Roderick M. Chisholm: Epistemology

Roderick M. Chisholm, a luminary of 20th century philosophy, is best known for his contributions in epistemology and metaphysics. His groundbreaking theory of knowledge opened the door to the late 20th and early 21st century work on the analysis of knowledge, skepticism, foundationalism, internalism, the ethics of beliefs, and evidentialism, to name just a few topics. Chisholm’s analysis of knowledge was the basis of the Gettier problem.

Chisholm responds to skepticism as one of three alternatives to the ancient, insoluble problem of the wheel, which he termed the problem of the criterion—the vicious circle encountered in answering the two fundamental questions of epistemology: ‘What kinds of things can we know?’ and ‘What are the sources of knowledge?’. Answering either requires first answering the other. Chisholm adopts particularism, Thomas Reid’s and G. E. Moore’s ‘common sense’ approach, which proceeds by proposing a tentative answer to the first question, in order to answer the second question.

Chisholm provides an analysis of epistemic justification as a response to the Socratic question “What is the difference between knowledge and true opinion?” He explains justification as epistemic preferability, a primitive relationship based on the epistemic goals and ethics of belief. Chisholm defines terms of epistemic appraisal associated with various levels of justified belief to elucidate the level required for knowledge. The sufficiency of Chisholm’s analysis is examined in light of the Gettier problem.

Chisholm’s epistemology is the standard bearer of foundationalism, first proposed by René Descartes. In its defense, Chisholm proposes a unique answer to explain why empirical knowledge rests on foundational certainties about one’s mental/phenomenal experiences, that is, sense-data propositions.

Chisholm resolves the metaphysical objections to sense-data raised by philosophers such as Gilbert Ryle. Chisholm argues that under certain conditions, sense-data propositions about how things appear are self-presenting, certain, and directly evident—the foundation of empirical knowledge.

Chisholm defines a priori knowledge to explain how necessary truths are also foundational. This definition explains Kant’s claims about synthetic a priori propositions and provides insight into the status of Chisholm’s epistemic principles.

Finally, Chisholm answers the problem of empiricism that plagued philosophers since John Locke, the problem of accounting for the justification of beliefs about the external world (non-foundational propositions) from propositions about the contents of one’s mind (foundational propositions). Chisholm proposes epistemic principles explaining the roles of perception, memory, and coherence (confirmation and concurrence) to complete his account of justification.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. The Fundamental Questions of Epistemology
    2. Chisholm’s Philosophical Method
  2. The Traditional Analysis of Knowledge
    1. Chisholm’s Analysis
    2. The Gettier Problem
  3. Why Foundationalism?
    1. The Myth of the Given and the Stopping Place for Socratic Questioning
  4. The Directly Evident—The Foundation
    1. Sense-Data and the Problem of the Speckled Hen
    2. The Directly Evident—Seeming, Appearing, and the Self-Presenting
  5. The Truths of Reason and A Priori Knowledge
    1. The Justification of A Priori Knowledge
    2. Chisholm, Kant, and the Synthetic A Priori
  6. The Indirectly Evident
    1. Chisholm’s Solution to the Problem of Empiricism
    2. Epistemic Principles—Perception and Memory, Confirmation and Concurrence
  7. Postscript
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Roderick M. Chisholm, one of the greatest philosophers of the 20th century (Hahn 1997), was not only a prolific writer best known for his works on epistemology (theory of knowledge) and metaphysics, but for his many students who became prominent philosophers. In epistemology, Chisholm is best known as the leading proponent of foundationalism, claiming that:

  • empirical knowledge is built on a foundation of the evidence of the senses; and
  • we have privileged epistemic access to the evidence of our senses.

Foundationalism has its roots in Rene Descartes’ classic work of early modern philosophy, Meditations on First Philosophy. Foundationalism was central to the debate concerning the nature of human knowledge between the Continental Rationalists (Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz), the British Empiricists (Locke, Berkeley, and Hume) and Kant. In the 20th century, Bertrand Russell and A. J. Ayer, luminaries of British Analytic Philosophy, and C. I. Lewis, the American Pragmatist, defended foundationalism; while Logical Positivists, including Hans Reichenbach, a member of the Vienna Circle, argued that foundationalism was untenable. After World War II, Chisholm entered this debate defending foundationalism from attacks by W. V. O. Quine and Wilfred Sellars; all three having been students of C. I. Lewis at Harvard University.

Chisholm’s writings on epistemology first appeared in a 1941 article and his comprehensive and detailed account of perceptual knowledge was first presented in his 1957 book Perceiving (Chisholm 1957). He refined his epistemology over the next forty years in response to counterexamples, objections, and questions raised by his colleagues, students, and critics. These refinements first appeared in Chisholm’s numerous published articles, and were incorporated into the three editions of Theory of Knowledge published in 1966, 1977 and 1989.

Chisholm’s epistemology was unique in not only addressing the “big questions”, but in presenting a detailed theory accounting for the structure of epistemic knowledge and justification.  

a. The Fundamental Questions of Epistemology

Chisholm opens his final edition of Theory of Knowledge addressing the most basic problem of epistemology, the challenge of skepticism—the view that we do not know anything. (For an explanation of skepticism, see: Chisholm explains that to answer this challenge an answer is required to the question:

    1. What do we know or what is the extent of our knowledge?

This, in turn, requires an answer to the question:

    1. How are we to decide, in a particular case, whether we know or what are the criteria of knowing?

But, to answer this second question, about the criteria of knowing, we must answer the first question, that is, of what we know. The challenge of skepticism thus ensnares us in the ancient problem of “the diallelus”—the problem of “the wheel”, or, as Chisholm calls it, “the problem of the criterion”. (For a detailed explanation of this problem, see

The problem of the criterion can only be resolved by adopting one of three views: skepticism, particularism, or methodism. Skepticism claims that we do not know the extent of our knowledge and we do not know the criteria of knowledge, hence, we do not or cannot know anything. Particularism claims that there are particular propositions or types of propositions that we know, so we have at least a partial answer to the first question, and we can use these paradigm cases of knowledge to develop criteria of knowing, answering the second question. Methodism claims that we can identify certain criteria of knowing, answering the second question, which in turn provides criteria which can be employed to determine the extent of our knowledge, answering the first question.

Chisholm asserts that deciding between these three views cannot be done without involving ourselves in a vicious circle or begging questions: assuming an answer to one or both of the questions posed. That is, Chisholm maintains that the problem of the criterion cannot be solved. Chisholm adopts a “common sense” brand of particularism following in the footsteps of Thomas Reid (the 18th century Scottish philosopher) and G. E. Moore (the 20th century English philosopher). The “common sense” assumption is that we know more or less what, upon careful reflection, we think that we know. To justify this working assumption of commonsense particularism, Chisholm sets out as a goal of epistemology to improve our beliefs by ranking them with respect to their relative reasonability. Doing this leads him to adopt an internalist conception of justified belief, presupposing “that one can know certain things about oneself without the need of outside assistance” (Chisholm 1989, pg. 5).

The breadth and depth of Chisholm’s epistemology require focusing here on his solution to four fundamental questions and problems in the theory of knowledge:

    1. The analysis of knowledge or, in his terms, the problem of the Theatetus;
    2. Why knowledge must rest on a foundation of sense-data (or why foundationalism)?
    3. What is the nature of the data of the senses (the Directly Evident) and the truths of reason (the a priori), conferring on them privileged epistemic status to serve as a foundation of knowledge?
    4. How is epistemic justification transmitted from sense-data to empirical propositions about the external world (the Indirectly Evident)?

The primary focus of this discussion will be Chisholm’s account of empirical knowledge (or a posteriori knowledge). In the process Chisholm’s account of the knowledge of necessary truths or a priori knowledge is examined.

b. Chisholm’s Philosophical Method

Chisholm introduces his epistemology by clearly articulating the specific philosophical puzzles or problems he proposes to solve, stating the problem unambiguously, presenting his solution clearly defining the terms in which his proposal is cast, considering a series of counterexamples or conceptual tests, and responding to each in detail. This approach not only characterized Chisholm’s philosophical writings, but also his pedagogical methodology. He conducted seminars attended by graduate students and faculty members, at Brown University (where he was on the faculty for virtually his entire academic career) and at the University of Massachusetts at Amherst (to which, for many years, he traveled 100 miles to conduct a weekly seminar). In addition to his colleagues at Brown, notable attendees at these seminars included Edmund Gettier, Herbert Heidelberger, Gareth Matthews, Bruce Aune, Vere Chappell, and his former graduate students Robert Sleigh and Fred Feldman.

Chisholm would present philosophical puzzles and his solutions, and the attendees would challenge his solutions by raising counterexamples, objections, and problems. Chisholm would respond to them, and then return the next week with a revised set of definitions and principles to be defended from the welcomed onslaught of a new set of counterexamples. Honoring this methodology, the Philosophical Lexicon defined a term:

chisholm, v. To make repeated small alterations in a definition or example. “He started with definition (d.8) and kept chisholming away at it until he ended up with (d.8””””).”

2. The Traditional Analysis of Knowledge

Chisholm opens the first edition of Theory of Knowledge (Chisholm 1966) considering Socrates’ claim in Plato’s Meno that, even though he does not know much, he knows that there is a difference between true opinion and knowledge. The Socratic challenge is to explain the difference between knowing a proposition and making a lucky guess. Plato’s answer, known as the Traditional Analysis of Knowledge (TAK), can be expressed as:

(TAK) S knows p =Df 1. S believes (or accepts) p;
2. p is true; and
3. S is justified in believing p.
(where S is the knower and p is a proposition or statement believed).

Thus, according to TAK, the difference between knowing that the Mets won last year’s World Series and making a lucky guess is having an account for, having a good reason for, or being justified in believing that they won the World Series.

Chisholm raises Socrates criticism of the traditional analysis of knowledge in Plato’s Theatetus:

We may say of this type of definition, then, what Socrates said of the attempt to define knowledge in terms of reason or explanation: “If, my boy, the command to add reason or explanation means learning to know and not merely getting an opinion…, our splendid definition of knowledge, would be a fine affair! For learning to know is acquiring knowledge, is it not?” (Theatetus 209E; cited in Chisholm 1966, pg. 7).

Chisholm explains that justified belief is ordinarily understood to presuppose the concept of knowledge. Therefore, the traditional analysis of knowledge appears to be circular, that is, defining knowledge in terms that are themselves defined in terms of knowledge. Chisholm sets out to explain a notion of epistemic justification which inoculates TAK from the charge of pernicious circularity.

a. Chisholm’s Analysis

Chisholm proposes to define knowledge as follows:

(TAK-C) S knows p =Df p is true, S accepts p, and p is evident for S. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 102)

He then undertakes to explain how his version of the traditional analysis avoids the circularity problem of the Theaetetus.

In this analysis the requirement of justified belief, the justification condition of knowledge, is replaced by a condition that the proposition is evident, where evident is a technical term of epistemic appraisal for which Chisholm provides a definition. Roughly speaking, a proposition is evident for a person on the condition that the evidence available to a person is sufficiently strong to constitute a good reason for believing the proposition.

Chisholm does not think that replacing the term justified belief with the term evident magically solves the circularity problem of the Theatetus. In fact, Chisholm concedes that his terms of epistemic appraisal, for example, evident, justified belief, know, more reasonable, certain, beyond reasonable doubt, acceptable, having some presumptions in its favor, gratuitous, and unacceptable, possibly form a closed circle of concepts that cannot be defined in non-epistemic terms. To avoid this seeming circularity, Chisholm first specifies a primitive term which expresses a relationship of epistemic preferability, more reasonable than, explaining this in terms of a specified set of epistemic goals or intellectual requirements of rationality. Next, he defines all of the terms of epistemic appraisal in terms of this primitive relationship. These technical terms, in turn, define various levels of epistemic justification. His final step is to identify the level of epistemic justification, that is, evident, as being the level of justification required for knowledge.

