Science and Ideology

This article illustrates some of the relationships between science and ideologies. It discusses how science has been enlisted to support particular ideologies and how ideologies have influenced the processes and interpretations of scientific inquiry.

An example from the biological sciences illustrates this. In the early 20th century, evolutionary theory was used to support socialism and laissez-faire capitalism. Those two competing ideologies were justified by appeal to biological claims about the nature of evolution.

Those justifications may seem puzzling. If science claims to generate only a limited set of facts about the world—say, the mechanisms of biological diversification—it is unclear how they could inform anything so far removed as economic theory. Part of the answer is that the process of interpreting and applying scientific theories can generate divergent results. Despite science’s capacities to render some exceedingly clear and well-verified central cases, its broader uses can become intertwined with separate knowledge claims, values, and ideologies. Thus, the apparently clear deliverances of natural sciences have been leveraged to endorse competing views.

Rightly or wrongly, this leveraging has long been part of the aims and practice of scientists. Many of the Early Modern progenitors of natural science hoped that science would apply to large swaths of human life. They believed that science could inform and improve politics, religion, education, the humanities, and more. One fictional version of this ideal, from Francis Bacon in the 17th century, imagined scientists as the political elites, ruling because they are best equipped to shape society. Such hopes live on today.

It is not only in its applications that science can become ideological; ideologies also can be part of the formation of sciences. If natural sciences are not hermetically sealed off from society, but instead are permeable to social values, power relations, or dominant norms of an era, then it is possible for science to reflect the ideologies of its practitioners. This can have a particularly pernicious effect when the ideologies that make their way into the science are then claimed to be results derived from the science. Those ideologies, now “naturalized,” have sometimes been granted added credibility because of their supposedly scientific derivation.

Not all sciences seem equally susceptible to ideological influence or appropriation. Ideologies seem to have closer connections to those sciences investigating topics nearer to human concerns. Sciences that claim to bear upon immigration restrictions, government, or human sexuality find wider audiences and wider disputes than scientific conclusions limited to barnacle morphology or quantum gravity.

The potential for science to become entwined with ideology does not necessarily undermine scientific claims or detract from science’s epistemic and cultural value. It hardly makes science trivial, or just one view among others. Science must be used well and taken seriously in order to solve real-world challenges. Part of taking science seriously involves judicious analysis of how ideologies might influence scientific processes and applications.

The topic is vast, and this article confines itself to some historical cases that exemplify significant interactions between science and ideologies.

Table of Contents

  1. Terminology
  2. Science and Political Economy
  3. Science and Race
  4. Science and Gender
  5. Science and Religion
  6. Science as Ideology: Scientism
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Terminology

First, a brief note about definitions.  What exactly is meant by “science” and by “ideology”?  Much has been written attempting to define these concepts, but we only need the broad outlines of such attempts before moving on.

The word “science” derives from the Latin scientia, or knowledge. It has historically been closely associated with philosophy. At least since the Renaissance, the term has acquired connotations of theoretical, organized, and experiential knowledge.

In the 17th century, a constellation of practices, ideas and institutions among natural philosophers contributed to what most historians recognize as the advent of modern science. Galileo Galilei, Rene Descartes, Francis Bacon, Robert Boyle, and Isaac Newton (all of whom considered themselves philosophers) wrote texts that subsequent practitioners lifted up as exemplary of the “new philosophy.” While there was no universal agreement on exactly what this new philosophy consisted of, some of the most salient elements included the rejection of Aristotelian forms and final causes; the attempt to account for most natural phenomena in terms of efficient causes operating according to laws of nature; the identification and quantification of objective “primary qualities” such as mass and velocity; and the introduction of experimental practices using the controlled operation of idealized or contrived events as evidence for nature’s operation.

Science encompasses two distinctive strands, including both a body of knowledge and a coordinated set of instrumental activities that generate technological or engineering solutions. The former continues the legacy of natural philosophy through its aim to understand, explain, and predict the world. The latter strand has more pragmatic concerns to build tools and solve problems. Perhaps unsurprisingly, philosophers have paid most attention to the first, natural philosophical, strand of science.

In the mid-20th century, philosophers launched a vigorous campaign to correctly characterize science and thus distinguish it from illegitimate forms of knowledge or pseudoscience. If the scientific method could be correctly identified, they supposed, then the right method for knowledge generation could be secured, and there would be a better way to jettison dubious, nonscientific, or merely ideological claims. For example, Karl Popper was famously keen to exclude Marxist historiography and Freudian psychoanalysis from the province of science. Along with Popper, Imre Lakatos and others contributed to a sophisticated body of literature on scientific method, attempting to square the idea of characteristic and rational rules of science with the historical record of dynamic, changing scientific theories and practices. Paul Feyerabend, by contrast, urged abandoning the search for rules of science altogether; he argued that, since science is a creative and evolving enterprise, there is no specific method it ever did, or should, follow.

The campaign to distinguish science from pseudoscience has now largely subsided with no clear resolution. Some philosophers see scientificity as a matter of degree that can be instantiated to a greater or lesser extent according to how systematic the study may be. Nonetheless, a single definition of science remains elusive. The diversity of activities and methods used across the natural sciences makes it difficult to find anything that neatly separates sciences from other human activities not typically considered scientific, like auto mechanical work. As one philosopher put it, “Why should there be the method of science? There is not just one way to build a house, or even to grow tomatoes. We should not expect something as motley as the growth of knowledge to be strapped to one methodology” (Hacking 1983).

Much like science, “ideology” is notoriously difficult to pin down as a single, determinate concept. The term was originally proposed around the year 1800 to be, quite literally, a science of ideas: a way to rigorously study humans’ ideas as part of natural history. The term’s creator, Destutt de Tracy, even imagined this new science as a branch of zoology.

