the other hand, the emphasis has been on questions of free will and determinism: Is a person responsible for her actions or character? Would the truth of determinism eliminate such responsibility? Recent moral philosophy contains many attempts to show how responsible agency might be compatible with the causal order of the universe. These debates obviously center on the individual agent. As such, they pose difficulties for understanding the topic of collective responsibility – an issue that twentieth century politics has raised with a new urgency. Nor does a concern with free will correspond to many everyday issues about responsibility – for example, questions of mutual accountability, defining a person’s sphere of responsibility, or judging a person as sufficiently responsible for a particular role.

This Encyclopedia article will mainly deal with the responsibility of individual persons; another article considers collective moral responsibility. In fact, there are several important uses of responsibility as it relates to individuals, which this article will tackle in turn. There are also important questions about the distinction between moral and legal responsibility. The article will then consider what relations there may be between the concept’s individual and collective uses. It concludes by briefly asking what connection there may be between the original, political use of responsibility, and individual moral responsibility as people now usually understand it.

2. Individual Responsibility

There is no philosophically well-settled way of dividing or analyzing the various components of responsibility, and some components are often ignored by philosophers. To take a more comprehensive approach, this article divides the responsibility of individuals into four areas of enquiry. Recent analytic moral philosophy has tended to ask two deceptively simple questions about responsibility:

  1. “What is it to be responsible?” and
  2. “What is a person responsible for?”

The first question is usually taken as a question about moral agency, the second as a question about holding people accountable for past actions. As noted, however, this does not capture the variety of uses that we make of the concept. We can see this by observing that both questions might mean something quite different, leading us to four distinct topics, as follows:

“What is it to be responsible?” is most often asked by philosophers as a question about the foundations of moral agency. What sort of creature can properly be held responsible for its actions? The simple answer is: a normal human adult. To explain and justify this reply, philosophers tend to turn to psychological and metaphysical features of normal adults, such as free will. We might also approach the same issue with a somewhat different emphasis: What features of (normal, adult) human interaction are involved in our holding one another responsible?

However, in asking “What is it to be responsible?” we might also have a second question in mind. We often praise some people as responsible, and criticize others as irresponsible. Here responsibility names a virtue – a morally valuable character trait. We may also praise an institution as responsible. One of the word’s original uses was to call for “responsible government.” We can compare this with the more recent demand that corporations be “socially responsible.” This aspect of responsibility has received very little philosophical attention.

“What is a person responsible for?” is a question most often asked by philosophers in connection with causation and accountability. This retrospective, or backward-looking, use is closely connected with praise and blame, punishment, and desert. When something has gone wrong, we invariably want to know who was at fault; and when something has gone right, we occasionally stop to ask who acted well. This is the topic of retrospective responsibility.

Again, however, we might use the same words to ask an entirely different question: “What is a person responsible for?” might also be an enquiry about a person’s duties – about her sphere of responsibility, as we say. A parent is responsible for caring for his child, an employee for doing her job, a citizen for obeying the law. It is a basic fact of human cooperation that responsibilities are often divided up between people: for example, the doctor is responsible for prescribing the right drugs, and the patient responsible for taking them correctly. As against questions of retrospective responsibility, this topic is sometimes termed prospective responsibility, that is, what responsibilities we are duty-bound to undertake.

These two apparently simple questions (“What is it to be responsible?” and “What is a person responsible for?”) about individual responsibility thus point to four different topics:

  1. moral agency
  2. responsibility as a virtue
  3. retrospective responsibility
  4. prospective responsibility

Each of these topics poses a host of important philosophical questions. Both the retrospective and prospective uses also raise the relation between legal and moral responsibility. Many important theories of responsibility relate to legal concerns, which will be discussed in a later section. As we pursue these topics, there is also the difficulty of seeing how they interrelate, so that it makes sense that we use the same word to raise each issue.

The discussion begins with the topics which philosophers have most often discussed: the nature of moral agency and retrospective responsibility.

a. Moral Agency

Normal human adults represent our paradigm case of responsible agents. What is distinctive about them, that we accord them this status? Thinking of retrospective responsibility in particular, why can be held accountable for their actions – justly praised or blamed, deservedly punished or rewarded? The philosophical literature has explored three broad approaches to moral agency:

  • Human beings have free will, that is, distinctive causal powers or a special metaphysical status, that separate them from everything else in the universe;
  • Human beings can act on the basis of reason(s);
  • Human beings have a certain set of moral or proto-moral feelings.

The first approach, although historically important, has largely been discredited by the success of modern science. Science provides, or promises, naturalistic explanations of such phenomena as the evolution of the human species and the workings of the brain. Almost all modern philosophers approach responsibility as compatibilists – that is, they assume that moral responsibility must be compatible with causal or naturalistic explanation of human thought and action, and therefore reject the metaphysical idea of free will. (An important note: There can be terminological confusion here. Some contemporary philosophers will use the term “free will” to describe our everyday freedom of choice, claiming that free will, properly understood, is compatible with the world’s causal order.)

Among modern compatibilists, a contest remains, however, between the second and third approaches – positions that are essentially Kantian and Humean in inspiration. Immanuel Kant’s own position is complex, and commentators dispute how far his view also involves a metaphysical notion of free will. It is indisputable, however, that our rationality is at the centre of his picture of moral agency. Kant himself does not speak of responsibility – the word was only just coming into the language of his day – but he does have much to say about imputation (Zurechnung), that is, the basis on which actions are imputed to a person. Kant was principally concerned with evaluation of the self. Although he occasionally mentions blame (mutual accountability), his moral theory is really about the basis on which a person treats herself as responsible. The core of his answer is that a rational agent chooses to act in the light of principles – that is, we deliberate among reasons. Therefore standards of rationality apply to us, and when we fail to act rationally this is, simply and crudely, a Bad Thing. It is important to be aware that Kant sees reason as having moral content, so that there is a failure of rationality involved when we do something immoral – for instance, by pursuing our self-interest at the expense of others. Even if we sometimes feel no inclination to take account of others, reason still tells us that we should, and can motivate us to do so. Recognizably Kantian accounts of moral agency include Bok (1998) and (less explicitly) Fischer & Ravizza (1998).

