Tyler Burge (1946—)

Tyler Burge is an American philosopher who has done influential work in several areas of philosophy. These include philosophy of language, logic, philosophy of mind, epistemology, philosophy of science (primarily philosophy of psychology), and history of philosophy (focusing especially on Frege, but also on the classical rationalists—Descartes, Leibniz, and Kant). Burge has also done some work in psychology itself.

Burge is best known for his extended elaboration and defense of the thesis of anti-individualism. This is the thesis that most representational mental states depend for their natures upon phenomena that are not determined by the individual’s own body and other characteristics. In other words, what it means to represent a subject matter—whether in perception, language, or thought—is not fully determined by individualistic characteristics of the brain, body, or person involved. One of the most famous illustrations of this point is Burge’s argument that psychologically representing a kind such as water requires the fulfillment of certain non-individualistic conditions; such as having been in causal contact with instances of the kind, having acquired the representational content through communication with others, having theorized about it, and so forth. A consequence of Burge’s anti-individualism, in this case, is that two thinkers who are physically indiscernible (who are, for example, neurologically indistinguishable in a certain sense) can differ in that one of them, but not the other, has thoughts containing the concept “water”.

When Burge first proposed the thesis of anti-individualism, it was common for philosophers to reject it for one reason or another. It is a measure of Burge’s influence, and the power of his arguments, that the early 21st century saw few philosophers deny the truth of the view.

Nevertheless, there is much more to Burge’s philosophical contributions than anti-individualism. Most of Burge’s more influential theses and arguments are briefly described in this article. An attempt is made to convey how the seemingly disparate topics addressed in Burge’s corpus are unified by certain central commitments and interests. Foremost among these is Burge’s long-standing interest in understanding the differences between the minds of human beings, on one hand, and the minds of other animals, on the other. This interest colors and informs Burge’s work on language, mind, and epistemology in particular.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Influence
  2. Language and Logic
  3. Anti-Individualism
  4. De Re Representation
  5. Mind and Body
  6. Justification and Entitlement
  7. Interlocution
  8. Self-Knowledge
  9. Memory and Reasoning
  10. Reflection
  11. Perception
  12. History of Philosophy
  13. Psychology
  14. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
      1. Books
      2. Articles
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Influence

Charles Tyler Burge graduated from Wesleyan University in 1967. He obtained his Ph.D. at Princeton University in 1971, his dissertation being directed by Donald Davidson. He is married with two sons. Burge’s wife, Dorli Burge, was prior to her retirement a clinical psychologist. Burge’s eldest son, Johannes, is Assistant Professor in Vision Science at the University of Pennsylvania. His younger son, Daniel, completed a Ph.D. in 20th century American History at Boston University.

Burge is a fan of sport and enjoys traveling and hiking. He also reads widely outside of philosophy (particularly literature, history, history of science, history of mathematics, psychology, biology, music, and art history). Three of Burge’s interests are classical music, fine food, and fine wine.

A list of Burge’s main philosophical contributions would include the following seven areas. First, in his dissertation and the 1970s more generally, Burge focused attention upon the central significance of context-dependent referential and representational devices, including many uses of proper names, as well as what he came to call “applications” in language and thought. This was during a philosophical era in which it was widely believed that such devices were reducible to context-independent representational elements such as linguistic descriptions and concepts in thought. Burge also appealed to demonstrative- or indexical-like elements in perhaps unexpected areas, such as in his treatment of the semantical paradox. A concern with referential representation, which Burge does not believe to be confined solely to empirical cases, has been as close to his central philosophical interest as any topic. Much the same could be said about Burge’s long-standing interest in predication and attribution. (See sections 2 and 4.) Burge’s work on context-dependent aspects of representation is indebted to Keith Donnellan and Saul Kripke.

Second, while broadly-understood anti-individualism has been a dominant view in the history of philosophy, Burge was the first philosopher to articulate the doctrine, to argue for it, and to mine it for many of its implications. Anti-individualism is the view that the natures of most representational states and events are partly dependent on relations to matters beyond the individuals with representational abilities. In the 20th century, anti-individualism went from being, for a decade or more after Burge discussed its several forms or aspects, a minority view to a view that is rarely even questioned in serious philosophical work today. Furthermore, the discussion of anti-individualism engendered by Burge’s work breathed new life into at least two somewhat languishing areas of philosophy: the problem of mental causation, and the nature of authoritative self-knowledge, each of which has since then become widely discussed and recognized as central areas of philosophy of mind, and epistemology, respectively. (See sections 3, 5 and 8.)

Third, Burge’s work on interlocution (commonly called “testimony”) has been widely discussed. He was among the first to defend a non-reductionist view of interlocution, one which remains among the best-articulated and supported accounts of our basic epistemic warrant for relying upon the words of others (see section 7); and Burge later extended this work to provide new ways of thinking about the problem of other minds, on one hand, and the epistemology of computer-aided mathematical proofs, on the other.

Fourth, beginning with his work on self-knowledge and interlocution, Burge began a rationalist initiative in epistemology that has been influential, in addition to areas already mentioned, in discussions of memory, the first-person concept, reflection and understanding, and other abilities, such as certain forms of reasoning, that seem to be peculiar to human beings. Central to Burge’s limited form of rationalism is his powerful case against the once-common view that both analytic and a priori truths are in some way insubstantial or vacuous; as well as his rejection of the closely related view that apriority is to be reduced to analyticity. (See sections 6-10.)

Fifth, beginning in the mid- to late-1980s all the way up to the early 21st century, Burge developed a detailed understanding of the nature of perception. Integral to this understanding has been the extent to which Burge has immersed himself in the psychology of perception as well as developmental psychology and ethology. Some of Burge’s work on perception is as much a contribution to psychology as to philosophy; one of the articles he has published on the topic covers a prominent and hotly contested question in psychology—the question whether infants and non-human animals attribute psychological states to agents with whom they interact. Parallel with these developments has been Burge’s articulation of a novel account of perceptual epistemic warrant. (See sections 6, 11 and 13.)

Sixth, throughout his career Burge has resisted the tendency of philosophers of mind, especially in the United States, to accept some form of materialism. While it may not have been a central focus of his published work, Burge has over time formulated and defended a version of dualism about the relation between the mind and the body in the literature today. Burge’s view holds that minds, mental states, and mental events are not identical with bodies, physical states, or physical events. It is important to note, however, that Burge’s dualism is not a substance dualism such as the view commonly attributed to Descartes. It is instead a “modest dualism” motivated by the view that counting mental events as physical events does no scientific or other good conceptual work; similarly, for mental properties and minds themselves. This is one example of Burge’s more general resistance to forms of reductionism in philosophy. (See section 5.)

The seventh respect in which Burge’s work has been influential is not confined to a certain body of work or a defended thesis. It lies in providing an antidote to the pervasive tendency, in several areas of philosophy, toward hyper-intellectualization. The earliest paper in which Burge discusses hyper-intellectualization is his short criticism of David Lewis’s account of convention (1975). The tendency toward hyper-intellectualization is exhibited in individualism about linguistic, mental, or perceptual representational content—the idea being that the individual herself must somehow be infallible concerning the proper application conditions of terms, concepts, and even perceptual attributives. It is at the center of the syndrome of views, called Compensatory Individual Representationalism, that Burge criticizes at some length. These views insist that objective empirical representation requires that the individual must in some way herself represent necessary conditions for objective representation. Hyper-intellectualization motivates various forms of epistemic internalism, according to which epistemic warrant requires that the individual be able in some way to prove that her beliefs are warranted, or at least to have good, articulable grounds for believing that they are. Finally, hyper-intellectualization permeates even action theory, which tends to model necessary conditions for animal action upon the intentional actions of mature human language-users. Burge has resisted all of these hyper-intellectualizing tendencies within philosophy, and to a lesser extent in psychology. (See sections 3, 6, 7 and 11.)

If there is a single, overriding objective running throughout Burge’s long and productive career, it is to understand wherein human beings are similar to, and different from, other animals in representational and cognitive respects. As he put the point early on, in the context of a discussion of anti-individualism:

I think that ultimately the greatest interest of the various arguments lies not in defeating individualism, but in opening routes for exploring the concepts of objectivity and the mental, and more especially those aspects of the mental that are distinctive of persons. (1986b, 194 fn. 1)

This large program has involved not only investigating the psychological powers that seem to be unique to human beings—such as a priori warranted cognition and reflection, and authoritative self-knowledge and self-understanding—but also competencies that we share with a wide variety of non-human animals, principally memory, action, and perception. (See sections 3, 4, 7, and 8-11.)

