Supervenience and Determination

The term “supervenience” gained prominence in the twentieth century when it was suggested that moral properties supervene on natural properties and that our mental characteristics supervene on our physical characteristics such as the properties of our nervous system. The term can be defined as follows. For two sets of properties, A (the supervenient set) and B (the subvenient set or supervenience base), A supervenes on B just in case there can be no difference in A without a difference in B. Turning this principle on its head gives us the converse concept of determination: B determines A just in case sameness with respect to B implies sameness with respect to A. Supervenience and determination are simply two sides of the same coin.

From the basic definition initially presented, supervenience might seem a fairly innocuous principle, yet it has led a somewhat murky and controversial existence: some love it; some hate it. It was, for example, described by John Post as an “accordion word: indefinitely stretchable” (1984, p. 163). It has certainly been pulled about throughout its history, but it does have its limits. Indeed, others view it as too limited to be of any philosophical worth whatsoever. This article charts the history of the concept of supervenience, discusses the current panoply of definitions, and reviews some of the more tractable portions of the contemporary debate. The primary aim is to gain a feel for the basic concept without getting bogged down with the more formal and abstruse aspects of supervenience. The aim of this first section is to get to grips with the core idea of supervenience, and see some of the contexts in which it has been and might be used.

Table of Contents

  1. Getting to Grips with Supervenience
  2. The Recent History of Supervenience
  3. The Unlovely Proliferation of Formulations
  4. Supervenience and Causation
  5. Reduction, Emergence, and Multiple Realization
  6. Adding Mystery to Mystery?
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Getting to Grips with Supervenience

As David Lewis puts it, “We have supervenience when there could be no difference of one sort without differences of another sort” (1986, p. 14). For example: no difference in an individual’s mental characteristics without some difference in physical characteristics; no difference in a computer’s program without a difference in the computer’s circuitry; no difference in the economy without some difference in the behavior of its underlying economic agents; no difference in the temperature of a gas without some difference in the behavior of the molecules forming it, and so on. But notice that there can be differences in the neurons, circuitry, agents, and molecules without a difference in mental, computational, economic, and thermal properties.

The idea in each of the above cases is that some property A (or family of properties) is “determined” by some other properties B that do not themselves possess the property A, and that do not reduce to B (though this is a controversial point, as we shall see): individual neurons don’t possess mental characteristics; circuits don’t possess computational properties; individual agents don’t possess economic properties; and individual molecules don’t have temperatures. The intent is to avoid the stronger relations (such as identity or definability) between the types of property, generally because it often isn’t clear how there could be such strong relations holding them together. Part of the reason for this, and one prime motivation for supervenience, is that mental, computational, economic, and thermodynamic characteristics are “multiply realizable:: the same properties might be realized by very different underlying physical configurations or stuff. However, it needs to be strong enough to support a kind of non-symmetric dependence between two levels of property, such that a “lower” level determines a “higher” level. This feature may give rise to the notion of “levels of dependence” and, in certain cases, “hierarchical organization”: the mental is at a higher “level,” is higher up the hierarchy, from the physical; the economy is at a higher level than the economic agents, and so on.

This hierarchy of levels charts out a progression of ontological dependence too: without the physical stuff of neurons, circuits, people, and molecules (or something like them), the higher level states would not exist at all. This feature thus makes supervenience a useful tool in analyzing relations between the subject matter of distinct theoretical disciplines, such as the relation between physics and biology. It is, more generally useful in analyzing relations between things that are connected (correlated) in a way that doesn’t suggest reduction or identity. However, note that levels are not a generic feature of supervenience. Consider the case of the relationship between the length of the sides of a square and the area of the square. There is, in both directions, no difference in one without a difference in the other, and once the sides (respectively, area) are fixed the area (respectively, length) is fixed. So we have a clear case of supervenience. But this is a symmetric case, and so the notion of a level of dependence or hierarchy makes no sense; it only makes sense when the relation is asymmetric, and these make for the most philosophically interesting cases.

But, before we get bogged down with such details, what is the basic idea of supervenience? It is perhaps best understood by means of a colorful example. To this end, let us begin by adapting a simple story presented by Paul Teller (1983). Teller asks us to imagine a bunch of watches churned out of an assembly line in the same state, so that they are functionally and qualitatively (at least, in terms of their intrinsic properties) identical—clearly the watches will register the same time. The properties having to do with the physical makeup of the watches—their structure and composition, and so on—give us our B set of properties (the subvenient set). The supervenient A set has to do with the time-keeping properties of the watches—for example, whether they enable their owners to get into work on time, and so on. In this case, as Teller points out, the A properties of some particular watch will be the same as any other watch from the assembly line since they have the same physical makeup (B properties), and that is all that counts towards the A properties in this story. Being a good timekeeper supervenes on the physical makeup of the timekeeping device: one could not alter the time-keeping properties of the watches without altering their underlying structural and compositional properties. Moreover, any two devices that share their physical makeup will either both be good or both be bad timekeepers. That is to say, the physical make-up of a watch determines its time-keeping properties.