The issue of reason’s moral content separates Kantians from Humeans. David Hume denied that reason can provide us with moral guidance, or the motivation to act morally. He is famous for his claim that “Reason is wholly inactive, and can never be the source of so active a principle as conscience, or a sense of morals” (A Treatise of Human Nature, book 3, part 1, sect. 1). If we are moral agents, this is because we are equipped with certain tendencies to feel or desire, dispositions that make it seem rational to us to act and think morally. Hume himself stressed our tendency to feel sympathy for others and our tendency to approve of actions that lead to social benefits (and to disapprove of those contrary to the social good). Another important class of feelings concern our tendencies to feel shame or guilt, or more broadly, to be concerned with how others see our actions and character. A Humean analysis of responsibility will investigate how these emotions lead us to be responsive to one another, in ways that support moral conduct and provide social penalties for immoral conduct. That is, its emphasis is less on people’s evaluation of themselves and more on how people judge and influence one another. Russell (1995) carefully develops Hume’s own account. In twentieth century philosophy, broadly Humean approaches were given a new lease of life by Peter Strawson’s “Freedom and Resentment” (1962). This classic essay underlined the role of “reactive sentiments” or “reactive attitudes” – that is, emotional responses such as resentment or shame – in practices of responsibility.

The basic criticisms that each position makes of the other are simple. Kantians are vulnerable to the charge that they do not give a proper account of the role of feeling and emotion in the moral life. They can also be accused of reifying our capacity for reason in a way that makes mysterious how human beings’ capacities for reason and morality might have evolved. Humeans are vulnerable to the charge that they cannot give any account of the validity of reasoning beyond the boundaries of what we might feel inclined to endorse or reject: Can the Humean really hold that moral reasoning has any validity for people who do not feel concern for others? Contemporary philosophers have developed both positions so as to take account of such criticisms, which has led to rather technical debates about the nature of reason (for instance, Bernard Williams’ (1981) well-known distinction between internal and external reasons) and normativity (what it is for something to provide a reason to act or think in a certain way, for example, Korsgaard, 1996). So far as responsibility is concerned, Wallace (1994) is a well-regarded attempt to mediate between the two approaches. Rather differently, Pettit (2001) uses our susceptibility to reasons as the basis for an essentially interactive account of moral agency.

For our purposes, perhaps the most important point is that both positions highlight a series of factors important to responsibility and mutual accountability. These factors include: general responsiveness to others (for instance, via moral reasoning or feelings such as sympathy); a sense of responsibility for our actions (for instance, so that we may offer reasons for our actions or feel emotions of shame or guilt); and tendencies to regard others as responsible (for instance, to respect persons as the authors of their deeds and to feel resentful or grateful to them). In each case, note that the first example in brackets has a typically Kantian (reason-based) cast, the second a Humean (feeling/emotion-related) cast.

Two further thoughts should be added which apply regardless of which side of this debate one inclines toward. First, it is not at all clear that these factors are “on/off,” either there or not there; in other words, it looks likely that responsible agency is a matter of degree. One possible implication of this is that some other animals might have a degree of moral agency; another implication is that human beings may vary in the extent of their agency. (This seems clearly true of children as opposed to adults. We may be more reluctant to believe that the extent of adults’ moral agency can vary, but such a claim is not obviously false.) Second, none of these factors has an obvious connection to free will, in the metaphysical sense that opposes free will to determinism. As we shall see, however, whether we emphasize the rational or the affective basis for responsible agency tends to generate characteristically different accounts of retrospective responsibility, where the issue of free will tends to recur.

b. Retrospective Responsibility

In assigning responsibility for an outcome or event, we may simply be telling a causal story. This might or might not involve human actions. For example: the faulty gasket was responsible for the car breaking down; his epileptic fit was responsible for the accident. Such usages do not imply any assignment of blame or desert, and philosophers often distinguish them by referring to “causal responsibility.” More commonly, however, responsibility attribution is concerned with the morality of somebody’s action(s). Among the many different causes that led to an outcome, that action is identified as the morally salient one. If we say the captain was responsible for the shipwreck, we do not deny that all sorts of other causes were in play. But we do single out the person who we think ought to be held responsible for the outcome. Philosophers sometimes distinguish this usage, by speaking of “liability responsibility.” Retrospective responsibility usually involves, then, a moral (or perhaps legal) judgment of the person responsible. This judgment typically pictures the person as liable to various consequences: to feeling remorse (or pride), to being blamed (or praised), to making amends (or receiving gratitude), and so forth.

This topic is an old concern of philosophers, predating the term “responsibility” by at least two millennia. The classic analysis of the issues goes back to Aristotle in the Nicomachean Ethics, where he investigates the conditions that exculpate us from blame and the circumstances where blame is appropriate. Among conditions that excuse the actor, he mentions intoxication, force of circumstances, and coercion: we cannot be held responsible where our capacity to choose was grossly impaired or where there was no effective choice open to us (though perhaps we can be blamed for getting into that condition or those circumstances). We can be blamed for what we do when threatened by others, but not as we would be if coercion were absent. In each case, the issue seems to be whether or not we are able to control what we do: if something lies beyond our control, it also lies beyond the scope of our responsibility.

