Manbendra Nath Roy (1887—1954)

M. N. RoyM. N. Roy was a twentieth century Indian philosopher. He began his career as a militant political activist and left India in 1915 in search of arms for organizing an insurrection against British rule in India. However, Roy’s attempts to secure arms ended in a failure, and finally in June 1916, he landed in San Francisco, California. It was there that Roy, who was then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. Roy developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. He began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! Roy met Lenin in Moscow in 1920, and went on to become an international ranking communist leader. Nevertheless, in September 1929 he was expelled from the Communist International for various reasons. He returned to India in December 1930 and was sentenced to six years imprisonment for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case.

Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years which he decided to use for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which would be a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote in jail over a period of five years, grew into nine rigorous volumes. The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not yet been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s.

In his philosophical works, Roy has made a clear distinction between philosophy and religion. According to Roy, no philosophical advancement is possible unless we get rid of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas. On the other hand, Roy has envisaged a very close relationship between philosophy and science. Moreover, Roy has given a central place to intellectual and philosophical revolution in his philosophy. Roy maintained that a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. Besides, Roy has, in the tradition of eighteenth century French materialist Holbach, revised and restated materialism in the light of twentieth century scientific developments. In the context of Indian philosophy, Roy could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism—both Lokayata and Carvaka.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms
    2. Towards Communism
    3. Return to India: Prison Years
    4. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism
    5. Final years
  2. Writings
    1. Autobiographical
    2. Philosophical
  3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy
    1. Philosophy and Metaphysics
    2. Philosophy and Religion
    3. Philosophy and Science
  4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy
    1. Basic Tenets of New Humanism
    2. Humanist Interpretation of History
    3. Inadequacies of Communism
    4. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy
    5. Radical Democracy
  5. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance
  6. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism
    1. Roy’s Materialism
    2. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism
      1. Change in the Concept of “Matter”
      2. Revision of Physical Determinism
      3. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World
      4. Emphasis on Ethics
    3. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism
      1. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism
      2. Rejection of Historical Materialism
      3. Emphasis on Ethics
    4. Roy and Lokayata
  7. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life


M. N. Roy’s original name was Narendra Nath Bhattacharya. He was born on 21 March 1887, at Arbalia, a village in 24 Parganas district in Bengal. His father, Dinabandhu Bhattacharya, was head pandit of a local school. His mother’s name was Basanta Kumari.

a. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms


Roy began his political career as a militant nationalist at the age of 14, when he was still a student. He joined an underground organization called Anushilan Samiti, and when it was banned, he helped in organizing Jugantar Group under the leadership of Jatin Mukherji. In 1915, after the beginning of the First World War, Roy left India for Java in search of arms for organizing an insurrection to overthrow the British rule in India. From then on, he moved from country to country, using fake passports and different names in his attempt to secure German arms. Finally, after wandering through Malay, Indonesia, Indo-China, Philippines, Japan, Korea and China, in June 1916, he landed at San Francisco in United States of America.

Roy’s attempts to secure arms ended in a failure. The Police repression had shattered the underground organization that Roy had left behind. He had also come to know about the death of his leader, Jatin Mukherji, in an encounter with police.

b. Towards Communism


The news of Roy’s arrival at San Francisco was somehow published in a local daily, forcing Roy to flee south to Palo Alto, California near Stanford University. It was here that Roy, until then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya or Naren, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. This change of name on the campus of Stanford University enabled Roy to turn his back on a futile past and look forward to a new life of adventures and achievements.

Roy’s host at Palo Alto introduced him to Evelyn Trent, a graduate student at Stanford University. Evelyn Trent, who later married Roy, became his political collaborator. She accompanied him to Mexico and Russia and was of great help to him in his political and literary work. The collaboration continued until they separated in 1929.

At New York, where he went from Palo Alto, Roy met Lala Lajpat Rai, the well-known nationalist leader of India. He developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. Roy also went to public meetings with Lajpat Rai. Questions asked by the working class audience in these meetings made Roy wonder whether exploitation and poverty would cease in India with the attainment of independence. Roy began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! In the beginning, nurtured as he was on Bankimchandra, Vivekanand and orthodox Hindu philosophy, Roy accepted socialism except its materialist philosophy.

Later in Mexico in 1919, Roy met Michael Borodin, an emissary of the Communist International. Roy and Borodin quickly became friends, and it was because of long discussions with Borodin that Roy accepted the materialist philosophy and became a full-fledged communist.

