Prosentential Theory of Truth

Prosentential theorists claim that sentences such as “That is true” are prosentences that function analogously to their better known cousins—pronouns. For example, just as we might use the pronoun ‘he’ in place of ‘James’ to transform “James went to the supermarket” into “He went to the supermarket,” so we might use the prosentence-forming operator ‘is true’ to transform “Snow is white” into “‘Snow is white’ is true.” According to the prosentential theory of truth, whenever a referring expression (for example, a definite description or a quote-name) is joined to the truth predicate, the resulting statement contains no more content than the sentence(s) picked out by the referring expression. To assert that a sentence is true is simply to assert or reassert that sentence; it is not to ascribe the property of truth to that sentence. The prosentential theory is one kind of deflationary theory of truth. Like all deflationary theories, it provides an alternative to explanations of truth that analyze truth in terms of reference, predicate satisfaction or a correspondence relation.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Prosentence?
  2. Quantificational Prosentences
  3. Why the Prosentential Theory is Deflationary
  4. The Recognition-Transcendence of Truth
  5. A Prosentential Theory of Falsity
  6. The Liar Paradox
  7. Objections
  8. Prosentential Theory vs. Other Deflationary Theories
  9. References and Further Reading

1. What is a Prosentence?

The prosentential theory was first developed by Dorothy Grover, Joseph Camp, Jr., and Nuel Belnap, Jr. (1975) and Grover (1992) and has received renewed attention due to the work of Robert Brandom (1994). The central claim of the prosentential theory is that ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator rather than a property-ascribing locution. Perhaps the best way to begin an explication of the prosentential theory is by looking at the more familiar proforms found in ordinary English usage. ‘Proform’ is the generic name for the linguistic category of expressions that ‘stand in’ for other expressions—pronouns being the most familiar variety.

Most uses of pronouns are lazy—the antecedents of the pronouns could have easily been used instead of the pronouns. For example,

(1) Mary wanted to buy a car, but she could only afford a motorbike.

(2) If she can afford it, Jane will go.

(3) John visited us. It was a surprise.

(4) Mary said that the moon is made of green cheese, but I didn’t believe it.

‘She’ simply stands in for ‘Mary’ in (1), and ‘she’ stands in for ‘Jane’ in (2), even though ‘she’ appears before ‘Jane.’ In (3) ‘it’ refers to the event of John’s having visited us, while in (4) ‘it’ refers to Mary’s statement. Lazy uses of pronouns are convenient but perhaps not essential linguistic conventions.

In addition to lazy uses of pronouns, there are also ‘quantificational uses,’ as in:

(5) If any car overheats, don’t buy it.

(6) Each positive integer is such that if it is even, adding 1 to it yields an odd number.

In these cases, the pronouns do not pick up their referents from their antecedents in the same straightforward way as pronouns of laziness do. Replacing the ‘it’ in (5) by the apparent antecedent ‘any car’ or the ‘it’ in (6) by ‘each positive integer’ yields the following.

(5′) If any car overheats, don’t buy any car.

(6′) Each positive integer is such that if each positive integer is even, adding 1 to each positive integer yields an odd number.

(5′) and (6′) obviously do not express the sense of the original sentences. ‘Any car’ and ‘each positive integer’ cannot be construed as referring expressions; rather, they pick out families of admissible expressions that can be substituted into the claims. (5) and (6) should be represented as

(5″) (x)[(x is a car & x overheats) → don’t buy x].

(6″) (x)[(x is a positive integer & x is even) → adding 1 to x yields an odd number].

More will be said about quantificational proforms below.

There are also many commonly used proforms that are not often recognized as proforms. These include proverbs:

(7) Dance as we do

(8) Mary ran quickly, so Bill did too


(9) We must strive to make men happy and to keep them so

and proadverbs:

(10) She twitched violently, and while so twitching, expired.

Most importantly, defenders of the prosentential theory of truth claim that English also contains prosentences. For example,

(11) Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: That is true.

(12) John: Bill claims that there are people on Mars but I don’t believe that it is true.

In these examples, ‘that is true’ and ‘it is true’ serve as ‘prosentences of laziness.’ They inherit their content from antecedent statements, just as pronouns inherit their reference from antecedent singular terms. John’s use of ‘it is true’ is lazy because he could have easily repeated the content of Bill’s claim without using a prosentence. John could have said the following.

(12′) John: Bill claims that there are people on Mars but I don’t believe that there are people on Mars.

The relation between a proform and its antecedent is called a relation of ‘anaphora.’ Defenders of the prosentential theory claim that prosentences such as ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ do not have any content of their own. Whatever content they have is inherited from their anaphoric antecedents. Because prosentences simply stand in for other sentences, prosentential theorists claim that utterances of ‘p’ and ‘p is true’ always have the same content.

There are many more kinds of prosentences than ‘that is true’ or ‘it is true.’ Each of the following sentences, for example, is also a prosentence.

(13) Goldbach’s conjecture is true.

(14) ‘Snow is white’ is true.

