The Stoa

The Stoa Poecile or “Painted Stoa” was a building in Athens where Zeno of Citium met his followers and taught. Later adherents of this philosophical tradition were given the name “Stoic” from their association with this place.

Table of Contents

  1. General Definition of Stoas and the Location of the Stoa Poecile
  2. History of the Use of the Stoa Poecile
  3. References and Further Reading

1. General Definition of Stoas and the Location of the Stoa Poecile

Stoas were a common feature in Greek cities and sanctuaries. Open at the front with a façade of columns, a stoa provided an open, but protected, space. In addition to providing a place for the activities of civil magistrates, shopkeepers, and others, stoas often served as galleries for art and public monuments, were used for religious purposes, and delineated public space. In the 5th century BCE the Athenian Agora had four, possibly five, stoas that lined the southern, western, and northern sides of the public area.

During excavations in the northern part of the Athenian Agora in the 1980s, archaeologists uncovered the southwestern corner of a building that is currently identified as the Stoa Poecile (for a fuller discussion of the archaeological evidence, see Camp, Archaeology of Athens, 68-69 and figures 64 and 65).

2. History of the Use of the Stoa Poecile

Originally named for Peisianax, brother-in-law of the Athenian politician Cimon, the Stoa Poecile was built at the northern end of the Athenian Agora in the 460s BCE. Made of limestone, the Stoa had a façade of Doric columns and a row of Ionic columns running down the middle to support the roof. It soon came to be popularly known as “poecile” or “painted” on account of the remarkable painted panels that adorned its back wall.

Soon after the Stoa Poecile was built, a series of panel paintings by leading artists of the day were installed. The Roman travel writer Pausanias (1.15) provides a vivid description of the appearance of these paintings in his own day, some six hundred years later. Among the mythological and historical topics portrayed were Theseus battling the Amazons, the Greeks fighting at Troy, the Athenian victory over Sparta at Oenoe near Argos (date unknown) and the Battle of Marathon (480 BCE). There were also portraits of the heroes Marathon, Theseus, Hercules, and the goddess Athena. Victory souvenirs from Athenian battles, such as the shields taken from captured Spartans at the battle of Pylos in 425 BC, also adorned the Stoa. However, the devastating invasions of the Herulians (CE 267) and the Visigoths (CE 396), along with the depradations of a greedy Roman proconsul, stripped the Stoa Poecile of its art (Synesius, Letters 54 and 135).

Scattered bits of information from antiquity testify to the variety of public uses of the Stoa Poecile. For example, juries sometimes conducted their business in the Stoa (IG II2 1641 and 1670), and public announcements were made there, such as during one of the annual celebrations of the Eleusinian Mysteries (Scholiast on Aristophanes’ Frogs 369). However, the Stoa Poecile was primarily the meeting place of ordinary people, beggars, fishmongers, entertainers, and others selling their wares or merely escaping the heat of a summer’s day. (Camp, Archaeology of Athens, 68-69).

When Zeno of Citium arrived in Athens around 313 BCE, he often met his followers in the Stoa Poecile and taught there. Zeno’s reasons for using the Stoa Poecile are unknown, but one may speculate that the depictions of virtue – so important in Stoic ethics – in many of the paintings that adorned the building may have had some part in his decision. Zeno also appears to have taught in the Academy and Lyceum gymnasiums (Diogenes Laertius 7.1.11) and perhaps in other venues in Athens – but the name of that first meeting place became synonymous with Zeno’s followers. The school itself never had a fixed locale, and later Stoic philosophers taught in gymnasia and music halls throughout Athens (Wycherley, Stones of Athens 231-233).

3. References and Further Reading

  • John M. Camp, The Archaeology of Athens (New Haven and London 2001)
  • Camp, John M. The Athenian Agora (London 1986)
  • Travalos, J. Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University