Plato: Theaetetus

platoThe Theaetetus is one of the middle to later dialogues of the ancient Greek philosopher Plato. Plato was Socrates’ student and Aristotle’s teacher. As in most of Plato’s dialogues, the main character is Socrates. In the Theaetetus, Socrates converses with Theaetetus, a boy, and Theodorus, his mathematics teacher. Although this dialogue features Plato’s most sustained discussion on the concept of knowledge, it fails to yield an adequate definition of knowledge, thus ending inconclusively. Despite this lack of a positive definition, the Theaetetus has been the source of endless scholarly fascination. In addition to its main emphasis on the nature of cognition, it considers a wide variety of philosophical issues: the Socratic Dialectic, Heraclitean Flux, Protagorean Relativism, rhetorical versus philosophical life, and false judgment. These issues are also discussed in other Platonic dialogues.

The Theaetetus poses a special difficulty for Plato scholars trying to interpret the dialogue: in light of Plato’s metaphysical and epistemological commitments, expounded in earlier dialogues such as the Republic, the Forms are the only suitable objects of knowledge, and yet the Theaetetus fails explicitly to acknowledge them. Might this failure mean that Plato has lost faith in the Forms, as the Parmenides suggests, or is this omission of the Forms a calculated move on Plato’s part to show that knowledge is indeed indefinable without a proper acknowledgement of the Forms? Scholars have also been puzzled by the picture of the philosopher painted by Socrates in the digression: there the philosopher emerges as a man indifferent to the affairs of the city and concerned solely with “becoming as much godlike as possible.” What does this version of the philosophic life have to do with a city-bound Socrates whose chief concern was to benefit his fellow citizens? These are only two of the questions that have preoccupied Plato scholars in their attempt to interpret this highly complex dialogue.

Table of Contents

  1. The Characters of Plato’s Theaetetus
  2. Date of Composition
  3. Outline of the Dialogue
    1. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences (146c – 151d)
    2. Knowledge as Perception (151d – 186e)
    3. Knowledge as True Judgment (187a – 201c)
    4. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos (201c – 210d)
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Commentaries
    2. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences
    3. Knowledge as Perception
    4. Knowledge as True Judgment
    5. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos

1. The Characters of Plato’s Theaetetus

In the Theaetetus, Socrates converses with two mathematicians, Theaetetus and Theodorus. Theaetetus is portrayed as a physically ugly but extraordinarily astute boy, and Theodorus is his mathematics teacher. According to the Oxford Classical Dictionary, Theaetetus lived in Athens (c. 415–369 BCE) and was a renowned geometer. He is credited with the theory of irrational lines, a contribution of fundamental importance for Euclid’s Elements X. He also worked out constructions of the regular solids like those in Elements XIII. Theodorus lived in Cyrene in the late fifth century BCE. In the dialogue, he is portrayed as a friend of Protagoras, well-aware of the Sophist’s teachings, and quite unfamiliar with the intricacies of Socratic Dialectic. As far as his scientific work is concerned, the only existing source is Plato’s Theaetetus: In the dialogue, Theodorus is portrayed as having shown the irrationality of the square roots of 3, 5, 6, 7, … ,17.  Irrational numbers are numbers equal to an ordinary fraction, a fraction that has whole numbers in its numerator and denominator. The passage has been interpreted in many different ways, and its historical accuracy has been disputed.

2. Date of Composition

The introduction of the dialogue informs the reader that Theaetetus is being carried home dying of wounds and dysentery after a battle near Corinth. There are two known battles that are possibly the one referred to in the dialogue: the first one took place at about 394 BCE, and the other occurred at around 369 BCE. Scholars commonly prefer the battle of 369 BCE as the battle referred to in the dialogue. The dialogue is a tribute to Theaetetus’ memory and was probably written shortly after his death, which most scholars date around 369 – 367 BCE. It is uncontroversial that the Theaetetus, the Sophist and the Statesman were written in that order. The primary evidence for this order is that the Sophist begins with a reference back to the Theaetetus and a reference forward to the Statesman. In addition, there is a number of thematic continuities between the Theaetetus and the Sophist (for instance, the concept of “false belief,” and the notions of “being,” “sameness,” and “difference”) and between the Sophist and the Statesman (such as the use of the method of “collection and division”).