In 1920, Roy was invited to Moscow to attend the second conference of the Communist International. Roy had several meetings with Lenin before the Conference. He differed with Lenin on the role of the local bourgeoisie in nationalist movements. On Lenin’s recommendation, the supplementary thesis on the subject prepared by Roy was adopted along with Lenin’s thesis by the second conference of the Communist International. The following years witnessed Roy’s rapid rise in the international communist hierarchy. By the end of 1926, Roy was elected as a member of all the four official policy making bodies of the Comintern – the presidium, the political secretariat, the executive committee and the world congress.

In 1927, Roy was sent to China as a representative of the Communist International. However, Roy’s mission in China ended in a failure. On his return to Moscow from China, Roy found himself in official disfavor. In September 1929, he was expelled from the Communist International for “contributing to the Brandler press and supporting the Brandler organizations.” Roy felt that he was expelled from the Comintern mainly because of his “claim to the right of independent thinking.” (Ray 1987)

c. Return to India: Prison Years



Roy returned to India in December 1930. He was arrested in July 1931 and tried for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case. He was sentenced to six years imprisonment.

When Roy returned to India, he was still a full-fledged communist, though he had broken from the Comintern. The forced confinement in jail gave him more time than before for systematic study and reflection. His friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy had planned to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which would be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he had been committed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. These writings show that Roy was not satisfied with a primarily economic explanation of historical processes. He studied and tried to assess the role of cultural and ideational factors in traditional and contemporary India, in the rise and expansion of Islam, and in the phenomenon of fascism. He was particularly severe on the obscurantist professions and practices of neo-Hindu nationalism. Roy tried to reformulate materialism in the light of latest developments in the physical and biological sciences. He was convinced that without the growth and development of a materialist and rationalist outlook in India, neither a renaissance nor a democratic revolution would be possible. In a way, seeds of the philosophy of new humanism, which was later developed fully by Roy, were already evident in his jail writings.

d. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism



Immediately after his release from jail on 20 November 1936, Roy joined Indian National Congress along with his followers. He organized his followers into a body called League of Radical Congressmen. However, in December 1940, Roy and his followers left Congress owing to differences with the Congress leadership on the role of India in the Second World War. Thereafter, Roy formed the Radical Democratic Party of his own. This signaled the beginning of the last phase of Roy’s life in which he developed his philosophy of new humanism.

After Roy’s release from jail in 1936, Ellen Gottschalk joined Roy in Bombay in March 1937. They were married in the same month. Subsequently, Ellen Roy played an important role in Roy’s life, and cooperated in all of his endeavors.

Roy prepared a draft of basic principles of “radical democracy” before the India conference of the Radical Democratic Party held in Bombay in December 1946. The draft, in which his basic ideas were put in the form of theses, was circulated among a small number of selected friends and associates of Roy. The “22 Theses” or “Principles of Radical Democracy”, which emerged as a result of intense discussions between Roy and his circle of friends, were adopted at the Bombay Conference of the Radical Democratic Party. Roy’s speeches at the conference in connection with the 22 Theses were published later under the title Beyond Communism.

In 1947, Roy published New Humanism A Manifesto, which offered an elaboration of the 22 Theses. The ideas expressed in the manifesto were, according to Roy, “developed over a period of number of years by a group of critical Marxists and former Communists.”

Further discussions on the 22 Theses and the manifesto led Roy to the conclusion that party-politics was inconsistent with his ideal of organized democracy. This resulted in the dissolution of the Radical Democratic Party in December 1948 and launching of a movement called the Radical Humanist Movement. At the Calcutta Conference, itself where the party was dissolved, theses 19 and 20 were amended to delete all references to party. The last three paragraphs of the manifesto were also modified accordingly. Thus, the revised versions of the 22 Theses and the manifesto constitute the essence of Roy’s New Humanism.

e. Final years


In 1946, Roy established the Indian Renaissance Institute at Dehradun. Roy was the founder-director of the Institute. Its main aim was to develop and organize a movement to be called the Indian Renaissance Movement.

In 1948, Roy started working on his last major intellectual project. Roy’s magnum opus Reason, Romanticism and Revolution is a monumental work (638 pages). The fully written, revised and typed press copy of the book was ready in April 1952. It attempted to combine a historical survey of western thought with an elaboration of his own system of ideas. While working on Reason, Romanticism and Revolution, Roy had established contacts with several humanist groups in Europe and America, which had views similar to his own. The idea gradually evolved of these groups coming together and constituting an international association with commonly shared aims and principles. The inaugural congress of the International Humanist and Ethical Union (IHEU) was planned to be organized in Amsterdam in 1952, and Roy was expected to play an influential role in the congress and in the development of the IHEU.

