The Ethics and Epistemology of Trust
Trust is a topic of long-standing philosophical interest because it is indispensable to the success of almost every kind of coordinated human activity, from politics and business to sport and scientific research. Even more, trust is necessary for the successful dissemination of knowledge, and, by extension, for nearly any form of practical deliberation and planning that requires us to make use of more information than we are able to gather individually and verify ourselves. In short, without trust, we could achieve few of our goals and would know very little. Despite trust’s fundamental importance in human life, there is substantial philosophical disagreement about what trust is, and further, how trusting is normatively constrained and best theorized about in relation to other things we value. Consequently, contemporary philosophical literature on trust features a range of different theoretical options for making sense of trust, and these options differ in how they (among other things) take trust to relate to such things as reliance, optimism, belief, obligations, monitoring, expectations, competence, trustworthiness, assurance, and doubt. With the aim of exploring these myriad issues in an organized way, this article is divided into three sections, each of which offers an overview of key (and sometimes interconnected) ethical and epistemological themes in the philosophy of trust: (1) The Nature of Trust; (2) The Normativity of Trust; and (3) The Value of Trust.
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Trust
- The Normativity of Trust
- The Value of Trust
- References and Further Reading
What is trust? To a very first approximation, trust is an attitude or a hybrid of attitudes (for instance, optimism, hope, belief, and so forth) toward a trustee, that involves some (non-negligible) vulnerability to being betrayed on the truster’s side. This general remark, of course, does not take us very far. For example, we may ask: what kind of attitude (or hybrid of attitudes) is trust exactly? Suppose that (as some philosophers of trust maintain) trust requires an attitude of optimism. Even if that is right, getting a grip on trust requires a further conception of what the truster, qua truster, must be optimistic about. One standard answer here proceeds as follows: trust (at least, in the paradigmatic case of interpersonal trust) involves some form of optimism that the trustee will take care of things as we have entrusted them. In the special case of trusting the testimony of another—a topic at the centre of the epistemology of trust—this will involve at least some form of optimism that the speaker is living up to her expectations as a testifier; for instance, that the speaker knows what she says or, more weakly, is telling the truth.
Even at this level of specificity, though, the nature of trust remains fairly elusive. Does trusting involve (for example) merely optimism that the trustee will take care of things as entrusted, or does it also involve optimism that the trustee will do so compresently (that is, concurrently) with certain beliefs, non-doxastic attitudes, emotions or motivations on the part of the trustee, such as with goodwill (Baier 1986; Jones 1996). Moreover, and apart from such positive characterizations of trust, does trust also have a negative condition to the effect that one fails to genuinely trust another if one—past some threshold of vigilance—monitors the trustee (or otherwise, reflects critically on the trust relationship so as to attempt to minimize risk)?
These are among the questions that occupy philosophers working on the nature of trust. This section explores four subthemes aimed at clarifying trust’s nature: these concern (a) the distinction between trust and reliance; (b) two-place vs three-place trust; (c) doxastic versus non-doxastic conditions on trust; (d) deception detection and monitoring.
Reliance is ubiquitous. You rely on the weather not to suddenly drop by 20 degrees, leaving you shivering; you rely on your chair not to give out, causing you to tumble to the floor. In these cases, are you trusting the weather and trusting your chair, respectively? Many philosophers working on trust believe the correct answer here is “no”. This is so even though, in each case, you are depending on these things in a way that leaves you potentially vulnerable.
The idea that trust is a kind of dependence that does not reduce to mere reliance (of the sort that might be apposite to things like chairs and the weather) is widely accepted. According to Annette Baier (1986: 244) the crux of the difference is that trust involves relying on another not just to take care of things any old way (for instance, out of fear, begrudgingly, accidentally, and so forth) but rather that they do so out of goodwill toward the truster; relatedly, a salient kind of vulnerability one subjects oneself to in trusting is vulnerability to the limits of that goodwill. On this way of thinking, then, you are not trusting someone if you (for instance) rely on that person to act in a characteristically self-centred way, even if you depend on them to do so, and even if you fully expect them to do so.
Katherine Hawley (2014, 2019) rejects the idea that what distinguishes trust from mere reliance has anything to do with the trustee’s motives or goodwill. Instead, on her account, the crucial difference is that in cases of trust, but not of mere reliance, a commitment on the part of the trustee must be in place. Consider a situation in which you reliably bring too much lunch to work, because you are a bad judge of quantities, and I get to eat your leftovers. My attitude to you in this situation is one of reliance, but not trust; in Hawley’s view, that is because you have made no commitment to provide me with lunch:
However, if we adapt the case so as to suggest commitment, it starts to look more like a matter of trust. Suppose we enjoy eating together regularly, you describe your plans for the next day, I say how much I’m looking forward to it, and so on. To the extent that this involves a commitment on your part, it seems reasonable for me to feel betrayed and expect apologies if one day you fail to bring lunch and I go hungry (Hawley 2014: 10).
If it is right that trust differs in important ways from mere reliance, then a consequence is that while reliance is something we can have toward people (when we merely depend on them) as well as toward objects (for instance, when we depend on the weather and chairs), not just anything can be genuinely trusted. Karen Jones (1996) captures this point, one that circumscribes people as the fitting objects of genuine trust, as follows:
One can only trust things that have wills, since only things with wills can have goodwills—although having a will is to be given a generous interpretation so as to include, for example, firms and government bodies. Machinery can be relied on, but only agents, natural or artificial, can be trusted (1996: 14).
If, as the foregoing suggests, trust relationships are best understood as a special subset of reliance relationships, should we also expect the appropriate attitudes toward misplaced trust to be a subset of a more general attitude-type we might have in response to misplaced reliance?
Katherine Hawley (2014) thinks so. As she puts it, misplaced trust warrants a feeling of betrayal. But the same is not so for misplaced (mere) reliance. Suppose, to draw from an example she offers (2014: 2) that a shelf you rely on to support a vase gives out; it would be inappropriate, Hawley maintains, to feel betrayed, even if a more general attitude of (mere) disappointment befits such misplaced reliance. Misplaced trust, by contrast, befits a feeling of betrayal.
In contrast with the above thinking, according to which disanalogies between trust and mere reliance are taken to support distinguishing trust from reliance, some philosophers have taken a more permissive approach to trust, by distinguishing between two senses of trust that differ with respect to the similarity of each to mere reliance.