3. Outline of the Dialogue

The dialogue examines the question, “What is knowledge (episteme)?” For heuristic purposes, it can be divided into four sections, in which a different answer to this question is examined: (i) Knowledge is the various arts and sciences; (ii) Knowledge is perception; (iii) Knowledge is true judgment; and (iv) Knowledge is true judgment with an “account” (Logos). The dialogue itself is prefaced by a conversation between Terpsion and Euclid, in the latter’s house in Megara. From this conversation we learn about Theaetetus’ wounds and impending death and about Socrates’ prophecy regarding the future of the young man. In addition, we learn about the dialogue’s recording method: Euclid had heard the entire conversation from Socrates, he then wrote down his memoirs of the conversation, while checking the details with Socrates on subsequent visits to Athens. Euclid’s role did not consist simply in writing down Socrates’ memorized version of the actual dialogue; he also chose to cast it in direct dialogue, as opposed to narrative form, leaving out such connecting sentences as “and I said” and “he agreed.” Finally, Euclid’s product is read for him and for Terpsion by a slave. This is the only Platonic dialogue which is being read by a slave.

a. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences (146c – 151d)

To Socrates’ question, “What is knowledge?,” Theaetetus responds by giving a list of examples of knowledge, namely geometry, astronomy, harmonics, and arithmetic, as well as the crafts or skills (technai) of cobbling and so on (146c–d). These he calls “knowledges,” presumably thinking of them as the various branches of knowledge. As Socrates correctly observes, Theaetetus’ answer provides a list of instances of things of which there is knowledge. Socrates states three complaints against this response: (a) what he is interested in is the one thing common to all the various examples of knowledge, not a multiplicity of different kinds of knowledge; (b) Theaetetus’ response is circular, because even if one knows that, say, cobbling is “knowledge of how to make shoes,” one cannot know what cobbling is, unless one knows what knowledge is; (c) The youth’s answer is needlessly long-winded, a short formula is all that is required. The definition of clay as “earth mixed with water,” which is also evoked by Aristotle in Topics 127a, is representative of the type of definition needed here. Theaetetus offers the following mathematical example to show that he understands Socrates’ definitional requirements: the geometrical equivalents of what are now called “surds” could be grouped in one class and given a single name (“powers”) by dint of their common characteristic of irrationality or incommensurability. When he tries to apply the same method to the question about knowledge, however, Theaetetus does not know how to proceed. In a justly celebrated image, Socrates, like an intellectual midwife, undertakes to assist him in giving birth to his ideas and in judging whether or not they are legitimate children. Socrates has the ability to determine who is mentally pregnant, by knowing how to use “medicine” and “incantations” to induce mental labor. Socrates also has the ability to tell in whose company a young man may benefit academically. This latter skill is not one that ordinary midwives seem to have, but Socrates insists that they are the most reliable matchmakers, and in order to prove his assertion he draws upon an agricultural analogy: just as the farmer not only tends and harvests the fruits of the earth, but also knows which kind of earth is best for planting various kinds of seed, so the midwife’s art should include a knowledge of both “sowing” and “harvesting.” But unlike common midwives, Socrates’ art deals with the soul and enables him to distinguish and embrace true beliefs rather than false beliefs. By combining the technê of the midwife with that of the farmer, Socrates provides in the Theaetetus the most celebrated analogy for his own philosophical practice.

b. Knowledge as Perception (151d – 186e)