However, although Aristotle thinks that our capacities for deliberation and choice are important to responsible agency, he lacks the Kantian emphasis on rational control discussed in the last section. Aristotle grants considerable importance to habituation and stable character traits – the virtues and vices. Hence another way of interpreting what he says about responsibility is to argue that Aristotle’s excusing conditions represent cases where an action does not reveal a person’s character: everybody would act like that if circumstances provided no other choice; no one makes responsible choices when drunk. On the other hand, how we respond to coercion does reveal much about our virtues and vices; the point is that the meaning of such acts is very different from the meaning they would have in the absence of coercion.

In its emphasis on character, Aristotle’s account is much closer to Hume’s than to Kant’s, since character is about tendencies to feel and behave in various ways, as well as to think and choose. Given that Kant’s moral psychology is usually thought to be less plausible than Aristotle or Hume’s, it is interesting that Kantian approaches have, nonetheless, dominated modern approaches to retrospective responsibility. Why should this be so?

Kant’s underlying thought is that the person who acts well deserves to be happy (he continually refers to goodness as “worthiness to be happy”). The person who acts badly does not: she deserves to be reproached, ought to feel remorse, and may even deserve punishment. Since blame, guilt and punishment are of great practical importance, it is clearly desirable that our account of responsibility justify them. Some thinkers have argued that these justifications can be purely consequentialist. For instance, Smart (1961) argues that blame, guilt and punishment are only merited insofar as they can encourage people to do better in the future. However, most philosophers have been dissatisfied with such accounts. Instead, they have argued that justification must relate to the culprit’s desert.

For most people, the intuitive justification for the sort of desert involved in retrospective responsibility lies in individual choice or control. You chose to act selfishly: you deserve blame. You chose not to take precautions: you deserve to bear the consequences. You chose to break the law: you deserve punishment. (The question of legal responsibility is considered separately, below.) This way of putting matters clearly gives pride of place to our capacity to control our conduct in the light of reasons, moral and otherwise. It will also emphasize the intentions underlying an action rather than its actual outcomes. This is because intentions are subject to rational choice in a way that outcomes often are not. Kant’s thought that the rational agent can choose whether or not to act on the basis of reasons is sometimes expressed in the idea that we should each be respected as the authors of our thoughts and intentions. This thought has the less positive consequence that when somebody chooses immorally and irrationally, he fails in a distinctive way, so that he is not (in Kant’s terms) “worthy to be happy.” Note, however, that this line of thought is open to a very obvious objection. It can be argued that our intentions and choices are conditioned by our characters, and our characters by the circumstances of our upbringing. Clearly these are not matters of choice. This is why a concern with retrospective responsibility raises the family of issues around moral luck and continues to lead back to the issue of free will: the idea that we are, really and ultimately, the authors of our own choices – despite scientific and common-sense appearances.

The article on praise and blame discusses this issue in more depth, contrasting Kant’s approach with that of Aristotle and utilitarianism. Humeans, favoring naturalistic explanation of thought and action, are likely to be drawn to elements of the last two – namely Aristotle’s emphasis on actions as revealing virtues and vices, and the consequentialist emphasis on social benefits of practices of accountability. In particular, Humeans are much more likely to see retrospective responsibility in terms of the feelings that are appropriate – for instance, our resentment at someone’s bad conduct, or our susceptibility to shame at others’ responses. Clearly, such feelings and the resulting actions are about our exercising mutual influence on one another’s conduct for the sake of more beneficial social interaction. In other words, although the Humean analysis can be understood in terms of individual psychology, it also points to the question: What is it about human interaction that leads us to hold one another responsible? Kantians, on the other hand, tend to think of retrospective responsibility, not as a matter of influencing others, but rather as our respecting individual capacities for rational choice. This respect may still have harsh consequences, as it involves granting people their just deserts, including blame and punishment.

c. Prospective Responsibility

A different use of “responsibility” is as a synonym for “duty.” When we ask about a person’s responsibilities, we are concerned with what she ought to be doing or attending to. Sometimes we use the term to describe duties that everyone has – for example, “Everyone is responsible for looking after his own health.” More typically, we use the term to describe a particular person’s duties. He is responsible for sorting the garbage; she is responsible for looking after her baby; the Environmental Protection Agency is responsible for monitoring air pollution; and so on. In these cases, the term singles out the duties, or “area of responsibility,” that somebody has by virtue of their role.

This usage bears at least one straightforward relation to the question of retrospective responsibility. We will tend to hold someone responsible when she fails to perform her duties. A captain is responsible for the safety of the ship; hence he will be held responsible if there is a shipwreck. The usual justification for this lies in the thought that if he had taken his responsibility more seriously, then his actions might have averted the shipwreck. In some cases, though, when we are entrusted with responsibility for something, we will be held responsible if harm occurs, regardless of whether we might have averted it. This might be true if one hires (that is, rents) a car, for instance: even if an accident is not your fault, the contract may stipulate that you will be responsible for part of the repair costs. In order to hire (rent) the car in the first place, one must accept – take responsibility for – certain risks.

Legal thinkers, in particular, have pointed out that this suggests one way in which Kantian approaches – that is, approaches to responsibility which focus on acts and outcomes that were under a person’s control – may be inadequate. We may think that everybody has a duty (that is, a prospective responsibility) to make recompense when certain sorts of risks materialize from their actions. Consider a standard example: suppose John accidentally slips and breaks a vase in Jane’s shop. This is probably not something John had control over, and to avoid the risk of damaging any of Jane’s possessions, John would have to avoid entering her shop altogether. Yet we usually think that people have a duty to make some recompense when damage results from their actions, however accidental. From the point of view of our interacting with one another, the issue is not really whether a person could have avoided a particular, unfortunate outcome, so much as the fact that all our actions create risks; and when those risks materialize, someone suffers. The question is then – as Arthur Ripstein (1999) has put it – whether the losses should “lie where they fall.” To say that they should is basically to shrug our shoulders about the damage; in that case, the only person who suffers is the shop-owner. But we often think that losses should be redistributed. For that to happen, someone else has to make some sort of amends – in this case, the person who caused the accident will have to accept responsibility.

