Understanding in Epistemology

Epistemology is often defined as the theory of knowledge, and talk of propositional knowledge (that is, “S knows that p”) has dominated the bulk of modern literature in epistemology. However, epistemologists have recently started to turn more attention to the epistemic state or states of understanding, asking questions about its nature, relationship to knowledge, connection with explanation, and potential status as a special type of cognitive achievement. There is a common and plausible intuition that understanding might be at least as epistemically valuable as knowledge—if not more so—and relatedly that it demands more intellectual sophistication than other closely related epistemic states. For example, while it is easy to imagine a person who knows a lot yet seems to understand very little, think of the student who merely memorizes a stack of facts from a textbook; it is considerably harder to imagine someone who understands plenty yet knows hardly anything at all.

It is controversial just which epistemological issues concerning understanding should be central or primary—given that understanding is a relative newcomer in the mainstream epistemological literature. That said, this article nonetheless attempts to outline a selection of topics that have generated the most discussion and highlights what is at issue in each case and what some of the available positions are. To this end, the first section offers an overview of the different types of understanding discussed in the literature, though their features are gradually explored in more depth throughout later sections. Section 2 explores the connection between understanding and truth, with an eye to assessing in virtue of what understanding might be defended as ‘factive’. Section 3 examines the notion of ‘grasping’ which often appears in discussions of understanding in epistemology. Furthermore, Section 3 considers whether characterizations of understanding that focus on explanation provide a better alternative to views that capitalize on the idea of manipulating representations, also giving due consideration to views that appear to stand outside this divide. Section 4 examines the relationship between understanding and types of epistemic luck that are typically thought to undermine knowledge. Section 5 considers questions about what might explain the value of understanding; for example, various epistemologists have made suggestions focusing on transparency, distinctive types of achievement and curiosity, while others have challenged the assumption that understanding is of special value. Finally, Section 6 proposes various potential avenues for future research, with an eye towards anticipating how considerations relating to understanding might shed light on a range of live debates elsewhere in epistemology and in philosophy more generally.

Table of Contents

  1. Types of Understanding
  2. Is Understanding Factive?
    1. The Factivity of Understanding-Why
    2. A Weak Factivity Constraint on Objectual Understanding
    3. Moderate Views of Objectual Understanding’s Factivity
  3. Coherence and the Grasping Condition
    1. Understanding as Representation Manipulability
    2. Understanding and Knowledge of Causes
    3. Understanding, Abilities and Know-How
    4. Understanding as Explanation
    5. Understanding as Well-Connected Knowledge
  4. Understanding and Epistemic Luck
    1. Understanding as (Partially) Compatible with Epistemic Luck
    2. Newer Defenses of Understanding’s Compatibility with Epistemic Luck
  5. Understanding and Epistemic Value
    1. Transparency
    2. Cognitive Achievement
    3. Curiosity
  6. Future Research on Understanding
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Types of Understanding

We regularly claim that people can understand everything from theories to pieces of technology, accounts of historical events and the psychology of other individuals. Consequently, engaging with the project of clarifying and exploring the epistemic states or states attributed when we attribute understanding is a complex matter. As Zagzebski (2009: 141) remarks, different uses of understanding seem to mean so many different things that it is “hard to identify the state that has been ignored” (italics added). Zagzebski notes that this easily leads to a vicious circle because “neglect leads to fragmentation of meaning, which seems to justify further neglect and further fragmentation until eventually a concept can disappear entirely.”

It will accordingly be helpful to narrow our focus to the varieties of understanding that feature most prominently in the epistemological literature. For one thing, it is prudent to note up front that there are uses of ‘understanding’ that, while important more generally in philosophy, fall outside the purview of mainstream epistemology. Most notably here is what we can call linguistic understanding—namely, the kind of understanding that is of particular interest to philosophers of language in connection with our competence with words and their meanings (see, for example, Longworth 2008). In addition, it is important to make explicit differences in terminology that can sometimes confuse discussions of some types of understanding.