Paul Faulkner (2011: 246; compare McMyler 2011), for example, distinguishes between what he calls predictive and affective trust. Predictive trust involves merely reliance in conjunction with a belief that the trustee will take care of things (namely, a prediction). Misplaced predictions warrant disappointment, not betrayal, and so predictive trust (like mere reliance) cannot be betrayed. Affective trust, by contrast, is a thick, interpersonal normative notion, and, according to Faulkner, it involves, along with reliance, a kind of normative expectation to the effect that the trustee (i) ought to prove dependable; and that they (ii) will prove dependable for that reason. On this view, it is affective trust that is uniquely subject to betrayal, even though predictive trust, which is a genuine variety of trust, is not.
The distinction between two-place and three-place trust, first drawn by Horsburgh (1960), is meant to capture a simple idea: sometimes when we trust someone, we trust them to do some particular thing (see also Holton 1994; Hardin 1992), for example, you might trust your neighbour to water your plant while you are away on holiday but not to look after your daughter. This is three-place trust, with an infinitival component (schematically: A trusts B to X). Not all trusting fits this schema. You might also simply trust your neighbour generally (schematically: A trusts B) and in a way that does not involve any particular task in mind. Three- and two-place trust are thus different in the sense that the object of trust is specified in the former case but not in the latter.
While there is nothing philosophically contentious about drawing this distinction, the relationship between two- and three-place trust becomes contested when one of these kinds of trust is taken to be, in some sense, more fundamental than the other. To be clear, it is uncontentious that philosophers, as Faulkner (2015: 242) notes, tend to “focus” on three-place trust. What is contentious is whether any—and if so, which—of these notions is theoretically more basic.
The overwhelming view in the literature maintains that three-place trust is the fundamental notion and that two-place (as well as one-place) trust are derivative upon three-place trust (Baier 1986; Holton 1994; Jones 1996; Faulkner 2007; Hieronymi 2008; Hawley 2014; compare Faulkner 2015). This view can be called three-place fundamentalism.
According to Baier, for instance, trust is centrally concerned with “one person trusting another with some valued thing” (1986: 236) and for Hawley, trust is “primarily a three-place relation, involving two people and a task” (2014: 2). We might think of two-place (X trusts Y) trust as derived from three-place trust (X trusts Y to phi) in a way that is broadly analogous to how one might extract a diachronic view of someone on the basis of discrete interactions, as opposed to starting with any such diachronic view. On this way of thinking, three-place trust leads to two place trust over time, and is established on the basis of it.
Resistance to three-place fundamentalism has been advanced by Faulkner (2015) and Domenicucci and Holton (2017). Faulkner takes as a starting point that it is a desideratum on any plausible account of trust that it should accommodate infant trust, and thus, “that it not make essential to trusting the use of concepts or abilities which a child cannot be reasonably believed to possess” (1986: 244). As Faulkner (2015: 5) maintains, however, an infant, in trusting its mother “need not have any further thought; the trust is no more than a confidence or faith – a trust, as we say – in his mother”. And so, Faulkner reasons, if we take Baier’s constraint seriously, then we “have to take two-place trust as basic rather than three-place trust.”
A second strand of arguments against three-place fundamentalism is owed to Domenicucci and Holton (2017). According to them, the kind of derivation of two-place trust from three-place trust that is put forward by three-place fundamentalists is implausible for other similar kinds of attitudes like love and friendship:
No one—or at least, hardly anyone—thinks that we should understand what it is for Antony to love Cleopatra in terms of the three place relation ‘Antony loves Cleopatra for her __’, or in terms of any other three-place relation. Likewise hardly anyone thinks that we should understand the two place relation of friendship in terms of some underlying three-place relation […]. To this extent at least, we suggest that trust might be like love and friendship (2017: 149-50).
In response to this kind of argument by association, a proponent of three-place fundamentalism might either deny that these three- to two-place derivations are really problematic in the case of love or friendship, or instead grant that they are and maintain that trust is disanalogous.
In order to get a better sense of whether two-place trust might be unproblematically derived from three-place trust, regardless of whether the same holds mutatis mutandis for love in friendship, it will be helpful to look at a concrete attempt to do so. For example, according to Hawley (2014), three-place trust should be analyzed as: X relies on Y to phi because Y believes Y has a commitment to phi. And then, two-place trust defined simply as “reliance on someone to fulfil whatever commitments she may have” (2014: 16). If something like Hawley’s reduction is unproblematic, then, as one line of response might go, this trumps whatever concerns one might have about the prospects of making analogous moves in the love and friendship cases.
Where does belief fit in to an account of trust? In particular, what beliefs (if any) must a truster have about whether the trustee will prove trustworthy? Proponents of doxastic accounts (Adler 1994; Hieronymi 2008; Keren 2014; McMyler 2011) hold that trust involves a belief on the part of the truster. On the simpler, straightforward incarnation of this view, when A trusts B to do X, A believes that B will do X. Other theorists propose more sophisticated belief-based accounts: on Hawley’s (2019) account, for instance, to trust someone to do something is to believe that she has a commitment to doing it, and to rely upon her to meet that commitment. Conversely, to distrust someone to do something is to believe that she has a commitment to doing it, and yet not rely upon her to meet that commitment.
Non-doxastic accounts (Jones 1996; McLeod 2002; Paul Faulkner 2007; 2011; Baker 1987) have a negative and a positive thesis. The negative thesis is just the denial of the belief requirement on trust that proponents of doxastic accounts accept (namely, a denial that trusting someone to do something entails the corresponding belief that they will do that thing). This negative thesis, to note, is perfectly compatible with the idea that trust oftentimes involves such a belief. What is maintained is that it is not essential. The positive thesis embraced by non-doxastic accounts involves a characterization of some further non-doxastic attitude the truster, qua truster, must have with respect to the trustee’s proving trustworthy.
An example of such a further (non-doxastic) attitude, on non-doxastic accounts, is optimism. For example, on Jones’ (1996) view, you trust your neighbour to bring back the garden tools you loaned her only if you are optimistic that she will bring them back, and regardless of whether you believe she will. It should be pointed out that oftentimes, optimism will lead to the acquisition of a corresponding belief. Importantly for Jones, the kind of optimism that characterizes trust is not itself to be explained in terms of belief but rather in terms of affective attitudes entirely. Such a commitment is more generally shared by non-doxastic views which take trust to involve affective attitudes that might be apt to prompt corresponding beliefs.
