Scientific Change

How do scientific theories, concepts and methods change over time? Answers to this question have historical parts and philosophical parts. There can be descriptive accounts of the recorded differences over time of particular theories, concepts, and methods—what might be called the shape of scientific change. Many stories of scientific change attempt to give more than statements of what, where and when change took place. Why this change then, and toward what end? By what processes did they take place? What is the nature of scientific change?

This article gives a brief overview of the most influential views on the shape and nature of change in science. Important thematic questions are: How gradual or rapid is scientific change? Is science really revolutionary? How radical is the change? Are periods in science incommensurable, or is there continuity between the first and latest scientific ideas? Is science getting closer to some final form, or merely moving away from a contingent, non-determining past? What role do the factors of community, society, gender, or technology play in facilitating or mitigating scientific change? The most important modern development in the topic is that none of these questions have the same answer for all sciences. When we speak of scientific change it should be recognized that it is only at a fairly contextualized level of description of the practices of scientists at rather specific times and places that anything substantial can be said.

Nonetheless, scientific change is connected with many other key issues in philosophy of science and broader epistemology, such as realism, rationality and relativism. The present article does not attempt to address them all. Higher-order debates regarding the methods of historiography or the epistemology of science, or the disciplinary differences between History and Philosophy, while important and interesting, represent an iteration of reflection on top of scientific change itself, and so go beyond the article’s scope.

Table of Contents

  1. If Science Changes, What is Science?
  2. History of Science and Scientific Change
  3. Philosophical Views on Change and Progress in Science
    1. Kuhn, Paradigms and Revolutions
      1. Key Concepts in Kuhn’s Account of Scientific Change
      2. Incommensurability as the Result of Radical Scientific Change
    2. Lakatos and Progressing and Degenerating Research Programs
    3. Laudan and Research Traditions
  4. The Social Processes of Change
    1. Fleck
    2. Hull’s Evolutionary Account of Scientific Change
  5. Cognitive Views on Scientific Change
    1. Cognitive History of Science
    2. Scientific Change and Science Education
  6. Further Reading and References
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Concepts, Cognition and Change
      2. Feminist, Situated and Social Approaches
      3. The Scientific Revolution

1. If Science Changes, What is Science?

We begin with some organizing remarks. It is interesting to note at the outset the reflexive nature of the topic of scientific change. A main concern of science is understanding physical change, whether it be motions, growth, cause and effect, the creation of the universe or the evolution of species. Scientific views of change have influenced philosophical views of change and of identity, particularly among philosophers impressed by science’s success at predicting and controlling change. These philosophical views are then reflected back, through the history and philosophy of science, as images of how science itself changes, of how its theories are created, evolve and die. Models of change from science—evolutionary, mechanical, revolutionary—often serve as models of change in science.

This makes it difficult to disentangle the actual history of science from our philosophical expectations about it. And the historiography and the philosophy of science do not always live together comfortably. Historians balk at the evaluative, forward-looking, and often necessitarian, claims of standard philosophical reconstructions of scientific events. Philosophers, for their part, have argued that details of the history of science matter little to a proper theory of scientific change, and that a distinction can and should be made between how scientific ideas are discovered and how they are justified. Beneath the ranging, messy, and contingent happenings which led to our current scientific outlook, there lies a progressive, systematically evolving activity waiting to be rationally reconstructed.

Clearly, to tell any story of ‘science changing’ means looking beneath the surface of those changes in order to find something that remains constant, the thing which remains science. Conversely, what one takes to be the demarcating criteria of science will largely dictate how one talks about its changes. What part of human history is to be identified with science? Where does science start and where does it end? The breadth of science has a dimension across concurrent events as well as across the past and future. That is, it has both synchronic (at a time) and diachronic (over time) dimensions. Science will consist of a range of contemporary events which need to be demarcated. But likewise, science has a temporal breadth: a beginning, or possibly several beginnings, and possibly several ends.

The synchronic dimension of science is one way views of scientific change can be distinguished. On one hand there are logical or rationalistic views according to which scientific activity can be reduced to a collection of objective, rational decisions of a number of individual scientists. On this latter view, the most significant changes in science can each be described through the logically-reconstructable actions and words of one historical figure, or at most a very few. According to many of the more recent views, however, an adequate picture of science cannot be formed with anything less than the full context of social and political structures: the personal, institutional, and cultural relations scientists are a part of. We look at some of these broader sociological views in the section on social process of change.

Historians and philosophers of science have wanted also to “broaden” science diachronically, to historicize its content, such that the justifications of science, or even its meanings, cannot be divorced from their past. We will begin with the most influential figure for history and philosophy of science in North America in the last half-century: Thomas Kuhn. Kuhn’s work in the middle of the last century was primarily a reaction to the then prevalent, rationalistic and a-historical view described in the previous paragraph. Along with Kuhn, we describe the closely related views of Imre Lakatos and Larry Laudan. For an introduction to the most influential philosophical accounts of the diachronical development of science, see Losee 2004.

When Kuhn and the others advanced their new views on the development of science into Anglo-Saxon philosophy of science, history and sociology were already an important part of the landscape of Continental history and philosophy of science. A discussion of these views can be found as part of the sociology of science section as well. The article concludes with more recent naturalized approaches to scientific change, which turn to cognitive science for accounts of scientific understanding and how that understanding is formed and changed, as well as suggestions for further reading.

Science itself, at least in a form recognizable to us, is a twentieth century phenomenon. Although a matter of debate, the canonical view of the history of scientific change is that its seminal event is the one tellingly labeled the Scientific Revolution. It is usually dated to the 16th and 17th centuries. The first historiographies of science—as much construction of the revolution as they were documentation—were not far behind, coming in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Professionalization of the history of science, characterized by reflections on the telling of the history of science, followed later. We begin our story there.

