Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology

spinozaThe theory of knowledge, or epistemology, offered by the 17th century Dutch philosopher Benedict de Spinoza may yet prove to be the most daring in the history of philosophy. Not only does Spinoza claim to be able to know all the ways one can know something, he also claims to be able to know what everything is. Few philosophers besides Spinoza have sought and proclaimed possession of absolute knowledge quite like he had. Of the philosophers who have claimed absolute knowledge, only Spinoza has offered it, not as the reception of a divine revelation, and not as the fulfillment of a historical process, as in Hegel’s epistemology, but as a means for intuitively affirming the truth inherent within all of reality. Reality is susceptible to such an intuition, he said, because every being is a mode of it, or a way that it expresses itself. In other words, for us to come to know the “absolute” is for the absolute to come to know itself. There is thus something basically self-reflexive and introspective about Spinoza’s epistemology. At the same time, knowledge for Spinoza is always of what he calls God or Nature, which can also be understood as the universe itself.

However, whether or not Spinoza’s epistemology is valid by any standard besides his own, remains a point of contention. Most philosophers believe that Spinoza’s epistemology wildly oversteps the limits of human finitude, while others believe that even if Spinoza certainly experienced something within himself that he called “the truth,” we have no real access to it ourselves. This article explores the role and function of knowledge in Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole and the methodology he uses to know things and to know knowledge. The article closely follows Spinoza’s threefold division of the different types of knowledge as  presented in his Ethics. This threefold division is constituted by the distinctions among imagination, intuition, and the exercise of the intellect.

Table of Contents

  1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy
    1. Why Search for Knowledge?
    2. Knowledge in the Ethics
  2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology
    1. The Geometric Method
    2. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism
  3. The First Kind of Knowledge
    1. Imagination
    2. Prejudice and Superstition
    3. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation
  4. The Second Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intellection
    2. Common Notions
    3. Reason
  5. The Third Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intuition
    2. Love and Blessedness
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy


Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole can be seen as continuous reflection on the role and function of knowledge itself. As a rationalist, along with Descartes and Leibniz, he was concerned with improving the power of the intellect, with its inherent capacity to reason, so that it could overcome the obscurity and confusion of our everyday perceptions. Spinoza’s first attempt at writing philosophy was a treatise intended to teach us how to best utilize our natural, rational powers so as to overcome our enslavement to the partial knowledge supplied by the senses. This work was the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (TdIE). Spinoza wrote this work, it is believed, in the early 1660s, but he never finished it. In the treatise, Spinoza begins with an autobiographical moment that explains to the reader why he wanted to improve or emend the intellect.

1a. Why Search for Knowledge?


Spinoza sees the obtaining of true knowledge to be the sole avenue for liberating oneself from the limits and fallibility of an average human existence. Both for the mind and the body, Spinoza is searching for a way we can come to correct ourselves and thus know reality with a certainty that would guarantee for us a thoroughly active and affirmative existence, which is an existence defined solely by the active affects of joy and love. There is, therefore, also an ethical aspect to the improvement of the mind that a search for true knowledge is intended to yield. Spinoza calls the joy which a true knowledge of things would imply the “true good.” Such a “true good” is not merely an ephemeral happiness, but instead an eternal joy. Spinoza writes:

After experience had taught me that all the things which regularly occur in ordinary life are empty and futile, and I saw that all the things which were the cause or object of my fear had nothing of good or bad in themselves, except insofar as [my] mind was moved by them, I resolved at last to try to find out whether there was anything which would be the true good, capable of communicating itself, and which alone would affect the mind, all others being rejected—whether there was something which, once found and acquired, would continuously give me the greatest joy, to eternity (TdIE 1).

Spinoza does not deny that searching for true knowledge is a risky gesture. To sacrifice the pleasantries and safety of what everyday experience provides and proclaims as certain is to risk interrupting the comfort of one’s normal routine. In light of this, Spinoza sought to search for true knowledge in a way that would not violate the comfort of his everyday existence, but that would reject what humans usually take to be the highest goods: “riches, honor, and sensual pleasure” (TdIE 3). What this means is that true knowledge will not make you money, give you a popular reputation, or even offer you any momentary delights. Spinoza’s own biography attends to this fact. However, Spinoza was no ascetic. For him, true knowledge does not consist in any misanthropic disavowal of the plight of human beings. Rather, obtaining true knowledge will simply allow one to live with the internal confidence that existence is not defined merely by the indefinite search for finite pleasures. True knowledge will instead empower its possessor to the extent that s/he will be unperturbed by the vacillating conflict of the emotions, or affects, that determine the everyday existence of most humans. In this sense, Spinoza’s emphasis on the affective power of true knowledge is very similar to Stoicism. Ultimately, we should search for true knowledge not only because it will improve our inherent rational ability to check and control our reactive and passive emotions and drives, but because true knowledge will lead us to a direct experience of the essence of all reality, which is an experience that liberates us from finite concerns and endows us with the power and virtue of true blessedness. For Spinoza, true blessedness is an expression of intellectual love towards an eternal and infinite entity: God or Nature. We should search for true knowledge because it will allow us to become truly blessed and wise. Wisdom is true blessedness, or beatitude, for Spinoza. To emend the intellect so that it can use its reason to control its emotions will also allow it, along with becoming wise, to discover the true laws of Nature and common properties of all things. Checking its natural tendency toward reactive passivity and confused perceptions is the self-cultivation of a power essential to the intellect. An emended intellect is, therefore, the perfection of a way of knowing and existing that has searched for and obtained true knowledge.