But the word has since changed its meaning and today frequently carries a negative connotation. In informal discourse, “being ideological” is often a pejorative label used to accuse someone of being blinkered to reality by a particular set of beliefs. This pejorative sense of ideology comes largely from classical social theorists, especially Karl Marx. For Marx, to be in the grip of a false ideology was to naively adopt ruling class ideas about art, religion, ethics, or politics, which are actually explained by that society’s economic structure. Those ideologies, Marx believed, generated a false consciousness about one’s own world and diverted one’s attention from true sources of oppression (Marx and Engels 1938). While ideologies claim to describe the way things are, Marx claimed that in reality they function to defend political structures underpinning class hierarchies. Marx diagnosed and critiqued such ideologies, hoping thereby to liberate individuals from self-oppression and to bring about social reforms. In this tradition, ideology was often seen as antithetical to science. This conceptual contrast between science and ideology has largely been passed down to us today, for example, when science is imagined to be quintessentially nonideological.

Following Marx, subsequent theorists extended views of ideology and why it might be harmful. Political philosopher Hannah Arendt criticized ideology for the way it short-circuits substantive political debate. Ideologies posit basic tenets or first principles, such as racial purity, class struggle, or free markets, from which other ideas automatically follow. According to Arendt, ideologies have a pernicious role in replacing genuine ethical debate with their own abstract and internal logic. Promising certainty, ideologies run roughshod over tradition, concrete historical particulars, and the difficult business of moral deliberation (Arendt 1973).

This article does not adhere solely to theoretical frameworks that criticize ideology, and so this article treats “ideology” in its broader and more neutral sense, as a description of the organizing beliefs of a population. This second, broader use is in accord with the practices of empirical anthropology, which might seek to describe the organizing beliefs of a foreign culture. When conceived of in this descriptive sense, ideologies may be understood as necessary or positive for many political purposes. Ideologies in this sense are merely ways of interpreting or “mapping” our political and social environments (Freeden 2003).

Some important features are common to both the pejorative and more neutral senses of ideology. First, ideologies are beliefs that legitimate or stabilize social power structures. Broadly speaking, ideologies relate to politics because they have a social function, and as such they can engender a sense of group identity or motivate the need for action. Second, ideologies are not always transparent to those who hold them. It is often easier to recognize ideology in others than in oneself. Third, ideologies involve beliefs that are closer to the center of one’s web of belief. That is to say, they are not easily acquired and released, because they play a structural role in how we see things, what is construed as evidence, and sometimes even personal identity. Fourth, there is typically a complex admixture of descriptive and prescriptive elements to ideologies: Their defense would appeal to the way things are and how things ought to be (Seliger 1976).

We need not dwell on these attempts to define such complex terms as science and ideology. It is worth noting, however, that particular definitions of the terms would render an analysis of science and ideology much less significant—or even meaningless. If science were just descriptive and ideology just prescriptive, then perhaps they would be two radically different sorts of things, and the two should never meet, since, according to some philosophers working in the tradition of David Hume, an is cannot generate an ought. On this view, they could not overlap without some improper transgression of one into the rightful territory of the other. However, ideologies are not just wishful desires; they are informed by some facts and make claims about the way the world is. Conversely, some philosophers argue that science is not accurately characterized as value-free, purely descriptive facts, but instead that science is laden with values (Douglas 2009).

A second set of definitions that might render the topic of science and ideology less meaningful would be if science were essentially or only ideological in nature, so that the two terms wholly collapse into one another. If science were just politics by other means,

then perhaps “science” would not add anything new to an investigation of “science and ideology.” But this collapse can be resisted. While we can fruitfully analyze the generation and transmission of scientific knowledge in its purely social and anthropological dimensions—that is, without reference to truth or to any unconditioned external reality—this does not make science nothing but ideology. Ignoring the distinctiveness of the world from human cognition risks an untenable relativism.

Accordingly, we may rest content with broad and common notions of science and ideology, recognizing that they label many different things and that their boundaries are not precise. This need not hinder investigation. Prototypically at least, sciences are not just ideologies. There may be overlap in the real-world history of science, but the terms regularly and usefully label distinct notions.

2. Science and Political Economy

Many well-known discussions of ideological influence on science illustrate how ideology can warp science. One notorious episode frequently construed as an ideological distortion of science is from mid-20th century Soviet biology, when the agricultural research of Trofim Lysenko was at the center of a broader effort to shape a uniquely Soviet biology (Roll-Hansen 2005; Graham 2016). Lysenko and others claimed that grain growth and heredity could be significantly influenced by environmental alterations such as treating the seeds with cold and moisture, and that such alterations could lead to improved crop yields and the reformulation of genetics writ large. The claims about temperature effects are true, while the latter claims are contested and more problematic. The ideological forces contributing to the rise of Lysenko’s science were at least twofold: First was a Soviet concern that natural science should address practical problems and contribute to the common good of the people—the connection with agriculture here was obvious in this period of scarcity and famine. Second was the Marxist precept that organisms are shaped primarily by their environments rather than determined by innate biological traits. Some Soviet scientists and politicians of the period understood Western genetics to be corrupted by capitalist notions of competition, innateness, and individualism, while they saw Western science more generally as unduly prioritizing pure theoretical science disconnected from the needs of the masses. While there was some merit in such critiques, Lysenkoist science was a failure on its own terms: Crop yields were not radically improved. Moreover, and perhaps most importantly, Stalin’s explicit approval of Lysenkoism as officially Soviet, and the ensuing eradication of a critical research community—including the imprisonment of dissenting scientists—contributed to the precipitous decline of Soviet genetics in this period. Political power structures that hinder open and critical debate damage science.