2. Language and Logic

Burge’s early work in philosophy of language and logic centered on semantics and logical form. The work on semantics constitutes the beginning of Burge’s lifelong goal of understanding reference and representation—beginning in language and proceeding to thought and perception. This work includes the logical form of de re thought (1977); the semantics of proper names (1973); demonstrative and indexical constructions (1974a); and also mass and singular terms (1972; 1974b). While the work on context-dependent reference was the dominant special case of Burge’s thought and writing on semantics and logical form, it also includes Burge’s work on paradoxes, especially the strengthened liar (semantic) paradox and the epistemic paradox.

Significant later work on logic and language prominently includes articles on logic and analyticity, and on predication and truth (2003a; 2007b).

3. Anti-Individualism

Anti-individualism is the view that the natures of most thoughts, and perceptual states and events, are partly determined by matters beyond the natures of individual thinkers and perceivers. By the “nature” of these mental states we understand that without which they would not be the mental states they are. So the representational contents of thoughts and perceptual states, for example, are essential to their natures. If “they” had different contents, they would be different thoughts or states. As Burge emphasizes, anti-individualism has been the dominant view in the history of philosophy. It was present in Aristotle, arguably in Descartes, and in many other major philosophers in the Western canon. When Burge, partly building upon slightly earlier work by Hilary Putnam, came explicitly to formulate and defend the view, it became controversial. There are several reasons for this. One is that materialistic views in philosophy of mind seemed incompatible with the implications of anti-individualism. Another was a tendency, which began to be dislodged only after the mid-20th century, to place very high emphasis upon phenomenology and introspective “flashes” of insight when it came to discussions of the natures of representational mental states and events. There are rear-guard defenses of the cognitive relevance of phenomenology that still have currency today. But anti-individualism appears to have become widely, if sometimes reluctantly, accepted.

As noted, anti-individualism is the view that most psychological representational states and events depend for their natures upon relations to subject matters beyond the representing individuals or their psychological sub-systems. This view was first defended in Burge’s seminal article, “Individualism and the Mental” (1979a). Some of Burge’s arguments for anti-individualism employ the Twin-Earth thought-experiment methodology originally set out by Putnam. Burge went beyond Putnam, among other ways, by arguing that the intentional natures of many mental states themselves, rather than merely associated linguistic meanings, depend for their natures on relations to a subject matter. Burge has also argued at length against Putnam’s view (which Putnam has since given up) that meanings and thought contents involving natural kinds are indexical in character.

There are five distinct arguments for anti-individualism in Burge’s work. The order in which they were published is as follows. First, Burge argued that many representational mental states depend for their natures upon relations to a social environment (1979a). Second, he argued that psychologically representing natural kinds such as water and aluminum depends upon relations to entities in the environment (1982). Third, Burge argued that having thoughts containing concepts corresponding to artefactual kinds such as sofas is compatible with radical, non-standard theorizing about the kinds (1986a). Fourth, Burge constructed a thought experiment that appears to show that even the contents of perception may depend for their natures on relations to entities purportedly perceived (1986b; 1986c). Finally, Burge has provided an argument for a version of empirical anti-individualism that he regards as both necessarily true and a priori: “empirical representational states as of the environment constitutively depend partly on entering into environment-individual causal relations” (2010, 69). This final argument has superseded the fourth as the main ground of perceptual anti-individualism. It could also be said that it provides the strongest ground for anti-individualism in general, at least for empirical cases, since propositional attitudes containing concepts such as “arthritis”, “water”, and “sofa”, are all parasitic, albeit in complex and non-fully-understood ways, upon basic perceptual categories covered by the fifth argument. Finally, while it is a priori that perceptual systems and states are partly individuated by relations to an environment, it is an empirical fact that there are perceptual states and events.

Rather than discussing each of these arguments in detail, the remainder of the section focuses on one of Burge’s schematic representations of the common structure of several of the arguments. The thought experiments in question involve three steps. In the first, one judges that someone could have thoughts about “a given kind or property as such, even though that person is not omniscient about its nature” (2013a, 548). For example, one can think thoughts about electrons without being infallible about the natures of electrons. This lack of omniscience can take the form of incomplete understanding, as in the case of the concept of arthritis. It can stem from an inability to distinguish the kind water from a look-alike liquid in a world that contains no water, or theorizing about water. Or it can issue from non-standard theorizing about entities, say sofas, despite fully grasping the concept of sofa.

In the second step, one imagines a situation just like the one just considered, but in which the person’s mistaken beliefs are in fact true. That is to say, one considers a situation in which the kind or property differs from its counterpart in the first situation, but in ways in which the individual cannot discriminate the kind or property in the first situation from its counterpart in the second step. Thus, in this step of the argument the thoughts one would normally express with the words used by the subject, present in the first step, are in fact true.

In the third step “one judges that in the second environment, the individual could not have thoughts about arthritis … [or] sofas, as such” (2013a, 549). The reason, of course, is that the relevant entities in the second step are not the same as those in the first step. There are additional qualifications that must be made, such as that it must be presupposed that, while there is no arthritis, water, or sofas, in the second step, no alternative ways of acquiring the concepts of arthritis, water or sofa is available or utilized. Burge continues:

The conclusion is that what thoughts an individual can have—indeed, the nature of the individual’s thoughts—depends partly on relations that the individual bears to the relevant environments. For we can imagine the individual’s make-up invariant between the actual and counterfactual situations in all other ways pertinent to his psychology. What explains the possibility of thinking the thoughts in the first environment and the impossibility of thinking them in the second is a network of relations that the individual bears to his physical or social surroundings. (2013a, 549)

In other words, the person is able to use the concepts of arthritis, water, and sofa in the first step of the argument for the same reasons that all of us can think with these concepts. Even if the person were indiscernible in individualistic respects, however, changes in the environment could preclude him from thinking with these concepts. If this is correct, then it cannot be the case that the thoughts that one can think with are fully determined by individualistic factors. That is to say, two possible situations in which a person is indistinguishable with respect to individualist factors can differ as regards the thoughts that she thinks.

What this schematic formulation of the first three thought experiments for anti-individualism emphasizes is arguably the same as the reason that it has come to be so widely accepted. As Burge had earlier put the point: the schematic representation of the arguments “exploits the lack of omniscience that is the inevitable consequence of objective reference to an empirical subject matter” (2007, 22-23). Thus, opposition to anti-individualism, or at least opposition to the three arguments in question, must in some way deny our lack of omniscience about the natures of our thoughts, or the conditions necessary for our thinking them. This denial appears to be unreasonable and without a solid foundation.

4. De Re Representation

To a first approximation, de dicto representation is representation that is entirely conceptualized and does not in any way rely upon non-inferential or demonstrative-like relations for its nature. By contrast, de re representation is both partly nonconceptual and reliant upon demonstrative-like relations (at least in empirical cases) for the determination of its nature. For example, the representational content in “that red sphere” is de re; it depends for its nature on a demonstrative-like relation holding between the representer and the putative subject matter. By contrast, “the shortest spy in all the world in 2019” is de dicto. It is completely conceptualized and is not in any way dependent for its nature on demonstrative-like relations. When Burge first began publishing on the topic, it was very common to hold that de re belief attributions (for example) could be reduced to de dicto ascriptions of belief.

Burge’s early work on de re representation sought to achieve three primary goals (1977). First, he provided a pair of characterizations of the fundamental nature of de re representation in language and in thought: a semantical and an epistemic characterization. The semantical account “maintains that an ascription ascribes a de re attitude by ascribing a relation between what is expressed by an open sentence, understood as having a free variable marking a demonstrative-like application, and a re to which the free variable is referentially related” (2007f, 68). The epistemic account, by contrast, maintains that an attitude is de re if it is not completely conceptualized. The second goal of Burge’s early paper on de re belief was to argue that any individual with de dicto beliefs must also have de re beliefs (1977, section II). Finally, Burge argued that the converse does not hold: it is possible to have de re beliefs but not de dicto beliefs. From the second and third claims it follows, contrary to most work on the topic at the time, that de re representation is in important respects more fundamental than de dicto representation.

