Totalitarianism is best understood as any system of political ideas that is both thoroughly dictatorial and utopian. It is an ideal type of governing notion, and as such, it cannot be realised perfectly.

Faced with the brutal reality of paradigmatic cases like Stalin’s USSR and Nazi Germany, philosophers, political theorists and social scientists have felt not just intellectually motivated but morally compelled to explain the causes and implications of totalitarianism. This has been in part an attempt to explain the socio-political phenomenon in itself, as well to develop an intellectual tool in the arsenal of democracy.

Diverse philosophical perspectives have been employed. They share the important common denominator of an appeal to the value of human life, critical thought, and a pluralistic society. Many of the key figures among the anti-totalitarian thinkers discussed here were European Jewish refugees who escaped totalitarian systems. Many who work on this question have been motivated by a desire to come to grips, philosophically, with what is undoubtedly the greatest intellectual justification for mass murder in history: the twentieth century totalitarian state.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Second World War and Cold War Thought
    1. The American Pragmatists on the Values of Pluralism and Democratic Debate
      1. John Dewey on Democratic Method
      2. Sidney Hook on Heresy versus Conspiracy
    2. The British Liberal Defence of the Open Society and Pluralism
      1. Karl Popper’s Indictment of Historicism
      2. Isaiah Berlin on Liberty
      3. Jacob Talmon on Totalitarian Democracy
    3. Hannah Arendt on the Origins and Implications of Totalitarianism
    4. Erich Fromm on Escaping from Freedom: A Psychoanalytical Approach
  3. Later Work
    1. Judith Shklar’s Liberalism of Fear
    2. Avishai Margalit on the Decent Society and Totalitarianism
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The term “totalitarianism” dates to the fascist era of the 1920s and 1930s, and it was first used and popularised by Italian fascist theorists, including Giovanni Gentile. It progressively came to be extended to include not just extreme utopian dictatorships of the far right, but also Communist regimes, especially that of the Soviet Union under Joseph Stalin. It is still frequently associated with Cold War thought of the 1940s and 1950s, a period during which it was most widely utilised as a governing concept, although its philosophical implications transcend that era’s political fears and rhetoric. As used in this article, “totalitarianism” will refer to the most extreme modern dictatorships possessing perfectionistic and utopian conceptions of humanity and society.

Totalitarianism’s appeal is linked to a variety of perennial values and intellectual commitments. Although a distinctly modern problem, proto-totalitarian notions may be found in a variety of philosophical and political systems. In particular, Plato’s utopian society discussed in the Republic featured a caste-based society in which both social and moral order are to be maintained and fostered through strict political control and eugenics.

In the seventeenth century, absolutists and royalists such as Thomas Hobbes and Jacques Bossuet advocated, in various ways, a strong centralized state as a guarantor against chaos in conformity with natural law and biblical precedent. However, it was only in the early twentieth century that totalitarianism, properly understood, became a conceptual and political reality. Thinkers as diverse as Carl Schmitt in Germany and Giovanni Gentile in Italy helped to lay the foundations of fascist ideology, stressing the defensive and unifying advantages of dictatorship. In the nascent USSR, Vladimir Lenin developed Marx’s ideas from a potentially totalitarian base into a full blown communist ideology, in which Marx’s own phrase “the dictatorship of the proletariat” was interpreted explicitly to mean the dictatorship of the Soviet Communist Party.

The term “totalitarianism” is also sometimes used to refer to movements that in one way or another manifest extreme dictatorial and fanatical methods, such as cults and forms of religious extremism, and it remains controversial in scope. It has been a topic of interdisciplinary interest, with various typologies offered by political scientists (see Friedrich and Brzezinski 1956 for the locus classicus of such approaches).

This article will primarily examine some key models and criticisms of the problem of totalitarianism defended by preeminent philosophers, as well as the thoughts of some key and representative scholars in other disciplines whose work is of philosophical significance. Their perspectival range encompasses strongly liberal, intellectual historical, neo-Marxist and pragmatist approaches. All have wished to distinguish totalitarianism sharply from liberal democratic ideals and society.

2. Second World War and Cold War Thought

a. The American Pragmatists on the Values of Pluralism and Democratic Debate

It is by no means surprising that American pragmatists should have responded to the challenge of totalitarianism in the mid-twentieth century. Not just Cold War realities, but philosophical method and values were key factors in this response. Given its strong emphasis on experimental method and the value of individual experience and fallibilism in epistemology, pragmatism would seem prima facie inimical to dictatorship.

i. John Dewey on Democratic Method

Philosophy, in order to be at its best, requires both critical thinking and democratic action, on any interpretation of Dewey’s pragmatism. In a number of works published between the 1930s and his death in 1952, John Dewey felt compelled to defend democracy against the growth and expansionism of totalitarianism, and this engagement was in keeping with Dewey’s passion for social activism and public education over the course of his long life. Dewey’s action on this matter included chairing the 1937 Dewey Commission that critically examined Soviet charges against Leon Trotsky.

Dewey had been interested in the problems of democracy for some time when he wrote his 1939 democratic credo I Believe. The rapid expansion of fascism and the Soviet Great Purge of the mid to late 1930s alerted Dewey to imminent threats to individual freedom from diverse quarters. In this short work, Dewey stated that he felt compelled to emphasize the fundamental value and importance of individuals over the state in the face of creeping totalitarianism. He here affirmed the pragmatist conviction that experience and institutions tempered by democratic problem solving ought to be primary in social philosophy. Dewey held that such problem solving, in order to be ethically compelling, must be respectful of the fundamental primacy of individual rights. It must furthermore involve an important element of negotiation and compromise over dogmatic assertion.