In terms of prospective responsibility, then, we may think that everyone has a duty to make certain amends when certain risks of action actually materialize – just because all our actions impose risks on others as well as ourselves. In this case, retrospective responsibility is justified, not by whether the person controlled the outcome or could have chosen to do otherwise, but by reference to these prospective responsibilities. Notice, however, that we might want to distinguish the duty to make amends from the issue of blameworthiness. One might accept the above account as to why the customer should compensate the owner of the broken vase, but add that in such a case she is not to blame for the breakage. There is clearly some merit to this response. It suggests that retrospective responsibility is more complicated than is often thought: blameworthiness and liability to compensate are different things, and may need to be justified in different ways. However, this question has not really been systematically pursued by moral philosophers, although the distinction between moral culpability and liability to punishment has attracted much attention among legal philosophers.

The connection between prospective and retrospective responsibility raises another complication. This stems from the fact that people often disagree about what they ought to do – that is, about what people’s prospective responsibilities are. This question of moral disagreement is not often mentioned in debates about responsibility, but may be rather important. To take an example: people have very different beliefs about the ethics of voluntary euthanasia – some call it “mercy killing,” others outright murder. Depending on our view, we will tend to blame or to condone the person who kills to end grave suffering. In other words, different views of somebody’s prospective responsibilities will lead to very different views of how retrospective responsibility ought to be assigned. One might even argue that many of our moral disagreements are actually brought to light, and fought out, when actors and on-lookers dispute what responses are appropriate. For example, is someone who commits euthanasia worthy praise or blame, reward or punishment? These disagreements, often very vocal, are important for the whole topic of responsibility, because they relate to how moral agents come to be aware of what morality demands of them.

Kantian ethics typically describes moral agency in terms of the co-authorship of moral norms: the rational agent imposes norms upon herself, and so can regard herself as an “author” of morality. (This element of Kantian ethics can be difficult to appreciate, because Kant is so clear that everyone should impose the same objective morality on themselves.) Whether or not one accepts the Kantian emphasis upon rationality or a universalist morality, it is clear that an important element of responsible agency consists in judging one’s own responsibilities. Hence, we do not tend to describe a dutiful child as responsible. This is because he obeys, rather than exercising his own judgment about what he ought to do. This issue is not just about how we judge our own duties, however: it’s also about how others judge us, and our right to judge others. So far as others regard us as responsible, they will recognize that we also have a right to judge what people’s prospective responsibilities are, and how retrospective responsibility ought to be assigned. Importantly, people can recognize one another as responsible in this way, even in the face of quite deep moral disagreements. By the same token, we know how disrespectful it is of someone, not to take her moral judgments seriously.

The question of how far we are entitled to judge prospective responsibilities – our own and other people’s – and how far we are entitled to judge retrospective responsibilities – our own and others’ – raises yet another complication for how we think about responsibility. As the example of childhood suggests, there can be degrees of responsibility. Ascribing different degrees of responsibility may be necessary or appropriate with regard to different sorts of decision-making. Hence we sometimes say, “He’s not ready for that sort of responsibility” or “She couldn’t be expected to understand the implications of that sort of choice.” In the first place, such statements highlight the close connection between prospective and retrospective responsibility: it will not be appropriate to hold someone (fully) responsible for his actions if he was faced with responsibilities that were unrealistic and over-demanding. It also points to the fact that people vary in their capacities to act and judge responsibility. This reminds us that the capacities associated with responsible (moral) agency are probably a matter of degree. It might also remind us of a fourth use of “responsibility”: to name a virtue of character.

d. Responsibility as a Virtue

While theories of moral agency tend to regard an agent as either responsible or not, with no half-measures, our everyday language usually deploys the term “responsible” in a more nuanced way. As just indicated, one way we do this is by weighing degrees of responsibility, both with regard to the sort of prospective responsibilities a person should bear and a person’s liability to blame or penalties. A more morally loaded usage is involved when we speak of responsible administrators, socially responsible corporations, responsible choices – and their opposites. In these cases, we use the term “responsible” as a term of praise: responsibility represents a virtue that people (and organizations) may exhibit in one area of their conduct, or perhaps exemplify in their entire lives.

In such cases, our meaning is usually quite clear. The responsible person can be relied on to judge and to act in certain morally desirable ways; in the case of more demanding (“more responsible”) roles, the person can be trusted to exercise initiative and to demonstrate commitment; and when things go wrong, such a person will be prepared to take responsibility for dealing with things. One way of putting this might be to say that the responsible person can be counted on take her responsibilities seriously. We will not need to hold her responsible, because we can depend on her holding herself responsible. Another way of putting the matter would be much more contentious, and harkens back to the question of whether we should think of moral agency as a matter of degree. One might claim that the responsible person possesses the elements pertaining to moral agency (such as capacities to judge moral norms or to respond to others) to a greater degree than the irresponsible person. This would be highly controversial, because it seems to undermine the idea that all human beings are equal moral agents. However, it would help us to see why a term we sometimes use to describe all moral agents can also be used to praise some people rather than others.

However this may be, it is fair to say that this usage of “responsible” has received the least attention from philosophers. This is interesting given that this is clearly a virtue of considerable importance in modern societies. At any rate, it is possible to see some important connections between the virtue and the areas that philosophers have emphasized.