(15) The claim that grass is green is true.

According to the prosentential theory, sentences (13), (14) and (15) say no more than sentences (16), (17) and (18), respectively.

(16) Every even number is the sum of two primes.

(17) Snow is white.

(18) Grass is green.

Each prosentence is formed by conjoining some expression that refers to a sentence to the truth predicate.

Although the semantic content of prosentences and their antecedents is the same, prosentences often differ in pragmatic respects from their antecedents. Consider the difference between the following cases:

(11) Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: That is true.

(11′) Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: There are people on Mars.

Although Mary’s utterance in (11′) asserts no more than her utterance in (11), her utterance in (11′) does not acknowledge that Bill has said anything. By acknowledging Bill’s previous statement, Mary’s utterance of ‘that is true’ avoids a kind of assertional plagiarism and has the effect of expressing agreement. Mary could have uttered her statement in (11′) without ever having heard Bill say anything and without, therefore, expressing any kind of agreement. Thus, the prosentential theory takes up the point emphasized by F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory of truth that assertions of truth do not assert anything new. Unlike redundancy theories, however, the prosentential theory does not take the truth predicate to be always eliminable without loss. What would be lost in (11′) is Mary’s acknowledgment that Bill had said something.

One of the prosentential theory’s most important claims about the truth predicate is that it is not used to ascribe a substantive property to propositions. Grover (1992, p. 221) writes,

Many other truth theories assume that a sentence containing a truth predication, e.g., ‘That is true,’ is about its antecedent sentence (‘Chicago is large’) or an antecedent proposition. By contrast, the prosentential account is that ‘That is true’ does not say anything about its antecedent sentence (e.g., ‘Chicago is large’) but says something about an extralinguistic subject (e.g., Chicago).

The truth predicate is not used to say something about sentences or propositions. It is used to say something about the world. As Grover (1992, p. 221) puts it, prosentences function “at the level of the object language.” Even when someone makes an utterance such as “John’s last claim is true”—which uses a referring expression that explicitly mentions an antecedent utterance token—the prosentential theory still denies that it is the utterance that is being talked about. The person uttering this sentence “expresses an opinion about whatever (extralinguistic thing) it was that John expressed an opinion about” (Grover, 1992, p. 19). W. V. Quine (1970, pp. 10-11) makes a similar claim, stating that the truth predicate serves “to point through the sentence to reality; it serves as a reminder that though sentences are mentioned, reality is still the whole point.” The prosentential theory uses the notion of the anaphoric inheritance of content to explain how reality remains the focus in such cases.

2. Quantificational Prosentences

In addition to lazy uses of prosentences, there are also ‘quantificational’ uses. For example,

(19) Everything John said is true

is a quantificational prosentence. A first attempt to translate (19) into a language containing bound propositional variables might read

(20) (p)(If John said that p, then p is true).

A natural language paraphrase of (20) which exhibits ‘it is true’ as a quantificationally dependent prosentence would be

(21) For anything one can say, if John said it, then it is true. (Grover, 1992, p. 130)

Since, according to the prosentential theory, the statement ‘p is true’ says no more than the statement ‘p,’ the truth predicate in (20) can be dropped to yield

(20′) (p)(If John said that p, then p).

If the variable ‘p’ ranges over objects and take names of objects as its substitution instances—i.e., if ‘(p)’ and ‘p’ are given their ordinary interpretations—then the consequent of the conditional inside (20′) will not be a grammatical expression. The antecedents and consequents of conditionals must be complete sentences. In order for (20′) to be a grammatical expression, two modifications in the standard interpretation of variables and quantifiers must be made. First, the variable ‘p’ must be understood to be a propositional variable, taking entire propositions instead of names of propositions as its substitution instances. Secondly, the universal quantifier ‘(p)’ must be understood substitutionally, since the traditional, objectual interpretation of the quantifiers does not square well with the use of propositional variables. A statement using the particular (or existential) substitutional quantifier is true just in case the open sentence following the quantifier has at least one true substitution instance; while a statement using the universal substitutional quantifier is true in case every substitution instance is true (cf. David, 1994, p. 85). In order to avoid confusion between the objectual and substitutional interpretations of the quantifiers, I shall use ‘∀p’ to designate the universal substitutional quantifier. (20′), then, should read

(20″) ∀p(If John said that p, then p).

If, however, we interpret the conditional in (20″) as a material conditional, (20″) will still misrepresent the content of (19).

To see why this is so, consider the fact that universally quantified statements can be understood as conjunctions of all their possible substitution instances. For example, (20″) is equivalent to

(22) (If John said that p1, then p1 is true) & (If John said that p2, then p2 is true) & (If John said that p3, then p3 is true) & … & (If John said that pn, then pn is true).