Furthermore, Dewey held that the rise of modern dictatorships was in part a reaction to an excessive form of individualism that isolated human beings from each other, and that offered only modern capitalism in mass society as a choice:

The negative and empty character of this individualism had consequences which produced a reaction toward an equally arbitrary and one-sided collectivism. This reaction is identical with the rise of the new form of political despotism. The decline of democracy and the rise of authoritarian states which claim they can do for individuals what the latter cannot by any possibility do for themselves are the two sides of one and the same indivisible picture.

Political collectivism is now marked in all highly industrialized countries, even when it does not reach the extreme of the totalitarian state….[the individual] is told that he must make his choice between big industry and finance and the big national political state. (Dewey, 1993: 235-236).

ii. Sidney Hook on Heresy versus Conspiracy

Sidney Hook was Dewey’s prime disciple in the application of pragmatism to anti-totalitarian thought. In his highly controversial 1953 book, Heresy, Yes—Conspiracy, No, Hook incurred the allegation of McCarthyism due to his advocacy of a firm line against the American Communist Party, especially within academia and educational trade unions.

Hook, who was social democratic for much of his career, distinguished between a genuinely progressive left that operates in a heretical and democratic matter, and the Stalinist American Communist Party and its fellow travellers. Heresy, for Hook, is an entirely legitimate expression of dissent on controversial matters. However, he held the Communist movement to be inherently conspiratorial and subversive of the very ground rules of democracy, and this led him to advocate restrictions against its carrying out policies and actions inimical to elected government. In effect, Hook affirmed the legitimacy of democracy protecting itself not just from external aggression, but from internal subversion in the interest of foreign aggressors, such as the USSR. He took this to be in keeping with the pragmatist emphasis on democratic consensus and open debate in the interest of solving social problems, a methodology diametrically opposed to Stalinism.

Hook’s core thesis of muscular liberalism is powerfully stated in a New York Times Magazine article subsequently expanded into a 1953 book:

Liberalism in the twentieth century must toughen its fibre, for it is engaged in a struggle on many fronts. Liberalism must defend the free market in ideas against the racists, the professional patrioteer, and those spokesmen of the status quo who would freeze the existing inequalities of opportunity and economic power by choking off criticism.

Liberals must also defend freedom of ideas against those agents and apologists of Communist totalitarianism, who, instead of honestly defending their heresies, resort to conspiratorial methods of anonymity and other methods of fifth columnists. (Hook, 1950: 143).

The usual objections to pragmatism are pertinent to its Deweyan anti-totalitarian strain. These revolve around the claims that pragmatism has an insufficiently robust and general conception of truth and evidence to serve as an adequate foundation for ethical and political principles. Ethical foundationalists in particular, have rejected pragmatism as possessing excessively relativistic implications, and for lacking a strong sense of moral tradition.

Contemporary pragmatists have, in different ways, attempted to respond to such criticisms by stressing the great value of democratic society in upholding value pluralism and open-ended inquiry:

…democracy is not just one form of social life among other workable forms of social life; it is the precondition for the full application of intelligence to the solution of social problems. (Putnam, 1992: 180).

 Whether or not pragmatist anti-totalitarianism succeeds in its defence of democracy and individual rights is thus deeply linked to the coherence and adequacy of pragmatist defenses of a fallibilistic and at times flexible conception of truth in ethics and politics. If there is no need for traditional ethical foundationalism in upholding the value of democracy against tyranny, then the pragmatist case against totalitarianism may be seen to be a serious methodological option.

b. The British Liberal Defence of the Open Society and Pluralism

Although both Karl Popper and Isaiah Berlin were born outside of Great Britain, they were both leading theorists of anti-totalitarianism in British academia. The Israeli scholar, Jacob L. Talmon, was British trained, and is best seen as applying the British liberal tradition to the Enlightenment. There are clear affinities between their positions on this issue, which are best seen as continuations of the British liberal tradition well into the twentieth century, when it faced the challenge of the totalitarian state. The three representatives of British liberalism discussed here shared a commitment to individual liberty, wariness of state power, and an evident suspicion of what they took to be the collectivist and utopian excesses of various Continental thinkers.

i. Karl Popper’s Indictment of Historicism

In several works, Karl Popper articulated a vigorous defence of liberal democracy over dictatorship. In his early work there is a particular emphasis on the unscientific and ultimately illogical character of all forms of historical determinism and collectivism. In The Poverty of Historicism, he stressed the philosophical errors of utopianism, and what he termed “historicism”—assuming or attempting to argue for the existence of deterministic historical laws, and the possibility of deriving accurate predictions from them. These predictions are purportedly scientific or metaphysical, and for Popper, they betray an epistemic confusion between falsifiable and limited predictions based on evidence, and “oracular prophesies” masquerading as science or philosophical rationality.

In keeping with his philosophy of natural science, Popper urges us to shun certainty and dogmatism in social science and history, in favour of a piecemeal approach characterised by attention to particulars and the trial and error methods of fallibilism. Such an approach is not only conducive to precise and clear social explanations; Popper defends it as a philosophical shield against tyranny as well. For it is precisely the immodesty of overgeneralising to alleged rigid laws in history that has led even great philosophers and other thinkers to commit the error of historicism, which is a key component of totalitarian and fanatical patterns of thought.