2. History of Science and Scientific Change

As history of science professionalized, becoming a separate academic discipline in the twentieth century, scientific change was seen early on as an important theme within the discipline. Admittedly, the idea of radical change was not a key notion for early practitioners of the field such as George Sarton (1884-1956), the father of history of science in the United States, but with the work of historians of science such as Alexandre Koyré (1892-1964), Herbert Butterfield (1900-1979) and A. Rupert Hall (1920-2009), radical conceptual transformations came to play a much more important role.

One of the early outcomes of this interest in change was the volume Scientific Change (Crombie, 1963) in which historians of science covering the span of science from the physical to the biological sciences, and the span of history from antiquity to modern science, all investigated the conditions for scientific change by examining cases from a multitude of periods, societies, and scientific disciplines. The introduction to Crombie’s volume presented a large number of questions regarding scientific change that remained key issues in both history and philosophy of science for several decades:

What were the essential changes in scientific thought and how were they brought about? What was the part played in the initiation of change by mutations in fundamental ideas leading to new questions being asked, new problems being seen, new criteria of satisfactory explanation replacing the old? What was the part played by new technical inventions in mathematics and experimental apparatus; by developments in pure mathematics; by the refinements of measurement; by the transference of ideas, methods and information from one field of study to another? What significance can be given to the description and use of scientific methods and concepts in advance of scientific achievement? How have methods and concepts of explanation differed in different sciences? How has language changed in changing scientific contexts? What parts have chance and personal idiosyncrasy played in discovery? How have scientific changes been located in the context of general ideas and intellectual motives, and to what extent have extra-scientific beliefs given theories their power to convince? … How have scientific and technical changes been located in the social context of motives and opportunities? What value has been put on scientific activity by society at large, by the needs of industry, commerce, war, medicine and the arts, by governmental and private investment, by religion, by different states and social systems? To what external social, economic and political pressures have science, technology and medicine been exposed? Are money and opportunity all that is needed to create scientific and technical progress in modern society? (Crombie, 1963, p. 10)

Of particular interest among historians of science have been the changes associated with scientific revolutions and especially the period often referred to as the Scientific Revolution, seen as the sum of achievements in science from Copernicus to Newton (Cohen 1985; Hall 1954; Koyré 1965). The word ‘revolution’ had started being applied in the eighteenth century to the developments in astronomy and physics as well as the change in chemical theory which emerged with the work of Lavoisier in the 1770s, or the change in biology which was initiated by Darwin’s work in the mid-nineteenth century. These were fundamental changes that overturned not only the reigning theories but also carried with them significant consequences outside their respective scientific disciplines. In most of the early work in history of science, scientific change in the form of scientific revolutions was something which happened only rarely. This view was changed by the historian and philosopher of science Thomas S. Kuhn whose 1962 monograph The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1970) came to influence philosophy of science for decades. Kuhn wanted in his monograph to argue for a change in the philosophical conceptions of science and its development, but based on historical case studies. The notion of revolutions that he used in Structure included not only fundamental changes of theory that had a significant influence on the overall world view of both scientists and non-scientists, but also changes of theory whose consequences remained solely within the scientific discipline in which the change had taken place. This considerably widened the notion of scientific revolutions compared to earlier historians and initiated discussions among both historians and philosophers on the balance between continuity and change in the development of science.

3. Philosophical Views on Change and Progress in Science

In the British and North American schools of philosophy of science, scientific change did not became a major topic until the 1960s onwards when historically inclined philosophers of science, including Thomas S. Kuhn (1922-1996), Paul K. Feyerabend (1924-1994), N. Russell Hanson (1924-1967), Michael Polanyi (1891-1971), Stephen Toulmin (1922-2009) and Mary Hesse (*1924) started questioning the assumptions of logical positivism, arguing that philosophy of science should be concerned with the historical structure of science rather than with an ahistorical logical structure which they found to be a chimera. The occupation with history led naturally to a focus on how science develops, including whether science progresses incrementally or through changes which represent some kind of discontinuity.

Similar questions had also been discussed among Continental scholars. The development of the theory of relativity and of quantum mechanics in the beginning of the twentieth century suggested that empirical science could overturn deeply held intuitions and introduce counter-intuitive new concepts and ideas; and several European philosophers, among them the German neo-Kantian philosopher Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945), directed their work towards rejecting Kant’s absolute categories in favor of categories that may change over time. In France, the historian and philosopher of science Gaston Bachelard (1884-1962) also noted that what Kant had taken to be absolute preconditions for knowledge had turned out wrong in the light of modern physics. On Bachelard’s view, what had seemed to be absolute preconditions for knowledge were instead merely contingent conditions. These conditions were still required for scientific reasoning and therefore, Bachelard concluded, a full account of scientific reasoning could only be derived from reflections upon its historical conditions and development. Based on the analysis of the historical development of science, Bachelard advanced a model of scientific change according to which the conceptions of nature are from time to time replaced by radical new conceptions – what Bachelard called epistemological breaks.

Bachelard’s view was later developed and modified by the historian and philosopher of science, and student of Bachelard, George Canguilhem (1904-1995) and by the philosopher and social historian, and student of Canguilhem, Michel Foucault (1926-1984). Beyond the teacher-student connections, there are other commonalities which unify this tradition. In North America and England, among those who wanted to make philosophy more like science, or to import into philosophical practice lessons from the success of science, the exemplar was almost always physics. The most striking and profound advances in science seemed to be, after all, in physics, namely the quantum and relativity revolutions. But on the Continent, model sciences were just as often linguistics or sociology, biology or anthropology, and not limited to those. Canguilhem’s interest in changing notions of the normal versus the pathological, for example, coming from an interest in medicine, typified the more human-centered theorising of the tradition. What we as humans know, how we know it, and how we successfully achieve our aims, are the guiding questions, not how to escape our human condition or situatedness.

