Sen’s Capability Approach

Amartya Sen
Amartya Sen

The Capability Approach is defined by its choice of focus upon the moral significance of individuals’ capability of achieving the kind of lives they have reason to value. This distinguishes it from more established approaches to ethical evaluation, such as utilitarianism or resourcism, which focus exclusively on subjective well-being or the availability of means to the good life, respectively. A person’s capability to live a good life is defined in terms of the set of valuable ‘beings and doings’ like being in good health or having loving relationships with others to which they have real access.

The Capability Approach was first articulated by the Indian economist and philosopher Amartya Sen in the 1980s, and remains most closely associated with him. It has been employed extensively in the context of human development, for example, by the United Nations Development Programme, as a broader, deeper alternative to narrowly economic metrics such as growth in GDP per capita. Here ‘poverty’ is understood as deprivation in the capability to live a good life, and ‘development’ is understood as capability expansion.

Within academic philosophy the novel focus of Capability Approach has attracted a number of scholars. It is seen to be relevant for the moral evaluation of social arrangements beyond the development context, for example, for considering gender justice. It is also seen as providing foundations for normative theorising, such as a capability theory of justice that would include an explicit ‘metric’ (that specifies which capabilities are valuable) and ‘rule’ (that specifies how the capabilities are to be distributed). The philosopher Martha Nussbaum has provided the most influential version of such a capability theory of justice, deriving from the requirements of human dignity a list of central capabilities to be incorporated into national constitutions and guaranteed to all up to a certain threshold.

This article focuses on the philosophical aspects of the Capability Approach and its foundations in the work of Amartya Sen. It discusses the development and structure of Sen’s account, how it relates to other ethical approaches, and its main contributions and criticisms. It also outlines various capability theories developed within the Capability Approach, with particular attention to that of Martha Nussbaum.

Table of Contents

  1. The Development of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Sen’s Background
    2. Sen’s Concerns
  2. Sen’s Critiques of Utilitarianism and Resourcism
    1. Utilitarianism
      1. Act-Consequentialism
      2. Welfarism
      3. Sum Ranking
    2. Resourcism
  3. Core Concepts and Structure of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Functionings and Capability
    2. Valuation: Which Functionings Matter for the Good Life?
    3. Evaluation: What Capability do People Have to Live a Good Life?
  4. Applying Sen’s Capability Approach
  5. Criticisms of Sen’s Capability Approach
    1. Illiberalism
    2. Under-Theorisation
    3. Individualism
    4. Information Gaps
  6. Theorising the Capability Approach
    1. Generating Lists for Empirical Research in the Social Sciences (Ingrid Robeyns)
    2. A Participatory Approach to Evaluating Capability Expansion (Sabina Alkire)
    3. Justice as Equal Capability of Democratic Citizenship (Elizabeth Anderson)
    4. Capability as Freedom from Domination (John Alexander)
  7. Martha Nussbaum’s Capability Theory of Justice
    1. Structure and Development of Nussbaum’s Capability Theory
    2. Criticisms of Nussbaum’s Theory
    3. Sen and Nussbaum
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Development of Sen’s Capability Approach

a. Sen’s Background

Amartya Sen had an extensive background in development economics, social choice theory (for which he received the 1998 Nobel Prize in Economics), and philosophy before developing the Capability Approach during the 1980s. This background can be pertinent to understanding and assessing Sen’s Capability Approach because of the complementarity between Sen’s contributions to these different fields. Sen’s most influential and comprehensive account of his Capability Approach, Development as Freedom (Sen 1999), helpfully synthesizes in an accessible way many of these particular, and often quite technical, contributions.

Sen first introduced the concept of capability in his Tanner Lectures on Equality of What? (Sen 1979) and went on to elaborate it in subsequent publications during the 1980s and 1990s. Sen notes that his approach has strong conceptual connections with Aristotle’s understanding of human flourishing (this was the initial foundation for Nussbaum’s alternative Capability Theory); with Adam Smith, and with Karl Marx. Marx discussed the importance of functionings and capability for human well-being. For example, Sen often cites Smith’s analysis of relative poverty in The Wealth of Nation in terms of how a country’s wealth and different cultural norms affected which material goods were understood to be a ‘necessity’. Sen also cites Marx’s foundational concern with “replacing the domination of circumstances and chance over individuals by the domination of individuals over chance and circumstances”.

b. Sen’s Concerns

The Capability Approach attempts to address various concerns that Sen had about contemporary approaches to the evaluation of well-being, namely:

(1) Individuals can differ greatly in their abilities to convert the same resources into valuable functionings (‘beings’ and ‘doings’). For example, those with physical disabilities may need specific goods to achieve mobility, and pregnant women have specific nutritional requirements to achieve good health. Therefore, evaluation that focuses only on means, without considering what particular people can do with them, is insufficient.

(2) People can internalize the harshness of their circumstances so that they do not desire what they can never expect to achieve. This is the phenomenon of ‘adaptive preferences’ in which people who are objectively very sick may, for example, still declare, and believe, that their health is fine. Therefore, evaluation that focuses only on subjective mental metrics is insufficient without considering whether that matches with what a neutral observer would perceive as their objective circumstances,.

(3) Whether or not people take up the options they have, the fact that they do have valuable options is significant. For example, even if the nutritional state of people who are fasting and starving is the same, the fact that fasting is a choice not to eat should be recognized. Therefore evaluation must be sensitive to both actual achievements (‘functionings’) and effective freedom (‘capability’).

(4) Reality is complicated and evaluation should reflect that complexity rather than take a short-cut by excluding all sorts of information from consideration in advance. For example, although it may seem obvious that happiness matters for the evaluation of how well people are doing, it is not all obvious that it should be the only aspect that ever matters and so nothing else should be considered. Therefore, evaluation of how well people are doing must seek to be as open-minded as possible. (Note: This leads to the deliberate ‘under-theorization’ of the Capability Approach that has been the source of some criticism, and it motivated the development of Nussbaum’s alternative Capability Theory.)