1b. Knowledge in the Ethics


The most mature statement of Spinoza’s philosophy is his Ethics. The Ethics is composed of five parts. The first part gives us Spinoza’s ontology. It deals primarily with what Spinoza regards to be the one true substance or thing that defines reality, which is, once again, God or Nature. Spinoza felt that, prior to discovering how one can know anything, it was best to start any philosophic investigation by establishing the very nature of what is. Getting to God as quickly as possible was only almost an injunction for Spinoza. Spinoza was a substance monist, which means he thought that everything is essentially one thing or substance and that all things are so many modes or ways it modifies or affects itself. The one substance that is everything is infinitely self-causing, self-expressing, and self-sustaining. It is all-powerful, perfect, and real. There is thus only one substance in Nature, as opposed to the many substances philosophers from Aristotle to Descartes had presumed, and that substance is Nature itself. Substance is an indivisible entity of which everything is a modification. The essence of substance, which is its eternal and necessary existence, is what Spinoza calls the attributes. While there is in essence an absolute and indivisible infinity of attributes, we know only two of these attributes: thought and extension. We can know thought and extension because we are ourselves modes of them. Thought is an infinite power of thinking that is God’s idea of himself, while we, our minds and all our thoughts, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite thoughts. In other words, God has and is every idea, while we are just our idea of our ideas of our body and the other bodies that affect us. Extension, likewise, is an infinite power of acting that is God’s infinite and self-causal body (for he is Nature and Nature is essentially physical), while we, our bodies and all the bodies that compose and affect us, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite bodies. In other words, God has and is every body—he is Nature’s naturing (natura naturans)—while we are just our body’s drive to persevere as it intends to actively make stronger compositions with other bodies.

The second part of the Ethics is about the human mind and how it has the ability to emend itself so it can come to know not only its own essence as a finite thing, but also the infinite essence of which it is a mode. The second part teaches us how we can come to know how we are a way God infinitely expresses and continuously causes himself to exist, which is to say we can come to know God’s attributes. We will deal with this part of the Ethics extensively in the sections to come. If the second part teaches us how to strengthen our minds so we can come to know what we really are and how we actually exist as thinking things, then the next two parts of the Ethics (the third dealing with the affects and the fourth their strength) teaches us how to strengthen our bodies so we can come to physically be what we really are and how we actually exist as extended things essentially defined by a desire to persevere. The fifth and final part of the Ethics, dealing with Spinoza’s definition of freedom, synthesizes these approaches and teaches us how to immediately intuit and affirm the infinite and eternal essence we had come to know and embody through the prior parts. The role of knowledge in the Ethics is, therefore, both essential and integral. Through an improvement of our knowledge we can come to be strong and free, or wise and blessed. Spinoza’s understanding and use of knowledge in the Ethics is presented as a way for giving us the means to discover not only the different ways we can know reality, but also the best way we can know it. The ultimate goal of showing us what knowledge is and how we can render it truer—thereby emboldening it with a certain adequacy, power, and clarity and distinctness—is to enable us to obtain that eternal joy which is the very reason why we search for true knowledge in the first place. The role and function of knowledge in the Ethics is to be that way through which we can come to adequately, actively, and rationally exist.

2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology

Implied in Spinoza’s epistemology is the admission that there are a variety of ways one can have knowledge. It is also implied in Spinoza epistemology that there is a definitively adequate way for knowing this variety of ways. Spinoza’s method for his epistemology has two aspects, one that is formal and another that is more concerned with the concrete perspectives that define the different ways one can have knowledge.