Though this captures much of the basic idea as encapsulated in our opening definition (which we can abbreviate to “no A-difference without a B-difference”), it misses one very crucial detail: modal impact. Supervenience is not intended to be a contingent “matter of actual fact” claim concerning two sets of properties that happen to be correlated at some particular time or place. Rather, it is intended to cover any situation involving A and B, covering any time, place, and world—though there will be natural restrictions concerning which worlds are to be included here (for example, logically possible [so that all logically coherent, non-contradictory worlds are considered], nomologically possible [so that all worlds permitted by the laws of physics are considered], and metaphysically possible [considering a class of worlds somewhere between the logically possible and the nomologically possible ones]). Different restrictions give different strengths. In our example, we should have to extend our story to include all possible watches that are indistinguishable in terms of their B-properties, including those inhabiting distinct worlds (from alien worlds and Twin-Earths, perhaps to worlds with different laws of physics). This additional modal aspect results in a profusion of distinct formulations that aim to adequately capture the fundamental notion of supervenience. Further proliferation results from the question of what are to be the objects that have the properties that enter into the supervenience/determination relation. Supervenience is, then, clearly far from innocuous!

2. The Recent History of Supervenience

Jaegwon Kim (1993, p. 131) notes that the term “supervenience” was in currency as far back as 1594. In its vernacular sense it means to “[come upon] a given event as something additional and extraneous (perhaps as something unexpected)” (ibid, p.132). However, the concept of Supervenience, as a philosophical term of art, is generally acknowledged to be traceable to G.E. Moore’s work on value theory, and from thence to R.M. Hare’s work on meta-ethics in which the term ‘supervenience’ was introduced into the philosophical literature. There it stifled for some time, before being unearthed by Davidson who applied it to the ‘mental-physical’ relationship. Let us review some central points from this historical development.

In “The Conception of Intrinsic Value” Moore writes that:

…if a given thing possesses any kind of intrinsic value in a certain degree, then not only must that same thing possess it, under all circumstances, in the same degree, but also anything exactly like it, must, under all circumstances, possess it in exactly the same degree. … it is not possible that of two exactly similar things one should possess it and the other not, or that one should possess it in one degree, and the other in a different one.

(Moore 1922, p. 261)

This sentiment is virtually parroted by Hare, this time specifically utilizing the term “supervenience” to describe the relation between certain natural (non-moral, physical) and moral properties, giving us ‘moral supervenience’:

…let us take that characteristic of “good” which has been called its supervenience. Suppose that we say ‘St. Francis was a good man.’ It is logically impossible to say this and to maintain at the same time that there might have been another man placed exactly in the same circumstances as St. Francis, and who behaved in exactly the same way, but who differed from St. Francis in this respect only, that he was not a good man.

(Hare 1952, p. 145)

Before we continue with the historical matters, let us briefly pause to consider what this means. Again, let’s give a simple example. Imagine we draw up a pair of catalogues of the properties of two people Saint Francis and Faint Srancis. The properties of Saint Francis are, say, kindness, bravery, niceness, neighborliness, and goodness. Faint Srancis’ properties differ from Saint Francis only in that the last property, goodness, is missing from his catalogue. Suppose, instead, that he has the property “badness” in its place. Now, according to the moral supervenience thesis espoused by Hare, this is simply not a genuinely possible state of affairs. All of the other properties, minus goodness, serve to fix or determine the property of goodness. It is just not possible that there be two such individuals differing in this way (whether they occupy the same world or not). Therefore, in possessing all of Saint Francis’ properties up to, but not including goodness, Faint Srancis must also thereby possess the property of goodness too. This is what is meant in saying that the property of goodness supervenes on a family of natural properties not including goodness. (Note that this matches Stalnaker’s, 1996, p. 87, preferred definition of supervenience: “To say that the A-properties or facts are supervenient on the B-properties or facts is to say that the A-facts are, in a sense, redundant, since they are already implicitly specified when one has specified all the B-facts.”) Let us now return to the historical path of the concept.