Chisholm fills in the details by providing an ethics of belief and a logic of epistemic terms. The full account of empirical knowledge is completed with a set of epistemic rules or principles, analogous to the rules of morality or logic, explaining the structure of the justification of empirical beliefs. Chisholm believed that the adequacy of a theory of knowledge is dependent on these principles.

The first condition of Chisholm’s analysis of knowledge requires the knower to accept (or, as more commonly expressed, believe) the proposition. Acceptance is one of three mutually exclusive propositional attitudes a person may take with respect to any proposition that he/she considers; the other two being: (1) denying the propositions, that is, accepting the denial (negation) of the proposition, and (2) withholding or suspending judgment about the proposition, that is, neither accepting nor denying the proposition. For example, a person who has considered the proposition that God exists is either (i) a theist who accepts the proposition that God exists, (ii) an atheist who denies that God exists (accepts that ‘God exists’ is false), or (iii) an agnostic who withholds or suspends judgment with respect to the proposition that God exists.

Chisholm draws a parallel between epistemology and ethics to explain epistemic appraisal. Ethics and epistemology are essentially normative or evaluative disciplines. Ethics is concerned with the justification of actions, and analogously, epistemology with the justification of belief (Chisholm 1977 pp. 1-2). A goal of ethics is to provide an account or explanation of moral appraisal, for example, good, right, and so forth. Similarly, epistemology seeks to provide an account or explanation of epistemic appraisal or evaluation. Chisholm’s account of knowledge proceeds by defining knowing a proposition in terms of the proposition’s being evident; and a proposition’s being evident in terms of the primitive relationship of epistemic evaluation, that is, more reasonable than.

Chisholm distinguishes two types of evaluation, absolute and practical, illustrating the distinction as follows. It may have been absolutely morally right to have killed Hitler or Stalin when they were infants, however, it would not have been practically right from the moral standpoint because no one could have foreseen the harm they would cause. Absolute rightness depends on an objective view of reality, that is, taking into consideration all of the truths related to an action. By contrast, practical rightness only depends on what a person could have foreseen.

Chisholm’s view is that justified belief depends on what is practically right for the person to believe. He is committed to the view that epistemic justification and, hence, knowledge, depends on evidence ‘internally’ available to the knower, a view known as Internalism. In support of this view, he points out that we rarely have direct access to the truth of propositions, that is, to reality. Being justified in believing a proposition is dependent on how well believing a given proposition meets the goals or requirements of rationality. The degree to which a proposition meets these goals is relative to the evidence available to a person; not relative to the absolute or ‘God’s eye’ view. Epistemic appraisal or evaluation is a function of the relative rationality of a person’s adopting a propositional attitude (acceptance, denial, withholding) given the evidence available to that person.

In his classic essay “The Ethics of Belief”, W. K. Clifford suggested that “it is always wrong … to believe on the basis of insufficient evidence” (Clifford 1877 pg. 183). In explicating one’s epistemic duties, Chisholm adopts the somewhat lower standard that one’s beliefs are innocent until proven guilty, that is, it is permissible to believe a proposition unless one has evidence to the contrary. At the foundation of Chisholm’s account of justified belief is the primitive concept of epistemic preferability, more reasonable than, which he explains by appealing to “the concept of what might be called an ‘intellectual requirement’.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 14). He elaborates:

We may assume that every person is subject to a purely intellectual requirement–that of trying his best to bring it about that, for every proposition h that he considers, he accepts h if and only if h is true (Chisholm 1977 pg. 14).

Epistemic preferability, captured by Chisholm’s term more reasonable than, expresses a person’s relationship between two propositional attitudes. The more reasonable propositional attitude is the one that best fulfills one’s epistemic goals/intellectual requirements better than another attitude. Chisholm explains:

What is suggested when we say that one attitude is more reasonable than another is this: If the person in question were a rational being, if his concerns were purely intellectual, and if he were to choose between the two attitudes, then he would choose the more reasonable in preference to the less reasonable. (Chisholm 1966, pp. 21-22).

It may occur to some that this requirement may be satisfied by suspending judgment concerning every proposition, thereby, believing only what is true. However, Chisholm appeals to William James’s criteria, explaining that:

“There are two ways of looking at our duty in the matter of opinion–ways entirely different… We must know the truth: and we must avoid error…”

Each person, then is subject to two quite different requirements in connection with any proposition he considers;         (1) he should try his best to bring it about that if a proposition is true then he believe it; and (2) he should try his best to bring it about that if a proposition is false then he not believe it. (Chisholm 1977 pp. 14-15).

Analogizing believing a proposition to betting on the truth of a proposition is a useful way of thinking about this requirement (Mavrodes 1973). Our epistemic goals can be thought of as providing the bettor with two pieces of advice: (1) win many bets; and (2) lose few bets. If we refrain from betting, we will have followed the second piece of advice and disregarded the first, and, if we bet on everything, we will have followed the first piece of advice to the exclusion of the second.

On Chisholm’s view, the epistemic goals or duties require not merely that we avoid believing false propositions, but that we also strive to find the truth. Our “intellectual requirement” is to strike a happy median between believing everything and believing nothing. While these are two distinct and independent intellectual requirements, one’s epistemic duty is to do one’s best to fulfill both requirements at the same time. If, for example, you saw a small furry animal with a tail in the distance but could not discern what kind of animal it was, you could better fulfill your epistemic duties by believing that it is a dog than denying that it is a dog (believing that it is not a dog); but you would best meet both epistemic goals by withholding or suspending belief rather than by either believing or denying it.

Chisholm elaborates that more reasonable than is a relationship between propositional attitudes p and q which person S may adopt with regard to propositions at time t, which means that “S is so situated at t that his intellectual requirement, his responsibility as an intellectual being, is better fulfilled by p than by q” (Chisholm 1977 pp. 14-15). More reasonable than is an intentional concept, that is, “if one proposition is more reasonable than another for any given subject S, then S is able to understand or grasp the first proposition.” It expresses a transitive and asymmetric relationship. “And finally, if withholding is not more reasonable than believing, then believing is more reasonable than disbelieving” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 13), for example, if agnosticism is not more reasonable than theism, then theism is more reasonable than atheism. Thus, for example, to say that accepting a proposition, p, is more reasonable than denying p for person, S, at time, t, is to say that believing p better fulfills S’s epistemic duties than does S’s denying p. In other words, S ought (epistemically) to accept p rather than deny p, given the evidence available to S.

Chisholm distinguishes levels of justified belief in terms of one propositional attitude being more reasonable than another, given a person’s evidence at a specific time. He defines terms of epistemic appraisal or evaluation that correspond to the level of justification a person has for a given proposition. Chisholm defines these terms to specify a hierarchy of levels of justified belief and specifies the minimum level of justified belief required for knowing. In Chisholm’s hierarchy of justified belief any proposition justified to a specific level is also justified to every lower level.

There is a concept of beyond reasonable doubt that is the standard in English Common Law. This is the level to which the members of the jury must be justified in believing that the accused is guilty in order to render a guilty verdict in a criminal trial. In this context it means that given the available evidence there is no reasonable explanation of the facts other than that the accused person has committed the crime. The underlying idea is an epistemic one, that is, the jurors must have good reason for believing that the accused committed the crime in order to convict the accused.

Chisholm adopts the term beyond reasonable doubt to identify a key level of epistemic justification, that is, when a person has an epistemic duty to believe a proposition. He defines it in a different way than Common Law as follows:

D1.1 h is beyond reasonable doubt for S =Df accepting h is more reasonable for S than withholding h. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 7).

In this sense, a proposition is beyond reasonable doubt for a person if and only if accepting it better fulfills the person’s intellectual requirements of believing all and only true propositions than withholding or suspending belief. More simply put, propositions which are beyond reasonable doubt are ones that a person epistemically ought to believe given the evidence he or she has.

Chisholm considers the proposition that the Pope will be in Rome on October 5th five years from now as an example of a proposition that has a positive level of justification for most of us, but not quite meeting this standard of beyond reasonable doubt. He points out that although it is more reasonable to believe it than to deny it (given that the Pope is in Rome on most days), but it is even more reasonable to withhold judgment about the Pope’s location five years from now. While the Pope spends most of his time in Rome, circumstances five years from October 5 th may require that he be somewhere else. Chisholm defines this slightly lower lever of justified belief, having some presumption in its favor, as follows:

D1.2. h has some presumption in its favor for S =Df Accepting h is more reasonable for S than accepting non-h. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 8).

Given the limited evidence that we have about the Pope’s whereabouts five years from now, it is more reasonable to believe that the Pope will be in Rome than believing that he will not be in Rome five years from October 5th. However, it is even more reasonable in these circumstances to withhold judgment about the Pope’s whereabouts. According to Chisholm, the proposition in question about the Pope’s whereabouts in the future has some presumption in its favor, that is, it is more reasonable to believe that it is true than false.

Chisholm defines a level of epistemic justification for propositions that are not beyond reasonable doubt and yet have a higher positive epistemic status than having some presumption in their favor. The level of justified belief is that of the proposition’s being acceptable which is defined as follows:

D1.3. h is acceptable for S =Df Withholding h is not more reasonable for S than accepting h. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 9).

An example of a proposition that has this level of justified belief is the proposition that I actually see something red when I seem to see something red under certain questionable lighting conditions. Withholding belief that I actually see something red is not more reasonable than believing it, and yet believing that I actually see something red may not be more reasonable than withholding it, that is, they may be equally reasonable to believe. Anything that is beyond reasonable doubt is acceptable and anything that is acceptable also has some presumption in its favor. As noted in the outset of this discussion, every higher level of justified belief is also justified to every lower level.

Chisholm thinks that while propositions that are beyond reasonable doubt have a high-level justification, that is, they ought to be believed, even though they do not have a sufficiently high level of justification for knowledge. The lower levels of justified belief, that is, acceptable or having some presumption in their favor, play an important role for Chisholm’s account as their level of justification may be raised to the level of evident when they support and are supported by other propositions at the lower levels.

Occupying the high end of Chisholm’s justification hierarchy are proposition which are certain. Chisholm distinguishes this epistemological sense of certain from the psychological sense. We may feel psychologically certain of the truth of a proposition, even though we are not justified in believing it. The epistemological sense of certainty represents the highest level of justified belief and is not merely a feeling of confidence in believing. Chisholm defines certainty as:

D1.4. h is certain for S =Df (i) h is beyond reasonable doubt for S, and (ii) there is no i, such that accepting i is more reasonable for S than accepting h. (Chisholm 1977, pg. 10)

As with all propositions justified to a higher level of epistemic justification, any proposition that is certain for a person also meets the criteria of every lower level of positive epistemic justification. Chisholm claims that propositions that describe the way things appear to a person and some truths of logic and mathematics, under the right conditions, are certain for us. The levels of justification do not come in degrees. Thus, no proposition that is certain, according to Chisholm is more reasonable than (or for that matter less reasonable than) any other proposition having this epistemic status. That is, certainty, in Chisholm’s technical sense, (as every level of justified belief) does not come in degrees.

Some philosophers thought that the criterion of the epistemic justification required for knowledge was certainty. Descartes equated certainty to not being subject to any possible doubt. Chisholm argues that this standard is too high a standard for knowledge because this would rule out, by definition, the possibility of our knowing many contingent truths which we think we can know. This would make skepticism about empirical knowledge true by definition.