Burge’s later work on de re representation includes a presentation of and an argument for five theses concerning de re states and attitudes. The first four theses concern specifically perception and perception-based belief. Thesis one is that all representation involves representation-as (2009a, 249-250). This thesis follows from the view that all perceptual content, and the content of all perception-based belief, involves attribution as well as reference. There is no such thing as “neat” perception. All perception is perspectival and involves attribution of properties (which may or may not correctly characterize the objects of perception, even assuming that perceptual reference succeeds). Thesis two is that all perception and perception-based belief is guided by general attributives (2009a, 252). An attributive is the perceptual analog of a predicate, for example, “red” in the perceptual content “that red sphere”. Perceptual representation must be carried out in such a way that one or more attributives is associated with the perception and guides the ostensible perceptual reference. The third thesis is that successful perceptual reference requires that some perceptual attribution must veridically characterize the entity perceived (2009a, 289-290). A main idea of this thesis is that something must make it the case that perceptual reference has succeeded, in a given instance, rather than failed. What must be so is not only that the right sort of causal relation obtains between the perceiver and the perceptual referent, but that some attributive associated with the object of perception veridically applies to it. Like the second thesis, this one is fully compatible with the fact that perceptual reference can succeed even where many attributions, including those most salient, fail. The difference is that the second thesis concerns only purported perceptual reference, while the third concerns successful reference. Successful reference is compatible with the incorrectness of some perceptual attribution, even if an attributive that functions to guide the reference fails to apply to the referent. But the third thesis, to reiterate, does require that some perceptual attributive present in the psychology of the individual correctly applies to the referent.

To summarize: the first thesis says that every representation must have a mode of representation. It is impossible for representation to occur neat. The second thesis holds that even (merely) purported reference requires attribution. And the third thesis states that successful perceptual reference requires that some attributives associated in the psychology of the individual with the reference correctly apply to the referent.

Burge’s final two theses concerning de re representation are more general and abstract. The fourth thesis states that necessary preconditions on perception and perceptual reference provide opportunities for a priori warranted belief and knowledge concerning perception. In Burge’s words: “Some of our perceptually based de re states and attitudes, involving context-based singular representations, can yield apriori warranted beliefs that are not parasitic on purely logical or mathematical truths” (2009a, 298). An example of such knowledge might be the following:

(AC*) If that object [perceptually presented as a trackable, integral body] exists, it is trackable and integral. (compare Burge 2009a, 301)

This thesis arguably follows from the third thesis concerning de re perceptual representation. It follows, to reiterate, because a minimal, necessary condition upon successful perceptual reference is that some attributive associated (by the individual or its perceptual system) with the referent veridically applies to the referent of perception—and the most general, necessarily applicable attributive where perceptual reference is concerned is that the ostensible entity perceived be a trackable, integral body. Finally, the fifth thesis concerning de re representational states and events provides a general characterization of de re representation that does not apply merely to empirical cases:

A mental state or attitude is autonomously (and proleptically) de re with respect to a representational position in its representational content if and only if the representational position contains a representational content that represents (purports to refer) nondescriptively and is backed by an epistemic competence to make non-inferential, immediate, nondiscursive attributions to the re. (2009a, 316)

The use of “autonomously” here is necessary to exclude reliance upon others in perception-based reference. Such reliance can be de re even if the third thesis fails (2009a, 290-291). “Proleptically” is meant to allow for representation that fails to refer. Technically speaking, failed perceptual or perception-based reference is never de re. But it is nevertheless purported de re reference and so is covered by the fifth thesis.

For discussion of non-empirical cases of de re representation, which Burge allowed for even in “Belief De Re”, see Burge (2007f, 69-75) and (2009a, 309-316).

It should be re-emphasized that two of Burge’s primary philosophical interests, throughout his career, have been de re reference and representation (1977; 2007f), on one hand, and the nature of predication, on the other (2007b; 2010a). These topics connect directly with the aforementioned interest in understanding representational and epistemic abilities that seem to be unique to human beings.

5. Mind and Body

Burge’s early work on the mind/body problem centered around sustained criticism of certain ways the problem of mental causation has been used to support versions of materialism (1992; 1993b). Burge’s criticisms of materialism about mind, including the argument against token-identity materialism, date back to “Individualism and the Mental” (1979a, section IV). As noted earlier, Burge’s position on the mind/body problem is a modest form of dualism that is principally motivated by the failure [of reduction of minds, mental states, and mental events, on one hand, to the body or brain, physical states, and physical events, on the other] to provide empirical or conceptual explanatory illumination. He has also done work on consciousness, and provided a pair of new arguments against what he calls “compositional materialism”.

Beginning in the late 1980s, many philosophers expressed doubts concerning the probity of our ordinary conception of mental causation. Discussion of anti-individualism partially provoked this series of discussions. Some argued that, absent some reductive materialist understanding of mental causation, we are faced with the prospect of epiphenomenalism—the view that instances of mental properties do not do any genuine causal work but are mere impotent concomitants of instances of physical properties. Burge argues that the grounds for rejecting epiphenomenalism are far stronger than any of the reasons that have been advanced in favor of the epiphenomenalist threat. He points out that, were there a serious worry about how mental properties can be causally efficacious, the properties of the special sciences such as biology and geology would be under as much threat as those in commonsense psychology or psychological science. Such causal psychological explanation “works very well, within familiar limits, in ordinary life; it is used extensively in psychology and the social sciences; and it is needed in understanding physical science, indeed any sort of rational enterprise” (1993b, 362). Such explanatory success itself shows, other things equal, the “respectability” of the ordinary conception of mental causation: “Our best understanding of causation comes from reflecting on good instances of causal explanation and causal attribution in the context of explanatory theories” (2010b, 471).

Burge has also provided arguments against some forms of materialism. One such argument employs considerations made available by anti-individualism to contend that physical events, as ordinarily individuated, cannot in the general case be identical with mental events (1979a, 141f.; 1993b, 349f.). This variation in mental events across individualistically indiscernible thinkers would not be possible, of course, if mental events were identical with physical events. In other words, if mental events were identical with physical events then mere variation in environment could not constitutively affect individuals’ mental events. Needless to say, the falsity of token-identity materialism entails the falsity of a claim of type-identity.

Burge has also provided another line of thought on the mind-body problem that supports his “modest dualism” concerning the relation of the mental to the physical. The most plausible of the various versions of materialism, Burge holds, is compositional materialism—the view that psychologies or minds, like tectonic plates and biological organisms, are composed of physical particles. However, like all forms of materialism, compositional materialism makes strong, empirically specific, claims. Burge writes:@

The burden on compositional materialism is heavy. It must correlate neural causes and their effects with psychological causes and their effects. And it must illuminate psychological causation, of both physical and psychological effects, in ways familiar from the material sciences (2010b, 479).

He holds that there is no support in science for the compositional materialist’s commitment to the view that mental states and events are identical with composites of physical materials.

The two new arguments against compositional materialism run roughly as follows. The first turns on the difficulty of seeing how “material compositional structures could ground causation by propositional psychological states or events” (2010b, 482). Physical causal structures—broadly construed, to include causation in the non-psychological special sciences—do not appear to have a rational structure. The propositional structures that help to type-individuate certain psychological kinds do have a rational structure. Hence, it is prima facie implausible that psychological causation could be reduced to physical-cum-compositional causal structures. The second argument is similar but does not turn on the notion of causation. Burge argues that:@

the physical structure of material composites consists in physical bonds among the parts. According to modern natural science, there is no place in the physical structure of material composites for rational, propositional bonds. The structure of propositional psychological states and events constitutively includes propositional, rational structure. So propositional states and events are not material composites. (2010b, 483)

Burge admits the abstractness of the arguments, and allows that subsequent theoretical developments might show how compositional materialism can overcome them. However, he suggests that the changes would have fundamentally to alter how either material states and events or psychological states and events are conceived.

