Bertrand Russell: Logic
For Russell, Aristotelian syllogistic inference does not do justice to the subject of logic. This is surely not surprising. It may well be something of a surprise, however, to learn that in Russell’s view neither Boolean algebra nor modern quantification theory do justice to the subject. For Russell, logic is a synthetic a priori science studying all the kinds of structures there. This thesis about logic makes up the lion’s share of Russell’s philosophy of logic until the late 1920’s, and we shall have little to say of his flirtations with the naturalization of mind thereafter. We shall have much to say about his views on the ontology of structures, for they underwent extensive changes in the time from his writing The Principles of Mathematics (1903) to the three of the four projected volumes of Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913) coauthored with Alfred North Whitehead. The fourth volume on geometry never appeared. Much of this article’s presentation of Russell’s Logic will concern Russell’s various logical systems as they pertain to his Logicism. In “Mathematics and the Metaphysicians” (1901), Russell’s heralds his logicist thesis, observing that mathematics has enjoyed a conceptual revolution. One of the chief triumphs of modern mathematics, he explains, consists in having discovered that mathematics studies relational structure and is therefore free of commitment to the metaphysicians’ abstract particulars such as numbers and spatial figures. This revolutionary conception of mathematics was made possible by advances in geometry, especially in non-Euclidean geometry, and advances in analysis, where real numbers, limits and continuity were newly defined by thinkers such as Cantor, Dedekind, and Weierstrass. On the new conception or mathematics, it is relational order, not magnitude that is the focus. Meanwhile, Logic was also enjoying a conceptual revolution due to Gottlob Frege, who maintained that with the impredicative comprehension of functions, logic (that is, comprehension principle logic, ‘cp-Logic’ hereafter) is an informative science. Russell took this new science to be a study of relational structure, conducted by studying relations independently of whether they are exemplified. The branches of mathematics, in Russell’s view, are studies of different sorts of relations, which structure their fields. Mathematics, then, is a branch of the cp-Logic of relations.
Table of Contents
- Russell’s Logicism
- The Simple Type Syntax of PrincipiaL
- Developments: Principia Mathematica’s Section 8, Definite Descriptions, Class Expressions
- The Ramified-Type Syntax of Church’s PrincipiaC
- The Quantification Theory of Propositions in Theory of Implication (c. 1905)
- The Substitutional Theory of Propositions (1905)
- The Substitutional Theory Without General Propositions (1906)
- Church’s PrincipiaC and Russell’s Orders of Propositions (c. 1907)
- Appendix A: Quantification Theory in The Principles of Mathematics
- Appendix B: The 1925 experiment of Principia MathematicaW
- References and Further Reading
In The Art of Philosophizing, Bertrand Russell offered the following admonishment:
If you wish to become a logician, there is one piece of advice which I cannot urge too strongly, and that is: Do Not learn the traditional formal logic. In Aristotle’s day it was a creditable effort, but so was the Ptolemaic astronomy. To teach either in the present day is a ridiculous piece of antiquarianism.
Russell’s own logics are tailored to his Logicism. Care must be taken in using the word ‘Logicism,’ however, since its advocates have had quite different agendas and quite different conceptions of what it entails. Carnap’s characterization presents Logicism as wedded to a deductive thesis according to which all the truths of mathematics can be derived as theorems from a consistent axiomatic foundation that captures all and only logical truths. This use of ‘Logicism’ can lead to confusion. This form of Logicism belongs neither to Frege’s nor to Russell’s conception. Though both held that a system of cp-Logic is consistently recursively axiomatizable, neither made it definitive of Logicism. Gödel showed that a consistent axiomatic calculus adequate to represent every recursive natural number theoretic function is negation incomplete. That is, for each such calculus there is a wff (well-formed formula) G such that neither G nor ~G is a theorem. Since either G or ~G is true in the standard model, the consistent axiomatic system must leave out a truth of arithmetic. But this is also irrelevant to Logicism as Frege and Russell understood it.
Let us put forth the following definition that altogether separates the deductive thesis from the Logicist thesis. Russell’s Logicism is expressed by this definition:
RLogicism =df pure mathematics is a branch of cp-Logic.
Russell’s Logicism is the thesis that all branches of mathematics, including geometry, Euclidean or otherwise, are studies of relational structures and therefore are studies that can be subsumed within the cp-Logic of relations. Cp-Logic is not modern quantification theory with identity. It is a quantification theory that enables the binding of predicate variables as well as individual variables and which embraces the impredicative comprehension of relations independently of whether these relations are exemplified. Its impredicativity indicates that no restrictions are to be placed on the quantifiers occurring in the wffs which give the exemplification conditions for comprehension of universals.