Foucault described his project as archaeology of the history of human thought and its conditions. He compared his project to Kant’s critique of reason, but with the difference that Foucault’s interest was in a historical a priori; that is, with what seem to be for a given period the necessary conditions governing reason, and how these constraints have a contingent historical origin. Hence, in his analysis of the development of the human sciences from the Renaissance to the present, Foucault described various so-called epistemes that determined the conditions for all knowledge of their time, and he argued that the transition from one episteme to the next happens as a break that entails radical changes in the conception of knowledge. Michael Friedman’s work on the relativized and dynamic a priori can be seen as continuation of this thread (Friedman 2001). For a detailed account of the work of Bachelard, Canguilhem and Foucalt, see Gutting (1989).

With the advent of Kuhn’s Structure, “non-Continental” philosophy of science also started focusing in its own way on the historical development of science, often apparently unaware of the earlier tradition, and in the decades to follow alternative models were developed to describe how theories supersede their successors, and whether progress in science is gradual and incremental or whether it is discontinuous. Among the key contributions to this discussion, besides Kuhn’s famous paradigm-shift model, were Imre Lakatos’ (1922-1974) model of progressing and degenerating research programs and Larry Laudan’s (*1941) model of successive research traditions.

a. Kuhn, Paradigms and Revolutions

One of the key contributions that provoked interest in scientific change among philosophers of science was Thomas S. Kuhn’s seminal monograph The Structure of Scientific Revolutions from 1962. The aim of this monograph was to question the view that science is cumulative and progressive, and Kuhn opened with: “History, if viewed as a repository for more than anecdote or chronology, could produce a decisive transformation in the image of science by which we are now possessed” (p. 1). History was expected to do more than just chronicle the successive increments of, or impediments to, our progress towards the present. Instead, historians and philosophers should focus on the historical integrity of science at a particular time in its development, and should analyze science as it developed. Instead of describing a cumulative, teleological development toward the present, history of science should see science as developing from a given point in history. Kuhn expected a new image of science would emerge from this diachronic historiography. In the rest of Structure he used historical examples to question the view of science as a cumulative development in which scientists gradually add new pieces to the ever-growing aggregate of scientific knowledge, and instead he described how science develops through successive periods of tradition-preserving normal science and tradition-shattering revolutions. For introductions to Kuhn’s philosophy of science, see for example Andersen 2001, Bird 2000, and Hoyningen-Huene 1993.

i. Key Concepts in Kuhn’s Account of Scientific Change

On Kuhn’s model, science proceeds in key phases. The predominant phase is normal science which, while progressing successfully in its aims, inherently generates what Kuhn calls anomalies. In brief, anomalies lead to crisis and extraordinary science, followed by revolution, and finally a new phase of normal science.

Normal science is characterized by a consensus which exists throughout the scientific community as to (a) the concepts used in communication among scientists, (b) the problems which can meaningfully be formulated as relevant research problems, and (c) a set of exemplary problem solutions that serve as models in solving new problems. Kuhn first introduced the notion ‘paradigm’ to denote these shared communal aspects, and also the tools used by that community for solving its research problems. Because so much was apparently captured by the term ‘paradigm’, Kuhn was criticized for using the term in ambiguous ways (see especially Masterman 1970). He later offered the alternative notion ‘disciplinary matrix’, covering (a) symbolic generalizations, or laws in their most fundamental forms, (b) beliefs about which objects and phenomena that exist in the world, (c) values by which the quality of research can be evaluated, and (d) exemplary problems and problem situations. In normal science, scientists draw on the tools provided by the disciplinary matrix, and they expect the solutions of new problems to be in consonance with the descriptions and solutions of the problems that they have previously examined. But sometimes these expectations are violated. Problems may turn out not to be solvable in an acceptable way, and then instead they represent anomalies for the reigning theories.

Not all anomalies are equally severe. Some discrepancy can always be found between theoretical predictions and experimental findings, and this does not necessarily challenge the foundations of normal science. Hence, some anomalies can be neglected, at least for some time. Others may find a solution within the reigning theoretical framework. Only a small number will be so severe and so persistent, that they suggest the tools provided by the accepted theories must be given up, or at least be seriously modified. Science has then entered the crisis phase of Kuhn’s model. Even in crisis, revolution may not be immediately forthcoming. Scientists may “agree” that no solution is likely to be found in the present state of their field and simply set the problems aside for future scientists to solve with more developed tools, while they return to normal science in its present form. More often though, when crisis has become severe enough for questioning the foundation, and the anomalies may be solved by a new theory, that theory gradually receives acceptance until eventually a new consensus is established among members of the scientific community regarding the new theory. Only in this case has a scientific revolution occurred.

Importantly though, even severe anomalies are not simply falsifying instances. Severe anomalies cause scientists to question the accepted theories, but the anomalies do not lead the scientists to abandon the paradigm without an alternative to replace it. This raises a crucial question regarding scientific change on Kuhn’s model: where do new theories come from? Kuhn said little about this creative aspect of scientific change; a topic that later became central to cognitively inclined philosophers of science working on scientific change (see the section on Cognitive Views below). Kuhn described merely how severe anomalies would become the fixation point for further research, while attempts to solve them might gradually diverge more and more from the solution hitherto accepted as exemplary. Until, in the course of this development, embryonic forms of alternative theories were born.

ii. Incommensurability as the Result of Radical Scientific Change

For Kuhn the relation between normal science traditions separated by a scientific revolution cannot be described as incorporation of one into the other, or as incremental growth. To describe the relation, Kuhn adopted the term ‘incommensurability’ from mathematics, claiming that the new normal-scientific tradition which emerges from a scientific revolution is not only incompatible but often actually incommensurable with that which has gone before.

Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability covered three different aspects of the relation between the pre- and post-revolutionary normal science traditions: (1) a change in the set of scientific problems and the way in which they are attacked, (2) conceptual changes, and (3) a change, in some sense, in the world of the scientists’ research. This latter, “world-changing” aspect is the most fundamental aspect of incommensurability. However, it is a matter of great debate exactly how strongly we should take Kuhn’s meaning, for instance when he stated that “though the world does not change with a change of paradigm, the scientist afterwards works in a different world” (p. 121). To make sense of these claims it is necessary to distinguish between two different senses of the term ‘world’: the world as the independent object which scientists investigate and the world as the perceived world in which scientists practice their trade.