As Kim and others have pointed out, it seems that both some version of the concept and the term ‘supervenience’ were in operation before Moore’s and Hare’s usage in the context of the British Emergentist School. The emergentist’s understanding of supervenience, being more in line with the vernacular sense, does not match the current understanding as well as Moore’s and Hare’s. See McLaughlin 1992 for an excellent analysis. Indeed, supervenience, as a concept, most likely has much earlier roots than this, and one can readily find examples (or approximations, at least) littered throughout the history of philosophy. Leibniz’s theory of space and time might be one such example, with spatial and temporal properties supervenient on non-spatial and non-temporal events. Hume’s theory of causation might be another example, with cause and effect supervening on sequences of events that do not have causal properties. However, for the purposes of a cleaner exposition we will stick with the orthodox historical trajectory of supervenience. Not many philosophers initially picked up on Hare’s use of supervenience, but new life was breathed into it when Donald Davidson (1970) utilized it to provide some of the support for his anomalous monism. For example, in an oft-quoted passage he writes:

Although the position I describe denies there are psychophysical laws, it is consistent with the view that mental characteristics are in some sense dependent, or supervenient, on physical characteristics. Such supervenience might be taken to mean that there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respect, or that an object cannot alter in some mental respect without altering in some physical respect.

(Davidson 1970, p.214)

Davidson uses this supervenience relation to defend a non-reductive, but nonetheless non-dualist, position with regard to the way in which the mental stands to the physical (that is, psychophysical supervenience). Though the mental is certainly dependent upon the physical, in the sense that the physical determines the mental, it cannot be reduced to it since there are no psychophysical laws while there are, of course, physical laws:

[P]sychological characteristics cannot be reduced to the others, nevertheless they may be (and I think are) strongly dependent on them. Indeed, there is a sense in which the physical characteristics of an event (or object or state) determine the psychological characteristics…

(Davidson 1973, p. 716)

Once it entered the mainstream literature via Davidson, other philosophers (Jaegwon Kim in particular) began to focus on supervenience as an object of study in its own right—the 1984 Spindel conference saw the beginnings of much of this new direction (see Horgan (ed.), 1984—required reading for those wishing to gain a deeper appreciation of the foundations of supervenience). This trend shows no signs of letting up, though there is certainly some increased negativity about the concept’s usefulness and significance. A large part of the perceived problem with supervenience is that there is no unique, agreed-upon formulation of it. Instead there are many distinct formulations. However, this might not be such a bad thing; different jobs may require different tools. It is entirely possible that the fortunes of supervenience will reverse with the coming of age of the so-called “science of complexity,” for this involves direct consideration of the relationship between levels in hierarchies whereby a higher level is generated by the level below—it also involves many of the “special sciences.” Supervenience might thus provide the required conceptual framework to make sense of this feature of complex systems. It has, for example, been endorsed by Elliot Sober (1993) as the best way of understanding the biological concept of “fitness,” the idea being that fitness is something exhibited by very different species and individuals in relation to very different environments.

3. The Unlovely Proliferation of Formulations

We come now to the “embarrassment of riches” issue concerning the formulation of supervenience—the problem of there appearing to be too many possible formulations. David Lewis refers to this as an “unlovely proliferation” (1986, p.14). The proliferation arises simply in trying to pin down what is meant by supervenience in a precise way. The core idea that a formulation needs to capture is that fixing some one set of properties fixes some other property (or properties). The first distinction we meet is that between weak and strong supervenience. These can be stated simply enough in plain English as follows:

[Weak-SV]: For any possible world w, B-duplicates in w are A-duplicates in w.

[Strong-SV]: For any possible worlds w and w*, B-duplicates (x and y) in w and w* respectively are A-duplicates in w and w* respectively.

So, for example, according to Weak-SV, if we (perhaps here on our ‘plain vanilla’ Earth) managed to create a Star-Trek style replication machine and proceeded to replicate the physical makeup of a person P, generating a copy Prep, then P and Prep would share their mental characteristics too: “same worldly” physical duplicates are also mental duplicates. To understand Strong-SV we simply imagine that some Twin-Earthlings (in another possible world) got hold of an exact blueprint of P and are sufficiently advanced to be able to create a physical replica. Once again P and Prep are mental duplicates since they are physical duplicates. (By simply setting w = w*, and assuming the same types of worlds, we see that Strong-SV implies Weak-SV, but not vice versa.)