2. Sen’s Critiques of Utilitarianism and Resourcism

An important part of Sen’s argument for the Capability Approach relates to his critique of alternative philosophical and economics accounts. In particular, he argues that, whatever their particular strengths, none of them provide an analysis of well-being that is suitable as a general concept; they are all focused on the wrong particular things (whether utility, liberty, commodities, or primary goods), and they are too narrowly focused (they exclude too many important aspects from evaluation). Sen’s criticisms of economic utilitarianism and John Rawls’ primary goods are particularly important in the evolution of his account and its reception.

a. Utilitarianism

Economics has a branch explicitly concerned with ethical analysis (‘Welfare Economics’). Sen’s systematic criticism of the form of utilitarianism behind welfare economics identifies and rejects each of its three pillars: act consequentialism, welfarism, and sum-ranking.

i. Act-Consequentialism

According to act consequentialism, actions should be assessed only in terms of the goodness or badness of their consequences. This excludes any consideration of the morality of the process by which consequences are brought about, for example, whether it respects principles of fairness or individual agency. Sen argues instead for a ‘comprehensive consequentialism’ which integrates the moral significance of both consequences and principles. For example, it matters not only whether people have an equal capability to live a long life, but how that equality is achieved. Under the same circumstances women generally live longer than men, for largely biological reasons. If the only thing that mattered was achieving equality in the capability to live a long life this fact suggests that health care provision should be biased in favor of men. However, as Sen argues, trying to achieve equality in this way would override important moral claims of fairness which should be included in a comprehensive evaluation.

ii. Welfarism

Welfarism is the view that goodness should be assessed only in terms of subjective utility. Sen argues that welfarism exhibits both ‘valuational neglect’ and ‘physical condition neglect’. First, although welfarism is centrally concerned with how people feel about their lives, it is only concerned with psychological states, not with people’s reflective valuations. Second, because it is concerned only with feelings it neglects information about physical health, though this would seem obviously relevant to assessing well-being. Not only does subjective welfare not reliably track people’s actual interests or even their urgent needs, it is also vulnerable to what Sen calls ‘adaptive preferences’. People can become so normalized to their conditions of material deprivation and social injustice that they may claim to be entirely satisfied. As Sen puts it,

Our mental reactions to what we actually get and what we can sensibly expect to get may frequently involve compromises with a harsh reality. The destitute thrown into beggary, the vulnerable landless labourer precariously surviving at the edge of subsistence, the overworked domestic servant working round the clock, the subdued and subjugated housewife reconciled to her role and her fate, all tend to come to terms with their respective predicaments. The deprivations are suppressed and muffled in the scale of utilities (reflected by desire-fulfilment and happiness) by the necessity of endurance in uneventful survival. (Sen 1985, 21-22)

iii. Sum Ranking

Sum-ranking focuses on maximizing the total amount of welfare in a society without regard for how it is distributed, although this is generally felt to be important by the individuals concerned. Sen argues, together with liberal philosophers such as Bernard Williams and John Rawls, that sum-ranking does not take seriously the distinction between persons. Sen also points out that individuals differ in their ability to convert resources such as income into welfare. For example, a disabled person may need expensive medical and transport equipment to achieve the same level of welfare. A society that tried to maximize the total amount of welfare would distribute resources so that the marginal increase in welfare from giving an extra dollar to any person would be the same. Resources would therefore be distributed away from the sick and disabled to people who are more efficient convertors of resources into utility.

b. Resourcism

Resourcism is defined by its neutrality about what constitutes the good life. It therefore assesses how well people are doing in terms of their possession of the general purpose resources necessary for the construction of any particular good life. Sen’s criticism of John Rawls’ influential account of the fair distribution of primary goods stands in for a criticism of resourcist approaches in general. Sen’s central argument is that resources should not be the exclusive focus of concern for a fairness-based theory of justice, even if, like Rawls’s primary goods, they are deliberately chosen for their general usefulness to a good life. The reason is that this focus excludes consideration of the variability in individuals’ actual abilities to convert resources into valuable outcomes. In other words, two people with the same vision of the good life and the same bundle of resources may not be equally able to achieve that life, and so resourcists’ neutrality about the use of resources is not as fair as they believe it is. More specifically, Sen disputes Rawls’ argument that the principles of justice should be worked out first for the ‘normal’ case, in terms of a social contract conceived as a rational scheme for mutually advantageous cooperation between people equally able to contribute to society, and only later extended to ‘hard’ cases, such as of disability. Sen believes such cases are far from abnormal and excluding them at the beginning risks building a structure that excludes them permanently. The general problem is that such accounts ‘fetishize’ resources as the embodiment of advantage, rather than focusing on the relationship between resources and people. Nevertheless Sen acknowledges that although the distribution of resources should not be the direct concern in evaluating how well people are doing, it is very relevant to considerations of procedural fairness.

3. Core Concepts and Structure of Sen’s Capability Approach

This section provides a technical overview of Sen’s account.

a. Functionings and Capability

When evaluating well-being, Sen argues, the most important thing is to consider what people are actually able to be and do. The commodities or wealth people have or their mental reactions (utility) are an inappropriate focus because they provide only limited or indirect information about how well a life is going. Sen illustrates his point with the example of a standard bicycle. This has the characteristics of ‘transportation’ but whether it will actually provide transportation will depend on the characteristics of those who try to use it. It might be considered a generally useful tool for most people to extend their mobility, but it obviously will not do that for a person without legs. Even if that person, by some quirk, finds the bicycle delightful, we should nevertheless be able to note within our evaluative system that she still lacks transportation. Nor does this mental reaction show that the same person would not appreciate transportation if it were really available to her.

The Capability Approach focuses directly on the quality of life that individuals are actually able to achieve. This quality of life is analyzed in terms of the core concepts of ‘functionings’ and ‘capability’.

  • Functionings are states of ‘being and doing’  such as being well-nourished, having shelter. They should be distinguished from the commodities employed to achieve them (as ‘bicycling’ is distinguishable from ‘possessing a bike’).
  • Capability refers to the set of valuable functionings that a person has effective access to. Thus, a person’s capability represents the effective freedom of an individual to choose between different functioning combinations – between different kinds of life – that she has reason to value. (In later work, Sen refers to ‘capabilities’ in the plural (or even ‘freedoms’) instead of a single capability set, and this is also common in the wider capability literature. This allows analysis to focus on sets of functionings related to particular aspects of life, for example, the capabilities of literacy, health, or political freedom.)