How many conjuncts make up the content of (22) will depend upon the size of the domain of discourse in question. That is, it will depend upon how many possible values of p there are. If the domain of the variable ‘p’ is the set of all things that can be said, then (22) will consist of an indefinitely large conjunction of substitution instances. Most of the conjuncts will be vacuously true by virtue of having false antecedents—i.e., there will be indefinitely many things that John did not say. This means that each of the indefinitely many conditionals formed from things that John did not say is just as much part of the content of (19) as each of the conditionals formed from things John did say. That seems counterintuitive and contrary to the meaning of (19). Suppose that John made only the following three statements on the occasion in question.

(23) Gas prices are too high.

(24) Taxes are too high.

(25) Professional baseball players’ salaries are too high.

It is plausible to think that (19) says something about (23), (24) and (25) but not about (26), (27) and (28)—statements John never made.

(26) Gas prices are too low.

(27) Taxes are too low.

(28) Professional baseball players’ salaries are too low.

Yet if the quantification in (20″) remains unrestricted, then its content consists of a conjunction of conditionals having (26), (27), (28) and countless other statements John did not say in their antecedents.

If quantificational prosentences such as ‘Everything John said is true’ are to refer to only finite classes of claims, their quantifiers must be restricted in some way. One way to trim down the domain of ‘p’ in (20″) is to limit the universe of discourse to the set of all statements made by John. Let ‘UJ’ represent some particular universe of discourse, and let ‘{p|Øp}’ mean ‘the set of all propositions such that ‘Øp’ is true.’ If we limit the universe of discourse to all and only the things that John said, then we have

(29) ∀p(If John said that p, then p). UJ = {p|John said p}

‘∀p(If John said that p, then p)’ will then consist of a finite conjunction of true conditionals, one for each thing said by John on the occasion in question. This arrangement, however, has the unusual feature that, for every grammatical subject of such a universally quantified sentence, there will be a different universe of discourse. For every x, there will be a unique universe of discourse for each statement of the form

(30) ∀p(If x said that p, then p). Ux = {p|x said p}

Other quantificational prosentences that would be instances of (30) include

(31) Everything the Pope says about theological doctrine is true.

(32) Everything Henry Kissinger says about foreign policy is true.

Following the current suggestion, (31) could be symbolized as either

(33) ∀p(If the Pope said that p, then p). UP = {p|the Pope said p & p is a matter of theological doctrine}


(33′) ∀p(If the Pope said that p & p is a matter of theological doctrine, then p). UP = {p|the Pope said p}

The symbolization for (32) would be analogous. It is not clear that we will be able to capture what is common to all of these cases if each quantificational prosentence is tied to a distinct universe of discourse. Perhaps there is another way to limit the domain of ‘p’ in (20″).

Nuel Belnap, Jr. (1973), one of the founders of the prosentential theory of truth, introduced the notion of ‘conditional assertion’ to solve the problem of restricted quantification—i.e., where one wants to quantify over only a limited domain. All prosentential theorists now rely upon Belnap’s model to explicate the logical structure of quantificational prosentences. Belnap introduced the notation ‘(A/B)’ to stand for conditional assertion. Conditional assertion occurs when someone does not assert the conditional ‘If A then B’ as much as conditionally assert B—that is, assert B on the condition that A. Belnap formulates the following principle to capture this idea:

(B1) If A is true, then what (A/B) asserts is what B asserts. If A is false, then (A/B) is nonassertive. (Belnap, 1973, p. 50)

Quantifying into conditional assertions yields a restricted form of quantification, regarding which Belnap offers the following principle.

(B2) Part 1. (x)(Cx/Bx) is assertive just in case ∃xCx is true. Part 2. (x)(Cx/Bx) is the conjunction of all the propositions (Bt) such that Ct is true. (ibid., p. 66)

Applying Belnap’s conditional assertion notation to (20″) yields

(34) ∀p(John said that p/p).

The content of (34), then, is a finite conjunction of claims. But notice that it is not a conjunction of conditionals of the form ‘If John said that p, then p,’ each with a true antecedent. Rather, it is a conjunction of claims p1, p2,…, pn, each of which satisfies the condition that John said it. The focus of such a claim is on what John said and only derivatively on the fact that it was John who did the saying. If the only statements John made were (23), (24) and (25), then the content of an assertion of (34) is exhausted by the conjunction of (23), (24) and (25). As a result, Belnap’s principle of restricted quantification solves the problem of how to interpret ‘Everything John said is true.’ Applying Belnap’s principles to (31) and (32) yields

(35) ∀p(the Pope said that p & p is a matter of theological doctrine/p).

(36) ∀p(Kissinger said that p & p is a matter of foreign policy/p).

Following Belnap’s interpretation of conditional assertion and restricted quantification, prosentential theorists can explain how quantificational prosentences have as their content finite conjunctions of claims rather than infinite conjunctions of conditionals, most of which are trivially true. Prosentential theorists thereby show that quantificational prosentences contain no more content than the anaphoric antecedents of those prosentences. Although quantificational prosentences may contain no more explicit content than their anaphoric antecedents, they can also be used as implicit attributions of reliability, where such attributions do not clearly appear in their antecedents. Cf. Beebe (forthcoming).