Believing that the President is in Washington today because we saw him there yesterday and he spends most of his time there, is beyond reasonable doubt. However, we need stronger justification for knowing that he is there today. Knowledge requires justification to a higher level than the proposition’s merely being beyond reasonable doubt. These considerations indicate to Chisholm that the minimum level of justification required for knowledge is higher than being beyond reasonable doubt and lower than certainty. Capturing this intuition, Chisholm defines evident to single out the level of justification required for knowledge as:

D1.5 h is evident for S =Df (i) h is beyond reasonable doubt for S, and (ii) for any i, if accepting i is more reasonable for S than accepting h, then i is certain. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 10).

According to Chisholm’s version of the Traditional Analysis of Knowledge, a necessary condition of knowledge is that the proposition is evident.

Chisholm’s ethics of belief solves the problem of the Theatetus as follows: He identified the epistemic goals with respect to any proposition under consideration as: (1) believe it if true and (2) do not believe it if false. These goals determine the relative merit of adopting the attitudes of accepting, denying, and withholding judgment with respect to any given proposition and the person’s evidence, that is, in determining which attitude is more reasonable than another. Chisholm’s definition of knowledge identifies the level of justification required for knowing a proposition as being evident, meaning that (i) it is more reasonable for the person to believe the proposition than to withhold belief (beyond reasonable doubt) and (ii) any proposition that is more reasonable is maximally reasonable (certain). This analysis sheds light on the level of justification required for knowing a proposition. Moreover, it is not defined in terms of something which, in turn, is defined in terms of knowledge. Chisholm’s analysis of knowledge thus avoids the circularity problem of the Theatetus.

b. The Gettier Problem

Before leaving the analysis of knowledge to explore the other important parts of Chisholm’s theory of knowledge, a critical objection to Chisholm’s analysis of knowledge, the Gettier Problem, needs to be outlined. Edmund Gettier, in a monumental paper “Is Knowledge Justified True Belief?” (Gettier 1963), proposes a set of counterexamples to Chisholm’s definition of knowledge which identify a genetic defect in the Traditional Analysis of Knowledge. Gettier argues these counterexamples demonstrate a defect in Chisholm’s version of the Traditional Analysis of Knowledge, as well as Plato’s and Ayer’s versions.

To illustrate the problem, let us consider one of Gettier’s examples. Suppose that Smith and Jones are the only two applicants for a job. Smith believes that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket because he knows that he has ten coins in his pocket and that the boss has told him that he will be offered the job. Unbeknownst to Smith, the other applicant, Jones, also has ten coins in his pocket and ultimately gets the job. Thus, Smith believes that the person who has ten coins in his pocket will get the job, it is true, and Smith is justified in believing (it is evident to him) that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket. However, Smith’s evidence is defective and, thus, Smith does not know that the man who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket.

Gettier examples, as they have become known, point to a genetic defect in the Traditional Analysis of Knowledge, that is, a person can have a justified (evident) true belief which is not knowledge. The Gettier problem became a major focus of epistemology in the 1960’s and continues today, more than a half century later. Solutions were proposed that add a fourth condition of knowledge or explain why the Gettier examples were not really problematic. Chisholm notes the Gettier Problem in the first edition of his Theory of Knowledge (Chisholm 1966) suggesting that the solution to the problem lies in adding a fourth condition of knowledge. In his characteristic style, Chisholm presented major revisions of his definitions intended, among other things to address the Gettier Problem, in Theory of Knowledge (Second Edition) in 1977 and in the third edition in 1989.

3. Why Foundationalism?

Chisholm’s epistemology does not begin and end with the analysis of knowledge. His work on the analysis of knowledge clears the conceptual landscape for answering fundamental questions about the structure of empirical knowledge, and for providing an account of the justification of empirical beliefs. In the process, he provides an answer to the much debated question of whether or not empirical knowledge rests on a foundation of epistemically privileged beliefs? Philosophers thought that the answer is obvious, the problem being some maintain it is obviously yes, while others obviously no. Those answering the question in the affirmative defend foundationalism, and those in the negative defend the coherence theory of justification, or simply coherentism.

Chisholm characterizes foundationalism (or the myth of the given as its detractors refer to it) as supporting two claims:

  1. The knowledge which a person has at any time is a structure or edifice, many parts and stages of which help support each other, but which as a whole is supported by its foundation.
  2. The foundation of one’s knowledge consists (at least in part) of the apprehension of what has been called, variously, “sensations”, “sense impressions”, “appearances”, “sensa”, “sense-qualia”, and “phenomena”. (Chisholm 1946, pp. 262-3).

Chisholm joins philosophy luminaries including Rene Descartes, Bertrand Russell, and C. I. Lewis as a leading defender of foundationalism. However, his unique take on why empirical knowledge rests on a foundation of self-justified beliefs reveals much about his approach to epistemology.

Foundationalism’s historical roots are found in the work of Rene Descartes, the father of Modern Philosophy. In his Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes embarks on securing a firm basis for empirical knowledge, having discovered many of the beliefs on which he based this knowledge to be false. He proposes to rectify this by purging all beliefs for which there was any possible reason to doubt. By applying this methodological doubt, he finds a set of propositions about which he cannot be mistaken. These include certainties about the contents of his mind, for example, about the way things appear to him. Applying the infallible method of deductive reasoning to this foundation of certainties, Descartes claims to build all knowledge in the way that the theorems of Geometry are derived from axioms and definitions, thereby eliminating possibility of error. Descartes argues that foundationalism is the only way to account for our knowledge of the world external to ourselves, and thereby, refutes skepticism.

Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, the British Empiricists, reject the claim that knowledge requires certainty and argue that Descartes’ deductive proof of the external world is unsound. They agree with Descartes that the foundation of empirical knowledge is sense-data but maintain that knowledge of the external world is merely justified as probable. As this probable justification is fallible and can justify false beliefs, the British Empiricists think that foundationalism is true, but compatible with skepticism.

Bertrand Russell, the 20th century founder of Anglo-American Analytic Philosophy, picks up the mantle of British empiricism. He too advocates for foundationalism, claiming that we have epistemically privileged access, as he calls it knowledge by acquaintance, to a foundation of sense-data. Russell, like his British Empiricist predecessors, thought that all empirical knowledge rested on this foundation, but did not claim that external world skepticism was refuted by foundationalism.

Russell’s empiricist successors, the logical empiricists or logical positivists, assumed that empirical knowledge was possible as they viewed science as the paradigm example of knowledge. Hans Reichenbach, a leading proponent of logical empiricism, rejects Russell’s and Descartes’ view arguing that empirical knowledge is not justified, and need not be justified, by a set of foundational beliefs to which we have epistemically privileged access. He claimed that, like scientific claims, empirical propositions are justified by their conformance with other merely probably propositions.

C.I. Lewis, a leading figure in 20th century American Philosophy (and Chisholm’s doctoral dissertation advisor), engages in a famous debate with Reichenbach on this very issue (see: Lewis 1952, Reichenbach 1952, van Cleve 1977, Legum 1980). In “Given Element in Empirical Knowledge”, (Lewis 1952) he argues that empirical knowledge must rest on a foundation of certainty, hence, foundationalism is the only viable alternative. Lewis’s rejection of Reichenbach’s position is based on the claim that there cannot be an infinite regress of justified beliefs. While agreeing that many empirical beliefs are justified because they are probable, he argues:

  1. No proposition is probable unless some proposition is certain;
  2. Therefore, there cannot be an infinite regress of merely probable beliefs;
  3. Some empirical propositions are justified because they are probable;
  4. Therefore, empirical knowledge must rest on a foundation of epistemic certainties.

a. The Myth of the Given and the Stopping Place for Socratic Questioning

Chisholm finds Descartes’ approach to epistemology attractive but is not persuaded by Descartes’ defense of foundationalism. Chisholm, also, endorses Lewis’s premise that if any proposition is probable then some proposition is certain (Chisholm 1989, pg. 14), but takes a different tack to defend foundationalism. Chisholm, not one to accept any philosophical dogma on something akin to religious faith, appeals to his method of developing a theory of knowledge in support of foundationalism. He suggests adopting the hypothesis that we know, more or less, what we think we know, and then, by asking Socratic questions about what justifies our believing of the things we think we know, develops the account for their justification.

In Perceiving (Chisholm 1957, pg. 54) and in Theory of Knowledge (Chisholm, 1966 pg. 18) Chisholm compares justifying a belief to confirming a scientific hypothesis. A hypothesis is confirmed by the evidence the scientist has supporting the hypothesis. Similarly, a belief is justified by the evidence a person has that supports its. Scientists often seek out further evidence to confirm the hypothesis. By contrast, only evidence already ‘internally’ possessed, can justify belief.

Chisholm claims that when we consider cases of empirical propositions which we think we know, we discover through Socratic questioning what justifies our believing these propositions. This process may begin by considering a proposition that I think I know, for example, that:

    1. There is a tree.

To identify what justifies my believing this, we need to answer the Socratic question, ‘What justifies me in believing this proposition?’. One might mistakenly think that as this proposition is obviously true, that is, that the proper answer to the Socratic question is the proposition itself, that is, that there is a tree. However, this would be to misunderstand what the Socratic question is asking. It is not asking from what other beliefs have I inferred this proposition. The question is, “What evidence do I currently possess that supports my believing this proposition?” Sitting here in my office, looking out my window at a tree, I clearly have evidence that there is a tree, namely, that:

    1. I see a tree.

This answer does not imply that I am currently thinking, or have ever thought, about seeing a tree, nor that I consciously believe that I see a tree and from this I infer that there is a tree. It merely implies that the proposition that I see a tree is evidence which is already available to me and which would serve to justify my belief that there is a tree.

This answer, however, is only the first part of a complete answer to the Socratic question “Why do you think that there is a tree?” or “What justifies you in thinking that there is a tree?”. The second part of the answer to the Socratic question is a rule of evidence, in this case a rule specifying conditions related to the proposition serving as evidence which are sufficient for being justified in believing the proposition in question, for example:

RE1. If S is justified in believing that S sees a tree, then S is justified in believing that there is a tree.

The answer to a Socratic question identifies two things: (1) a proposition that serves as evidence for the proposition in question, and (2) a rule of evidence specifying conditions met by the evidence which are sufficient for a person to be justified in believing the proposition in question.

This does not yet amount to a complete account of my being justified in believing that there is a tree. A proposition cannot justify a person’s belief unless the person is justified in believing it. This in turn suggests another step or level is required in the process of Socratic questioning, that is, “What justifies my believing that I see a tree?” The first part of the answer is the evidence that I have for believing this, for example:

    1. I seem to see a tree.

This proposition asserts that I am experiencing a certain psychological or phenomenological state of the kind that I would have in cases where I am actually seeing a tree, dreaming that I am seeing a tree, or hallucinating that I am seeing a tree. The second part of the answer to this question is a rule of evidence, in this case:

RE2. If S is justified in believing that S seems to see a tree and has no evidence that S is not seeing a tree, then S is justified in believing that S sees a tree.

This in turn raises the next step or level in the process of Socratic questioning, that is, “What justifies my believing that I seem to see a tree?” The appropriate answer to this question in this case is not some other proposition that serves as evidence that I seem to see a tree. Rather, the truth of the proposition, that is, my having the psychological experience of seeming to see a tree, is my evidence for believing that I seem to see a tree. The second part of the answer is a rule of evidence like the following:

RE3. If it is true that S seems to see a tree, then S am justified in believing that S seems to see a tree.

This rule of evidence is a different kind than the others encountered in the process of Socratic questioning. This rule conditions justified belief on the truth of a proposition, in contrast to the other rules which condition justified belief on being justified in believing another proposition.

Chisholm questions whether our process of Socratic questioning goes on without end, ad infinitum, by either justifying one claim with another or by going around in a circle? He believes that “…if we are rational beings, we will do neither of these things. For we will find that our Socratic questions lead us to a proper stopping place.” (Chisholm 1977, pg. 19). We come to a final empirical proposition whose justification is that the proposition believed is true.