Popper defines “historicism” as a theory of history that affirms the existence of deterministic laws from which iron-clad predictions can be derived. He thus accuses purportedly scientific theorists of history, including Karl Marx, of misinterpreting trends as inexorable laws, thereby producing unscientific and potentially irrational schemes of historical development. When coupled with grandiose or holistic schemes of social engineering, such approaches, for Popper, combine bad social science with lethal utopianism. We ought, he claims, to opt for “piecemeal engineering” employing trial and error experimentation, openness to constructive criticism, and the falsification of our programs:

[commitment to holistic or utopian social engineering] prejudices the Utopianist against certain sociological hypotheses which state limits to institutional control….problems connected with the uncertainty of the human factor must force the Utopianist, whether he likes it or not, to try to control the human factor by institutional means, and to extend his programme, so as to embrace not only the transformation of society, according to plan, but also the transformation of man. (Popper, 1960: 69-70).

Although written slightly later than The Poverty of Historicism, Popper’s The Open Society and its Enemies was published during the Second World War. It is therefore best seen as an intellectual contribution to the Allied cause against fascism, which was subsequently readily adapted to the struggle against Soviet dictatorship during the Cold War. Both works are permeated by a sense that democracy was under fire and could potentially be annihilated by its totalitarian rivals.

Here Popper broadens his critique of totalitarianism by indicting major figures of the Western philosophical tradition, notably Plato, Hegel and Marx. All three, he held, were guilty of collectivist and utopian social projects. In diverse ways, Plato’s notion of guardianship and the philosopher kings, Hegel’s glorification of the militaristic nation state, and Marx’s belief in the inevitability of class warfare and violent revolution all share a misguided common denominator: the historicist belief in holistic explanations derived from alleged laws of historical inevitability. In place of this, Popper recommended a non-dogmatic “critical rationalism,” within an open society that respects debate and a quest for truth and knowledge. This method ought to at all costs be substituted for historicist and utopian grand schemes of social science and philosophy of history that are characterised by a kind of oracular faith in their own future prophesies, dogmatism, and immunity to falsification.

Popper explained the appeal of historicism as a product of a false conception of the power of social science and historiography, combined with alienation and dissatisfaction:

Why do all these social philosophies support the revolt against civilization? And what is the secret of their popularity? Why do they attract and seduce so many intellectuals? I am inclined to think that the reason is that they give expression to a deep felt dissatisfaction with a world which does not, and cannot, live up to our moral ideals and to our dreams of perfection. The tendency of historicism (and of related views) to support the revolt against civilization may be due to the fact that historicism itself is, largely, a reaction against the strain of our civilization and its demand for personal responsibility. (Popper, 2011: xxxix).

Popper’s faith in rationalism and the open society has been criticised by Leszek Kołakowski for not taking into account democracies’ propensity towards self-destruction. Kolakowski holds that the diverse ends of open societies can come into conflict with each other, thereby vitiating attempts to combine liberal values coherently. He writes of Popper’s model:

The open society is described less as a state constitution and more as a collection of values, among which tolerance, rationality, and a lack of commitment to tradition appear at the top of the list. It is assumed, naively so I think, that this set is wholly free of contradictions, meaning that the values that it comprises support each other in all circumstances or at least do not limit each other. (Kołakowski, 1990: 164).

This criticism points to the question of value pluralism as discussed by Isaiah Berlin: how can a multiplicity of values, some of them potentially mutually exclusive, provide a coherent and adequate buffer against repressive, totalitarian state power?

ii. Isaiah Berlin on Liberty

Throughout his career, Isaiah Berlin devoted a considerable amount of attention to the question of totalitarianism. He saw it as one of the most important features of twentieth century history, and as the logical outcome of an excessive devotion to what he took to be a dangerously paternalistic conception of liberty.

In a key work on the subject (1969, reprinted and expanded in 2002), Berlin drew an important distinction between the negative and positive conceptions of liberty or freedom:

The first of these political senses of freedom or liberty…which (following much precedent) I shall call the “negative sense,” is involved in the answer to the question “What is the area within which the subject—a person or group of persons—is or should be left to do or be what he is able to do or be, without interference by other persons?” The second, which I shall call the “positive” sense, is involved in the answer to the question ‘What, or who, is the source of control or interference that can determine someone to do, or be, this rather than that?’ The two questions are clearly different, even though the answers to them may overlap. (Berlin, 2002: 169).

He thus held that the former is the foundation of the pluralistic liberalism that he wished to defend, and that the latter is a very different notion, involving obligatory self-realisation through the perfection of the individual and society in accordance with natural or historical necessity. Whereas negative liberty is a cornerstone of toleration, openness to new knowledge and individual rights, positive liberty, for Berlin, is the state’s paternalistic high road to totalitarianism.

Long associated with despotic and dictatorial regimes, positive freedom had, by the mid-twentieth century, formed part of the justification for both communist and fascist dictatorships. By claiming deterministic justifications including a truly scientific conception of historical law, social Darwinism or the will of the people, totalitarian states of both the extreme left and the extreme right justified the murder of millions in the name of a unitary and static utopian future that they saw as set and predictable.

For Berlin, this totalitarian development of positive liberty was not an aberration, but a logical conclusion. It emerged in a particularly lethal form in the twentieth century due to its central role in the justification of illiberal and non-humanistic ideologies, including communism, fascism, and the sort of extreme romantic nationalism and clericalism already present prototypically in the thought of nineteenth century figures such as Joseph de Maistre.