2a. The Geometric Method


It might appear strange that Spinoza waits until part II of the Ethics to address the human mind and the different ways it can have knowledge, considering that the search for the freedom and blessedness of true knowledge is the stated purpose of his thinking. The reason he does this is because of the structural demands of the form in which he wrote the Ethics. Spinoza writes the Ethics in geometric form, which entails that in each part of the text the formal presentation of his arguments involve the use of definitions, axioms, propositions, demonstrations, proofs, scholia, and so on. Formally, the Ethics is written in a way that is similar to Euclid’s Elements. Also, Descartes had popularized the use of geometric form in Spinoza’s time. In opposition to Descartes, however, Spinoza preferred a more synthetic geometric approach than an analytic one. Synthesis is a way of combining primary or axiomatic truths already established as indubitable or self-evident in order to reach other primary truths. To utilize a synthetic geometric method allows one to start with certain ultimate conclusions or truths in order to build a new knowledge from them by demonstrating and proving propositions on their basis. This is why Spinoza starts with God, the one substance that is everything. There are things about God or Nature that simply cannot be denied and that must serve as the basis from which all other knowledge will be derived: that he essentially exists, that he is absolutely infinite, self-causal, conceivable as existing only in and through himself, omnipotent, omniscient, and eternally existing of necessity.

So, in a sense, Spinoza already has absolute knowledge before he reaches it. While the synthetic geometric method was that powerful for him, Spinoza also knew that we, as readers, still needed to progress through the entirety of his text in order to see if and how he was right. Believing that what Spinoza establishes as axiomatically certain is in fact so is a necessary gesture on our part if we are to come to know how Spinoza can start with such perfect knowledge. In other words, Spinoza writes the rest of his Ethics for a reason when he could have just as easily cut everything off after part I, and that reason is that he wants to teach us what we, quite paradoxically, already know as well. The knowledge we all already have is what Spinoza himself explicitly knows as he put it into axiomatic form. The process of coming to have knowledge, for Spinoza, is thus always an explication of a knowledge that is eternally implied in every mind. Spinoza uses the axiomatic geometric form so he does not have to waist time by starting from scratch and eventually discovering the very basis from which he can start through the simple establishment of definitions and axioms. This can be seen as the reason why he never completed the TdIE as well, because it began with the natural inadequacy of our everyday knowledge and sought to overcome it through an almost analytic process of forming a basis from which future knowledge would be capable of discovering the very truth of God that Spinoza and, according to him, we all already know. Such an analytic approach was Descartes’ in his Meditations and it was also probably the main inspiration for Spinoza’s writing the TdIE in the way that he did. By beginning with God and what is absolutely true of him in the Ethics, Spinoza could then show us the variety of ways in which we are inherently both inadequately and adequately knowing God from the start. Spinoza found the destructive tendencies of the analytic method, especially of Descartes’ hyperbolic doubt, to be superfluous because if one has the truth it is not doubted and if it is doubted then it is not the truth and you do not have it.

For Spinoza, it is not that we do not have knowledge of God. The problem is that our knowledge is usually quite poor and confused. But merely by following Spinoza through the Ethics, because of its synthetic geometric form, we come to know that we already have a knowledge that is, in an everyday sense, quite poor. The way to come to know adequately then what we always already know inadequately is to come to know the different ways that knowledge can be known and the different ways knowledge knows things, both of which will become utterly identical through the reflexivity demanded by Spinoza’s epistemology. Such reflexivity, therefore, will constitute Spinoza’s actual method for doing epistemology insofar as the geometric method is the formal presentation of its synthetic necessities, but not its precise application to the different kinds of knowledge. Spinoza says as much in the TdIE when he argues that any true method must be “reflexive knowledge” (TdIE 38). This is not to say that Spinoza’s geometric method does not itself imply reflexivity, but that it is more the form in which a truly reflexive epistemology can be invented and utilized.

2b. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism


The truly reflexive way Spinoza does epistemology can be called the sub specie model. Sub specie is Latin for “under the species or aspect of,” or “from the perspective of.” Each aspect or perspective of knowledge is a way of knowing. Spinoza uses the phrase when speaking of how, when we use the common notions and reason that define the second kind of knowledge, we perceive reality “under a certain species of eternity” (EIIP44C2). True knowledge for Spinoza, as we will see, means that one shifts one’s perspective away from imagining reality in terms of the abstractions and quantifications implied by using time (and space) to measure an indefinitely enduring finite existence, to intellectually conceiving reality from the perspective of its own true and indivisible eternity. Insofar as there is only one substance, one real thing, in and as the universe for Spinoza, when we have any knowledge, whether it is true or false, it is necessarily going to be of this substance. The sub specie model states that all the ways of knowing are different ways of knowing one thing and not different ways of knowing substantially different things. Each way of knowing is a perspective on one substance. While our knowledge may be perceived as changing, what we know cannot be truly perceived in such a way.

