Spinoza: Free Will and Freedom
Baruch Spinoza (1632-1677) was a Dutch Jewish rationalist philosopher who is most famous for his Ethics and Theological-Political Treatise. Although influenced by Stoicism, Maimonides, Machiavelli, Descartes, and Hobbes, among others, he developed distinct and innovative positions on a number of issues in metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, politics, biblical hermeneutics, and theology. He is also known as a pivotal figure in the development of Enlightenment thinking. Some of his most notorious claims and most radical views surround issues concerning determinism and free will. Spinoza was an adamant determinist, and he denied the existence of free will. This led to much controversy concerning his philosophy in subsequent centuries. He was, in fact, one of the first modern philosophers to both defend determinism and deny free will. Nevertheless, his philosophy champions freedom, both ethically and politically. It provides an ethics without free will but one that leads to freedom, virtue, and happiness. Prima facie, such an ethical project might seem paradoxical, but Spinoza distinguished between free will, which is an illusion, and freedom, which can be achieved. A thorough familiarity with Spinoza’s views on determinism, free will, freedom, and moral responsibility resolves this apparent paradox of an ethics without free will.
Table of Contents
- Spinoza’s Determinism
- Spinoza on Free Will
- Spinoza on Human Freedom
- The Free Man and the Way to Freedom
- Spinoza on Moral Responsibility
- References and Further Reading
1. Spinoza’s Determinism
Contrary to many of his predecessors and contemporaries, Spinoza is an adamant and notorious determinist. For him, nature is thoroughly determined. While there are many different varieties of determinism, Spinoza is committed to causal determinism, or what is sometimes called nomological determinism. Some commentators argue that Spinoza is also a necessitarian or that he holds that the actual world is the only one possible (see IP33); (for an overview, see Garrett 1991). In any case, as a causal determinist, Spinoza certainly argues that events are determined by previous events or causes (which are further determined by previous past events or causes, and so on) following the laws of nature. Spinoza clearly expresses that all events are determined by previous causes:
Every singular thing, or anything which is finite and has a determinate existence, can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another cause, which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again, this cause can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another, which is also finite and has a determinate existence, and so on, to infinity. (IP28)
Here, Spinoza is arguing for an infinite chain of finite causes for any given effect, or, as he puts it, any singular thing which exists. Spinoza demonstrates the above proposition in his (in)famous geometrical method, which requires starting with definitions and axioms, demonstrating propositions from them, and building upon previous demonstrations. His commitment to causal determinism is already displayed in Axiom 3 of Part I: “From a given determinate cause, the effect follows necessarily; and conversely, if there is no determinate cause, it is impossible for an effect to follow.” Surprisingly, Spinoza uses only this axiom to demonstrate the previous proposition, IP27 “a thing which has been determined by God to produce an effect cannot render itself undetermined.” His demonstrations refer to Axiom 3: “This proposition is evident from A3.” So, it is clear that Spinoza thinks that every effect has a cause, but why he holds this view is not yet clear.
To understand why Spinoza is committed to causal determinism, requires an examination of his larger philosophical commitments. First, Spinoza is a rationalist, and as a rationalist, he holds that everything is, in principle, explainable or intelligible. This is to say that everything that exists and everything that occurs have a reason to be or to happen, and that this reason can be known and understood. This is known as the principle of sufficient reason, after Leibniz’s formulation. Secondly, Spinoza is committed to naturalism, at least a kind of naturalism that argues that there are no explanations or causes outside of nature. This is to say, there are no super-natural causes, and all events can be explained naturally with respect to nature and its laws. Spinoza’s rationalism and naturalism are in evidence when he argues for the necessary existence of the one infinite substance (IP11), God or Nature (Deus sive Natura), which is the immanent (IP18) and efficient cause (IP25) of all things.
The existence of everything cannot be a brute fact for Spinoza, nor does it make sense to him to postpone the reason for existence by referring to a personal God as the creator of all. Rather, he argues that the one substance (“God” or “Nature” in Spinoza’s terminology, but in the following just “God” with the caveat that Nature is implied) is the cause of itself and necessarily exists. “God, or a substance consisting of infinite attributes, each of which expresses eternal and infinite essence, necessarily exists” (IP11). In his alternate demonstration for this proposition, he explicitly uses the principle of sufficient reason: “for each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence” (417). The one substance, or God, is the cause of itself, or, as he defines it “that whose essence involves existence, or that whose nature cannot be conceived except as existing” (ID1).
This necessary existence of God entails the necessity by which every individual thing is determined. This is because Spinoza is committed to substance monism, or the position that there is only one substance. This is markedly different from his rationalist predecessor, Descartes, who, though also arguing that only God is properly speaking an independent substance (Principles I, 51), held that there were indefinitely many substances of two kinds: bodies, or res extensa, and thoughts, or res cogitantes (Principles I, 52). Spinoza, though, defines God as one substance consisting of infinite attributes. An attribute is “what the intellect perceives of a substance as constituting its essence” (ID4). By “infinite” here, Spinoza refers primarily to a totality rather than a numerical infinity, so that the one substance has all possible attributes. Spinoza goes on to indicate that the human intellect knows two attributes, namely extension and thought (IIA5). Besides the one substance and its attributes, Spinoza’s ontology includes what he calls modes. Modes are defined as “affections of a substance or that which is in another thing through which it is also conceived” (ID5). Furthermore, Spinoza distinguishes between infinite modes (IP23) and finite modes, the latter generally taken to be all the singular finite things, such as apples, books, or dogs, as well as ideas of these things, thus also the human body and its mind.
There is much scholarly controversy about the question of how substance, attributes, and infinite and finite modes all relate to each other. Of particular contention is the relation between the finite modes and the one infinite substance. A more traditional interpretation of Spinoza’s substance monism takes finite modes to be parts of God, such that they are properties which inhere in the one substance, with the implication of some variety of pantheism, or the doctrine that everything is God. Edwin Curley, however, influentially argues that finite modes should be taken merely as causally and logically dependent on the one infinite substance, that is, God, which itself is causally independent, following Spinoza’s argument of substance as cause of itself or involving necessary existence (IP1-IP11). According to this interpretation, God is identified with its attributes (extension and thought) as the most general structural features of the universe with infinite modes, following necessarily from the attributes and expressing the necessary general laws of nature (for instance, Spinoza identifies the immediate infinite mode of the attribute of extension with motion and rest in Letter 64, 439). On this causal-nomological interpretation of substance, God is the cause of all things but should only be identified with the most general features of the universe rather than with everything existing, for instance the finite modes (Curley 1969, esp. 44-81).
There is, however, resistance to this causal interpretation of the relation between substance and finite modes (see Bennett 1984, 92-110; 1991; Nadler 2008). Jonathan Bennet argues against Curley’s interpretation—returning to the more traditional relation of modes as properties that inhere in a substance—by taking Spinoza’s proposition IP15 more literally: “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be, or be conceived without God.” Bennett identifies the finite modes as ways in which the attributes are expressed adjectively (that is, this region of extension is muddy), keeping closer to Spinoza’s use of “mode” as “affections of God’s attributes… by which God’s attributes are expressed in a specific and determinate way” (IP25C). But as Curley points out, Bennett’s interpretation has some difficulty explaining the precise relation of finite modes to infinite modes and attributes, the latter having an immediate causal relation to God (Curley 1991, 49). Leaving aside the larger interpretive controversies, the issue here is that God and its attributes, being infinite and eternal, cannot be the direct or proximate cause of finite modes, though God is the cause of everything, including finite modes. Spinoza writes “From the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many modes (that is, everything that can fall under an infinite intellect)” (IP16). For this reason, Spinoza’s argument for determinism seems to recognize an infinite chain of finite causes and a finite chain of infinite causes. The former has already been referred to when Spinoza argues in IP28 that any particular finite thing is determined to exist or produce an effect by another finite cause “and so on, ad infinitum.” Indeed, in his demonstration, Spinoza states that God, being infinite and eternal, could not be the proximate cause of finite things. Further, in the Scholium to this proposition, Spinoza explains that God is the proximate cause of only those things produced immediately by him, which in turn are infinite and eternal (eternal here indicating necessity as in IP10S, 416). That is, Spinoza does indeed argue that that which follows from the absolute nature of any of God’s attributes must be likewise infinite and eternal in IP21-P23.
Some commentators interpret God as being the proximate cause (through its attributes) of the infinite modes, which are understood as part of the finite chain of infinite causes associated with the most basic laws of nature. While Spinoza does not write directly of the “laws of nature” in this discussion in the Ethics, he does so in the Theological Political Treatise (TTP) in his discussion of miracles. Here Spinoza argues that nothing happens outside of the universal laws of nature, which for him are the same as God’s will and decree. Spinoza writes “But since nothing is necessarily true except by the divine decree alone, it follows quite clearly that the universal laws of nature are nothing but decrees of God, which follow from the necessity and perfection of the divine nature” (TTP VI.9). He goes on to argue that if a miracle were conceived as an occurrence contrary to the universal laws of nature, it would be contradictory in itself and mean that God was acting contrary to his own nature. From this passage, it is clear that Spinoza equates what follows from God’s nature with the universal laws of nature, which are eternal and immutable. For this reason, God’s attributes and the infinite modes are often identified with the most general feature of the universe, expressing the laws of nature.
We tend to use “laws of nature” when referring to physical laws. Spinoza, however, holds that God can be understood under the attribute of extension or the attribute of thought, that is, God is both extended (IIP2) and thinking (IIP1). For this reason, laws of nature exist not only in the attribute of extension but also in that of thought. Bodies and ideas both follow the laws of nature. Bodies are finite modes of extension, while ideas are finite modes of thought. Accordingly, he argues that “the order and connection of ideas are the same as the order and connection of things” (IIP7). This is Spinoza’s famous “parallelism,” though he never uses this term. While there is much controversy concerning how to interpret this identity, Spinoza indicates that the extended thing and the thinking thing are one and the same thing expressed under two different attributes or conceived from two different perspectives (IIP7S). For this reason, a body, or an extended mode, and its correlating idea, or a thinking mode, are one and the same thing conceived from different perspectives, namely through the attributes of extension or thought.