Quite a few important debates about trust turn on the matter of whether a doxastic account or a non-doxastic account is correct. For example, discussions of the rationality of trust will look one way if trust essentially involves belief and another way if it does not (Jones 1996; Keren 2014). Relatedly, what one says about trust and belief will bear importantly on how one thinks about the relationship between trust and monitoring, as well as the distinction between paradigmatic trust and therapeutic trust (the kind of trust one engages in in order to build trustworthiness; see Horsburgh 1960; Hieronymi 2008; Frost-Arnold 2014).
A notable advantage of the doxastic account is that it simplifies the epistemology of trust—and in particular, how trust can provide reasons for belief. Suppose, for instance, that the doxastic account is correct, and so your trusting your colleague’s word that they will return your laptop involves believing that they will return your laptop. This belief, some think, conjoined with the fact that your colleague tells you they will return your laptop, gives you a reason to believe that they will return your laptop. As Faulkner (2017: 113) puts it, on the doxastic account, “[t]rust gives a reason for belief because belief can provide reason for belief”. Non-doxastic accounts, by contrast, require further explanation as to why trusting someone would ever give you a reason to believe what they say.
Another advantage of doxastic accounts is that they are well-positioned to distinguish trusting someone to do something and mere optimistic wishing. Suppose, for instance, you loan £100 to a loved one with a terrible track record for repaying debts. Such a person may have lost your trust years ago, and yet you may remain optimistic and wishful that they will be trustworthy on this occasion. What distinguishes this attitude from genuine trust on the doxastic account is simply that you lack any belief that your loved one will prove trustworthy. Explaining this difference is more difficult on non-doxastic accounts. This is especially the case on non-doxastic accounts according to which trust not only does not involve belief but positively precludes it, by essentially involving a kind of “leap of faith” (Möllering 2006) that differs in important ways from belief.
Nonetheless, non-doxastic accounts have been emboldened in light of various serious objections that have been raised to doxastic accounts. One often raised objection of this kind highlights a key disanalogy with respect to how trust and belief interact with evidence, respectively (Faulkner 2007):
[Trust] need not be based on evidence and can demonstrate a wilful insensitivity to the evidence. Indeed there is a tension between acting on trust and acting on evidence that is illustrated in the idea that one does not actually trust someone to do something if one only believes they will do it when one has evidence that they will (2007: 876).
As Baker (1987) unpacks this idea, trusting can require ignoring counterevidence—as one might do when one trusts a friend despite evidence of guilt—whereas believing does not.
A particular type of example that puts pressure on doxastic accounts’ ability to accommodate dis-analogies with belief concerns therapeutic trust. In cases of therapeutic trust, the purpose of trusting is to promote trustworthiness, and is thereby not predicated on prior belief of trustworthiness. Take a case in which one trusts a teenager with an important task, in hopes that by trusting them, it will then lead them to become more trustworthy in the future. In this kind of case, we are plausibly trusting, but not on the basis of prior evidence or belief we have that the trustee will succeed on this occasion. To the contrary: we trust with the aim of establishing trustworthiness (Frost-Arnold 2014; Faulkner 2011). To the extent that such a description of this kind of case is right, therapeutic trust offers a counterexample to the doxastic account, as it involves trust in the absence of belief.
A third kind of account—the performance-theoretic account of trust (Carter 2020a, 2020c)—makes no essential commitment as to whether trusting involves belief. On the performance-theoretic account, what is essential to the attitude of trusting is how it is normatively constrained. An attitude is a trust attitude (toward a trustee, T, and a task, X) just in case the attitude is successful if and only if T takes care of X as entrusted to. Just as there is a sense in which, for example, your archery shot is not successful if it misses the target (see, for example, Sosa 2010a, 2015; Carter 2020b), your trusting someone to keep a secret misses its mark, and so fails to be successful trust, if the trustee spills the beans. With reference to this criterion of successful (and unsuccessful) trust, the performance-theoretic account aims to explain what good and bad trusting involves (see §2.a), and also why some variety of trust is more valuable than others (see §3).
Given that trusting inherently involves the incurring of some level of risk to the truster, it is natural to think that trust would in some way be improved by the truster doing what she can to minimize such risk, for example, by monitoring the trustee with an eye to pre-empting any potential betrayal or at least mitigating the expected disvalue of potential betrayal.
This prima facie plausible suggestion, however, raises some perplexities. As Annette Baier (1986) puts it: “Trust is a fragile plant […] which may not endure inspection of its roots, even when they were, before inspection, quite healthy” (1986: 260). There is something intuitive about this point. If, for instance, A trusts B to drive the car straight home after work—but then proceeds to surreptitiously drive behind B the entire way in order to make sure that B really does drive straight home, it seems that A in doing so is no longer trusting B. The trust, it seems, dissolves through the process of such monitoring.
Extrapolating from such cases, it seems that trust inherently involves not only subjecting oneself to some risk, but also remaining subjected to such risk—or, at least—behaving in ways that are compatible with one’s viewing oneself as (remaining to be) subjected to such risk.
The above idea of course needs sharpened. For example, trusting is plausibly not destroyed by negligible monitoring. The crux of the idea seems to be, as Faulkner (2011, §5) puts it, that “too much reflection” on the trust relation, perhaps in conjunction with making attempts to minimize risks that trust will be betrayed, can undermine trust. Specifying what “too much reflection” or monitoring involves, however, and how reflecting relates to monitoring to begin with, remains a difficult task.
One form of monitoring—construed loosely—that is plausibly compatible with trusting is contingency planning (Carter 2020c). For example, suppose you trust your teenager to drive your car to work and back in order that they may undertake a summer job. A prudent mitigation against the additional risk incurred (for instance, that the car will be wrecked in the process) will be to buy some additional insurance upon entrusting the teenager with the car. The purchasing of this insurance, however, does not itself undermine the trusting relationship, even though it involves a kind of risk mitigating behaviour.