3. Why the Prosentential Theory is Deflationary

The prosentential theory of truth counts as a deflationary theory because it denies that any analysis of truth of the form

(37) (x)(x is true iff x is F)

can be given, where ‘x is F’ expresses a property that is conceptually or explanatorily more fundamental than ‘x is true.’ An analysis of truth would be appropriate if the truth predicate were a property-ascribing locution and the property that is ascribed could be broken down into more fundamental properties. However, prosentential theorists deny that uses of the truth predicate ascribe any property to sentences or propositions.

A common anti-deflationist approach to truth analyzes truth in terms of reference and predicate satisfaction. Stephen Stich (1990, ch. 5), for example, takes the proper analysis of truth to be

(38) ‘a is F’ is true iff there exists an object x such that ‘a’ refers to x and ‘F’ is satisfied by x.

Instead of denying the truth of statements such as (38), deflationists merely deny that they constitute analyses of truth (cf., e.g., Horwich, 1998, p. 10). Deflationists claim that the most fundamental facts about truth are the instances of the various truth schemata used by deflationary theorists. Consider the equivalence schemata employed by Quine’s (1970) disquotationalism:

(D) ‘p’ is true iff p

and Paul Horwich’s (1998) minimalism:

(MT) The proposition that p is true iff p.

Nominalizations of descriptive items are substituted on the left-hand sides of each biconditional schema, while the right-hand sides contain either descriptive items themselves or appropriate translations of them. Each of these theorists claims that there is no more to truth than what is expressed by the substitution instances of these equivalence schemata. Truth is not analyzed as a relation and the instances of the equivalence schemata are taken to be the most fundamental facts about truth. The prosentential theory claims that each of the favored examples of these deflationary theorists is simply a special case of the more general phenomenon of anaphora. Regardless of the points of disagreement among deflationary theorists, they all agree that instances of the truth schemata represent facts about truth that are more fundamental vis-à-vis truth than any fact given in an analysis such as (38).

Some theories, such as the correspondence theory of truth, take truth to be a relation between propositions and the world. Where ‘C’ expresses the correspondence relation, ‘y’ ranges over segments of reality, and ‘x’ is used—for the sake of convenience—as a placeholder for both descriptive items and the contents of descriptive items, we can represent a common version of the correspondence theory as

(39) (x)[x is true iff (∃y)(Cxy)].

(39) should read ‘For any (descriptive item) x, x is true if and only if there is a (segment of reality) y such that x corresponds to y.’ If truth cannot be analyzed at all, then it obviously cannot be analyzed as a relation. If, however, truth can be analyzed, then perhaps it would be appropriate to analyze it as a relation between descriptive items and segments of the world. How should one go about deciding between the correspondence theory and the prosentential theory?

Prosentential theorists respond by inviting readers to consider the following facts. The correspondence theory claims that snow’s being white is necessary but not sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ In addition to snow’s being white, the proposition that snow is white must stand in a relation of correspondence to the fact that snow is white. The prosentential theory, by contrast, claims that snow’s being white is both necessary and sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ As Alston (1996, p. 209) puts it, “Nothing more is required for its being true that p than just the fact that p; and nothing less will suffice.” One of the hallmarks of deflationism is the claim that the truth of a descriptive item depends only upon the meaning or content expressed by that item and how things actually stand in the world. Prosentential theorists and other deflationists hope that their readers will see that further constraints on truth are unnecessary.

The prosentential theorist’s claim that no analysis of truth can be given should not be confused with the claim that no explanation of truth can be given. The prosentential theory explains the function of the truth predicate by showing how ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator. (Because the prosentential explanation of truth makes the story about truth depend upon a story about how we use words and concepts, the prosentential explanation of the function of “true” generally leads theorists to adopt a version of the ‘use theory of meaning.’)

Deflationary theorists also claim that truth never performs any real explanatory work. Suppose, for example, that Smith successfully performs the action of attending a concert on Friday and that his action was in part based upon his belief that the concert is on Friday. If Smith succeeds in arriving at the concert on Friday, what best explains the success of his action? The non-deflationist answers that it is the truth of Smith’s belief that explains his success. His action succeeds because his belief is true. In other words, there is an important property of his belief (or perhaps a property of the proposition expressed by his belief)—namely, truth—that is central to any adequate explanation of Smith’s successful action. Deflationists disagree. They reply that the reason that Smith succeeded in performing an action based upon the belief that the concert is on Friday is that the concert is on Friday. There is no need to implicate a special truth property in this explanation. Why do actions based upon the belief that oxygen is necessary for combustion generally succeed (other things being equal)? Because oxygen is necessary for combustion. And so on. Because prosentences never have any content of their own, whatever explanatory burden one may wish for them to shoulder will always fall to their anaphoric antecedents.