In Structure, Kuhn argued for incommensurability in perceptual terms. Drawing on results from psychological experiments showing that subjects’ perceptions of various objects were dependent on their training and experience, Kuhn suspected that something like a paradigm was prerequisite to perception itself and that, therefore, different normal science traditions would cause scientists to perceive differently. But when it comes to visual gestalt-switch images, one has recourse to the actual lines drawn on the paper. Contrary to this possibility of employing an ‘external standard’, Kuhn claimed that scientists can have no recourse above or beyond what they see with their eyes and instruments. For Kuhn, the change in perception cannot be reduced to a change in the interpretation of stable data, simply because stable data do not exist. Kuhn thus strongly attacked the idea of a neutral observation-language; an attack similarly launched by other scholars during the late 1950s and early 1960s, most notably Hanson (Hanson 1958).

These aspects of incommensurability have important consequences for the communication between proponents of competing normal science traditions and for the choice between such traditions. Recognizing different problems and adopting different standards and concepts, scientists may talk past each other when debating the relative merits of their respective paradigms. But if they do not agree on the list of problems that must be solved or on what constitutes an acceptable solution, there can be no point-by-point comparison of competing theories. Instead, Kuhn claimed that the role of paradigms in theory choice was necessarily circular in the sense that the proponents of each would use their own paradigm to argue in that paradigm’s defense. Paradigm choice is a conversion that cannot be forced by logic and neutral experience.

This view has led many critics of Kuhn to the misunderstanding that he saw paradigm choice as devoid of rational elements. However, Kuhn did emphasize that although paradigm choice cannot be justified by proof, this does not mean that arguments are not relevant or that scientists are not rationally persuaded to change their minds. In contrast, Kuhn argued that, “Individual scientists embrace a new paradigm for all sorts of reasons and usually for several at once.” (Kuhn 1996. p. 152)  According to Kuhn, such arguments are, first of all, about whether the new paradigm can solve the problems that have led the old paradigm to a crisis, whether it displays a quantitative precision strikingly better than its older competitor, and whether in the new paradigm or with the new theory there are predictions of phenomena that had been entirely unsuspected while the old one prevailed. Aesthetic arguments, based on simplicity for example, may enter as well.

Another common misunderstanding of Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability is that it should be taken to imply a total discontinuity between the normal science traditions separated by a scientific revolution. Kuhn emphasized, rather, that a new paradigm often incorporates much of the vocabulary and apparatus, both conceptual and manipulative, of its predecessor. Paradigm shifts may be “non-cumulative developmental episodes …,” but the former paradigm can be replaced “… in whole or in part …” (Ibid. p. 2). In this way, parts of the achievements of a normal science tradition will turn out to be permanent, even across a revolution. “[P]ostrevolutionary science invariably includes many of the same manipulations, performed with the same instruments and described in the same terms …” (Ibid. p 129-130). Incommensurability is a relation that holds only between minor parts of the object domains of two competing theories.

b. Lakatos and Progressing and Degenerating Research Programs

Lakatos agreed with Kuhn’s insistence on the tenacity of some scientific theories and the rejection of naïve falsification, but he was opposed to Kuhn’s account of the process of change, which he saw as “a matter for mob psychology” (Lakatos, 1970, p. 178). Lakatos therefore sought to improve upon Kuhn’s account by providing a more satisfactory methodology of scientific change, along with a meta-methodological justification of the rationality of that method, both of which were seen to be either lacking or significantly undeveloped in Kuhn’s early writings. On Lakatos’ account, a scientific research program consists of a central core that is taken to be inviolable by scientists working within the research program, and a collection of auxiliary hypotheses that are continuously developing as the core is applied. In this way, the methodological rules of a research program divide into two different kinds: a negative heuristic that tells the scientists which paths of research to avoid, and a positive heuristic that tells the scientists which paths to pursue. On this view, all tests are necessarily directed at the auxiliary hypotheses which come to form a protective belt around the hard core of the research program.

Lakatos aims to reconstruct changes in science as occurring within research programs. A research program is constituted by the series of theories resulting from adjustments to the protective belt but all of which share a hard core. As adjustments are made in response to problems, new problems arise, and over a series of theories there will be a collective problem-shift. Any series of theories is theoretically progressive, or constitutes a theoretically progressive problem-shift, if and only if there is at least one theory in the series which has some excess empirical content over its predecessor. In the case if this excess empirical content is also corroborated the series of theories is empirically progressive. A problem-shift is progressive, then, if it is both theoretically and empirically progressive, otherwise it is degenerate. A research program is successful if it leads to progressive problem-shifts and unsuccessful if it leads to degenerating problem-shifts. The further aim of Lakatos’ account, in other words, is to discover, through reconstruction in terms of research programs, where progress is made in scientific change.

The rationally reconstructive aspect of Lakatos’ account is the target of criticism. The notion of empirical content, for instance, is carrying a pretty heavy burden in the account. In order to assess the progressiveness of a program, one would seem to need a measure of the empirical content of theories in order to judge when there is excess content. Without some such measure, however, Lakatos’ methodology is dangerously close to being vacuous or ad hoc.

We can instead take the increase in empirical content to be a meta-methodological principle, one which dictates an aim for scientists (that is, to increase empirical knowledge), while cashing this out at the methodological level by identifying progress in research programs with making novel predictions. The importance of novel predictions, in other words, can be justified by their leading to an increase in the empirical content of the theories of a research program. A problem-shift which results in novel predictions can be taken to entail an increase in empirical content. It remains a worry, however, whether such an inference is warranted, since it seems to simply assume novelty and cumulativity go together unproblematically. That they might not was precisely Kuhn’s point.

A second objection is that Lakatos’ reconstruction of scientific change through appeal to a unified method runs counter to the prevailing attitude among philosophers of science from the second half of the twentieth century on, according to which there is no unified method for all of science. At best, anything they all have in common methodologically will be so general as to be unhelpful or uninteresting.