The sub specie model is reflexive because it allows Spinoza to know how knowledge actually functions while still sustaining his substance monism. He retains his substance monism by affirming the existence of the great variety of ways humans, and moreover all beings, can have knowledge as being so many ways God expresses himself. If all ways of knowing are ways God is known, then God himself, insofar as he is absolutely self-causal and self-expressive, would have to thereby know himself through and as all the different ways he is known. Therefore, from the perspective of God, God knows himself in an infinity of ways, while we, in our everyday existence and from our finite perspective, are just so many of these infinite ways God can both inadequately and adequately know all of reality as himself. But, does this mean that God is actually false as he knows himself inadequately through us? Yes, but only from a finite, limited, and inadequate perspective. On the other hand, while God essentially is the way we know him naturally and inadequately, he is also the adequate knowledge of our inadequate knowledge insofar as he absolutely knows all the ways he is known; or more precisely, he adequately knows himself in every way, from every perspective, he is known. God’s knowledge, therefore, is the absolutely self-reflexive epistemological model we must try to express, experience, embody, intuit, and know if we are to come to have true knowledge ourselves. In other words, we must become as epistemologically self-reflexive as God; that is, we must come to know our inadequate knowledge in the exact way or from the very perspective God adequately knows it.

To come to have adequate or true knowledge is first to come to know how our everyday, finite knowledge is just a way, a particular perspective, of having knowledge and that it is a perspective on God just like every other way of knowing. For us to have an adequately reflexive knowledge is for us to have a reflexive knowledge of God’s reflexive knowledge. That is, we must think God from his own absolutely self-reflexive, self-knowing perspective in order to have adequate knowledge, an adequate knowledge that is both of God and ourselves. For Spinoza, to have an adequate knowledge of epistemology, or adequate knowledge of the ways knowledge knows and is known, is to have an adequate epistemology of epistemology itself. Yet, we must now see how we can arrive at such knowledge. Now we must see the three main ways humans can have knowledge and how we can come to have God’s absolute knowledge of these ways from the absolute perspective he has on himself. We must see how we can shift our perspective to that of God’s absolute perspectivism. We must come to know how we can know reality sub specie aeternitatis.

3. The First Kind of Knowledge

Spinoza defines the first kind of knowledge as the lowest or most inadequate kind. It is also the natural way humans have knowledge. The first kind of knowledge is humanity’s perspective on reality. Spinoza, echoing Parmenides’ [] distinction between aletheia, or truth, and doxa, calls it opinion. The first kind of knowledge is also the only source of falsity (EIIP41).

3a. Imagination


For Spinoza, the human being is a singular thing, which means that it has a finite and determined existence (IID7). From one perspective, the human is a mind or thinking thing (IIA2). The human mind both has ideas and is itself an idea. From another perspective, the human is also an extended thing, or a finite and determined body. The human body is both composed of a great many bodies and is affected by a great many other bodies. The human mind and all its thoughts think nothing but the human body, the bodies that go to compose it, and the bodies that affect it (IIP12, 13). The human mind is the idea of the human body and it involves and expresses through all of its ideas all the bodies that compose its body and all the bodies that cause, affect, and determine it. The mind, in its naturally determined singularity, thinks nothing but its body’s affections. Affections are the states or conditions of a body’s reaction to another body’s affecting it. They are the ways both how our body reacts to being affected and how our mind thinks such reactions. From the perspective of the body, affections are usually expressions of receptivity, reactivity, passivity, and weakening on the part of the affected body. Affections are also feelings. Spinoza defines affections in terms of the physical affects, which are the ways the body becomes either stronger or weaker, or more joyful or sad (IIID3). Usually, one’s affections enslave one to a passive existence defined by a diminishing of one’s drive to persevere through forming greater and stronger compositions with other stronger bodies. From the perspective of the mind, affections are images of its affected body (and its increase or decrease in active power or freedom) and the bodies that affect it. Even though affections are things reactively received, they are also those thoughts through which the mind can posit as present the actual existence of its own affected body and all the bodies that affect it. As images, affections are still, even while passively received, essentially positive. Spinoza writes, “the affections of the human body whose ideas present external bodies as present to us, we shall call images of things…and when the mind regards bodies in this way, we shall say that it imagines” (IIP17S).

Now, for Spinoza, the human mind has knowledge of the singular existence of any body insofar as it imagines it. The problem, however, is that any knowledge based on passive affections, or images, is a partial, confused, mutilated (or fragmented), and inadequate knowledge. “Insofar as the human mind imagines an external body, it does not have an adequate knowledge of it” (IIP26C). Any idea, which is itself also an image, of an affection that is an image of an affected or affecting body inadequately expresses the true nature of such bodies. An image is inadequate, an inadequate idea, because it expresses only a confused and mutilated understanding of how a body affects another and what a body essentially is as a self-causal and affecting entity. For a body to imagine other bodies as actively, affectively, and causally determining the form of its existence is for a body to betray its own very minimal ability to be active, affective, and causal itself. Imagination is, therefore, submission to external determination. Through the imagination, a singular mind and body is defined solely by how other bodies determine its existence. The inadequacy of imagining is an expression of mental and physical weakness, for it is only a partial explanation of how bodies are essentially active and self-causally striving for an enhanced perseverance. An inadequate knowledge—a knowledge that merely posits as presently existing externally affective bodies and one’s own passively affected body—is a weak knowledge and, for Spinoza, is thus the very definition of falsity.