Encouraged by Socrates’ maieutic intervention, Theaetetus comes up with a serious proposal for a definition: knowledge is perception. Satisfied with at least the form of this definition, Socrates immediately converts it into Protagoras’ homo-mensura doctrine, “Man is the measure of all things, of the things that are that [or how] they are, of the things that are not that [or how] they are not.” The Protagorean thesis underscores the alleged fact that perception is not only an infallible but also the sole form of cognition, thereby bringing out the implicit assumptions of Theaetetus’ general definition. Socrates effects the complete identity between knowledge and perception by bringing together two theses: (a) the interpretation of Protagoras’ doctrine as meaning “how things appear to an individual is how they are for that individual” (e.g., “if the wind appears cold to X, then it is cold for X”); and (b) the equivalence of “Y appears F to X” with “X perceives Y as F” (e.g., “the wind appears cold to Socrates” with “Socrates perceives the wind as cold”). His next move is to build the ontological foundation of a world that guarantees perceptual infallibility. For that, Socrates turns to the Heraclitean postulate of Radical Flux, which he attributes to Protagoras as his Secret Doctrine. Nearly all commentators acknowledge that Protagoras’ secret teaching is unlikely to be a historically accurate representation of either Protagoras’ ontological commitments or Heraclitus’ Flux doctrine. The notion of Universal Flux makes every visual event—for example the visual perception of whiteness—the private and unique product of interaction between an individual’s eyes and an external motion. Later this privacy is explained with the metaphor of the perceiver and the perceived object as parents birthing a twin offspring, the object’s whiteness and the subject’s corresponding perception of it. Both parents and offspring are unique and unrepeatable: there can be no other, identical interaction between either the same parents or different parents able to produce the same offspring. No two perceptions can thus ever be in conflict with each other, and no one can ever refute anyone else’s perceptual judgments, since these are the products of instantaneous perceptual relations, obtaining between ever-changing perceiving subjects and ever-changing perceived objects. Although the assimilation of Protagorean Relativism to Theaetetus’ definition requires the application of the doctrine to Perceptual Relativism—which explains Socrates’ extensive focus on the mechanics of perception—one should bear in mind that the man-as-measure thesis is broader in scope, encompassing all judgments, especially judgments concerning values, such as “the just” and “the good,” and not just narrowly sensory impressions. Socrates launches a critique against both interpretations of Protagoreanism, beginning with its broad—moral and epistemological—dimensions, and concluding with its narrow, perceptual aspects.

Socrates attacks broad Protagoreanism from within the standpoint afforded him by three main arguments. First, Socrates asks how, if people are each a measure of their own truth, some, among whom is Protagoras himself, can be wiser than others. The same argument appears in Cratylus 385e–386d as a sufficient refutation of the homo-mensura doctrine. The Sophists’ imagined answer evinces a new conceptualization of wisdom: the wisdom of a teacher like Protagoras has nothing to do with truth, instead it lies in the fact that he can better the way things appear to other people, just as the expert doctor makes the patient feel well by making his food taste sweet rather than bitter, the farmer restores health to sickly plants by making them feel better, and the educator “changes a worse state into a better state” by means of words (167a).

The second critique of Protagoras is the famous self-refutation argument. It is essentially a two-pronged argument: the first part revolves around false beliefs, while the second part, which builds on the findings of the first, threatens the validity of the man-as-measure doctrine. The former can be sketched as follows: (1) many people believe that there are false beliefs; therefore, (2) if all beliefs are true, there are [per (1)] false beliefs; (3) if not all beliefs are true, there are false beliefs; (4) therefore, either way, there are false beliefs (169d–170c). The existence of false beliefs is inconsistent with the homo-mensura doctrine, and hence, if there are false beliefs, Protagoras’ “truth” is false. But since the homo-mensura doctrine proclaims that all beliefs are true, if there are false beliefs, then the doctrine is manifestly untenable. The latter part of Socrates’ second critique is much bolder—being called by Socrates “the most subtle argument”—as it aims to undermine Protagoras’ own commitment to relativism from within the relativist framework itself (170e–171c). At the beginning of this critique Socrates asserts that, according to the doctrine under attack, if you believe something to be the case but thousands disagree with you about it, that thing is true for you but false for the thousands. Then he wonders what the case for Protagoras himself is. If not even he believed that man is the measure, and the many did not either (as indeed they do not), this “truth” that he wrote about is true for no one. If, on the other hand, he himself believed it, but the masses do not agree, the extent to which those who do not think so exceed those who do, to that same extent it is not so more than it is so. Subsequently, Socrates adds his “most subtle” point: Protagoras agrees, regarding his own view, that the opinion of those who think he is wrong is true, since he agrees that everybody believes things that are so. On the basis of this, he would have to agree that his own view is false. On the other hand, the others do not agree that they are wrong, and Protagoras is bound to agree, on the basis of his own doctrine, that their belief is true. The conclusion, Socrates states, inevitably undermines the validity of the Protagorean thesis: if Protagoras’ opponents think that their disbelief in the homo-mensura doctrine is true and Protagoras himself must grant the veracity of that belief, then the truth of the Protagorean theory is disputed by everyone, including Protagoras himself.