At any rate, Lakatos does offer us a positive heuristic for the description and even explanation of scientific change. For him, change in science is a difficult and delicate thing, requiring balance and persistence. “Purely negative, destructive criticism, like ‘refutation’ or demonstration of an inconsistency does not eliminate a program. Criticism of a program is a long and often frustrating process and one must treat budding programs leniently. One may, of course, whop up on [criticize] the degeneration of a research program, but it is only constructive criticism which, with the help of rival research programs, can achieve real successes; and dramatic spectacular results become visible only with hindsight and rational reconstruction” (Lakatos, 1970, p. 179).

c. Laudan and Research Traditions

In his Progress and Its Problems: Towards a Theory of Scientific Growth (1977), Laudan defined a research tradition as a set of general assumptions about the entities and processes in a given domain and about the appropriate methods to be used for investigating the problems and constructing the theories in that domain. Such research traditions should be seen as historical entities created and articulated within a particular intellectual environment, and as historical entities they would “wax and wane” (p. 95). On Laudan’s view, it is important to consider scientific change both as changes that may appear within a research tradition and as changes of the research tradition itself.

The key engine driving scientific change for Laudan is problem solving. Changes within a research tradition may be minor modifications of subordinate, specific theories, such as modifications of boundary conditions, revisions of constants, refinements of terminology, or expansion of a theory’s classificatory network to encompass new discoveries. Such changes solve empirical problems, essentially those problems Kuhn conceives of as anomalies. But, contrary to Kuhn’s normal science and to Lakatos’ research programs, Laudan held that changes within a research tradition might also involve changes to its most basic core elements. Severe anomalies which are not solvable merely by modification of specific theories within the tradition may be seen as symptoms of a deeper conceptual problem. In such cases scientists may instead explore what sorts of (minimal) adjustments could be made in the deep-level methodology or ontology of that research tradition (p. 98). When Laudan looked at the history of science, he saw Aristotelians who had abandoned the Aristotelian doctrine that motion in a void is impossible, and Newtonians who had abandoned the Newtonian demand that all matter has inertial mass, and he saw no reason to claim that they were no longer working within those research traditions.

Solutions to conceptual problems may even result in a theory with less empirical support and still count as progress since it is overall problem solving effectiveness (not all problems are empirical ones) which is the measure of success of a research tradition (Laudan 1996). Most importantly for Laudan, if there are what can be called revolutions in science, they reflect different kinds of problems, not a different sort of activity. David Pearce calls this Laudan’s methodological monism (see Pearce 1984). For Kuhn and Lakatos, identification of a research tradition (or program or paradigm) could be made at the level of specific invariant, non-rejectable elements. For Laudan, there is no such class of sacrosanct elements within a research tradition—everything is open to change over time. For example, while absolute time and space were seen as part of the unrejectable core of Newtonian physics in the eighteenth century, they were no longer seen as such a century later. This leaves a dilemma for Laudan’s view. If research traditions undergo deep-level transformations of their problem solving apparatus this would seem to constitute a significant change to the problem solving activity that may warrant considering the change the basis of a new research tradition. On the other hand, if the activity of problem solving is strong enough to provide the identity conditions of a tradition across changes, consistency might force us to identify all problem solving activity as part of one research tradition, blurring distinctions between science and non-science. Distinguishing between a change within a research tradition and the replacement of a research tradition with another seems both arbitrary and open-ended. One way of solving this problem is by turning from just internal characteristics of science to external factors of social and historical context.

4. The Social Processes of Change

Science is not just a body of facts or sets of sentences. However one characterizes its content, that content must be embodied in institutions and practices comprised of scientists themselves. An important question then, with respect to scientific change, regards how “science” is constructed out of scientists, and which unit of analysis – the individual scientist or the community—is the proper one for understanding the dynamic of scientific change? Popper’s falsificationism was very much a matter of personal responsibility and reflection. Kuhn, on the other hand, saw scientific change as a change of community and generations. While Structure may have been largely responsible for making North American philosophers aware of the importance of historical and social context in shaping scientific change, Kuhn was certainly not the first to theorize about it. Kuhn himself recognized his views in the earlier work of Ludwick Fleck (See for example Brorson and Andersen 2001, Babich 2007 and Mössner 2011 for comparisons between the views of Kuhn and Fleck).

a. Fleck

As early as the mid-1930s, Ludwik Fleck (1896-1961) gave an account of how thoughts and ideas change through their circulation within the social strata of a thought-collective (Denkkollektiv) and how this thought-traffic contributes to the process of verification. Drawing on a case study from medicine on the development of a diagnostic test for syphilis, Ludwik Fleck argued in his 1935 monograph Genesis and the Development of a Scientific Fact that a thought collective is a functional unit in which people who interact intellectually are tied together through a particular ‘thought style’ that forces narrow constraints upon the thinking of the individual. The thought-style is dogmatically transmitted from one generation to the next, by initiation, training, education or other devices whose aim is introduction into the collective. Most people participate in numerous thought-collectives, and any individual therefore possesses several overlapping thought-styles and may become carriers of influence between the various thought-collectives in which they participate. This traffic of thoughts outside the collective is linked to the most outstanding alterations in thought-content. The ensuing modification and assimilation according to the foreign thought-style is a significant source of divergent thinking. According to Fleck, any circulation of thoughts therefore also causes transformation of the circulated thought.