When we encounter an answer that the truth of the proposition justifies believing the proposition, Chisholm points out, we have reached the stopping place of Socratic questioning, that is, we have completed the account of the justification of the initial proposition. Furthermore, according to Chisholm, we typically find that the proposition reached at the end of the process of Socratic questioning describes the person’s own psychological state, that is, describes the way things appear to that person. Thus, at least hypothetically, Chisholm identifies a class of beliefs which may serve as the foundation of all empirical knowledge. This is tantamount to saying that if we know any empirical or perceptual propositions, then believing these propositions is, at least in part, justified by the relationship they have to the psychological proposition describing the way things appear to us.

Chisholm claims that when we consider cases of empirical propositions which we think we know, we discover that the process of Socratic questioning, that is, that the account of the justification for believing these propositions, comes to a proper stopping place in a finite number of steps. When we reach the final stage of Socratic questioning, we have discovered, as foundationalism implies, the foundation on which empirical knowledge rests. In contrast to Descartes, Chisholm does not think that the only alternative to skepticism is foundationalism. While he may agree with C. I. Lewis that you cannot have an infinite regress of propositions which are probable, he does not claim that this proves that that there is no viable alternative to foundationalism. Chisholm thinks that the fact that we find a proper stopping place to Socratic questioning makes it plausible to accept foundationalism as a postulate or an axiom for developing a theory of knowledge. That foundationalism is acceptable, for Chisholm, should be judged by how well it explains the justification of empirical beliefs. Thus, to defend foundationalism, Chisholm presents one of the most detailed and complete explanations answering the two fundamental questions: (i) What makes the foundational beliefs about one’s psychological states or sense-data ‘self-justified’ (as Chisholm calls them, ‘directly evident’)?, and (ii) How does the foundation of sense-data serve as the ultimate justification of all empirical knowledge? Chisholm’s answer to these two critical questions is thus discussed in the next section.

4. The Directly Evident—The Foundation

Descartes proposed that empirical knowledge must rest on a foundation of certainties, propositions about which one cannot be mistaken. His foundation was composed of propositions about which even an all-powerful and all-knowing evil genius could not deceive him. It included not only logical or necessary truths, but also psychological propositions about himself. These propositions are of the form that I exist…, I doubt …., I understand …, I affirm …, I deny …, I imagine …., and, most importantly, I have sensory perceptions of … . Propositions of the last type, that is, propositions about one’s psychological or phenomenological states describing the raw data of the senses, are perhaps the most crucial propositions upon which all empirical knowledge is founded. These sense-data propositions, expressed by statements like ‘I seem to see a fire’, describe the inner workings of one’s mind, and do not imply the existence of anything in the external world.

Locke, Berkeley, and Hume (the British Empiricists) recognize that the data of the senses, that is, sense-data, serves as the foundation of empirical knowledge. Bertrand Russell agrees with them that these propositions constitute the foundation of empirical knowledge and claims that they have a privileged epistemic status which he dubbed knowledge by acquaintance. C. I. Lewis agreed that empirical knowledge rests on a foundation of sense-data, which are the given element in empirical knowledge.

Many 20th century empiricists were skeptical about the existence of sense-data which led to their doubting that empirical knowledge rests on a foundation of epistemically privileged sense-data. Gilbert Ryle, for example, raised this type of objection and argued that sense-data theory is committed to an untenable view of the status of appearance. Chisholm enters the historical debate, defending foundationalism from Ryle’s objection in one of his earliest papers on epistemology, “The Problem of the Speckled Hen” (Chisholm 1942).

a. Sense-Data and the Problem of the Speckled Hen

Ryle asks you to suppose you take a quick look at a speckled hen which has 48 speckles that are in your field of vision. According to the view under consideration you have a 48 speckled sense-datum. If, as foundationalism claims, you can never be wrong about the sense-data that present themselves to the mind, it would seem that you could never be mistaken in thinking that you were presented with a 48 speckled datum. Ryle’s point is that while we might concede that one could never be mistaken in thinking that a sense-datum had two or three speckles, but, as the number of speckles gets sufficiently large, for example, 48, we may be mistaken the number of speckles in the sense-datum. Chisholm points out that this is not an isolated problem in an odd situation, but that similar issues can be raised concerning most perceptual presentations, that is, most sense-data are complex like the speckled hen case.

A.J. Ayer, a leading logical positivist and a defender of foundationalism, replies that the example is mistaken, arguing that any inaccuracy introduced in counting the speckles can be accounted for because sense-data do not have any definite number of speckles. (Ayer 1940). Chisholm points out that it is odd to think that the sense-data caused by a looking at a hen having a definite number of speckles do not have a specific number of speckles. Thus, Ayer must adopt either of two unacceptable positions. The first is that it is neither true nor false that the hen sense-datum has 48 speckles. This amounts to saying that certain propositions expressing sense-data are neither true nor false. But this is hardly acceptable because it would commit one to denying the logical law of the excluded middle. The alternative would be that while the hen sense-datum had many speckles, it did not have any specific number of speckles. Chisholm argues that this is untenable because it is like claiming that World War II would be won in 1943, but not in any of the months that make up 1943.

Chisholm thinks that the Problem of the Speckled Hen demonstrates that not all sense-data propositions are foundational. One’s justification for believing complicated sense-data propositions, for example, that I seem to see a 48 specked hen, are not the propositions themselves, but are other sense-data propositions, for example, that I seem to see an object with red speckles. Chisholm grants that complex sense-data propositions can and often do refer to judgments that go past what is presented or given in experience. Such propositions assign properties to our experience that compare the given experience to another experience. Any such judgment goes beyond what is given or presented in the experience and, as such, introduces the possibility of being mistaken in the comparison. When a sense-data judgment goes beyond what is presented in experience, its justification is not the truth of the proposition, but is justified by other simpler sense-data which in turn are either simpler or foundational.

Chisholm’s concludes that the class of sense-data proposition is larger than the class of epistemically foundational or basic propositions. Only the subset comprised of simple sense-data propositions, for example, propositions about colors and simple shapes that appear, may be foundational beliefs. The challenge for Chisholm is two-fold: (a) to provide an account of which sense-data propositions are foundational, or as he calls them Directly Evident, that avoids the metaphysical pitfalls Ryle identified with sense-data; and (b) to identify what enables them to serve as the foundation of perceptual knowledge, that is, to explain their privileged epistemic status.

b. The Directly Evident—Seeming, Appearing, and the Self-Presenting

In short, Chisholm claims that to discover what justifies our believing some proposition can be determined by a process of Socratic questioning which identifies the evidence we have for believing the proposition, and then the evidence we have for believing the evidence, until we reach a proper stopping point. The proper stopping point arises when the proper answer is that the evidence that justifies one in believing the proposition is the truth of the proposition. These propositions whose truth constitutes their own evidence are the given element in empirical knowledge, that is, the Directly Evident.

The following example of a line of Socratic questioning illustrates Chisholm’s point. Suppose I know that:

    1. There is a blue object.

In response to the question of what evidence I have for believing this I may cite that:

    1. I perceive (see, feel, hear, and so forth) that there is a blue object.

In response to the question of what evidence I have for accepting (2), I would cite that:

    1. I seem to see to see something blue (or alternatively that I have a blue sense-datum).

When we reach an answer like (3), we have reached Chisholm’s proper stopping point of Socratic questions. On Chisholm’s view, psychological or phenomenological propositions like (3) are self-justifying or self-presenting, they are the given element in empirical knowledge, and they serve as the foundation of perceptual knowledge.

Chisholm defends Descartes’ and C. I. Lewis’ assertion that propositions which describe a person’s phenomenological experience, that is, propositions which describe the way that things seem or appear to a person, are important constituents of the foundation of perceptual knowledge. These phenomenological propositions which constitute the foundation of perceptual knowledge are expressed by statements using ‘appears’ or ‘seems’, and they do not imply that one believes, denies, has evidence supporting, or that is hedging about whether there is something that actually has a certain property. Rather, ‘appears’ or ‘seems’ describes one’s sensory or phenomenological state, for example, that I seem to see something white.

Chisholm distinguishes comparative and non-comparative uses of ‘appears’ in statements describing one’s sensations or phenomenological state. The comparative use describes the way that we are appeared to by comparing it with the way that certain physical objects have appeared in the past. Thus, when I use ‘appears’ in the comparative way, I am “saying that there is a certain manner of appearing, f, which is such that: (1) something now appears f, and (2) things that are blue may normally be expected to appear f.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 59). By contrast, if I use ‘appears’ in the noncomparative way, I am saying that there is a blue way of appearing (or seeming) and I am now in this phenomenological state or having this kind of phenomenological experience. Chisholm claims that only those propositions expressed by sentences using the noncomparative descriptive phenomenological sense of ‘appear’ or ‘seems’ are directly evident.

Chisholm’s solution to the Problem of the Speckled Hen is that sense-data compose the given element in empirical knowledge, that is, the foundation on which all perceptual knowledge stands, but not all sense-data are foundational. Only sense-data statements referring to some sensory characteristics are candidates for this special status, and they can be called basic sensory characteristics. It should be said that, at least for most of us, the characteristic like the speckled hen’s appearing to have 48 speckles are not basic sensory characteristics, and therefore are not foundational beliefs. Rather, only appearance propositions using the basic or simple sensory characteristics, for example, basic visual characteristics (for example, blue, green, red), olfactory characteristics, gustatory characteristics, auditory characteristics, or tactile characteristics, will be candidates for the directly evident.

One might wonder what distinguishes appearing blue from appearing to have 48 speckles that makes the former a basic sensory characteristic while the latter not. Most people can recognize a triangle at a glance and do not need to count the three sides or angles in order to recognize that the object is a triangle. Moreover, at a glance, we can distinguish it from a square, rectangle, or pentagon. Contrast that with recognizing a chiliagon (1000 sided polygon). Other than perhaps a few geometric savants (perhaps Thomas Hobbes who attempted to make a polygon into a circle), we cannot recognize a chiliagon at a glance. In fact, we would have to go through a long process of counting to discover that a given polygon in fact had 1000 sides. Clearly, appearing chiliagon shaped is not going to be a basic sensory characteristic in contrast to appearing triangular.

Like most adults I can discern a triangle immediately, while very young children cannot. A child playing with a toy containing holes of different shapes and blocks to be inserted into the corresponding shaped hole may have difficulty matching the triangle to the triangular hole, indicating that it is difficult for the very young child to recognize a triangle. It seems reasonable to conclude that appearing triangular is a basic sensory characteristic for me but not for the very young child. Thus, one and the same characteristic may be a basic sensory characteristic for one person while not a basic characteristic for another depending on their visual acuity. Moreover, visual acuity may change from time to time for the same person, hence, at different times, the same characteristic may be a basic sensory characteristic at one time and not at another time. (Chudnoff 2021 discusses empirical evidence that training can help one develop new recognitional abilities).

The distinction between basic sensory characteristics from non-basic ones is based on whether or not a person requires evidence to be justified in believing that the sensation has a certain characteristic. For most of us (at least those of us who are not color-blind), being justified in believing the proposition that I seem to see something green would require no evidence beyond our phenomenological state or experience. By contrast, being justified in believing that I seem to see a 48 speckled thing would require our having evidence from counting up the speckles. Thus, being 48 speckled would not be a basic sensory characteristic. By contrast, being 5 speckled (or fewer) for most of us would be a basic sensory characteristic. The test of whether a sensory characteristic is basic would be the answer to the Socratic question of what justifies the person in believing that it is an experience of that characteristic.