In the famous digression (172a–177c), which separates the second from the third argument against broad Protagoreanism, Socrates sets up a dichotomy between the judicial and the philosophical realm: those thought of as worldly experts in issues of justice are blind followers of legal practicalities, while the philosophical mind, being unrestricted by temporal or spatial limitations, is free to investigate the true essence of justice. Civic justice is concerned with the here-and-now and presupposes a mechanical absorption of rules and regulations, whereas philosophical examination leads to an understanding of justice as an absolute, non-relativistic value. This dichotomy between temporal and a-temporal justice rests on a more fundamental conceptual opposition between a civic morality and a godlike distancing from civic preoccupations. Godlikeness, Socrates contends, requires a certain degree of withdrawal from earthly affairs and an attempt to emulate divine intelligence and morality. The otherworldliness of the digression has attracted the attention of, among others, Aristotle, in Nicomachean Ethics X 7, and Plotinus, who in Enneads I 2, offers an extended commentary of the text.

In his third argument against broad Protagoreanism, Socrates exposes the flawed nature of Protagoras’ definition of expertise, as a skill that points out what is beneficial, by contrasting sensible properties—such as hot, which may indeed be immune to interpersonal correction—and values, like the good and the beneficial, whose essence is independent from individual appearances. The reason for this, Socrates argues, is that the content of value-judgments is properly assessed by reference to how things will turn out in the future. Experts are thus people who have the capacity to foresee the future effects of present causes. One may be an infallible judge of whether one is hot now, but only the expert physician is able accurately to tell today whether one will be feverish tomorrow. Thus the predictive powers of expertise cast the last blow on the moral and epistemological dimensions of Protagorean Relativism.

In order to attack narrow Protagoreanism, which fully identifies knowledge with perception, Socrates proposes to investigate the doctrine’s Heraclitean underpinnings. The question he now poses is: how radical does the Flux to which the Heracliteans are committed to must be in order for the definition of knowledge as perception to emerge as coherent and plausible? His answer is that the nature of Flux that sanctions Theaetetus’ account must be very radical, indeed too radical for the definition itself to be either expressible or defensible. As we saw earlier, the Secret Doctrine postulated two kinds of motion: the parents of the perceptual event undergo qualitative change, while its twin offspring undergoes locomotive change. To the question whether the Heracliteans will grant that everything undergoes both kinds of change, Socrates replies in the affirmative because, were that not the case, both change and stability would be observed in the Heraclitean world of Flux. If then everything is characterized by all kinds of change at all times, what can we say about anything? The answer is “nothing” because the referents of our discourse would be constantly shifting, and thus we would be deprived of the ability to formulate any words at all about anything. Consequently, Theaetetus’ identification of knowledge with perception is deeply problematic because no single act can properly be called “perception” rather than “non perception,” and the definiendum is left with no definiens.

After Socrates has shown that narrow Protagoreanism, from within the ontological framework of radical Heracliteanism, is untenable, he proceeds to reveal the inherent faultiness of Theaetetus’ definition of knowledge as perception. In his final and most decisive argument, Socrates makes the point that perhaps the most basic thought one can have about two perceptible things, say a color and a sound, is that they both “are.” This kind of thought goes beyond the capacity of any one sense: sight cannot assess the “being” of sound, nor can hearing assess that of color. Among these “common” categories, i.e., categories to which no single sensual organ can afford access, Socrates includes “same,” “different,” “one,” and “two,” but also values, such as “fair” and “foul.” All of these are ascertained by the soul through its own resources, with no recourse to the senses. Theaetetus adds that the soul “seems to be making a calculation within itself of past and present in relation to future” (186b). This remark ties in with Socrates’ earlier attribution to expertise of the ability to predict the future outcome of present occurrences. But it also transcends that assertion in the sense that now a single unified entity, the soul, is given cognitive supremacy, in some cases with the assistance of the senses whereas in other cases the soul “itself by itself.” Perception is thus shown to be an inadequate candidate for knowledge, and the discussion needs to foreground the activity of the soul when “it is busying itself over the things-which-are” (187a). The name of that activity is judging, and it is to this that the second part of the conversation now turns.