Ideological influence is not only exerted upon scientific research, but on the dissemination of that research as well. Popular understanding of science is crucial for public policy formation, and that understanding can be shaped by any number of forces. For example, multiple independent lines of evidence established a link between cigarette smoking and lung cancer in the 1940s and 1950s, yet the tobacco industry, aware of these health effects, lobbied think tanks, academics, and media executives to disseminate a message that this science was inconclusive. The industry’s efforts were immensely successful, as many Americans, including medical doctors, reported believing that science had no conclusive evidence for such a link for decades afterwards (Michaels 2008; Brandt 2012; Proctor 2012). The same tactics of purposefully manufacturing scientific uncertainty have been deployed to spread ignorance about scientific knowledge of acid rain, ozone hole depletion, and greenhouse gas emissions (Oreskes and Conway 2010). Behind this campaign of manufactured doubt has been a political concern that some science could be used to support environmental or public health regulations, thus threatening the unregulated markets that some groups find central to political economics.

While ideologies can distort science and its popular understanding, it is important to point out that many of the classic studies of science and ideology investigated which ideologies provided the best contexts for scientific advance (Bernal 1939, Merton 1942). An important thesis concerned whether Western-style liberal democracies could be the best political arrangements for the production of quality science. One idea here was that good science may require a kind of openness to critique that is essentially a political ideal, and that such openness also underpins liberal democracies. One contrast, during this time period, was the Soviet Union’s communism, which excelled in centralized planning of science. State direction of scientific activities contributed to the Soviet Union’s Cold War successes, such as Sputnik, and such strategies were also sometimes used by the US, for example in its Manhattan Project. Political ideologies shape science through funding, planning, institutionalization, and their political ethos.

Much discussion has also been generated by the question of which political or economic ideologies might be supported by particular scientific theories. To take just one example, the theory of evolution by natural selection has been used to legitimate multiple and incompatible political ideologies, from conservative politics and laissez faire capitalism to socialism.

Biology has often been used to reinforce essentialist, individualist, and conservative doctrines. If people are who they are because of innate traits, and society is the way it is because of those traits too, then it seems as if nature itself underwrites the political order. On this view, class structure has its particular form because the upper classes have the right stuff in their blood. Attempts to change the political order, then, would mean not just fighting a status quo, but fighting nature itself. Such ideas, sometimes called “biological determinism,” minimize the influence of environments, history, and culture in shaping societies or individuals and are typically used to oppose efforts to shape society through education, welfare programs, or other promotions of social mobility.

Biology has also been used to bolster a specifically capitalist ideology that places competition in the center of its worldview. The idea here is that just as organisms’ competition for scarce resources eventually generates evolutionary change by weeding out the unfit, so also individual competition should yield social and economic progress. One source for this view in the 19th century was scientific naturalist Herbert Spencer, the pre-Darwinian popularizer of evolution who coined the term “survival of the fittest.” Spencer’s view of evolution was all-encompassing and ardently progressive, positing competition at the center of a process yielding a more harmonious “social organism.” Spencer imagined a biological process responsible for progress in social, political, economic, and even racial dimensions. While Spencer did not intend to justify corporate or state rapaciousness, his popular evolutionary narrative was adopted by others to justify laissez faire capitalism. Upon studying Spencer, American industrialist Andrew Carnegie testified, “I remember that light came as in a flood and all was clear… I had found the truth of evolution. ‘All is well since all grows better’ became my motto, my true source of comfort” (Carnegie 1920). Such ideas apparently meshed with Carnegie’s objection to government influence in commerce, his repudiation of workers’ unions, and his insistence that the concentration of capital by industrialists like himself was essential for social progress. Capitalists were confident nature was on their side.

Socialists were too. Many socialists seized on the materialist implications of evolution—that biological history could be explained in terms of natural laws—to support their view that social history was likewise governed by laws. Some said that Marx had anticipated Darwin by developing an evolutionary picture of social change. The philosopher Georgi Plekhanov went further, practically equating the two theories: “Marxism is Darwinism in its application to social science” (1956). Friedrich Engels thought that evolutionary theory provided evidence for the dialectical nature of historical change, which he argued was key to understanding social and natural history alike. Others found evolution as evidence for socialism only when purged of its problematic framing as essentially competitive. The Russian scientist and philosopher Peter Kropotkin emphasized the centrality of cooperation in biological evolution; his (1902) study of mutual aid argued that a variety of mutualistic and altruistic behaviors had been largely underrepresented in contemporary biology in favor of the more gladiatorial frameworks deployed by British naturalists.  For Kropotkin, the extent of cooperative behaviors in nature bore lessons for social organization writ large: While the “unsociable species” were “doomed to decay,” the more sociable ones were invariably “more prosperous,” open to “further progress,” “higher intellectual development,” and “further progressive evolution.” In turn, Kropotkin advocated a distinctive version of small-scale communism based on voluntary cooperative living.

Indeed, many have found nature replete with lessons about social order, and nature’s authority has been claimed by reactionaries and revolutionaries alike. Darwinism has been grafted onto political economics by various institutions and individuals to serve distinct ends. These combinations of Darwinism and political economics were then no longer straightforwardly scientific theories, but malleable cultural resources that could serve various interests.

Darwin’s evolutionary theory, postulating common descent and natural selection as a mechanism of change, has been accepted in broad outline by contemporary biologists. Moreover, there is a widespread expectation that evolution should inform and enrich many other areas of science and human life. How to use that theory, and what it means for our understanding of economics or politics, remain topics of continued debate. In particular, there is considerable ambiguity in the scope of evolutionary generalizations. Questions remain as to what phenomena evolution applies to, what it does or does not explain, and whether certain forms of social organization are more natural, and therefore preferable, to others. Such questions are not settled by the biological data that were so influential in the theory’s adoption, and they remain contested today.