Chisholm’s solution to the Problem of the Speckled Hen addresses the metaphysical concerns about sense-data. A standard view of sense-data is that if I am looking at a white wall that is illuminated by red lights, there is a red wall sense-datum, which is really red and this object is what ‘appears before my mind’. Philosophers have objected to the sense-data theory’s dependence upon the existence of non-physical ghost-like entities serving as intermediaries between physical objects and the perceiver. Ayer, for example, proposed that these odd metaphysical entities may have seemingly contradictory properties, for example, having many speckles but no specific number of speckles. Others rejected these metaphysical claims as entailing skepticism about the external world as we only have access to the sense-data. Chisholm intends his theory to account for the epistemic properties of sense-data, that is, that they are directly evident, without entailing the objectionable metaphysical assumption sense-data are ghost-like entities.

Chisholm explains that if we are going to be precise, something appears f to me is not directly evident because this implies that there are objects, sense-data, which appear to me and for which it is proper to seek further justification. Consider a case of my hallucinating a green table and as a result it is true that:

I seem to see a green table.

A defender of sense-data would say that this means the same as:

There is a green sense datum which is appearing to me.

But, it is perfectly proper to seek justification for the belief that a green sense-datum exists, hence, the proposition that I seem to see a green table is not directly evident.

Such examples suggest to Chisholm that a better formulation of the statement which expresses the directly evident is “I am experiencing an f appearance.” “But,” he is concerned that, “in introducing the substantive ‘appearances’ we may seem to be multiplying entities beyond necessity.” (Chisholm 1977, pg. 29). Chisholm, therefore, wants to avoid referring to any unusual entities like sense-data in statements intended to express the directly evident. The reason cited for avoiding references to sense-data is parsimony, that is, the principle of assuming the existence of no more types of objects than required.

Chisholm shows us how to get rid of the substantives in appear-statements. We begin with a statement:

a. Something appears white to me;

which is to be rewritten more clearly as:

b. I have a white appearance.

But this sentence contains the substantive ‘appearance’. To avoid reference to any strange metaphysical entities, sense-data, the sentence must be rewritten to read as:

c. I am appeared white to.

Chisholm notes that we have not yet succeeded in avoiding referring to sense-data, for ‘white’ is an adjective and, thus, must describe some entity (at least according to the rules of English grammar). We, however, want ‘white’ to function as an adverb that describes the way that I am appeared to. Thus, the sentence becomes:

d. I am appeared whitely to;

 or, to put it in a somewhat less awkward way,

e. I sense whitely.

Chisholm does not propose that we should use this terminology in our everyday discourse, nor even that we should use this terminology whenever we are discussing epistemology. Rather, he wants us to keep in mind that when we use sentences like (a), (b), and (c) to express the foundation of empirical knowledge, what we are asserting is what (d) and (e) assert.

Chisholm concludes that (d) and (e), the directly evident propositions, do not imply that there are non-corporeal entities, sense-data, that are something over and above the physical objects and their properties which we perceive. When our senses deceive us, we are not seeing, hearing, feeling, smelling, or tasting (that is, perceiving) a non-physical entity. Rather, we are misperceiving or sensing wrongly, which is why Chisholm calls this the Adverbial Theory. We are sensing in a way that, if taken at face value, gives us prima facie evidence for a false proposition, that is, that we are actually perceiving something that has this property, hence, we do know the proposition we are perceiving something to have this property.

Chisholm maintains that our empirical knowledge rests on a foundation of propositions expressed by true noncomparative appear statements which we are sufficiently justified in believing to know, or to use his technical term, are evident. He further asserts that they have the highest level of epistemic justification, that is they are certain. However, in saying that they are certain, Chisholm is not endorsing Descartes’ view that they are incorrigible, that is, that we can never be wrong in believing these propositions. Nonetheless, Chisholm is agreeing with Descartes that they have a special level of justification., that is, they are in some sense self-evident or, as he prefers, directly evident.

To explain this special epistemic status Chisholm appeals to Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz’s notion of primary truths, which are of two types: primary truths of reason and primary truths of fact. A paradigm primary truth of reason is a mathematical truth like a triangle has three sides. Such truths are knowable, a priori, independently of experience, because the predicate of the statement, having three sides, is contained in the subject, triangle (Leibniz 1916, Book IV Chapter IX). Knowing primary truths of reason requires no proof, rather they are immediately obvious. Leibniz claims that similarly our knowledge of our own existence and our thoughts (the contents of our own minds) are primary truths of fact immediately known through experience, a posteriori. There is no difference between our knowing them, their being true, and our understanding or being aware of them.

Leibniz likens our immediately intuiting the truth of basic logical truths to our direct awareness of our psychological or phenomenological states at the time they occur. We are directly aware of both primary truths of reason and experience because the truth of the propositions themselves is what justifies us in believing them. We reach the proper stopping point in Socratic questioning when have reached a primary truth of fact, a proposition describing our psychological or phenomenological state when it occurs. Its truth (or the occurrence of the state) constitutes our immediate justification in believing, hence, knowing such propositions. There is no need to appeal to any other reason that justified our believing them, hence, they are directly evident.

In explaining the epistemic status of appearance, Chisholm appeals to Alexis Meinong’s observation that psychological or phenomenological states of affairs expressed by propositions of the form: ‘I think …’, ‘I believe …’, ‘I am appeared to …’, and so forth, are self-presenting in the sense that whenever these propositions are true, they are certain for the person (Chisholm 1989 pg. 19). Thus, when one is appeared to whitely (in the non-comparative sense of appeared to) one is justified in believing it and there is no proposition that the person is more justified in believing. On Chisholm’s view these self-presenting propositions, for example, about the way things (non-comparatively) appear are paradigm examples of the directly evident, hence, serve as the foundation of empirical knowledge.

Chisholm explains that while all self-presenting propositions are directly evident, not all directly evident propositions are self-presenting. The directly evident, the foundation on which empirical knowledge rests, also contains propositions that are related to, but are not themselves, propositions that are self-presenting. Chisholm writes:

But isn’t it directly evident to me now both that I am thinking and that I do not see a dog? The answer is yes. But the concept of the directly evident is not the same as that of the self-presenting. (Chisholm 1977, pg. 23)

Thus, according to Chisholm, the foundation of empirical knowledge is comprised of a broader class of propositions that include the class of self-presenting propositions, their logical implications, and the negation of the self-presenting. He uses the term directly evident to designate this class of foundational beliefs, which he defines as:

Def 2.2  h is directly evident for S =Df. h is logically contingent; and there is an e such that (i) e is self-presenting for s, and (ii) necessarily, whoever accepts e accepts h. (Chisholm 1977 pp. 23-24)

Thus, for example, Descartes’ first foundational proposition, that I exist, is directly evident for me whenever I think, for this later proposition is self-presenting for me, and (per Descartes’s insight) necessarily whoever accepts the proposition, that I think, accepts the proposition, that I exist.

The class of propositions which are directly evident for a person include propositions concerning a person’s occurrent beliefs and thoughts and propositions describing the way that things appear to a person. These latter propositions are expressed by noncomparative appear-statements of the form, ‘I am appeared F-ly to’. This class of propositions serve as the foundation of knowledge, the set propositions in relationship to which all other propositions are justified.

5. The Truths of Reason and A Priori Knowledge

Leibniz divided true propositions into two types: truths of reason and truths of fact. Truths of reason are necessarily true and their negation is impossible, while truths of fact are contingent and their negation is possible. Leibniz’s division is also based on the source of knowledge of propositions of each kind. We find out that a necessary proposition is true by analyzing it into simpler ideas or truths until we reach what he calls ‘primary truths’. He concludes that the source of knowledge of necessary truths is reason and can be known a priori, that is, independently of experience, while the source of knowledge of contingent truths is experience and can be known a posteriori.

The focus to this point has been on Chisholm’s views on the empirical foundation of knowledge or foundational knowledge a posteriori. Chisholm believes that some of our knowledge is based on necessary truths which are known a priori. He provides the following account of the justification of necessary truths, including logical truths, mathematical truths, and conceptual truths, explaining how some of these truths serve as evidence for empirical knowledge.

a. The Justification of A Priori Knowledge

Chisholm appeals to Leibniz, Frege (the late 19th and early 20th century German philosopher, logician, and mathematician), and Aristotle to explain the basis of a priori knowledge. Leibniz writes: “The immediate awareness of our existence and of our thoughts furnishes us with the first a posteriori truths of facts… while identical propositions”, [propositions of the form A=A], “embody the first a priori truths or truths of reason… Neither admits of proof, and each can be called immediate.” (Leibniz 1705, Book IV, Ch 9). The traditional term for Leibniz’s first truths of reason is ‘axioms’. Frege explains: “Since the time of antiquity an axiom has been taken to be a thought whose truth is known without being susceptible by a logical train of reasoning” (Chisholm 1989 pg. 27). Chisholm explains the meaning of ‘incapable of proof’ by appealing to Aristotle’s suggestion in Prior Analytics that “[a]n axiom or ‘basic truth’… is a proposition ‘which has no proposition prior to it’; there is no other proposition which is ‘better known’ than it is” (Chisholm 1989 pg. 27).

Chisholm proposes that axioms are necessary propositions known a priori serving as foundational propositions. They are similar in the following respect to the self-presenting (directly evident) propositions about how we are appeared to, for example, that we are appeared redly to. When we are appeared to in a certain way, we are justified in believing the proposition that we are appeared to in this way; in Chisholm’s terminology, they are evident to us. We ‘immediately’ know about these mental states because they present themselves to us. Analogously, there are some necessary truths which are evident to us ‘immediately’ upon thinking about them.

Chisholm defines axioms, the epistemically foundational propositions, as follows:

D1 h is an axiom =Df h is necessarily such that (i) it is true, and (ii) for every S, if S accepts h, then h is certain for S. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 28)

His examples of axioms include:

If some men are Greeks, then some Greeks are men;
The sum of 5 and 3 is 8;
All squares are rectangles.

Notice that according to this definition, if a person accepts a proposition which is an axiom, the proposition is certain for that person. But being an axiom is not sufficient for the proposition’s being evident or justified for a person. The person may never have considered the proposition or, worse, may believe or accept that it is false, and hence cannot be justified in believing it at all. To be sufficient for an axiom is to be certain or evident (justified) for a person, and the person must also accept the proposition.

Chisholm, therefore, adds the condition that the person accepts the proposition, defining a proposition’s being axiomatic for S as:

D2 h is axiomatic for S =Df (i) h is an axiom, and (ii) S accepts h. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 28).

Thus, for the proposition that all squares are rectangles to be axiomatic for a person requires not only that the proposition be an axiom, that is, necessarily true and necessarily such that if the person accepts it then it is certain for the person, but also that the person believes or accepts the proposition. Note that a proposition which is axiomatic for a person has the highest level of justification for the person, putting axiomatic propositions on a par, epistemically, with propositions that are directly evident.

Chisholm claims that the class of propositions that are axiomatic is the class of foundational propositions known a priori. There are also non-foundational propositions known a priori. For example, propositions that are implied by axioms may also be known a priori. However, it is not sufficient that the axiom implies the other proposition for the second proposition to be known a priori, as that would imply that all implications of axioms are also justified, whether the person is aware of the implications or not. Rather, it must also be axiomatic for the person that the axiom implies the other proposition. Suppose, for example, that it is axiomatic for a person that all interior angles of a rectangle are right angles, and also that it is axiomatic for that person that something’s being a square implies that it is a rectangle. In that case, the proposition that all the interior angles of a square are right angles is also known a priori for that person.