The difference between Weak and Strong supervenience, then, simply boils down to their respective modal strengths. One world is quantified over in the former, with objects compared within a world, while all worlds (subject to some restriction) are quantified over in the latter, with objects compared across worlds. For this reason Jackson (1998, p. 9) refers to these types as “intra-world” and “inter-world” supervenience respectively. Clearly the weak formulation cannot support basic counterfactuals of the form “if there were some B-duplicate of some object, then it would be an A-duplicate too.” Without this ability, Weak-SV is pretty much useless, for some dependency might be purely accidental. For example, it is perfectly consistent with Weak-SV that there be a world physically identical to ours yet with no conscious beings. (Though, of course, if one wants to describe such possibly accidental relations then Weak-SV might indeed be the right tool for the job.) Note also that Weak-SV does not tell us that a certain group of B-properties makes one morally good, or a piece beautiful, or a piece of matter alive. All Weak-SV tells us is that B-twins are A-twins; it does not tell us whether B-twins are one way or the other morally speaking, for example, just that whatever goes for on goes for the other. Hence, it fails to accomplish the task we set it: namely, to encode a notion of dependence and determination. Strong-SV gets around this problem of course, but it has its own problems. Suppose that there are two individuals, Fred and Ted, inhabiting worlds w and w* respectively. Let Fred and Ted be “almost” B-duplicates, differing only in one single trivial B-property, suppose one is wearing aftershave and the other is not. Then it follows from Strong-SV that Fred could be conscious but Ted not, all because he didn’t remember to put aftershave on!

There are alternative “modal operator” [MO] versions of the weak and strong formulations of supervenience. Again in “plain” English, these are:

[MO-Weak-SV]: Necessarily, if anything has property F in A, then there is some property G in B such that the thing has G, and whatever has G has F.

[MO-Strong-SV]: Necessarily, if anything has property F in A, then there is some property G in B such that the thing has G, and necessarily whatever has G has F.

The only difference between strong and weak here is that the strong formulation features an additional necessity operator. What these definitions amount to is this: Weak supervenience holds at any world (given restrictions on the class of worlds), and once that world is selected one compares B-duplicates, in that world, and sees whether they are A-duplicates, if weak supervenience is true then they will be. Strong supervenience holds at any world (again, given restrictions on the allowable worlds), and once a world is selected it follows that at any world accessible from that world, objects in the initially selected and the accessed world that are B-duplicates, will be A-duplicates—hence, one can compare cross-world cases. The modal operator versions capture something that the possible worlds formulations miss, namely that possession of a supervenient property demands that a subvenient one be had as well. So, in the possible worlds formulation, two things can be B-duplicates by not possessing any B-properties (that is, if they exactly zero B-properties)! Not so in the modal operator versions.

Another distinction concerns that between Weak-SV and Strong-SV, taken as a pair, and Global supervenience, which we can write as:

[Global-SV]: Possible worlds w and w* that are B-duplicates are also A-duplicates.

Thus, whereas Weak-SV and Strong-SV concern the properties of individual objects (within a world and potentially across worlds respectively), Global-SV concerns whole possible worlds and the pattern of properties distributed over them. One might wish for such a formulation to capture certain philosophical theses, such as physicalism (roughly: fixing the physical facts fixes everything), Humean supervenience (roughly: everything is fixed by the spatiotemporal distribution of local intrinsic properties), or determinism (roughly: everything to the future is fixed by the present, and perhaps past, facts), which involve worlds (or ‘world segments’) taken as individual objects. In each formulation, though, we can distinguish between cases with differing modal force by quantifying over different types of possible world (that is, by imposing different accessibility relations on the set of worlds). An accessibility relation is just a binary relation RMod (w, w*) holding between pairs of worlds, w and w*, so that RMod (w, w*) is true whenever w* satisfies the same M-laws (of physics, logic, and so forth) as w. If you’re only bothered about relations satisfying our laws of physics, then you will only want to consider the nomologically possible worlds, in which case RNom (w, w*) whenever w* follows the same physical laws as w. If you want to go beyond our laws, then quantification over the metaphysically possible worlds is more appropriate (one needs to ‘expand’ the accessibility relation).

There is some confusion in spelling out what is meant in saying that worlds are B-duplicates. Does it mean that the worlds may differ in other ways, so long as they do not differ with respect to B-properties? For example, might we consider two worlds B-duplicates where one world, but not the other, has ghosts (with C-properties)? If they are B-duplicates, and B-properties account for all there is, and the worlds contain the same individuals, then what distinguishes such worlds? These issues can cause problems when one tries to put supervenience to work. Moreover, Global-SV faces a similar problem to that mentioned with regard to Strong-SV. So long as two worlds are not B-duplicates they can differ in any way you like with respect to their A-properties. For example, if one single atom is out of place, then this could mean that one world has conscious beings and the other world only has zombies!