One explanation here turns on the distinction between (i) mitigating against the risk that trust will be betrayed; and (ii) mitigating against the extent or severity of the harm or damage incurred if trust is betrayed. Contingency planning involves type-(ii) mitigation, whereas, for example, trailing behind the teenager with your own car, which is plausibly incompatible with trusting, is of type-(i).
Norms of trust arise between the two parties of reciprocal trust: a norm to be trusting in response to the invitation to trust, and to be trustworthy in response to the other’s trusting reliance (Fricker 2018). The former normativity lies “on the truster’s side”, and the latter on the trustee’s side. In this section, we discuss norms on trusting by looking at these two kinds of norms—that govern the truster and the trustee, respectively—in turn.
This section first discusses general norms on trusting on the truster’s side, and then engages—in some detail—with the complex issue of the norms governing trust in another’s words specifically. Second, it discusses the normativity of trust on the trustee’s side and the nature of trustworthiness.
If—as doxastic accounts maintain—trust is a species of belief (Hieronymi 2008), then the rational norms governing trust govern belief, such that (for example) it will be irrational to trust someone whom you have strong evidence to be unreliable, and the norm violation here is the same kind of norm violation in play in a case where one simply believes, against the evidence, that an individual is trustworthy. Thus: to the extent that one is rationally entitled to believe the trustee is trustworthy, with respect to F, one thereby has an entitlement (on these kinds of views) to trust the trustee to F.
The norms that govern trust on the truster’s side will look different on non-doxastic accounts. For example, on a proposal like Frost-Arnold’s (2014), according to which trust is characterized as a kind of non-doxastic acceptance rather than as belief, the rationality governing trusting will be the rationality of acceptance, where rational acceptance can in principle come apart from rational belief. For one thing, whereas the rationality of belief is exclusively epistemically constrained, the rationality of acceptance need not be. In cases of therapeutic trust, for example, it might be practically rational (namely, rational with reference to the adopted end of building a trusting relationship) to accept that the trustee will F, and thus, to use the proposition that they will F as a premise in practical deliberation (see Bratman 1992; Cohen 1989)—that is, to act as if it is true that they will F. Of course, acting as if a proposition is true neither implies nor is implied by believing that it is true.
On performance-theoretic accounts, trusting is subject, on the truster’s side, to three kinds of evaluative norms, which correspond with three kinds of positive evaluative assessments: success, competence, and aptness. Whereas trusting is successful if and only if the trustee takes care of things as intrusted, trusting is competent if and only if one’s trusting issues from a reliable disposition—namely, a competence—to trust successfully when appropriately situated (for discussion, see Carter 2020a).
Just as successful trust might be incompetent as when one trusts someone with a well-known track record of unreliability who happens to prove trustworthy on this particular occasion, likewise, trust might fail to be successful despite being competent, as when one trusts an ordinarily reliable individual who, due to fluke luck, fails to take care of things as entrusted on this particular occasion. Even if trust is both successful and competent, however, there remains a sense in which it could fall short of the third kind of evaluative standard—namely, aptness. Aptness demands success because competence, and not merely success and competence (see Sosa 2010a, 2015; Carter 2020a, 2020b). Trust is apt, accordingly, if and only if one trusts successfully such that the successful trust manifests her trusting competence.
Why not lie? (Or, more generally, why not promise to take care of things, and then renege on that promise whenever it is convenient to do so?) According to a fairly popular answer (Faulkner 2011; Simion 2020b), deception is bad not only for the deceived, but it is bad likewise for the deceiver (see also Kant). If one cultivates a reputation as being untrustworthy, then this comes with practical costs in one’s community; the untrustworthy person, recognized as such, is outcast, and de facto foregoes the (otherwise possible) social benefits of trusting.
Things are more complicated, however, in one-off trust-exchanges—where the risk of the disvalue of cultivating an untrustworthy reputation is minimal. The question can be reposed within the one-off context: why not lie and deceive, when it is convenient to do so, in one-off exchanges? In one-off interactions where we (i) do not know others’ motivations but (ii) do appreciate that there is a general motivation to be unreliable (for example, to reap gains of betrayal), it is surprising that we find as much trustworthy behaviour as we do. Why do people not betray to a greater extent than they do in such circumstances, given that betrayal seems prima facie the most rational decision-theoretic move?
According to Faulkner, when we communicate with another as to the facts, we face a situation akin to a prisoner’s dilemma (2011: 6). In a prisoner’s dilemma, our aggregate well-being will be maximized if we both cooperate. However, given the logic of the situation, it looks like the rational thing to do for each of us is to defect. We are then faced with a problem: how to ensure the cooperative outcome?
Similarly, Faulkner argues, speakers and audiences have different interests in communication. The audience is interested in learning the truth. In contrast, engaging in conversations is to the advantage of speakers because it is a means of influencing others: through an audience’s acceptance of what we say, we can get an audience to think, feel, and act in specific ways. So, according to Faulkner, our interest, qua speakers’, is being believed, because we have a more basic interest in influencing others. The commitment to telling the truth would not be best for the speaker. The best outcome for a speaker would be to receive an audience’s trust and yet have the liberty to tell the truth or not (2011: 5-6).
There are four main reactions to this problem in the literature in the epistemology of testimony. According to Reductionism (Adler 1994; Audi 1997, 2004, 2006; Faulkner 2011; Fricker 1994, 1995, 2017, 2018; Hume 1739; Lipton 1998; Lyons 1997), in virtue of this lack of alignment of hearer and speaker interests, one needs positive, independent reasons to trust their speaker: since communication is like a prisoner’s dilemma, the hearer needs a reason for thinking or presuming that the speaker has chosen the cooperative, helpful outcome. Anti-Reductionism (Burge 1993, 1997; Coady 1973, 1992; Goldberg 2006, 2010; Goldman 1999; Graham 2010, 2012a, 2015; Greco 2015, 2019; Green 2008; Reid 1764; Simion 2020b; Simion and Kelp 2018) rejects this claim. According to these philosophers, we have a default (absent defeaters) entitlement to believe what we are being told. In turn, this default entitlement is derivable on a priori grounds from the nature of reason (Burge 1993, 1997), sourced in social norms of truth-telling (Graham 2012b), social roles (Greco 2015), the reliance on other people’s justification-conferring processes (Goldberg 2010), or from the knowledge norm of assertion (Simion 2020b). Other than these two main views, we also encounter hybrid views (Lackey 2003, 2008; Pritchard 2004) that try to impose weaker conditions on testimonial justification than Reductionism, while, at the same time, not being as liberal about it as Anti-Reductionism. Last but not least, a fourth reaction to Faulkner’s problem of cooperation for testimonial exchanges is scepticism (Graham 2012a; Simion 2020b); on this view, the problem does not get off the ground to begin with.