Finally, Burge has written two articles on consciousness. The first of these defends three points. One is that all kinds of consciousness, including access consciousness, presuppose the presence of phenomenal consciousness. Phenomenal consciousness is the “what it is like” aspect certain mental states and events. The claim of presupposition is that no individual can be conscious, in any way, unless it has mental states some of which are phenomenally conscious. The second point is that the notion of access consciousness, as understood by Ned Block, for example, needs refinement. As Block understands access consciousness, it concerns mental states that are poised for use in rational activity (1997). Burge argues that this dispositional characterization runs afoul of the general principle that consciousness, of whatever sort, is constitutively an occurrent phenomenon. Burge’s refinement of the notion of access consciousness is called “rational-access consciousness”. The third point is that we should make at least conceptual space for the idea of phenomenal qualities that are not conscious throughout their instantiation in an individual.

Burge’s second paper on consciousness: (a) notes mounting evidence that a person could have phenomenal qualities without the qualities being rationally accessible; (b) explores ways in which a state could be rationally-access conscious despite not being phenomenally conscious; (c) distinguishes phenomenal consciousness from other phenomena, such as attention, thought, and perception; and (d) sets out a unified framework for understanding all aspects of phenomenal consciousness, as a type of phenomenal presentation of qualities to subjects (2007e).

6. Justification and Entitlement

Burge draws a crucial distinction between two forms of epistemic warrant. One is justification. A justified belief is one that is warranted by reason or reasons. By contrast, an epistemic entitlement is an epistemic warrant that does not consist in the possession of reasons. Entitlement is usually defined by Burge negatively—in such way, because there is no simple way to express what entitlement consists in that abstracts from the nature of the representational competence in question.

The distinction was first articulated in “Content Preservation” (1993a). Burge there explained that:

(t)he distinction between justification and entitlement is this: Although both have positive force in rationally supporting a propositional attitude or cognitive practice, and in constituting an epistemic right to it, entitlements are epistemic rights or warrants that need not be understood by or even accessible to the subject. We are entitled to rely, other things equal, on perception, memory, deductive and inductive reasoning, and on … the word of others. (230)

What entitlement consists in with respect to each of these cases is different. What they do have in common is the negative characteristics listed. Burge continues:

The unsophisticated are entitled to rely on their perceptual beliefs. Philosophers may articulate these entitlements. But being entitled does not require being able to justify reliance on these resources, or even to conceive such a justification. Justifications … involve reasons that people have and have access to. (1993a, 230)

Throughout his career, Burge has provided explanations for our entitlement to rely upon interlocution, certain types of self-knowledge and self-understanding, memory, reasoning, and perception. The last of these is briefly sketched before some misunderstandings of the distinction between justification and entitlement are warned against. The case of perceptual entitlement provides one of the best illustrations of the nature of entitlement in general.

People are entitled to rely upon their perceptual beliefs just in case the beliefs in question: (a) are the product of a natural perceptual competence, that is functioning properly; (b) are of types that are reliable, where the requirement of reliability is restricted to a certain type of environment; and (c) have contents that are normally transduced from perceptual states that themselves are reliably veridical (Burge 2003c, sections VI and VIII; 2020, section I). These points are part of a much larger and more complex discussion, of course. The point for now is that each of (a)-(c) are examples of elements of entitlements. As is the case with all entitlements, individuals who are perceptually entitled to their beliefs do not have to know anything concerning (a)-(c); and indeed need not even be able to understand the explanation of the entitlement, or the concept “entitlement”. A final key point is that while all entitlements, like all epistemic warrants generally for Burge, must be the product of reliable belief-forming competences, no entitlement consists purely in reliability. In the case of perception, the sort of reliability that is necessary for entitlement is reliability in the kind of environment that contributed to making the individual’s perceptual states and beliefs what they are (2003c, section VI; 2020, section I).

Numerous critics of Burge have misunderstood the nature of entitlement, and/or the distinction between justification and entitlement. Rather than exhaustively cataloging these misinterpretations, the remainder of the section is devoted to articulating the four main sources of misunderstanding. Keeping these in mind would help to prevent further interpretive mistakes. In increasing levels of subtlety, the mistakes are the following. The first error is simply to disregard Burge’s insistence that entitlements need not be appealed to, or be even within the ken, of the entitled individual. The fact that an individual has no knowledge of any warranting conditions, in a given case, is not a reason for doubting that she is entitled to the relevant range of beliefs.

The second error is insisting that entitlement be understood in terms of “epistemic grounds”, or “evidence”. Each of these notions suggests the idea of epistemic materials in some way made use of by the believer. But entitlement is never something that accrues to a belief, or by extension to a believer, because of something that he or she does, or even recognizes. The example of perceptual entitlement, which accrues in virtue of conditions (a)-(c) above, illustrates these points. The individuation conditions of perceptual states or beliefs are in no sense epistemic grounds. The notion of evidence is even less appropriate for describing entitlement. While evidence can be made up of many different sorts of entities, or states of affairs, evidence must be possessed or appreciated by a subject in order for it to provide an epistemic warrant. But in that case, on Burge’s view, the warrant would be a justification rather than an entitlement.

A variant on this second source of misunderstanding is to assume that since justification is an epistemic warrant by reason, and reasons are propositional, all propositional elements of epistemic warrants are justifications (or parts of justifications). Several types of entitlements involve propositionality—examples of which are interlocution, authoritative self-knowledge, and even perception (in the sense that perceptual beliefs to which we are entitled must have a propositional structure appropriately derived from the content of relevant perceptual states). But none is a justification or an element in a justification. Being propositional is necessary, but not sufficient, for an element of an epistemic warrant to be, or to be involved in, a justification (as opposed to an entitlement). Another way to put the point is to explain that being propositional in structure is necessary, but not sufficient, for being a reason.

The third tendency that leads to misunderstandings of Burge’s two notions of epistemic warrant is the assumption that they are mutually exclusive. On this view, a belief warranted by justification (entitlement) cannot also be warranted by entitlement (justification). Not only is this not the case, but in fact all beliefs that are justified are also beliefs to which the relevant believer is entitled. Every belief that a thinker is justified in holding is also a belief that is produced by a relevantly reliable, natural competence. (Though the converse obviously does not hold.) Entitlement is the result of a well-functioning, natural, reliable belief-forming competence. There are two species of justification for Burge. In the first case, one is justified in believing a self-evident content such as “I am thinking”, or “2+2=4”. In effect, these contents are reasons for themselves—believing them is enough, other things equal, for the beliefs to be epistemically warranted and indeed to be knowledge. The second kind of justification involves inference. If a sound inference is made by a subject, the premises support the conclusion, and the believer understands why the inference is truth-preserving (or truth-tending), then the belief is justified. Notice that each of these kinds of justified beliefs are, for Burge, also the products of well-functioning, natural, reliable belief-forming competencies. The competence in the case of contents that are reasons for themselves is understanding; and the competence in the second case is a complex of understanding the contents, understanding the pattern of reasoning, and actually reasoning from the content of the premises to the content of the conclusion. So all cases of justification are also cases in which the justified believer is entitled to his or her beliefs.

The subtlest mistake often made by commenters concerning Burge’s notions of justification and entitlement is to assume that what Burge says is not true of entitlement is true of his notion of justification. After all, in “Content Preservation”, Burge states that entitlement “need not be understood by or even accessible to the subject” (1993a, 230). And later, in “Perceptual Entitlement”, Burge makes a number of additional negative claims about entitlement. He writes that entitlement “does not require the warranted individual to be capable of understanding the warrant”, and that entitlement is a “warrant that need not be fully conceptually accessible, even on reflection, to the warranted individual” (2003c, 503). Finally, Burge argues that children, for example, are entitled to their perceptual beliefs, rather than being justified, because they lack sophisticated concepts such as epistemic, entails, perceptual state, and so forth (2003c, 521). So we have the following negative specifications concerning entitlement:

(I) It does not require understanding the warrant;

(II) It does not require being able to access the warrant;


(III) It does not require the use of sophisticated concepts such as those mentioned above.

The mistake, of course, is to assume that these things that are not required by entitlement are required by justification, as Burge understands justification. This difficulty is a reflection of the fact that Burge, in these passages and others like them, is doing two things at once. He is not only explaining how he thinks of entitlement and justification, but also distinguishing entitlement from extant conceptions of justification. Since his conception of justification differs from most other conceptions, it is a fallacy to infer from (I)-(III), together with relevant context, that they must be abilities or capacities that justification does require.