Figure 1. Outline of the core relationships in the Capability Approach

Figure 1 outlines the core relationships of the Capability Approach and how they relate to the main alternative approaches focused on resources and utility. Resources (such as a bicycle) are considered as an input, but their value depends upon individuals’ ability to convert them into valuable functionings (such as bicycling), which depends, for example, on their personal physiology (such as health), social norms, and physical environment (such as road quality). An individual’s capability set is the set of valuable functionings that an individual has real access to. Achieved functionings are those they actually select. For example, an individual’s capability set may include access to different functionings relating to mobility, such as walking, bicycling, taking a public bus, and so on. The functioning they actually select to get to work may be the public bus. Utility is considered both an output and a functioning. Utility is an output because what people choose to do and to be naturally has an effect on their sense of subjective well-being (for example, the pleasure of bicycling to work on a sunny day). However the Capability Approach also considers subjective well-being – feeling happy – as a valuable functioning in its own right and incorporates it into the capability framework.

b. Valuation: Which Functionings Matter for the Good Life?

Sen argues that the correct focus for evaluating how well off people are is their capability to live a life we have reason to value, not their resource wealth or subjective well-being. But in order to begin to evaluate how people are performing in terms of capability, we first need to determine which functionings matter for the good life and how much, or at least we need to specify a valuation procedure for determining this.

One way of addressing the problem is to specify a list of the constituents of the flourishing life, and do this on philosophical grounds (Martha Nussbaum does this for her Capability Theory of Justice). Sen rejects this approach because he argues that it denies the relevance of the values people may come to have and the role of democracy (Sen 2004b). Philosophers and social scientists may provide helpful ideas and arguments, but the legitimate source of decisions about the nature of the life we have reason to value must be the people concerned. Sen therefore proposes a social choice exercise requiring both public reasoning and democratic procedures of decision-making.

One reason that social scientists and philosophers are so keen to specify a list is that it can be used as an index: by ranking all the different constituents of the flourishing life with respect to each other it would allow easier evaluation of how well people are doing. Sen’s social choice exercise is unlikely to produce collective agreement on a complete ranking of different functionings, if only because of what Rawls called the ‘fact of reasonable disagreement’. But Sen argues that substantial action-guiding agreement is possible. First, different valuational perspectives may ‘intersect’ to reach similar judgments about some issues, though by way of different arguments. Second, such agreements may be extended by introducing ‘ranges’ of weights rather than cardinal numbers. For example, if there are four conflicting views about the relative weight to be attached to literacy vis-à-vis health, of ½, ⅓, ¼ and 1/5, that contains an implicit agreement that the relative weight on education should not exceed ½, nor fall below 1/5, so having one unit of literacy and two of health would be better than having two units of literacy and one of health.

Sen does suggest that in many cases a sub-set of crucially important capabilities associated with basic needs may be relatively easily identified and agreed upon as urgent moral and political priorities. These ‘basic capabilities’, such as education, health, nutrition, and shelter up to minimally adequate levels, do not exhaust the resources of the capability approach, only the easy agreement on what counts as being scandalously deprived. They may be particularly helpful in assessing the extent and nature of poverty in developing countries. However, taking a basic capability route has implications for how the exercise of evaluating individuals’ capability can proceed, since it can only evaluate how well people’s lives are going in terms of the basics.

c. Evaluation: What Capability do People Have to Live a Good Life?

Evaluating capability is a second order exercise concerned with mapping the set of valuable functionings people have real access to. Since it takes the value of functionings as given, its conclusions will reflect any ambiguity in the valuation stage.

Assessing capability is more informationally demanding than other accounts of advantage since it not only takes a much broader view of what well-being achievement consists in but also tries to assess the freedom people actually have to choose high quality options. This is not a purely procedural matter of adding up the number of options available, since the option to purchase a tenth brand of washing powder has a rather different significance than the option to vote in democratic elections. For example, Sen argues that the eradication of malaria from an area enhances the capability of individuals living there even though it doesn’t increase the number of options those individuals have (since they don’t have the ‘option’ to live in a malarial area anymore). Because the value of a capability set represents a person’s effective freedom to live a valuable life in terms of the value of the functionings available to that individual, when the available functionings are improved, so is the person’s effective freedom.

The capability approach in principle allows a very wide range of dimensions of advantage to be positively evaluated (‘what capabilities does this person have?’). This allows an open diagnostic approach to what is going well or badly in people’s lives that can be used to reveal unexpected shortfalls or successes in different dimensions, without aggregating them all together into one number. The informational focus can be tightened depending on the purpose of the evaluation exercise and relevant valuational and informational constraints. For example, if the approach is limited to considering ‘basic capabilities’ then the assessment is limited to a narrower range of dimensions and attempts to assess deprivation – the shortfall from the minimal thresholds of those capabilities – which will exclude evaluation of how well the lives of those above the threshold are going.

As well as being concerned with how well people’s lives are going, the Capability Approach can be used to examine the underlying determinants of the relationship between people and commodities, including the following (Sen 1999, 70-71):

(1)      Individual physiology, such as the variations associated with illnesses, disability, age, and gender. In order to achieve the same functionings, people may have particular needs for non-standard commodities – such as prosthetics for a disability – or they may need more of the standard commodities – such as additional food in the case of intestinal parasites. Note that some of these disadvantages, such as blindness, may not be fully ‘correctable’ even with tailored assistance.

(2)      Local environment diversities, such as climate, epidemiology, and pollution. These can impose particular costs such as more or less expensive heating or clothing requirements.

(3)      Variations in social conditions, such as the provision of public services such as education and security, and the nature of community relationships, such as across class or ethnic divisions.

(4)      Differences in relational perspectives. Conventions and customs determine the commodity requirements of expected standards of behaviour and consumption, so that relative income poverty in a rich community may translate into absolute poverty in the space of capability. For example, local requirements of ‘the ability to appear in public without shame’ in terms of acceptable clothing may vary widely.