c. Knowledge as True Judgment (187a – 201c)

While true judgment, as the definiens of knowledge, is the ostensible topic of the discussants’ new round of conversation, the de facto topic turns out to be false judgment. Judgment, as the soul’s internal reasoning function, is introduced into the discussion at this juncture, which leads Theaetetus to the formulation of the identification of knowledge with true judgment. But Socrates contends that one cannot make proper sense of the notion of “true judgment,” unless one can explain what a false judgment is, a topic that also emerges in such dialogues as Euthydemus, Cratylus, Sophist, Philebus, and Timaeus. In order to examine the meaning of “false judgment,” he articulates five essentially abortive ways of looking at it: (a) false judgment as “mistaking one thing for another” (188a–c); (b) false judgment as “thinking what is not” (188c–189b); (c) false judgment as “other-judgment” (189b–191a); (d) false judgment as the inappropriate linkage of a perception to a memory – the mind as a wax tablet (191a–196c); and (e) potential and actual knowledge – the mind as an aviary (196d–200c).

The impossibility of false judgment as “mistaking one thing for another” is demonstrated by the apparent plausibility of the following perceptual claim: one cannot judge falsely that one person is another person, whether one knows one of them, or both of them, or neither one nor the other. The argument concerning false judgment as “thinking what is not” rests on an analogy between sense-perception and judgment: if one hears or feels something, there must be something which one hears or feels. Likewise, if one judges something, there must be something that one judges. Hence, one cannot judge “what is not,” for one’s judgment would in that case have no object, one would judge nothing, and so would make no judgment at all. This then cannot be a proper account of false judgment. The interlocutors’ failure prompts a third attempt at solving the problem: perhaps, Socrates suggests, false judgment occurs “when a man, in place of one of the things that are, has substituted in his thought another of the things that are and asserts that it is. In this way, he is always judging something which is, but judges one thing in place of another; and having missed the thing which was the object of his consideration, he might fairly be called one who judges falsely” (189c). False judgment then is not concerned with what-is-not, but with interchanging one of the things-which-are with some other of the things-which-are, for example beautiful with ugly, just with unjust, odd with even, and cow with horse. The absurdity of this substitution is reinforced by Socrates’ definition of judgment as the final stage of the mind’s conversing with itself. How is it possible, then, for one to conclude one’s silent, internal dialogue with the preposterous equation of two mutually exclusive attributes, and actually to say to oneself, “an odd number is even,” or “oddness is evenness”?

The next attempt at explaining false judgment invokes the mental acts of remembering and forgetting and the ways in which they are implicated in perceptual events. Imagine the mind as a wax block, Socrates asks Theaetetus, on which we stamp what we perceive or conceive. Whatever is impressed upon the wax we remember and know, so long as the image remains in the wax; whatever is obliterated or cannot be impressed, we forget and do not know (191d-e). False judgment consists in matching the perception to the wrong imprint, e.g., seeing at a distance two men, both of whom we know, we may, in fitting the perceptions to the memory imprints, transpose them; or we may match the sight of a man we know to the memory imprint of another man we know, when we only perceive one of them. Theaetetus accepts this model enthusiastically but Socrates dismisses it because it leaves open the possibility of confusing unperceived concepts, such as numbers. One may wrongly think that 7+5 = 11, and since 7+5 = 12, this amounts to thinking that 12 is 11. Thus arithmetical errors call for the positing of a more comprehensive theoretical account of false judgment.