This is not to say that (I)-(III) are wholly irrelevant to Burge’s notion of justification. For his conception is not completely unlike others’ conceptions. For example, one who believes that 2+2=4 based on his or her understanding of the content does understand the warrant—for the warrant is the content itself. So what (I) denies of entitlement is sometimes true of Burge’s notion of justification. Similarly, a relative neophyte who understands at least basic logic, and makes a sound inference in which the premises support the conclusion, is in one perfectly good sense able to access his or her warrant for believing the conclusion, as in what is denied in (II). The notion of access in question, when Burge invokes the notion in characterizations of epistemic warrant, is conscious access. (See section 5 above.)

But the other two claims are more problematic. Burge’s conception of justification is not as demanding as one which holds that the denials of (II) and (III) correctly characterize what is necessary for justification. Thus, while perceptual entitlement is the primary form of epistemic warrant for those with empirical beliefs, it is not impossible for children or adults to have justifications for their perceptual beliefs. It is only that these will almost always be partial. They will usually be able to access and understand the warrant (the entitlement) only partially. In effect, they are justified only to the extent that they have an understanding of the nature of perceptual entitlement. Fully understanding the warrant, the entitlement, would require concepts such as those mentioned in (IV). But even children and many adults, as noted, are capable of approximating understanding of the warrant. Burge gives the example of a person averring a perceptual belief and providing in support of his belief the claim that it looks that way to him or her. This is a kind of justification. But there is no (full) understanding of the warrant, and likely not even possession of all the concepts employed in a discursive representation of the complete warrant. Finally, Burge’s notion of justification, or epistemic support by reason, is even weaker than these remarks suggest. For he holds that some nonhuman animals probably have reasons for some of their perceptual beliefs (and therefore have justifications for them)—but these animals can in no sense at all access or understand the warrant. As Burge writes, “My notion of having a reason or justification does not require reflection or understanding. That is a further matter” (2003c, 505 fn. 1). This passage brings out how different Burge’s notion of justification is from many others’ conceptions; and it helps to explain why it is an error to assume that what Burge says is not true of entitlement is true of (his notion of) justification.

7. Interlocution

Burge’s early work on interlocution (or testimony) defended two principal theses. One is the “Acceptance Principle”—the view, roughly speaking, that one is prima facie epistemically warranted in relying upon the word of another. The argument for this principle draws upon three a priori theses: (a) speech and the written word are indications of propositional thought; (b) propositional thought is an indication of a rational source; and (c) rational sources can be relied upon to present truth. The other thesis Burge defended was that it is possible to be purely a priori warranted in believing a proposition on the basis of interlocution (1993a). Burge came to regard this second thesis as a large mistake (2013b, section III), and has since then held that the required initial perceptual uptake of the words in question—utilization of which is made in (a)—makes all interlocutionary knowledge and warranted belief at least minimally empirical in epistemic support. It should be noted, however, that Burge’s view on our most basic interlocutionary warrant remains distinctive in that he regards it as fundamentally non-inferential in character. It is an entitlement—whose nature is structured and supported by the Acceptance Principle, and the argument for it—rather than a justification. Furthermore, none of the critics of Burge’s early view on interlocutionary entitlement identified the specific problem that eventually convinced him that the early view had to be given up.

The specific problem in question was that Burge had initially held that since interlocutionary warrant could persist in certain cases, even as perceptual identification of an utterance failed, the warrant could not be based, even partly, on perception. Burge came to believe that this persistence was possible only because of a massive presumption of reliability where perception was concerned. So the fact that interlocutionary warrant could obtain even where perception failed does not show that the warrant is epistemically independent of perception (2013b, section III).

8. Self-Knowledge

Burge’s views on self-knowledge developed over three periods. The first of these consisted largely in a demonstration that anti-individualism is not, contrary to a common view at the time, inconsistent with or in any tension with our possession of some authoritative self-knowledge (1986d; compare 2013, 8). Burge pointed to certain “basic cases” of self-knowledge—such as those involving the content of “I am now entertaining the thought that water is wet”—which are infallible despite consisting partly in concepts that are anti-individualistically individuated. Using the terms that Burge introduced later, this content is a pure cogito case. It is infallible in the sense that thinking the content makes it true. It is also self-verifying in the sense that thinking the content provides an epistemic warrant, and indeed knowledge, that it is the case. There are also impure cogito cases, an example of which is “I am hereby thinking [in the sense of committing myself to the view] that writing requires concentration”. This self-ascription is not infallible. One can think the content, even taking oneself to endorse the first-order content in question, but one can fail actually to commit oneself to it. But impure cogito cases are still self-verifying. The intentional content in such cases “is such that its normal use requires a performative, reflexive, self-verifying thought” (2003e, 417-418). What Burge calls “basic self-knowledge” in his early work on self-knowledge is comprised of cogito cases, pure and impure. He is explicit, however, that not all authoritative self-knowledge, much less all self-knowledge in general, has these features.

To reiterate, the central point of this early work was simply to demonstrate that there is no incompatibility between our possession of authoritative self-knowledge and anti-individualism. Basic cases of self-knowledge illustrate this. One further way to explain why there is no incompatibility is to note that the conditions that, in accordance with anti-individualism, must be in place for the first-order contents to be thought are necessarily also in place when one self-ascribes such an attitude to oneself (2013, 8).

The second period of Burge’s work on self-knowledge centered around a more complete discussion of the different forms of authoritative self-knowledge, as well as defending the thesis that a significant part of our warrant for non-basic cases of such self-knowledge derives from its indispensable role in critical reasoning (1996). Critical reasoning is meta-representational reasoning that conceptualizes attitudes and reasons as such. The role of (non-basic) authoritative self-knowledge in critical reasoning is part of our entitlement to relevant self-ascriptions of attitudes in general. This second period thus extended Burge’s account of authoritative self-knowledge to non-cogito instances of self-knowledge. It also began the project of explaining wherein we are entitled to authoritative self-knowledge among instances where the self-ascriptions are not self-verifying. Since cogito cases provide reasons for themselves, as it were, basic cases of self-knowledge involve justification. By contrast, non-basic cases of authoritative self-knowledge are warranted by entitlement rather than justification. (See section 6.)

The third period of Burge’s work on self-knowledge consisted in a full discussion of the nature and foundations of authoritative self-knowledge (2011a). Burge argues that authoritative self-knowledge, including a certain sort of self-understanding, is necessary for our role in making attributions concerning, and being subject to, norms of critical reasoning and morality. A key to authoritative self-knowledge, as stressed by Burge from the beginning of his work on the topic, is the absence of the possibility of brute error. Brute error is an error that is not in any way due to malfunctioning or misuse of a representational competence. In perception, for example, one can be led into error despite the fact that one’s perceptual system is working fully reliably; if, say, light is manipulated in certain ways. By contrast, while error is possible in most cases of authoritative self-knowledge, it is possible only when there is misuse or malfunction. Since misuse and malfunction undermine the epistemic warrant, it can be said that instances of authoritative self-knowledge for Burge are “warrant factive”—warrant entails, in such cases, true self-ascriptions of mental states.

The full, unified account of self-knowledge in Burge (2011a) explains each element in our entitlement to self-knowledge and self-understanding. The account is extended to cover, not only basic cases of self-knowledge, but also knowledge of standing mental states; of perceptual states; and of phenomenal states such as pain. The unified treatment explains why its indispensable role in critical reasoning is not all there is to our entitlement to (non-basic cases of) self-knowledge and self-understanding. Burge’s explanation of the impossibility of brute error with respect to authoritative self-knowledge makes essential use of the notion of “preservational psychological powers”, such as purely preservative memory and betokening understanding. Betokening understanding is understanding of particular instances of propositional representational content. The unification culminates in an argument that shows how immunity to brute error follows from the nature of certain representational competencies, along with the nature of epistemic entitlement (2011a, 213f). In yet later work, Burge explained in detail the relation between authoritative self-knowledge and critical reasoning (2013, 23-24).

9. Memory and Reasoning

Two of Burge’s most important philosophical contributions are his identification and elucidation of the notion of purely preservative memory, on one hand, and his discussion of critical reasoning, particularly its relation to self-knowledge and the first-person concept, on the other.