4. The Recognition-Transcendence of Truth

Unlike some alternatives to the correspondence theory (e.g., the epistemic theories of truth of C. S. Peirce, Hilary Putnam, and Michael Dummett), the prosentential theory accepts that truth can be recognition-transcendent. Epistemic theories of truth always have epistemic operators (e.g., ‘justifiably believes that…,’ ‘warrantedly asserts that…’) of some sort on the right-hand side of their analyses of truth. For example,

(CSP) p is true iff the unlimited communication community in the long run would believe that p.

(HP) p is true iff one would be warranted in asserting that p in ideal epistemic circumstances.

(IJC) p is true iff it would be justifiable to believe that p in a situation in which all relevant evidence (reasons, considerations) is readily available. (due to Alston, 1996, p. 194)

Unlike correspondence and prosentential theories, epistemic theories always mention the knowledge, assertions or justified beliefs of particular people. Subjects and their beliefs do not figure into correspondence and prosentential theories in any way.

Truth theories such as (CSP), (HP) and (IJC) have the implication that there could not be any true propositions “such that nothing that tells for or against their truth is cognitively [in]accessible to human beings, even in principle” (Alston, 1996, p. 200). Summarizing a common thread of epistemic theories of truth, Alston (1996, pp. 189-190) writes,

The truth of a truth bearer consists not in its relation to some “transcendent” state of affairs, but in the epistemic virtues the former displays within our thought, experience, and discourse. Truth value is a matter of whether, or the extent to which, a belief is justified, warranted, rational, well grounded, or the like.

According to prosentential theorists, truth theories like (CSP), (HP) and (IJC) that focus on epistemic virtues are incompatible with the various truth schemata used by deflationists to explicate the concept of truth. Schemata such as

(40) p is true iff p

represent facts about truth that are so fundamental and obvious that the uninitiated often have difficulty seeing beyond their triviality to the significance of the deflationary thesis.

According to (IJC), snow’s being white is neither necessary nor sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white’ or the proposition that snow is white. If it is possible for all relevant evidence to be readily available and yet for this evidence to be unable to make a belief that snow is white justifiable, then ‘snow is white’ will not be true—even if snow is, in fact, white. Since this seems clearly possible, snow’s being white is not sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ Moreover, if it is possible for all relevant evidence to be readily available and for this evidence to make the belief that snow is white justifiable even when snow is not white, then (since this seems clearly possible) snow’s being white is not necessary for the truth of ‘snow is white’ either. Similar considerations apply to (CSP) and (HP). Prosentential theorists claim that any theory which makes snow’s being white neither necessary nor sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white’ is inadequate. The equivalence schemata simply do not allow any room for the epistemic status of a proposition (or a belief or statement) being both necessary and sufficient for that proposition’s truth. In the eyes of prosentential theorists, epistemic theories of truth are incompatible with the equivalence schemata and their instances.

By contrast, the prosentential theory embraces the recognition-transcendence of truth. Truth schemata such as

(40) p is true iff p

do not require that anyone be able to tell whether p is the case in order for p to be true. In order for p to be true, nothing more is required than p. No one has to be able to verify or warrantedly assert it. The right-hand side of (40), then, does not limit truth to what falls within our thought, experience and discourse. As a result, the prosentential theory of truth is compatible with (though it neither entails nor is entailed by) a robustly realist metaphysics. It is a mistake to think that the correspondence theory is the only truth theory a metaphysical realist can buy into and that any critic of the correspondence theory will be an antirealist.

5. A Prosentential Theory of Falsity

The prosentential theory of truth can be extended to account for uses of the predicate ‘x is false.’ The prosentential theory of falsity will be strongly analogous to the prosentential theory of truth. The prosentential theorist can claim that, just as the predicate ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator, so does ‘x is false.’ When an expression referring to an antecedent utterance is substituted for ‘x’ in ‘x is true,’ the resulting claim will have the same content as its anaphoric antecedent. By parity, when a referring expression that denotes some antecedent utterance is substituted for ‘x’ in ‘x is false,’ the resulting claim will have the same content as the denial of its anaphoric antecedent. Consider the following example.

(41) Joe: The sky is cloudy. Jane: That’s true. Mark: That’s false.

Jane’s utterance has the same content as Joe’s, namely, that the sky is cloudy. Mark’s utterance, on the other hand, has the same content as the denial of Joe’s utterance, namely,

(42) The sky is not cloudy.

Mark’s utterance inherits part of its content from its anaphoric antecedent (that is, Joe’s utterance), but his utterance includes an extra bit of content not found in that antecedent: negation. Instances of the prosentence-forming operator ‘x is false,’ then, will have the same content as the negations of their antecedents.

6. The Liar Paradox

The prosentential theory of truth implies a solution to the liar paradox. Consider the following sentence.

(43) This sentence is false.

Is (43) true or false? If (43) says something true, then—since it says that (43) itself is false—it says something false. However, if (43) says something false, then—since it says that (43) is false—it says something true, namely, that (43) is false. We are thus confronted with a paradox.