A further distinction is to be made between “single domain supervenience” and “multiple domain supervenience.” The difference here concerns whether we wish to consider the A- and B-properties associated to the same or to different things respectively. In the latter, multiple domain case, one would look at those cases where there cannot be A-differences in one thing without a B-difference in some other distinct thing. Thus, weak and strong are clearly single domain formulations. The multiple domain account has several applications: for example, in the case of the problem of material composition (for example, the way a statue stands to the lump of clay that out of which it is composed), those who believe that the statue and the clay literally coincide (share their spatial boundaries at a time, if not for all time, and indeed these divergent histories is what makes them different—they can also differ in their modal properties, so that they satisfy different counterfactuals) will want to say that the statue supervenes on the clay. But since these are two different things, according to the coincidence advocate, w will need a multiple domain account. For the same reasons, those who view societies, or other similar structures, as separate objects, autonomous from the individuals from which they are composed, will need a multiple domain account if they wish to say that social properties supervene on the properties of the underlying individuals. (One can also formulate “local” or “regional” supervenience, which restrict the supervenience relation to a spacetime region within a world, rather than some concrete object within a world. Again, this splits into weak and strong versions.)

There is something of a cottage industry devoted to spelling out the various entailment relations between the various formulations. We saw that Strong-SV implies Weak-SV, and it looks like Strong-SV implies Global-SV too. However, the converse is trickier: given a certain understanding of the properties involved, they become equivalent. However, equivalence is ruled out by a simple counterexample (due to Petrie): Suppose we have two worlds w and w*, each with two properties A = {S}| and B= {P}, and two individuals x and y (and no more) in world w, and x* and y* (and no more) in world w*. The world w is characterized by the following distribution of properties over its individuals: Px, Sx, Py, ~Sy. While world w* is characterized by the distribution: Px*, ~Sx*, ~Py*, and ~Sy*. Clearly, strong supervenience is ruled out by this model since x and x* are B-duplicates but not A-duplicates. But this isn’t incompatible with global supervenience because the worlds are not B-duplicates, so A-duplication is irrelevant. The fact that this model is consistent with global supervenience yet inconsistent with strong supervenience is enough, says Petrie, to show that they are not equivalent. There are objections to this argument, but we shan’t go in to these matters here. Let us instead turn to some controversial issues that arise in contemporary debates.

4. Supervenience and Causation

Supervenient properties are often those to which we wish to attach causal powers. For example, mental effects from mental causes and even physical effects from mental causes. If one thinks of an old love it may cause one to feel sad, or have some other emotion. It may cause one to cry. But the mental supervenes on the physical, which means that the physical fixes the mental. So both mental causes and mental effects are supervenient on some physical conditions. But then the mental cause is irrelevant here since the physical conditions are sufficient to bring about the effect. At best, the mental effect is over-determined by the mental and physical causes. At worst, it leads to epiphenomenalism about mental properties. Presumably the ground of the supervenience relation will be relevant here.

If the supervenient properties are understood as emergent, then it is possible that some “global” properties, to do with a whole system, can causally effect other things, and its parts (the supervenience base). For example, a group of agents can interact to generate an economy, but the economy has properties of its own (prices, interest rates, and such like); these will be able to influence how the agents behave. In other words, there is the possibility of a ‘feedback loop’ from global to local. Such a possibility would appear not to be available in the case of a “mereological” grounding of a supervenience relation, according to which the whole is just identified with the sum of its parts. In the former case, the whole is supposed to be some how more than the sum of its parts (due to the non-linear nature of the interactions between the parts). But, nonetheless, in both cases, once we fix the subvenient properties, we fix the supervenient ones too. However, there are very problematic causal issues involved in the case with a feedback loop where we would appear to have “downward causation” so that the supervenient properties constrain and even modify the subvenient ones. The existence of a “preferred direction” to the relation seems to have been lost in such cases. This is an interesting topic in need of much further work, but we cannot pursue it further here.

5. Reduction, Emergence, and Multiple Realization

Reductionism is as old as philosophy itself. The ancient Greek cosmologists each defended what appear to be reductive theories according to which everything that exists is made up of some single fundamental element or a group of such elements. Most apt here is the version of atomism given to us by Leuccipus and Democritus according to which all things, including secondary qualities, souls, and thoughts, were reduced to atoms moving in the void. But there are some things that, it seems, are not easily reducible. Take Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony. How does one reduce this? To a sound structure (that is, a sequence of sounds)? If so, then many different sound structures can realize it, on CDs, Vinyl, a badly tuned piano, and so on. This piece of music is, then, multiply realizable (there is a many-to-one relationship between the subvenient realizations and the supervenient property). We might also consider some “higher order” properties of musical works, say “being a grand piece of music.” This property too is multiply realizable: there are many ways to be a grand piece of music. This seems to rule out reduction, at least to a unique sound structure. But, and here we return to Hare’s example, if there are two indistinguishable realizations, then if one is a grand work of music, the other cannot fail to be. The grandeur is determined by the sound structure—we are, of course, assuming that grandeur is a property intrinsic to a work, otherwise one and the same sound structure could be both grand and not grand.