Burge’s discussion of memory and persons distinguishes three different forms of memory: experiential memory; substantive content memory; and purely preservative memory (2003c, 407-408). Experiential memory is memory of something one did, or that happened to one, from one’s own perspective. Substantive content memory is closer to our ordinary notion of simply recalling a fact, or something that happened, without having experienced it personally. Purely preservative memory, by contrast, simply holds a remembered (or seemingly remembered) content, along with the content’s warrant and the associated attitude or state, in place for later use. When I remember blowing out the candles at my 14th birthday party, this is normally experiential memory. Remembering that the United States tried at least a dozen times to assassinate Fidel Castro, in most cases, is an example of substantive content memory. When one conducts inference over time, by contrast, memory functions simply to hold earlier steps along with their respective warrants in place for later use in the reasoning. This sort of memory is purely preservative. Burge argues that no successful reasoning over time is possible without purely preservative memory. Purely preservative memory also plays an important role in Burge’s earlier account of the epistemology of interlocution (1993a; 2013b); and in his most developed account of the epistemology of self-knowledge and self-understanding (2011a).

In “Memory and Persons” he discussed the role of memory in psychological representation as well as the issue of personal identity. Burge argues that memory is “integral to being a person, indeed to having a representational mind” (2003b, 407). He does this by arguing that three common sorts of mental acts, states, and events—those involving intentional agency, perception, and inference—presume or presuppose the retention of de se representational elements in memory. De se states have two functions. First, they mark an origin of representation. In the case of a perceptual state this might be between an animal’s eyes. Second, they are constitutively associated with an animal’s perspectives, needs, and goals. Thus, a dog might not simply represent in perceptual memory the location of a bone—but instead, the location of his or her bone. De se markers are also called by Burge “ego-centric indexes” (2003c; 2019).

Intentional agency requires retention in memory of de se representational elements because intention formation and fulfillment frequently take place over time. If someone else executes the sort of action that one intends for oneself, this would not count as fulfillment of the veridicality condition of one’s intention. Marking one’s own fulfillment (or the lack of it) requires retention in memory of one’s own de se representational elements. Another example is perception. It requires the use of perceptual contents. This use always and constitutively involves possession or acquisition of repeatable perceptual abilities. “Such repeatable abilities include a systematic ability to connect, from moment to moment, successive perceptions to one another and to the standpoint from which they represent” (2003b, 415). The activity necessarily involved in perception, too, involves retention of de se contents in purely preservative memory. Inference, finally, requires this same sort of retention for reasons alluded to above. If reliance on a content used earlier in a piece of reasoning is not ego-centrally indexed to the reasoner, then simple reliance on the content cannot epistemically support one’s conclusion. The warrant would have to be re-acquired whenever use was made of a given step in the process of reasoning—making reasoning over time impossible.

It follows from these arguments that attempts to reduce personal identity to memory-involving stretches of consciousness cannot be successful. Locke is commonly read as attempting to carry-out such a reduction. Butler pointed out a definitional circularity—memory cannot be used in defining personal identity because genuine memories presuppose such identity. Philosophers such as Derek Parfit and Sydney Shoemaker utilized a notion of “quasi-memory”—a mental state just like memory but which does not presuppose personal identity—in an attempt to explain personal identity in more fundamental terms. Burge’s argumentation shows that this strategy involves an explanatory circularity. Only a creature with a representational mind could have quasi-memories. However, for reasons set out in the previous two paragraphs, having a representational mind requires de se representational elements that themselves presuppose personal identity over time. Hence, quasi-memory presupposes genuine memory, and cannot therefore be used to define or explain it (2003b, sections VI-XI).

As noted in the previous section, critical reasoning is meta-representational reasoning that characterizes propositional attitudes and reasons as such. One of Burge’s most important discussions of critical reasoning explains how fully understanding such reasoning requires use and understanding of the full, first-person singular concept “I” (1998).

Descartes famously inferred his existence from the fact that he was thinking. He believed that this reasoning was immune to serious skeptical challenges. Some philosophers, most notably Lichtenberg, questioned this. They reasoned that while it might be the case that one can know one is thinking, simply by reflecting on the matter, the ontological move from thinking to a thinker seems dubious at worst, and unsupported at best. Burge argues, using only premises that Lichtenberg was himself doubtless committed to—such as that it is a worthwhile philosophical project to understand reason and reasoning—that the first-person singular concept is not dispensable in the way that Lichtenberg and others have thought. Among other things, Burge’s argument provides a vindication of Descartes’s reasoning about the cogito. The argument shows that Descartes’s inference to his existence as a thinker from the cogito is not rationally unsupported, as Lichtenberg and others had suggested.

All reasons that thinkers have are, in Burge’s terminology, “reasons-to”. That is, they are not merely recognitions of (for example) logical entailments among propositions—they enjoin one to change or maintain one’s system of beliefs or actions. This requires not merely recognition of the relevance of a rational review, but also acting upon it. “In other words, fully understanding the concept of reason involves not merely mastering an evaluative system for appraising attitudes … [but also] mastering and conceptualizing the application of reasons in actual reasoning” (1998, 389). Furthermore, reasons must sometimes exert their force immediately. Their implementational relevance, that is to say, is sometimes not subject to further possible rational considerations. Instead, the reasons carry “a rationally immediate incumbency to shape [attitudes] in accordance with the evaluation” of which the reasons are part (1998, 396). Burge argues that full understanding of reasoning in general, and this rational immediacy in particular, requires understanding and employing the full “I”-concept. If correct, this refutes Lichtenberg’s contention that the “I”-concept is only practically necessary; and it supports Descartes’s view that understanding and thought alone are sufficient to establish one’s existence as a thinker. Only by adverting to the “I” concept can we fully explain the immediate rational relevance that reasons sometimes enjoy in a rational activity.

10. Reflection

Burge has also discussed the epistemology of intellection (that is, reason and understanding) and reflection. He argues that classical rationalists maintained three principles concerning reflection. One is that reflection in an individual is always, at least in principle, sufficient to bring to conscious articulation steps or conclusions of the reflection. Another is that reflection is capable of yielding a priori warranted belief and knowledge of objective subject matters. The final classical principle about reflection is that success in reflection requires skillful reasoning and is frequently difficult—it is not a matter simply of attaining immediate understanding or knowledge from a “flash” of insight (2013a, 535-537).

Burge accepts the second and third principles about reflection but rejects the first. He argues that anti-individualism together with advances in psychology show the first principle to be untenable. Anti-individualism shows that “the representational states one is in are less a matter of cognitive control and internal mastery, even ‘implicit’ cognitive control and mastery, than classical views assumed” (2013a, 538). Advances in psychology cast doubt on the first thesis primarily because it seems that many nonhuman animals, as well as human infants, think thoughts (and thus have concepts) despite lacking the ability to reflect on them; and because it has become increasingly clear that much cognition is modular and therefore inaccessible to conscious reflection, even in normal, mature human beings.

Burge has also carried out extensive work on how reflection can (and sometimes, unaided, cannot) “yield fuller understanding of our own concepts and conceptual abilities” (2007d, 165); on the emergence of logical truth and logical consequence as the key notions in understanding logic and deductive reasoning (which discussion includes an argument that fully understanding reasoning commits one ontologically to an infinite number of mathematical entities) (2003a); and on the nature and different forms of incomplete understanding (2012, section III). Finally, a substantial portion of Burge’s other work makes extensive use of a priori reflection—an excellent example being “Memory and Persons” (see section 9).

11. Perception

Burge’s writing on perception is voluminous in scope. Most historically important is Origins of Objectivity (2010). [This book is not most centrally about perception, as some commentators have suggested, but on what its title indicates: the conditions necessary and sufficient for objective psychological reference. A much more complete treatment of perception is to be found in the successor volume to OriginsPerception: First Form of Mind (2021)]. The first part of the present section deals with Burge’s work on the structure and content of perception. The second part briefly describes his 2020 article on perceptual warrant.

Origins is divided into three parts. Part I provides an introduction, a detailed discussion of terminology, and consideration of the bearing of anti-individualism on the rest of the volume’s contents. Part II is a wide-ranging discussion of conceptions of the resources necessary for empirical reference and representation, covering both the analytic and the continental traditions, and spanning the entire 20th century. Part III develops in some detail Burge’s conception of perceptual representation: including biological and methodological backgrounds; the nature of perception as constitutively associated with perceptual constancies; discussion of some of the most basic perceptual representational categories; and a few “glimpses forward”, one of which is mentioned below.