This claim has two significant consequences. First, when Spinoza indicates that each singular finite thing is determined to exist and to produce an effect by another singular finite thing ad infinitum, this applies to ideas as well as bodies. For this reason, just as bodies and their motion or rest are the cause of other bodies and their motion or rest—in accordance with universal laws of nature, namely the laws of physics—ideas are the cause of other ideas (IIP9) in accordance with universal laws of nature, presumably psychological laws. Second, being one and the same thing, bodies and ideas do not interact causally. That is to say, the order and connection of ideas are one and the same as the order and connection of bodies, but ideas cannot bring about the motion or rest of bodies, nor can bodies bring about the thinking of ideas. Spinoza writes “The body cannot determine the mind to thinking, and the mind cannot determine the body to motion, to rest, or to anything else if there is anything else” (IIIP2). It is clear, then, that both bodies and ideas are causally determined within their respective attributes and that there is no interaction between them. This will have a significant consequence for Spinoza’s understandings of free will versus freedom.
Spinoza’s most challenging consequence from these positions is his blunt denial of contingency in IP29, where he states: “In nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way.” To recall, finite modes of the one infinite substance (in the case of the attributes of extension or thought, bodies and ideas) are determined to exist by a finite cause (that is, another body or idea), which is further determined to exist by another cause, and so on to infinity. Furthermore, though the connection between singular things and God (conceived as the one eternal, infinite substance) is complex, ultimately, God is the cause of everything that exists, and everything is determined according to the universal and necessary laws of nature expressed by the infinite modes and the other fundamental features of the attributes of God, as mentioned above. In other words, for Spinoza, every event is necessitated by previous causes and the laws of nature.
2. Spinoza on Free Will
Because he is a determinist, Spinoza denies the existence of free will. This would make him, in contemporary discussions of free will, an incompatibilist as well as a determinist. In contemporary discussions of free will, the major concern centers mostly on the question of whether free will and thereby moral responsibility are compatible with determinism. There are two dominant solutions to this problem. Incompatibilism claims that free will and/or moral responsibility are incompatible with determinism because the latter prohibits free choice and thus accountability. Some incompatibilists, namely libertarians, even claim that—because human beings do have free will and we hold each other accountable for our actions—the world is not thoroughly determined. Other incompatibilists argue that if the world is determined, then free will is not compatible, but may be agnostic about whether the world is determined. The opposite camp of compatibilism claims that free will and/or moral responsibility are compatible with determinism, though they can also be agnostic about whether the world is determined.
Spinoza’s position cannot easily be sorted into this scheme because he distinguishes between free will (libera voluntas) and freedom (libertas). It is very clear that he denies free will because of his determinism: “In the mind there is no absolute, or free, will, but the mind is determined to will this or that by a cause which is also determined by another, and this again by another, and so to infinity” (IIP48). It is also, however, a consequence of Spinoza’s conception of the will. In the Scholium to IIP48, Spinoza explains that by “will” he means “a faculty of affirming or denying and not desire” (IIP48S, 484). That is to say, Spinoza, here, wants to emphasize will as a cognitive power rather than a conative one. In this respect, he seems to be following Descartes, who also understands the will as a faculty of affirming and denying, which, coupled with the understanding, produces judgements. However, Spinoza quickly qualifies against Descartes that the will is not, in fact, a faculty at all, but a universal notion abstracted from singular volitions: “we have demonstrated that these faculties are universal notions which are distinguished from the singulars from which we form them” (IIP48S, 484). Spinoza is here referring to his earlier explanation in the Ethics of the origin of “those notions called universals, like man, horse, dog, and the like” (IIP40S, 477). For Spinoza, these universal notions are imaginary or fictions that are formed “because so many images are formed at one time in the human body that they surpass the power of imagining.” The resulting universal notion combines what all of the singulars agree on and ignores distinctions.
Spinoza is making two bold and related claims here. First, there is no real faculty of will, that is a faculty of affirming and denying. Rather, the will is a created fiction, a universal that adds to the illusion of free will. Second, the will is simply constituted by the individual volitions—our affirmations and denials—and these volitions are simply the very ideas themselves. For this reason, Spinoza claims that the will is the same as the intellect (or mind) (IIP49C). Therefore, it is not an ability to choose this or that as in the traditional understanding, and certainly not an ability to choose between alternative courses of action arbitrarily. It is not even an ability to affirm or deny, as Descartes claimed. Descartes, in explaining error in judgment, distinguishes the intellect from the will. Thus, with his claim that the will is the same as the intellect, Spinoza is directly criticizing the Cartesian view of free will. We will return to this criticism after examining Spinoza’s view of the human mind.
For Spinoza, the human mind is the idea of an actually existing singular thing (IIP11), namely the body (IIP13). So, for instance, my mind is the idea of my body. As mentioned above, Spinoza holds that the order and connection of ideas are the same as the order and connection of things (IIIP7) insofar as God is understood through both the attribute of extension and the attribute of thought. This entails that for every body, there is an idea that has that body as its object, and this idea is one and the same as that body, although conceived under a different attribute. On the other hand, Spinoza also characterizes the human mind as a part of the infinite intellect of God (IIP11C) understood as the totality of ideas. For this reason, Spinoza explains that when the human mind perceives something, God has this idea “not insofar as he is infinite, but insofar as he is explained through the nature of the human mind, or insofar as he constitutes the essence of the human mind,” that is, as an affection or finite mode of the attribute of thought.
While Spinoza says the mind is the idea of the body, he also recognizes that the human body is considered an individual composed of multiple other bodies that form an individual body by the preservation of the ratio of motion and rest (II Physical Interlude, P1 and L5). Accordingly, every body that composes the individual’s body also has a correlative idea. Therefore, the mind is made up of a multitude of ideas just as the body is made up of a multitude of bodies (IIP15). Furthermore, when the human body interacts with the other bodies external to it, or has what Spinoza calls affections, ideas of these affections (the affections caused by external bodies in the individual human body) become part of the mind and the mind regards the external body as present (IIP16 and IIP17). These ideas of the affections, however, involve both the nature of the human body and that of the external body. Spinoza calls these “affections of the human body whose ideas present external bodies as present to us” images. He continues that “when the mind regards bodies in this way, we shall say that it imagines” (IIP17S, 465). Note here that Spinoza avers that images are the affections of the body caused by other bodies, and although they do not always “reproduce the figures of things”, he calls having the ideas of these affections of the body imagining.
As we can see, for Spinoza, the mind is a composite idea that is composed of ideas of the body and ideas of the body’s affections, which involve both the human body and the external body (and ideas of these ideas as well (IIP20)). Without these ideas of the affections of our body “the human mind does not know the human body, nor does it know that it exists, except through ideas of the affections by which the body is affected” (IIP19). At the same time, Spinoza explains that whenever the human mind perceives something, God has the idea of this thing together with the human mind (IIP11C); but God has the idea which constitutes the human mind only “insofar as he is considered to be affected by the idea of another singular thing” (IIP19D). That is, on the one hand, as explained in IP28, finite singular things come into existence or produce an effect by other finite singular things, on the other hand though, to the extent that all things are modes of the one substance, each effect is at the same time caused by God. Though most of our knowledge of the body and the external world comes from ideas of fections, Spinoza claims that these ideas of the body and its affections are for the most part inadequate, that is, incomplete, partial, or mutilated, and therefore not clear and distinct. Spinoza writes “Insofar as he [God] also has the idea of another thing together with the human mind, we say that the human mind perceives the thing only partially, or inadequately” (IIP11C).
Spinoza argues that for the most part we only have inadequate knowledge (cognitio) of the state of our body, of external bodies that affect our body, and of our own mind (as ideas of ideas of our body) (IIP26C, IIP27, and IIP28). Our knowledge concerning our body and its affections and the external bodies affecting our body and our own mind is, therefore, limited in its distinctness. While it is not always entirely clear what Spinoza means by inadequate knowledge or an inadequate idea, he defines an adequate idea as “an idea which, insofar as it is considered in itself, without relation to an object, has all the denomination of a true idea” (IID4). Avoiding the epistemic problems of a correspondence theory of truth, Spinoza argues we can form adequate ideas insofar as “every idea which in us is absolute, or adequate and perfect, is true” (IIP34). An inadequate idea is an incomplete, partial, or mutilated idea, and Spinoza argues that “falsity consists in the privation of knowledge which inadequate, or mutilate and confused, ideas involve” (IIP35).
Returning to Spinoza’s claim that the will is the same as the intellect, the mind is just constituted by all the individual ideas. To say that the will is the same as the intellect means that, for Spinoza, the will as the sum of individual volitions is just the sum of these individual ideas which compose the mind. What Spinoza has in mind is that our ideas, which constitute our mind, already involve affirmations and negations. There is no special faculty needed. To give a simple example, while sitting in a café, I see my friend walk in, order a coffee, and sit down. Perceiving all this is to say that my mind has ideas of the affections of my body caused by external bodies (which is also to say that there is in God the idea of my mind together with the ideas of other things). All these ideas are inadequate, incomplete, or partial. Because I perceive my friend, the idea of the affection of my body affirms that she is present in the café, drinking coffee, sitting over yonder. I am not choosing to affirm these ideas, according to Spinoza, but the very ideas already involve affirmations. As I am distracted by other concerns, such as reading a book, these ideas continue to involve the affirmation of her being present in the café, regardless of whether that fact is true or not. If I look up and see her again, this new idea reaffirms her presence. But if I look up and she has gone, the new idea negates the previous idea.
Spinoza seems to hold that ideas involve beliefs. This is what Spinoza means when he says that the ideas themselves involve affirmations and negations. Rather than the will choosing to assent or deny things, the will is only the individual volitions that are in fact the individual ideas, which always already involve affirmation and/or negation. To be sure, even knowledge as simple as my friend’s presence will involve a complex of indefinite affirmations and negations, everything from the general laws of nature to mundane facts about daily life. A consequence of ideas as involving affirmation and negation is that error does not result from affirming judgments that are false but rather is a consequence of inadequate knowledge (IIP49SI, 485). Unfortunately, most of our ideas are inadequate. In the above example, it can easily be the case that I continue to have the idea of my friend’s presence when she is no longer in the café, because I will have this idea as long as no other idea negates it (IIP17C).