3. Science and Race

Racist societies have generated racist sciences. If, as was hinted above, science is sometimes permeable to social values, then it makes sense that racist ideologies could make their way into the questions, methods, and analyses of some scientists. Decades of diverse research programs were devoted to establishing the natural basis of European racial supremacy. In the 20th century, eugenics continued the legacy of racist science in its widespread adoption throughout Europe and North America.

Eighteenth and 19th century anthropologists regularly described non-European peoples and cultures as “savage,” “primitive,” and “uncivilized.” Their subjects were typically described in opposition to the “advanced” cultures that anthropologists imagined themselves part of. Early anthropology was closely linked with the colonial projects of Europe, and the notion that foreign peoples were incompetent to look after themselves fit well with the drive to colonize foreign places to extract their resources, bodies, and labor. This period gave rise to the notion that races are biological categories. While theorists continue to debate whether there are viable biological notions of race—for example, as lineages whose geographical isolation is responsible for superficial phenotypic differences (Kitcher 2007)—many contemporary anthropologists, biologists, and philosophers reject the notion that folk categories of race are real biological divisions (Baker et al. 2017; Gannett 2004; Witherspoon et al. 2007; Yudell et al. 2016; Winther and Kaplan 2013).

But if races were distinct biological populations, as many scientists of the 19th century believed, then one scientific task was to classify these distinct groups. An important question among these biologists was whether races descended from a single source—assumed to be Adam and Eve, according to their Christian beliefs—or from multiple, separate sources, perhaps from different places or different Adams. These hypotheses were labeled monogenism and polygenism. Polygenists found an important spokesperson in Harvard biologist Louis Agassiz. Quantitative evidence for Agassiz’s polygenism came from Samuel George Morton’s renowned biometrical measurements of cranial volumes. In this period, skull sizes were believed to be indicators of mental capacity, and Morton’s studies “found” just the answers he expected to find: Europeans had the largest cranial volumes. Such studies were later discovered to be badly compromised by selection bias, but not before they had a significant impact on social policies that disenfranchised non-Europeans. Agassiz, one of the most influential American biologists of the 19th century, used those studies to argue for polygenism, the innate inferiority of “colored races,” and by extension, for separate educational regimes for different ethnicities (Gould 1996).

Darwin hoped that the monogenism inherent to his own theory—this time evolutionary in character rather than creationist—would have remedial social effects. Because evolution posited common descent, emphasizing humans’ shared history, Darwin hoped it would diminish the scientific arguments for racial hierarchy, and therefore contribute to the demise of the slave trade that he abhorred (Desmond and Moore 2009). However, many scientists found that their racism was compatible with multiple scientific theories, including Darwin’s: If we all evolved from a common ancestor, they reasoned, then some of us are more evolved than others. Because evolutionary theory was widely understood as a kind of progressive force molding better and better organisms, it was sometimes used to separate the putatively advanced from less advanced humans, and such scientific hypotheses aligned with common social hierarchies of the time.

Some of the racist proclivities visible in the biometrical programs of cranial measurement persisted into later strands of psychology, including intelligence measurement. Intelligence tests, originally designed by Alfred Binet for diagnostic and remedial purposes, were later transformed by Henry Goddard, who interpreted the tests as indicators of an innate general intelligence. Goddard and many others in his wake used such tests to articulate the social “menace” posed by those of low intelligence, and also to argue for immigration restrictions. His IQ tests were administered to newly arrived immigrants at Ellis Island, where Goddard claimed they showed that about 80% of Jews, Hungarians, and Italians—groups that were often considered inferior races—were officially “feeble-minded.” Goddard concluded, “[T]he immigration of recent years is of a decidedly different character from the early immigration… We are now getting the poorest of each race” (cited in Gould 1996).

Underpinning many lines of such nativist and racist science was a belief in hereditarianism, the doctrine that heredity, rather than environmental influences, decisively shapes or even determines human character traits, including personality and intelligence. For example, many scientists believed that traits like criminality could be passed on from one generation to the next. This hereditarian doctrine, when combined with the modernist political will for social engineering and optimism that the nascent science of genetics would discover discrete underpinnings of traits like criminality, contributed to the rise of eugenics in the early 20th century.

Darwin’s cousin Francis Galton coined the term eugenics, meaning “good breeding,” in 1883 to describe the application of hereditary science to human improvement. The idea was to improve society through more selective reproduction; it could be manifest in positive eugenics, encouraging reproduction among the “right” kind of people; or negative eugenics, discouraging or prohibiting reproduction among the “wrong” kind of people. It was implemented around the world but especially in Europe and North America; records show that 20,000 people were sterilized against their wills in the state of California alone. While eugenics reinforced multiple social prejudices against the disabled, the poor, and the “feeble-minded,” racism was a central element of its broad agenda.

Eugenics garnered widespread support from many corners of public life, including conservatives, progressives, scientists, and the religious. As just one measure of its broad scientific backing, consider that no fewer than five presidents of the American Association for the Advancement of Science were members of the advisory board for the American Eugenics Society. Eugenics flourished in different forms of governments, including socialist, liberal democratic, and authoritarian (Mottier 2010). Galton hoped that eugenics might one day obtain the mass social appeal of “orthodox religion,” and this hope was not far off: Eugenics enjoyed broad support among Protestants, and there was even a sermon competition for best sermons supporting eugenics in America (Rosen 2004). While there was disagreement about how to implement eugenics, there were few institutional voices questioning whether eugenics should be implemented until the 1930s, when the Catholic Church voiced its opposition. British Catholic and public intellectual G. K. Chesterton (1922) was a noteworthy exception to the broad consensus favoring eugenics.