Against this, Berlin urged humanity to seek a decent society with pluralistic values, thus eschewing utopian perfectionism. This he thought to be characterised by a fallibilistic conception of knowledge, peaceful trade-offs, and the rejection of nihilism and relativism in favour of common values across genuinely diverse ways of life. Such a society would, he held, resolve to maintain a pluralistic balance of values against any and all attempts to sacrifice entire groups of people in the name of a future that can never be fully predicted.

A key criticism of a stark division between negative and positive liberty has been offered by Charles Taylor (1985). He claims that the terms have been used in an excessively narrow way so as not to do justice to the complexity of human freedom. In particular, the existence of what he has termed “strong evaluations” (Taylor, 1985: 220). That is, important qualitative distinctions in the ranking of individuals’ desires and projects, would seem to render incomplete any use of the idea negative freedom as essentially a lack of coercion or obstacle. For Taylor, this conception of negative liberty stems from diverse and likely parallel sources in the Western philosophical tradition, such as Hobbes and Bentham. He claims that in order to do justice to freedom, even sophisticated liberals such as Mill have made significant use of concepts of self-development and improvement, and this implies some degree of positive liberty. So positive liberty is best understood as a part of individual freedom and flourishing, and not necessarily a component of totalitarianism.

The extent to which the state should promote it remains an important question. Understood along the lines indicated by Taylor, it may be a value to be realized through self-development in a more democratic society. This is in keeping with what not only Taylor, but other thinkers, claim.

iii. Jacob Talmon on Totalitarian Democracy

In 1952, Jacob L. Talmon published a liberal indictment of those views of eighteenth century thought that saw the French Enlightenment as manifesting overwhelmingly liberal tendencies.

Talmon argued, in The Origins of Totalitarian Democracy, that both liberal-empirical and totalitarian tendencies were significant and influential in European thought by the time of the French Revolution. In particular, he held that key aspects of the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and lesser known radical Babouvist egalitarian Enlightenment figures such as Gabriel Bonnot de Mably, and Étienne-Gabriel Morelly, are best seen as a foreshadowing of twentieth century totalitarianism.

Like Berlin, Talmon stresses the fundamental divergence between individualist and collectivist or statist conceptions of freedom. He divided early modern democratic thought into two broad categories: “liberal” and “totalitarian” democracy. The former led, through a long process of parliamentary development across the nineteenth century, to the institutions regarded as democratic in the mid-twentieth century. The liberal democratic thought of Benjamin Constant and Alexis de Tocqueville in France, as well as John Stuart Mill in England, were instrumental in developing this political tradition to a philosophical apogee. Talmon traced its origins in part to John Locke’s defense of individual property rights. Totalitarian democracy, on the other hand, developed largely from radical French Enlightenment thought through Babeuf and the Jacobin stream of the French Revolution, and through nineteenth and early twentieth century Marxism. Talmon describes it as a form of “political Messianism.”

Liberal democracy has stressed the importance of individual human rights, empiricism and the rule of law from its beginnings. It advocates piecemeal reform and the application of rationality to arrive at optimal political remedies to social problems. Totalitarian democracy from Robespierre and the Jacobins through Karl Marx and into the twentieth century has been utopian, collectivist and statist. Talmon furthermore holds it to be characterised by historical determinism and a notion of a single comprehensible truth in political life.

The two intellectual tendencies both claim to promote freedom to the highest degree, but differ greatly in their conceptions of legitimate freedom. Both schools affirm the supreme value of liberty, but whereas the one finds the essence of freedom in spontaneity and the absence of coercion, the other believes it to be realized only in the pursuit and attainment of an absolute collective purpose. Liberal democrats believe that, in the absence of coercion, men and society may one day reach through a process of trial and error a state of ideal harmony. In the case of totalitarian democracy, this state is precisely defined, and is treated as a matter of immediate urgency, a challenge for direct action, an imminent event:

[Human beings,] in so far as they are at variance with the absolute ideal they can be ignored, coerced or intimidated into conforming, without any real violation of the democratic principle being involved. (Talmon, 1986: 2-3).

Talmon devotes considerable attention to what he takes to be Rousseau’s totalitarian tendencies in The Social Contract. Talmon finds especially collectivist Rousseau’s notion of the “general will” being over and above society and representing the highest aspirations of humanity. Furthermore, the idea that the individual can only find true liberation through the state and its supreme “Legislator” is the high road to dictatorship, for Talmon. Rousseau is thus seen as a merciless collectivist, willing to “force people to be free” in order to create a new and perfected type of human being. This ideal involves a notion of democracy as the constant and unanimous participation of the citizens of an ideal state in the acting out of the general will, thereby realising true democratic citizenship.

Talmon’s conception of the origins of totalitarianism in the French Enlightenment and its revolutionary heritage has been challenged on various grounds. The Canadian scholar C.B. Macpherson, influenced by Marxism, argued that Talmon erred in stressing ideas over class and social realities, and in thus making too strong a causal claim in linking notions of natural order and political unanimity to inevitable totalitarianism. Furthermore, he claimed that the Jacobins instituted a type of early totalitarian rule largely in response to the social pressures of revolutionary power and foreign counter-revolutionary invasion.

In effect, the true causes of historical change are thus seen as grounded in class and general social trends, and not merely in purely philosophical or ideological causes. This criticism implies holds that understanding key ideas and movements requires an understanding of their class background:

A petit-bourgeois movement like Jacobinism, or a proletarian movement still based on the same individualist assumptions (like Bavouism) is particularly liable to demand a completely general unanimity at a time when it is least possible. It might be argued that it was the petit-bourgeois character of these ideologies, rather than the assumption of a natural order, that led so readily to totalitarian dictatorship. (Macpherson, 1952: 57).