For Spinoza, therefore, the will is not free and is the same as the intellect. He is aware that this is a strange teaching, explicitly pointing out that most people do not recognize its truth. The reason for this failure to recognize the doctrine that the will is not free can, however, be understood both as an epistemic and a global confusion. Epistemically, most people do not understand that an idea involves an affirmation or negation, but they believe the will is free to affirm or deny ideas. According to Spinoza, “because many people either completely confuse these three – ideas, images, and words – or do not distinguish them accurately, or carefully enough, they have been completely ignorant of this doctrine concerning the will” (IIP49SII, 485-86). First, some people confuse ideas with images “which are formed in us from encounters with bodies.” Images, for Spinoza, are physical and extended, and are, therefore, not ideas. But these people take the ideas to be formed by the direct relation between the mind and body. This has two results: a) ideas of things of which no image can be formed are taken to be “only fictions which we feign from free choice of the will”. In other words, some ideas are not understood as ideas (which involve affirmation and negation) caused by other ideas but as choices of the free will; b) these people “look on ideas, therefore, as mute pictures on a panel,” which do not involve affirmation or negation but are affirmed and denied by the will. Second, some people confuse words with ideas or with the affirmation involved in the ideas. Here they confuse affirmations and negations with willfully affirming or denying in words. Spinoza points out that they cannot affirm or deny something contrary to what the very idea in the mind affirms or negates. They can only affirm or deny in words what is contrary to an idea. In the above example, I can deny in words that my friend is in the café, but these words will not be a negation of the idea which I had while perceiving her as being in the café. For Spinoza, images and words are both extended things and not ideas. This confusion, however, has hindered people from realizing that ideas in themselves already involve affirmations and negations.
Spinoza further explains these confusions and defends his view against possible objections. It is here that Spinoza launches his attack on the Cartesian defense of free will and its involvement in error. Before turning to these possible objections and Spinoza’s replies, a brief overview of Descartes’ view of the will is helpful. In Meditations 4, Descartes explains error through the different scopes of the intellect and the will. The former is limited since we only have limited knowledge, that is, clear and distinct ideas, while our will possibly extends to everything in application, and is thus infinite. Descartes writes, “This is because the will simply consists in our ability to do or not do something (that is, to affirm or deny, to pursue or avoid), or rather, it consists simply in the fact that when the intellect puts something forward for affirmation or denial, for pursuit or avoidance, our inclinations are such that we do not feel we are determined by any external force” (57). Descartes continues, however, that freedom of the will does not consist in indifference. The more the will is inclined toward the truth and goodness of what the intellect presents to it, the freer it is. Descartes’ remedy against error is the suspension of judgment whenever the intellect cannot perceive the truth or goodness clearly and distinctly. Descartes, therefore, understands the will as a faculty of choice, which can affirm or deny freely to make judgments upon ideas presented by the intellect. Though the will is freer when it is based on clear and distinct ideas, it still has an absolute power of free choice in its ability to affirm or deny.
Turning to the possible objections to Spinoza’s view of the will brought up in II49S, the first common objection concerns the alleged different scope of the intellect and the will. Spinoza disagrees that the “faculty of the will” has a greater scope than the “faculty of perception”. Spinoza argues that this only seems to be the case because: 1) if the intellect is taken to only involve clear and distinct ideas, then it will necessarily be more limited; and 2) the “faculty of the will” is itself a universal notion “by which we explain all the singular volitions, that is, it is what is common to them all” (488). Under this view of the will, the power of assenting seems infinite because it employs a universal idea of affirmation that seems applicable to everything. Nevertheless, this view of the will is a fiction. Against the second common objection, that we know from experience that we can suspend judgment, Spinoza denies that we have the power to do so. What actually happens when we seem to hold back our judgment is nothing but an awareness that we lack adequate ideas. Therefore, suspension of judgment is nothing more than perception and not an act of free volition. Spinoza provides examples to illustrate his argument, among them that of a child who imagines a winged horse. The child will not doubt the existence of the winged horse, like an adult who has ideas that exclude the existence of winged horses, until he learns the inadequacy of such an idea. Spinoza is careful to note that perceptions themselves are not deceptive. But they do already involve affirmation independently of their adequacy. For this reason, if nothing negates the affirmation of a perception, the perceiver necessarily affirms the existence of what is perceived.
The third objection is that, since it seems that it is equally possible to affirm something which is true as to affirm something which is false, the affirmation cannot spring from knowledge but from the will. Therefore, the will must be distinct from the intellect. In reply to this, Spinoza reminds us that the will is something universal, which is ascribed to all ideas because all ideas affirm something. As soon as we turn to particular cases, the affirmation involved in the ideas is different. Moreover, Spinoza “denies absolutely” that we need the same power of thinking to affirm something as true which is true as we would need in the case of affirming something as true which is false. An adequate or true idea is perfect and has more reality than an inadequate idea, and therefore the affirmation involved in an adequate idea is different from that of an inadequate idea. Finally, the fourth objection refers to the famous Buridan’s ass, who is caught equidistantly from two piles of feed. A human in such an equilibrium, if it had no free will, would necessarily die. Spinoza, rather humorously, responds, “I say that I grant entirely that a man placed in such an equilibrium (namely, who perceives nothing but thirst and hunger and such food and drink as are equally distant from him) will perish of hunger and thirst. If they ask me whether such a man should be thought an ass rather than a man, I say that I do not know – just as I also do not know how highly we should esteem one who hangs himself, or children, fools, and madmen, and so on” (II49S, 490).
Besides answering the common objections to his identification of the will with the intellect, Spinoza also provides an explanation for the necessary origin of our illusionary belief that the will is free (see Melamed 2017). Spinoza alludes to this illusion a number of times. In the Ethics, it first occurs in the Appendix to Part 1 when he argues against natural teleology. He writes that,
All men are born ignorant of the causes of things, and that they all want to seek their own advantage and are conscious of this appetite. From these it follows, first, that men think themselves free, because they are conscious of their volitions and their appetites, and do not even think in their dreams, of the causes by which they are disposed to wanting and willing because they are ignorant of those causes. (440)
That is, because human beings are 1) ignorant of the causes of their volitions but 2) conscious of their desires, they necessarily believe themselves to be free. Hence, free will is an illusion born of ignorance. In a correspondence with Shuller, Spinoza provides a vivid image of the illusion of free will, writing that a stone, when put into motion, if it could judge, would believe itself free to move, though it is determined by external forces. This is exactly the same for human beings’ belief in free will. Spinoza even writes that “because this prejudice is innate in all men, they are not so easily freed from it” (Letter 58, 428).
Spinoza has another extensive discussion of free will as a result of ignorance in the scholium of IIIP2 in the Ethics. The proposition states “I body cannot determine the mind to thinking, and the mind cannot determine the body to motion, to rest, or anything else (if there is anything else)” (IIIP2). Spinoza’s parallelism holds that the mind and the body are one and the same thing conceived through different attributes, so there is no intra—attribute causality. The order and connection of ideas are the same as the order and connection of bodies, but it is not possible to explain the movement of bodies in terms of the attribute of thought, nor is it possible to explain the thinking of ideas through the attribute of extension. Spinoza is well aware that this will be unacceptable to most people who believe their will is free and that it is the mind which causes the body to move: They are so firmly persuaded that the body now moves, now is at rest, solely from the mind’s command, and that it does a great many things which depend only on the mind’s will and its art of thinking” (IIIP2S, 494-95).
Against this prejudice, Spinoza defends his position by pointing out 1) that human beings are so far quite ignorant of the mechanics of the human body and its workings (for instance, the brain) and 2) that human beings cannot explain how the mind can interact with the body. He further elucidates these points by responding to two objections taken from experience.
But they will say [i] that – whether or not they know by what means the mind moves the body – they still know by experience that unless the human mind were capable of thinking, the body would be inactive. And then [ii], they know by experience, that it is in the mind’s power alone both to speak and to be silent, and to do many other things, which they therefore believe to depend on the mind’s decision. (495)
In response to the first objection, Spinoza argues that while it is true that the body cannot move if the mind is not thinking, the contrary, that the mind cannot think if the body is inactive, is equally true, for they are, after all, one and the same thing conceived through different attributes. Against the great disbelief, though, that “the causes of buildings, of painting, and of things of this kind, which are made only of human skill, should be able to be deduced from the laws of Nature alone, insofar as it is considered corporeal” (496), Spinoza responds by reaffirming that humans are not yet aware of what the human body can do according to its own laws. He gives an interesting example of sleepwalkers doing all kinds of actions, none of which they recall when they are awake.
Concerning the second objection that humans apparently speak (a physical action) from the free power of the mind being an indication that the mind controls the body, Spinoza states that humans have just as much control over their words as over their appetites. He points out that they can hold their tongue only in cases of a weak inclination to speak, just as they can resist indulgence in a weak inclination to certain pleasures. But when it comes to stronger inclinations, humans often suffer from akrasia, or weakness of will. Again, they believe themselves to be free when, in fact, they are driven by causes they do not know. He points to:
[The infant believing] he freely wants the milk; the angry child that he wants vengeance; and the timid, flight. So, the drunk believes it is from a free decision of the mind that he speaks the things he later, when sober, wishes he had not said. So, the madman, the chatterbox, the child, and great many people of this kind believe they speak from a free decision of the mind, when really they cannot contain their impulse to speak. (496)
Here again, Spinoza argues that humans believe themselves free because they are conscious of their own desires but ignorant of the causes of them. Discussing the will with the body, he then states that, as bodies and minds are identical, decisions of the mind are the same as appetites and determinations of the body, understood under different attributes.