As long as I am merely receiving my affections and passively imagining the bodies that affect me, I express an inadequate and false knowledge of things. As long as I merely imagine bodies, I am not internally self-determining and explicitly expressive of the truly self-causal and active essence of all things and myself. Images are like the scars or traces bodies leave on me as they batter me because of my mental and physical sadness and weakness. Images are “like conclusions without premises” (IIP28D). By merely imagining bodies, I am enslaved to the common order of Nature, with its incessantly active, functioning, and self-causally moving bodies. By being so enslaved I understand Nature’s common order not in its inherently intellectual rationality, but rather as the fortuitous run of circumstance one endures through casual, vague, and random experiences (IIP40S2). It is important to emphasize, however, that the positivity implicit in false ideas cannot be the cause of their falsity, and that falsity does not involve a total privation of knowledge. Images are not non-beings devoid of all expressive content. Falsity is still an expression of the fact that all singular things exist; it is just that it is the weakest way of knowing this fact.  In other words, inadequacy is the lowest degree of actual and active knowing and existing for Spinoza. Falsity is the poorest way of knowing God or Nature, that is, the poorest way it knows itself.

Spinoza defines a few other characteristics of the falsity of the first kind of knowledge. Affections, or images, are the sensations through which singular beings think and feel their externally determined bodies. Knowledge that stems entirely from sense perception is inadequate and false. Sense perception also defines a kind of knowing that forms only fictitious ideas of things (TdIE 52-56). These fictions are uncertain ideas of what constitutes the essential and necessary existence of things. Knowledge of the first kind is also knowledge based on signs and hearsay (TdIE 19). Signs and hearsay, along with all knowledge based on memory, give us knowledge of “almost everything that is of practical use in life” (TdIE 20). The good and common sense that makes everyday experiences and relations possible involve neither the clarity and distinctness nor the internal and self-causal adequacy that the truth requires. Instead, an everyday human existence is defined by a collective opining on the part of a multitude of singular beings that do not have the rational strength to overcome their enslavement to partially expressing through fragmented and confused ideas their passivity and externally determined existence.

3b. Prejudice and Superstition


One of Spinoza’s favorite examples of falsity is the illusion of free will that is so often propagated by the mutilated imagination of human beings. It is a natural prejudice of humans to assume they have liberty. Spinoza writes, “men are deceived in that they think themselves free [i.e., they think that, of their own free will, they can either do a thing or forbear doing it], an opinion which consists only in this, that they are conscious of their actions and ignorant of the causes by which they are determined” (EIIP35S). Humans imagine they get to make choices because their knowledge is an inadequate expression of what actually determines them to do everything they do, which includes them imagining they have free will. Spinoza is a thinker of determinism and necessitarianism. Humans are necessarily determined to be prejudicial and not know why or how. It is natural law, for Spinoza, that “men are born ignorant of the causes of things” (IApp). Spinoza next notes that humans often turn their prejudicial assumption of free will into the dogma of divine choice. Humans take their imaginary freedom based on contingency and possibility and apply it to a transcendent creator of the entire universe. The human image of God is of a being with an omnipotent reservoir of choices. Because humans find such an image staggering they are terrified they may choose something (namely, a form of worship) that God either has not himself chosen or that he has deemed to be morally reprehensible. Humans thus allow their prejudicial free will to congeal into a superstitious obsession with the impenetrable and inexhaustible free will of God (IApp). All of this is grossly inadequate and false, for Spinoza, for it merely doubles the error of free will and enslaves singular beings to an almost complete irrationality.

3c. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation


Another example of falsity that Spinoza gives is an extension of prejudice and superstition. It is the religious instinct to believe in the miraculous and prophetic, both of which depend upon the imagined reception of the revelation of God’s free choices. In the case of miracles, the necessity of natural laws is broken by an ultimately unknowable divine decision (TTP, 6). Once again, humans explain away their ignorance of the causes that determine them by imagining a substantial interruption in the natural order of things. While a miracle is imagined to provide humans with what they perceive to be an advantage, an omen is the negative counterpart to a miracle, but it still expresses the same falsity. Certain types of humans take advantage, for political purposes, of the inadequacy of the prejudicial and superstitious nature of those who are susceptible to believing in miracles and omens—that is, the multitude—by declaring their own ability to receive directly the revelation of the immediate results of God’s choices and commands. These beings are prophets and priests, and prophecy for Spinoza is nothing but a clever way of exploiting and disciplining the multitude through the use of an agile and vivid imagination (TTP, 1). For Spinoza, “revelation has occurred through images alone” (TTP, 1), which means that all religions based on revelation are essentially false. Revelation is an utterly inadequate and inappropriate way of understanding God.