This multiple realizability lies at the core of supervenience’s job, namely, to describe a dependency weaker than identity and reduction. The idea is, that fixing the physical properties of the work of music (the tones, durations, intensities, and so on) suffices to fix any and all aesthetic properties the piece might have. But then the idea of emergence amounts to the claim that these aesthetic properties (and similar higher-level properties) are not reducible to the physical ones, they are something “novel” arising from the physical organization. (The distinction between physical and non-physical properties here amounts to both the fact that the latter type can be had by many objects with different natures and constitutions, and the fact that the former type obey the laws of, possibly complete, physics. However, nothing said here hinges on this distinction, one might as well say that aesthetic properties are physical too, since they occupy the world. Thus, this is just a way of speaking to label a curious fact, namely that some properties seem not to be reducible to what are standardly taken to be unproblematic ‘physical’ properties, such as mass, charge, spin, and so on.) Dualism and epiphenomenalism are avoided (1) because the physical facts are needed to fix the emergent facts and (2) because the emergent properties are supposed to be causally efficacious: the beauty of the Adagio from Mahler’s Fifth Symphony can cause a person to cry; it isn’t the durations, intensities, and pitch of sounds that is causally responsible—though one might conceivably take a hard line here and argue that it is precisely the physical (subvenient) properties that cause the tears. (Though it must be understood that causation is far from simple in these contexts, as we saw in the previous section.)

In an early and pioneering work on supervenience and determination, in the context of a defense and formulation of physicalism, Hellman and Thompson were concerned with separating out supervenience from reduction. Physicalism can be understood simply as follows: When God made the World, did he just have to fix the facts regarding the elementary particles and the forces (the B-properties) and all the rest (the A-properties: colors, qualia, aesthetic properties, moral properties, and so forth) followed from that, or did he have to then attach all the rest? A physicalist will answer Yes to the former question. Supervenience, or rather determination, is supposed to support the affirmative answer, for it says precisely that the B-properties determine the A-properties. Hellman and Thompson wanted to show that supervenience is neutral in respect of reduction between supervenient and subvenient levels of properties.

Why might we wish to defend the view that supervenience is non-reductive? One reason, as we have seen, is to capture a notion of ontological dependence—say of the mind on physical brain states or processes—without eliminating the mind, or identifying the mind with the brain states. The problem with such a view is that prima facie it appears to let in ‘unphysical’ properties, that either amount to dualism or epiphenomenalism. There is certainly a problem in making ontological sense of supervenient properties, but one needn’t espouse either dualism or epiphenomenalism if one is committed to a supervenience thesis. For all that is being said is that fixing some one set of facts fixes some others. However, there is an argument that attempts to demonstrate that supervenience is reductive. Let us consider this argument, and then present one against reduction.

The argument is given in Kim’s “Supervenience and Nomological Incommensurables”. In capsule form, it goes as follows: Suppose we have two sets of properties, P (for physical) and S (for special, as in special science). Let s be a property in S and let pn be the list of properties contained in P. Define qn to be the set of maximally conjunctive properties that can be built from pn (where the maximally conjunctive condition means that for each pi, either pi or its negation is a conjunct of qn). If S is supervenient on P then any pair of objects that share some qi must both possess s or both lack s. Now, let D be the disjunction of all of those qi such that if an object has qi then it has s too. However, this implies that possession of an S property is equivalent to possession of a P property. In other words, for all x’s, s has x if and only if D has x (in shorthand: x , s(x) iff D(x)). This, of course, is tantamount to a reduction of S to P, for the claim is that every higher level, supervenient, property is coextensive with some Boolean complex of lower level, subvenient, properties, say a long (possibly infinite) disjunction of properties. Thus, any two objects with the supervenient property A must possess the very same subvenient property B, but B is a very complex property that will involve an exhaustive list of the ways that A could be had by any object.

Hellmann and Thompson’s strategy is to disallow infinite conjunctions and disjunctions of properties, thereby blocking the route to the infinitely complex properties that Kim’s argument let in, and therefore blocking the route to reduction. However, while an outright ban on such properties may be otherwise well motivated, it is too ad hoc in this case. A more promising approach to stop Kim’s argument is to simply not allow that the kind of Boolean operations that Kim utilizes to generate new properties result in genuine properties. One might apply this strategy either to negations of properties, disjunctive properties, conjunctive properties, or some combination of these (see McLaughlin’s article “Varieties of Supervenience”).

In his “Reduction of Mind” Lewis speaks of supervenience as a reductive principle, going somewhat against the philosophical grain. As a build up he writes:

I hold, as an a priori principle, that every contingent truth must be made true, somehow, by the pattern of coinstantiation of fundamental properties and relations [that is, occurring all together]. The whole truth about the world, including the mental part of the world, supervenes on this pattern. If two possible worlds were exactly isomorphic in their patterns of coinstantiation of fundamental properties and relations, they would thereby be exactly alike simpliciter.