An influential discussion of understanding is Kvanvig’s (2003). Firstly, Kvanvig introduces propositional understanding as what is attributed in sentences that take the form “I understand that X” (for example, John understands that he needs to meet Harold at 2pm). Some (for example, Gordon 2012) suggest that attributions of propositional understanding typically involve attributes of propositional knowledge or a more comprehensive type of understanding—understanding-why, or objectual understanding (these types are examined more closely below).

A second variety of understanding that has generated interest amongst epistemologists is, understanding-why. This type of understanding is ascribed in sentences that take the form ‘I understand why X’ (for example, “I understand why the house burnt down”). Some of Pritchard’s (for example, 2009) earlier work on understanding uses the terminology ‘atomistic understanding’ as synonymous with ‘understanding-why’ and indeed his more recent work shifts to using the latter term. There is debate about both (i) whether understanding-why might fairly be called explanatory understanding and (ii) how understanding-why might differ from propositional knowledge.

Thirdly, and perhaps most interestingly, objectual understanding is attributed in sentences that take the form “I understand X” where X is or can be treated as a body of information or subject matter. For example, Kvanvig describes it as obtaining “when understanding grammatically is followed by an object/subject matter, as in understanding the presidency, or the president, or politics” (2003: 191). Objectual understanding is equivalent to what Pritchard has at some points termed ‘holistic understanding’ (2009: 12). Grimm (2011) suggests that what we should regard as being understood in cases of objectual understanding—namely, the ‘object’ of the objectual attitude relation—can be helpfully thought of as akin to a “system or structure [that has] parts or elements that depend upon one another in various ways.”

With these three types of understanding in mind—propositional understanding, understanding-why and objectual understanding—the next section considers some of the key questions that arise when one attempts to think about when, and under what conditions, understanding should be ascribed to epistemic agents.

2. Is Understanding Factive?

Knowledge is almost universally taken to be to be factive (compare, Hazlett 2010). In other words, S knows that p only if p is true. But is understanding factive? This is not so obvious, and at least, not as obvious as it is in the case of knowledge. This section considers the connection between understanding-why and truth, and then engages with the more complex issue of whether objectual understanding is factive.

a. The Factivity of Understanding-Why

There is little work focusing exclusively on the prospects of a non-factive construal of understanding-why; most authors, with a few exceptions, take it that understanding-why is obviously factive in a way that is broadly analogous to propositional knowledge. For example, Hills (2009: 4) says “you cannot understand why p if p is false” (compare: S knows that p only if p).  Pritchard (2008: 8) points out that—for example—if one believes that one’s house burned down because of the actions of an arsonist when it really burnt down because of faulty wiring, it just seems plain that one lacks understanding of why one’s house burned down.

However, Baker (2003) has offered an account on which at least some instances of understanding-why are non-factive. Her line is that understanding-why involves (i) knowing what something is, and (ii) making reasonable sense of it. If making reasonable sense merely requires that some event or experience make sense to the epistemic agent herself, Baker’s view appears open, as Grimm (2011) has suggested, to counterexamples according to which an agent knows that something happened and yet accounts for that occurrence by way of a poorly supported theory. For example, a self-proclaimed psychic might see someone trip and believe that he caused this person’s fall. Further, suppose that the self-proclaimed psychic even has reason to believe he is right to think he is psychic, as his friends and family deem that it is safer or kinder to buy into his delusions outwardly. A view on which the psychic’s epistemic position in this case qualifies as understanding-why would be unsatisfactorily inclusive. This is perhaps partially because there is a tendency to hold a person’s potential understanding to standards of objective appropriateness as well as subjective appropriateness.

A more charitable interpretation of Baker’s position would be to read “making reasonable sense” more strongly. For example, we might require that the agent make sense of X in a way that is reasonable—few would think that the psychic above is reasonable, though it is beyond the scope of the current discussion to stray into exploring accounts of reasonableness.

b. A Weak Factivity Constraint on Objectual Understanding

It is plausible that a factivity constraint would also be an important necessary condition on objectual understanding, but there is more nuanced debate about the precise sense in which this might be the case. A useful taxonomising question is the following: how strong a link does understanding demand between the beliefs we have about a given subject matter and the propositions that are true of that subject matter? One can split views on this question into roughly three positions that advocate varying strengths of a factivity constraint on objectual understanding.