4. The Second Kind of Knowledge

In light of the passive and inadequate state of our everyday knowledge and existence, beset as we are by an external determination of our singular existence by all the bodies we confusedly imagine as affecting us, Spinoza aims to establish the ways in which we can overcome our falsity and weakness and come to have an adequate and active knowledge. The first step to becoming adequate for Spinoza is for one to actively and reflexively shift one’s perspective away from the imagination to that of the rational powers inherent to the intellect. This self-activation of the intellect occurs through the formation of common notions, which are concepts that express the universal properties of all things.

4a. Intellection


Spinoza never supplied a clear-cut definition of the intellect. He appears to offer three different kinds of intellects. One is simply our finite mind. Another is the immediately caused and infinite in kind modal intellect that is common to and shared by all finite intellects. And there is a third kind of intellect that is God’s absolutely infinite and indivisibly self-causal thinking of himself, or the attribute of thought itself that goes to define God’s essential existence. These three intellects are implicit in each other as they are taken from their own explicit perspectives. From the explicit perspective of the finite intellect, for example, the imagination constitutes the vast majority of one’s thoughts, even though, Spinoza argues, implicit to a finite thinking is the infinite in kind thinking of which it is a part and the indivisibly infinite thinking it truly and essentially is. In order to emend our finite intellect so that it is no longer enslaved to imagining, but instead conceives what is implicit to its thinking, Spinoza shows us how to reflect upon the very nature of our minds and find what it is about it that we know with a fair degree of certainty. By reflecting upon our imagination we cannot but notice that imagining is the way we necessarily think in our usual condition and that we, even prior to noting that we are necessarily imagining beings, also notice that we are necessarily things that think. It is through this reflection upon the natural necessity of the inadequacy of our thinking that we begin to affirm with a certain clarity and distinctness something essential about ourselves as thinking things and so shift our perspective away from only explicitly imagining. For Spinoza, it follows from the necessity of the order of Nature that human beings inadequately imagine all that affects them and thus also imagine all of what they think (EIIP36). But it is this very thought of the necessity of our being singular entities that inadequately imagine that activates the powers of our intellect. By intellectually affirming the natural necessity that we as imagining beings are determined from without and follow a natural order, we can thereby come to know and internally affirm our own essential necessity in light of this order. The activation of the finite intellect is also the self-ordering of the affections or images that usually constitute a finite mind. To intellectually order one’s affections in the way they are necessarily and naturally determined is to begin to know both the conditions for their being caused and what in fact causes them as so many modes that follow and flow from an infinite mode of God.

An active finite intellect is a mind that knows that it falsely imagines the bodies that affect it. But to know one’s falsity truly for Spinoza is for one to know the truth because the truth is the standard both of itself and falsity (IIP43S). By reflecting on such a slight enhancement of knowledge, a finite intellect can increase its activity even more by beginning to understand the necessity and natural order it now knows it follows, and now orders its affection in accordance with, as being something of which it is a part and mode. For a mind, as it begins to actively conceive of its nature as a way Nature necessarily functions and follows from itself, it can begin to use its intellective capacities to know the essence of the infinite thinking that must be common to it and that it must be a way or mode of in order to be a thinking thing at all. For a body, as it begins to actively affect and determine the bodies that were formerly affecting and determining it, it can begin to compose greater composites of other bodies with these bodies it now determines and so strengthen its own essential activity and joy. In order for both the mind and the body to do this, what is common to all singular beings must be adequately known and conceived.

4b. Common Notions

Spinoza argues that what is common to all singular things cannot constitute the essence merely of one or an indefinite amount of particular things, but rather must be “equally in the part and the whole” (IIP37) of all singular things. This is because “those things which are common to all, and which are equally in the part and in the whole, can only be conceived adequately” (IIP38). The question is then, what is common to all singular things? If the intellect is activated through an affirmation of the necessity of the natural order of determinations it is a part of, it becomes even more active if it can conceive what all intellects must constitute as the entire or whole order of thinking itself. What is common to all finite intellects is an infinite intellect of which they are all modes and parts. For a finite intellect to conceive of the whole infinite intellect that it goes to compose, and thus is a way that it modifies itself, is for it to render its thinking adequate. The adequacy of conceiving what is common to all finite thinking is an expression of truth, or clarity and distinctness, for Spinoza.