However, before going abroad, Roy needed some rest. He and Ellen Roy went up for a few days from Dehradun to the hill station of Mussoorie. On June 11 1952, Roy met a serious accident. He fell fifty feet down while walking along a hill track. He was moved to Dehradun for treatment. On the 25th of August, he had an attack of cerebral thrombosis resulting in a partial paralysis of the right side. The accident prevented the Roys from attending the inaugural congress of the IHEU, which was held in August 1952 at Amsterdam. The congress, however, elected M.N. Roy, in absentia, as one of its vice-presidents and made the Indian Radical Humanist Movement one of the founder members of the IHEU. On August 15 1953, Roy had the second attack of cerebral thrombosis, which paralyzed the left side of his body. Roy’s last article dictated to Ellen Roy for the periodical Radical Humanist was about the nature and organization of the Radical Humanist Movement. This article was published in the Radical Humanist on 24 January 1954. On January 25 1954, ten minutes before midnight, M.N. Roy died of a heart attack. He was nearly 67 at that time.

2. Writings

a. Autobiographical


Roy was a prolific writer. He wrote many books edited, and contributed to several journals. However, he was reluctant to write about himself.  M. N. Roy’ Memoirs (627 pages), which he wrote after initial reluctance, only covers a short period of six years from 1915. When Roy was in an Indian prison, his friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy’s letters to her from jail, published subsequently as Letters from Jail (1943), contains pointers to his reading and thinking during those years.

b. Philosophical


Four volumes of Selected Works of M. N. Roy, edited by Sibnarayan Ray, have been published by the Oxford University Press.  Many of the writings of M. N. Roy such as Revolution and Counter-Revolution in China belong to the period when he was a communist. We have already mentioned some of his works related to the final humanist phase of his life, such as, Beyond Communism, New Humanism – A Manifesto and Reason, Romanticism and Revolution. According to M. N. Roy, his books Scientific Politics (1942) along with New Orientation (1946) and Beyond Communism (1947) constitute the history of the development of radical humanism. The final ideas are, of course, contained in New Humanism.

As mentioned earlier, Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years after returning to India in 1930.  He decided to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which was to be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. Materialism (1940), Science and Superstition (1940), Heresies of the 20th Century (1939), Fascism (1938), The Historical Role of Islam (1939), Ideal Of Indian Womanhood (1941), Science and Philosophy (1947) and India’s Message (1950) are among the books that were made from these handwritten note books. Of these Materialism and Science and Philosophy, are of special interest from the point of view of studying Roy’s concept of philosophy and his formulations on materialism.

Since 1937, Roy was editing a new weekly named Independent India. In 1949, Independent India weekly changed to The Radical Humanist weekly. The name of another quarterly journal The Marxian Way, which Roy had been publishing since 1945 in collaboration with Sudhindranath Datta, was changed to The Humanist Way in the same year. The Humanist Way has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published by the Indian Renaissance Institute as a monthly.

3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy

Philosophy, according to Roy, is contemplation, study and knowledge of nature. Its function is “to know things as they are, and to find the common origin of the diverse phenomena of nature, in nature itself”.

Philosophy, says Roy, begins when “spiritual needs” of human beings are no longer satisfied by primitive natural religion, which imagines and worships a variety of gods as personification of the diverse phenomena of nature. The grown-up human is no longer satisfied with the nursery-tales, with which “he was impressed in his spiritual childhood”. Intellectual growth emboldens him to seek the causes of all natural phenomena in nature itself and to “find in nature a unity behind its diversity.” (Roy 1951)

In his book Science and Philosophy, Roy defines philosophy as “the theory of life”. The function of philosophy, in words of Roy, “is to solve the riddle of the Universe”. According to Roy, philosophy is born out of the efforts of man to explain nature and to understand his own relationship with it. (5-6)

a. Philosophy and Metaphysics

Roy has made a distinction between philosophy and metaphysics. According to him, metaphysics also begins with the desire to discover the unity behind the diversity. However, it leaves the ground of philosophy in its quest for a “noumenon” beyond nature, something that is distinct from “phenomena”. Thus, it abandons the inquiry into what really exists, and “plunges into the wilderness of speculation”. It takes up the absurd task of knowing the intangible, as the condition for the knowing the tangible.