As it is axiomatic for every person that any proposition implies itself, axiomatic propositions are also known a priori. The theorems of logic or mathematics are also known a priori, as long as the person accepts the axiom and as long as it is axiomatic for that person that the axiom implies the theorem. Chisholm adds these additional propositions to the class of a priori knowledge by defining a priori knowledge as:

D3 h is known a priori by S =Df There is an such that (i) e is axiomatic for S, (ii) the proposition, e implies h, is axiomatic for S, and (iii) S accepts h. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 29)

Chisholm defines a proposition’s being a priori as:

D4 h is a priori =Df It is possible that there is someone for whom h is known a priori.

(Chisholm 1989 pg. 31).

b. Chisholm, Kant, and the Synthetic A Priori

Kant distinguished two types of a priori propositions, analytic and synthetic. Roughly, an analytic proposition is one in which the predicate adds nothing new to the subject, for example, ‘all squares are rectangles’. It asserts that a component of the complex concept of the subject, for example, square or equilateral rectangle, is the concept of the predicate, rectangle. The underlying idea is that the concept of the subject can be analyzed in a way that it includes the concept of the predicate. By contrast, synthetic propositions are propositions in which the predicate is ascribing properties to the subject over and above what is contained in the concept of the subject, for example, the square is large.

It is generally thought that analytic propositions are not only necessarily true, but also a priori. However, as analytic propositions seem to be redundant and trivial, they appear to contribute little or no content to a person’s knowledge. This led Kant to raise the much-debated question of whether there are propositions which are synthetic and known a priori.

Chisholm argues that much of the debate concerning Kant’s question is based on a much broader concept of ‘analytic’ than the one which Kant had in mind. To clarify the epistemological importance of Kant’s question, Chisholm provides definitions of ‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’. Underlying the concept of an analytic proposition are two concepts, that of a property implying another property and two properties being conceptually equivalent. He defines the first as:

D5 The property of being F implies the property of being G =Df The property of being F is necessarily such that if something exemplifies it then something exemplifies the property of being G. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 33)

Thus, for example, the property of being a bachelor implies the property of being single. A bachelor is necessarily such that if something is a bachelor, then something is a single person. He then defines what it is for two properties to be conceptually equivalent as:

D6 P is conceptually equivalent to Q =Df Whoever conceives P conceives Q, and conversely. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 33)

For example, the property of being a bachelor is conceptually equivalent to being a single male, as anyone conceiving of or thinking of a bachelor conceives of a single male, and vice versa, anyone who conceives of a single male conceives of a bachelor.

Chisholm defines the concept an ‘analytic proposition’ in terms of the forgoing concepts as follows:

D7 The proposition that all Fs are Gs is analytic =Df The property of being F is conceptually equivalent to a conjunction of two properties, P and Q, such that: (i) P does not imply Q, (ii) Q does not imply P, and (iii) the property of being G is conceptually equivalent to Q. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 34)

A proposition which is not analytic is synthetic, as per the following definition:

D8 The proposition that all Fs are Gs is synthetic =Df The proposition that all Fs are Gs is not analytic. (Chisholm 1989 pg. 34)

Chisholm’s definitions clarify the philosophical importance of Kant’s question, which is whether a synthetic proposition—a proposition in which the predicate cannot be found in the analysis of the subject, that is, a proposition that is not redundant and adds content to the subject—can be known to be true a priori. Finding such a proposition implies that “the kind of cognition that can be attributed to reason alone may be more significant” (Chisholm 1989 pg. 34).

Chisholm suggests that there are four types of examples of synthetic a priori propositions. Examples of the first type are the propositions expressed by the following sorts of sentences: “Everything that is a square is a thing that has shape” and “Everyone who hears a something in C-sharp major hears a sound”. Some have claimed that the property of being a square is conceptually equivalent to the properties of having a shape and some additional properties. The second possible type of synthetic a priori propositions are referred to by Leibniz as ‘disparates’. An example of such a proposition is ‘Nothing that is red is blue’. Chisholm notes that while attempts have been made to show propositions of these two types to be analytic, none has been successful.

The third possible type of synthetic a priori propositions are statements of moral judgments like the one expressed by the following sort of sentence: “All pleasures, as such, are intrinsically good, or good in themselves, whenever and wherever they may occur”. Chisholm concurs with Leibniz’s assertion that while such propositions can be known, no experience of the senses could serve as evidence in their favor.

The final possible type of synthetic a priori propositions are propositions of arithmetic. Kant asserted that propositions like 2 +1 = 3 are not analytic, hence, they are synthetic. Some might question whether the propositions they assert are of the right form, that is, all Fs are Gs, but there may be a way to formulate them into the ‘all Fs are Gs’ form. While the principles of arithmetic have been analyzed in terms of sets, this has not been done in such a way that the predicate can be analyzed out of the subject, in which case they have yet to be shown to be analytic.

While various epistemic principles to account for the justification of certain types of propositions are discussed in this section, more of these epistemic principles are examined in the next one. Chisholm’s use of these principles raises meta-epistemological questions related to the status of these principles and the nature of epistemology itself. Are the epistemic principles necessary or contingent? Can they be known a priori or a posteriori? And are they analytic or synthetic? While Chisholm’s answers to these questions are not clear, it would not be surprising if he thought that they are synthetic a priori necessary truths.

6. The Indirectly Evident

Chisholm’s account of the Directly Evident, explains and defends one of the two main theses of foundationalism. It identified a set of propositions describing one’s psychological or phenomenological states, the way things appear or seem, as being self-presenting. These propositions and some of their logical consequences are epistemic certainties composing the directly evident foundation of empirical knowledge. The second main thesis of foundationalism is that these directly evident propositions ultimately serve, at least in part, as the justification of all empirical knowledge. To complete his theory of knowledge Chisholm undertakes to explain how empirical propositions which are indirectly evident are justified. In the process Chisholm undertakes to solve the problem of empiricism that has plagued epistemology since Descartes.

Chisholm’s account of the Indirectly Evident proposes to answer the fundamental question of how propositions about the external world are justified by propositions about one’s internal psychological experiences or states, solving what he calls the problem of empiricism. This problem finds its roots in Descartes and was inherited by his British Empiricist successors, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume.

Descartes proposed to solve this problem by employing deductive logic. Starting from his discovered foundation of certainties, composed of propositions about the contents of his mind and some necessary truths that could be proven with certainty, he sets out to prove the truth of propositions about the external world. Following his method of Geometric proof (deductive logic), he sets out to derive, through deductive reasoning the existence of the external world from the empirical certainties about the contents of his mind and some other necessary truths.

Descartes argues that, for example, when he is having a certain sort of visual experience, he is certain of the proposition that I seem to see something red. From this certainty and some additional logical certainties, among them being the proposition that God exists and is not a deceiver (for which he provides deductive proofs) using deductive reasoning he derives propositions about the external world, for example, that there is something red. In this manner, Descartes purports to have built knowledge about the external world, from foundational certainties using only deductive reasoning, a method which cannot go wrong. This epistemological program, its methodology and its associated philosophy of mind earned Descartes, and his European continental successors Baruch Spinoza and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, the title of Continental Rationalists.

John Locke, the progenitor of British Empiricism, claims that all knowledge of the external world is based on experience. He argues that Descartes’ demonstrations are flawed, claiming that knowledge of the external world cannot be justified by applying deductive reasoning to the foundational propositions. Locke argues that a fundamental mistake in Descartes’ program is setting the standard of certainty for knowledge and epistemic justification too high. On Locke’s view, avoiding skepticism merely requires the probability of truth to account for the transfer of justified belief from the contents of the mind to propositions about the external world.

To account for the transfer of justification, Locke appeals to his empiricist philosophy of mind according to which the mind is a blank slate, a tabula rasa, upon which sense-data is deposited. The data provided by the senses is the source knowledge about the world. Knowledge of the external world is ultimately justified by the experience of the senses. Locke, allowing for fallible epistemic justification, claims that one can be completely justified in believing a proposition that is not entailed by the evidence or reasons that one has for believing the proposition.

Locke claims that the move from one’s sensing something to be red to the proposition that there is something that is red is justifiable because of the resemblance between the contents of one’s minds (sensations and ideas) and objects in the external world which cause these sensations and ideas. Thus, for example, we are justified in believing the proposition that I am actually seeing something red because our idea or mental representation of the red thing resembles the object which caused it. Thus, according to Locke, any proposition about the external world is justified only if the mental representation resembles the corresponding physical object.

George Berkeley, Locke’s successor, finds Locke’s justification of beliefs about physical objects from their resemblance to the contents of one’s mind problematic. Berkeley is concerned that this inference is justifiable if, and only if, we have reason to think that the external world resembles our ideas. To be justified in believing that there is a resemblance one would have to be able to compare the ideas and the physical object. However, we cannot possibly compare the two. Noting that on Locke’s view we only have epistemic access to our ideas, Berkeley objects that this inference is problematic. We can never get “outside our minds” to observe the physical object and compare it to our mental image of it, and thus, we can have no reason to think that one resembles the other. Berkeley concludes that Locke’s view entails skepticism about the external world, that is, the belief that no empirical beliefs about the external world could ever be justified.

To avoid these skeptical consequences while maintaining that knowledge of the external world is based on sense-data, Berkeley advocates phenomenalism, the view captured by his slogan “esse est percipi” (“to be is to be perceived”). (Berkeley 1710, Part I Section 3). Berkeley’s phenomenalism claims that physical objects are made up of sense-data which are the permanent possibility of sensation. There are no physical objects over and above sense-data. Propositions about the physical world are to be reduced to propositions about mental experiences of perceivers, that is, phenomenological propositions.

Berkeley’s position can be clarified with an example. The proposition that the ball is red may be analyzed in terms of (and thus entails) propositions about the perceivers’ sensations, for example, that the ball appears red, spherical shaped, and so forth. Common sense propositions about the physical objects composing the external world are justified on the basis of an inductive inference from the propositions describing how things appear to perceivers that are entailed by the external world proposition. The ball’s being red is confirmed by the phenomenal or mental sensations of spherical redness that perceivers have. One’s having certain spherical and round sense-data confirms via induction the proposition that the ball is red which entails those sense-data.

The objection that Berkeley raises to Locke’s theory is a problem endemic to empiricism. It leaves open a gap that needs to be bridged to account for knowledge on the basis of the evidence of the senses. The gap to be explained is how sense-data, that is, propositions about one’s own mental states, justifies one’s beliefs in propositions about object in the external world. Berkeley avoids the problem of explaining the reason to think that one’s sensations resemble the real physical objects by adopting phenomenalism. In Berkeley’s metaphysics, Idealism, there are no non-phenomenal entities; physical objects are just the permanent possibility of sensation. The difference between sense-data that are veridical and non-veridical is that the veridical perceptions are sustained by God’s continuously having these sense-data in His mind. Thus, for Berkeley, the meaning of statements about physical objects may be captured by statements referring only to sense experience. In his theory physical objects just are reducible to sense-data. Berkeley proposes that God’s perceptions “hold” the physical universe together.

David Hume, the next luminary of British Empiricism, finds the dependence of epistemic justification on God’s perceptions to be unacceptable. Hume’s answer to the explanatory gap in Locke’s theory is that we naturally make the connection. One way of understanding Hume is by pointing to the fact that he adopts the view which in the 20th century would become known as epistemology naturalized which relegates the explanation of the inference to science. Others have understood Hume as embracing skepticism with respect to the external world. Thomas Reid, Hume’s contemporary, invokes common sense to explain the inference. He argues that we have as good a reason to think that these common sense inferences are sufficient justification for knowledge as we have for thinking that deductive reasoning is sufficient justification for the derivation of knowledge.