In Kuhn’s Structure, the distinction between the individual scientist and the community as the agent of change was not quite clear, and Kuhn later regretted having used the notion of a gestalt switch to characterize changes in a community because “communities do not have experiences, much less gestalt switches.” Consequently, he realized that “to speak, as I repeatedly have, of a community’s undergoing a gestalt switch is to compress an extended process of change into an instant, leaving no room for the microprocesses by which the change is achieved” (Kuhn 1989, p. 50). Rather than helping himself to an unexamined notion of communal change, Fleck, on the other hand, made the process by which individual interacted with collective central to his account of scientific development and the joint construction of scientific thought. What the accounts have in common is a view that the social plays a role in scientific change through the social shaping of science content. It is not a relation between scientist and physical world which is constitutive of scientific knowledge, but a relation between the scientists and the discipline to which they belong. That relation can be restrictive of change in science. It can also provide the dynamics for change.

b. Hull’s Evolutionary Account of Scientific Change

Several philosophers of science have held the view that the dynamics of scientific change can be seen as an evolutionary process in which some kind of selection plays a central role. One of the most detailed evolutionary accounts of scientific change has been provided by David Hull (1935-2010). On Hull’s account of scientific change, the development of science is a function of the interplay between cooperation and competition for credit among scientists. Hence, selection in the form of citations plays a central role in this account.

The basic structure of Hull’s account is that, for the content element of science—problems and their solutions, accumulated data, but also beliefs about the goals of science, proper ways to realize these goals, and so forth—to survive in science they must be transmitted more or less intact through history. That is, they must be seen as replicators that pass on their structure in successive replication. Hence, conceptual replication is a matter of information being transmitted largely intact by different vehicles. These vehicles of transmission may be media such as books or journals, but also scientists themselves. Whereas books and journals are passive vehicles, scientists are active in testing and changing the transmitted ideas. They are therefore not only vehicles of transmission but also interactors, interacting with their environment in a way that causes replication to be differential and hence enabling of scientific change.

Hull did not elaborate much on the inner structure of differential replication, apart from arguing that the underdetermination of theory by observation made it possible. Instead, the focus of his account is on the selection mechanism that can cause some lineages of scientific ideas to cease and others to continue. First, scientists tend to behave in ways that increase their conceptual fitness. Scientists want their work to be accepted, which requires that they gain support from other scientists. One kind of support is to show that their work rests on preceding research. But that is at the same time a decrease in originality. There is a trade-off between credit and support. Scientists whose support is worth having are likely to be cited more frequently.

Second, this social process is highly structured. Scientists tend to organize into tightly knit research groups in order to develop and disseminate a particular set of views. Few scientists have all the skills and knowledge necessary to solve the problems that they confront; they therefore tend to form research groups of varying degrees of cohesiveness. Cooperating scientists may often share ideas that are identical in descent, and transmission of their contributions can be viewed as similar to kin selection. In the wider scientific community, scientists may form a deme in the sense that they use the ideas of each other much more frequently than the ideas of scientists outside the community.

Initially, criticism and evaluation come from within a research group. Scientists expose their work to severe tests prior to publication, but some things are taken so much for granted that it never occurs to them to question it. After publication, it shifts to scientists outside the group, especially opponents who are likely to have different—though equally unnoticed—presuppositions. The self-correction of science depends on other scientists having different perspectives and different career interests—scientists’ career interests are not damaged by refuting the views of their opponents.

5. Cognitive Views on Scientific Change

Scientific change received new interest during the 1980s and 1990s with the emergence of cognitive science; a field that draws on cognitive psychology, cognitive anthropology, linguistics, philosophy, artificial intelligence and neuroscience. Historians and philosophers of science adapted results from this interdisciplinary work to develop new approaches to their field. Among the approaches are Paul Churchland’s (*1942) neurocomputational perspective (Churchland, 1989; Churchland, 1992), Ronald Giere’s (*1938) work on cognitive models of science (Giere, 1988), Nancy Nersessian’s (*1947) cognitive history of science (Nersessian, 1984; Nersessian, 1992; Nersessian, 1995a; 1995b), and Paul Thagard’s (*1950) computational philosophy of science (Thagard, 1988; Thagard, 1992). Rather than explaining scientific change in terms of a priori principles, these new approaches aim at being naturalized by drawing on cognitive science to provide insights on how humans generally construct and develop conceptual systems and how they use these insights in analyses of scientific change as conceptual change. (For an overview of research in conceptual change, see (Vosniadou, 2008).)

a. Cognitive History of Science

Much of the early work on conceptual change emphasized the discontinuous character of major changes by using metaphors like ‘gestalt switch’, indicating that such major changes happen all at once. This idea had originally been introduced by Kuhn, but in his later writings he admitted that his use of the gestalt switch metaphor had its origin in his experience as a historian working backwards in time and that, consequently, it was not necessarily suitable for describing the experience of the scientists taking part in scientific development. Instead of dramatic gestalt shifts, it is equally plausible that for the historical actors there exist micro-processes in their conceptual development. The development of science may happen stepwise with minor changes and yet still sum up over time to something that appears revolutionary to the historian looking backward and comparing the original conceptual structures to the end product of subsequent changes. Kuhn realized this, but also saw that his own work did not offer any details on how such micro-processes would work, though it did leave room for their exploration (Kuhn 1989).

Exploration of conceptual microstructures has been one of the main issues within the cognitive history and philosophy of science. Historical case studies of conceptual change have been carried out by many scholars, including Nersessian, Thagard, the Andersen-Barker-Chen groupThat (see for example Nersessian, 1984; Thagard, 1992; Andersen, Barker, and Chen, 2006).

Some of the early work in cognitive history and philosophy of science focused on mapping conceptual structures at different stages during scientific change (see for example Thagard, 1990; Thagard and Nowak, 1990; Nersessian and Resnick, 1989) and developing typologies of conceptual change in terms of their degree of severeness (Thagard, 1992). These approaches are useful for comparing between different stages of scientific change and for discussing such issues as incommensurability. However, they do not provide much detail on the creative process through which changes are created.