It is obvious that Roy was opposed to speculative philosophy, which set for itself the impossible task of prying into the transcendental being “above and behind” the physical universe – of acquiring the knowledge of the reality behind the appearance. According to Roy, an inquiry, which denies the very existence of the object to be enquired, is bound to end in idle dreams and hopeless confusion.

b. Philosophy and Religion

Roy was opposed not only to speculative philosophy but also to the identification of philosophy with poetic fancy or theology and religion. According to him, for the average educated human, the term philosophy has a very vague meaning. It stands not only for speculative thought, but also for poetic fancy. Not only that, in India, philosophy is often not distinguished from religion and theology. “Indeed,” according to Roy, “what is generally believed to be the distinctive feature of Indian philosophy is that it has not broken away from the medieval tradition, as modern Western philosophy did in the seventeenth century.”

According to Roy, faith in the supernatural does not allow the search for the causes of natural phenomena in nature itself. Therefore, rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas is the precondition for philosophy.  Roy was of the view that, religion will certainly be liquidated by the rise of science, because scientific knowledge enables humankind to answer questions, confronted by which in its childhood, it was forced to assume super-natural forces or agencies. Therefore, according to Roy, in order to perform its function, “philosophy must break away from religion” and start from the reality of the physical universe.

c. Philosophy and Science

On the one hand, Roy regards rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas as the essential precondition of philosophy, and on the other, he envisages a very intimate relationship between philosophy and science. In fact, according to Roy, the philosophical significance of modern scientific theory is to render untenable the old division of labor between science and philosophy. Science is, says Roy, stepping over the old boundary line, “Digging deeper and deeper into the secrets of nature, science has come up against problems, the solution of which was previously left to philosophy. Scientific inquiry has pushed into what is traditionally regarded as the ‘metaphysical’ realm.”

The problems of philosophy – cosmology, ontology and epistemology – can all be progressively solved, according to Roy, in the light of scientific knowledge. The function of philosophy is, points out Roy, to explain existence as a whole. An explanation of existence requires knowledge of existence. Knowledge about the different phases of existence is being gathered by the various branches of science. Therefore, says Roy, the function of philosophy is to coordinate an entire body of scientific knowledge into a comprehensive theory of nature and life.  Philosophy can now exist only as the science of sciences – a systematic coordination, a synthesis of all positive knowledge, continuously readjusting itself to progressive enlargement of the store of human knowledge. A mystic metaphysical conception of the world is no longer to be accorded the distinction of philosophy. Thus, according to Roy, philosophy is a logical coordination of all the branches of positive knowledge in a system of thought to explain the world rationally and to serve as a reliable guide for life.

4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy


“New Humanism” is the name given by Roy to the “new philosophy of revolution” which he developed in the later part of his life. This philosophy has been summarized by Roy in the “Twenty-Two Theses” and elaborated in his New Humanism A Manifesto.

New Humanism, as presented in the Twenty-Two Theses, has both a critical and a constructive aspect. The critical aspect consists of describing the inadequacies of communism (including the economic interpretation of history), and of formal parliamentary democracy. The constructive aspect, on the other hand, consists of giving highest value to the freedom of individual, presenting a humanist interpretation of history, and outlining a picture of radical or organized democracy along with the way for achieving the ideal of radical democracy.

a. Basic Tenets of New Humanism


Apart from Roy’s effort to trace the quest for freedom and search for truth to the biological struggle for existence. The basic idea of the first three theses of Roy is individualism. According to Roy, the central idea of the Twenty-Two Theses is that political philosophy must start from the basic idea that the individual is prior to society, and freedom can be enjoyed only by individuals.

Quest for freedom and search for truth, according to Roy, constitute the basic urge of human progress. The purpose of all-rational human endeavor, individual as well as collective, is attainment of freedom in ever-increasing measure. The amount of freedom available to the individuals is the measure of social progress. Roy refers back the quest for freedom to human being’s struggle for existence, and he regards search for truth as a corollary to this quest. Reason, according to Roy, is a biological property, and it is not opposed to human will. Morality, which originates from the rational desire for harmonious and mutually beneficial social relations, is rooted in the innate rationality of man.

b. Humanist Interpretation of History


In his humanist interpretation of history, presented in theses four, five and six, Roy gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and emphasizes the role of ideas in the process of social evolution. Formation of ideas is, according to Roy, a physiological process but once formed, ideas exist by themselves and are governed by their own laws. The dynamics of ideas runs parallel to the process of social evolution and both of them influence each other. Cultural patterns and ethical values are not mere super structures of established economic relations. They have a history and logic of their own.

c. Inadequacies of Communism

Roy’s criticism of communism, contained in theses seven to eleven is based mainly on the experience of the former Soviet Union, particularly the “discrepancy between the ideal and the reality of the socialist order.”  According to Roy, freedom does not necessarily follow from the capture of political power in the name of the oppressed and the exploited classes and abolition of private property in the means of production. For creating a new world of freedom, revolution must go beyond an economic reorganization of society. A political system and an economic experiment which subordinate the man of flesh and blood to an imaginary collective ego, be it the nation or class, cannot possibly be, in Roy’s view, the suitable means for the attainment of the goal of freedom.