This criticism of Talmon’s core thesis bears affinities with a critique of Arendt, and it raises the general question of the social causation of ideas in an interesting way. To what extent are philosophical ideas responsible solely, or at least primarily, for mass movements throughout history, including totalitarianism? If Talmon and Arendt are right, they certainly possess sufficient causal potency to be determining factors in social and political development. If their critics hold the high ground, they have inflated the importance of secondary or even epiphenomenal notions and properties to an unrealistic station.

c. Hannah Arendt on the Origins and Implications of Totalitarianism

In her seminal 1951 book, Hannah Arendt attempted to show how totalitarianism emerged as a distinctly modern utopian problem in the twentieth century, growing out of a lethal combination of imperialism, anti-Semitism and extreme statist bureaucracies. As much a work of intellectual history as political philosophy, The Origins of Totalitarianism jarred many due to its indictment of European civilization during a period of post-war reconstruction. Arendt held that totalitarianism was not a reactionary aberration, an attempt to turn back the clock to earlier tyrannies, but rather a revolutionary form of radical evil explicable by particularly destructive tendencies in modern mass politics. The atomisation of lonely individuals and the receptivity to propaganda of mass society in the modern age makes it an ongoing temptation to be resisted through critical thinking and the affirmation of fundamental human values.

Tracing what she took to be the prime causes of totalitarianism to the nineteenth century, Arendt focused on the rise of imperialism and political anti-Semitism, and the concomitant decline of both the remnants of the feudal order and the nation state. Imperialism and anti-Semitism both drew from racist and Social Darwinist wellsprings in their repudiation of unity through language, culture, and universal rights in favour of biologically fixed and hierarchical distinctions within humanity and a struggle for world conquest. The consequent de-humanisation of entire races and ethnic groups in favour of Aryanist ideals set the grounds for fascism, with the enthusiastic support of what Arendt termed “the mob,” that is, the resentful European déclassés. Furthermore, the narrow chauvinism of pan-Slavism coupled with notions of class warfare and annihilation paved the way for a parallel communist regime of terror in the Soviet Union.

Arendt held that in both its fascist and communist varieties, the totalitarian system’s terror is not incidental, but essential. Unlike authoritarian dictatorships that strive to uphold conservative values, such regimes by their very nature aim to destroy civil society and tradition in favour of a utopian re-fashioning of humanity to suit their collectivist ideological purposes. The twentieth century totalitarian state thus emerges as a juggernaut of terror, a terror maintained in no small part by the eradication of fundamental human values and all critical thought in favour of ideology and propaganda. It thereby seeks to destroy all communal and civil institutions between it and its atomised and lonely citizens. Arendt wrote:

The ideal subject of totalitarian rule is not the convinced Nazi or the convinced Communist, but people for whom the distinction between fact and fiction (that is, the reality of experience) and the distinction between true and false (that is, the standards of thought) no longer exist. (Arendt, 1968: 474).

A key challenge to Arendt’s analysis is shared with all such work on the frontier between political theory and intellectual history, namely its degree of empirical truthfulness and the precise accuracy of its causal explanations (Gleason, 1995). Establishing such causal connections requires the extensive use of detailed historical evidence, as well as the colligation of coexisting ideas upon which Arendt relied. So, the account is subject to the usual historiographical and logical criticisms concerning the possible gap between the causation of events and the correlation of trends.

For all of the considerable attention that The Origins of Totalitarianism attracted in 1951, it was in 1963 that Arendt was to produce one of the most controversial works ever written by a political philosopher. Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil did not merely generate much discussion; it produced an intellectual shock wave heard around the world that still reverberates:

Hannah Arendt’s Eichmann in Jerusalem was published fifty years ago….It’s hard to think of another work capable of setting off ferocious polemics a half century after its publication. (Lilla, 2013).

Arendt here developed and expanded her general conclusions on the Holocaust and fascist bureaucracy from a series of articles that she wrote on the Eichmann trial for The New Yorker.

She claimed that for all of his extreme evil, Eichmann was not a mysterious monster, neither in his overall demeanour nor in his political and moral psychology. His evil was as much a matter of consequences as of intent, and in fact his intentions emerged as mixed, during the trial before the Israeli court. Arendt did not claim, in her thesis of “the banality of evil” that Eichmann was entirely neutral in his managing of the Nazi’s final solution, as has been maintained. Rather, she saw him as a distinctly modern product of a totalitarian bureaucracy who at times was eager to implement Hitler’s genocide, but who also showed real tendencies towards narrow instrumental rationality, clichéd thought and speaking patterns, and superficial amorality. She was thus struck by his at times entirely average bearing and thought patterns throughout the trial, for all of the enormous evil that he perpetrated.

Furthermore, Arendt claimed that the Eichmann case confirmed her view that totalitarianism represents a gross perversion of fundamental civilised and ethical values in favour of mass bureaucracy, propaganda and thoughtlessness. Both perpetrators and victims of the Holocaust were thus corrupted through a process involving the malevolence and instrumental efficiency of the Nazis, as well as the activities of a collaborating minority in the ghetto police and Jewish Councils. This last point was to provoke particular discomfort and sheer hostility, giving Arendt a virtual pariah status, although later Holocaust historiography has placed the general problem of collaboration in a more balanced context.