Socrates’ next explanatory model, the aviary, is meant to address this particular kind of error. What Aristotle later called a distinction between potentiality and actuality becomes the conceptual foundation of this model. Socrates invites us to think of the mind as an aviary full of birds of all sorts. The owner possesses them, in the sense that he has the ability to enter the aviary and catch them, but does not have them, unless he literally has them in his hands. The birds are pieces of knowledge, to hand them over to someone else is to teach, to stock the aviary is to learn, to catch a particular bird is to remember a thing once learned and thus potentially known. The possibility of false judgment emerges when one enters the aviary in order to catch, say, a pigeon but instead catches, say, a ring-dove. To use an arithmetical example, one who has learned the numbers knows, in the sense that he possesses the knowledge of, both 11 and 12. If, when asked what is 7+5, one replies 11, one has hunted in one’s memory for 12 but has activated instead one’s knowledge of 11. Although the aviary’s distinction between potential and actual knowledge improves our understanding of the nature of episteme, it is soon rejected by Socrates on the grounds that it explains false judgment as “the interchange of pieces of knowledge” (199c). Even if one, following Theaetetus’ suggestion, were willing to place in the aviary not only pieces of knowledge but also pieces of ignorance—thereby making false judgment be the apprehension of a piece of ignorance—the question of false judgment would not be answered satisfactorily; for in that case, as Socrates says, the man who catches a piece of ignorance would still believe that he has caught a piece of knowledge, and therefore would behave as if he knew. To go back to the arithmetical example mentioned earlier, Theaetetus suggests that the mistaking of 11 for 12 happens because the man making the judgment mistakes a piece of ignorance for a piece of knowledge but acts as if he has activated his capacity for knowing. The problem is, as Socrates says, that we would need to posit another aviary to explain how the judgment-maker mistakes a piece of ignorance for a piece of knowledge.

Socrates attributes their failure to explain false judgment to their attempting to do so before they have settled the question of the nature of knowledge. Theaetetus repeats his definition of knowledge as true judgment but Socrates rejects it by means of the following argument: suppose, he says, the members of a jury are “justly persuaded of some matter, which only an eye-witness could know and which cannot otherwise be known; suppose they come to their decision upon hearsay, forming a true judgment. Hence, they have decided the case without knowledge, but, granted they did their job well, they were correctly persuaded” (201b-c). This argument shows that forming a true opinion about something by means of persuasion is different from knowing it by an appeal to the only method by means of which it can be known—in this case by seeing it—and thus knowledge and true judgment cannot be the same. After the failure of this attempt, Socrates and Theaetetus proceed to their last attempt to define knowledge.

d. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos (201c – 210d)

Theaetetus remembers having heard that knowledge is true judgment accompanied by Logos (account), adding that only that which has Logos can be known. Since Theaetetus remembers no more, Socrates decides to help by offering a relevant theory that he once heard.

According to the Dream Theory (201d-206b), the world is composed of complexes and their elements. Complexes have Logos, while elements have none, but can only be named. It is not even possible to say of an element that “it is” or “it is not,” because adding Being or non-Being to it would be tantamount to making it a complex. Elements cannot be accounted for or known, but are perceptible. Complexes, on the contrary, can be known because one can have a true belief about them and give an account of them, which is “essentially a complex of names” (202b).

After Theaetetus concedes that this is the theory he has in mind, he and Socrates proceed to examine it. In order to pinpoint the first problematic feature of the theory, Socrates uses the example of letters and syllables: the Logos of the syllable “so” – the first syllable of Socrates’ name – is “s and o”; but one cannot give a similar Logos of the syllable’s elements, namely of “s” and “o,” since they are mere noises. In that case, Socrates wonders, how can a complex of unknowable elements be itself knowable? For if the complex is simply the sum of its elements, then the knowledge of it is predicated on knowledge of its elements, which is impossible; if, on the other hand, the complex is a “single form” produced out of the collocation of its elements, it will still be an indefinable simple. The only reasonable thing to say then is that the elements are much more clearly known than the complexes.