The Marxian doctrine of state, according to which the state is an instrument of exploitation of one class by another, is clearly rejected by Roy. According to Roy, the state is “the political organization of society” and “its withering away under communism is a utopia which has been exploded by experience”.

Similarly, Roy rejects the communist doctrine of the dictatorship of the proletariat. “Dictatorship of any form, however plausible may be the pretext for it, is,” asserts Roy, “excluded by the Radical-Humanist perspective of social revolution”.

d. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy


Roy has discussed the shortcomings of formal parliamentary democracy in his twelfth and thirteenth theses. These flaws, according to Roy, are outcome of the delegation of power. Atomized individual citizens are, in Roy’s view, powerless for all practical purposes, and for most of the time. They have no means to exercise their sovereignty and to wield a standing control of the state machinery.

“To make democracy effective,” says Roy, “power must always remain vested in the people and there must be ways and means for the people to wield sovereign power effectively, not periodically, but from day to day.”

e. Radical Democracy


Thus, Roy’s ideal of radical democracy, as outlined in theses fourteen to twenty-two consists of a highly decentralized democracy based on a network of people’s committee’s through which citizens wield a standing democratic control over the state.

Roy has not ignored the economic aspect of his ideal of radical democracy. He argued that progressive satisfaction of the material necessities is the pre-condition for the individual members of society unfolding their intellectual and other finer human potentialities. According to him, an economic reorganization, which will guarantee a progressively rising standard of living, is the foundation of the Radical Democratic State. “Economic liberation of the masses”, says Roy, “is an essential condition for their advancing towards the goal of freedom.”

The ideal of radical democracy will be attained, according to Roy, through the collective efforts of mentally free men united and determined for creating a world of freedom. They will function as the guides, friends and philosophers of the people rather than as their would-be rulers. Consistent with the goal of freedom, their political practice will be rational and, therefore, ethical.

Roy categorically asserts that a social renaissance can come only through determined and widespread endeavor to educate the people as regards the principles of freedom and rational co-operative living.  Social revolution, according to Roy, requires a rapidly increasing number of men of the new renaissance, and a rapidly expanding system of people’s committees and an organic combination of both. The program of revolution will similarly be based on the principles of freedom, reason and social harmony.

As pointed out by Roy himself in his preface to the second edition of the New Humanism: A Manifesto, though new humanism has been presented in the twenty-two theses and the Manifesto as a political philosophy, it is meant to be a complete system. Because of being based on the ever-expanding totality of scientific knowledge, new humanism cannot be a closed system. “It will not be”, says Roy, “a dogmatic system claiming finality and infallibility.”

f. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance

It is obvious from the foregoing that Roy was a great supporter of philosophical revolution or renaissance, and he has given a central place to it in his radical humanism. Roy was an admirer of European renaissance and drew inspiration from it. For him, “the renaissance was the revolt of man against God and his agents on this earth”. According to Roy, the renaissance “heralded the modern civilization and the philosophy of freedom”. He strongly believed that India, too, needed a renaissance on rationalist and humanist lines. According to him, this was a necessary condition for democracy to function in a proper manner. He believed that “a new Renaissance based on rationalism and cosmopolitan humanism” was essential for democracy to be realized. (Roy has used the word “rationalist” not in the Cartesian sense but in the popular sense. In this sense, a “rationalist” regards reason including both perception and inference as a source of knowledge.)

According to Roy, a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. He was opposed to blind faith and superstitions of all kinds and supported rationalism. As a physical realist, he rejected all allegedly supernatural entities like god and soul. Similarly, he was opposed to fatalism and the doctrine of karma. He unequivocally rejected the religious mode of thinking and advocated a scientific outlook and a secular morality. As noted earlier, he was in favor of delinking philosophy with religion and associating it closely with science.  He believed that science would ultimately liquidate religion.

According to Roy, a revolutionary is one who has got the idea that the world can be remade, made better than it is to-day, that it was not created by a supernatural power, and therefore, could be remade by human efforts.

Further, according to Roy, “the idea of improving upon the creation of God can never occur to God-fearing. We can conceive of the idea only when we know that all gods are our own creation, and we can depose whomsoever we have enthroned.”

