Gustav Shpet (1879—1937)

Shpet, a professor of philosophy at the University of Moscow, introduced Husserlian transcendental phenomenology into Russia. Additionally, he wrote extensively on aesthetics, hermeneutics, the history of Russian philosophy and the philosophy of language. During the Stalinist years in Russia he was condemned as being an idealist in philosophy and a counter-revolutionary in politics. The depth and breadth of his numerous studies stand as a testament to the philosophic spirit in Russia during the waning years of tsarism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gustav Gustavovich Shpet was born in Kiev in April 1879. Late in life during the Stalinist period, he sought to emphasize his humble origins as the illegitimate son of a seamstress. In fact, his maternal grandfather appears to have been a member of the Polish gentry. No information is available on his father. Whether he had any religious upbringing is unclear. On his university registration form he gave his religion as Lutheran, although his mother was, based on family testimony, Catholic.

Upon finishing studies at a gymnasium (secondary school) in Kiev Shpet enrolled at the university there in 1898. Also at this time he became involved in a Marxist circle, although the degree of his active participation is unclear. In any case, his involvement resulted in expulsion from the university. After a relatively short time, however, he was permitted back to attend classes. From that time onward, Shpet always maintained a respectable distance from philosophical Marxism, while apparently retaining a measured sympathy for its socio-economic ideals. After finishing his studies in 1906 he taught for a time at a Kiev gymnasium but followed his former teacher Georgij Chelpanov to Moscow in 1907 upon the latter’s succession to the philosophy chair formerly held by Sergej Trubeckoj.

In Moscow Shpet continued his studies at the university and worked in Chelpanov’s newly established psychology institute. In addition, he taught at a number of educational institutions in the city. During the summer months of 1910 and 1911 Shpet went abroad to Paris, Edinburgh and various locales in Germany in connection with the psychology institute and his own research for a dissertation. During one of these trips he first encountered Husserl, but it was not until his stay in Goettingen during the 1912-13 academic year that he came firmly under Husserl’s influence. Attending Husserl’s lectures and seminars at this time, Shpet became acquainted with the nascent ideas of transcendental phenomenology and, in particular, with those that would eventually become known as Ideen II. When Ideen I was published in 1913 Shpet amazingly mastered in short order the change in Husserl’s orientation. The next several years were arguably the most philosophically productive of his life, producing in rapid succession a series of works on epistemology, the history of philosophy and the history of Russian philosophy. In 1915 he wrote a large study of the 19th century Moscow philosophy professor Pamfil Yurkevich, followed the next year by the defense and the publication of his dissertation Istorija kak problema logika (History as a Problem of Logic) and then the writing of Germenevtika i ee problemy (Hermeneutics and Its Problems), which languished in manuscript for decades.

His work, however, as the first propagandist, if you will, in Russia for Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology and philosophy as a rigorous science is perhaps that for which he is best known, at least in Western philosophical circles. Although the Husserlian influence waned over the years, due at least in part to his increasing isolation within Soviet Russia, Shpet produced within a few short months of its appearance in 1913 the first book-length study of Husserl’s Ideen I. In 1917 and 1918 he edited the philosophical yearbook Mysl’ i slovo, which also contained valuable contributions by Shpet himself and amplified his own position vis-a-vis Husserlian phenomenology. In 1918 he was appointed to a professorship at Moscow University and in the following year he succeeded to the chair held by Leo Lopatin, who had recently died.

Despite his varied intellectual activities on many fronts during the early years of the Bolshevik regime, Shpet, as an openly non-Marxist intellectual, could not be permitted to retain his teaching position long. His name appeared on Lenin’s August 1922 listing of those to be exiled from Russia, a list that included numerous prominent philosophers, such as Berdyaev, Lossky and Lapshin. Shpet, however, successfully appealed to Lunacharskij, the Soviet cultural minister, with whom he was acquainted from his student days in Kiev, to have his name removed.

In 1923 with the creation of the Russian–later State–Academy for Cultural Studies, Shpet was tapped to be its vice-president. There he continued his scholarly work, albeit slightly redirected or, perhaps more accurately, re-focused away from pure philosophy. Again despite his prolific output and that of his colleagues, the Academy, though at least nominally headed by a Marxist, was closed in 1929. Over the next several years he made his living chiefly by preparing translations from such authors as Dickens and Byron, and he also participated in the preparation of a Russian edition of Shakespeare.

On 14 March 1935 Shpet, along with several other former colleagues from the State Academy, was arrested, charged with anti-soviet activities and sentenced to five years internal exile. Later that year the place of exile was changed to Tomsk, a university city in Siberia, where Shpet prepared a new Russian translation of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. On 27 October 1937 he was again arrested and charged with belonging to a monarchist organization. Recently uncovered documents from the former KGB headquarters in Tomsk indicate that Shpet was executed on 16 November 1937.