Other lines of research have focused on the reasoning processes that are used in creating new concepts during scientific change. One of the early contributions to this line of work was Shapere who argued that, as concepts evolve, chains of reasoning connect the successive versions of a concept. These chains of reasoning therefore also establish continuity in scientific change, and this continuity can only be fully understood by analysis of the reasons that motivated each step in the chain of changes (Shapere 1987a;1987b). Over the last two decades, this approach has been extended and substantiated by Nersessian (2008a; 2008b) whose work has focused on the nature of the practices employed by scientists in creating, communicating and replacing scientific representations within a given scientific domain. She argues that conceptual change is a problem-solving process. Model-based reasoning processes, especially, are used to facilitate and constrain abstraction and information from multiple sources during this process.

b. Scientific Change and Science Education

Aiming at insights into general mechanisms of conceptual development, some of the cognitive approaches have been directed toward investigating not only the development of science, but also how sciences are learned. During the 1980s and early 1990s, several scholars argued that conceptual divides of the same kind as described by Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis might exist in science education between teacher and student. Science teaching should, therefore, address these misconceptions in an attempt to facilitate conceptual change in students. Part of this research incorporated the (controversial) thesis that the development of ideas in students mirrors the development of ideas in the history of science—that cognitive ontogeny recapitulates scientific phylogeny. For the field of mechanics in particular, research was done to show that children’s’ naïve beliefs parallel early scientific beliefs, like impetus theories, for example. (Champagne, Klopfer, and Anderson, 1980; Clement, 1983; McClosky, 1983). However, most research went beyond the search for analogies between students’ naïve views and historically held beliefs. Instead, they carried out material investigations of the cognitive processes employed by scientists in constructing scientific concepts and theories more generally, through the available historical records, focussing on the kinds of reasoning strategies communicated in those records (see Nersessian, 1992; Nersessian, 1995a). Thus, this work still assumed that the cognitive activities of scientists in their construction of new scientific concepts was relevant to learning, but it marked a return to a view of the relevance of the history of science as a repository of case studies demonstrating how scientific concepts are constructed and changed. In assuming a conceptual continuity between scientific understanding “then and now,” the cognitive approach had moved away from the Kuhnian emphasis on incommensurability and gestalt shift conceptual change.

6. Further Reading and References

It is impossible to disentangle entirely the history and philosophy of scientific change from a great number of other issues and disciplines. We have not addressed here the epistemology of science, the role of experiments in science (or of thought experiments), for instance. The question of whether science, or knowledge in general, is approaching truth, or tracking truth, or approximating to truth, are debates taken up in epistemology. For more on those issues one should consult the relevant references. Whether science progresses (and not just changes) is a question which supports its own literature as well. Many iterations of interpretations, criticism and replies to challenges of incommensurability, non-cumulativity, and irrationality of science have been given. Beliefs in scientific progress founded on a naïve realism, according to which science is getting ever closer to a literally true picture of the world, have been criticized soundly. A simple version of the criticism is the pessimistic meta-induction: every scientific image of reality in the past has been proven wrong, therefore all future scientific images will be wrong (see Putnam 1978; Laudan 1984). In response to challenges to realism, much attention has been paid to structural realism, an attempt to describe some underlying mathematical structure which is preserved even across major theory changes. Past theories were not entirely wrong, on this view, and not entirely discarded, because they had some of the structure correct, albeit wrongly interpreted or embedded in a mistaken ontology or broader world view which has been since abandoned.
On the question of unity of science, on whether the methods of science are universal or plural, and whether they are rational, see the references given for Cartwright (2007), Feyerabend (1974), Mitchell (2000;2003); Kellert, et al (2006). For feminist criticisms and alternatives to traditional philosophy and history of science the interested reader should consult Longino (1990;2002); Gary, et al (1996); Keller, et al (1996); Ruetsche (2004). Clough (2004) puts forward a program combining feminism and naturalism. Among twenty-first century approaches to the historicity of science there are Friedman’s dynamic a priori approach (Friedman 2001), the evolving subject-object relation of McGuire and Tuchanska (2000), and complementary science of Hasok Chang (2004).

Finally, on the topic of the Scientific Revolution, there are the standard Cohen (1985), Hall (1954) and Koyré (1965); but for subsequent discussion of the appropriateness of revolution as a metaphor in the historiography of science we recommend the collection Rethinking the Scientific Revolution, edited by Osler (2000).

a. Primary Sources

  • Crombie, A. C. (1963). Scientific Change: Historical studies in the intellectual, social and technical conditions for scientific discovery and technical invention, from antiquity to the present. London: Heinemann.
  • Feyerabend, P. (1974) Against Method. London: New Left Books.
  • Feyerabend, P. (1987) Farewell to Reason. London: Verso.
  • Fleck, L. (1979) The Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, (edited by T.J. Trenn and R.K. Merton, foreword by Thomas Kuhn) Chicago: University of Chicago Press
  • Hull, D.L. (1988). Science as a Process: Evolutionary Account of the Social and Conceptual Development of Science. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Kuhn, T. S. (1970). The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Kuhn, T. S. (1989). Speaker´s Reply. In S. Allén (Ed.), Possible Worlds in Humanities, arts, and Sciences. Berlin: de Gruyter. 49-51.
  • Lakatos, I. (1970). Falsification and the Methodology of Scientific Research Programs. In I. Lakatos and A. Musgrave, eds., Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 91-196.
  • Laudan, L. (1977). Progress and Its Problems. Towards a Theory of Scientific Growth. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Laudan, L. (1996). Beyond Positivism and Relativism: Theory, Method, and Evidence. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Toulmin, S. (1972). Human Understanding: The Collective Use and Evolution of Concepts. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Andersen, H. (2001). On Kuhn, Belmont CA: Wadsworth
  • Babich, B. E. (2003). From Fleck’s Denkstil to Kuhn’s paradigm: conceptual schemes and incommensurability, International Studies in the Philosophy of Science 17: 75-92
  • Bird, A. (2000). Thomas Kuhn, Chesham: Acumen
  • Brorson, S. and H. Andersen (2001). Stabilizing and changing phenomenal worlds: Ludwik Fleck and Thomas Kuhn on scientific literature, Journal for General Philosophy of Science 32: 109-129
  • Cartwright, Nancy (2007). Hunting Causes and Using Them. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chang, H. (2004). Inventing Temperature: Measurement and Scientific Progress. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Clough, S. Having It All: Naturalized Normativity in Feminist Science Studies. Hypatia, vol. 19 no. 1 (Winter 2004). 102-18.
  • Feyerabend, P. K. (1981). Explanation, reduction and empiricism. In Realism, Rationalism and Scientific Method: Philosophical Papers. Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 44-96.
  • Friedman, M. (2001). Dynamics of Reason. Stanford: CSLI Publications.
  • Gutting G. (1989). Michel Foucault’s archaeology of scientific reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Gutting G. (2005). Continental philosophy of science. Oxford: Blackwell
  • Hall, A.R. (1954). The Scientific Revolution 1500-1800. Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Hoyningen-Huene, P. (1993). Reconstructing Scientific Revolutions, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Losee, J. (2004). Theories of Scientific Progress. London: Routledge.
  • McGuire, J. E. and Tuchanska, B. (2000). Science Unfettered. Athens: Ohio University Press.
  • Mössner, N. (2011). Thought styles and paradigms – a comparative study of Ludwik Fleck and Thomas S. Kuhn, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 42: 362-371.