Roy’s critical approach towards religion comes out very clearly in the preface of his book, India’s Message, where he asserts that a criticism of religious thought and a searching analysis of traditional beliefs and the time-honored dogmas of religion is essential for the belated Renaissance of India. “The spirit of inquiry should overwhelm the respect for tradition.”

According to Roy, “a critical examination of what is cherished as India’s cultural heritage will enable the Indian people to cast off the chilly grip of a dead past. It will embolden them to face the ugly realities of a living present and look forward to a better, brighter and pleasanter future.” Thus, Roy was opposed to an uncritical and vain glorification of India’s so-called “spiritual” heritage. However, he did not stand for a wholesale rejection of ancient Indian thought either. He favored a rational and critical approach towards ancient traditions and thoughts. Roy believed that the object of European renaissance was to rescue the positive contributions of ancient European civilization, which were lying buried in the Middle Ages owing to the dominance of the Church. Roy had something similar in his mind about India. According to him, one of the tasks of the Renaissance movement should be to rescue the positive outcome and abiding contributions of ancient thought – contributions, which just like the contributions of Greek sages, are lying in ruins under the decayed structure of the Brahmanical Society – the tradition of which is erroneously celebrated as the Indian civilization.

5. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism

a. Roy’s Materialism

M .N. Roy was a strong supporter of materialist philosophy. According to Roy, strictly speaking, materialism is “the only philosophy possible”, because  it represents the knowledge of nature as it really exists—knowledge acquired through the contemplation, observation and investigation of nature itself.

Roy points out that materialism is not the “monstrosity” it is generally supposed to be. It is not the cult of “eat, drink and be merry”, as it has been depicted by its ignorant or malicious adversaries. It simply maintains that “the origin of everything that really exists is matter, that there does not exist anything but matter, all other appearances being transformations of matter, and these transformations are governed necessarily by laws inherent in nature.”  (Roy 1951)

Thus, broadly speaking, Roy’s philosophy is in the tradition of materialism. However, there are some important differences between Roy’s materialism and traditional materialism.  In fact, Roy’s “materialism” is a restatement of traditional materialism in the light of contemporary scientific knowledge.  According to Roy, the substratum of the universe is not matter as traditionally conceived, but it is “physical as against mental or spiritual”. It is, in other words, “a measurable entity”. Therefore, says Roy, to prevent prejudice, materialism could be renamed “physical realism”.

b. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism

Roy was of the view that materialism must be dissociated from certain notions, which have been rendered untenable by the discoveries of science. His revision and restatement of materialism embraces both the basic tenets of materialism: the concept of matter as well as the doctrine of physical determinism.

i. Change in the Concept of “Matter”

According to Roy, the discoveries of quantum physics have “made the classical notion of matter untenable”. Nevertheless, Roy insists that though the substratum of the universe is “not matter as traditionally conceived” it is “physical as against mental or spiritual. It is a measurable entity”.

The so-called “crisis” of materialism, according to Roy, involved the conception of matter, and not its existence.  The “crisis” simply exposed the inadequacy of the old atomist theory. The substance of the “crisis” was, “that it appeared to reduce matter from mass to energy and radiation”. However, there cannot be any doubt about the fact that “atomic physics deals with material realities which exist objectively, outside the mind of the physicist.” Thus, in Roy’s physical realism “matter” is not made up of hard and massy stone-like atoms as in traditional “mechanical materialism”. The whole concept of “matter” has been revised in the light of new physics. In fact, Roy was even ready to discard the term “matter” provided a more appropriate new term could be coined. In Science and Philosophy, Roy describes “matter” as the “sole-existence.” According to Roy, it is not very important what name is attached to the “substratum of existence” – matter, energy, action, vibratory motion or field. However, he insists that it is a physical reality. What Roy means by calling it physical is that it exists objectively and that it is measurable. As we have seen, Roy has even renamed his revised version of materialism as “physical realism”.

ii. Revision of Physical Determinism


Roy disagrees with the view of some thinkers that Heisenberg’s Principle of Uncertainty requires the rejection of the doctrine of determinism. According to Roy, only a modification in the traditional conception of causality is required. Causality, in Roy’s view, is not an a priori form of thought or an axiomatic law; it is physical relation inherent in the constitution of the universe.

Roy, in fact, tries to temper a rigidly mechanical view of determinism by interpreting it in terms of probability. He admits plurality of possibilities and the element of contingency in the world, and tries to show that determinism and probability are not mutually exclusive. However, Roy insists that statistical methods presuppose determinism. The universe is a law-governed system, and the existence of law presupposes causality. He is emphatic that the element of uncertainty in the sub-atomic world is not to be equated with indeterminacy. Rejection of the idea that there are invariant relations in nature, maintains Roy, will blast the very foundation of science.