For Arendt, Eichmann was as much a product of the worst possible tendencies of state bureaucracy as a creator of them. This bureaucratic context in no way exonerated him, as she was careful to indicate; she held his execution in 1962 to be justified, even though she thought that there was a strong case in international law for an international tribunal for the case, rather than the Israeli court. However, the bureaucratic framework of Eichmann’s crimes required a re-examination of what she held to be a misleading diabolical conception of evil. That there is a tension between this account and the notion of radical evil developed in The Origins of Totalitarianism seems clear. However, both works share the important common denominator of an indictment of totalitarian bureaucracies that render the unthinkable not just possible, but probable and even banal. In a very real sense, this is a more disturbing thesis than Arendt’s earlier conception of evil as radical or in no small part beyond rational explanation. If Arendt was right overall, totalitarianism is a constant threat in modern mass societies, and no complacency on the matter can be justified.

d. Erich Fromm on Escaping from Freedom: A Psychoanalytical Approach

Among the various attempts to apply psychoanalysis to the question of totalitarianism, Erich Fromm’s Escape from Freedom is conspicuous for its sustained argumentation and conceptual scope. Fromm’s thesis that there exists an “authoritarian character” was subsequently developed through empirical case studies by Theodor W. Adorno and his co-authors in their work, The Authoritarian Personality.

Fromm was a philosophically inclined sociologist, who drew from both the Freudian and Marxist traditions in elaborating an explanation of diverse social phenomena. This is apparent in his view that there exists what might termed a self-reinforcing causal mechanism between social processes and ideology, in which psycho-social factors are reinforced by belief systems, and vice versa.

Central to Fromm’s analysis is the notion that totalitarianism stems from several root causes linked to the full emergence of modern individualism in the aftermath of the Reformation. Medieval social psychology was strongly transcendental in its emphasis of the secondary character of secular authority under God, and thus it inhibited the development of the sense of loneliness and isolation that characterised Western history from about the sixteenth century onwards.

For Fromm, Protestantism stimulated the development of individualism in its stress on individual success and good works, dutiful submission to God, thrift, and a significant sphere for secular authority. A self-reinforcing causal mechanism became increasingly apparent, especially among the middle classes of modern capitalist society, as the new form of Christianity helped to create the modern individual, and was in turn strengthened by the resultant socio-economic psychology of modern European society.

However, there can be no turning back the clock according to Fromm. Rather, modern humanity must strive to encourage healthy life-affirming values and the expression of human freedom. This is best done by recognising, as a society, the values of love, spontaneity, and secure personal development.

Fromm proposes that the anxiety in isolated individuals, produced by the great burden to succeed demonstrably and without secured grace in the eyes of God, led to severe social and psycho-pathologies. In particular, collectivist ideologies, including totalitarianism, emerged to satisfy the modern individual’s need for a sense of a higher purpose or calling:

It seems that nothing is more difficult for the average man to bear than the feeling of not being identified with a larger group….The fear of isolation and the relative weakness of moral principles help any party to win the loyalty of a large sector of the population once that party has captured the power of the state. (Fromm, 1969: 234).

A chilling picture thus emerges of an inherently alienated and insecure modern society that generates mass social movements of conformity. For Fromm, this was especially true of the German lower middle class, which he held to be strongly influenced by modern individualistic ideologies. He furthermore held that this class was the most alienated class in Germany, and thereby prone to a compensatory destructiveness, and that it was strongly characterised in Weimar Germany by a sense of having lost its legitimate class status. Thus the rise of Nazism had both important psycho-social and class factors, in his view.

Fromm analyses various “mechanisms of escape” by which the alienated seek relief from the burden of individual autonomy. Prime strategies, linked to totalitarianism’s appeal, are unthinking submission to the leader, and mindless conformity. The latter trend he saw not just in totalitarian society, but in capitalist democracies as well, and as requiring concerted social activism.

Both sadism and masochism are seen by Fromm as attempts to overcome feelings of individual powerlessness and meaninglessness. In politics, the authoritarian character is characterized by a slavish and nihilistic submission to authority, and a desire to have it over others. This character type, for Fromm, is the one most easily seduced by fascism.

If Fromm was correct in this, then the root causes of totalitarianism are both internal or psychological and external, in the form of trends in class relations and ideological evolution. The threat therefore remains nascent even in seemingly highly democratic modern societies, although Fromm did not advocate a relativism that would blur the lines between imperfect democracies and dictatorships.

Fromm, like Taylor, holds that positive notions of freedom can be of constructive value in counteracting political and social distortions and pathologies. In particular, a social democratic society that provides the individual with adequate resources and a sense of autonomous personal development can do much, he held, to reduce the appeal of totalitarian ideologies and to promote mental health and social ethics:

We must replace manipulation of men by active and intelligent cooperation, and expand the principle of government of the people, by the people, for the people to the economic sphere. (Fromm, 1969: 300).

Fromm’s analysis focussed considerably more on fascism than on communism. Its political diagnosis of Nazism, in particular, has been faulted even by sympathetic critics on several counts:

Fromm did not…treat the intensity of Hitler’s anti-Semitism, choosing instead to locate the Jew with the communist and the Frenchman as examples of Hitler’s purportedly “lesser” groups. Nor did Fromm point to the discredited Social Darwinist premises behind the Nazi quest for Aryan purity…. His hypothesis about the lower middle class has not held up. The Nazis gained votes from all classes. (Friedman, 2013: 113).

In his later work, Fromm extended his classic work on human aggression and destructiveness, providing psycho-biographies of totalitarian leaders such as Hitler, Himmler, and Stalin.