Madison Grant’s (1916) Passing of the Great Race extended hereditarian thinking with explanations of how climate molded Nordic superiority, leading to an advanced race of humans. Grant combined this notion of Nordic supremacy with the leitmotif of white fragility. Whiteness, in this tradition, was fashioned as dominant and innately superior, but at the same time fragile and threatened with imminent demise. Grant was an American amateur anthropologist, but he found a wide audience, and a personal note of praise was mailed to him from none other an overseas admirer than Adolf Hitler, who called the book “my Bible.”

Hitler’s Third Reich was largely founded upon a biomedical ideology of “racial hygiene” (Proctor 1988). The regime is most infamous for its anti-Semitism, but its targeted killings began with the disabled, Roma people, homosexuals, and others who were thought to threaten the purity of the Nordic ideal advanced by Grant and others. Such ideals were construed as public health policies in Germany, backed by physicians in the name of national health. Those policies were continuous with—and in fact sometimes based on—policies arising from American eugenic programs (Kühl 1994, Whitman 2017). As late as 1934, American physicians in favor of forced sterilization laws lamented that “The Germans are beating us at our own game” (cited in Kevles 1985).

The eventual reaction against eugenics was based partly on collective horror of the atrocities of the Holocaust. In addition to this political change in temperament, there were also scientific repudiations of eugenics, notably from anthropologist Franz Boas and biologist Theodotious Dobzhansky. Dobzhansky argued that natural selection maintains variation in population, and that such variation is biologically beneficial. Accordingly, the reduction of such genetic variation via eugenics would be disastrous (Beatty 1994, Paul 1994). In this way, Dobzhansky became one of the predominant critics of eugenics and defenders of human diversity.

4. Science and Gender

Gender ideologies are often visible in the history of theorizing the natural basis of sex (Tuana 1989, Keller and Longino 1989). Aristotle, a progenitor of biological science, writes that being a woman is essentially a deficiency, being a kind of incomplete male. In a series of psychological, anatomical, and physiological comparisons, he contrasts male and female organisms, typically highlighting females’ inferiority. Women are not only “less perfectly formed” than men, but they are even “mutilated” versions of men. Bewilderingly, given that he was such a careful observer, he even wrote that women have fewer teeth than men. For Aristotle, being female is often defined in terms of the female’s incapacities: to concoct blood, to produce semen, or to convert menses into something better. On the topic of reproductive contributions of males and females, he theorized that men pass on the “active principle” of the human form through their semen, whereas women contribute the passive material causes of the embryos.

Aristotle’s biological work was hugely influential for many centuries, and even later scientists noteworthy for challenging Aristotle’s authority still reaffirmed his traditional Greek view that women are biologically inferior to men (Lloyd 1983, Merchant 1990). The case of reproductive physiology is again illustrative. The Roman physician Galen, for example, attributed formal and material causes to both males and females, but nevertheless insisted on female inferiority because of their “imperfect” semen and because their genitalia were internal. Seventeenth century thinkers continued this line of research bolstering male superiority. William Harvey, most famous for his discovery of blood circulation, assigned efficient causes to both male and female reproductive powers, but still insisted that the male was “the superior and more worthy progenitor” (cited in Merchant 1990). Such work supported a predominant belief in Early Modern Europe that males were progenitors while females were essentially incubators.

These cases also illustrate how being female was interpreted as deviation from norm, best, or perfect. That womanhood was theorized as an alterity reflects an important fact about the homogenous population doing the theorizing for most of the history of science, namely, that they were all men.

According to some 19th century psychologists, paleontologists, and anthropologists, women are more infantile, immature versions of men. Whether based on measurements of cranial volume or psychological development, the view here was that women exist in a childlike stage from which males would outgrow. Moreover, according to this thinking, women are biologically closer to animals and the “savage.” German zoologist and physiologist Carl Vogt wrote, “The female European skull resembles much more the Negro skull than that of the European man…[W]henever we perceive an approach to the animal type, the female is nearer to it than the male” (quoted in Russett 1989). Notice the confluence here with the above section on race, where evolutionary narratives were used to establish European supremacy; similar narratives were used to establish male supremacy (Milam 2010).

The physical sciences were also relevant for investigations into gender. In the wake of successful developments in thermodynamics and energy conservation, proponents of “limited energy theory” sought to explain sex differences in the human developmental process. Harvard physician Edward Clarke theorized that strenuous work in one part of the body limited ability and development of other parts of the body. “The brain cannot take more than its share without injury to other organs. It cannot do more than its share without depriving other organs of that exercise and nourishment which are essential to their health and vigor” (Clarke 1873). Limited energy theory had important ramifications for educational practices, according to Clarke, since women who sought the same educations as men diverted their energies from their bodies to mental work, thus risking “neuralgia, uterine disease, hysteria, and other derangements of the nervous system” (1873). Clarke warned that giving men and women equal educations threatened the very survival of the human species. While such theories might seem humorously arcane today, they were partly responsible for excluding generations of women from higher education.

More recent biological sciences, too, have been liable to rely on cultural gender prejudices when describing reproductive behavior and anatomy. Many have detected common Victorian gender prejudices in Darwin’s work, especially his writing on sexual selection (Roughgarden 2009, Richards 2017). The stereotype of the passive female and the adventurous, competitive male has proved remarkably enduring, apparently making its way into late 20th century cell biology. One consequence was an overemphasis on the passivity of the female egg during fertilization: The most influential cell biology textbook of the era described how “an egg will die within hours unless rescued by the sperm” (cited in Martin 1991). Such stereotypical metaphors, aligning with widespread gender ideologies, could impede science to the extent that they hinder investigations or descriptions at odds with culturally entrenched ideas. Indeed, subsequent discoveries of the egg’s active roles in fertilization were nevertheless slow to change biologists’ descriptions. Alternatively, such metaphors could unwittingly naturalize human cultural norms and make them seem unquestionable: “That these stereotypes are now being written in at the level of the cell constitutes a powerful move to make them seem so natural as to be beyond alteration” (Martin 1991).