Roy also tries to reconcile “freedom of will” with determinism. According to him, human beings possess free will and can choose out of various alternatives in front of them. Roy, however, is not unique among materialists in recognizing free will. Epicurus, among ancient Greek materialists, and Hobbes, among modern materialists, tried to accommodate free will in their philosophies. According to Roy, the vast world of biological evolution lies between the world of human beings and the world of inanimate matter, and, therefore, the world of human beings has its own specific laws, though these laws can be referred back to the general laws of the world of dead matter. Nevertheless, human will, says Roy, cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Thus, Roy is not, to use the terminology of William James, a “hard” determinist like Holbach, but a “soft” determinist like Hobbes.

iii. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World

Though Roy traces the origin of mental activities to the physical background of the living world, yet he also grants them an objective existence of their own. Mind and matter, according to Roy, can be reduced to a common denominator; as such, they are two objective realities. In Roy’s view, once formed, ideas exist by themselves, governed by their own laws. Thus, Roy grants much more objectivity and autonomy to the mental world than has been traditionally granted by materialists. Roy’s materialism is not an “extreme” materialism like that of the eighteenth century French materialist, Julien de la Mettrie, who regarded man to be a self-moving machine. According to Roy, on the other hand, “Man is not a living machine, but a thinking animal”.

iv. Emphasis on Ethics

Roy has given a very important place to ethics in his philosophy. According to Roy, “the greatest defect of classical materialism was that its cosmology did not seem to have any connection with ethics”. Roy strongly asserts that if it is not shown that materialist philosophy can accommodate ethics, then, human spirit, thirsting for freedom, will spurn materialism. In Roy’ view materialist ethics is not only possible but also the noblest form of morality. Roy links morality with human being’s innate rationality. Human beings are moral, according to Roy, because they are rational. In Roy’s ethics freedom, which he links with the struggle of existence is the highest value. Search for truth is a corollary to the quest for freedom.

However, Roy is not unique among materialists in emphasizing the importance of ethics in his philosophy. Contrary to popular impression, ancient materialist Epicurus and modern materialist Holbach, for example, accorded an important place to ethics in their philosophies. However, the details of Roy’s ethics are somewhat different from these philosophers.

c. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism


Before he formulated and expounded his own philosophy of New Humanism, Roy was an orthodox Marxist. In fact, Roy’s revision of materialism was carried out in the context of Marxism. Thus, Roy’s revision of materialism in general is also applicable to Marxian materialism to the extent Marxian materialism resembles traditional materialism.

Roy’s Physical Realism is, however, different from Marxian materialism in three important ways:

i. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism

Roy considers the Hegelian heritage a weak spot of Marxism. The simplicity and scientific soundness of materialism are marred by making its validity conditional upon dialectic. According to Roy, materialism pure, and simple, can stand on its own legs, and, therefore, he tries to de-link dialectics from materialism. The validity of materialism, maintains Roy, is in no way conditional on dialectics, as there is no logical connection between the two.

ii. Rejection of Historical Materialism

Roy rejects historical materialism and advocates a humanist interpretation of history in which he gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and he recognizes the autonomy of the mental world. He argues that human will cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Ideas, too, have an objective existence, and are governed by their own laws. The economic interpretation of history is deduced from a wrong interpretation of materialism.

iii. Emphasis on Ethics


Roy’s materialism is sharply different from Marxian materialism in so far it recognizes the importance of ethics and gives a prominent place to it. According to Roy, Marxian materialism wrongly disowns the humanist tradition and thereby divorces materialism from ethics. The contention that “from the scientific point of view this appeal to morality and justice does not help us an inch farther” was based, according to Roy, upon a false notion of science.

d. Roy and Lokayata


His materialism or physical realism could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism: Lokayata or Carvaka. In fact, in the third chapter of his book Materialism, titled “Materialism in Indian Philosophy”, Roy has approvingly referred to Lokayata. According to him, “the long process of the development of naturalist, rationalist, skeptic, agnostic and materialist thought in ancient India found culmination in the Charvak system of philosophy, which can be compared with Greek Epicureanism, and as such is to be appreciated as the positive outcome of the intellectual culture of India”. (94)

6. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy

Roy was a former Marxist and a hero of Indian communists for having rubbed shoulders with Lenin and Stalin. However, he later gave up Marxism and advocated his own “radical humanism”. Naturally, he has been criticized generally by Marxists and communists for renouncing Marxism as well as for finding fault with communist doctrines like “the dictatorship of the proletariat”. Nonetheless, there was a small group of intellectuals who collaborated closely with him in preparing the “Twenty-two Theses on Radical Democracy” and New Humanism: A Manifesto; namely, V. M. Tarkunde, Phillip Spratt, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Sibnarayan Ray, G. D. Parikh, G. R. Dalvi, Sikander Choudhary and Ellen Roy (Roy’s wife). Some of them like Tarkunde, Sibnarayan Ray and G. D. Parikh remained active in the radical humanist movement launched by Roy and also wrote and edited books on him. (See References and Further Reading)

Among the journals founded by M. N. Roy, The Humanist Way, has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published as a monthly by the Indian Renaissance Institute. It was edited for a long time by Tarkunde. Since Tarkunde, it has been edited by R. M. Pal and R. A. Jahagirdar among others.

Outside the select group of Roy’s close friends and associates, A. B. Shah, founder of the Indian Secular Society and The Secularist journal was one of the important intellectuals influenced by Roy’s ideas.

Some of his final ideas are open to criticism even from a humanist perspective. For example, Roy’s use of the word “spiritual” in certain contexts is problematic. Roy talks of “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” of human beings (Section 3), when, in fact, he was a materialist. He was at pains to emphasize that reality is “physical as against mental or spiritual” (Section 5 a ). As a materialist, he was also opposed to the vain glorification of the so-called “spiritual” heritage of India. (Section 4 f ) Apparently, Roy has used the word “spiritual” in phrases like “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” in the sense of “intellectual.” Nonetheless, the use of the term “spiritual” by Roy even in these contexts could be misleading, considering the fact that he did not believe in the existence of soul and spirit. (Ramendra 2001)

Roy’s advocacy of party-less democracy, too, is open to criticism. Freedom of association is a fundamental democratic freedom. In any democracy worth the name, citizens with similar political ideas and programs are bound to come together and cooperate with one another by forming political parties and other non-party organizations. The only possible way to prevent them from doing so will be to deny the fundamental right to association, which will be an undemocratic act in itself. Therefore, the ideal of “party-less democracy” seems to be self-contradictory, impractical and unrealizable.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Parikh, G. D. compiler.  Essence of Royism (Bombay: Nav Jagriti Samaj, 1987).
    • Anthology of  M. N. Roy’s writings by one of his close academician associates.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan. ed., Selected Works of M. N. Roy, vol. I, (Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1987).
    • Altogether four volumes have been published. The first volume contains an illuminating introduction written by the editor, another close academician associate of Roy.
  • Roy, M. N. and Spratt, Phillip.  Beyond Communism (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Shows Roy’s transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N.  India’s Message (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • One of the books made out of the ‘Prison Manuscripts’. Published originally as the second volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  First volume was titled Memoirs of a Cat.
  • Roy, M. N.  Letters from Jail ( Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Private Ltd., 1965).
    • Third volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  Letters written to his future wife and a close associate, Ellen Roy.
  • Roy, M. N.  Materialism (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Ltd., 1951).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N.  M. N. Roy’s Memoirs (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • Covers a short period of six years from 1915.
  • Roy, M. N. New Humanism – A Manifesto (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s final ideas on humanism
  • Roy, M. N. New Orientation (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N. Politics, Power and Parties (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s views on party-politics.
  • Roy, M. N. Reason, Romanticism and Revolution (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1989).
    • Last major work.
  • Roy, M. N. Science and Philosophy (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1984).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N. Scientific Politics (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers, 1947).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism

b. Secondary Sources

  • Karnik, V. B. M. N. Roy (New Delhi: National Book Trust, 1980).
    • A biography of Roy by one of his close associates.
  • Pal, R. M. ed., Selections from the Marxian Way and the Humanist Way (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 2000).
    • Selections from the journal The Marxian Way and The Humanist Way (changed name), edited by Roy.
  • Ramendra. M. N. Roy’s New Humanism and Materialism (Patna: Buddhiwadi Foundation, 2001).
    • A critical study of Roy’s new humanism and materialism.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan, ed. M.N. Roy Philosopher-Revolutionary (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1995).
    • Contains some writings of  M. N. Roy, but also writings of many others on Roy, including that of V. B. Karnik, Suddhindranath Datta, Ellen Roy, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Phillip Spratt, G. D. Parikh, Stanley Maron and H. J. Blackham.
  • Tarkunde, V. M.    Radical Humanism (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • An exposition of radical humanism by an intellectual-activist and a close associate of Roy.

Author Information

Ramendra Nath
Patna University