2. Philosophy

The nascent secondary literature is still at a very early stage. Nevertheless, already three areas of disagreement exist concerning: a) the influences on Shpet’s philosophy; b) the number of stages in the development of his thought; and c) Shpet’s lasting contribution to philosophy. With regard to the first area, some have tended to emphasize the phenomenological aspect of his thought and, consequently, have stressed the Husserlian influence. Others have noted the influence of Hegel, while still others have sought to demonstrate Shpet’s indebtedness to the Russian metaphysical tradition. To a large degree, however, the depiction of the dominant influence on Shpet has been determined by one’s response to the third area, namely, his contribution to philosophy. During the Soviet era, Russian scholars saw Shpet almost exclusively as an historian of Russian philosophy. To the extent that his ideas at that time received recognition in the West he was viewed as the Russian disciple of Husserl. Today both inside Russia and in Western circles Shpet is receiving attention as a phenomenologist of language, if not the first to study language from within a broadly phenomenological perspective.

In any case, Shpet’s philosophical development can be broken into at least three periods. Although one contemporary scholar (A. Haardt) holds the first of these to range from 1898-1905, no writings have emerged from these very youthful years and certainly Shpet published nothing at this time. What little information we have comes from an autobiographical remark in his huge 1916 thesis. Thus, seeing his Marxist infatuation as a stage in Shpet’s thought serves no useful purpose.

Whatever was the nature of his Marxism, already by 1903 Shpet felt an affinity toward idealism and, in particular, saw the former as riddled with what he thought were epistemological and methodological errors. In his thesis for Kiev University, published under the title “The Problem of Causality in Hume and Kant: Did Kant Answer Hume’s Doubt?,” Shpet writing under the unmistakable influence of Chelpanov and the “Kiev School of Kant-Interpretation,” fundamentally sided with a phenomenalist reading of Kant. In addition, referring explicitly to the writings of the Baden School of neo-Kantianism, Shpet cautiously held that although Kant had demonstrated the “real necessity” of a priori cognitions, he had not proved their “logical necessity.”

“We must recognize, therefore, that Kant succeeded in proving the real necessity of a priori categories. Nevertheless, he did not prove their logical necessity. ” (1, p. 202)

That is, the Kantian a priori categories, including causality, must be postulated so as to account for objectively valid knowledge. In this way Shpet accords belief in the categories, and thus practical reason, a primacy in and over epistemology. Therefore, based simply on the textual evidence available to the contemporary scholar for analysis, the first period in Shpet’s thought is marked by a neo-Kantian phase extending from circa 1903-1912 and is the only period conceptually quite distinct from the others.

The exact evolution of Shpet’s ideas immediately after moving to Moscow is unclear. What is clear, however, is that he irrevocably distanced himself from neo-Kantianism and came under the influence of Lopatin and the works of the recently deceased S. Trubeckoj. From them, as well perhaps as through his reading of Vladimir Solovyov, Shpet began to employ the unmistakeable terminology and think philosophically in the categories and problems of Platonism, particularly that variant then dominant at Moscow University. In addition to criticizing psychologism–and, indeed, all “isms”– for its failure to grasp the psyche as a “living whole,” Shpet began to see philosophy itself as based on the immediate data of reflection.

“The spirit of our philosophy is that of a living,concrete and integral philosophy based on the reliable data of inner experience. ” (2, p.264.)

Despite the obvious pedigree of this conception in, on the one hand, the Moscow metaphysicians, and, on the other, James, Dilthey, Stumpf and the early Husserl–as Shpet himself acknowledged–we should not disregard the fact that Chelpanov also stressed the importance of introspection as a technique in psychology, albeit bereft of metaphysical interpretation.

The next period in Shpet’s philosophy is that for which he is best known. In Appearance and Sense, published in mid-1914, Shpet provided, on the one hand, a summarization of many points covered in Husserl’s Ideen I. Yet, on the other hand, Shpet sought to invoke Husserl’s transcendental turn for his own purposes, while cautiously noting what he saw as deficiencies in the latter. Like Husserl, Shpet was willing to characterize phenomenology as the fundamental science and, again like Husserl, Shpet made extensive use of eidetic intuition. This reliance on the Husserlian technique of “ideation” is one that Shpet continued to value years later even after coming under political attack for his idealism. Husserl and Shpet differed, however, on the goal of such procedures and methods. Whereas the former sought to construct a presuppositionless philosophy, a “science” of consciousness and cognition, Shpet saw philosophy as ultimately a study of being, of which cognizing is but one form among many. Modern philosophy’s error is found in its concentration on the forms of cognition, rather than on cognition as such. In modern parlance we could say philosophy has failed to distinguish the forest from the trees. The subject-matter of phenomenology, as Shpet conceived it, is the study of cognition, qua a mode of being. The major oversight of modern philosophy is not to have seen the non-empirical and non-actual nature of the cognizing subject.