All singularly thinking things agree in certain respects. One way they all agree is that they are all determined to imagine affections. Another is the simple fact that they all think. And another is that they all modify both an infinite in kind thinking, which is the inherent unity of all thinking as it is immediately caused by God, and also an indivisibly infinite thinking, which is God’s absolute thought of himself. All intellects are modes of an infinite intellect conceivable both as an immediately caused unity of finite intellects and an indivisible identity of all intellectual activity as being one absolutely infinite and eternally self-causal thinking. Spinoza argues that the common notion of the infinite intellect—from both its infinite in kind, immediately caused and indivisibly infinite, self-causal perspectives—is “common to all men” (IIP38C), which also means that it is inherent to the finite intellects of all singular beings. Every thinking thing cannot but implicitly think what is common to it, what it shares with other thinking things, what it is a part of, what it is essentially a unity of, and what it essentially is as a way God thinks himself. The process whereby a finite intellect thinks its inherent common notions is the active becoming of its explicit expression of the truth of all thinking things. The common notion the finite intellect adequately expresses as it becomes increasing active and self-determined is the clear and distinct idea of the immediate and infinite in kind intellect it modifies by being a part of it and the attribute of thought it modifies as an indivisible way God modifies itself.

There is another common notion implicit to an activated and adequate finite intellect, and it is a conception of what is common to all singular bodies. Insofar as all thoughts are actually the bodies and affections they think because of Spinoza’s doctrine of the parallel identity of thoughts and bodies, the common notions of the infinite intellect and the attribute of thought are also clear and distinct conceptions of the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension and extension itself. It is of the nature of bodies first of all to be extended things. Secondly, it is of the nature of all extended things to indefinitely compose with and decompose each other. All bodies agree in that they are all each both parts of a larger whole and themselves wholes with parts. The fact that all bodies are alive for Spinoza leads this compositional structure of all bodies to be constantly in flux. Therefore, what is also common to all bodies, along with being extended composites, is the fact that they are all moving at different speeds. To be a singular body is to be an indefinitely composing and decomposing extended composite that speeds up or slows down (IIP13, Ep 32). Spinoza calls the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension “motion and rest.” Motion and rest is the whole or unity of all bodies conceived as one individual body that is all the degrees of compositional movement. All singular bodies are modes of motion and rest, which is itself the immediate and infinite in kind mode of the indivisibly infinite and absolutely self-modifying attribute of extension, or what Spinoza calls Nature naturing (natura naturans). Motion and rest parallels the infinite in kind intellect, and both are in essence the attributes they immediately modify and follow from, which is God’s indivisibly self-causal essence.

4c. Reason


Spinoza next needs to show us how we can conceive of these common notions through our affections. For Spinoza, we are very affected. The more we are affected the more we think, but usually imagine, what affects us. But now we know how to adequately conceive of the true nature, the essential properties, of all singular things. Through common notions we can open ourselves up to a plethora of affections without becoming enslaved to them because of our reflexive and perspectival ability to know the necessity and intellectual order of all things, that is, to know all things either as ways an infinite intellect thinks or as ways the whole of Nature compositionally moves. To be active and affirmative toward one’s affections is to use reason to understand how they determine one to exist. But reason is not merely a calm reception of affections. Through an adequate conception and utilization of the reasoning power of the common notions one can become the active cause of all of what one is affected by. The power to be affectively causal in one’s own right is reason’s ability to make us truly free. True freedom, for Spinoza, is the affirmative following of divine or natural necessity. By being rational one can control and order all of one’s affections by conceiving what it truly common to what one is affected by and thus thinks. To open oneself up to an indefinite amount of affections, and yet still rationally control one’s reactions to them, is to actually compose with all such bodies by forming a greater, stronger, and more joyful whole. Through a rational use of the implicit truth and power of the common notions inherent to the intellect one can become the very means through which the unity, and even more the absolute indivisibility, of God or Nature can be intuitively affirmed and embodied through one’s own essential existence.

5. The Third Kind of Knowledge


If the truth and adequacy of the common notions activate our intellectual capacity to rationally control our emotions and causally determine the bodies around us to enter into greater and stronger compositions, thereby liberating us into the absolute necessity of God’s natural and lawful order, then it is the intuition, the intuitive knowledge and embodiment, of this truth that will make us eternally wise and blessed. Blessedness consists in loving God with the love whereby he loves himself (VP36), and to intellectually love God not only gives us a blessed existence, it also gives us eternal joy. With the third kind of knowledge, knowledge is solely sub specie aeternitatis.