One further aspect of gender is sexuality, and psychiatric science has shaped—and been shaped by—sexual norms and ideologies. Late 20th century typologies of disease, notably the official manual of mental health known as the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM), pathologized homosexuality in an era when it was considered deviant. According to that standard, homosexuality was officially a psychiatric illness in the United States from 1952 to 1973, and variant categories of homosexuality persisted in the DSM through 1987. While homosexuality has since been de-pathologized in the medical community, some religious communities continue to advocate “reorientation therapy” to treat what they consider the malady of homosexuality (Waidzunas 2015). The history of many mental health disorders has been closely associated with social trends; perhaps being mentally healthy may often depend on social attitudes about the acceptable range of normalcy and variation.

5. Science and Religion

Religions can form the basis of totalizing belief systems encompassing cosmology, theology, politics, and ethics, and so for some theorists, religion is the quintessential ideology. Marx famously called religion “the opiate of the masses” and thought it was precisely the kind of ideology from which people needed liberation in order to understand power dynamics as they truly are. He thought that religions like Christianity served the interests of the ruling classes by placating adherents, making them less willing to acknowledge and confront manifest injustices by deferring justice to an afterlife rather than establishing a more equitable society on earth.

Accordingly, if religion is a typical ideology, then a familiar narrative contrasts religion with science, supposing they are locked in essential conflict with each other. This notion looms large in the popular imagination, and conflict is especially apparent as it has related to the interpretation of religious scriptures. Galileo’s condemnation by the Catholic Church partly involved the church’s resolution to control the interpretation of scripture, which was especially salient during the Counter-Reformation following the Council of Trent. The book of Joshua records that God stopped the sun (presumably from moving around the Earth), which the Church interpreted as evidence for a geocentric planetary order. Galileo suggested an alternative interpretation of the passage that was compatible with heliocentrism, but religious authorities of the 17th century were reluctant to let an outspoken astronomer dictate the correct meaning of scripture.

While strictly literal interpretations of scripture have not been standard in the Christian tradition, some Christians’ opposition to evolutionary theory today likewise hinges on their literal interpretation of religious texts, which they say describes how the world was created in seven days in the year 4004 BC, according to a traditional 17th century chronology by Bishop James Ussher. Evolutionary theory, positing species transmutation and an enormously extended historical timescale, found mixed reception among Christians in different times and places. In America, Darwinian evolution did not meet much resistance until the 1920s, when some Christian evangelicals and fundamentalists linked evolution with threats to favored theological and moral orders. At that time, there was little debate about the status of organic evolution among professional biologists or among most religious leaders, but its tenability was soon called into question especially as a way to influence secondary school curricula. It was in this connection that evolution became the topic of globally publicized courtroom dramas: first as the 1925 Scopes “Monkey” trial on whether evolution was allowed in a Tennessee classroom, and later as the 1982 United States Supreme Court decision on whether creationism was allowed in an Arkansas classroom (Ruse 1988). When creationism was judged to be a religious rather than scientific theory, and thus ruled out of biology classes, it morphed into intelligent design theory, which focused less on advancing specifically Biblical explanations, and more on challenging the status of evolutionary theory. Since the 1970s, creationists and intelligent design theorists alike sought intellectual support from scientific and philosophical resources including Francis Bacon, Karl Popper, and Thomas Kuhn to argue that their preferred version of science was on equal footing with evolutionary theory (Numbers 2006).

Antievolutionism was not led primarily by churches but by individuals like William Jennings Bryan and George McCready Price. Bryan was the populist politician, a three-time presidential candidate of the Democratic party, who battled evolution at the Scopes trial. For Bryan, evolution was associated with moral decay and a decline of Biblical authority. Bryan thought Darwinism was implicated in the militant German nationalism of World War I and the decrease in religious belief among college-educated Americans. Despite Bryan’s renown as an opponent of evolution, he was primarily concerned with protecting the supernatural origin of humans, and in fact had no qualms with evolution in general or the standard reading of “days” in the book of Genesis as extended periods of time compatible with geological findings. Young-Earth creationism was born as the “flood geology” of Seventh-day Adventist George McReady Price, who posited a literal six-day creation narrative and a young-Earth chronology. While this was not the traditional Christian interpretation of Genesis, Price advocated for this strictest version of creationism because he was following the teachings of Adventist founder Ellen G. White, who claimed divine inspiration for her view that the fossil record was the result of the Noachian flood. While much of the rhetoric among creationists has focused on matters of Biblical interpretation, the fact that such strident literalist antievolutionism took form only in the 1920s, and did not catch on with a broader public until the 1960s, suggests that creationism is at least partly explained by social and political conditions unique to those periods, such as some Christians’ rejections of what they considered modernity’s excesses.

The supposition that there is an essential conflict between science and religion is often founded on the premise that they are pursuing the same goals—say, the true description of the world—and so they are competing for the same territory. One narrative based on that notion of shared goals has it that science is displacing religious explanations of natural phenomena: Where mythological or religious explanations once sufficed, we now have true scientific explanations. However, the premise that science and religion share the same goals has been disputed from various quarters. Biologist Stephen Jay Gould argued that science and religion are “non-overlapping magesteria,” two realms concerned with two separate subject matters: science with facts and religion with values (Gould 1999, see also Brooke 2016). Reformed theologian Karl Barth, arguing from a very different perspective, theorized how science and religion rest on wholly separate foundations: science on empirical reality and religion on revelation. Such arguments are sensitive to the ways that sciences and religions evince distinctive ends and practices; perhaps they do not share the same goals after all.