i. Concepts, Cognition and Change

  • Andersen, H., Barker, P., and Chen, X. (2006). The Cognitive Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Champagne, A. B., Klopfer, L. E., and Anderson, J. (1980). Factors Influencing Learning of Classical Mechanics. American Journal of Physics, 48, 1074-1079.
  • Churchland, P. M. (1989). A Neurocomputational Perspective. The Nature of Mind and the Structure of Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Churchland, P. M. (1992). A deeper unity: Some Feyerabendian themes in neurocomputational form. In R. N. Giere, ed., Cognitive models of science. Minnesota studies in the philosophy of science. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. 341-363.
  • Clement, J. (1983). A Conceptual Model Discussed by Galileo and Used Intuitively by Physics Students. In D. Gentner and A. L. Stevens, eds. Mental Models. Hillsdale: Lawrence Earlbaum Associates. 325-340.
  • Giere, R. N. (1988). Explaining Science: A Cognitive Approach. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hanson, N.R.(1958). Patterns of Discovery: An Inquiry into the Conceptual Foundations of Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McClosky, M. (1983). Naive Theories of Motion. In D. Gentner and A. L. Stevens (Eds.), Mental Models. Hillsdale: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates. 75-98.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (1984). Faraday to Einstein: Constructing Meaning in Scientific Theories. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (1992). Constructing and Instructing: The Role of “Abstraction Techniques” in Creating and Learning Physics. In R.A. Duschl and R. J. Hamilton, eds. Philosophy of Science, Cognition, Psychology and Educational Theory and Practice. Albany: SUNY Press. 48-53.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (1992). How Do Scientists Think? Capturing the Dynamics of Conceptual Change in Science. In R. N. Giere, ed. Cognitive Models of Science. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. 3-44.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (1995a). Should Physicists Preach What They Practice? Constructive Modeling in Doing and Learning Physics. Science and Education, 4. 203-226.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (1995b). Opening the Black Box: Cognitive Science and History of Science. Osiris, 10. 194-211.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (2008a). Creating Scientific Concepts. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • Nersessian, N. J. (2008b). Mental Modelling in Conceptual Change. In S.Vosniadou, ed. International Handbook of Research on Conceptual Change. New York: Routledge. 391-416.
  • Nersessian, N., ed. (1987). The Process of Science. Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publisher.
  • Nersessian, N. J. and Resnick, L. B. (1989). Comparing Historical and Intuitive Explanations of Motion: Does “Naive Physics” Have a Structure. Proceedings of the Cognitive Science Society, 11. 412-420.
  • Shapere, D. (1987a). “Method in the Philosophy of Science and Epistemology: How to Inquire about Inquiry and Knowledge.” In Nersessian, N., ed. The Process of Science. Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publisher.
  • Shapere, D. (1987b.) “External and Internal Factors in the Development of Science.” Science and Technology Studies, 1. 1–9.
  • Thagard, P. (1990). The Conceptual Structure of the Chemical Revolution. Philosophy of Science 57, 183-209.
  • Thagard, P. (1992). Conceptual Revolutions. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Thagard, P. and Nowak, G. (1990). The Conceptual Structure of the Geological Revolution. In J. Shrager and P. Langley, eds. Computational Models of Scientific Discovery and Theory Formation. San Mateo: Morgan Kaufmann. 27-72.
  • Thagard, P. (1988). Computational Philosophy of Science. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Thagard, P. (1992). Conceptual Revolutions. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Vosniadou, S. (2008). International Handbook of Research in Conceptual Change. London: Routledge.

ii. Feminist, Situated and Social Approaches

  • Garry, Ann and Marilyn Pearsall, eds. (1996). Women, Knowledge and Reality: Explorations in Feminist Epistemology. New York: Routledge.
  • Goldman, Alvin. (1999). Knowledge in a Social World. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hacking, Ian. (1999). The Social Construction of What? Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox and Helen Longino, eds. (1996). Feminism and Science. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Keller, Stephen H., and Helen E. Longino, and C. Kenneth Waters, eds (2006). Scientific Pluralism. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 19, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Longino, H. E. (2002). The Fate of Knowledge. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Longino, H. E. (1990). Science as Social Knowledge: Values and Objectivity in Scientific Inquiry. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • McMullin, Ernan, ed. (1992). Social Dimensions of Scientific Knowledge. South Bend: Notre Dame University Press.
  • Ruetsche, Laura, 2004, “Virtue and Contingent History: Possibilities for Feminist Epistemology”, Hypatia, 19.1: 73–101
  • Solomon, Miriam. (2001). Social Empiricism. Cambridge: Massachusetts Institute of Technology Press.

iii. The Scientific Revolution

  • Cohen, I. B., (1985). Revolution in Science, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Koyré, A. (1965). Newtonian Studies. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Osler, Margaret (2000). Rethinking the Scientific Revolution. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.


Author Information

Hanne Andersen
University of Aarhus


Brian Hepburn
University of Aarhus