On the weakest view, one can understand a subject matter even if none of one’s beliefs about that subject matter are true. Zagzebski (2001), whose view maintains that at least not all cases of understanding require true beliefs, gestures to something like this view. In addition, Zagzebski supports the provocative line that understanding can perhaps sometimes be more desirable when the epistemic agent does not have the relevant true beliefs. Her key thought here is that grasping the truth can actually impede the chances of one’s attaining understanding because such a grasp might come at too high a cognitive cost. Her main supporting example is of understanding the rate at which objects in a vacuum fall toward the earth (that is, 32 feet per second), a belief that ignores the gravitational attraction of everything except the earth and so is therefore not true. Nonetheless, Zagzebski thinks that believing this actually allows us more understanding for most purposes than the ‘vastly more complicated’ truth owing to our cognitive limitations.

Zagzebski’s weak approach to a factivity constraint aligns with her broadly internalist thinking about what understanding actually does involve—namely, on her view, internal consistency and what she calls ‘transparency.’ A theoretical advantage to a weak factivity constraint is that it neatly separates propositional knowledge and objectual understanding as interestingly different. Nevertheless, distinguishing between the two in this manner raises some problems for her view of objectual understanding, which should be unsurprising given the aforementioned counterexamples that can be constructed against a non-factive reading of Baker’s construal of understanding-why.

For example, and problematically for any account of objectual understanding that relaxes a factivity constraint, people frequently retract previous attributions of understanding. Consider a student saying, “I thought I understood this subject, but my recent grade suggests I don’t understand it after all”. These retractions do not t seem to make sense on the weak view. In addition, the weak view leaves it open that two agents might count as understanding some subject matter equally well in spite of the fact that for every relevant belief that one has, the other agent maintains its denial. In other words, each denies all of the other’s respective beliefs about the subject, and yet the weak view in principle permits that they might nonetheless understand the subject equally well. And furthermore, weakly factive accounts welcome the possibility that internally coherent delusions (for example, those that are drug-induced) that are cognitively disconnected from real events might nonetheless yield understanding of those events. Proponents of weak factivity must address both of these potentially problematic results.

There is arguably a further principled reason that an overly weak view of the factivity of understanding will not easily be squared with pretheoretical intuitions about understanding. Specifically, a very weak view of understanding’s factivity does not fit with the plausible and often expressed intuition that understanding is something especially epistemically valuable. For example, Kvanvig (2003: 206) observes that “we have an ordinary conception that understanding is a milestone to be achieved by long and sustained efforts at knowledge acquisition” and Whitcomb (2012: 8) reflects that “understanding is widely taken to be a “higher” epistemic good: a state that is like knowledge and true belief, but even better, epistemically speaking.” Yet, these observations do not fit with the weak view’s commitment to, for example, the claim that understanding is achievable in cases of delusional hallucinations that are disconnected from the facts about how the world is.

Elgin (2007), like Zagzebski, is sympathetic to a weak factivity constraint on objectual understanding, where the object of understanding is construed as “a fairly comprehensive, coherent body of information” (2007: 35). According to Elgin, a factive conception of understanding “neither reflects our practices in ascribing understanding nor does justice to contemporary science”.  Though her work on understanding is not limited to scientific understanding (for example, Elgin 2004), one notable argument she has made is framed to show that “a factive conception cannot do justice to the cognitive contributions of science and that a more flexible conception can” (2007: 32).