According to Faulkner himself, trust lies at the heart of the solution to his problem of cooperation, that is, it gives speakers reasons to tell the truth (2011, Ch. 1; 2017). Faulkner thinks that the problem is resolved “once one recognizes how trust itself can give reasons for cooperating” (2017: 9). When the hearer H believes that the speaker S can see that H is relying on S for information about whether p, and in addition H trusts S for that information, then H will make a number of presumptions: 1. H believes that S recognizes H’s trusting dependence on S proving informative; 2. H presumes that if S recognizes H’s trusting dependence, then S will recognize that H normatively expects S to prove informative; 3. H presumes that if S recognizes H’s expectation that S should prove informative, then, other things being equal, S will prove informative for this reason; 4. Hence, taking the attitude of trust involves presuming that the trusted will prove trustworthy (2011: 130). The hearer’s presumption that the speaker will prove informative rationalizes the hearer’s uptake of the speaker testimony.
Furthermore, Faulkner claims, H’s trust gives S “a reason to be trustworthy”, such that S is, as a result, more likely to be trustworthy: it raises the objective probability that S will prove informative in utterance. In this fashion, “acts of trust can create as well as sustain trusting relations” (2011: 156-7). As Graham (2012a) puts it, “the hearer’s trust—the hearer’s normative expectation, which rationalizes uptake—then ‘engages,’ so to speak, the speaker’s internalization of the norm, which thereby motivates the speaker to choose the informative outcome.” Speakers who have internalized these norms will then often enough choose the informative outcome when they see that audiences need information; they will be “motivated to conform” because they have “internalized the norm” and so “intrinsically value” compliance (2011: 186). As such, the de facto reliability of testimony is explained by the fact that the trust placed in hearers by the speakers triggers, on the speakers’ side, the internalization of social norms of trust, which, in turn, makes speakers objectively likely to put hearers’ informational interests before their own.
According to Peter Graham (2012a), however, Faulkner’s own solution threatens to dissolve the problem of cooperation rather than solve it (Graham 2012a). Recall how the problem was set up: the thought was that speakers only care about being believed, whether they are speaking the truth or not, which is why the hearer needs some reason for thinking the speaker is telling them the truth. But if speakers have internalized social norms of trustworthiness, it is not true that speakers are just as apt to prove uninformative as informative. It is not true that they are only interested in being believed. Rather, they are out to inform, to prove helpful; due to having internalized the relevant trustworthiness norms, speakers are committed to informative outcomes (Graham 2012a).
Another version of scepticism about the problem of cooperation is voiced in Simion’s “Testimonial Contractarianism” (2020b). Recall that, according to Faulkner, in testimonial exchanges, the default position for speakers involves no commitment to telling the truth. If that is the case, he argues, the default position for hearers involves no entitlement to believe. Here is the argument unpacked:
(P1) Hearers are interested in truth; speakers are interested in being believed.
(P2) The default position for speakers is seeing to their own interests rather than to the interests of the hearers.
(P3) Therefore, it is not the case that the default position for speakers is telling the truth (from 1 and 2).
(P4) The default position for hearers is trust only if the default position for speakers is telling the truth.
(C) Therefore, it is not the case that the default position for hearers is trust (from 3 and 4).
There is one important worry for this argument: on the reconstruction above, the conclusion does not follow. In particular, the problem is with premise (3), which is not supported by (1) and (2) (Simion 2020b). That is because being interested in being believed does not exclude also being interested in telling the truth. Speakers might still—by default—also be interested in telling the truth on independent grounds, that is, independently of their concern (or, rather, lack thereof) with hearers’ interests; indeed, the sources of entitlement proposed by the Anti-Reductionist—for instance, the existence of social norms of truth-telling, the knowledge norm of assertion and so forth—may well constitute themselves in reasons for the speaker to tell the truth—absent overriding incentive to do otherwise. If that is the case, telling the truth will be default for hearers, therefore, trust will be default for hearers. What the defender of the Problem of Cooperation needs, then, for validity, is to replace (P1) with the stronger (P1*): Hearers are interested in truth; speakers are only interested in being believed. However, it is not clear that (P1*) spells out the correct utility profile of the case: are all speakers really such that they only care about being believed? This seems like a fairly heavy empirical assumption that is in need of further defence.
A final normative species that merits discussion on the truster’s side is the obligation to trust. Obligations to trust can be generated, trivially, by promise-making (compare Owens 2017) or by other kinds of cooperative agreements (Faulkner 2011, Ch. 1). Of more philosophical interest are cases where obligations to trust are generated without explicit agreements.
One case of particular interest here arises in the literature on testimonial injustice, pioneered by Miranda Fricker (2007). Put roughly, testimonial injustice occurs when a speaker receives an unfair deficit of credibility from a hearer due to prejudice on the hearer’s part, resulting in the speaker’s being prevented from sharing what she knows.
An example of testimonial injustice that Fricker uses as a reference point is from Harper Lee’s To Kill a Mockingbird, where Tom Robinson, a black man on trial after being falsely accused of raping a white woman, has his testimony dismissed due to the prejudiced preconceptions on the part of the jury which owes to deeply seated racial stereotypes. In this case, the jury makes a deflated credibility judgement of Robinson, and as a result, he is unable to convey to them the knowledge that he has of the true events which occurred.
On one way of thinking about norms of trusting on the truster’s side, the members of the jury have mere entitlements to trust Robinson’s testimony though no obligation to do so; thus, their distrust of Robinson is not norm-violating. This gloss of the situation, on Fricker’s view, is incomplete; it fails to take into account the sense in which Robinson is wronged in his capacity as a knower as a result of this distrust. An appreciation of this wrong, according to Fricker, should lead us to think of the relevant norm on the hearer’s side as generating an obligation rather than a mere permission to believe; as such, on this view, distrust that arises from affording a speaker a prejudiced credibility deficit is not merely an instance of foregoing trusting when one is entitled to trust, but failing to trust when one should. For additional work discussing the relationship between trust and testimonial injustice see, for example, Origgi (2012); Medina (2011); Wanderer (2017); Carter and Meehan (2020).