Bertrand Russell rejects Berkley’s view that there are really no physical objects, but they are just bundles of perceptions. Russell accounts for perceptual knowledge claiming that we have direct access to sense-data, and these sense-data serve as the basis of empirical knowledge. Russell, in The Problems of Philosophy, admits that “in fact ‘knowledge’ is not a precise conception: it merges into ‘probable opinion’.” (Russell 1912 pg. 134).

C. I. Lewis (Lewis 1946) proposes a pragmatic version of phenomenalism to bridge the explanatory epistemological gap between sense-data and the external world. Lewis agrees with the British Empiricists that sense-data are what is ‘directly’ experienced and, moreover, serve as the given element in empirical knowledge. Berkeley’s phenomenalism attempts to bridge the explanatory gap with metaphysical Idealism. Lewis agrees with Russell that this is problematic. Lewis proposes a version of phenomenalism that is compatible with metaphysical Realism. On this view, external world propositions entail an infinite number of conditional propositions stating that if one initiates a certain type of actions (a test of the empirical proposition in question), then one experiences a certain type or sense-data. Thus, the explanatory gap is bridged by the rules of inductive inference.

Lewis’s example helps to explain his phenomenalistic account. Consider the external world proposition that there is a doorknob. Lewis claims that this proposition logically entails an unlimited number of conditional propositions expressing tests that could be undertaken to confirm that there really is a doorknob causing the experience. One such conditional would “if I were to appear to reach out in a certain way, I would have a sensation of grasping a doorknob shaped object.” One’s undertaking to appear to reach out and grab the doorknob, followed by the tactile experience of doorknob sense-data, provides confirmation, hence, pragmatic justification for believing the proposition that there is a doorknob. Thus, according to Lewis, the justification of empirical beliefs is based on an inductive interference, having confirmed sufficiently many such tests.

a. Chisholm’s Solution to the Problem of Empiricism

Chisholm enters the fray arguing (Chisholm 1948) that Lewis’s view is defective and thus fails to solve the problem of empiricism, that is, it cannot account for the inference from the mind to the external world. According to Lewis’s phenomenalism, statements about the external world, for example:

This is red;

entail propositions only referring to mental entities, sense-data, for example:

Redness will appear.

Chisholm argues that certain facts about perceptual relativity demonstrate that physical world propositions like P do not entail any propositions which refer exclusively to mental entities like R.

Chisholm explains that P, when conjoined with:

This is observed under normal conditions; and if this is red and observed under normal conditions, redness will appear;

entails R, that redness will appear. But P in conjunction with:

This is observed under normal conditions except for the presence of blue lights; and if this is red and observed under conditions which are normal except for the presence of blue lights, redness will not appear;

entails that R is false. If P and any other proposition that is consistent with P, for example S, entails that R is false, then P cannot entail Q. Perceptual relativity, the way that things appear in any circumstance being relative to the conditions under which the object is observed, makes it clear that S is consistent with P. However, P and S entail that redness will not appear, for red things do not appear red under blue light. Therefore, P does not entail R. Similarly, no physical object statement (like P) entails any proposition that is only about sense-data (like R). Chisholm concludes that Lewis’s phenomenalism is untenable.

The problem of empiricism, the justification of beliefs about physical objects based on perception, that Chisholm embarks on solving requires a plausible account of perceptual knowledge. The Lockean account claims that sense-data (mental ideas) justifies or makes evident beliefs about physical objects because sense-data resembles the physical objects. agreement of ideas. However, on Locke’s account we can never “get outside” the mind to observe the resemblance between the sense-data and the physical object causing them. Thus, it fails to provide the requisite reason for thinking that physical objects resemble the mental images. Phenomenalism proposes to avoid this problem by claiming that propositions about physical objects entail purely psychological propositions about apparent experience, sense-data. Thus, inductive reasoning (or the hypothetico-deductive method) from the psychological propositions could provide justification for the physical proposition they entail; thereby, justifying beliefs about the physical object.

But, Chisholm argues, propositions about physical objects do not entail any purely psychological propositions, that is, phenomenalism is false. Thus, if empiricism is to be salvaged, there must be another account or explanation of how propositions about appearances provide evidence that justifies beliefs about the physical world. Chisholm answers this problem with his account of the Indirectly Evident.

b. Epistemic Principles—Perception and Memory, Confirmation and Concurrence

Chisholm adopts three methodological assumptions in developing his epistemic principles or rules of evidence to account for empirical knowledge:

  • We know, more or less, what (upon reflection) we think we know (an anti-skeptical assumption);
  • On occasions when we do have knowledge, we can know what justifies us in believing what we know;
  • There are general principles of evidence that can be formulated to capture the conditions which need to be satisfied by these things that we know.

Carneades of Cyrene (ca.213-129 B.C.E.), the Ancient Greek Academic Skeptic who was a successor to Plato as the leader of the Academy, developed three skeptical epistemic principles to explain the justification that perception provides for beliefs about the external world. On Carneades’ view, while ‘perceiving’ something to be a cat is not sufficient for knowing that there is a cat, nonetheless, it makes the proposition that there is a cat acceptable. While disagreeing with Carneades’ skeptical conclusion, Chisholm thinks that Carneades’ approach to developing epistemic principles is correct.

Chisholm formulates Carneades’ first epistemic principle related to perception as:

C1. “Having a perception of something being F tends to make acceptable the proposition that something is an F.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 68).

Having identified these acceptable propositions, Carneades notes that the set of perceptual propositions that are “hanging together like the links of a chain”, and which are “uncontradicted and concurring” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 69), including the perceptions of color, shape, and size, are also acceptable. The concurrence of these propositions makes all of them acceptable, hence his second principle

C2. Confirmed propositions that concur and do not contradict each other are more reasonable than those that do not.

Finally, the acceptable propositions that remain after close scrutiny and testing are even more reasonable than merely acceptable. This is captured in a third epistemic principle:

C3. “Concurrent propositions that survive ‘close scrutiny and test’ are more reasonable than those that do not.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 70).

Pyrrho, Carneades’ Ancient Greek skeptic predecessor, believed that our common sense beliefs about the world were completely irrational and thus irrational to act upon. This extreme form of skepticism on its face is unacceptable to most; for example, people in general do not try to walk off cliffs nor think that doing so would be rational. Carneades’ approach to epistemology and his development of principles explaining how our beliefs are rational or acceptable, but not knowledge, by contrast, seems intuitively plausible. Thus, Chisholm adopts Carneades’ common sense approach in developing his account of the indirectly evident.

Chisholm points out that there are three possible ways in which the indirectly evident may be justified:

  1. By the relationship they bear to what is directly evident;
  2. By the relationship they bear to each other; and
  3. By their own nature, independent of any relationship they bear to anything else.

He notes that theories that account for the justification of beliefs in this first way is considered foundationalist, and that ones that account for justification of beliefs in the second way is coherentism or a coherence theory. Chisholm claims that the indirectly evident is justified in all three ways. This is consistent with his view that focusing on the ‘isms’ is not conducive to solving philosophical problems.

Chisholm claims that just about every indirectly evident proposition is justified, at least in part, by some relationship it bears to the foundation of empirical knowledge, to the directly evident. The foundation cannot serve as justification for knowing anything unless we are justified in believing these propositions. To remind us of how the directly evident is justified, Chisholm presents the following epistemic principle

(A) S’s being F is such that, if it occurs, then it is self-presenting to S that he is F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 73).

The epistemic principles are formulated as schemata, that is, abbreviations for infinitely many principles. In (A), ‘F’ may be replaced by any predicate that would be picked from “a list of various predicates, each of such a sort as to yield a description of a self-presenting state of S.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 73). This principle asserts that, for example, if I am appeared redly to, then it is self-presenting to me that I am appeared redly to. Moreover, whenever I am in such a state, for example, the state of being am appeared redly to, the proposition that I am appeared to redly is evident, directly evident, for me.

Chisholm’s next two epistemic principles concern perception. These principles are intended to show how the indirectly evident is justified by the combination of their relationship to the foundation and by their own nature, that is, the nature of perception and memory. Some clarification of the terminology used in these principles will aid in understanding the theory. Chisholm uses ‘believes he/she perceives that’ to assert a relationship between a person and a proposition, for example, that Jones believes that she perceives that there is a cat. This can be true even when it is false that there is a cat in front of her, for example, even when she is hallucinating. An alternative way Chisholm sometimes expresses this is as ‘Jones takes there to be a cat’. Chisholm prefers to use ‘believes that she perceives’ in place of ‘takes’ as it makes the ‘that’-clause explicit, noting that we will assume that ‘believes that she perceives’ means simply that the person has a spontaneous nonreflective experience, one that she would normally express by saying, “I perceive that…”.

Chisholm observes that, to account for the justification of perceptual propositions, one might be inclined (as he was in the first edition of Theory of Knowledge) to formulate a principle along the line of Carneades’ first epistemic principle that if a person believes that he perceives that there is a sheep, then the person is justified in believing that there is a sheep.

However, such a principle must be qualified because of cases like the following. Suppose that a person seems to see an animal that looks like a sheep, but also knows that (i) there are no sheep in the area, and (ii) many dogs in the area look like sheep. Contrary to what this principle implies, the person is not justified in believing that it is a sheep (but rather a dog).

Chisholm qualifies this principle to exclude cases like this one because the person has grounds for doubt that the proposition in question. To qualify this principle he defines a term, ground for doubt, which in turn depends on having no conjunction of propositions that are both acceptable for the person which tend to confirm that the proposition in question is false.

Chisholm defines the requisite notion of confirmation as

D4.1 e tends to confirm h =Df Necessarily, for every S, if e is evident for S and if everything that is evident for S is entailed by e, then h has some presumption in its favor for s.

He explains that confirmation is both a logical and an epistemic relation. If it obtains between two propositions, that is, if e confirms h, then necessarily it obtains between these two propositions (it is a matter of logic that it obtains). Furthermore, if e confirms h, and if one knew that e was true, one would also have reason for thinking that h was true. Chisholm cautions that from the fact that e confirms h, it does not follow that the conjunction e and another proposition, g, also confirms h. What we assert in saying that e confirms h may also be expressed by saying that h has a certain (high) probability in relation to e.

Armed with this concept notion of confirmation, he now defines what is it for something to be believed without ground for doubt as≔=

D4.3 S believes, without ground for doubt, that p =Df (i) S believes that p, and (ii) no conjunction of propositions that are acceptable for S tends to confirm the negation of the proposition that p. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 76)

Chisholm qualifies the epistemic principle under consideration as:

(B) For any subject S, if S believes without ground for doubt that he perceives something to be F, then it is beyond reasonable doubt for S that he perceives something to be F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 76).

While this principle justifies beliefs about the external world to a higher degree than did Carneades’ principle, it falls short of rendering them sufficiently justified for knowledge. Chisholm’s reason for this is that the property designated in the schema by F can be replaced by a property like being a sheep about which the person may have mistakenly classified the object he is looking at.

Chisholm proposes a third epistemic principle which yields knowledge level justification of propositions by restricting the properties that one is perceiving the object to have to the ‘proper objects’ of perception. These are sensible characteristics, such as visual characteristics like colors and shapes, auditory characteristics like loud and soft, tactile characteristics like smooth and rough, olfactory characteristics like spicy and burn, gustatory characteristics like salty and sweet, and ‘common sensibles’ like movement and number. This principle states:

(C) For any subject S and any sensible characteristic F, if S believes, without ground for doubt, that he is perceiving something to be F, then it is evident for S that he perceives something to be F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 78)

This principle accounts for justifying the indirectly evident on the basis of the directly evident. Consider how it works in a case that Jones is looking at a red object. Assume that she is appeared to redly (the object appears to her to be red) and that she has no evidence that would count against her actually perceiving that there is something red (that is, that nothing acceptable to her that tends to confirm that she is not actually perceiving something to be red). In such a case it is evident to her that (i) she actually perceives something to be red, and (ii) that there is something red. Moreover, she knows those propositions assuming that she believes them.