Two important revolutions, one due to Cantor and another due to Frege, are behind Russell’s Logicism and it would inconceivable without them. Henri Poincaré, a prominent mathematician, never could embrace the revolutions. Poincaré thought of logic and mathematics in the old ways, with mathematics about metaphysical abstract particulars, numbers and spatial figures, and logic constrained to proper inference in reason—a theory of a deductive consequence relation. Poincaré thought Russell’s Logicism entailed that mathematicians are to change their creative practices and tailor proofs techniques into the p’s and q’s of a canonical logistic. Russell’s Logicism entails no such transformation. It simply maintains that, as a study of relational structures, mathematics is a part of cp-Logic as the synthetic a priori science studying all the kinds of relational structures there are by studying the way relations, exemplified or not, order their fields. This is not a movement coming outside of mathematics. It comes from within. It implies that mathematicians are doing cp-Logic—that is, studying relation structures—when they do mathematics.
In Russell’s view, Cantor’s revolution, together with such figures as Weierstrass, Dedekind and Pieri, was responsible for inaugurating the transformation of all branches of mathematics into studies of kinds of relational structures. Russell’s agenda was to demonstrate that abstract particulars are nowhere needed in any branch of mathematics. Frege’s revolution was no less central to Russell’s unique Logicism. It was responsible for transforming the field of logic into cp-Logic, which, as Frege saw it, embraces the informative impredicative comprehension of functions. It was precisely this imprediative comprehension that enabled his new cp-Logic to be an informative science capable of capturing the notions of the ancestral and cardinal number, and to arrive at a theorem of mathematical induction. Frege had seen this already in his Begriffsschrift (1879). Russell came to appreciate it slowly. Frege never quite embraced what Russell regarded as the Cantorian revolution and certainly did not have the Russellian agenda of eliminating abstract particulars—not from geometry and certainly not from the arithmetic of numbers (cardinal, natural, and so on). Quite to the contrary, Frege was adamant in maintaining that cardinal numbers are objects.
In The Principles of Mathematics (1903) Russell’s aim is to explain his Logicism.
The Principles of Mathematics operates with an ontology of logically necessary abstract particulars that are called ‘propositions’. They are mind and language independent entities some of which have the unanalyzable property of being true while others are false. The work was to have a second volume which worked out in a technically formal symbolic way the doctrines of the first volume. The second volume would also solve paradoxes such as Cantor’s paradox of the greatest cardinal, the Burali-Forti paradox of the greatest ordinal, and Russell’s paradoxes of classes and attributes (The Principles of Mathematics , p. xvi). The second volume was to have been coauthored with Alfred North Whitehead who had been a long-time mentor of Russell in mathematics and whose work on abstract algebra is a natural ally of the logicist agenda. But, the project was abandoned.
Instead, Whitehead and Russell produced Principia Mathematica. The Preface goes so far as to say that the work of Principia Mathematica had begun in 1900, even prior to the publication of The Principles of Mathematics. It explains that instead of a second volume for The Principles of Mathematics couched in an ontology of logical necessary existing propositions, the work offers a fresh start avoiding abstract particulars not only in all the branches of mathematics but avoiding them in the field of cp-Logic itself (Principia Mathematica, p. v). Ultimately, Russell went on to endeavor to eliminate abstract particulars from philosophy altogether. This is the agenda of his book Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy (1914) which offered a research program that made Principia Mathematica’s cp-Logic the essence of philosophy. The program, Russell thought, held promise for solving all philosophical problems—problems arising from the paucity of imagination among speculative metaphysicians that results in an inadequate logic that produces indispensability arguments for abstract particulars and kinds of non-logical necessity governing them.
Though Russell’s transition from The Principles of Mathematics to Principia Mathematica is quite complicated, the logicist thesis of the former has not changed at all in the latter. Ample evidence can be found in Principia Mathematica in the following:
Section A: The theory of Deduction (p. 90).
Summary of Principia’s Part I (p. 87).
Summary of Part II, Section A: Prolegomenon to Cardinal Arithmetic (p. 329).