3. Later Work

a. Judith Shklar’s Liberalism of Fear

Throughout her work, the American political theorist Judith Shklar stressed the importance of seeing liberalism not as a utopian or perfectionistic ideal, but rather as a bulwark against tyranny and cruelty. In effect, she claimed that liberalism ought to be defined more by its opposition to oppression and nastiness than by anything else.

Shklar traces the roots of liberalism to the struggle for religious toleration in Reformation and Baroque Europe. In her model, a progressive consensus emerged in Western thought, holding that cruelty is supremely wicked. Early figures in this development include Montaigne and Montesquieu, whom Shklar contrasted with Machiavelli on this question.

This commitment to “put cruelty first” contributed greatly to the development of liberalism’s abhorrence of dictatorships of all kinds, including those of a modern totalitarian character. This implies an affirmation of memory over hope, and of sensitivity to the horrors of oppression over utopian aspiration. Not merely property rights, cultural pluralism, and the rule of law, but anti-tyranny first and foremost define the modern liberal perspective. If liberalism is rare historically and globally, this has more to do with the widespread character of cruel delusion than with any intrinsic defect on its part. For Shklar, we ought to remember at all costs the disastrous consequences of not putting cruelty first:

We must…be suspicious of ideologies of solidarity, precisely because they are so attractive to those who find liberalism emotionally unsatisfying, and who have gone on in our century to create oppressive and cruel regimes of unparalleled horror. (Shklar, 1998: 18).

Shklar’s negative liberalism has been criticised by Michael Walzer as setting reasonable anti-totalitarian boundaries for democratic action, while not recognising the importance of moving beyond them in the interest of social progress:

We always have to be afraid of political power; that is the central liberal insight. But this is an insight into a central experience that wasn’t discovered, only theorised by liberal writers. Nor does this fear by itself make for an adequate theory of political power. We must address the uses of power as well as its dangers. And since it has many uses, we must choose among them, designing policies, like Shklar’s guaranteed employment, that enhance and strengthen what we most value in own way of life. Then we try to enforce those policies, carefully if we are wise, remembering the last time we were fearful, and acting within the limits of liberal negativity. (Walzer, 1996: 24).

If this is correct, then the strong anti-totalitarianism of the liberalism of fear should be seen as setting boundaries against tyranny, rather than final limits to progressive social policy. Positive liberty is thereby affirmed, within strong democratic boundaries.

b. Avishai Margalit on the Decent Society and Totalitarianism

In reaction to the strong emphasis upon theories of justice in late twentieth century political thought, Avishai Margalit presented his case for the “decent society.” Such a society is, first and foremost, one that does not humiliate people. This means not treating human beings as less than human, as mere machines, animals, or inanimate objects. For Margalit, even if a society is just institutionally and procedurally, it may nonetheless denigrate its citizens and subjects in diverse institutional ways, thereby rendering it formally civilized but indecent. Without denying the value of social justice and the rule of law, Margalit has claimed that philosophy and political theory long neglected decency, which is every bit as important as justice. In so doing, they could not do justice to one of the main forms of oppression: institutional and state contempt for individuals.

In The Decent Society, Margalit contrasts totalitarian and gossip societies. Both these types of society are, for Margalit, indecent in not respecting individuals and their own legitimate social space. Gossip societies allow for a considerable range of imperfection, but lack decency in their absence of respect for privacy, and their non-institutional or cultural humiliation of alleged non-conformists.

In their radical perfectionism, totalitarian societies have no respect for individual privacy, and they systematically and institutionally obliterate communal and family structure between the individual and the state. Such societies’ regimes do everything within their considerable power to humiliate their subjects so as ultimately to perfect them, by recognising no legitimate private space, and by gathering sensitive information with which to blackmail and control them. They are thus agents of ultimate indecency, for Margalit.

Friendship among anti-totalitarian dissidents is thus especially valuable and intense, because of the potentially life and death solidarity that is generated by opposition to supreme state and bureaucratic indecency. The violation of such friendships by forcing dissidents to reveal sensitive information about others to the state is, for Margalit, one of the worst aspects of totalitarianism:

Totalitarian societies have proved to be a prescription for and guarantor of brave friendship, since friendships in regimes of this sort are conspiracies of humanity against the inhumanity of the regime. (Margalit, 1996: 210).

Margalit’s analysis provoked some re-examination of political and social philosophy’s focus on justice. In particular, the general core question of the balance to be struck between decency and justice raises fundamental questions about value priority:

…one might take the view that the best way for a society to strive to become decent is by promoting justice. By treating people in accordance with justice, society denies them one sound reason to feel rejected from humanity, however much they may actually feel that way….the decent and the just society may be too closely intertwined for us to be able to say that one or other has clear priority as an ideal. (Patten, 2001: 231).