(5)      Distribution within the family – distributional rules within a family determining, for example, the allocation of food and health-care between children and adults, males and females.


The diagnosis of capability failures, or significant interpersonal variations in capability, directs attention to the relevant causal pathways responsible. Note that many of these interpersonal variations will also influence individuals’ abilities to access resources to begin with. For example, the physically handicapped often have more expensive requirements to achieve the same capabilities, such as mobility, while at the same time they also have greater difficulty earning income in the first place.

4. Applying Sen’s Capability Approach

The concept of a capability has a global-local character in that its definition abstracts from particular circumstances, but its realization depends on specific local requirements. For example, the same capability to be well-nourished can be compared for different people although it may require different amounts and kinds of food depending on one’s age, state of health, and so on. This makes the Capability Approach applicable across political, economic, and cultural borders. For example, Sen points out that being relatively income poor in a wealthy society can entail absolute poverty in some important capabilities, because they may require more resources to achieve. For example, the capability for employment may require more years of education in a richer society

Many capabilities will have underlying requirements that vary strongly with social circumstances (although others, such as adequate nourishment, may vary less). For example, the ‘ability to appear in public without shame’ seems a capability that people might generally be said to have reason to value, but its requirements vary significantly according to cultural norms from society to society and for different groups within each society (such as by gender, class, and ethnicity). Presently in Saudi Arabia, for example, women must have the company of a close male relative to appear in public, and require a chauffeur and private car to move between private spaces (since they are not permitted to use public transport or drive a car themselves). Strictly speaking the Capability Approach leaves open whether such ‘expensive’ capabilities, if considered important enough to be guaranteed by society as a matter of justice, should be met by making more resources available to those who need them (subsidized cars and chauffeurs), or by revising the relevant social norms. The Capability Approach only identifies such capability failures and diagnoses their causes. However, if there is general agreement in the first place that such capabilities should be equally guaranteed for all, there is a clear basis for criticizing clearly unjust social norms as the source of relative deprivation and thus as inconsistent with the spirit of such a guarantee.

The capability approach takes a multi-dimensional approach to evaluation. Often it may seem that people are generally well-off, yet a closer analysis reveals that this ‘all-things-considered’ judgement conceals surprising shortfalls in particular capabilities, for example, the sporting icon who can’t read. Capability analysis rejects the presumption that unusual achievement in some dimensions compensates for shortfalls in others. From a justice perspective, the capability approach’s relevance here is to argue that if people are falling short on a particular capability that has been collectively agreed to be a significant one, then justice would require addressing the shortfall itself if at all possible, rather than offering compensation in some other form, such as increased income.

Capability evaluation is informationally demanding and its precision is limited by the level of agreement about which functionings are valuable. However, Sen has shown that even where only elementary evaluation of quite basic capabilities is possible (for example, life-expectancy or literacy outcomes), this can still provide much more, and more relevant, action-guiding information than the standard alternatives. In particular, by making perspicuous contrasts between successes and failures the capability approach can direct political and public attention to neglected dimensions of human well-being. For example, countries with similar levels of wealth can have dramatically different levels of aggregate achievement – and inequality – on such non-controversially important dimensions as longevity and literacy. And, vice versa, countries with very small economies can sometimes score as highly on these dimensions as the richest. This demonstrates both the limitations of relying exclusively on economic metrics for evaluating development, and the fact that national wealth does not pose a rigid constraint on such achievements (that GNP is not destiny). Such analyses are easily politicized in the form of the pointed question, Why can’t we do as well as them?

Philippines South Africa
Gross National Income per capita (ppp) $ 4,002 $9,812
Life expectancy (years) 72.3 52
Mean years of schooling 8.7 8.2

Figure 2. Perspicuous contrasts: The Philippines does more with less

(Data from the 2010 UNDP Human Development Report)

5. Criticisms of Sen’s Capability Approach

This section outlines important criticisms of Sen’s approach, together with his responses.

a. Illiberalism

Liberal critics of Sen often identify the focus of the Capability Approach – ‘the ability to achieve the kind of lives we have reason to value’ – as problematic because it appears to impose an external valuation of the good life, whatever people may actually value. Rawls, for example, notes that the reason for liberals to focus on the fair allocation of general purpose resources rather than achievement is that this best respects each individual’s fundamental right to pursue their own conception of the good life. This relates to Rawls’ conception of justice as political rather than metaphysical: it is not the task of justice to assess people’s achievements, but rather to ensure the fairness of the conditions of participation in a society. Justice should be neutral with regard to judging different people’s conceptions of the good. But this neutrality seems incompatible with the Capability Approach’s concern with assessing people’s achievements, which would seem to require a much more substantive view of what counts as a good life than one needs for assessing general purpose resources. Rawls suggests that this constitutes the privileging of a particular (non-political) comprehensive conception of rational advantage or the good.

In replying to this criticism, Sen particularly points to the heterogeneity (variability) in people’s abilities to convert the same bundle of resources into valuable functionings. Theories of justice that focus on the distribution of means implicitly assume that they will provide the same effective freedom to live the life one has reason to value to all, but this excludes relevant information about the relationship between particular people and resources. Even if one abstracts from existing social inequalities or the results of personal choices (‘option luck’), as many liberal theories of justice do, one will still find a substantial and pervasive variation in the abilities of different members of a society to utilize the same resources – whether of specific goods like education or general purpose goods like income. That means that even if it happened that everyone had the same conception of the good, and the same bundle of resources, the fact of heterogeneity would mean that people would have differential real capability to pursue the life they had reason to value. Therefore, Sen argues, a theory of justice based on fairness should be directly and deeply concerned with the effective freedom – capability – of actual people to achieve the lives they have reason to value.

b. Under-Theorisation

Both capability theorists and external critics express concern that the content and structure of Sen’s Capability Approach is under-theorised and this makes it unsuitable as a theory of justice. Sen does not say which capabilities are important or how they are to be distributed: he argues that those are political decisions for the society itself to decide. Many philosophers have argued that without an objectively justified list of valuable capabilities the nature of the life ‘we have reason to want’ is unclear and so it is hard to identify the goal that a just society should be aiming towards, to assess how well a society is doing, or to criticize particular shortfalls. Different capability theorists have taken different approaches to the valuation of capabilities, from procedural accounts to ones based on substantive understandings of human nature. There are related concerns about the institutional structure of the Capability Approach, for example, brought by the Rawlsian social justice theorist, Thomas Pogge (Pogge 2002). How should capabilities be weighted against each other and non-capability concerns? For example, should some basic capabilities be prioritized as more urgent? What does the Capability Approach imply for interpersonal equality? How should capability enhancement be paid for? How much responsibility should individuals take for the results of their own choices? What should be done about non-remediable deprivations, such as blindness?