Principia Mathematica says, for example, that the subject of cardinal arithmetic is regarded as different only in degree from the subject matter of logic discussed in Part I. Principia Mathematica is surely advocating Logicism just as in The Principles of Mathematics, but some quite striking changes occur between the two works. For example, in Principia Mathematica Whitehead and Russell no longer regard the infinity of natural numbers to be a subject for mathematics to decide. This result so surprised Boolos (1994) that he concluded that work no longer advances Logicism. But quite to the contrary, it stems from the same source as the discovery in non-Euclidean geometry that not all right triangles obey the Pythagorean theorem. The agenda is to reject indispensability arguments for abstract particulars; the results follow from there. Similarly, that the infinity of the natural numbers is not a mathematical issue follows from the rejection of classes or sets as abstract particulars. There are many such surprises in Principia Mathematica. Another is the discovery that Hume’s Principle, which asserts that the cardinals of two classes are the same if and only if the classes are similar, admits of exceptions (see Landini 2016). Though the conception of Logicism has not changed, it is easy to see that quite a lot happened in the interim between The Principles of Mathematics and Principia Mathematica.
For a great many years the interim period has been akin to the dark ages whose role in modern science has only recently come to light. In this period, Russell worked steadfastly to emulate the impredicative comprehension of cp-Logic in an ingenious substitutional logic of propositional structure. The foundations of the idea to find a substitutional theory to emulate a simple type of universals (and thereby classes) is already manifest in Appendix B of The Principles of Mathematics itself. But, it used the substitution of denoting concepts (‘all a’, ‘some a’, ‘the a’, ‘an a’ ‘any a’ and ‘every a’). The theory of denoting concepts of The Principles of Mathematics proved to be a quagmire and without the 1905 theory of definite descriptions, Russell could not execute the plan for a substitutional theory (see, Landini 1998b). The substitutional theory finally became viable in 1905 and it pervaded Russell’s work until 1908, but most of it was almost completely unknown until the 1980’s. Happily, much of Russell’s work during this time has become clear such that we can better understand the evolution of Principia Mathematica and Russell’s apparently sudden abandonment of propositions. Contrary to years of misunderstanding, the evolution of Russell’s mathematical logic toward Principia Mathematica was not driven by a misguided interest in finding a common solution of both logical and semantic paradoxes. What ended Russell’s substitutional theory of propositional structure was not problems of unity, not problems concerning Liar paradoxes of propositions, and certainly not semantic paradoxes of naming or denoting or defining characteristic of the Richard paradox or Berry or the Grelling. What ended the substitutional theory was a paradox, here called Russell’s ‘ / paradox’. Unlike Liars and semantics paradoxes, it is a Cantorian diagonal paradox grounded in the fact that the emulation of simple types of attributes in the substitutional theory is inconsistent with Cantor’s power-theorem that assures that there can be no function from objects (propositions being themselves objects) onto properties of those objects.
In summary, the whole of Russell philosophical work in mathematical logic may be seen in terms of his trials and tribulations at emulating an impredicative simple-type regimented cp-Logic of universals. Our focus, therefore, is squarely on the evolution of the cp-Logic of Principia Mathematica. In what follows, we shall outline the major logical systems that led Whitehead and Russell to Principia Mathematica’s syntax and formal theory and the informal semantic interpretation they gave it. Since Russell’s work toward a substitutional theory in The Principles of Mathematicss ended in a quagmire and did not yield a formal system, we shall not pause to discuss it. The basic quantification theory of The Principles of Mathematics was replaced by the 1905 “Theory of Implication” which formed the quantification theory for logic of substitution which was to appear in Whitehead and Russell second volume of The Principles of Mathematics.
When Russell abandoned the propositions of his substitutional theory, he abandoned the idea of a second volume for The Principles of Mathematics. But he did not abandon hope that an emulation of an impredicative simple-type stratified regimentation of the cp-Logic of universals might still be found. In the introduction to the first edition of Principia Mathematica, Whitehead and Russell propose an informal nominalistic semantic interpretation of the object-language bindable predicate variables. But by 1920, Russell had come to realize that such a nominalistic semantics could not validate impredicative comprehension axioms. Only a Realist semantics can validate the comprehension principles Principia Mathematica’s impredicative simple-type regimented cp-Logic. Russell never stopped trying, however. In its 1925 second edition, Russell experimented with Wittgensteinian ideas for emulating impredicative comprehension, imagining an altered grammar to accommodate extensionality. Whitehead was not happy with this experiment being included in the new edition since neither he nor Russell intended to advocate it. Alas, Whitehead was right (see, for example, Lowe 1990, Monk 1996). The ideas of the 1925 second edition are sketched in an appendix and end our discussion of Russell’s logics.
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