(Lewis 1994, p.292)

Lewis adds to this that all the fundamental properties and relations are physical, so that a materialist thesis is generated from the supervenience—the position amounts, more or less, to a statement of his “Humean Supervenience;” the claim that “All there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of fact…And that is all” (1986, p.ix-x) so that “truth supervenes on being” (1994b, p.225). But how can supervenience be reductive? Lewis gives the following example:

Imagine a grid of a million tiny spots – pixels – each of which can be made light or dark. When some are light and some are dark, they form a picture, replete with interesting gestalt properties. The case evokes reductionist comments. Yes, the picture really does exist. Yes, it really does have those gestalt properties. However, the picture and the properties reduce to the arrangement of light and dark pixels. They are nothing over and above the pixels. They make nothing true that is not made true already by the pixels. They could go unmentioned in an inventory of what there is without thereby rendering that inventory incomplete. And so on.

(Lewis 1994, p. 294)

Such comments Lewis happily endorses: “The picture reduces to the pixels. And that is because the picture supervenes on the pixels” (loc. cit.). Lewis’ position here stems from the fact that the supervenience relation is (in this case, at least) non-symmetric and relates large to small—though it isn’t at all obvious that this is sufficient for reduction.

However, there is a way for the anti-reductionist to respond here, and this response ties in to much of the contemporary debate regarding supervenience (and emergence). The response is known as the “multiple realizability” objection, and was first used by Jerry Fodor (1974) in the context of the debate concerning the non-reducibility of special science to lower-level science (ultimately, physics). The argument, in a nutshell, is that properties associated to a ‘special science’ (for example, psychology) can be realized by a multitude of heterogeneous lower-level properties or states. Let us see how this works by focusing on a simplified example given by Putnam (1975).

We are asked to consider a board that has a round hole in it of 5 inches in diameter, and a square peg that is 5 inches on each of its sides. Clearly the peg will not go into the hole. The question we are faced with is why the peg does not go through. Obviously, says Putnam, the respective size and shape of the peg and hole give us the answer. These properties, size and shape, Putnam refers to as “macroproperties”, as contrasted with the “microproperties,” of the peg and board, namely the positions, momenta, charge, and so forth, of the atoms composing them. Clearly the shape and size of the peg and the board supervene on the microproperties. Do these microproperties provide an answer to the above question? Putnam says not, because the details at that level are irrelevant to why the peg did not penetrate the board: the microproperties could have been very different, in fact, and the result would have been the same. What are we to conclude from this? That the “peg/board/hole”-level features (the macroproperties) are autonomous, so that they cannot be reduced to lower-level features (the microproperties). This is, more or less, just multiple realizability again, but here it keys in to an interesting aspect of that concept. It tells us that what is explainable using supervenient features is not always explainable using the associated subvenient features. Here one can make connections traditional issues with philosophy of science.

There are dissenting voices to Putnam’s thesis, but we shall not go any further into the ins and outs of the debate here since it quickly becomes dense and complex. Suffice it to say that supervenience is still “live” in many philosophical debates and will no doubt continue to remain so for some time to come.

6. Adding Mystery to Mystery?

Supervenience is something of a halfway house. It is called upon by some to ground a view according to which certain properties that we think of as “unphysical” are not definable in terms of, or reducible to physical properties and yet are nonetheless connected in some way. It is supposed to somehow avoid the mystery of how physical matters can have a determinative role to play in unphysical properties, without those unphysical properties causing a problem in being materialistically un-kosher. For others, supervenience is a reductive principle, a matter of how the world is and must be.

Many philosophers have complained about the (in)significance of supervenience. Stephen Schiffer suggests that the invocation of supervenience simply moves the explanatory task back a step. How, he asks,

could being told that non-natural moral properties stood in the supervenience relation to physical properties make them any more palatable? On the contrary, invoking a special primitive metaphysical relation of supervenience to explain how non-natural moral properties were related to physical properties was just to add mystery to mystery, to cover one obscurantist move with another.