Sen’s main response to such criticisms has been to admit that the Capability Approach is not a theory of justice but rather an approach to the evaluation of effective freedom.

c. Individualism

Sen’s emphasis on individual effective freedom as the focal concern of the Capability Approach has been criticized as excessively individualistic. There are several components to this family of criticisms. Some communitarians see Sen’s account as lacking interest in, and even sometimes overtly hostile to, communal values and ways of life because of an excessive focus on individuals. Charles Gore, for example, has argued that Sen’s approach only considers states of affairs and social arrangements in terms of how good or bad they are for an individual’s well-being and freedom (Gore 1997). But this excludes consideration of certain other goods which individuals may have reason to value which are ‘irreducibly social’ because they cannot be reduced to properties of individuals, such as a shared language, set of moral norms, or political structure. A related criticism argues that Sen’s emphasis on individual freedom is vague and fails to consider how one individual’s freedom may affect others. Martha Nussbaum, for example, points out that a just society requires balancing and even limiting certain freedoms, such as regarding the expression of racist views, and in order to do so must make commitments about which freedoms are good or bad, important or trivial (Nussbaum 2003).  Others have noted that ‘freedom’ though broad, is a poor way of conceptualizing certain inter-personal goods such as friendship, respect, and care. A third line of critique takes issue with Sen’s ‘thin’ agency based picture of persons as too abstract and rationalistic. It is said to be founded too closely in Sen’s personal dialectical relationship between economics and philosophy, and not enough in the perspectives and methods of anthropology, sociology, or psychology (see, for example, Giri 2000; Gasper 2002). As a result Sen’s account is said to have a poor grasp, for example, of the centrality and complexity of personal growth and development.

With regard to ‘irreducibly social goods’ like culture, Sen argues that they not only enter into the analysis instrumentally (such as in the requirements for appearing in public without shame) but also as part of the lives people have reason to value. Nevertheless Sen is clear in his view that the value of social goods is only derivative upon the reflective choices of those concerned (see, for example, Sen 2004a). So if people on reflection don’t value such social goods as the traditional religious institutions of their society or continuing to speak a minority language then that should trump the ‘right’ of those institutions to continue. With regard to freedom, Sen distinguishes the ability to choose between different options from the value of those options. These two together make up effective freedom or capability. Simple freedom to choose may be vulnerable to the objection that it is compatible with invidious freedoms, but the Capability Approach is concerned with people’s ability to live a life they have reason to value, which incorporates an ethical evaluation of the content of their options. It is not concerned only with increasing people’s freedom-as-power. Finally, Sen’s Capability Approach is particularly concerned with grasping the dimensions of human well-being and advantage missing from standard approaches. This relates to its concern with tracing the causal pathways of specific deprivations, with how exactly different people are able or unable to convert resources into valuable functionings. Although this remains somewhat abstractly presented in the formal structure of the Capability Approach, Sen’s analysis of, for example, adaptive preferences and intra-household distribution do go at least some way to a situated and sociological analysis.

d. Information Gaps

Sen’s Capability Approach is founded on the idea that much more information about the quality of human lives can and should be taken into account in evaluating them. The Human Development Index developed by Amartya Sen and the economist Mahbub ul Haq in 1990 for the United Nations Development Programme’s Human Development Reports is the most influential capability metric currently used. However it has been criticized for its crudeness. It contains only three dimensions – longevity, literacy (mean years of schooling), and Gross National Income per capita – which are weighted equally. The Capability Approach is supposed to be interested in assessing how people fare on many dimensions of life including some which seem very difficult to obtain information about, such as people’s real choice sets or such complicated capabilities as the ability to appear in public without shame or to form relationships with others. It also requires detailed information on the real inter-personal variations in translating commodities into functionings. It is not clear however that such informational ambitions could ever be realized. Furthermore even the effort of trying to collect such detailed information about people’s lives and their ‘real’ disabilities can be seen as invasive.

Sen was concerned about the crudeness of the Human Development Index (HDI) from the start, but was won over by Mahbub ul Haq’s argument for the rhetorical significance of a composite index of human well-being that could compete directly with the crude GDP per capita numbers that have been so influential in development thinking. Thus the HDI does not fully reflect the scope or methodology of the Capability Approach. Nevertheless it has succeeded in demonstrating that capability related information can be used systematically as a credible supplement to economic metrics. Sen accepts that some information about capabilities is easier to obtain than others. Firstly, he argues that we already have quite extensive information about some basic capabilities even for many quite poor countries, such as about health, that can and should be systematically assessed. There is therefore no need to limit our assessment to economic metrics which firstly count the wrong things (means) and secondly also come with significant measurement error despite their apparent numerical precision. Secondly, he argues that if researchers accept the capability space as the new priority for evaluation that will motivate the development of new data collection priorities and methods. As a result more information will become available about how people are faring on the currently ‘missing dimensions’ of the lives we have reason to value, for example, relating to employment or gender equality in domestic arrangements. Nevertheless, the Capability Approach is not concerned with information collection for its own sake, but rather with the appropriate use of information for assessment. It is therefore not committed to, nor does its effective use require, building a perfect information collection and assessment bureaucracy.