If science and religion sometimes pursue separate goals with separate methods, then this dimishes the emphasis on conflict. Historically, at least, the emphasis on conflict is an incomplete way to tell the story of science and religion. It was not a common way to think of the relationship of science and religion until recently. The “conflict narrative,” as it is known by historians, dates only from the late 19th century, from influential if methodologically flawed history texts by John William Draper and Andrew Dixon White. No such totalizing conflict was perceived for most of the history of science (Brooke 1991, Numbers 2009, Harrison 2010).

While the sources of modern sciences are diverse, reaching back to ancient Greek and medieval Arabic and European roots, modern sciences were institutionalized in an overwhelmingly Christian Europe in the 17th century (see also Effron 2010). It would have been quite surprising, then, if this new “mechanistic philosophy,” as it was then known, was considered irreligious. It was not. Many of the architects of modern sciences were themselves Christians of one stripe or another, in whose minds there was no conflict between their own scientific and religious practices. To the contrary, for most of these early scientists, doing science was a pious activity especially befitting the religious, insofar as coming to know God’s creation was a way of coming to know the Creator. The tradition of natural theology, which sought to infer the existence or attributes of the Creator through the design apparent in the creation, was a religious framework for doing science for centuries (Re Manning 2013, Topham 2010). Kepler, Galileo, Newton, and many others believed that doing science amounted to deciphering the “book of nature”—a common theological metaphor that placed scientific investigation alongside the study of religious scripture. Robert Boyle, the 17th century chemist and namesake of Boyle’s Law, labored to ensure that the new mechanistic philosophy was not seen as threatening religious belief, but rather as more compatible with Christian theology than the reigning Scholastic approach of his time. In one passage, Boyle even advocated performing experimental science on the Sabbath, as it could be considered a form of worship (Davis 2007).

Accordingly, the conflict narrative does not capture most of the history of science and religion. Science advanced not despite, but often because of its religious significance to early scientists. As one historian writes, “a distinctive feature of the Scientific Revolution is that, unlike other earlier scientific programs and cultures, it is driven, often explicitly, by religious considerations: Christianity set the agenda for natural philosophy in many respects and projected it forward in a way quite different from that of any other scientific culture” (Gaukroger 2006). Impulses arising from within religious movements spurred and shaped the formation of natural sciences (Harrison 1998).

If contemporary historians reject the conflict view relating science and religion, they have adopted a more nuanced position known simply as the complexity thesis, which states that there is no single relation between science and religion. Such complexity should be entirely expected if science and religion are not stable, monolithic entities with timeless essences, but instead are labels for diverse, dynamic traditions of thought and practice. Consider briefly that there is no essential element shared across all religions—not even a general one such as belief in gods. It should not be surprising, then, that all those things called religions might not have a single relationship with science. Such complexity, then, provides a warning sign for all studies of science and religion: Sweeping narratives that so readily lend themselves to ideological or rhetorical purposes often ignore complexity at the cost of historical accuracy.

6. Science as Ideology: Scientism

Finally, it is worth noting a sense in which science itself can form a basis of an ideology. When science is credited as the one and only way we have to describe reality, or to state truth, such restrictive epistemology might graduate into scientism. According to this view, the only rationality is scientific rationality. Poetry, literature, music, fine art, religion, or ethics could not be considered sources of knowledge, according to this view, because they are not generated by scientific methods. Such fealty to the deliverances of science, especially at the expense of other ways of knowing, can become ideological, and scientism is the preferred description of such a view. While enthusiasm for science has been a part of its ethos since the Enlightenment, scientism goes beyond enthusiasm in its insistence that whatever falls outside the scope of science is not knowledge. Alternatively, scientism is sometimes used to refer more specifically to the uses of science to inform policy. If political issues are framed as scientific, so that scientific evidence alone can adjudicate the right policies, it constitutes a strongly technocratic move to replace politics with science, and such replacement can also be a form of scientism.

The use of the label “scientism” typically implies a negative judgment about a problematic fidelity to science, but a few theorists have embraced the label as well. There is no simple relationship between science and scientism. Many scientists reject scientism, while some humanities scholars promote it. When humanists decide they ought to work within a metaphysics they imagine to be scientific, they may feel compelled to adopt a materialist or reductionist framework rejecting traditional categories of humanistic inquiry, such as person, will, freedom, judgment, or agency. Insofar as natural sciences might not recognize those categories, some humanistic scholarship has been transformed—some would say attenuated—by the loss of such concepts (Pfau 2013).

We can identify at least four challenges for scientism. First, an overweening loyalty to science and rejection of nonscience may presuppose that such categories have discrete boundaries. As noted in Section 1, however, the longstanding attempt to characterize science through a definition or definitive methods has been largely unsuccessful. It has proven incredibly difficult to specify exactly what makes an approach to the world scientific, which obviously problematizes the derogation of nonscience. Second, the appeal to science can obscure the question of which parts of science are being drawn upon. If science consists of a variety of distinctive practices, answering many different questions with many different methodological approaches, then appeals to science simpliciter can obfuscate important questions about which science is being included, which omitted, and how it is analyzed. This is important because different scientific studies and methods often do not align to provide straightforward results: Separate analyses even of the very same data can yield remarkably divergent conclusions (Stegenga 2011). Third, proponents of scientism sometimes marshal their own scientific credentials to back their claims. In a society that grants so much cultural authority to scientists, those credentials can easily bestow rhetorical power. Nonetheless, scientific expertise does not automatically entail expertise in other areas, and it has proved all too easy for, say, some biologists to make philosophical and theological pronouncements without training in, or even appreciation for, those other fields of study. A fourth challenge faces scientism as a replacement for politics; the problem is that political debates are typically not exhausted by their scientific dimensions. Issues like climate change or race relations, for example, involve more than scientific results; they also include conceptions of justice, freedom, economics, and even religion, which are each infused with ethical concerns. Politics cannot be reduced to technical scientific problems, and so the attempt to convert essentially ideological debates into straightforward scientific hypotheses can misconstrue what is at stake and overlook important issues under debate (Oakeshott 1962, Bernstein 1976, Seliger 1976).