Now, turning to the fourth definition of knowledge as true judgment accompanied by Logos, Socrates wishes to examine the meaning of the term Logos, and comes up with three possible definitions. First, giving an account of something is “making one’s thought apparent vocally by means of words and verbal expressions” (206c). The problem with this definition is that Logos becomes “a thing that everyone is able to do more or less readily,” unless one is deaf or dumb, so that anyone with a true opinion would have knowledge as well. Secondly, to give an account of a thing is to enumerate all its elements (207a). Hesiod said that a wagon contains a hundred timbers. If asked what a wagon is, the average person will most probably say, “wheels, axle, body, rails, yoke.” But that would be ridiculous, Socrates says, because it would be the same as giving the syllables of a name to someone’s asking for an account of it. The ability to do that does not preclude the possibility that a person identifies now correctly and now incorrectly the elements of the same syllable in different contexts. Finally, giving an account is defined as “being able to tell some mark by which the object you are asked about differs from all other things” (208c). As an example, Socrates uses the definition of the sun as the brightest of the heavenly bodies that circle the earth. But here again, the definition of knowledge as true judgment with Logos is not immune to criticism. For if someone, who is asked to tell what distinguishes, say, Theaetetus, a man of whom he has a correct judgment, from all other things, were to say that he is a man, and has a nose, mouth, eyes, and so on, his account would not help to distinguish Theaetetus from all other men. But if he had not already in his mind the means of differentiating Theaetetus from everyone else, he could not judge correctly who Theaetetus was and could not recognize him the next time he saw him. So to add Logos in this sense to true judgment is meaningless, because Logos is already part of true judgment, and so cannot itself be a guarantee of knowledge. To say that Logos is knowledge of the difference does not solve the problem, since the definition of knowledge as “true judgment plus knowledge of the difference” begs the question of what knowledge is.

The definition of knowledge as “true judgment plus Logos” cannot be sustained on any of the three interpretations of the term Logos. Theaetetus has nothing else to say, and the dialogue ends inconclusively. Its achievement, according to Socrates, has been to rid Theaetetus of several false beliefs so that “if ever in the future [he] should attempt to conceive or should succeed in conceiving other theories, they will be better ones as the result of this enquiry” (210b–c).

Despite its failure to produce a viable definition of knowledge, the Theaetetus has exerted considerable influence on modern philosophical thought. Socrates’ blurring of the distinction between sanity and madness in his examination of knowledge as perception was picked up in the first of Descartes’ Meditations (1641); echoes of Protagorean Relativism have appeared in important works of modern philosophy, such as Quine’s Ontological Relativity and Other Essays (1969) and Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1970); In Siris: A Chain of Philosophical Reflexions and Inquiries Concerning the Virtues of Tar-Water (1744), Bishop Berkeley thought that the dialogue anticipated the central tenets of his own theory of knowledge; in Studies in Humanism (1907), the English pragmatist F.C.S. Schiller saw in the section 166a ff. the pragmatist account of truth, first expounded and then condemned; and L. Wittgenstein, in Philosophical Investigations (1953), found in the passage 201d–202b the seed of his Logical Atomism, espoused also by Russell, and found it reminiscent of certain theses of his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus.

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Commentaries

  • Bostock, D. Plato’s Theaetetus. Oxford, 1988.
  • Burnyeat, M. F. The Theaetetus of Plato. Trans. M.J. Levett. Indianapolis and Cambridge, 1990.
  • Campbell, L. The Theaetetus of Plato. 2nd Ed. Oxford, 1883.
  • Cornford, F. M. Plato’s Theory of Knowledge. The Theaetetus and the Sophist of Plato. Trans. F. M. Cornford. London, 1935.
  • McDowell, J. Plato: Theaetetus. Trans. J. McDowell. Oxford, 1973.
  • Polansky, R. Philosophy and Knowledge: A Commentary on Plato’s Theaetetus. Lewisburg, 1992.
  • Sedley, D. N. The Midwife of Platonism: Text and Subtext in Plato’s Theaetetus. Oxford, 2004.

b. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences

  • Burnyeat, M. F. “The Philosophical Sense of Theaetetus’ Mathematics.” Isis 69 (1978). 489–513.
  • Burnyeat, M. F. “Socratic Midwifery, Platonic Inspiration.” Bulletin of the Institute of the Classical Studies 24 (1977). 7–16.
  • Santas, G. “The Socratic Fallacy.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 10 (1972). 127–41.