6. Theorising the Capability Approach

A number of philosophers sympathetic to Sen’s foundational concerns have nevertheless been dissatisfied with the vagueness and under-elaboration of the theoretical structure of his Capability Approach (although these features seem to be quite deliberate on Sen’s part). A number of theoretical accounts have been developed that seek to elaborate the Capability Approach more systematically and to address these philosophers’ particular concerns. Some theoretical accounts are primarily concerned with operationalising the evaluative dimension of the Capability Approach: the assessment of quality of life, well-being and human development. Others focus on developing a capability based ‘Theory of Justice’ in the spirit of its concerns. This section provides a brief outline of some of these.

a. Generating Lists for Empirical Research in the Social Sciences (Ingrid Robeyns)

Ingrid Robeyns argues that attempting to develop a single all-purpose list of capabilities would be incompatible with Sen’s concern with a general framework of evaluation. Instead she proposes a procedural approach to the selection of capabilities for particular purposes, such as the evaluation of gender inequality in terms of capabilities (Robeyns 2003). She claims that valuational procedures that meet her criteria provide epistemic, academic, and political legitimacy for empirically evaluating capability. Her five criteria are:

(1) Explicit formulation. All proposed list elements should be explicit, so they can be discussed and debated.

(2) Methodological justification. The method of generating the list should be made explicit so it can be scrutinized.

(3) Sensitivity to context. The level of abstraction of the list should be appropriate to its purposes, whether for philosophical, legal, political, or social discussion.

(4) Different levels of generality. If the list is intended for empirical application or public policy then it should be drawn up in two distinct stages, first an ideal stage and then a pragmatic one that reflects perhaps temporary feasibility constraints on information and resources.

(5) Exhaustion and non-reduction. The list should include all important elements and those elements should not be reducible to others (though they may overlap).

b. A Participatory Approach to Evaluating Capability Expansion (Sabina Alkire)

Sabina Alkire has developed a philosophically grounded framework for the participatory valuation and evaluation of development projects in terms of capability enhancement (Alkire 2005). This allows her to go beyond standard cost-benefit analyses of development projects in financial terms to investigate which capabilities that the people concerned have reason to value are enhanced and by how much.

Alkire’s approach has 2 stages of evaluation: i) a theoretical one-off stage in which ‘philosophers’ employ practical reason to reflexively identify the basic spheres or categories of value, and ii) a local participatory phase in which members of a social group deliberate, with the aid of a facilitator, about what their needs are and what, and how, they would like to do about them (with the basic categories employed as prompts to ensure that all main dimensions of value are discussed). For the first, philosophical, stage Alkire proposes an adaptation of the practical reasoning approach of John Finnis to identify the basic dimensions of human well-being by asking iteratively, ‘why do I/others do what we do?’ until one comes to recognize the basic reasons for which no further reasoned justification can be given. This method is intended to yield substantive and objective descriptions of the fundamental, non-hierarchically ordered, dimensions of human flourishing, while allowing the content and relative importance of these dimensions to be specified in a participatory process according to a particular group’s historical, cultural, and personal values. The intrinsically important dimensions identified by this method are: Life; Knowledge; Play; Aesthetic experience; Sociability; Practical reasonableness; Religion.

One of the advantages Alkire claims for her approach is its ability to elicit what the people whose lives are the subject of development projects really consider valuable, which may sometimes surprise external planners and observers. Her use of the participatory approach for assessing NGO fieldwork in Pakistan showed, for example, that even the very poor can and do reasonably value other things than material well-being, such as religion and social participation.

c. Justice as Equal Capability of Democratic Citizenship (Elizabeth Anderson)

Elizabeth Anderson has proposed a partial theory of justice based on equal capability of democratic citizenship (Anderson 1999). Anderson takes equality in social relationships as the focus for her egalitarian theory of justice and argues that one should analyze the requirements of such equality in terms of the social conditions supporting it as a capability. Although Anderson’s primary concern is for equality in the particular dimension of democratic citizenship, she suggests that this has extensive egalitarian implications for the nature of the society as a whole, because other capabilities – such as relating to health, education, personal autonomy and self-respect, and economic fairness – are required as supporting conditions to realize truly equal citizenship.  She argues that, “Negatively, people are entitled to whatever capabilities are necessary to enable them to avoid or escape entanglement in oppressive social relationships. Positively, they are entitled to whatever capabilities are necessary for functioning as an equal citizen in a democratic state (Anderson 1999, 317).”

d. Capability as Freedom from Domination (John Alexander)

John Alexander has proposed a capability theory based on a Republican understanding of the importance of freedom as non-domination (Alexander 2008). He argues that the Capability Approach’s concern with people’s ‘real freedom’ sets it outside and against the standard liberal egalitarian theory of justice framework which understands freedom as the absence of constraints. But he argues that the Capability Approach should go further to elaborate this commitment to real freedom in Republican terms. In this perspective it is not only important that one be able to achieve certain functionings, such as mobility, but whether one’s achievement of these are conditional on the favor or goodwill of other people or are independently guaranteed by one’s own rights and powers. Capability is standardly understood as mapping one’s range of choices over valuable functionings regardless of their content. For example, the ability of a physically disabled but socially well-connected person to travel outside whenever she wants by arranging the help of friends, family and voluntary organizations. In addition the Republican perspective requires that her capability for mobility should be independent of context. For example, in the form of a guaranteed legal right to government assistance on demand, or by the provision of her own specially adapted self-drive vehicle. Otherwise she may be said to be still deprived since her capability is not completely free.

Domination should also be integrated into capability evaluation because it will often be a cause of capability deprivation. It is no coincidence that the people who are most capability deprived are often the poorest and weakest in society, and as a result also vulnerable to yet further exploitation. This emphasis on freedom from domination also gives a strong normative orientation to the Capability Approach’s evaluation of the causes of capability failure: some causes are simply unacceptable, such as social norms restricting women’s freedom of movement and employment, and should be removed rather than mitigated.

7. Martha Nussbaum’s Capability Theory of Justice

This section outlines Martha Nussbaum’s work on the Capability Approach: its structure, criticisms, and relationship to Amartya Sen’s work.

a. Structure and Development of Nussbaum’s Capability Theory

Martha Nussbaum has developed the most systematic, extensive, and influential capability theory of justice to date. Nussbaum aims to provide a partial theory of justice (one that doesn’t exhaust the requirements of justice) based on dignity, a list of fundamental capabilities, and a threshold.

Nussbaum’s list of The Central Human Capabilities (Reproduced from Creating Capabilities 2011, 33-4)

1. Life. Being able to live to the end of a human life of normal length; not dying prematurely, or before one’s life is so reduced as to be not worth living.