The irresponsible person is not one who lacks prospective responsibilities, nor is she one who may not be held responsible retrospectively. It is only that she does not take her responsibilities seriously. Note, however, that the more responsible someone is, the more we will be inclined to entrust her with demanding roles and responsibilities. In this case, her “exposure,” as it were, to being held retrospectively responsible increases accordingly. And the same is true in the opposite direction, when someone consistently behaves less responsibly. An illuminating essay by Herbert Fingarette (1967) considers the limit case of the psychopath, someone who shows absolutely no moral concern for others, nor any sensitivity to moral reproach. Perhaps our first response will be to say that such a person is irresponsible, even evil. Fingarette argues we must finally conclude that he is in fact not a candidate for moral responsibility – that he is not a moral agent, not to be assigned prospective responsibilities, not to be held retrospectively responsible for his actions. In other words, it only makes sense to grade someone as responsible or irresponsible, so long as holding her responsible has any prospect of making her act more responsibly. The psychopath will never be responsive to blame, nor ever feel guilt. In fact, as someone who will never take any responsibility seriously, he does not qualify as a moral agent at all – as being responsible in its most basic sense. This might sound like writing the person a blank check to behave utterly immorally, but two points should be remembered: First, society protects itself against such people, often by incarcerating them as insane (“psychopathy” names a mental disorder). Second, the Kantian account reminds us that not to treat someone as responsible for her actions is to fail to respect her as the author of her deeds. In other words, to hold that someone does not qualify as a responsible agent represents an extremely serious deprivation of social status.

Looking at the matter positively, we can also say that a person who exhibits the virtue of responsibility lives up to the three other aspects of responsibility in an exemplary way. First, she exercises the capacities of responsible moral agency to a model degree. Second, she approaches her previous actions and omissions with all due concern, being prepared to take responsibility for any failings she may have shown. And third, she takes her prospective responsibilities seriously, being both a capable judge of what she should do, and willing to act accordingly.

3. Moral versus Legal Responsibility

As some of the examples of retrospective and prospective responsibility indicate, law has an especial connection with questions of responsibility. Legal institutions often assign responsibilities to people, and hold them responsible for failing to fulfill these responsibilities – either via the criminal law and policing, or by allowing other parties to bring them to court via the civil law, for example when a contract is breached. Accordingly, the justification of punishment represents a major concern of philosophy of law. Likewise, legal philosophers, including figures such as H.L.A. Hart, Herbert Morris and Joel Feinberg, have written a great deal about the philosophy of responsibility. Their discussions have had considerable influence on moral and political philosophers.

The most obvious point, that all writers will endorse, is that legal and moral responsibility often overlap, but will diverge on some occasions. In the liberal state we can hope that there will be systematic convergence, inasmuch as the law will uphold important moral precepts, especially concerning the protection of rights. (In a corrupt or tyrannical state, on the other hand, it is obviously very common that legal and moral responsibility have no relation at all. Tyrants often demand that their subjects be complicit in immorality, such as harming the innocent.) An example where law and morality clearly overlap is murder: it is both a legal crime and an egregious moral wrong. Few would dispute, then, that murder ought to be punished, both legally and morally speaking.

However, the law does not punish attempted murder in the same way as an actual murder – that is, it does not prioritize intentions over outcomes in the same way that many believe that moral judgment should. The difference between murder and grievous bodily harm may not lie in the intention or even in the actual wounds inflicted: everything depends on the outcome, that is, whether death results. Thus the crimes attract different punishments, though our moral judgment of someone may be no lighter in the case of a particularly vicious assault. One way of putting this is to say that the law is concerned with definite outcomes, and only secondarily with intentions. Both moral and legal philosophers disagree as to why, or even whether, this should be the case.

A distinguished line of thought, exemplified by H.L.A. Hart in his essay “Legal Responsibility and Excuses” (in Hart, 1968), holds that legal responsibility should be understood in different terms to moral judgment. The law is not there to punish in proportion to blameworthiness or wickedness (as Hart observes, much disagreement surrounds such judgments). Instead, the law provides people who are competent to choose with reasons to act in socially responsible ways. Hart focuses on excuses under the law, such as insanity or coercion. Law admits such excuses in spite of their possible consequentialist disutility (excuses may well decrease the deterrent force of law, because some people might hope to misuse these excuses to wriggle out of legal accountability). For Hart, excuses are an important part of a system that does not just seek to prevent crime, but also to protect choice; as a result, law does not punish those who were not able to choose their actions. Under such a “choosing system,” “individuals can find out, in general terms at least, the costs they have to pay if they act in certain ways” (1968: 44). In this way, law can foster “the prime social virtue of self-restraint” (1968: 182). Law can also respect what Peter Strawson stressed in “Freedom and Resentment” (1962): that our social relations depend on our emotional responses to people’s voluntary actions. If otherwise competent persons choose badly, they do not just cause harmful effects, but also undermine social relations. Hart’s justification of punishment, then, holds that attributions of (legal) responsibility help uphold social order while respecting individual choice. His account therefore combines a consequentialist emphasis on external actions and outcomes with an important mental element: punishment is only appropriate in case of competent choice, that is, where excusing conditions do not apply. However, Hart emphasizes that his account does not apply to moral judgment, about which his views seem to be more or less Kantian.

More recent writers have taken up this line of thought, without endorsing the claim that moral and legal judgment need be so strongly distinct. Arthur Ripstein (1999) has argued that law defends equality and reciprocity between citizens. It therefore has to protect people’s interests in freedom of action as well their interests in security of person and property. Law has to be concerned with fairness to victims as well as fairness to culprits. To do this, it defines a system of prospective responsibilities that protect the interests of all, and holds people retrospectively responsible for breaches. For instance, the coercive measure of punishment is called for where a person disregards another’s liberty or security interests. Threats or attempts also disregard those interests and may be punishable, but they do not undermine equality in social relations as severely as successful violations of rights. (As Ripstein notes, his approach actually descends from Kant’s account of punishment, which works in a different way to Kant’s account of moral imputation. On this, see Hill, 2002.) Ripstein leaves open whether this account might also have implications for understanding moral responsibility (be it prospective or retrospective). However, his underlying idea – concerning fairness to both wrong-doer and victim – does suggest problems for accounts of retrospective moral responsibility that focus (in more or less Kantian fashion) only on the culprit’s choice and intentions.