Finally, Spinoza points out that humans could not even speak unless they recollected words, though recollecting or forgetting itself is not at will, that is, by the free power of the mind. So it must be that the power of the mind consists only in deciding to speak or not to speak. However, Spinoza counters that often humans dream they are speaking and in their dreams believe that they do this freely, but they are not in fact speaking. In general, when humans are dreaming, they believe they are freely making many decisions, but in fact they are doing nothing. Spinoza asks pointedly:
So, I should very much like to know whether there are in the mind two kinds of decisions – those belonging to our fantasies and those that are free? And if we do not want to go that far in our madness, it must be granted that this decision of the mind, which is believed to be free, is not distinguished from the imagination itself, or the memory, nor is it anything beyond that affirmation which is the idea, insofar as it is an idea, necessarily involves. And so the decisions of the mind arise by the same necessity as the idea of things which actually exist. Those, therefore, who believe that they speak or are silent or do anything from a free decision of the mind, dream with open eyes. (497)
One final point concerning the illusion of free will: Spinoza uses belief in free will as one of his examples of error in IIP35S. IIP35 states that “falsity consists in the privation of knowledge which inadequate, or mutilated and confused ideas, involve.” In the Scholium, he reiterates the now familiar cause of the belief in free will, namely, that humans are conscious of their volitions but ignorant of the causes which determine their volitions. However, Spinoza here is not just claiming that we have an inadequate knowledge of the causes of our volitions leading us to err in thinking the will is free. He makes the stronger claim that because our knowledge of the will is inadequate, we cannot help but imagine that our will is free, that is, we cannot help but experience our will as free in some way, even if we know that it is not.
This can be seen from the second example of error that he uses. When looking at the sun, we imagine that it is rather close. But, Spinoza argues, the problem is not just the error of thinking of a much smaller distance than it is. The problem is that we imagine (that is, we have an idea of the affectation of our body affected by the sun) or experience the sun as being two hundred feet away regardless of whether we adequately know the true distance. Even knowing the sun’s true distance from our body, we will always experience it as being about two hundred feet away. Similarly, even if we adequately understand that our will is not free but that each of our volitions is determined, we will still experience it as free. The reason for this is explained in IIP48S, where Spinoza argues that the will, understood as an absolute faculty, is a “complete fiction or metaphysical being, or universal” which we form, however, necessarily. As mentioned above, universals are formed when—the body overloaded with images through affections—the power of imagining is surpassed, and a notion formed by focusing on similarities and ignoring a great many of the differences between its ideas. Spinoza’s point here in emphasizing the inevitability of error due to the prevalence of imagination and the limited scope of our reason is that humans cannot escape the illusion of free will.
3. Spinoza on Human Freedom
While Spinoza denies that the will is free, he does consider human freedom (libertas humana) as possible. Given the caveat just described, this freedom must be understood as limited. For Spinoza, freedom is the end of human striving. He often equates freedom with virtue, happiness, and blessedness (beatitudo), the more familiar end of human activity (for an overview, see Youpta 2010). Spinoza does not understand freedom as a capacity for choice, that is, as liberum arbitrium (free choice), but rather as consisting in acting as opposed to being acted upon. For Spinoza, freedom is ultimately constituted by activity. In Part I of the Ethics, Spinoza defines, “that thing is called free which exists from the necessity of its nature alone, and is determined to act by itself alone. But a thing is called necessary, or rather compelled, which is determined by another thing to exist and produce an effect in a certain and determinant manner” (ID7). According to this definition, only God, properly speaking, is absolutely free, because only God exists from the necessity of his nature and is determined to act from his nature alone (IP17 and IP17C2). Nevertheless, Spinoza argues that freedom is possible for human beings insofar as they act: “I say we act when something happens, in us or outside of us, of which we are the adequate cause, that is, (by D1), when something in us or outside of us follows from our nature, which can be clearly and distinctly understood through it alone” (IIID2). IIID1 gives the definition of adequate cause: “I call that cause adequate whose effect can be clearly and distinctly perceived through it.” From these definitions, we can see that if human freedom is constituted by activity, then freedom will be constituted by having clear and distinct ideas or adequate knowledge.
Above, it was seen that for Spinoza, will and intellect are one and the same. The will is nothing but singular volitions, which are ideas. These ideas already involve affirmation and negation (commonly ascribed to the faculty of will). In Part II, when arguing against the Cartesian view of the will, Spinoza emphasizes the will as a supposed “faculty of affirming and denying” in order to dispel the universal notion of a free will. In Part III, in his discussion of affects, he provides a fuller description of the will and the affective nature of ideas, providing the tools for his discussion of human freedom. By “affect,” Spinoza understands “the affections of the body by which the body’s power of acting is increased or diminished, aided and restrained, and at the same time, the ideas of these affections” (IIID3). Accordingly, he concludes that “if we can be the adequate cause of any of these affections, I understand by the affect an action; otherwise, a passion.” There is thus a close connection between activity and adequate ideas, as well as between passions and inadequate ideas (IIIP3).
Since most of our knowledge involves ideas of affections of the body, which are inadequate ideas, human beings undergo many things, and the mind suffers many passions until the human body is ultimately destroyed. Nevertheless, Spinoza argues that “each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its own being” (IIIP6)”. This is Spinoza’s famous conatus principle, by which each individual strives to preserve its being or maintain what might be called homeostasis. In fact, Spinoza argues that the conatus, or striving, is the very essence of each thing (IIIP7). Furthermore, this striving is the primary affect, appetite, or desire. The conatus, or striving, when related solely to the mind, is understood as the will. When the conatus is conceived as related to both mind and body, Spinoza calls it appetite, and when humans are conscious of their appetite, he calls it desire (IIIP9S). Hence, Spinoza defines “desire is man’s very essence, insofar as it is conceived to be determined, from any given affection of it, to do something” (Def. Aff. I).
The conatus is central to Spinoza’s entire moral psychology, from which he derives his theory of affects, his theory of freedom, and his ethical and political theories. In arguing that any human individual is fundamentally striving (conatus) to persevere in being, Spinoza follows Hobbes’ moral psychology. In the Leviathan, Hobbes introduces his concept of conatus in its English version: “the small beginnings of motion within the body of man, before they appear in walking, speaking, and other visible action, are commonly called endeavor [conatus]. This endeavor, when it is toward something which causes it, is called appetite or desire” (Leviathan VI.1-2). Such desire or voluntary motion does not spring from a free will, Hobbes argues, but has its origins from the motion of external bodies imparting their motion to the human body, producing sensation. That is, Hobbes already equates the conatus with the will. Also, Hobbes already derives a taxonomy of passions from the conatus, albeit one that is far less sophisticated and complex than Spinoza’s taxonomy. Furthermore, Hobbes holds that the entire life of human beings consists of an endless desire for power, by which he understands “the present means to attain some future apparent good” (Leviathan X.1). This desire for power ends only with the eventual death of an individual (Leviathan IX.2). For Hobbes, humans are, for the most part, led by their passions, as, for instance, in the construction of a commonwealth from the state of nature, in which they are led by the fear of death and hope for a better life (Leviathan XIII.14). Though, of course, reason provides the means by which the construction of the state is possible. While there are many parallels between Hobbes’ and Spinoza’s psychology, Hobbes understands the conatus entirely as physical, explained by a materialistic mechanical philosophy. In contrast, for Spinoza, the conatus is both physical and psychological, according to his parallelism. Notwithstanding his focus on an ethic, his account of the affects often emphasizes psychological explanations.
From desire, that is, the conscious appetite of striving, Spinoza derives two other primary affects, namely joy and sadness. Spinoza describes joy as the passage or transition of the mind from a lesser to a greater perfection or reality, and sadness as the opposite, the passage of the mind from a greater to a lesser perfection or reality (IIIP11S). The affect of joy as related to both mind and body, he calls “pleasure or cheerfulness,” that of sadness “pain or melancholy.” IIIP3 underlines Spinoza’s parallelism with respect to his theory of affects: “the idea of anything that increases or diminishes, aids or restrains, our body’s power of acting, increases or diminishes our power of thinking” (IIIP11). In these essential basic definitions, Spinoza employs the concept of perfection or reality (equated in IID6). What he means by this can be grasped rather intuitively. The more perfection or reality an individual has, the more power it has to persevere in being, or the more the individual is capable of acting and thinking. When this power increases through a transition to greater perfection, the individual experiences joy. But if it decreases to lesser perfection, it experiences sadness.
Spinoza holds that from these three main affects all others, in principle, can be deduced or explained. However, the variety of affects is dependent not only on the individual but also on all the external circumstances under which they strive. Still, Spinoza provides explanations of the major human affects and their origin from other affects. The first affects he deduces from joy and sadness are love and hate. Whatever an individual imagines increases their power and causes joy, they love; and what decreases their power and causes sadness, they hate: “Love is nothing but joy and the accompanying idea of an external cause, and hate is nothing but sadness with the accompanying idea of an external cause” (IIIP13S). Accordingly, human beings strive to imagine those things (that is, have ideas of the affections of their body caused by those things) that increase their power of acting and thinking (IIIP12), causing joy, while avoiding imagining things that decrease their power of acting and thinking, causing sadness. Like Hobbes, Spinoza holds that human beings strive to increase their power, Spinoza, though, understands this specifically as a power to act and indeed to think.
Furthermore, because “the human body can be affected in many ways in which its power of acting is increased or diminished, and also in others which render its power of acting neither greater nor less” (III Post.I), there are many things which become the accidental cause of joy or sadness. In other words, it can happen that an individual loves or hates something not according to what actually causes joy (or an increase in power) or sadness (or a decrease in power), but rather something that appears to bring joy or sadness. This is possible because human beings are usually affected by two or more things at once, one or more of which may increase or decrease their power or causes joy or sadness, while others have no effect. Moreover, an individual, remembering experiences of joy or sadness accidently related to certain external causes, can come to love and hate many things by association (IIIP14). Indeed, Spinoza holds that there are as many kinds of joy, sadness, and desire as there are objects that can affect us (IIIP56), noting the well—known excessive desires of gluttony, drunkenness, lust, greed, and ambition.