Insofar as science’s powers are rooted in methods aimed at studying nature independent of any ideologies, this also represents a limit to its application. While scientific inquiry can contribute to nearly any problem we face, science typically cannot determine the solutions to those problems on its own; to think otherwise is to fall prey to scientism. Most real-world problem solving involves more than just applying scientific results; it also involves complex philosophical and ethical judgments, whether or not those are explicitly articulated.

7. Conclusion

Although it is often lamented whenever science is politicized, this article shows how frequently scientific knowledge has been intertwined with broader social and political concerns. History does not entail that such politicization is acceptable or inevitable. History does suggest it is nothing new. So long as we believe that science will matter to the things we care about most deeply, we should expect such contestations to continue in the future. Seen this way, ideological debates over science illustrate just how central science is in the modern world. Ideologically-contested science is not a sign that we fail to value science; to the contrary it shows us just how much all partisans agree that science is central to their advocacy. Of course, this can be problematic if science is misrepresented in order to justify particular interests.

Ideologues have often claimed science to be on their side. That is not surprising, given the cultural status of science, and given that ideologies are usually informed by some factual, putatively scientific claims. This article has shown how science has been used to support various ideologies.

It has also shown how ideologies can make their way into science. In the West, science has often been shaped by dominant ideologies which have privileged the white, the male, and the heterosexual, while demoting or pathologizing non-Europeans, women, and homosexuals. It seems clear that scientists have sometimes drawn on widely shared social beliefs when they are doing science, and that such ideologies can influence their science. Thus, it is problematic, to say the least, when those scientific results are then cited as independent evidence for the ideologies themselves (Lewontin 1992).

On the other hand, science has also been used as a check or bulwark against inhumane ideologies, such as Darwin’s fight against the slave trade or Dobzhansky’s arguments against eugenics. In these ways, ostensibly scientific disputes can also be sites of adjudicating ideological conflict, though such adjudication necessarily draws on more than just scientific data.

If ideologies can be assimilated into science, science has also challenged traditional beliefs and ideologies. As one classicist argues, “Ancient science is from the beginning strongly marked by the interplay between, on the one hand, the assimilation of popular assumptions, and, on the other, their critical analysis, exposure and rejection, and this continues to be a feature of science to the end of antiquity and beyond” (Lloyd 1983). Science and ideologies can adjust to one another, and this process is ongoing.

A close look at the history of science makes any clean-cut division between science and ideology appear artificially imposed. The history of science instead engenders a sense for the complex assortment and rearrangement of ideas that can problematize any straightforward isolation of the scientific from the ideological. Indeed, most contemporary historians and sociologists of science make sense of scientific changes partly by recognizing science’s permeability to cultural pressures. Political and religious frameworks can influence the questions scientists ask, which research they take to be significant, how they assess its importance, and even how long particular problems are worth pursuing.

As one historian put it, “The lines between science, ideology and world view are seldom tightly drawn” (Greene 1982). The point is that science has historically been enmeshed with social trends and beliefs that include ideologies. Historian Bob Young went so far as to claim that ideology is pervasive: “Ideology is an inescapable level of discourse” (Young 1971).

While the historical cases sketched above are well documented, the philosophical conclusions we might draw from them remain contested. For instance, one view is that they are unfortunate instances of science gone bad. Another is that perhaps they are cases where science is corrupted or objectivity is compromised. Optimistically, we might learn from them and try to remain more unbiased or ideologically neutral in the future. Perhaps self-awareness about our own social and political values will help secure more objective science.

However, it is possible that it will remain difficult to fully recognize exactly how broader patterns of thought, including background assumptions that are ideological in nature, influence scientific theorizing. Recent cognitive studies of implicit bias indicate that humans operate with biases they often do not recognize and which are difficult or impossible to eliminate. It remains to be seen how such biases might influence scientific theorizing. As was noted in section 1, ideologies are often difficult to recognize—especially in oneself—but their critical analysis is important not just for politics but for science as well.

Because ideologies are held by everyone, including scientists, they can sometimes explain why some scientific hypotheses are not pursued, while others are pursued or accepted uncritically. In his published writings at least, Darwin seems to have rejected out of hand the hypothesis that women could be cognitively equal to men; such equality would seem extremely implausible given the Victorian gender norms that Darwin generally shared. For other scientists, hypotheses such as the genetic determination of intelligence have been uncritically accepted because they fit a favored ideological narrative (Richardson 1984).

It is possible that ideologies find their way into science more effectively among homogenous groups of scientists. Examples such as the longstanding research program of white men asking why women and minorities were so much less intelligent are at the very least suggestive. Who is doing the science may very well influence what scientific questions are asked, which of course relates to what conclusions are reached. Some philosophers argue that more diverse groups of inquirers can foster objectivity. On this view, the lack of diversity in science is no mere political or moral problem, but an epistemic problem. Insofar as modern sciences are no longer primarily the pursuit of individuals, but a collective enterprise to be analyzed at the community level, then objectivity might best be achieved among groups with different backgrounds or life experiences (Longino 1990). Analyses of the relationship between social position and scientific knowledge were pioneered by feminist philosophers but have since become mainstream (Richardson 2010). Some empirical evidence indeed suggests that ethnic and geographic diversity among researchers can improve scientific results (Adams 2013; Freeman and Huang 2014).

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Author Information

Eric C. Martin
Baylor University
U. S. A.