A quite different school of thought, recently exemplified in the work of Michael Moore (1998), endorses a recognizably Kantian view of moral responsibility, and argues that the law ought to share this approach. Apart from the theoretical difficulties that face the Kantian approach to moral responsibility, however, this school of thought has to claim that large parts of legal practice are misconceived. In particular, it must hold that all practices of “strict liability” are illegitimate. Strict liability is the practice of holding a person accountable if certain harms materialize, even where she could not have done anything to prevent those harms coming about. (Contrast Ripstein’s account just given, or the above example of the customer who accidentally breaks a vase in a shop.) Similarly, Moore’s approach faces severe difficulties in explaining why the law should punish on the basis of outcomes and not only intentions – even though every legal system shares this feature.

Legal responsibility has another interesting relation to the question of responsible agency. In addition to admitting “excusing conditions” such as insanity, systems of law stipulate various age conditions as to who counts as responsible. For example, all jurisdictions have an age of criminal responsibility: a person under the age of, say, twelve cannot be punished for murder. Likewise, law permits only people above certain ages to engage in various activities: drinking alcohol, voting, standing as an elected representative, entering into contracts, consenting to medical treatment, and so forth. Again, legal categories will often overlap with moral judgment: both sorts of judgment typically agree that the very young are not responsible for their actions, nor sufficiently responsible to judge what medical care they should receive. That said, our non-legal judgments about when a person becomes sufficiently mature to be responsible invariably depend on the person, as well as on the difficult question of what degree of maturity is necessary to responsible conduct in different spheres of life.

4. Collective Responsibility

In recent decades increasing attention has been given to the question of collective responsibility. This question can arise wherever the actions of a group of people combine to generate a particular result – whether a corporation, or the citizens of a state, or even individuals who have no particular connection to one another. (A well-known example of the last is “the tragedy of the commons,” when lots of people use a shared resource – for instance, everyone using the commons as grazing land for their cattle – resulting in the degradation of that resource. Our increasing awareness of damage to environment has given this case particular contemporary importance.) There are questions about the responsibilities of the collective, and of the individual as a member of that body. Recall that one of the original uses of the word responsible” was to describe a desirable quality of government, and that we still use the word in this way to praise some institutions, just as we may criticize a corporation or group as irresponsible.

Many perplexities about shared responsibility arise from the thought that individuals are responsible agents, in a way that groups cannot be. A well-known formulation captures this problem neatly: “No soul to damn, no body to kick” (Coffee, 1981). As pointed out above, it is usually thought that a person can be blamed or deserve punishment by virtue of certain psychological capacities (“soul”), as well as by virtue of being the same person (“body”) today as she was yesterday. On this account, there is a serious puzzle as to how a collective can be responsible, since a collective lacks the psychological capacities of an individual person (but see the Encyclopedia article on collective intentionality) and its membership tends to alter over time. Note, however, that if we think of responsibility in terms of capacities to interact in the light of shared norms – as the Humean account of moral agency might suggest – rather than as a matter of particular psychological capacities, then we need not be so concerned with those capacities nor, perhaps, with changes in membership.

A separate article, collective moral responsibility, discusses the issues that arise here. It may be useful, however, to indicate briefly how the four aspects of individual responsibility discussed above might apply to the collective case.

a. The Agency of Groups

In the first place, it is clear that collective bodies can function as agents, at least in some circumstances. Groups and organizations can pursue particular policies, respect legal requirements, reach decisions about how to respond to situations, and create important benefits and costs for other agents. They can also offer an account of their previous actions and policies, setting out how and why these were decided upon. However, these abilities clearly depend upon the collective’s being appropriately organized, which is a matter of internal communication, deliberative mechanisms, and allocation of responsibilities to individuals. Clearly, organizations may function better or worse in all these regards – as may the other organizations with which they interact and which may, in turn, hold them responsible.

b. Retrospective Responsibility of Collectives

By the same token, collective bodies can be held responsible. In fact, law does this all the time, at least for formally established collectives that are not states, for example, corporations, charities and statutory bodies such as government agencies. Responsible officers may be called to account – to answer for their organization’s actions, to be dismissed or even punished if that account is unsatisfactory. As a body, the collective owns property and acts in systematic ways: legal measures can therefore make it provide compensation, or exact fines simply as a punishment; a court can order the body to act differently or to remedy a particular case or situation.

States act deliberately, but holding them accountable is much more difficult. States can commit the most serious wrongs, waging war or inflicting grave injustice upon their own peoples. International law attempts to codify some duties of states, and the duties of individuals who govern them. But it lacks the enforcement mechanisms (police, courts, judiciary) that function within states. Examples of attempts to hold states and their agents retrospectively responsible include: South Africa’s well-known Truth and Reconciliation Commission, which addressed the brutalities of the old apartheid regime; the trial of individuals, such as the 1961 Jerusalem trial of Nazi functionary Adolf Eichmann; and the exacting of reparations following the defeat of a state, for instance the notorious Versailles agreement that penalized Germany for its role in the First World War.