As Elgin (2007) notes, it is normal practice to attribute scientific understanding to individuals even when parts of the bodies of information that they endorse diverge somewhat from the truth. As will see, a good number of epistemologists would agree that false beliefs are compatible with understanding. However, Elgin takes this line further and insists that—with some qualifications—false central beliefs, and not merely false peripheral beliefs, are compatible with understanding a subject matter to some degree. Consider here two cases she offers to this effect:

EVOLUTION: A second grader’s understanding of human evolution might include as a central strand the proposition that human beings descended from apes. A more sophisticated understanding has it that human beings and the other great apes descended from a common hominid ancestor (who was not, strictly speaking, an ape). The child’s opinion displays some grasp of evolution. It is clearly cognitively better than the belief that humans did not evolve. But it is not strictly true. Since it is central to her take on human evolution, factivists like Kvanvig must conclude that her take on human evolution does not qualify as understanding. (2007: 37)

COPERNICUS: A central tenet of Copernicus’s theory is the contention that the Earth travels around the sun in a circular orbit. Kepler improved on Copernicus by contending that the Earth’s orbit is not circular, but elliptical. Having abandoned the commitment to absolute space, current astronomers can no longer say that the Earth travels around the sun simpliciter, but must talk about how the Earth and the sun move relative to each other. Despite the fact that Copernicus’s central claim was strictly false, the theory it belongs to constitutes a major advance in understanding over the Ptolemaic theory it replaced. Kepler’s theory is a further advance in understanding, and the current theory is yet a further advance. The advances are clearly cognitive advances. With each step in the sequence, we understand the motion of the planets better than we did before. But no one claims that science has as yet arrived at the truth about the motion of the planets. Should we say that the use of the term ‘understanding’ that applies to such cases should be of no interest to epistemology? (2007: 37-8)

How should an account of objectual understanding incorporate these types of observations—namely, where the falsity of a central belief or central beliefs appears compatible with the retention of some degree of understanding? Pritchard (2007) has put forward some ideas that may prevent the need to adopt a weak view of understanding’s factivity while nonetheless maintaining the key thrust of Elgin’s insight. In particular, as Pritchard suggests, we might want to consider that agents working with the ideal gas law or other idealizations do not necessarily have false beliefs as a result, even if the content of the proposition expressed by the law is not strictly true. This is a point Elgin is happy to grant. See Elgin (2004) for some further discussion of the role of acceptance and belief in her account.  In other words, even though there is no such gas as that referred to in the law, accepting the law need not involve believing the law to be true and thus believing there to be some gas with properties that it lacks.

The underlying idea in play here is that, in short, thinking about how things would be if it were true is an efficacious way to get to further truths; an insight has attracted endorsement in the philosophy of science (for example, Batterman 2009). Working hypotheses and idealizations need not, on this line, be viewed as representative of reality—idealizations can be taken as useful fictions, and working hypotheses are recognized as the most parsimonious theories on the table without thereby being dubbed as wholly accurate. Since, for instance, the ideal gas law (for example, Elgin 2007) is recognized as a helpful fiction and is named and taught as such, as is, naïve Copernicanism or the simple view that humans evolved from apes. It is not only unnecessary, but moreover, contentious, that a credible scientist would consider the ideal gas law true. It seems as though understanding would possibly be undermined in a case where someone relying on the ideal gas law failed to appreciate it as an idealization. That is, there is something defective about a scientist’s would-be understanding of gas behavior were that scientist, unlike all other competent scientists, to reject that the ideal gas law is an idealization and instead embraced it as a fact. Putting this all together, a scientist who embraces the ideal gas law, as an idealization, would not necessarily have any relevant false beliefs. Therefore, the need to adopt a weak factivity constraint on objectual understanding—at least on the basis of cases that feature idealizations—looks at least initially to be unmotivated in the absence of a more sophisticated view about the relationship between factivity, belief and acceptance (however, see Elgin 2004).