Spinoza ultimately develops a rich taxonomy of passions and their mixtures, including the more common anger, envy, hope, fear, and pride, but also gratitude, benevolence, remorse, and wonder, to name a few. Not only does he define these passions, but he also gives an account of their logic, which is paramount for understanding the origin of these passions, and thereby ultimately overcoming them. True to his promise in the preface to the third part, Spinoza treats the affects “just as if they were a question of lines, planes, and bodies” (492). Initially and broadly, Spinoza discusses those affects that are passions because we experience them when we are acted upon. Human beings are passive in their striving to persevere in their being due to their inadequate ideas about themselves, their needs, as well as external things. Therefore, their striving to imagine what increases their power and avoiding what decreases their power fails, leading to a variety of affects of sadness. In contrast to traditional complaints about the weakness of humans with respect to their affects, however, Spinoza argues that “apart from the joy and desire which are passions, there are other affects of joy and desire which are related to us insofar as we act” (IIIP58) and that all such affects related to humans insofar as they act are ones of joy or desire and not sadness. Of course, this makes sense, as sadness is the transition from greater to lesser perfection and a decrease in the power of acting or thinking.
Spinoza’s theory of affects provides the foundation for his theory of human freedom, because ultimately freedom involves maximizing acting and minimizing being acted upon, that is, having active affects and not suffering passions. Recall that for Spinoza only God is absolutely free, because only God is independent as a self—caused substance and acts according to the necessity of his own nature, and because Spinoza defines a free thing as “existing from the necessity of its nature alone, and is determined to act by itself alone.” Human beings cannot be absolutely free. But insofar as they act, they are the adequate cause of their actions. This is to say that the action “follows from their nature, which can be clearly and distinctly understood through it alone” (IIID2). Therefore, when human beings act, they are free. This is opposed to being acted upon, or having passions, in which humans are only the inadequate or partial cause and are not acting according to their nature alone but are determined by something outside of themselves (see Kisner 2021). Therefore, the more human beings act, the freer they are; the more they suffer from passions, the less they are free.
Thus, Spinoza understands freedom in terms of activity as opposed to passivity, acting as opposed to being acted upon, or being the adequate cause of something as opposed to the inadequate cause of something: “I call that cause adequate whose effect can be clearly and distinctly perceived through it. But I call it partial or inadequate if its effect cannot be understood through it alone” (IIID1). From the perspective of the attribute of thought, being the adequate cause of an action is a function of having adequate ideas or true knowledge. He writes, “Our mind does certain things, [acts] and undergoes other things, namely, insofar as it has adequate ideas, it necessarily does certain things, and insofar as it has inadequate ideas, it necessarily undergoes other things” (IIIP1). Spinoza’s reasoning here is that when the mind has an adequate idea, this idea is adequate in God insofar as God constitutes the mind through the adequate idea. Thus, the mind is the adequate cause of the effect because the effect can be understood through the mind alone (by the adequate idea) and not something outside of the mind. But in the case of inadequate ideas, the mind is not the adequate cause of something, and thus the inadequate idea is, in God, the composite of the idea of the human mind together with the idea of something else. For this reason, the effect cannot be understood as being caused by the mind alone. Thus, it is the inadequate or partial cause. While this is Spinoza’s explanation of how being an adequate cause involves having adequate knowledge, there is some controversy among scholars about the status of humans having adequate ideas and true knowledge.
In Part II of the Ethics in IIP40S2, Spinoza differentiates three kinds of knowledge, which he calls imagination, reason, and intuitive knowledge. The first kind, imagination, mentioned above, has its sources in bodies affecting the human body and the ideas of these affections, or perception and sensation. It also includes associations with these things by signs or language. This kind of knowledge is entirely inadequate or incomplete, and Spinoza often writes that it has “no order for the intellect” or follows from the “common order of Nature,” that is, it is random and based on association. Passions, or passive affects, fall in the realm of imagination because imaginations are quite literally the result of the body being acted upon by other things, or, what is the same, ideas of these affections. The other two kinds of knowledge are adequate. Reason is knowledge that is derived from the knowledge of the common properties of all things, what Spinoza calls “common notions”. His thinking here is that there are certain properties shared by all things and that, being in the part and the whole, these properties can only be conceived adequately (IIP38 and IIP39). The ideas of these common properties cannot be but adequate in God when God is thinking the idea that constitutes the human mind and the idea which constitutes other things together in perception. Also, those ideas that are deduced from adequate ideas are also adequate (P40). The common notions, therefore, are the foundation of reasoning.
Some commentators, however, have pointed out that it seems impossible for humans to have adequate ideas. Michael Della Rocca, for instance, argues that having an adequate idea seems to involve knowledge of the entire causal history of a particular thing, which is not possible (Della Rocca 2001, 183, n. 29). This is because of Spinoza’s axiom that “the knowledge of an effect depends on and involves the knowledge of its cause” (IA4), and, as we have seen, finite singular things are determined to exist and produce an effect by another finite singular thing, and so on ad infinitum. Thus, adequate knowledge of anything would require adequate knowledge of all the finite causes in the infinite series. Eugene Marshall obviates this problem by arguing that it is possible to have adequate knowledge of the infinite modes (Marshall 2011, 31-36), which some commentators take, for Spinoza, to be the concern of the common notions (Curley 1988, 45fn; Bennett 1984, 107). Indeed, Spinoza argues that humans have adequate knowledge of God’s eternal and infinite essence (IIP45-P47), which would include knowledge of the attributes and infinite modes. Intuitive knowledge is also adequate, though it is less clear what specifically it entails. Spinoza defines it as “a kind of knowing [that] proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the formal essence of things” (IIP40S2, 478). Here, Spinoza does indicate knowledge of the essence of singular things returning to the above problem, though Marshall, for instance, points out that Spinoza does not indicate the essence of finite modes existing in duration (existing in time), which would require knowledge of the causal history of a finite mode. Rather, he suggests that Spinoza here speaks of the idea of the essence of things as sub specie aeternitatis, or things considered existing in the eternal attributes of God (Marshall 2011, 41-50). Furthermore, rational knowledge and intuitive knowledge are both related (Spinoza argues that rational knowledge encourages intuitive knowledge) but also distinct (VP28).
Rational knowledge and intuitive knowledge, because they involve adequate ideas, are necessary for human freedom. Again, this is because human freedom is constituted by activity, and humans act when they are the adequate cause of something that follows from their nature (IIID2). Moreover, humans can be the adequate cause, in part, when the mind acts or has adequate ideas (IIIPI). This is how Spinoza explains the possibility of human freedom metaphysically. However, human freedom, which Spinoza equates with virtue and blessedness, is the end of human striving, that is, the ongoing project of human existence. The essence of a human being, the conatus, is the striving to persevere in being and consequently to increase the power of acting and thinking, and this increase brings about the affect of joy. This increase in the power of acting and thinking can occur passively— the passion of joy—when human beings strive from inadequate ideas, or it can occur actively when human beings strive from adequate ideas, or from reason and intuitive knowledge. The more human beings strive for adequate ideas or act rationally in accordance with their own nature, the freer they are and the greater is their power of acting and thinking and the consequent joy. Therefore, reason and intuitive knowledge are paramount for freedom, virtue, and blessedness (VP36S) (see Soyarslan 2021).
For Spinoza, human freedom is very different from free will as ordinarily understood. It is not a faculty or ability apart from the intellect. Rather, it is a striving for a specific way of life defined by activity, reason, and knowledge instead of passivity and ignorance. Determinism is not opposed to this view of freedom, as freedom is understood as acting according to one’s own nature and not being compelled by external forces, especially passions. In this respect, it has many similarities to the view of freedom held by Hobbes and that of the Stoa in different respects. For Hobbes, being a materialist, freedom only applies properly to bodies and concerns the absence of external impediments to the motion of a body. Likewise, calling a human free indicates he is free “in those things which by his own strength and wit he is able to do is not hindered to do what he has a will to” (Leviathan XXI.1-2). However, Spinoza’s view of freedom differs substantially from Hobbes in that he has a more extensive view of what it means to be impeded by external forces, recognizing that the order of ideas and bodies are one and the same. For the Stoa, generally speaking, freedom consists in living a rational life according to nature. If one lives according to nature, which is rational, one can be free despite the fact that nature is determined because one conforms the desires to the order of nature through virtue. A famous illustration of such an understanding of freedom is given by a dog led by a cart. If the dog willingly follows the cart that is pulling it, it acts freely; if it resists the motion of the cart, being pulled along nonetheless, it lacks freedom (Long 1987, 386). For Spinoza, freedom does not conflict with determinism either, as long as human beings are active and not passive. Likewise, the greatest impediment to freedom are the passions, which can so overcome the power of an individual that they are in bondage or a slave. Spinoza famously writes “Man’s lack of power to moderate and restrain the affects I call bondage. For the man who is subject to affects is under the control, not of himself, but of fortune, in whose power he so greatly is that often, though he sees the better for himself, he is still forced to follow the worse” (IV Preface, 543). In these lines, Spinoza presents not only the problem that the passions present to human thriving but also situates this problem within the context of the classic enigma of akrasia, or weakness of will.
In the first 18 propositions of Part IV of the Ethics, entitled “Of Human Bondage, or the Power of the Affects,” Spinoza aims to explain “the causes of man’s lack of power and inconstancy, and why men do not observe the precepts of reason” (IVP18S, 555). First, he sets up the general condition that human beings, being a part of nature, are necessarily acted upon by other things (IVP2). Their power in striving to persevere in being is limited and surpassed by the power of other things in nature (IVP3). Therefore, it is impossible for them to be completely free or act only in accordance with their own nature (IVP4). Accordingly, Spinoza admits, “from this it follows that man is necessarily always subject to passions, that he follows and obeys the common order of Nature, and accommodates himself to it as much as the nature of things requires” (IVP4C). This, of course, is the reason that human freedom is always limited and requires constant striving. Human beings are constantly beset by passions, but what is worse is that the power of a passion is defined by the power of external causes in relation to an individual’s power (IVP5). This is to say, human beings can be overwhelmed by the power of external causes in such a way that “the force of any passion or affect can surpass the other actions, or powers of a man, so that the affect stubbornly clings to the man” (IVP6). This can be easily understood from the universal human experiences of grief and loss, envy and ambition, great love and hatred, as well as from any form of addiction and excessive desire for pleasures. Such passions, and even lesser ones, are hard to regulate and can interrupt our striving for a good life or even completing the simple tasks of daily life.