c. Knowledge as Perception

  • Bolton, R. “Plato’s Distinction between Being and Becoming.” Review of Metaphysics 29 (1975/6). 66–95.
  • Burnyeat, M. F. “Protagoras and Self Refutation in Plato’s Theaetetus.” Philosophical Review 85 (1976). 172–95.
  • Burnyeat, M. F. “Plato on the Grammar of Perceiving.” Classical Quarterly 26 (1976). 29–51.
  • Burnyeat, M.F. “Idealism and Greek Philosophy: What Descartes Saw and Berkeley Missed.” Philosophical Review 90 (1982). 3–40.
  • Cole, A. T. “The Apology of Protagoras.” Yale Classical Studies 19 (1966). 101–18.
  • Cooper, J. M. “Plato on Sense Perception and Knowledge: Theaetetus 184 to 186.” Phronesis 15 (1970). 123–46.
  • Lee, E.N. “Hoist with His Own Petard: Ironic and Comic Elements in Plato’s Critique of Protagoras (Tht. 161–171),” in E.N. Lee and A.P.D. Mourelatos (eds.) Exegesis and Argument: Studies in Greek Philosophy Presented to Gregory. Vlastos. Assen, 1973. 225–61.
  • Matthen, M. “Perception, Relativism, and Truth: Reflections on Plato’s Theaetetus 152 – 160.” Dialogue 24 (1985). 33–58.
  • McCabe, M.M. Plato and his Predecessors: The Dramatisation of Reason. Cambridge, 2000.
  • Modrak, D.K. “Perception and Judgment in the Theaetetus.” Phronesis 26 (1981). 35–54.
  • Rowe, C.J. et al. “Knowledge, Perception, and Memory: Theaetetus 166B.” Classical Quarterly 32 (1982). 304–6.
  • Silverman, A. “Flux and Language in the Theaetetus.” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (2000). 109–52.
  • Waterlow, S. “Protagoras and Inconsistency.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 59 (1977). 19–36.

d. Knowledge as True Judgment

  • Ackrill, J. “Plato on False Belief: Theaetetus 187–200.” Monist 50 (1966). 383–402.
  • Burnyeat, M.F. and J. Barnes, “Socrates and the Jury: Paradoxes in Plato’s Distinction Between Knowledge and True Belief.” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 54 (1980). 173-91 and 193–206.
  • Denyer, N. Language, Thought and Falsehood in Ancient Greek Philosophy. London, 1991.
  • Lewis, F.A. “Foul Play in Plato’s Aviary: Theaetetus 195Bff,” in E.N. Lee and A.P.D. Mourelatos (eds.) Exegesis and Argument: Studies in Greek Philosophy Presented to Gregory. Vlastos. Assen, 1973. 262–84.
  • G.B. Matthews, G.B. “A Puzzle in Plato: Theaetetus 189b–190e,” in David F. Austin (ed.) Philosophical Analysis: A Defense by Example. Dordrecht, 1988. 3–15.
  • Rudebusch, G. “Plato on Sense and Reference.” Mind 104 (1985). 526–37.
  • C.F.J. Williams, C.F.J. “Referential Opacity and False Belief in the Theaetetus.” Philosophical Quarterly 22 (1972). 289-302.

e. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos

  • Annas, J. “Knowledge and Language: The Theaetetus and the Cratylus,” in Malcolm Schofield and Martha C. Nussbaum (eds.) Language and Logos: Studies in Ancient Greek Philosophy presented to G.E.L. Owen. Cambridge, 1982. 95–114.
  • Fine, G.J. “Knowledge and Logos in the Theaetetus.” Philosophical Review 88 (1979). 366–97.
  • Gallop, D. “Plato and the Alphabet.” Philosophical Review 72 (1963). 364–76.
  • Morrow, G.R. ”Plato and the Mathematicians: An Interpretation of Socrates’ Dream in the Theaetetus.” Philosophical Review 79 (1970). 309–33.
  • Ryle, G. “Letters and Syllables in Plato.” Philosophical Review 69 (1960). 431–51.

Author Information

Zina Giannopoulou
University of California, Irvine
U. S. A.