Some attempts to solve the liar paradox involve extreme measures. Tarski, for example, thought that the paradox could be avoided only by eschewing ‘semantically closed languages’—i.e., languages which contain semantic terms that are applicable to sentences of that same language. He maintained that a theory of truth for a language should not be formulated within that same language. So, a theory of truth-in-L1 must be formulated in some meta-language, L2. If we allow the predicate ‘x is true-in-L1’ to be part of L1, paradoxes will result. The predicate ‘x is true-in-L1,’ then, must be part of the meta-language, L2. Since no well-formed sentence of L1 can be used to talk about the truth value of any sentence in L1, there is no chance for the liar paradox to arise because the basic liar sentence makes a claim about its own truth value. Tarski succeeds in avoiding the basic form of the liar paradox—but only at a very high price. He must content himself with providing an account of ‘true-in-Li’ rather than an account of truth. And, since natural languages like English are semantically closed, Tarski’s theory also has the weakness of applying only to artificial languages.

Defenders of the prosentential theory claim that they can provide a solution to the liar paradox that is more natural and comes with a significantly lower price tag. According to the prosentential theory, (43) is neither true nor false because it fails to pick up an anaphoric antecedent. Just as I cannot inherit my own wealth, a prosentence cannot inherit its content from itself. Anaphoric inheritance is a non-reflexive relation that holds between two distinct things. A prosentence has content only when content has been passed to it from a content-bearing antecedent. Consequently, (43) will have content only if its anaphoric antecedent does. But if (43) is its own antecedent, (43) will have content only if (43) does. Since prosentences do not have their own independent content, (43) fails to have any content. Since it does not succeed in expressing a proposition, the liar sentence is neither true nor false and the paradox is avoided.

7. Objections

Philosophical objections to the prosentential theory of truth can be divided into two main groups. One set of objections is directed against Grover, Camp and Belnap’s (1975) original version of the theory; the other is directed against Brandom’s (1994) updated version. Originally, Grover, Camp and Belnap claimed that each prosentence—e.g., ‘it is true’ or ‘that is true’—referred as a whole to an antecedent sentence token. Each occurrence of ‘it’ or ‘that’ in a prosentence, they claimed, should not be interpreted as a referring expression. In fact, ‘it,’ ‘that’ and ‘…is true’ should not be treated as having independent meanings at all. Grover, Camp and Belnap were trying to undermine the idea that the truth predicate is a property-ascribing locution. They thought that if ‘it’ and ‘that’ were taken to be referring expressions, it would seem only too natural to conclude that ‘…is true’ ascribed a predicate to their referents.

One consequence of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s commitment to the non-composite nature of prosentences is that they are forced to find non-composite prosentences in places where there do not seem to be any. Consider, for example,

(13) Goldbach’s conjecture is true


(14) ‘Snow is white’ is true.

Grover, Camp and Belnap must argue that, despite appearances, (13) and (14) are not really composed of the referring expressions ‘Goldbach’s conjecture’ and ‘’Snow is white’’ conjoined to the predicate ‘…is true.’ According to the original version of the prosentential theory, the logical form of (13) is actually something like

(13′) For any sentence, if it is Goldbach’s conjecture, then it is true


(13″) There is a unique sentence, such that Goldbach conjectured that it is true, and it is true.

The logical form of (14) would be either

(14′) For any sentence, if it is ‘Snow is white,’ then it is true


(14″) Consider: snow is white. That is true. (Grover, Camp and Belnap, p. 103)

(Each of these interpretations has been suggested by some prosentential theorist.) In three of the four interpretations, quantifiers are introduced so that the prosentence ‘it is true’ can remain an unbroken unit. Universal quantifiers are used in (13() and (14(), and an existential quantifier is used in (13″).

An obvious objection to Grover, Camp and Belnap’s strategy is that it seems quite unlikely that (13′) and (14′) or (13″) and (14″) reveal the true logical structure of (13) and (14). There is no good reason to suppose that the surface structure of (13) and (14) hides genuine quantifiers below the surface. Furthermore, there are simply too many uses of the truth predicate outside of the phrases ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ for Grover, Camp and Belnap’s interpretation to be plausible. (Cf. Brandom (1994, pp. 303-305) and Kirkham (1992, pp. 325-329) for more critical discussion of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s early version of the prosentential theory.)

Brandom (1994, pp. 303-305) has argued that prosentential theorists do not need to treat ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ as non-composite units. Instead, he claims that ‘…is true’ should be treated as a prosentence-forming operator. When it is conjoined to any kind of referring expression, the resulting expression will have the same content as the antecedent sentence or utterance denoted by the referring expression. (This is the version of the prosentential theory that I have been assuming throughout.) However, a different set of problems confronts this version of the prosentential theory. Consider the following example inspired by Wilson’s (1990) criticisms of the prosentential theory.

(44) Steve: Boudreaux won the mayoral election. Kate: What that conniving, good-for-nothing bum said was true.