These epistemic principles account only for the justification of our beliefs concerning what we are perceiving at any given moment. To account for the justification of anything about the past, Chisholm proposes epistemic principles to account for the justification of beliefs based on memory. We should note that “’memory’ presents us with a terminological difficulty analogous to that presented by ‘perception’.“ (Chisholm 1977 pg. 79). Chisholm proposes that the expression ‘believes that he remembers’ be used in a way analogous to the way he uses ‘believes that he perceives’; that is, ‘S believes that he remembers that p’ does not imply the truth of p (nor does it imply that p is false).

Chisholm notes that “[s]ince both our memory and perception can play us false, we run a twofold risk when we appeal to the memory of a perception.” (Chisholm 1977 pg. 79). If we are justified in believing a proposition based on our seeming to remember that we perceived it to be true, we can go wrong in two ways: our perception or our memory (or possibly both) may mislead us. For this reason, Chisholm formulates principles for remembering that we perceived, principles along the same lines as the principles concerning perception but takes into account that the evidence that memory of a perception provides is weaker than that of perception. The principles about memory of perceptions, therefore, only justify propositions to a lower epistemic level of justification than those of perception. Corresponding to (B), Chisholm proposes:

(D) For any subject S, if S believes, without ground for doubt, that he remembers perceiving something to be F, then the proposition that he does remember perceiving something to be F is one that is acceptable for S. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 80).

Restricting the range of ‘F’ to sensible predicates, he presents the following analogue to (C):

(E)     For any subject S, if S believes, without ground for doubt, that he remembers perceiving something to be F, then it is beyond a reasonable doubt for S that he does remember perceiving something to be F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 80).

Chisholm points out that if our memory of perceptions is reasonable, then so must our memory of self-presenting states, and thus, proposes that:

(F)     For any subject S and any self-presenting property F, if S believes, without ground for doubt, that he remembers being F, then it is beyond a reasonable doubt for S that he remembers that he was F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 81).

Although Chisholm explained the justification of some empirical beliefs, the epistemic principles presented thus far do not account for knowledge of ordinary common-sense propositions (for example, ‘There is a cat on the roof’). The epistemic principles proposed to this point account for these propositions being acceptable or beyond reasonable doubt, but do not account for their being evident, that is, justified to the level required for knowledge.

Chisholm appeals to the coherence of propositions about memory and perception, that is, their being mutually confirming and concurring, to explain how beliefs can be justified to the level required for knowledge. A proposition justified to a certain level is also justified to all lower levels, for example, an evident proposition, is also beyond a reasonable doubt, acceptable, and has some presumption in its favor. Some propositions justified according to the epistemic principles of perception and memory are evident, others beyond reasonable doubt, and others as acceptable, but all propositions justified by these principles are at least acceptable.

Chisholm proposes that if the conjunction of all propositions that are acceptable for someone tend to confirm another proposition, then this latter proposition has some presumption in its favor, that is:

(G)    If the conjunction of all those propositions e, such that e is acceptable for S at t tends to confirm h, then h has some presumption in its favor for S at t. (Chisholm 1977 pp. 82-83).

He then defines the concept of a concurrent set of propositions, which may be thought of as coherence of propositions or beliefs, as follows:

D4.4   A is a set of concurrent propositions =Df A is a set of two or more propositions each of which is such that the conjunction of all the others tends to confirm it and is logically independent of it. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 83).

He proposes the following, somewhat bold, epistemic principle of how concurring proposition raise their level of epistemic justification:

(H)      Any set of concurring propositions, each of which has some presumption in its favor for S, is such that each of its members is beyond reasonable doubt for S.

To explain how this principle works, Chisholm asks us to consider the following propositions:

    1. There is a cat on the roof today;
    2. There was a cat on the roof yesterday;
    3. There was a cat on the roof the day before yesterday;
    4. There is a cat on the roof almost every day.

He asks us to suppose that (1) expresses a perceptual belief and, therefore, is beyond reasonable doubt; (2) and (3) express what I seem to remember perceiving, and thus, are acceptable; and (4) is confirmed by the conjunction of these acceptable statements. As this set of propositions is concurrent, each is beyond reasonable doubt (according to (H)).

Chisholm completes his theory of evidence by accounting for our knowledge which is gained via perception with the following principle:

(I)    If S believes, without ground for doubt, that he perceives something to be F, and if the proposition that there is something F is a member of a set of concurrent propositions each of which is beyond reasonable doubt for S, then it is evident for S that he perceives something to be F. (Chisholm 1977 pg. 84).

This completes the account that Chisholm promised of how the Indirectly Evident may be justified in three ways. The first is, at least partially, by its relationship to the foundation. The epistemic principles accounting for justification of propositions based on perception and memory are partially dependent on the self-presenting states of being appeared to in a certain way, that is, seeming to perceive and seeming to remember perceiving. The second is that they provide justification because of their own nature, that is, that perception and memory provide prima facie evidence for believing that they represent the way things are in the world. The third is that by the coherence, the confirmation and concurrence, of propositions that are justified to a lower level than required by knowledge. Chisholm’s account is not only a version of foundationalism, but also incorporates elements of the coherence theory.

Chisholm admits that these epistemic principles provide, at best, an outline of a full-blown account of our knowledge of the external world, and a very rough one at that. They do not give an account of our knowledge of many of the very common things that we know about the past and about the complex world that we live in. However, this was all that Chisholm promised to provide. Moreover, this account is one of the most complete and comprehensive accounts developed of empirical knowledge.

7. Postscript

This presentation of Chisholm’s epistemology is largely based on the version of his theory from the second edition of his book Theory of Knowledge (Chisholm 1977). Chisholm continuously revised and improved his theory based on counterexamples and objections raised by his colleagues and students. His subsequent works provided his answers to the Gettier Problem, as well as a more detailed account of the epistemic principles accounting for the Indirectly Evident. In 1989 Chisholm published his third, and what became his final, edition of his Theory of Knowledge. This article is intended to introduce Chisholm’s theory of knowledge to lay the groundwork for the reader to undertake a detailed examination of the final version of his theory. It is left as an exercise to the reader to decide whether Chisholm’s principles do what he intends them to do.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J., 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge, New York, NY: St. Martins Press.
  • Berkeley, George, 1710. The Principles of Human Knowledge, (
  • Chisholm Roderick, 1942, “The Problem of the Speckled Hen,” Mind 51(204): 368-373.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1946, Monograph: “Theory of Knowledge” in Roderick M. Chisholm, Herbert Feigl, William H. Frankena, John Passmore, and Manley Thomson (eds.), Philosophy: The Princeton Studies: Humanistic Scholarship in America, 233-344, reprinted in Chisholm 1982.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1948. “The Problem of Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy 45, 512-517.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1957. Perceiving: A Philosophical Study, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1965. “‘Appear’, ‘Take’, and ‘Know’”, reprinted in Robert J. Swartz (ed.), Perceiving, Sensing, and Knowing, (University of California, Berkeley, California, 1965).
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1966. Theory of Knowledge, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1977. Theory of Knowledge, 2nd edition. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1979. “The Directly Evident,” in George Pappas (ed.), Justification and Knowledge, Dordrecht, D. Reidel Publishing Co.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1982. The Foundations of Knowing, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1989. Theory of Knowledge, 3rd edition. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Chudnoff, Elijah, 2021. Forming Impressions: Expertise in Perception and Intuition, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Clifford, W. K., 1877. “The Ethics of Belief”, Contemporary Review (177), reprinted in Clifford’s Lectures and Essays (London, MacMillan, 1879).
  • Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard, 2011. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, Rene, 1641, Meditations on First Philosophy (Third Edition), edited by Donald J. Cress, Indianapolis, IN, Hackett Publishing Company, 1993.
  • Feldman, Richard, 1974. “An Alleged Defect in Gettier-Counterexamples,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 52(1), 68-69.
  • Feldman, Richard, 2003. Epistemology, Upper Saddle River, NJ, Prentice Hall.
  • Foley, R., 1997. “Chisholm’s Epistemic Principles,” in Hahn 1997, pp. 241–264.
  • Gettier, Edmund, 1963. “Is Knowledge Justified True Belief?” Analysis 23, 121-123.
  • Goldman, Alvin, 1976. “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” Journal of Philosophy, 64, 357-372.
  • Hahn, Lewis Edwin 1997. The Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm, (The Library of Living Philosophers: Volume 25), Lewis Edwin Hahn (ed.), Chicago, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Heidelberger, H., 1969. “Chisholm’s Epistemic Principles,” Noûs, 3(1), 73–82.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature, (London, Oxford Clarendon Press, 1973).
  • Hume, David, Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals (3rd Edition), (London, Oxford Clarendon Press, 1976).
  • James, William, 1896. “The Will to Believe”, in The Will to Believe, and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, and Human Immortality, New York, Dover Publications, 1960.
  • Kyburg, Henry E. Jr., 1970. “On a Certain Form of Philosophical Argument,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7,  229-237.
  • Legum, Richard A. 1980. “Probability and Foundationalism: Another Look at the Lewis-Reichenbach Debate.” Philosophical Studies 38(4), 419–425.
  • Lehrer, Keith, 1997, “The Quest for the Evident” in Hahn 1997, pp. 387–401.
  • Leibniz, Gottfreid Wilhelm, 1705, New Essays Concerning Human Understanding, (LaSalle, Il: Open Court Publishing Company, 1916),
  • Lewis, C.I., 1929. Mind and the World Order. New York, Dover Publications.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1946. An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation. La Salle, IL, Open Court.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1952. “The Given Element in Empirical Knowledge.” The Philosophical Review 61, 168-175.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, edited by Peter H. Niddich (Clarendon Press; 1st Clarendon edition (2 Aug. 1979)).
  • Mavrodes George, 1973. “James and Clifford on ‘The Will to Believe’,” in Keith Yandell (ed.), God, Man, and Religion (McGraw-Hill, New York, 1973).
  • Pollock, J and Cruz, J. 1999. Contemporary Theories of Knowledge, 2nd edition. New York, Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Pryor, J. 2001. “Highlights of Recent Epistemology,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 52, 95-124. (Stresses that modest foundationalism looks better in 2001 than it looked ca. 1976).
  • Quine. W.V.O. 1951. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” The Philosophical Review 60, 20-43.
  • Reichenbach, Hans, 1952. “Are Phenomenal Reports Absolutely Certain.” The Philosophical Review 61, 168-175.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1912, The Problems of Philosophy, Hackett Publishing Company, Indianapolis.
  • Sellars, Wilfred, 1956, “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” in H. Feig l and M. Scriven, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. I, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1956), pp. 253-329.
  • Sosa, Ernest, 1980. “The Raft and The Pyramid: Coherence versus Foundations in the Theory of Knowledge,” in French, Uehling, and Wettstein (eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy, Volume V, Studies in Epistemology, (University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1980).
  • Sosa, Ernest, 1997, “Chisholm’s Epistemology and Epistemic Internalism,” in The Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm (The Library of Living Philosophers: Volume 25), Lewis Edwin Hahn (ed.), Chicago, La Salle, Open Court, pp. 267–287.
  • van Cleve, James. 1977. “Probability and Certainty: A Reexamination of the Lewis-Reichenbach Debate’,” Philosophical Studies 32(4), 323-34.
  • van Cleve, James. 2005. “Why Coherence is Not Enough: A Defense of Moderate Foundationalism,” in Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, edited by Matthias Steup and Ernest Sosa. Oxford, Blackwell, pp. 168-80.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. 1990. “Cartesian Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation.” The Journal of Philosophy 87, 658-666.


Author Information

Richard Legum
City University of New York
U. S. A.