In IVP7, Spinoza touches on the main issue in akrasia, writing that “an affect cannot be restrained or taken away except by an affect opposite to and stronger than the affect to be restrained”. Here we can see why merely knowing what is good or best does not restrain an affect, and humans often see the better course of action but pursue the worse. The issue here is that Spinoza thinks that a true or adequate idea does not restrain a passion unless it is also an affect that increases the individual’s power of action (IVP 14). Furthermore, an affect’s power is compounded by its temporal and modal relationship to the individual. For instance, temporally, an affect whose cause is imagined to be present is stronger than if it were not (IVP9), if it is imagined to be present imminently rather than far in the future, or if it was present in the recent past rather than in distant memory (IVP10). Likewise, modally, an affect toward something humans view as necessary is more intense than if they view it as possible or contingent (IVP11).
Because the power of affects is temporally and modally affected and because an affect can be restrained by an opposite and more powerful affect, it often is the case that a desire that does come from true knowledge or adequate ideas is still overcome by passions (IVP 15). This can be easily seen in a desire for some future good, which is overcome by the longing for pleasures of the moment (IVP16), as is so often the case. However, “a desire that arises from joy is stronger, all things being equal, than one which arises from sadness” (IVP18). That joy is more powerful than sadness is prima facie a good thing, except that in order to overcome the passions and achieve the good life, true knowledge of good and evil in the affects is necessary. Spinoza’s conception of the good life, or what he calls blessedness, is in essence overcoming this domination of the passions and providing the tools for living a life of the mind, which is the life of freedom (see James 2009). Thus, Spinoza provides guidance for how such a good life can be achieved in Books IV and V of the Ethics, namely in the ideal exemplar of the free man and the so-called remedies of the passion.
4. The Free Man and the Way to Freedom
In the preface to Part IV of the Ethics, Spinoza introduces the idea of the model of human nature, or the “free man”. The free man is understood as an exemplar to which humans can look to decide whether an action is good or evil (there is some controversy over the status of the free man, for instance, see Kisner 2011, 162-78; Nadler 2015; Homan 2015). Spinoza is often interpreted as a moral anti-realist because of some of his claims about moral values. For instance, he writes “We neither strive for, nor will, neither want, nor desire anything because we judge it to be good; on the contrary, we judge it to be good because we strive for it, will it, want it, and desire it” (IIIP9S). And by “good here I understand every kind of joy, and whatever leads to it, and especially what satisfies any kind of longing, whatever that may be. And by evil, every kind of sadness, and especially what frustrates longing” (IIIP39S, 516). However, as anything can be the accidental cause of joy or sadness (IIIP15), it would seem that good and evil, or some goods and evils, are relative to the individual, as is the case for Hobbes. Moreover, Spinoza indicates that in nature there is nothing good or evil in itself. He writes “As far as good and evil are concerned, they also indicate nothing positive in things, considered in themselves, nor are they anything other than modes of thinking or notions we form because we compare things to one another” (IV Preface, 545) (for an overview of Spinoza’s meta-ethics, see Marshall 2017).
Nevertheless, in Part IV of the Ethics, Spinoza redefines good and evil. Good is now understood as what is certainly known to be useful to us, and evil as what is certainly known to prevent the attainment of some good (IVD1 and IVD2). What does Spinoza mean here by “useful”? What is useful to a human individual is what will allow them to persevere in being and increase their power of acting and thinking, especially according to their own nature, or “what will really lead a man to greater perfection” (IVP18S, 555). This new definition of good as what is really useful is distinguished from mere joy or pleasure, which, insofar as it prevents us from attaining some other good, can be an evil. For Spinoza, the most useful thing for humans is virtue (IVP18S), by which they can attain greater perfection, or greater power of acting and thinking. In order to understand what is really useful and good, Spinoza proposed the idea of the free man “as a model of human nature which we may look to”. For this reason, he also defines good relative to this model, writing, “I shall understand by good, what we certainly know is a means by which we may approach nearer and nearer to the model of human nature we set before ourselves” (IV Preface, 545).
With this model of human nature in mind, Spinoza then goes on to give an analysis of what is good and evil in the affects. Generally speaking, all passions that involve sadness, that is, affects that decrease the perfection or reality of an individual and consequently the ability of the mind to think and the body to act are evil (IVP41). For instance, hate towards other humans is never good (IVP45) and all species of such hate such as envy, disdain, and anger, are evil (IVP45C2). Also, any affects that are mixed with sadness, such as pity (IVP50), or are vacillations of the mind, like hope and fear (IVP47), are not good in themselves. In contrast, all affects that are joyful, that is, which increase the reality or perfection of an individual and consequently the ability of the mind to think and the body to act, are directly good. Spinoza qualifies, however, since the net increase and decrease in power of the individual has to be taken as a whole, with its particular conditions, and over time. For instance, the passion of joy and pleasure might be excessive (IVP43) or relate to only one part of an individual (IVP60), and the power of passions, being defined by the power of external causes, can easily overcome our power of acting and thinking as a whole and, thus, lead to greater sadness. Likewise, some sadness and pain might be good to the extent that they prevent a greater sadness or pain by restraining excessive desires (IVP43). It can easily be seen that love, which is a species of joy, if excessive, can be evil. Spinoza writes:
Sickness of the mind and misfortunes take their origin, especially, from too much love towards a thing which is liable to many variations and which we can never fully possess. For no one is disturbed or anxious concerning anything unless he loves it, nor do wrongs, suspicions, and enmities arise except from love for a thing which no one can really fully possess. (VP20S, 606)
Here again, it can be seen that, though joy in itself is directly good, it is often problematic as a passion and sometimes leads to sadness. Nevertheless, there is an interesting asymmetry here. While human beings’ passivity often leads them to the experiences of passions that are a variety of sadness, there are certain passions of joy that can, all things being equal, increase the power of an individual. This asymmetry allows for how human beings can increase their power of thinking and acting before they can act on adequate ideas. Therefore, it is important to note that joyful passions qua passions can be good and increase activity, despite being passions, and insofar as it increases our power of acting, it adds to freedom (see Goldenbaum 2004; Kisner 2011, 168-69). In this respect, the view toward the passions developed by Spinoza, undoubtedly influenced by Stoicism, differs from the general Stoic view. For the Stoa, virtue is living according to reason. The goal of the Stoic sage is to reach ataraxia, a state of mental tranquility, through apatheia, a state in which one is not affected by passions (pathai), which by definition are bad. By contrast, Spinoza explicitly understands passions of joy, all things being equal, as good.
Moreover, Spinoza also emphasizes that there are many things external to the human individual that are useful and therefore good, including all the things that preserve the body (IVP 39) and allow it to optimally interact with the world (IVP 40): “It is the part of a wise man, I say, to refresh and restore himself in moderation with pleasant food and drink, with scents, with the beauty of green plants, with decorations, music, sport, the theater, and other things of this kind, which anyone can use without injury to another” (IVP 45S, 572). Most significant in the category of external goods are other human beings. While other humans can be one of the greatest sources of conflict and turmoil insofar as they are subject to passions (IVP32-34), Spinoza also thinks that “there is no singular thing in Nature which is more useful to man than a man who lives according to the guidance of reason” (IVP35C). For this reason, Spinoza recognizes, similar to Aristotle, that good political organization and friendship are foundational to the good life – freedom, virtue, and blessedness (IVP73, for instance).
Leaving aside the many things in nature that are useful and good for human freedom, despite being external to the individual, what is ultimately constitutive of human freedom is active affects or what is the same, rational activity, that is, striving to persevere in being through the guidance of reason and understanding. Actions are affects which are related to the mind because it understands them, and all such affects are joyful (IIIP59). Nor can desires arising from reason ever be excessive (IVP61). Thus, active joy and desire are always good. Spinoza equates the human striving to persevere in being through the guidance of reason with virtue, which he understands as power, following Machiavelli’s virtu. Albeit for Spinoza, this power is acting from reason and understanding. It can be seen that the conatus is intimately related to virtue, and it is indeed the foundation of virtue. Spinoza writes “The striving to preserve oneself is the first and only foundation of virtue” (IVP22C). When we strive to persevere in being, we seek our own advantage, pursuing what is useful (and therefore good) (IVP19) for increasing our power of acting and thinking. The more we pursue our own true advantage, the more virtue we have (IVP20).
Initially, this apparent egoism may seem like an odd foundation for virtue. However, virtue is the human power to persevere in being, and Spinoza qualifies: “A man cannot be said absolutely to act from virtue insofar as he is determined to do something because he has inadequate ideas, but only insofar as he is determined because he understands” (IVP23). So, virtue, properly speaking, is seeking one’s advantage according to knowledge and striving to persevere in being through the guidance of reason (IVP34). Furthermore, Spinoza argues that what we desire from reason is understanding (IVP26), and the only things that we know to be certainly good or evil are those things which lead us to understanding or prevent it (IVP27). Virtue, therefore, is a rational activity, or active affect, by which we strive to persevere in our being, increasing our power of acting and thinking, through the guidance of reason. Spinoza calls this virtue specifically fortitudo, or “strength of character”. He further divides the strength of character into animositas, or “tenacity” and generositas, or “nobility”. Tenacity is the desire to preserve one’s being through the dictates of reason alone. Nobility, likewise, is the desire to aid others and join them in friendship through the dictates of reason alone (IIIP59S). These two general virtues are both defined as a “desire to strive” to live according to the dictates of reason or to live a rational life of understanding and pursuing what is really to the advantage of the individual.