2. Bodily Health. Being able to have good health, including reproductive health; to be adequately nourished; to have adequate shelter.

3. Bodily Integrity. Being able to move freely from place to place; to be secure against violent assault, including sexual assault and domestic violence; having opportunities for sexual satisfaction and for choice in matters of reproduction.

4. Senses, Imagination, and Thought. Being able to use the senses, to imagine, think, and reason – and to do these things in a ‘‘truly human’’ way, a way informed and cultivated by an adequate education, including, but by no means limited to, literacy and basic mathematical and scientific training. Being able to use imagination and thought in connection with experiencing and producing works and events of one’s own choice, religious, literary, musical, and so forth. Being able to use one’s mind in ways protected by guarantees of freedom of expression with respect to both political and artistic speech, and freedom of religious exercise. Being able to have pleasurable experiences and to avoid non-beneficial pain.

5. Emotions. Being able to have attachments to things and people outside ourselves; to love those who love and care for us, to grieve at their absence; in general, to love, to grieve, to experience longing, gratitude, and justified anger. Not having one’s emotional development blighted by fear and anxiety. (Supporting this capability means supporting forms of human association that can be shown to be crucial in their development.)

6. Practical Reason. Being able to form a conception of the good and to engage in critical reflection about the planning of one’s life. (This entails protection for the liberty of conscience and religious observance.)

7. Affiliation.

A. Being able to live with and toward others, to recognize and show concern for other human beings, to engage in various forms of social interaction; to be able to imagine the situation of another. (Protecting this capability means protecting institutions that constitute and nourish such forms of affiliation, and also protecting the freedom of assembly and political speech.)

B. Having the social bases of self-respect and nonhumiliation; being able to be treated as a dignified being whose worth is equal to that of others. This entails provisions of nondiscrimination on the basis of race, sex, sexual orientation, ethnicity, caste, religion, national origin.

8. Other Species. Being able to live with concern for and in relation to animals, plants, and the world of nature.

9. Play. Being able to laugh, to play, to enjoy recreational activities.

10. Control Over One’s Environment.

A. Political. Being able to participate effectively in political choices that govern one’s life; having the right of political participation, protections of free speech and association.

B. Material. Being able to hold property (both land and movable goods), and having property rights on an equal basis with others; having the right to seek employment on an equal basis with others; having the freedom from unwarranted search and seizure. In work, being able to work as a human being, exercising practical reason, and entering into meaningful relationships of mutual recognition with other workers.

In her early contributions to the capability approach, Nussbaum justified the composition of her list by explicitly Aristotelian argument about the perfectionist requirements of the truly human life (Nussbaum 1988). In the mid-1990s however she converted the structure of her account to a Rawlsian style ‘politically liberal’ account. This means that she now presents her list as a proposal that is neutral with respect to particular conceptions of the good, but can be endorsed by many different groups in a society through an overlapping consensus. However the list components themselves remain almost identical and retain a distinctively Aristotelian cast.

Nussbaum’s account is motivated by a concept of human dignity (in contrast to Sen’s emphasis on freedom), which she links to flourishing in the Aristotelian sense. She argues that her list of 10 fundamental capabilities follow from the requirements of dignity and have been tested and adapted over the course of an extensive cross-cultural dialogue she has carried out, particularly in India (as related in her book, Women and Human Development, 2001). The threshold is a ‘sufficientarian’ principle that specifies the minimum requirements of justice: everyone must be entitled to each capability at least to this degree by their governments and relevant international institutions. Access to these capabilities is required by human dignity, Nussbaum argues, but this does not mean that a life lacking in any of these, whether from external deprivation or individual choice, is a less than human life. Choice and deprivation are different however. If someone lacks access to these capabilities, for example, to be well-nourished (bodily health), that reflects a failure by society to respect her human dignity. If someone chooses not to take up her opportunities to certain capabilities, for example, to adopt an ascetic life-style and fast for religious reasons at the expense of her bodily health, respecting that choice is also an aspect of respecting her dignity.

Nussbaum suggests that her list, together with the precise location of the threshold, should be democratically debated and incorporated into national constitutional guarantees, international human rights legislation and international development policy. In keeping with its commitment to political liberalism, the components of Nussbaum’s list have a ‘thick-vague’ character in that while they have a universal claim to be of central importance to any human life, their definition is vague enough to allow their specification in multiple ways that reflect the values, histories, and special circumstances of particular political societies. For example, freedom of speech may be defined differently in law in the USA and Germany, because of their different histories, without endangering the fundamental capability. Nevertheless, because each capability is equally centrally important and a shortfall in any area is significant in itself, the scope for governments to make trade-offs between them, for example, on the basis of quantitative cost-benefit analysis, is limited.

b. Criticisms of Nussbaum’s Theory

Nussbaum’s capability theory of justice received quite intense criticism. Some have questioned the epistemological basis of her approach, finding it rather suspicious that after all her years of cross-cultural discussion her list remains basically the same rather ‘intellectualized’ Aristotelian one she had suggested in the first place (Okin 2003), and suggest that it rather reflects the values of a typical 21st century American liberal than a set of timeless universal values or a contemporary global overlapping consensus (Stewart 2001). Others have argued that her legal-moral-philosophical orientation is elitist and over-optimistic about what constitutions and governments are like and are capable of (Menon 2002); is over-specified and paternalistic yet still misses out important capabilities and is inappropriate for many uses, such as quality of life measurement or development fieldwork (Alkire 2005, 35-45).

In response to such criticisms, Nussbaum has defended the contents of her list as having cross-cultural credibility, but also emphasised that she is not trying to impose a definitive capability theory on everyone. She makes a clear and explicit distinction between the dimensions of justification (why her theory is best) and implementation (its more humble meta-status as an object for democratic deliberation and decision by those concerned) (Nussbaum 2004).

c. Sen and Nussbaum

Nussbaum and Sen collaborated in the late 1980s and early 1990s and since they are the most high-profile writers in the Capability Approach their accounts are often elided, despite significant differences. When they are distinguished, Nussbaum’s account is often seen as the more ‘philosophical’ because she has developed the Capability Approach in a more orthodox philosophical way, for example, by focusing on theoretical rigor, coherence and completeness. As a result, Sen’s approach is sometimes perceived merely as a predecessor to Nussbaum’s more developed second generation account, and therefore of primarily historical interest to understanding the Capability Approach rather than a parallel account in its own right.