Patten’s question reminds us of the extent to which justice and rights have a fundamental role in social and political values. It should be clear that Margalit in no way wishes to deny the value of justice. However, one may recall here Arendt’s thesis to the effect that totalitarianism arose in part not only because of an indecent Social Darwinism, but due to the repudiation of universal human rights. This may well be a strong challenge to attempts to reduce the firm priority of justice in political life.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W., Frenkel-Brunswik, Else, Levinson, Daniel J., and Sanford, R. Nevitt. The Authoritarian Personality. Harper & Brothers, New York, 1950.
  • Arendt, Hannah. Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report of the Banality of Evil. Penguin, New York, 2006.
  • Arendt, Hannah. The Origins of Totalitarianism. Harvest Books, Harcourt Brace Janovitch, San Diego, New York and London, 1968.
  • Arendt, Hannah. Between Past and Future: Six Exercises in Political Thought. Meridian Books, the World Publishing Company, Cleveland and New York, 1963. (Contains “What is Authority?”)
  • Berlin, Isaiah. The Crooked Timber of Humanity: Chapters in the History of Ideas. Edited by Henry Hardy. Pimlico, London, 2003a. (Contains “The Pursuit of the Ideal,” and “The Decline of Utopian Ideals in the West.”)
  • Berlin, Isaiah. Freedom and its Betrayal: Six Enemies of Human Liberty. Hardy, Henry (editor). Pimlico, London, 2003b.
  • Berlin, Isaiah. Liberty. Hardy, Henry (editor). Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York, 2002. (Contains several key essays in the section “Five Essays on Liberty.”)
  • Berlin, Isaiah. The Sense of Reality. Hardy, Henry (editor). Chatto and Windus, London, 1996. (Contains important essays such as “”The Sense of Reality,” “Political Judgement,” and “Philosophy and Government Repression.”)
  • Bossuet, Jacques. Politics Drawn from the Very Words of Holy Scripture. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1999.
  • Cotter, Matthew J. (editor). Sidney Hook Reconsidered. Prometheus Books, Amherst, NY, 2004.
  • Dewey, John. The Political Writings. Morris, Deborah and Shapiro, Ian (editors). Hackett, Indianapolis and Cambridge, 1993. (ContainsI Believe”)
  • Friedman, Lawrence J. The Lives of Erich Fromm: Love’s Prophet. Columbia University Press, New York, 2013.
  • Friedrich, Carl J. and Brzezinski, Zbigniew K. Totalitarian Dictatorship and Autocracy. Harvard University Press, Cambridge, 1956.
  • Fromm, Erich. The Anatomy of Human Destructiveness. Holt, Rinehart and Winston, New York, 1973.
  • Fromm, Erich. Escape from Freedom (Fear of Freedom in the UK). Avon Books, New York, 1969.
  • Fromm, Erich. Man for Himself. Fawcett Premier, Greenwich, Connecticut, 1967.
  • Gentile, Giovanni. Origins and Doctrine of Fascism with Selections from Other Works. Edited by A. James Gregor. Transaction Publishers, Edison, NJ, 2003.
  • Gleason, Abbott. Totalitarianism: The Inner History of the Cold War. Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York, 1995.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. Leviathan. Wordsworth Editions, Hertfordshire, 2014.
  • Hoffmann, Stanley (editor). Political Thought and Political Thinkers. University of Chicago Press, Chicago and London, 1998.
  • Hook, Sidney. Heresy, Yes—Conspiracy, No. Greenwood Press, Publishers, Westport, Connecticut, 1953.
  • Hook Sidney. “Heresy, Yes—But Conspiracy, No.” New York Times Magazine, July 9, 1950. Available online through Dissent Archives.
  • Kołakowski, Leszek. Modernity on Endless Trial. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 1990.
  • Konvitz, Milton R. and Kennedy, Gail (editors). The American Pragmatists. Meridian Books, UK, 1960.
  • Lenin, Vladimir. The State and Revolution. Penguin Books, Middlesex, 2009.
  • Lilla, Mark. “Arendt and Eichmann: The New Truth.” New York Review of Books, November 21, 2013. Online version.
  • Litwack, Eric B. “Erratum to: Epistemic Arguments against Dictatorships.” Human Affairs 21, 2011, pp. 226-235,.
  • Macpherson, C. B. “Review of The Origins of Totalitarian Democracy.” Past and Present, Number 2, November 1952, pp. 55-57.
  • Patten, Alan. “Review of The Decent Society.” Mind, Volume 110, Number 437, January 2001, pp. 229-232.
  • Plato. Republic. Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1993.
  • Popper, Karl. The Open Society and its Enemies. Routledge Classics, Oxford, 2011.
  • Popper, Karl. The Poverty of Historicism. Routledge, London, 1960.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Renewing Philosophy. Harvard University Press, Cambridge and London, 1992.
  • Schmitt, Carl. Dictatorship. Polity Press, Cambridge, 2013.
  • Schmitt, Carl. The Concept of the Political. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 2007.
  • Shklar, Judith N. “The Liberalism of Fear,” in Political Thought and Political Thinkers. Hoffman, Stanley (editor). University of Chicago Press, Chicago and London, 1998.
  • Shklar, Judith N. “Putting Cruelty First.” Daedalus Volume 111, Number 3, Summer, 1982, pp. 17-27.
  • Talisse, Robert B. “Politics without Dogmas: Hook’s Basic Ideals.” In Cotter 2004, pp. 117-128.
  • Talmon, J. L. The Origins of Totalitarian Democracy. Penguin Books, Harmondsworth, UK and New York, 1986.
  • Taylor, Charles. Philosophy and the Human Sciences. Philosophical Papers 2. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge and New York, 1985. (Contains “What’s Wrong with Negative Liberty?”)
  • Walzer, Michael. “On Negative Politics.” Yack, Bernard (editor) (1996), pp. 17-24.
  • Westbrook, Robert B. Democratic Hope: Pragmatism and the Politics of Truth. Cornell University Press, Ithaca and London, 2005.
  • Yack, Bernard (editor). Liberalism without Illusions: Essays on Liberal Theory and the Political Vision of Judith N. Shklar. University of Chicago Press, Chicago and London, 1996.

Author Information

Eric B. Litwack
Queen’s University and Syracuse University in London
United Kingdom