Fricker’s ground-breaking proposal concerns cases when one is harmed in their capacity as a knower via distrust sourced in prejudice. That being said, several philosophers believe that the phenomenon generalizes beyond cases of distinctively prejudicial distrust; that is, that it lies in the nature and normativity of telling that we have a defeasible obligation to trust testifiers, and that failure to do so is impermissible, whether it is sourced in prejudice or not. Indeed, G. E. M. Anscombe (1979) and J. L. Austin (1946) famously believed that you can insult someone by refusing their testimony.
We can distinguish between three general accounts of what it is that hearers owe to speakers and why: presumption-based accounts, purport-based accounts, and function-based accounts. The key questions for all accounts are whether they successfully deliver an obligation to trust, what rationale they provide, and whether their rationale is ultimately satisfactory.
While there are differences in the details, the core idea behind presumption-based views (Gibbard 1990, Hinchman 2005, Moran 2006, Ridge 2014) is that when a speaker S tells a hearer H that p, say, S incurs certain responsibilities for the truth of p. Crucially, H, in virtue of recognising what S is doing, thereby acquires a reason for presuming S to be trustworthy in their assertion that p. But since anyone who is to be presumed trustworthy in asserting that p ought to be believed, we get exactly what we were looking for: an obligation to trust speakers alongside an answer to the rationale question.
Of course, the question remains whether the rationale provided is ultimately convincing. Sandy Goldberg (2020) argues that the answer is no. To see what he takes to be the most important reason for this, one should first look at a distinction Goldberg introduces between a practical entitlement to hold someone responsible and an epistemic entitlement to believe that they are responsible. Crucially, one can have the former without the latter. For instance, if your teenager tells you that they will be home by midnight and they are not, you will have a practical entitlement to hold them responsible even if you do not have an epistemic entitlement to believe that they are responsible. Importantly, to establish a presumption of trustworthiness, you need to make a case for an epistemic entitlement to believe. According to Goldberg, however, presumption-based accounts only deliver an entitlement to hold speakers responsible for their assertions, not an entitlement to believe that they are responsible. That is to say, when S tells H that p and thereby incurs certain responsibilities for the truth of p and when H recognises that this is what S is doing, H comes by an entitlement to hold S responsible for the truth of p. Crucially, to get to the presumption of trustworthiness we need more than this, as the case of the teenager clearly indicates. But presumption-based accounts do not offer more (Goldberg 2020, Ch. 4).
Another problem for these views is sourced in the fact that extant presumption-based accounts are distinctively personal: all accounts share the idea that in telling an addressee that p, speakers perform a further operation on them and that it is this further operation that generates the obligation on the addressee’s side. In virtue of this, presumption-based accounts deliver too limited a presumption of trustworthiness. To see this, we should go back to Fricker’s cases of epistemic injustice: it looks as though, not believing what a testifier says in virtue of prejudice is equally bad, whether one is the addressee of the instance of telling in question or merely overhears it (Goldberg 2020).
Goldberg’s own alternative proposal is purport-based: according to him, assertion has a job description, which is to present a content as true in such a way that, were the audience to accept it on the basis of accepting the speaker’s speech contribution, the resulting belief would be a candidate for knowledge (Goldberg 2020, Ch. 5). Since assertion has this job description, when speakers make assertions, they purport to achieve exactly what the job description says. Moreover, it is common knowledge that this is what speakers purport to do. But since assertion will achieve its job description only if the speaker meets certain epistemic standards and since this is also common knowledge, the audience will recognise that the performed speech act achieves its aim only if the relevant epistemic standards are met. Finally, this exerts normative pressure on hearers. To be more precise, hearers owe it to speakers to recognize them as agents who purport to be in compliance with the epistemic standards at work and to treat them accordingly.
According to Goldberg, our obligation toward speakers is weaker than presumption-based accounts would have it: in the typical case of testimony, what we owe to the speakers is not to outright believe them, but rather to properly assess their speech act epistemically. The reason for this, Goldberg argues, is that we do not have access to their evidence, or their deliberations; given that this is so, the best we can do is to adjust our doxastic reaction to “a proper (epistemic) assessment of the speaker’s epistemic authority, since in doing so they are adjusting their doxastic reaction to a proper (epistemic) assessment of the act in which she conveyed having such authority” (Goldberg 2020, Ch. 5).
As a first observation, note that Goldberg’s purport-based account deals better with cases of testimonial injustice than presumption-based accounts. After all, since the normative pressure is generated by the fact that it is common knowledge that in asserting speakers represent themselves as meeting the relevant epistemic standards, the normative pressure is on anyone who happens to listen in the conversation, not just on the direct addressees of the speech act.
With this point in play, let us return to Goldberg’s argument that there is no obligation to believe. According to Goldberg, this is because hearers do not have access to speakers’ reasons and their deliberations. One question is why exactly this should matter. After all, one might argue, the fact that the speaker asserted that p provides them with sufficient reason to believe that p (absent defeat, of course). That the assertion does not also give hearers access to the speakers’ own reasons and deliberations does nothing to detract from this, unless one endorses dramatically strong versions of reductionism about testimony (which Goldberg himself would not want to endorse). If so, the fact that assertions do not afford hearers access to speakers’ reasons and deliberations provides little reason to believe that there is no obligation to believe on the part of the hearer (Kelp & Simion 2020a).
An alternative way to ground an obligation to trust testimony (Kelp & Simion 2020a) relies on the plausible idea that the speech act of assertion has the epistemic function to generate true belief (Graham 2010), or knowledge (Kelp 2018; Kelp & Simion 2020a; Simion 2020a). According to this view, belief-responses on behalf of hearers contribute to the explanation of the continuous existence of the practice of asserting: were hearers to stop believing what they are being told, speakers would lose incentive to assert, and the practice would soon disappear. Since this is so, and since hearers are plausibly criticism-averse, it makes sense to have a norm that imposes an obligation on the hearers to believe what they are being told (absent defeat). Like that, in virtue of their criticism-aversion, hearers will reliably obey the norm—that is, will reliably form the corresponding beliefs—which, in turn, will keep the practice of assertion going (Kelp & Simion 2020a, Ch. 6).