Though Spinoza does not give a systematic taxonomy of the two sets of virtues, certain specific virtues (and vices) can be found throughout the Ethics (for more, see Kisner 2011, 197-214). Neither does he give an exhaustive list of the “dictates of reason,” though many of these too can be gleaned from the text (see LeBuffe 2010, 177-179). For instance, when he states “He who lives according to the guidance of reason strives, as far as he can, to repay the other’s hate, anger, and disdain towards him with love and nobility” (IVP 46). However, since there is nothing good or evil in nature in itself, the exemplar of the free man is used to consider, in any particular case, what is good and evil from the perspective of the life of freedom and blessedness or happiness. Similar to Aristotle’s phronimos, who is the model of phronesis for discerning virtue in practice, Spinoza’s “free man” can be interpreted as an exemplar to whom an individual can look in order to discern what is truly useful for persevering in being, and what is detrimental to leading a good life defined by rational activity and freedom. In IVP67-IVP73, the so-called “free man propositions”, Spinoza provides an outline of some dictates of reason derived from the exemplar of the free man. Striving to emulate the free man, an individual should not fear death (IVP67), use virtue to avoid danger (IVP68), avoid the favors of the ignorant (IVP70), be grateful (IVP71), always be honest (IVP72), and live a life in community rather than in solitude (IVP73). Ultimately, the exemplar of the free man is meant to provide a model for living a free life, avoiding negative passions by striving to live according to the dictates of reason. However, Spinoza is well aware, as some commentators have pointed out, that the state of the free man, as one who acts entirely from the dictates of reason, may not be entirely attainable for human individuals. In paragraph XXXII of the Appendix to Part IV, he writes “But human power is very limited and infinitely surpassed by the power of external causes. So we do not have the absolute power to adapt things outside us to our use. Nevertheless, we shall bear calmly those things which happen to us contrary to what the principles of our advantage demand, if we are conscious that we have done our duty, that the power we have could not have extended itself to the point where we could have avoided those things, and that we are a part of the whole of nature, whose order we follow.”
In the final part of the Ethics, Spinoza proposes certain remedies to the passions, which he understands as the tools available to reason to overcome them, “the means, or way, leading to freedom.” In general, Spinoza thinks that the more an individual’s mind is made up of adequate ideas, the more active and free the individual is, and the less they will be subject to passions. For this reason, the remedies against the passions focus on activity and understanding. Spinoza outlines five general remedies for the passions:
I. In the knowledge itself of the affects;
II. In the fact that it [the mind] separates the affects from the thought of an external cause, which we imagine confusedly;
III. In the time by which the affection related to things we understand surpasses those related to things we conceive confusedly or in a mutilated way;
IV. In the multiplicity of causes by which affections related to common properties or to God are encouraged;
V. Finally, in the order by which the mind can order its affects and connect them to one another. (VP20S, 605)
The suggested techniques rely on Spinoza’s parallelism, stated in IIP7, that the order of ideas is the same as the order of things. For this reason, Spinoza argues that “in just the same way as thoughts and ideas of things are ordered and connected in the mind, so the affections of the body, images of things are ordered and connected in the body” (IVP1). Therefore, all the techniques suggested by Spinoza involve ordering the ideas according to adequate knowledge, through reason and intuitive knowledge. In this way, the individual becomes more active, and therefore freer, in being a necessary part of nature.
Spinoza’s first and foundational remedy involves an individual fully understanding their affects to obtain self-knowledge. Passive affects, or passions, are, after all, based on inadequate knowledge. Spinoza’s suggestion here is to move from inadequate knowledge to adequate knowledge by attempting to fully understand a passion, that is, to understand its cause. This is possible because, just as the mind is the idea of the body and has ideas of the affections of the body, it can also think ideas of ideas of the mind (IIP20). These ideas are connected to the mind in the same way as the mind is connected to the body (IIP21). Understanding a passion, then, is thinking about the ideas of the ideas of the affections of the body. Attempting to understand a passion has two main effects. First, by the very thinking about their passion, the individual is already more active. Second, by fully understanding their affect, an individual can change it from a passion to an action because “an affect which is a passion ceases to be a passion as soon as we form a clear and distinct idea of it” (VP3).
Spinoza’s argument for the possibility of this relies on the fact that all ideas of the affections of the body can involve some ideas that we can form adequately, that is, there are common properties of all things—the common notions or reason (VP4). So, by understanding affects, thinking ideas of the ideas of the affections of the body, particularly thinking of the causes of the affections of the body, we can form adequate ideas (that follow from our nature) and strive to transform passions into active affects. Spinoza does qualify that we can form some adequate ideas of the affections of the body, underlining that such understanding of passions is limited, but he also writes that “each of us has—in part, at least, if not absolutely—the power to understand himself and his affects, and consequently, the power to bring it about that he is less acted on by them” (VP4S, 598). Since “the appetite by which a man is said to act, and that by which he is said to be acted on are one and the same” (VP4S, 598) anything an individual does from a desire, which is a passion, can also be done from a rational affect.
Interconnected with the first remedy, Spinoza’s second remedy recommends the separation of the affect from the idea of the external cause. VP2 reads “If we separate emotions, or affects, from the thought of an external cause and join them to other thoughts, then the love, or hate, towards the external cause is destroyed, as are the vacillations of the mind arising from these affects.” For Spinoza, love or hate are joy or sadness with an accompanying idea of the external cause. He, here, is indicating that by separating the affect from the thought of an external cause that we understand inadequately, and by understanding the affect as mentioned above by forming some adequate ideas about the affect, we destroy the love and hate of the external cause. As mentioned earlier, anything can be the accidental cause of joy and sorrow (IIIP15), and therefore of love and hate. Furthermore, the strength of an affect is defined by the power of the external cause in relation to our own power (IVP5). Separating the passion from the external cause allows for understanding the affect in relation to the ideas of the mind alone. It might be difficult to grasp what Spinoza means by separating the affect from the external cause in the abstract, but consider the example of the jealous lover. Spinoza defines jealousy as “a vacillation of the mind born of love and hatred together, accompanied by the idea of another who is envied” (IIIP35S). The external causes accompanying the joy and sadness are the beloved and the (imagined) new lover who is envied. By separating the affect from the idea of the external cause, Spinoza is suggesting that a jealous lover could come to terms with the jealousy and form some clear and distinct ideas about it, that is, form some adequate ideas that reduce the power of the passion. Spinoza’s third remedy involves the fact that “affects aroused by reason are, if we take account of time, more powerful than those related to singular things we regard as absent” (VP7). Simply put, “time heals all wounds,” but Spinoza gives an account of why this is. Whereas passions are inadequate ideas that diminish with the absence of the external cause (we have other ideas that exclude the imagining of the external object), an affect related to reason involves the common properties of things “which we always regard as present” (VP7D). Therefore, over time, rational affects are more powerful than passions. This mechanism of this remedy is readily seen in a variety of passions, from heartbreak to addiction.
Spinoza’s fourth and fifth remedies are more concerned with preventing the mind from being adversely affected by passions than with overcoming a specific passion which already exists. The fourth remedy involves relating an affect to a multitude of causes, because “if an affect is related to more and different causes, which the mind considers together with the affect itself, it is less harmful, we are less acted on by it, and we are affected less toward each cause than is the case with another equally great affect, which is related only to one cause or to fewer causes” (VP9). This is the case because, when considering that affect, the mind is engaged in thinking a multitude of different ideas, that is, its power of thinking is increased, and it is more free. Again, this remedy is, in large part, related to the first foundational one. In understanding our affects, we form some adequate ideas and understand the cause of the affect, in part, from these ideas. Insofar as these adequate ideas are common notions concerning the common properties of things, we relate the affects to many things that can engage the mind. Spinoza ultimately claims that “the mind can bring it about that all the body’s affections, or images of things, are related to the idea of God” (VP14), for the mind has an adequate idea of the essence of God (IIP47). Because these affections are related to adequate ideas and follow from our own nature, they are effects of joy accompanied by the idea of God. In other words, all affections of the body can encourage an intellectual love of God. For Spinoza, “he who understands himself and his affects clearly and distinctly loves God, and does so the more, the more he understands himself and his affects” (VP15). This is a large part of how Spinoza conceives of the joyful life of reason and understanding that he calls blessedness.
Finally, the fifth remedy involves the fact that, as Spinoza argues, “so long as we are not torn by affects contrary to our nature, we have the power of ordering and connecting the affection of the body according to the order of the intellect” (VP10). What this amounts to is that the mind will be less affected by negative passions the more adequate ideas it has and will order its ideas according to reason instead of the common order of nature. Spinoza’s suggestion is to “conceive of right principles of living, or sure maxims of life,” which we can constantly look at when confronted by common occurrences and emotional disturbances of life. For instance, Spinoza gives the example of how to avoid being suddenly overwhelmed by hatred by preparing oneself by meditating “frequently on the common wrongs of men, and how they may be warded off best by nobility” (VP10S). This provides the practical mechanism by which we can use the virtues of tenacity and nobility to live a free life (see Steinberg 2014). All the remedies Spinoza mentions allow an individual to be rationally responsive to their environment rather than just being led by their emotions, and insofar as they are led by reason and adequate knowledge, they are free.
5. Spinoza on Moral Responsibility
The discussion about free will and freedom is often concerned with moral responsibility because free will is generally considered a necessary condition for moral responsibility. Moral responsibility is taken to be the condition under which an individual can be praised and blamed, rewarded and punished for their actions. Spinoza’s view on responsibility is complex and little commented upon. And he indeed avers that praise and blame are only a result of the illusion of free will: “Because they think themselves free, those notions have arisen: praise and blame, sin and merit” (I Appendix, 444). Though Spinoza does not speak directly of moral responsibility, he does not completely disavow the idea of responsibility because of his denial of free will. In a series of correspondences with Oldenburg, he makes clear that he does think that individuals are responsible for their actions despite lacking free will, though his sense of responsibility is untraditional. Oldenburg asks Spinoza to explain some passages in the Theological Political Treatise that seem, by equating God with Nature, to imply the elimination of divine providence, free will, and thereby moral responsibility. Spinoza indeed denies the traditional view of divine providence as one of free choice by God. For Spinoza, absolute freedom is acting from the necessity of one’s nature (ID7), and God is free in precisely the fact that everything follows from the necessity of the divine nature. But God does not arbitrarily choose to create the cosmos, as is traditionally argued.