If Brandom’s version of the prosentential theory is correct, Kate’s utterance should have no more content than Steve’s. Clearly, however, Kate’s remark does more than simply reassert the content of Steve’s remark. It casts aspersions on Steve’s character. According to Brandom’s seemingly more defensible version of the prosentential theory, a referring expression used at the head of a prosentence serves only to pick out an antecedent from which the prosentence can inherit its content. But referring expressions can be naughty or nice, informative or dull. Once Brandom opens the door for prosentences to be formed by conjoining any referring expression to the prosentence-forming operator ‘…is true,’ it seems that he can no longer maintain that prosentences never have any more content than their anaphoric antecedents. Referring expressions are not all like proper names. Very often they bring with them a great deal more content than is strictly necessary for them to succeed in referring. A proper interpretation of prosentences cannot ignore this extra content. (Cf. Wilson (1990) for more criticisms that apply to both versions of the prosentential theory.)

8. Prosentential Theory vs. Other Deflationary Theories

According to F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory, one of the earliest deflationary theories, sentences such as

(45) The earth is round


(46) It is true that the earth is round

say exactly the same thing. The phrase “It is true” is a superfluous addition. Ramsey did not, however, explain why phrases like “It is true that…” or “…is true” exist at all if they serve no real purpose. The prosentential theory incorporates Ramsey’s claim about redundancy of content in its account of the function of prosentences. Since prosentences inherit their content from their anaphoric antecedents, they will say the same thing as their antecedents. However, the prosentential theory goes beyond the redundancy theory by providing an explanation of why we have the truth predicate in our language. Prosentences of laziness (e.g., “That’s true” spoken after someone utters “It’s very humid in Louisiana”), it is argued, give us a way of expressing agreement without having to repeat what has been said while at the same time acknowledging that an assertion has been made. Also, quantificational prosentences (e.g., “Everything Henry Kissinger says is true”) enable us to state generalizations when we might be unable to state each individual instance of any such generalization.

The prosentential theory also tries to incorporates some of the central claims of P. F. Strawson’s performative theory of truth. According to Strawson, statements such as “That’s true” (uttered after someone says that the sun is bright) or “It is true that the sun is bright” are nonassertoric performative utterances. An utterance is nonassertoric if it does not make an assertion. Commands (e.g., “Clean your room”) are examples of nonassertoric utterances because they do not purport to state or describe any facts. Similarly, according to Strawson, “It is true” (uttered after someone says that the sun is bright) and “It is true that the sun is bright” do not assert that some sentence or proposition has the property of being true. Rather, these are performative utterances, which do not so much say something as do something. In these cases the truth predicate is being used to express agreement or to endorse some claim.

The prosentential theory follows Strawson’s performative theory in denying that the truth predicate ascribes a truth property to propositions or statements. However, the prosentential theory does not deny that prosentences—while they may very well be used to express agreement—also assert something in the act of expressing this agreement. In addition, the prosentential theory can accommodate one type of case that causes trouble for the performative theory. Many embedded uses of the truth predicate do not seem to be expressions of agreement, as in “If what he said is true, we’ll be out of this building before winter.” Such a use of the truth predicate may very well not express agreement. The speaker may be unsure whether he should endorse the claim and may be merely thinking hypothetically. The prosentential theory does not require that every use of the truth predicate be an expression of agreement—although they can be used to do so. It explains that prosentences—even those that are embedded in the antecedents of conditionals (e.g., “what he said is true”)—inherit their content from their anaphoric antecedents.

W. V. Quine’s (1970) disquotational theory of truth views the truth predicate as a convenient device of ‘semantic ascent.’ When, for example,

we want to generalize on ‘Tom is mortal or Tom is not mortal,’ ‘Snow is white or snow is not white,’ and so on, we ascend to talk of truth and of sentences, saying ‘Every sentence of the form ‘p or not p’ is true,’ or ‘Every alternation of a sentence with its negation is true.’ What prompts this semantic ascent is not that ‘Tom is mortal or Tom is not mortal’ is somehow about sentences while ‘Tom is mortal’ and ‘Tom is Tom’ are about Tom. All three are about Tom. We ascend only because of the oblique way in which the instances over which we are generalizing are related to one another. (Quine, 1970, p. 11)

The truth predicate, then, exists because it enables us to form certain generalizations that would otherwise quite difficult to state without some such device of semantic ascent. When, however, the truth predicate is used with single sentences (e.g., “‘Snow is white’ is true”), it is superfluous.

Defenders of the prosentential theory agree with Quine (1970, p. 12) that, “despite a technical ascent to talk of sentences, our eye is on the world” when we use the truth predicate. In other words, both Quine’s disquotationalism and the prosentential theory deny that the truth predicate is used to ascribe a property to propositions. The truth predicate, they claim, is used to say something about the world. The prosentential theory also acknowledges the important role the truth predicate plays in forming generalizations that might otherwise be difficult or impossible to state (cf. the discussion of quantificational prosentences above). Furthermore, both theories explain truth by explaining the role of certain linguistic items (e.g., devices of semantic ascent, prosentences) rather than focusing on language-independent propositions and properties.