(Schiffer 1987, p.153-4)

Much recent work has been devoted to decrying the philosophical utility of specific formulations of supervenience, the general idea, or proving equivalences between them. All of the formulations we have seen do no more than to chart certain correlations between properties. They do not tell us anything about dependency or determination between the properties, in the sense of, say, a causal relation. Supervenience directs us to search for the underlying reasons for the correlation—it might not always be there. In the case of the special sciences it isn’t clear that an “underlying reason” is to be found. Kim (1987, p. 167), for example, believes that supervenience is not a “deep” metaphysical relation, but instead is a superficial relation that points to some other ‘deeper’ relation that might explain the superficial pattern of dependency—though more recently Kim has shifted to a reductive view of the relation (see Kim, 2005, for a clear account). In this sense, supervenience is a useful concept, for it can function as a filter on types of relations, letting through those of a certain type. Once we have identified a dependence relation, we can then delve deeper to see what might account for it: causation, mereology, definition, emergence, and so forth. In this sense there is no question of supervenience being an explanatory device, so there is no mystery here; but it can nonetheless be used in the search for explanations.

Supervenience has many useful applications too, in making other areas of philosophy clearer and more navigable. For example, the internalism/externalism distinction concerning mental content [very roughly, externalism is the view that mental content depends on things outside of the mind as well as inside; internalism denies this—saying that only what’s inside matters] can be cast into the endorsement and denial respectively of the following supervenience thesis: the content of a mental state (that is, what it is about) supervenes on certain neurobiological properties (narrow content). On the other hand, the externalist, as can be discerned from the rough characterization above, believes that there is more to content than this: the world plays a role too. One can clarify the distinction between internal and external relations too: an internal relation is one that supervenes on the intrinsic properties of its relata (for example, being heavier than), while this is not true in the case of external relations (for example, being 2 miles away from); it does not matter what something is like for it satisfy this latter relation, but it does for the former. We have seen too that it allows for a definition of physicalism and helps with the puzzle of material coincidence. Surely, if by a concept’s work shall you know it, supervenience deserves the central place that it has found in the philosophers’ toolbox.

7. References and Further Reading

For a more technical and detailed presentation of the concept of supervenience, see McLaughlin and Bennett’s article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

  • Beckermann, A., Flohr, H., & Kim, J., (eds.). Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1992.
  • Davidson, D. 1970. “Mental Events.” In D. Davidson (ed.), Essays on Actions and Events, 1980: 207-225.
  • Davidson, D. “The Material Mind.” In P. Suppes (ed.), Logic, Methodology and the Philosophy of Science. North-Holland. Reprinted in Essays on Action and Events (Oxford University Press, 1980).
  • Fodor, J. “Special Sciences, or the Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis.” Synthese, 1974, 28: 97-115.
  • Hare, R.M. The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1952.
  • Hellman, G. & Thompson, F. “Physicalism, Ontology, Determination, and Reduction,” The Journal of Philosophy, 1975, 72: 551-64.
  • Horgan, T. “From Supervenience to Superdupervenience: Meeting the Demands of a Material World.” Mind, 1993, 102: 555-86.
  • Horgan, T. (ed.) Southern Journal of Philosophy 22: The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984.
  • Jackson, F. From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Kim, J. Supervenience, or Something Near Enough. Princeton University Press, 2005.
  • Kim, J. Supervenience and Mind. Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Kim, J. “Concepts of Supervenience.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 1984, 45, 2: 153-176.
  • Kim, J. “Supervenience as a Philosophical Concept.” Reprinted in J. Kim, Supervenience and Mind, 1993 (1990): 131-160.
  • Kim, J. “’Strong’ and ‘Global’ Supervenience Revisited.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 1987, 48, 2: 315-326.
  • Lewis, D.K. The Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Lewis, D. K. “Reduction of Mind.” In D. Lewis (ed.), Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology. Cambridge University Press, 1999 (1994): 291-324.
  • McLaughlin, B. & Bennett, K. “Supervenience.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2005 Edition), edited by Edward N. Zalta.
  • McLaughlin, B.P. “The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism.” In A. Beckermann et al. (eds.), Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Walter de Gruyter, 1992: 49-93.
  • McLaughlin, B.P. “Varieties of Supervenience.” In E. Savellos & U. Yalcin (eds.), Supervenience: New Essays. Cambridge University Press, 1995: 16-59.
  • Moore, G.E. Philosophical Studies. London: Routledge, 1922.
  • Paull, C.P. & Sider, T.R. 1992. “In Defense of Global Supervenience,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 32, 1992: 830-45.
  • Post, J. F. “Comment on Teller.” In Horgan (ed.), The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984: 163-167.
  • Putnam, H. “Philosophy and our Mental Life.” In Mind, Language, and Reality. Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • E. Savellos & U. Yalcin (eds.), Supervenience: New Essays. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Schiffer, S. Remnants of Meaning. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1987.
  • Sober, E. The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus. University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Stalnaker, R. “Varieties of Supervenience.” Philosophical Perspectives 10, 1996: 221-241.
  • Teller, P. “A Poor Man’s Guide to Supervenience and Determination.” In Horgan (ed.), The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984: 137-50.

Author Information

Dean Rickles
University of Calgary