5a. Intuition

Spinoza defines the third kind of knowledge as a “kind of knowing that proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things” (IIP40S2). The second kind of knowledge supplies us with the adequate idea that all singular things must be unified into something immediately caused by God (the infinite in kind and immediate modes) and that all singular things are modes of certain attributes of God (thought and extension). With the third kind of knowledge we can know an attribute not merely through a common notion, but as the essential existence itself of God’s indivisible infinity and eternal necessity. The third kind of knowledge is the knowledge that knows the essence of each and every thing as a way that God causes himself to exist. Knowing a singular thing without the explicit mediation of knowing what it composes into or is as a part of an immediate causal order and connection, is to know it intuitively as simply being a way God eternally and infinitely exists. Intuition is intellectual knowledge taken beyond the immediacy of the infinite in kind. Intuition is more immediate than immediacy; it is affirmative identification, the absolutely self-reflexive identification and knowledge of God and his modes through oneself. Intuition is the absolute affirmation of the natural and necessary eternity of God’s attributes as essentially being the singular things he expresses of himself. Intuition is the knowledge that all things are one thing that God is, that all his attributes are the modes with which he modifies himself. We can know through the essence of singular things that the certain attributes they modify are also the indivisibility of all of God’s attributes, insofar as “no attribute of substance can be truly conceived from which it follows that substance can be divided” (IP12). Intuition is what allows us to know not merely the attributes we modify, but to know both ourselves as the attributes we modify and all the attributes themselves as being the essential existence of all things that is God. In other words, intuition allows us to know all the attributes as the ways God is one indivisible and absolutely immanent entity. Through an intuition of God’s essence one can know the infinity and eternity of one’s own mind and body. To shift one’s perspective to that of God’s is to conceive of the eternal aspect of all things and to intuitively see oneself through God’s absolute perfection and power.

5b. Love and Blessedness


For Spinoza, to intuit God is to love God. The intuition of God is the intellectual love of his essential existence, with love being that power of intuition that makes intellection (the exercise of the intellect) more immediate than the immediacy known through the common notions of the second kind of knowledge. Love is defined, on the one hand, as “joy with the accompanying idea of an external cause” (IIIP13S), but, on the other hand, with the intellectual love of God the idea of the cause of such joy is more an internal cause than an external one because through the third kind of knowledge one knows absolutely that God constitutes one’s own essential existence. In a finite sense, joy is an increase in perfection, but the joy involved in the intellectual love of God is almost an identification of one’s love with God’s very absolute perfection, or infinite self-love. God’s absolute self-love is his indivisibly infinite and eternal self-causal power to essentially exist as all things. The third kind of knowledge, intuitive knowledge, loves this self-love in the way that it loves itself. The intellectual love of God is the absolute knowledge of all the ways one can know God and all the ways God knows himself as an infinity of ways he conceives and loves his own truth for all eternity. It is with the aid of the affective power of reason that our liberation into true necessity is affirmed even more intensely as we come to embody the freedom to conceive of the universe from its own eternally living and infinitely natural perspective of absolute perfection, power, and reality.

The third kind of knowledge endows us with a kind of immortality. It is not that we exist in our perceived or imagined finite form for all eternity, because all finite bodies and the ideas and affections of them decompose, but that we exist eternally by shifting our perspective and our knowledge to that of the infinity and eternity of God’s indivisibly physical self-conception and self-knowledge (VP29). Spinoza writes, “Insofar as our mind knows itself and the body under a species of eternity, it necessarily has knowledge of God, and knows that it is in God and is conceived through God” (VP30). To intuit God through an intellectual love of his essential existence, and thereby conceive all things from his eternal perspective, is to render our adequate knowledge and rational freedom truly divine. Blessedness is the virtue, rarity, excellence, and power of our absolute knowledge of God’s absolute knowledge. Absolute knowledge is thus divine wisdom.

6. References and Further Reading

All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I – V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). For example, (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. For example, (TdIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.

  • Curley, Edwin, “Experience in Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 25-59.
  • Curley, Edwin, Filippo Magnini, and W. N. A Klever (eds). Spinoza’s Epistemology, vol.2 of Studia Spinozana. (Hanover: Walther & Walther Verlag, 1986).
  • De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Spinoza: Practical Philosophy. (San Francisco: City Lights Books, 1988).
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
  • Floistad, Guttorm, “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge in the Ethics” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 101-127.
  • Garret, Don, “Spinoza,” in A Companion to Epistemology, ed. Ernest Sosa and Jonathan Dancy, (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1992), 488-490.
  • Garrett, Don, “Representation and Consciousness in Spinoza’s Naturalistic Theory of the Imagination” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 4-25.
  • Huenemann, Charlie, “Epistemic Autonomy in Spinoza,” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 94-110.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, Part of Nature: Self-Knowledge in Spinoza’s Ethics. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994).
  • Mark, Thomas Carson. Spinoza’s Theory of Truth. (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., “Language and Knowledge in Spinoza” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 73-100.
  • Wilson, Margaret D., “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, ed. Don Garrett, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), 89-141.

Author Information

Nels Dockstader
The University of Western Ontario