However, unlike disquotationalism, the prosentential theory recognizes that there are many uses of the truth predicate in which there is nothing to disquote. For example, in the sentence “Goldbach’s conjecture is true,” there are no quotation marks to be removed. Instead of being used in connection with an entire sentence, here the truth predicate is joined to an expression (‘Goldbach’s conjecture’) referring to an antecedent sentence. It is not clear how the disquotational theory might be extended to cover this kind of case. The prosentential theory explains that any referring expression (e.g., a name, definite description, etc.) inherits its content from its anaphoric antecedent(s) and, when such an expression is conjoined to the truth predicate, a prosentence with the same content as the antecedent(s) results.

Paul Horwich’s minimalist theory of truth (1998)—unlike the prosentential theory and some other deflationary theories—takes the primary bearers of truth to be propositions rather than sentences or utterances. Horwich claims that the conjunction of all the instances of the schema

(MT) The proposition that p is true iff p

yields an implicit definition of truth. Each instance is an axiom of his theory. How many instances are there? There’s one for every possible proposition, including propositions no human being understands and maybe even a few that no human being could ever understand. In other words, there are infinitely many. Horwich claims that there is nothing more to our concept of truth than our disposition to assent to each of the instances of (MT).

Horwich and defenders of the prosentential theory agree in thinking that no analysis of truth can be given. Horwich, however, thinks that the truth predicate does expresses a property, since he believes that all predicates express properties in some minimal sense. Although the prosentential theory is typically described as denying that “true” expresses a property of any sort (see, for example, Lynch, 2001, p. 4), the writings of Dorothy Grover (1992)—the primary defender of the prosentential theory—are far from clear on the issue of predicates and properties. Grover claims that the truth predicate is not used to ascribe a property to propositions, but this is compatible with the truth predicate expressing a property in a minimal sense (à la Horwich) nonetheless. The fact that a certain Rolex is not used as a paperweight does not mean that it lacks the property of being able to weigh down papers. Grover also claims that truth is not a substantive or naturalistic property, but this claim is compatible with truth being an insubstantial or nonnaturalistic property (also à la Horwich). Since Grover does not sufficiently explain her remarks about substantive or naturalistic properties, it is difficult to tell how close her prosentential theory actually is to Horwich on this issue. Brandom’s (1994, ch. 5) discussion of the prosentential theory does not even broach the issue.

What is clear is that Horwich and defenders of the prosentential theory disagree about the virtues of the substitution interpretation of the quantifiers. Horwich recognizes that if he used substitutional quantifiers, his theory would be finitely statable. He explains, however, that substitutional quantifiers would be too costly an addition to our language: “The advantage of the truth predicate is that it allows us to say what we want without having to employ any new linguistic apparatus of this sort” (Horwich, 1998, p. 4, n. 1). Horwich also harbors doubts about whether we can spell out the notion of substitutional quantification without circularly relying upon the notion of truth (Horwich, 1998, pp. 25-26). In making this last remark, Horwich is thinking of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s unusual thesis that every use of a prosentence—even “‘Snow is white’ is true”—implicitly contains a quantifier. (Cf. section VII for more discussion of this point.) Since substitutional quantifiers must be brought in to explain every use of a prosentence, Grover, Camp and Belnap cannot explain substitutional quantification in terms of truth. However, Brandom’s (1994) version of the prosentential theory does not use substitutional quantification to explain the function of the truth predicate. He argues that, although quantificational prosentences employ substitutional quantification, lazy uses of prosentences—which are more fundamental than their quantificational cousins—do not (cf. section II above). Brandom, thus, avoids the problem of circularity.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. P. (1996). A Realist Conception of Truth. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Beebe, J. R. (2003). Attributive uses of prosentences. Ratio, 02/2003; 16(1), 1 – 15.
  • Belnap, Jr., N. D. (1973). Restricted quantification and conditional assertion. In H. Leblanc (Ed.), Truth, syntax and modality (pp. 48-75). Amsterdam: North Holland Publishing Co.
  • Brandom, R. B. (1994). Making it explicit: Reasoning, representing, and discursive commitment. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • David, M. (1994). Correspondence and disquotation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Grover, D. (1992). A prosentential theory of truth. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Grover, D., Camp, Jr., J., & Belnap, Jr., N. D. (1975). A prosentential theory of truth. Philosophical Studies, 27, 73-124.
  • Horwich, P. (1998). Truth (2nd ed.). New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kirkham, R. L. (1992). Theories of truth: A critical introduction. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lynch, M. P. (2001). Introduction: The mystery of truth. In M. P. Lynch (Ed.), The nature of truth: Classic and contemporary perspectives (pp. 1-6). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1970). Philosophy of logic. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Stich, S. P. (1990). The fragmentation of reason: Preface to a pragmatic theory of cognitive evaluation. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Wilson, W. K. (1990). Some reflections on the prosentential theory of truth. In J. M. Dunn & A. Gupta (Eds.), Truth or consequences (pp. 19-32). Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Author Information

James R. Beebe
Email: beebe “at” yahoo “dot” com
University at Buffalo
U. S. A.