One potential worry for this view is that it does not deliver the “normative oomph” that we want from a satisfactory account of the hearer’s obligation to trust: think of paradigm cases of epistemic injustice again. The hearers in these cases seem to fail in substantive moral and epistemic ways. However, on the function-based view, their failure is restricted to breaking a norm internal to the practice of assertion. Since norms internal to practices need not deliver substantive oughts outside of the practice itself—think, for instance, of rules of games—the function-based view still owes us an account of the normative strength of the “ought to believe” that drops out of their picture.
As the previous sections of this article show, trust can be a two-place or a three-place relation. In the former case, it is a relation between a trustor and a trustee, as in “Ann trusts George”. Two-place trust seems to be a fairly demanding affair: when we say that Ann trusts George simpliciter, we seem to attribute a fairly robust attitude to Ann, one whereby she trusts him in (at least) several respects. In contrast, three-place trust is a less involved affair: when we say that Ann trusts George to do the dishes, we need not say much about their relationship otherwise.
This contrast is preserved when we switch from focusing on the trustor’s trust to the trustee’s trustworthiness. That is, one can be trustworthy simpliciter (corresponding to a two-place trust relation) but one can also be trustworthy with regard to a particular matter—that is, two-place trustworthiness (Jones 1996) —corresponding to three-place trust. For instance, a surgeon might well be extremely trustworthy when it comes to performing surgery well, but not in any other respects.
Some philosophers working on trustworthiness focus more on two-place trust. As such, since the two-place trust relation is intuitively a more robust one, they put forward accounts of trustworthiness that are generally quite demanding, in that they require the trustee to be reliably making good on their commitments, but also to do so out of the right motive.
The classic account of such kind is Annette Baier’s goodwill-based account; in a similar vein, others combine reliance on goodwill with certain expectations (Jones 1996) including in one case a normative expectation of goodwill (Cogley 2012). According to this kind of view, the trustworthy person fulfils their commitments in virtue of their goodwill toward the trustor. This view, according to Baier, makes sense of the intuition that there is a difference between trustworthiness and mere reliability, that corresponds to the difference between trust and mere reliance.
The most widely spread worry about these accounts of trustworthiness is that they are too strong: we can trust other people without presuming that they have goodwill. Indeed, our everyday trust in strangers falls into this category. If so, the argument goes, this seems to suggest that whether or not people are making good on their commitments out of goodwill or not is largely inconsequential: “[w]e are often content to trust without knowing much about the psychology of the one-trusted, supposing merely that they have psychological traits sufficient to get the job done” (Blackburn 1998).
Another worry for these accounts is that, while plausible as accounts of trustworthiness simpliciter, they give counterintuitive results in cases of two-place trustworthiness: indeed, whether George is trustworthy when it comes to washing the dishes or not seems not to depend on his goodwill, nor on other such noble motives. The goodwill view is too strong.
Furthermore, it looks as though there is a reason to believe the goodwill view is, at the same time, too weak. To see this, consider the case of a convicted felon and his mother: it looks as though they can have a goodwill-based relationship, and thus be trustworthy within the scope thereof, while, at the same time, not being someone whom we would describe as trustworthy (Potter 2002: 8).
If all of this is true, it begins to look as though the presence of goodwill is independent of the presence of trustworthiness. This observation motivates accounts of trustworthiness that rely on less highbrow motives underlying the trustee’s reliability. One such account is the social contract view of trustworthiness. According to this view, the motives underlying people’s making good on their commitments are sourced in social norms and the unfortunate consequences to one’s reputation and general wellbeing of breaking them (Hardin 2002: 53; see also O’Neill 2002; Dasgupta 2000). Self-interest determines trustworthiness on these accounts.
It is easy to see that social contract views do well in accounting for trustworthiness in three-place trust relations: George is trustworthy when it comes to washing the dishes, on this view: he makes good on his commitments in virtue of social norms making it such that it is in his best interest to do so. The main worry for these views, however, is that they will be too permissive, and thus have difficulties in distinguishing between trustworthiness proper and mere reliability. Relatedly, the worry goes, these views seem less well equipped to deal with trustworthiness simpliciter, that is, the kind of trustworthiness that corresponds to a two-place trust relation. For instance, on a social contract view, it would seem that a sexist employer who treats female employees well only because he believes that he would face legal sanctions if he did not, will come out as trustworthy (Potter 2002: 5). This is intuitively an unfortunate result.
One thought that gets prompted by the case of the sexist employer is that trustworthiness is a character trait that virtuous people possess; after all, this seems to be something that the sexist employer is missing. On Nancy Potter’s view, trustworthiness is a disposition to respond to trust in appropriate ways, given “who one is in relation [to]” and given other virtues that one possesses or ought to possess (for example, justice, compassion) (2002: 25). According to Potter, a trustworthy person is “one who can be counted on, as a matter of the sort of person he or she is, to take care of those things that others entrust to one.”
When it comes to demandingness, the virtue-based view seems to lie somewhere in-between the goodwill view, on one hand, and the social contract view, on the other. It seems more permissive than the former in that it can account for the trustworthiness of strangers insofar as they display the virtue at stake. It seems more demanding than the latter in that it purports to account for the intuition that mere reliability is not enough for trustworthiness: rather, what is required is reliability sourced in good character.
An important criticism of virtue-based views comes from Jones (2012). According to her, trustworthiness does not fit the normative profile of virtue in the following way: if trustworthiness was a virtue, then being untrustworthy would be a vice. However, according to Jones, that cannot be right: after all, we are often required to be untrustworthy in one respect or another—for instance, because of conflicting normative constraints—but it cannot be that being vicious is ever required.
Another problem for Potter’s specific view are its apparent un-informativeness; first, defining the trustworthy person as “a person who can be counted on as a matter of the sort of person he or she is” threatens vicious circularity: after all, it defines the trustworthy as those that can be trusted. Relatedly, the account turns out to be too vague to give definite predictions in a series of cases. Take again the case of the sexist employer: why is it that he cannot be “counted on, as a matter of the sort of person he is, to take care of those things that others entrust to one” in his relationship with his female employees? After all, in virtue of the sort of person he is—that is, the sort of person who cares about not suffering the social consequences of mistreating them—he can be counted on to treat his employees well. If that is so, Potter’s view will not do much better than social contract views when it comes to distinguishing trustworthiness from mere reliability.