As the article on collective moral responsibility discusses, imposing liabilities, punishments or duties onto collective bodies will finally involve costs or duties for individuals. This poses many difficult questions about how the supposed responsibilities of the group might be traced back to particular individuals. Perhaps the people who were most to blame have died or moved jobs or are otherwise out of reach. Should the citizens of a country make amends for the wrong-doing of their forefathers, for instance? Ought a corporation that has fired its top managers still be liable to pay fines for the misdeeds that those former managers led the corporation into? For many, such questions highlight the most puzzling aspect of collective responsibility, namely that individuals might justly be required to make amends for others’ actions and policies.

c. Prospective Responsibilities of Groups

For formally organized collectives, prospective responsibilities are often codified by law, or (in the case of a charity, for instance) specified in a group’s constitution. As in the individual case, of course, our moral judgment may differ from codified responsibilities: not only moral but also political arguments often surround these allocations of responsibility. Proponents of corporate social responsibility, for example, generally hold that companies’ responsibilities extend much beyond their legal duties, including wider obligations to the communities amongst which they operate and to the natural environment. Just as in the case of individuals, attempts to hold groups and organizations retrospectively accountable often, therefore, reveal serious moral disagreements, and invariably have a political dimension, too.

d. Responsibility as a Virtue

Groups, companies, and states can all be more or less responsible. Originally, “responsible government” described government responsive to the wants and needs of its citizens; in the same way, we now speak of corporate social responsibility. As in the individual case, for collectives to exhibit the virtue of responsibility depends on the other three aspects of responsibility discussed in this article. With regard to moral agency, it will require good internal organization, so that the body is aware of its situation, capacities, actions and impacts. With regard to retrospective responsibility, it involves a willingness and ability to deal with failings and omissions, and to learn from these. In terms of prospective responsibility, the collective’s activities and policies must be aptly chosen, conformable to wider moral norms, and properly put into effect. As with individuals, how far a body is likely to do these things also depends on how far those around it (that is, both individuals and other collectives) act responsibly. For instance, others will need to form appropriate expectations of the collective, and be prepared to enforce these expectations fairly and reasonably.

5. Conclusion

This article has pointed to four dimensions of responsibility, reflecting the various ways in which the word is used. Moral agency can also be termed responsible agency, meaning that a person is open to moral evaluation. This sort of moral status points in two directions. It means that a person’s actions can be judged morally, so that various responses such as praise or punishment may be appropriate – this is the stuff of retrospective responsibility. In the other direction, a moral agent has particular duties or concerns – the stuff of prospective responsibility. Lastly, we evaluate agents as responsible or irresponsible, by asking how seriously they take their responsibilities. This involves evaluating them in terms of how far they exercise (or possess) the capacities pertaining to moral agency, how they approach their past actions and failings, and how they approach their duties and areas of responsibility. As we have seen, writers differ concerning the connections between moral and legal responsibility, but it is also true that these four dimensions all find echo in legal uses of responsibility.

Philosophical discussion often considers these aspects of responsibility only with regard to individuals, so that the term “collective responsibility” appears puzzling, despite its frequent usage in everyday life. The final part of this article briefly considered how each of these dimensions can be applied to groups, although it has left aside some difficult questions that arise – for example, how a group’s retrospective responsibilities can be fairly apportioned to individuals, or how collectives can be organized so as to be more or less responsible.

This article began by observing that the word responsibility is surprisingly modern, and that two quite different philosophical stories have been told about it. Very little was said concerning the first story, concerning responsibility in political thought. However, it has pointed out that the concept extends more widely than modern philosophical debates tend to acknowledge. Prospective responsibility relates to the fine-grained division of responsibilities involved in the different roles which people adopt in modern societies – above all, the different spheres of responsibility which we are given in the workplace. By the same token, responsibility has clearly become a very important virtue in modern societies.