In Letter 74, Oldenburg writes “I shall say what most distresses them. You seem to build on a fatal necessity of all things and actions. But, once that has been asserted and granted, they say the sinews of all laws, of all virtue and religion, are cut, and all rewards and punishments are useless. They think that whatever compels or implies necessity excuses. Therefore, they think no one will be inexcusable in the sight of God” (469). Oldenburg points out the classical argument against determinism, namely that it makes reward and punishment futile and pointless because if human beings have no free will, then they seem to have no control over their lives, and if they have no control over their lives, then there is no justification for punishment or reward. All actions become excusable if they are outside the control of individuals. However, in his response to Oldenburg, Spinoza maintains the significance of reward and punishment even within a deterministic framework. He states,
This inevitable necessity of things does not destroy either divine or human laws. For whether or not the moral teachings themselves receive the form of law or legislation from God himself, they are still divine and salutary. The good which follows from virtue and the love of God will be just as desirable whether we receive it from God as a judge or as something emanating from the necessity of the divine nature. Nor will the bad things which follow from evil actions and affects be any less to be feared because they follow from them necessarily. Finally, whether we do what we do necessarily or contingently, we are still led by hope and fear. (Letter 75, 471)
Spinoza has two points here. The first is that all reward and punishment are natural consequences of actions. Even if everything is determined, actions have good and evil consequences, and these are the natural results of actions. Determinism does not eliminate reward and punishment because there are determined consequences, that are part of the natural order. Traditional views on responsibility are tied to free will, but in this passage, Spinoza is indicating that reward and punishment are justified by the power or right of nature. The second point is that these consequences can regulate human behavior because human beings are led by the hope for some good and the fear of some evil. Determinism does not destroy the law but rather gives it a framework for being effective. Spinoza here seems to be advocating something like a consequentialist theory of responsibility. What matters is that the reward and punishment can act as a deterrent to bad behavior or motivation for desired behavior. Traditional views on responsibility are tied to free will, but in this passage, Spinoza is indicating that reward and punishment are still justified from a social and political standpoint (see Kluz 2015).
To understand Spinoza’s points better, we have to examine his view of law. Spinoza thinks that law is either dependent on natural necessity, that is, laws of nature, or human will. However, because human beings are a part of nature, human law will also be a part of natural law. Moreover, he also thinks that the term “law” is generally more applied to human experience. He writes, “Commonly nothing is understood by law but a command which men can either carry out or neglect—since law confines human power under certain limits, beyond which that power extends, and does not command anything beyond human powers.” For this reason, Spinoza qualifies, “Law seems to need to be defined more particularly: that it is a principle of living man prescribes to himself or to others for some end” (TTP IV.5). Spinoza further divides law into human and divine law. By “human law,” Spinoza specifically means “a principle of living which serves only to protect life and the republic” (TTP IV.9), or what we might call “political” or “civil” law. By “divine law,” he specifically means, that which aims only at the supreme good, that is, the true knowledge and love of God” (TTP IV.9), or what we might call “religious” and “moral” law. The different ends of the law are what distinguish human law from divine law. The first concerns providing security and stability in social life; the second concerns providing happiness and blessedness, which are defined by virtue and freedom. For this reason, “divine law” in Spinoza’s sense concerns what leads to the supreme good for human beings, that is, the rule of conduct that allows humans to achieve freedom, virtue, and happiness. This law Spinoza propounds as moral precepts in the Ethics mentioned above. These laws follow from human nature, that is, they describe what is, in fact, good for human individuals in their striving to persevere in their being, based upon rational knowledge of human beings and nature in general, with the free man as the exemplar toward which they strive.
However, it is not the case that all individuals can access and follow the “divine law” through reason alone, and, therefore, traditionally, divine law took the form of divine commandments ensconced within a system of reward and punishment (while still including, more or less, what Spinoza indicates by ‘divine law”). For Spinoza, what is true in Holy Scripture and “divine law” can also be gained by adequate knowledge because “divine law” is a rule of conduct men lay down for themselves that “aims only at the supreme good, that is, the true knowledge and love of God.” (TTP IV.9). That is to say, “divine law” follows from human nature, which is a part of Nature, but while the free man follows these moral precepts because he rationally knows what is, in fact, advantageous for him, other individuals follow moral precepts because they are led by their passions, namely the hope for some good or the fear of some evil, that is, reward and punishment. Though reward and punishment are, ultimately, the same for the free man and other individuals, the free man is led by reason while other individuals are led by imagination, or inadequate ideas or passions. Likewise, human law, that is, political law, uses a system of reward and punishment to regulate human behavior through hope and fear. Human law provides security and stability for the state in which human individuals co-exist and punishes those who transgress the laws. Moreover, just as in the case of “divine law”, the free man follows human law because he rationally knows his advantage, while other individuals are more led by their passions. Returning to Spinoza’s response, determinism does not do away with law, moral or political, because the utility of the law, that is, the great advantages that following the law provides for the individual and the community and the disadvantages that result from transgressing the law, are retained whether or not human beings have free will. Ultimately, for Spinoza, moral precepts and the law are ensconced in a system of reward and punishment that is necessary for regulating human behavior even without free will.
6. References and Further Reading
All translations are from The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. I and II, ed. and trans. Edwin Curley.
a. Primary Sources
- Descartes, Rene. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol. I and II, trans. John Cottingham et al. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985).
- Hobbes, Thomas. The Leviathan with Selected Variants from the Latin Edition of 1668, ed. Edwin Curley. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994).
- Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley, trans., The Hellenistic Philosophers, Vol. 1: Translations of the Principal Sources, with Philosophical Commentary. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987).
- Spinoza, Baruch. The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. I and II, ed. and trans. by Edwin Curley. (Princeton University Press, 1985).
b. Secondary Sources
- Bennett, Jonathan. A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984).
- Bennett, Jonathan. “Spinoza’s Monism: A Reply to Curley”, in God and Nature: Spinoza’s Metaphysics, ed. Yirmiyahu Yovel. (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991), 53-59.
- Curley, Edwin. Spinoza’s Metaphysics: An Essay in Interpretation. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1969).
- Curely, Edwin. Behind the Geometrical Method. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985).
- Curley, Edwin. “On Bennett’s Interpretation of Spinoza’s Monism”, in God and Nature: Spinoza’s Metaphysics, ed. Yirmiyahu Yovel. (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991), 35-52.
- De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
- Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
- Gatens, Moira. “Spinoza, Law and Responsibility”, in Spinoza: Critical Assessments of Leading Philosophers Vol.III, ed. by Genevieve Lloyd. (London: Routledge, 2001), 225-242.
- Garrett, Don. “Spinoza’s Necessitarianism”, in God and Nature: Spinoza’s Metaphysics, ed. Yirmiyahu Yovel. (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991), 197-218.
- Goldenbaum, Ursula. “The Affects as a Condition of Human Freedom in Spinoza’s Ethics”, in Spinoza on Reason and the “Free Man”, edited by Yirmiyahu Yovel. (New York: Little Room Press, 2004), 149-65.
- Goldenbaum, Ursula, and Christopher Kluz, eds. Doing without Free Will: Spinoza and Contemporary Moral Problems. (New York: Lexington, 2015).
- Hübner, Karolina “Spinoza on Being Human and Human Perfection”, in Essays on Spinoza’s Ethical Theory, eds. Mathew Kisner and Andrew Youpta. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), 124-142.
- Homan, Matthew. “Rehumanizing Spinoza’s Free Man”, in Doing without Free Will: Spinoza and Contemporary Moral Problems, eds. Ursula Goldenbaum and Christopher Kluz (New York: Lexington, 2015), 75-96.
- James, Susan. “Freedom, Slavery, and the Passions”, in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza’s Ethics, ed. by Olli Koistinen. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009), 223-41.
- Kisner, Mathew. Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy and the Good Life. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011).
- Kisner, Mathew, and Andrew Youpta eds. Essays on Spinoza’s Ethical Theory. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014).
- Kisner, Matthew. “Spinoza’s Activities: Freedom without Independence”, in Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza’s “Ethics”, ed. Noa Naaman-Zauderer. (London: Routledge, 2021), 37-61.
- Kluz, Christopher. “Moral Responsibility without Free Will: Spinoza’s Social Approach”, in Doing without Free Will: Spinoza and Contemporary Moral Problems, eds. Ursula Goldenbaum and Christopher Kluz (New York: Lexington, 2015), 1-26.
- LeBuffe, Michael. From Bondage to Freedom: Spinoza on Human Excellence. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010).
- Marshal, Colin. “Moral Realism in Spinoza’s Ethics”, in Cambridge Critical Guide to Spinoza’s Ethics, ed. Yitzhak Melamed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2017), 248-265,
- Marshal, Eugene. The Spiritual Automaton: Spinoza’s Science of the Mind. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014).
- Melamed, Yitzhak. “The Causes of our Belief in Free Will: Spinoza on Necessary, “Innate,” yet False Cognition”, in Cambridge Critical Guide to Spinoza’s Ethics, ed. Yitzhak Melamed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2017)
- Naaman-Zauderer, Nao ed. Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza’s “Ethics”. (London: Routledge, 2021).
- Nadler, Steven. “Whatever is, is in God: substance and things in Spinoza’s metaphysics”, in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charles Huenemann. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 53-70.
- Nadler, Steven. “On Spinoza’s Free Man”, Journal of the American Philosophical Association, Volume 1, Issue 1, Spring 2015, 103-120.
- Rutherford, Donald. “Deciding What to Do: The Relation of Affect and Reason in Spinoza’s Ethics”, in Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza’s “Ethics”, ed. Noa Naaman-Zauderer. (London: Routledge, 2021), 133-151.
- Soyarslan, Sanem. “From Ordinary Life to Blessedness: The Power of Intuitive Knowledge in Spinoza’s Ethics”, in Essays on Spinoza’s Ethical Theory eds. Mathew Kisner and Andrew Youpta. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), 236-257.
- Steinberg, Justin. “Following a Recta Ratio Vivendi: The Practical Utility of Spinoza’s Dictates of Reason”, in Essays on Spinoza’s Ethical Theory, eds. Mathew Kisner and Andrew Youpta. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), 178-196.
- Youpta, Andrew. “Spinoza’s Theory of the Good”, in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza’s Ethics, ed. Olli Koistinen. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), pp. 242 – 257.
- Youpta, Andrew. The Ethics of Joy: Spinoza on the Empowered Life. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2019).
- Yovel, Yirmiyahu, ed. Spinoza on Reason and the “Free Man”. (New York: Little Room Press, 2004).
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