Part I characterizes a view that Burge calls “Compensatory Individual Representationalism” (CIR). With respect to perception, this is the view that the operation of the perceptual system, even when taken in tandem with ordinary relevant causal relations, is insufficient for objective reference to and representation of the empirical world. The individual perceiver must herself compensate for this insufficiency in some way if objective reference is to be possible. This view is then contrasted with Burge’s own view of the origins of objective reference and representation, which is partly grounded in anti-individualism as well as the sciences of perceptual psychology, developmental psychology, and ethology.

Part II of Origins critically discusses all the major versions of CIR. The discussion is comprehensive, including analyses of several highly influential 20th-century philosophers (and some prominent psychologists) who reflected upon the matter in print. There are two families of CIR. The first family holds that a more primitive level of representation is needed, underlying ordinary empirical representation, without which representation of prosaic entities in the environment is not possible. Bertrand Russell is an example of one who held a first-family version of CIR. Representation of the physical world, on his view, was parasitic upon being acquainted—representing—sense data (2010, 119). Second family forms of CIR did not require a more primitive level of representation. They did require, however, that certain advanced competencies be in place if objective reference and empirical representation are to be possible. Peter Strawson, for example, held that objective representation requires the use of a comprehensive spatial framework, as well as the use of one’s position in this represented allocentric space (2010, 160).

Both families of CIR share a negative and a positive claim. The negative claim is that the normal functioning of a perceptual system, together with regular causal relations, is insufficient for objective empirical representation. The positive claim is that such representation requires that an individual in some way herself represents necessary conditions upon objective representation. Burge argues that all versions of CIR are without serious argumentative or empirical support. This includes even versions of CIR that are compatible with anti-individualism. Burge extracted the detailed discussion of Quine’s version of the syndrome in an article (2009b).

The central chapter of Part III of Origins, chapter 9, discusses Burge’s conception of the nature of perceptual representation, including what distinguishes perception from other sensory systems. It argues that perception is paradigmatically attributable to individuals; sensory; representational; a form of objectification; and involves perceptual constancies. All perception must occur in the psychology of an individual with perceptual capacities, and in normal cases some individual perceptions must be attributable to the individual (as opposed to its subsystems). Perception is a special sort of sensory system—a system that functions to represent through the sort of objectification that perceptual constancies consist in. Perception is constitutively a representational competence, for Burge. Objectification involves, inter alia, marking an important divide between mere sensory responses, on one hand, and representational capacities that include such responses, but which cannot be explained solely in terms of them, on the other (2010, 396). Finally, perceptual constancies “are capacities to represent environmental attributes, or environmental particulars, as the same, despite radically different proximal stimulations” (2010, 114).

Burge argues that genuine objective perception begins, for human beings, nearly at birth, and is achieved in dozens or hundreds of other animal species, including some arthropods. The final chapter of the book includes “glimpses beyond”. It points, perhaps most importantly, toward Burge’s work—thus far unpublished—explaining the origins of propositional thought, including what constitutively distinguishes propositional representation from perceptual and other forms of representation. (Burge has published, in addition to the discussion in Origins of Objectivity, some preparatory work in this direction (2010a).)

The remainder of this section briefly discusses Burge’s 2020 work on perceptual warrant. This lengthy article is divided into five substantial sections. The first consists in a largely or wholly a priori discussion of the nature of epistemic warrant, including discussion of the distinction between justification and entitlement; and the nature of representational and epistemic functions and goods. Two of the most important theses defended in the first section are the following: (i) the thesis that, setting aside certain probabilistic cases and beliefs about the future, epistemic warrant certifies beliefs as knowledge—that is, if a perceptual belief (say) is warranted, true, and does not suffer from Gettier-like problems, then the belief counts as knowledge; and (ii) the thesis that epistemic warrant cannot “block” knowledge. That is to say, whatever epistemic warrant is, it cannot be such that it prevents a relevantly warranted belief from becoming knowledge. Burge uses these theses to argue for the inadequacy of various attempts at describing the nature of epistemic warrant.

The second section uses the a priori connections between warrant, knowledge, and reliability to argue against certain (internalist) conceptions of empirical warrant. The central move in the argument against epistemic internalism about empirical warrant is the thesis that warrant and knowledge require reliability in normal circumstances, but that nothing in perceptual states or beliefs taken in themselves ensures such reliability. Burge argues for the reliability requirement on epistemic warrant by an appeal to the “no-blockage” thesis—any unreliable way of forming beliefs would block those beliefs from counting as knowledge. So the argument against epistemic internalism has two central steps. First, the “no-blockage” thesis shows that reliability, at least in certain circumstances, is required for an epistemic warrant. And second, nothing that is purely “internal” to a perceiver ensures that her perceptual state-types are reliably veridical; or, therefore, that her perceptual belief-types are reliably true. Hence, internalism cannot be a correct conception of perceptual warrant.

The third section discusses differences between refuting skeptical theses, on one hand, and providing a non-question-begging response to a skeptical challenge, on the other. (In section VI of “Perceptual Entitlement” (2003c), for example, Burge explains perceptual warrant but does not purport to answer skepticism.) Burge argues that many epistemologists have conflated these two projects, with the result (inter alia) that the nature of epistemic warrant has been obscured. The fourth section argues that a common line of reasoning concerning “bootstrapping” is misconceived. Some have held that if, as on Burge’s view, empirical warrants do not require justifying reasons, then there is the unwelcome consequence that we can infer inductively from the most mundane pieces of empirical knowledge, or warranted empirical beliefs, that our perceptual belief-forming processes are reliable. Burge argues that it is not the nature of epistemic warrant that yields this unacceptable conclusion but instead a misunderstanding concerning the nature of adequate inductive inference. Finally, the fifth section argues at length against the view that conceptions of warrant like Burge’s imply unintuitive results in Bayesian confirmation theory (2020).

12. History of Philosophy

Finally, Burge has done sustained and systematic work on Frege. The work tends to be resolutely historical in focus. All but two of his articles on Frege are collected in Truth, Thought, Reason (2005). The others are Burge (2012) and (2013c). The latter article contains Burge’s fullest discussion of the relation between philosophy and history of philosophy.

The substantial introduction to Burge (2005) is by far the best overview of Burge’s work on Frege. The introduction contains not only a discussion of Frege’s views and how his collected essays relate to them, but also Burge’s most complete explanation of wherein his own views differ from Frege’s. The first essay provides a valuable, quite brief introduction to Frege and his work (2005a). The remaining essays are divided into three broad categories. The first discusses Frege’s views on truth, representational structure, and Frege’s philosophical methodology. The second category deals with Frege’s views on sense and cognitive value. Included in this category is the article that Burge believes is his philosophically most important article on Frege (1990). Finally, the third section of Burge’s collection of essays on Frege treats aspects of Frege’s rationalist epistemology. One of the articles on Frege that do not appear in Burge (2005) critically discusses an interpretation of Frege’s notion of sense advanced by Kripke; it also provides an extended discussion of the nature of incomplete understanding (2012). The other paper discusses respects in which Frege has influenced subsequent philosophers and philosophy (2013c).

Burge has also done historical work on Descartes, Leibniz, and Kant. Much of this work remains unpublished, save three articles. One traces the development and use of the notion of apriority through Leibniz, Kant, and Frege (2000). The other two discuss Descartes’s notion of mental representation, especially including evidence for and against the view that Descartes was an anti-individualist about representational states and events (2003d; 2007c).

13. Psychology

Much of Burge’s work on perception is also a contribution to the philosophy of psychology or even to the science of psychology itself (for example, 1991a; 2010; 2014a; 2014b). He was the first to introduce into philosophical discussion David Marr’s groundbreaking work on perception (Burge, 1986c). Burge himself has also published a couple of shorter pieces in psychology (2007g; 2011b).

In addition to this, Burge published a long article in Psychological Review (2018), that is not focused on perception. This article criticizes in detail the view, common among psychologists and some philosophers, that infants and nonhuman animals attribute mental states to others. The key to Burge’s argument is recognizing and developing a non-mentalistic and non-behavioristic explanatory scheme that centers on explaining action and action targets, but which does not commit itself to the view that relevant subjects represent psychological subject matters. The availability of this teleological, conative explanatory scheme shows that it does not follow, other things equal, from the fact that some infants and nonhuman animals represent actions and actors that they attribute mental states to these actors.

14. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature

i. Books

  • (2005). Truth, Thought, Reason: Essays on Gottlob Frege: Philosophical Essays, Volume 1 (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • (2007). Foundations of Mind: Philosophical Essays, Volume 2 (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • (2010). Origins of Objectivity (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • (2013). Cognition Through Understanding: Self-Knowledge, Interlocution, Reasoning, Reflection: Philosophical Essays, Volume 3 (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • (2021) Origins—Perception: First Form of Mind. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

ii. Articles

  • (1972). ‘Truth and Mass Terms’, The Journal of Philosophy 69, 263-282.
  • (1973). ‘Reference and Proper Names’, The Journal of Philosophy 70, 425-439.
  • (1974a). ‘Demonstrative Constructions, Reference, and Truth’, The Journal of Philosophy 71, 205-223.
  • (1974b). ‘Truth and Singular Terms’, Noûs 8, 309-325.
  • (1975). ‘On Knowledge and Convention’, The Philosophical Review 84, 249-255.
  • (1977). ‘Belief De Re’, The Journal of Philosophy 74, 338-362. Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1979a). ‘Individualism and the Mental’, Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4, 73-121. Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1979b). ‘Semantical Paradox’, The Journal of Philosophy 76, 169-198.
  • (1982). ‘Other Bodies’, in A. Woodfield (ed.) Thought and Object (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1982). Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1984). ‘Epistemic Paradox’, The Journal of Philosophy 81, 5-29.
  • (1986a). ‘Intellectual Norms and Foundations of Mind’, The Journal of Philosophy 83, 697-720. Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1986b). ‘Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception’, in P. Pettit and J. McDowell (eds.) Subject, Thought, and Context (Oxford: Oxford University Press). Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1986c). ‘Individualism and Psychology’, The Journal of Philosophy 95, 3-45. Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1986d). ‘Individualism and Self-Knowledge’, The Journal of Philosophy 85, 649-663. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (1990). ‘Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning’, in D. Bell and N. Cooper (eds.) The Analytic Tradition (Oxford: Blackwell). Reprinted in Truth, Thought, Reason.
  • (1991a). ‘Vision and Intentional Content’, in E. LePore and R. Van Gulick (eds.) John Searle and His Critics (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • (1991b). ‘Frege’, in H. Burkhardt and B. Smith (eds.) Handbook of Ontology and Metaphysics (Munich: Philosophia Verlag). Reprinted in Truth, Thought, Reason.
  • (1992). ‘Philosophy of Language and Mind: 1950-1990’, The Philosophical Review 101, 3-51. Expanded version of the portion on mind in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1993a). ‘Content Preservation’, The Philosophical Review 102, 457-488. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (1993b). ‘Mind-Body Causation and Explanatory Practice’, in J. Heil and A. Mele (eds.) Mental Causation (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993). Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1996). ‘Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 96, 91-116. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (1997a). ‘Interlocution, Perception, and Memory”. Philosophical Studies 86, 21-47. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (1997b). ‘Two Kinds of Consciousness’, in N. Block, O. Flanagan, and G. Güzeldere (eds.) The Nature of Consciousness (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press). Reprinted in Foundations of Mind.
  • (1998). ‘Reason and the First Person’, in C. Wright, B. Smith, and C. Macdonald (eds.) Knowing Our Own Minds (Oxford: Clarendon Press). Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (1999). ‘Comprehension and Interpretation’, in L. Hahn (ed.) The Philosophy of Donald Davidson (Chicago, IL: Open Court Press). Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2000). ‘Frege on Apriority’, in P. Boghossian and C. Peacocke (eds.) New Essays on the A Priori (Oxford: Oxford University Press). Reprinted in Truth, Thought, Reason.
  • (2003a) ‘Logic and Analyticity’, Grazer Philosophische Studien 66, 199-249.
  • (2003b) ‘Memory and Persons’, The Philosophical Review 112, 289-337. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2003c). ‘Perceptual Entitlement’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67, 503-548.
  • (2003d). ‘Descartes, Bare Concepts, and Anti-individualism’, in M. Hahn and B. Ramberg (eds.) Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).
  • (2003e). ‘Mental Agency in Authoritative Self-Knowledge’, M. Hahn and B. Ramberg (eds.) Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).
  • (2005a). ‘Frege’, in Truth, Thought, Reason.
  • (2007a). ‘Disjunctivism and Perceptual Psychology’, Philosophical Topics 33, 1-78.
  • (2007b). ‘Predication and Truth’, The Journal of Philosophy 104, 580-608.
  • (2007c). ‘Descartes on Anti-individualism’, in Foundations of Mind.
  • (2007d). ‘Postscript: “Individualism and the mental”’, in Foundations of Mind.
  • (2007e). ‘Reflections on Two Kinds of Consciousness’, in Foundations of Mind.
  • (2007f). ‘Postscript: “Belief De Re”’, in Foundations of Mind.
  • (2007g). ‘Psychology Supports Independence of Phenomenal Consciousness: Commentary on Ned Block’, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 30, 500-501.
  • (2009a). ‘Five Theses on De Re States and Attitudes’, in J. Almog and P. Leonardi (eds.) The Philosophy of David Kaplan (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • (2009b). ‘Perceptual Objectivity’, The Philosophical Review 118, 285-324.
  • (2010a). ‘Steps toward Origins of Propositional Thought’, Disputatio 4, 39-67.
  • (2010b). ‘Modest Dualism’, in R. Koons and G. Bealer (eds.) The Waning of Materialism (New York: Oxford University Press). Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2011a). ‘Self and Self-Understanding’: The Dewey Lectures. Presented in 2007. Published in The Journal of Philosophy 108, 287-383. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2011b). ‘Border-Crossings: Perceptual and Post-Perceptual Object Representation’, Behavioral and Brain Sciences 34, 125.
  • (2012). ‘Living Wages of Sinn’, The Journal of Philosophy 109, 40-84. Reprinted in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2013a). ‘Reflection’, in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2013b). ‘Postscript: Content Preservation’, in Cognition Through Understanding.
  • (2013c). ‘Frege: Some Forms of Influence’, in M. Beaney (ed.) The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • (2014a). ‘Adaptation and the Upper Border of Perception: Reply to Block’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 89, 573-583.
  • (2014b). ‘Perceptual Content in Light of Perceptual Consciousness and Biological Constraints: Reply to Rescorla and Peacocke’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 88, 485-501.
  • (2018). ‘Do Infants and Nonhuman Animals Attribute Mental States?’ Psychological Review 125, 409-434.
  • (2019). ‘Psychological Content and Ego-Centric Indexes’, in A. Pautz and D. Stoljar (eds.) A. Pautz, Blockheads! Essays on Ned Block’s Philosophy of Mind and Consciousness (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • (2020). ‘Entitlement: The Basis for Empirical Warrant’, in N. Pederson and P. Graham (eds.) New Essays on Entitlement (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

b. Secondary Literature

  • Two volumes of essays have been published on Burge’s work: M. Frápolli and E. Romero (eds.) Meaning, Basic Self-Knowledge, and Mind: Essays on Tyler Burge (Stanford, CA: CSLI Publications, 2003); and M. Hahn and B. Ramberg (eds.) Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 2003). The second volume is nearly unique, among Festschriften, in that Burge’s responses make up nearly half of the book’s 470 pages. Further pieces include the following:
  • An article on Burge in The Oxford Companion to Philosophy, Ted Honderich (ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • An article on Burge, in Danish Philosophical Encyclopedia. Politikens Forlag, 2010.
  • Interview with Burge. Conducted by James Garvey, The Philosophers’ Magazine, 2013—a relatively wide-ranging yet short discussion of Burge’s views.
  • Interview with Burge. Conducted by Carlos Muñoz-Suárez, Europe’s Journal of Psychology, 2014—a discussion focused on anti-individualism and perception.
  • Article on Burge, in the Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, Peter Graham, 2015.
  • Article on Burge, in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Mikkel Gerken and Katherine Dunlop, 2018—provides a quick overview of some of Burge’s philosophical contributions.
  • Article on Burge, in Oxford Bibliographies in Philosophy, Brad Majors, 2018—contains brief summaries of most of Burge’s work, together with descriptions of a small portion of the secondary literature.


Author Information

Brad Majors
Email: bradmajors9@gmail.com
Baker University
U. S. A.