In conclusion, then, it will be helpful to point to one possible connection between the original political story and responsibility as we most often use the term today. (See also Pettit, 2001, for another account.) Uncertainty and disagreement about how we should live together is one of the most marked features of modern life. We live in an age when both individuals and organizations are asked to be endlessly flexible. Our roles and responsibilities are continually changing and continually challenged. Uncertainty and disagreement about prospective responsibilities are always passing over into disputes about retrospective responsibility, as we hold one another accountable. We all face the test, then, of how to conduct ourselves amid this uncertainty and disagreement. It is surely one hallmark of the person who exhibits the virtue of responsibility that she contributes to cooperation in the face of this difficult situation. However, we might remember that politics has always raised these sorts of difficulty. In modern societies, negotiation, compromise and judgment are required, not just of those who take on formal political office, but of all of us. It is surely no wonder, then, that we no longer think of responsibility as only a question for the political sphere.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adkins, A.W.H. (1960) Merit and Responsibility, Clarendon Press, Oxford
    • Argues that the Greeks lacked modern, Kantian notions of duty and fairness in assigning responsibility.
  • Aristotle Nicomachean Ethics – the most readable translation is Roger Crisp’s, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 2000.
  • Bok, Hilary (1998) Freedom and Responsibility, Princeton University Press, Princeton NJ
    • A Kantian analysis of moral agency and retrospective responsibility.
  • Bovens, Mark (1998) The Quest for Responsibility: Accountability and Citizenship in Complex Organizations, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
    • Investigates how regulation, organisational reform, and different means of accountability can address irresponsibility on the part of institutions.
  • Coffee, Jr., John (1981) “‘No Soul to Damn: No Body to Kick’: An Unscandalized Inquiry into the Problem of Corporate Punishment” Michigan Law Review, 79, 386-460.
  • Duff, R.A. (1990) Intention, Agency and Criminal Liability, Blackwell, Oxford, Chapters 3-5
    • A careful analysis of moral and legal responsibility, focusing on the centrality of intentional action.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1970) Doing and Deserving: Essays in the Theory of Responsibility, Princeton University Press, Princeton
    • A collection of classic essays on moral and legal responsibility.
  • Fingarette, Herbert (1967) “Acceptance of Responsibility” in his On Responsibility, Basic Books, New York
    • The essay referred to above, which takes the example of psychopathy and argues that responsibility attributions are intelligible only insofar as they connect up with a person’s existing moral concern.
  • Fingarette, Herbert (2004) Mapping Responsibility: Explorations in Mind, Law, Myth, and Culture, Open Court, Chicago
    • A collection of notably succinct essays, summarizing a life-time’s careful reflection on many aspects of responsibility.
  • Fischer, John Martin & Mark Ravizza (1998) Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
    • Contemporary restatement of the idea that responsibility relates to rational control over one’s actions.
  • Hart, H.L.A. (1968) Punishment and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, Oxford
    • A noted twentieth century legal theorist analyses legal and moral responsibility, strongly defending distinctions between moral and legal responsibility, and between “punishment” and (in case of insanity) “treatment” .
  • Hill, Thomas E (2002) Human Welfare and Moral Worth: Kantian Perspectives, Clarendon, Oxford
    • Chapters 9 & 10 explain how Kant’s account of punishment is distinct from his account of moral imputation.
  • Hume, David (1777) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (various editions)
    • Appendix IV, “Of some verbal disputes,” argues that there is no real line between a talent and a (moral) virtue, and that the real question concerning any character trait is whether it elicits approval (praise) or disapproval (blame) .
  • Jaspers, Karl (1947) The Question of German Guilt, translated by E.B. Ashton, Dial Press, New York
    • A classic reflection on the issues facing Germany after the second world war, posed in terms of criminal, political, moral, and metaphysical guilt.
  • Jonas, Hans (1984) The Imperative of Responsibility, University of Chicago Press, Chicago
    • Argues that our new power to destroy nature creates a historically novel responsibility toward future generations.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1793) Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, books I & II (various translations)
    • Kant’s most sustained investigation of the basis on which individuals can be held accountable for failing to live up to morality. .
  • Korsgaard, Christine (1996) “Creating the Kingdom of Ends: Reciprocity and Responsibility in Personal Relations” in her Creating the Kingdom of Ends, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
    • A sophisticated Kantian account of responsibility, that quietly takes leave of Kant’s own views on the matter.
  • Korsgaard, Christine (1996) The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Kutz, Christopher (2000) Complicity: Ethics and Law for a Collective Age, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
    • A study of collective responsibility, arguing that individuals can justly be held responsible for group actions, in ways that need not mirror their individual contributions.
  • McKeon, Richard (1957) “The development and the significance of the concept of responsibility” Revue Internationale de Philosophie, XI, no. 39, 3-32
    • A historical study of the concept, stressing its political roots.
  • Moore, Michael (1998) Placing Blame, Clarendon Press, Oxford
    • Argues that legal responsibility and moral (retrospective) responsibility should both be understood in Kantian manner, based on the culpability that can only owe to a person’s free choices.
  • Pettit, Philip (2001) A Theory of Freedom: From the Psychology to the Politics of Agency, Polity, Cambridge
    • An account of responsible agency that emphasizes both responsiveness to reasons and the interactive nature of responsibility attribution, and explores the connection between individual agency and political contexts.
  • Ricoeur, Paul (1992) “The concept of responsibility: an essay in semantic analysis” in his The Just, trans David Pellauer, University of Chicago Press, Chicago
    • A demanding but astonishingly rich essay analyzing the concept historically and in relation to the fundamentals of human agency.
  • Ripstein, Arthur (1999) Equality, Responsibility and the Law, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge
    • An important recent discussion, that disavows the “voluntarism” (the focus on individual capacities underlying responsible agency and the fairness of retrospective responsibility) of many moral and legal accounts of responsibility, by suggesting that legal practices of responsibility are essentially about fostering fair terms of interaction.
  • Russell, Paul (1995) Freedom and Moral Sentiment: Hume’s Way of Naturalising Responsibility, Oxford University Press, New York
    • Shows how Hume’s approach is more sophisticated than a narrow utilitarian “economy of threats” theory.
  • Scanlon, T M (1998) What We Owe to Each Other, Chapter 6: “Responsibility,” Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA
    • Attacks a simple account of retrospective responsibility in terms of choice (“the forfeiture view”), for a more sophisticated “value of choice” view.
  • Sher, George (1987) Desert, Princeton University Press, Princeton
    • A careful, advanced study of the concept of desert.
  • Smart, J.J.C. (1961) “Free will, praise and blame” Mind 70, 291-306
    • A clear and succinct utilitarian account of praise and blame.
  • Smiley, Marion (1992) Moral Responsibility and the Boundaries of Community: Power and Accountability from a Pragmatic Point of View, University of Chicago Press, Chicago
    • Criticizes conventional discussions of freedom and determinism, claiming that they fail to investigate the idea of responsibility.
  • Strawson, Peter (1962) “Freedom and resentment” Proceedings of the British Academy 48, 1-25, reprinted in his Freedom and Resentment and Other Essays, Methuen, London, 1974
    • A classic essay, that seeks to bypass “free will” based accounts of responsibility for one based on moral sentiments such as resentment, reflecting the line of thought labeled above as Humean.
  • Wallace, R. Jay (1994) Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA
    • Seeks to mediate between the Humean and Kantian accounts of (retrospective) responsibility sketched above, by asking when it is fair to hold someone responsible and thus expose them to “reactive” emotions such as resentment or indignation.
  • Watson, Gary (1982) Free Will, Oxford University Press, Oxford
    • A useful anthology of twentieth century treatments of free will, including Strawson (1962) .
  • Williams, Bernard (1981) “Internal and external reasons,” in his Moral Luck, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Williams, Bernard (1993) Shame and Necessity, University of California Press, Berkeley
    • Argues that the ancient Greeks had a sophisticated account of responsibility attribution. Though Williams relies on ancient Greek texts, his own views are identifiably Humean, and can be read as a reply to Adkins’ (1960) quasi-Kantian critique of Greek morality.
  • Williams, Bernard (1995) Making Sense of Humanity and other Philosophical Papers, 1982-1993, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, Chapters 1-3.

Author Information

Garrath Williams
Lancaster University
United Kingdom