The accounts of Sen and Nussbaum differ significantly in ways that relate to their different concerns and backgrounds. In particular:

  • Nussbaum is concerned to produce a philosophically coherent normative (partial) theory of justice; Sen is concerned with producing a general framework for evaluating the quality of lives people can lead that can incorporate the very diverse concerns and dimensions that may be applicable.
  • While Sen’s approach is founded on enhancing individual freedom, Nussbaum’s theory is founded on respecting human dignity.
  • Sen’s comprehensive consequentialism makes room for incorporating empirical information about feasibility and instrumental relationships between capabilities when considering policies; Nussbaum largely rejects such instrumental analysis because she is wary of its ‘Utilitarian associations’.
  • Sen’s Capability Approach in its normative ‘developmental’ aspect, is mainly concerned with practical incremental improvements; Nussbaum’s approach is rather more utopian in that it demands the full implementation of minimal justice (achievement of the minimum thresholds of all fundamental capabilities) for all, and this is specified so demandingly that no country yet meets it (though she has suggested that Finland may be close).

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • John M. Alexander 2008. Capabilities and Social Justice. Ashgate Publishing, Ltd.
    • Introduction to the Capability Approach, with attention to Sen’s, Nussbaum’s, and Anderson’s accounts and a development of his own Republican account in the final chapter.
  • Sabina Alkire. 2005. Valuing Freedoms. Oxford University Press.
    • First half of the book develops a procedure for operationalizing the Capability Approach for participatory development; second half applies this to the evaluation of development projects.
  • Elizabeth Anderson. 1999. “What Is the Point of Equality?” Ethics 109 (2): 287-337.
    • Critique of luck egalitarianism and outline of a capability theory of justice based on the capability for equal democratic citizenship.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 1988. Nature, Function, and Capability: Aristotle on Political Distribution. In Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy. Oxford University Press.
    • Martha Nussbaum’s first contribution to the capability approach, based on a reading of Aristotle’s politics and ethics.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2001. Women and Human Development (Cambridge University Press,).
    • Key text in Nussbaum’s second stage – political – development of a capability theory of justice.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2004. “On Hearing Women’s Voices: A Reply to Susan Okin.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 32 (2): 193-205.
    • Nussbaum replies to criticisms of the methodology and legitimacy of her list.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2011. Creating Capabilities: The Human Development Approach (Harvard University Press).
    • Non-technical introduction to the capability approach and Nussbaum’s capability theory of justice intended for university undergraduates.
  • Ingrid Robeyns. 2003. “Sen’s Capability Approach and Gender Inequality: selecting relevant capabilities.” Feminist Economics 9 (2): 61-92.
    • Robeyns outlines her procedure for choosing capabilities and applies it to the case of gender equality.
  • Amartya Sen. 1979. Equality of What? Stanford University: Tanner Lectures on Human Values (Available from the Tanner Lectures website)
    • Amartya Sen’s first publication on the capability approach, particularly focused on criticizing utilitarian and Rawlsian perspectives on well-being.
  • Amartya Sen. 1985. Commodities and Capabilities. North-Holland.
    • The most formal (technical) elaboration of Sen’s capability approach.
  • Amartya Sen. 1989. “Development as Capability Expansion,” Journal of Development Planning 19: 41–58.
    • An especially accessible and succinct account of the capability approach to human development.
  • Amartya Sen. 1999. Development as Freedom. Oxford University Press.
    • Important and influential synthesis of Sen’s work on human development and the Capability Approach.
  • Amartya Sen. 2004a. UN Human Development Report 2004: Chapter 1 Cultural Liberty and Human Development. UN Human Development Reports. United Nations Development Programme. (Available from the UNDP website).
    • Strong argument by Sen that cultural rights should be derivative upon individuals’ freedom to choose.
  • Amartya Sen. 2004b. “Capabilities, Lists, and Public Reason: Continuing the Conversation,” Feminist Economics 10, no. 3: 77-80.
    • An interview with Amartya Sen in which he elaborates on his rejection of a fixed list of capabilities (frequently cited).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Des Gasper. 2002. “Is Sen’s Capability Approach an Adequate Basis for Considering Human Development?” Review of Political Economy 14 (4): 435-461.
    • Thorough analysis of Sen’s account, including a critique of its excessive abstraction.
  • Ananta Kumar Giri. 2000. “Rethinking Human Well-being: A Dialogue with Amartya Sen.” Journal of International Development 12 (7): 1003-1018.
    • Critique of Sen’s neglect of personal development.
  • Charles Gore. 1997. “Irreducibly Social Goods and the Informational Basis of Amartya Sen’s Capability Approach.” Journal of International Development 9 (2): 235-250.
    • Critique of Sen’s neglect of social values.
  • Susan Moller Okin. 2003. “Poverty, Well-Being, and Gender: What Counts, Who’s Heard?” Philosophy and Public Affairs 31 (3): 280-316.
    • Feminist critique of Nussbaum’s theory
  • Nivedita Menon. 2002. “Universalism without Foundations?” Economy and Society 31 (1): 152.
    • Critique of the political philosophy in Nussbaum’s theory.
  • Martha Nussbaum. 2003. “Capabilities as Fundamental Entitlements: Sen and Social Justice.” Feminist Economics 9 (2): 33.
    • Critique of Sen’s Capability Approach as too vaguely specified to support normative judgments.
  • Thomas Pogge. 2002. “Can the Capability Approach Be Justified?” Philosophical Topics 30 (2): 167–228.
    • Important Rawlsian critique of Sen’s account, frequently cited.
  • Frances Stewart. 2001. Book Review “Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, by Martha Nussbaum” Journal of International Development 13 (8): 1191-1192.
    • Short but powerful critique of Nussbaum’s capability theory from a leading human development scholar.


Author Information

Thomas Wells
Erasmus University Rotterdam
The Netherlands