Several philosophers propose less demanding accounts of trustworthiness. Katherine Hawley’s (2019) view falls squarely within this camp. According to her, trustworthiness is a matter of avoiding unfulfilled commitments, which requires both caution in incurring new commitments and diligence in fulfilling existing commitments. Crucially, on this view, one can be trustworthy regardless of one’s motives for fulfilling one’s commitments. Hawley’s is a negative account of trustworthiness, which means that one can be trustworthy while avoiding commitments as far as possible. Untrustworthiness can arise from insincerity or bad intentions, but it can also arise from enthusiasm and becoming over-committed. A trustworthy person must not allow her commitments to outstrip her competence.
One natural question that arises for this view is: how about commitments that we do not, but we should take on board? Am I a trustworthy friend if I never take on any commitments toward my friends? According to Hawley, in practice, through friendship, work and other social engagements we take on meta-commitments—commitments to incur future commitments. These can make it a matter of trustworthiness to take on certain new commitments.
Another view in a similar, externalist vein, is developed by Kelp and Simion (2020b). According to them, trustworthiness is a disposition to fulfil one’s obligations. What drives the view is the thought that one can fail to fulfil one’s commitments in virtue of being in a bad environment—an environment that “masks” the normative disposition in question—while, at the same time, remaining a trustworthy person. Again, on this view as well, whether the disposition in question is there in virtue of good will or not is inconsequential. That being said, their view can accommodate the thought that people who comply with a particular norm for the wrong reason are less trustworthy than their good-willing counterparts. To see how, take the sexist employer again: insofar as it is plausible that there are norms against sexism, as well as norms against mistreating one’s female employees, the sexist employer fulfils the obligations generated by the latter but not by the former. In this, he is trustworthy when it comes to treating his employees well, but not trustworthy when it comes to treating them well for the right reason.
Another advantage of this view is that it explains the intuitive difference in robustness between two-place trustworthiness and trustworthiness simpliciter. According to this account, one is trustworthy simpliciter when one meets a contextually-variant threshold of two-place trustworthiness for contextually-salient obligations. For instance, a philosophy professor is trustworthy simpliciter in the philosophy department just in case she has a disposition to meet enough of her contextually salient obligations: do her research and teaching, not be late for meetings, answer emails promptly, help students with their essays and so forth. Plausibly, some of these contextually salient obligations will include doing these things for the right reasons. If so, the view is able to account for the fact that trustworthiness simpliciter is more demanding than two-place trustworthiness.
Trust is valuable. Without it, we face not only cooperation problems, but we also incur substantial risks to our well-being—namely, those ubiquitous risks to life that characterize—at the limit case—the Hobbesian (1651/1970) “state of nature”. Accordingly, one very general argument for the value of trust appeals to the disutility of its absence (see also Alfano 2020).
Moreover, apart from merely serving as an enabling condition for other valuable things (like the possibility of large-scale collective projects for societal benefit), trust is also instrumentally valuable for both the truster and the trustee as a way of resolving particular (including one-off) cooperation problems in such a way as to facilitate mutual profit (see §2). Furthermore, trust is instrumentally valuable as a way of building trusting relationships (Solomon and Flores 2003). For example, trust can effectively be used—as when one trusts a teenager with a car to help cultivate a trust relationship—in order to make more likely the attainments of the benefits of trust (for both the truster and the trustee) further down the road (Horsburgh 1960; Jones 2004; Frost-Arnold 2014; see also the discussion of therapeutic trust above).
Apart from trust’s uncontroversial instrumental value (for helpful discussion, see O’Neill 2002), some philosophers believe that trust has final value. Something X is instrumentally valuable, with respect to an end, Y, insofar as it is valuable as a means to Y; instrumental value can be contrasted with final value. Something is finally valuable iff it is valuable for its own sake. A paradigmatic example of something instrumentally valuable is money, which we value because of its usefulness in getting other things; an example of something (arguably) finally valuable is happiness.
One way to defend the view that trust can be finally valuable, and not merely instrumentally valuable, is to supplement the performance-theoretic view of trust (see §1.c and §2.a) with some additional (albeit somewhat contentious) axiological premises as follows:
(P1) Apt trust is successful trust that is because of trust-relevant competence. (from the performance-theoretic view of trust)
(P2) Something is an achievement if and only if it is a success because of competence. (Premise)
(C1) So, apt trust is an achievement. (from P1 and P2)
(P3) Achievements are finally valuable. (Premise)
(C2) So, apt trust has final value. (from C1 and P3)
Premise (2) of the argument is mostly uncontentious, and is taken for granted widely in contemporary virtue epistemology (for instance, Greco 2009, 2010; Haddock, Millar, and Pritchard 2009; Sosa 2010b) and elsewhere (Feinberg 1970; Bradford 2013, 2015).
Premise (3), however, is where the action lies. Even if apt trust is an achievement, given that it involves a kind of success because of ability (that is, trust-relevant competences), we would need some positive reason to connect the “success because of ability” structure with final value if we are to accept (P3).
A strong line here defends (3) by maintaining that all achievements (including evil achievements and “trivial” achievements) are finally valuable, because successes because of ability (no matter what the success, no matter what the ability used) have a value that is not reducible to just the value of the success.
This kind of argument faces some well-worn objections (for some helpful discussions, see Kelp and Simion 2016; Dutant 2013; Goldman and Olsson 2009; Sylvan 2017). A more nuanced line of argument for C2 will weaken (3) so that it says, instead, that (3*) some achievements are finally valuable. But with this weaker premise in play, (3*) and (C1) no longer entail C2; what would be needed—and this remains an open problem for work on the axiology of trust—is a further premise to the effect that the kind of achievement that features in apt trust, specifically, is among the finally valuable rather than non-finally valuable achievements. And a defence of such a further premise, of course, will turn on further considerations about (among other things) the value of successful and competent trust, perhaps also in the context of wider communities of trust.
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J. Adam Carter
University of Glasgow
University of Glasgow