Of the several articles Shpet published immediately subsequent to the appearance of Appearance and Sense two in particular stand out: “Consciousness and Its Proprietor” and “Wisdom or Reason.” In the first of these, which appeared in 1916, Shpet already addressed an issue that would later prove to be a major bone of contention among the next generation of phenomenologists. Developing ideas enunciated by Solovyov during the last years of his life, Shpet asked who “owns” or “possesses” the unity of consciousness. Whereas he is willing, pace Hume, to concede on the issue of such a unity, it is no one’s, i.e., it has no proprietor. We are led astray in seeking such a proprietor by an inaccurate analogy drawn from our everyday language.

“Ultimately, it is as impossible to say whose consciousness as it is to say whose space, whose air, even though everybody is convinced that the air which he breathes is his air, and the space which he occupies is his space. ” (4, p. 205)

In direct opposition to Husserl, whom he accuses of betraying the “principle of all principles,” stated in Ideen I, Shpet finds no “pure Ego.” What unity there is certainly cannot serve as an epistemological guarantee, and it certainly cannot be called a Self or an Ego.

In “Wisdom or Reason” from 1917 Shpet presents what may well be the first attempt to depict the phenomenological idea, or what we today often view as that idea, as the telos of Western philosophy. Noticeably, however, Shpet never mentions phenomenology as such; instead he uses the locution “philosophy as pure knowledge” and even “philosophy as knowledge.” In a precise manner, Parmenides established the proper object of philosophy and showed the path along which philosophy is directed to solve the problem posed by that object. (5, p. 7)

This itself can be seen as a distancing from the Husserlian influence in that Shpet traces his conception back to the Greeks and indeed to Parmenides. In any case, Shpet holds that philosophy proceeds through three stages (and as in Hegel’s Phenomenology whether these are purely logical or chronological as well is arguable): from wisdom then on to metaphysics before finally arriving at rigorous science or knowledge. Unlike positivistic “scientific philosophy,” which seeks to copy the methodology of an arbitrarily chosen natural science or bases itself on results attained in natural science, philosophy as pure knowledge grounds the specific sciences.

The recent emergence and publication of Shpet’s hitherto virtually inaccessible 1918 work Hermeneutics and Its Problems, in both the original Russian and a German translation, has drawn notable international attention. In it Shpet presents a history of hermeneutics ranging from the Greeks to the early 20th century, seeing the work of Dilthey and Husserl, as represented in the first “Logical Investigation,” as the highest point yet attained.

Throughout this period and later Shpet maintained that his work was a continuation of that direction in philosophy associated with Brentano and Husserl. Where they erred was in forgetting the social dimension. There can and do exist forms of collective or socio-cultural consciousness. An element of such consciousness is language, more specifically words. The understanding plays an analogous role in the grasping of sense, for which words act as the “material bearer,” as sense perception does in the individual’s representational consciousness. Shpet developed these themes at some length in his Aesthetic Fragments from 1922/23 and his Inner Form of the Word from 1927.

In addition, Shpet shortly before and after the Bolshevik Revolution devoted considerable attention to the history of Russian philosophy, publishing a number of valuable studies studded with numerous caustic comments on the poverty of philosophy in his homeland.

3. References and Further Reading

  • “Problema prichinosti u Juma i Kanta. Otvetil li Kant na somnenija Juma?” (“The Problem of Causality in Hume and Kant. Did Kant Answer Hume’s Doubt?”), Kievskie universitetskie izvestija, 1907, #5.
  • “Odin put’ psikhologii i kuda on vedet” (“One Path in Psychology and Where It Leads”), Filosofskij sbornik L. M. Lopatinu ot Moskovskogo Psikhologicheskogo Obshchestva, Moscow, 1912, pp. 245-264.
  • Javlenie i smysl, Moscow, 1914. [English translation: Appearance and Sense, trans. by Thomas Nemeth, Kluwer Academic Publishers: Dordrecht, 1991]
  • “Soznanie i ego sobstvennik” (“Consciousness and Its Proprietor”), Sbornik statej po filosofii, posvjashchennyj G. I. Chelpanovu, Moscow, 1916, pp. 156-210.
  • Istorija kak problema logiki. Kriticheskie i metodologicheskie issledovanija. Chast’ I: Materialy (History as a Problem of Logic. Critical and Methodological Investigations. Part I: Materials), Moscow, 1916.
  • “Mudrost’ ili razum” (“Wisdom or Reason”), Mysl’ i slovo, vyp. 1, 1917, pp. 1-69.
  • Ocherk razvitija russkoj filosofii. Chast 1. (An Outline of the Development of Russian Philosophy. Part 1.), Petrograd, 1922.
  • Esteticheskie fragmenty (Aesthetic Fragments), I. Petergrad 1922. II, III. Petrograd 1923.
  • Vnutrennjaja forma slova. Etjudy i variacii na temy Humbol’dta (Inner Form of the Word. Studies and Variations on a Humboldtian Theme), Moscow, 1927.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.