Nevertheless, considering weakly factive construals of objective understanding draws attention to an important point—that there are also interesting epistemic states in the neighborhood of understanding. These similar states share some of the features we typically think understanding requires, but which are not bona fide understanding specifically because a plausible factivity condition is not satisfied. A good example here is what Riggs (2003) calls intelligibility, a close cousin of understanding that also implies a grasp of order, pattern and connection, but does not seem to require a substantial connection to truth. Grimm (2011) calls this ‘subjective understanding.’ He describes subjective understanding as being merely a grasp of how specific propositions interlink—one that does not depend on their truth but rather on their forming a coherent picture. Since what Grimm is calling subjective understanding (that is, Riggs’s intelligibility) is by stipulation essentially not factive, the question of the factivity of subjective understanding simply does not arise. Though in light of this fact, it is not obvious that ‘understanding’ is the appropriate term for this state. Consider here an analogy: a false belief can be subjectively indistinguishable from knowledge. We could, for convenience, use the honorific term ‘subjective knowledge’ for false belief, though in doing so, we are no longer talking about knowledge in the sense that epistemologists are interested in, any more than we are when, as Allan Hazlett (2010) has drawn attention to, we say things like “Trapped in the forest, I knew I was going to die; I’m so lucky I was saved.” Perhaps the same should be said about alleged subjective understanding: to the extent that it is convenient to refer to non-factive states of intelligibility as states of ‘understanding’, we are no longer talking about the kind of valuable cognitive achievement of interest to epistemologists.

c. Moderate Views of Objectual Understanding’s Factivity

At the other end of the spectrum, we might consider an extremely strong view of understanding’s factivity, according to which understanding a subject matter requires that all of one’s beliefs about the subject matter in question are true. Such a constraint would preserve the intuition that understanding is a particularly desirable epistemic good and would accordingly be untroubled by the issues highlighted for the weakest view outlined at the start of the section. However, such a strong view would also make understanding nearly unobtainable and surely very rare—for example, on the extremely strong proposal under consideration, recognized experts in a field would be denied understanding if they had a single false belief about some very minor aspect of the subject matter. This is of course an unpalatable result, as we regularly attribute understanding in the presence of not just one, but often many, false beliefs. This point aligns with the datum that we often attribute understanding by degrees. That is, we often describe an individual as having a better understanding of a subject matter than some other person, perhaps when choosing whom to approach for advice or when looking for someone to teach us about a subject. While we would apply a description of ‘better understanding’ to agent A even if the major difference between her and agent B was that A had additional true beliefs, we would also describe A as having ‘better understanding’ than B if the key difference was that A had fewer false beliefs. If we sometimes attribute understanding to two people even when they differ only in terms of who has more false beliefs about a subject, this difference in degrees indicates that one can have understanding that includes some false beliefs. We can acknowledge this simply by regarding B’s understanding as, even if only marginally, relatively impoverished, rather than by claiming, implausibly, that no understanding persists in such cases. This leaves us, however, with an interesting question about the point at which there is no understanding at all, rather than merely weaker or poorer understanding.

Regarding factivity, then, it seems there is room for a view that occupies the middle ground here. We can accommodate the thought that not all beliefs relevant to an agent’s understanding must be true while nonetheless insisting that cases in which false beliefs run rampant will not count as understanding. Kvanvig (2003; 2009) offers such a view, according to which understanding of some subject matter is incompatible with false central beliefs about the subject matter. This view, while insisting that central beliefs must all be true, is flexible enough to accommodate that there are degrees of understanding—that is, that understanding varies not just according to numbers of true beliefs but also numbers of false, peripheral beliefs. It also allows attributions of understanding in the presence of peripheral false beliefs, without going so far as to grant that understanding is present in cases of internally consistent delusions—as such delusions will feature at least some false central beliefs. In this respect, then, Kvanvig’s view achieves the result of a middle ground.

However, advocates of moderate approaches to the factivity of understanding are left with some difficult questions to answer. Many of these questions have gone largely unexplored in the literature. For example:

  • In virtue of what does a belief count as ‘central’ in the relevant sense?
  • Moderate factivity implies that we should withhold attributions of understanding when an agent has a single false central belief, even in cases where the would-be understanding is of a large subject matter where all peripheral beliefs in this large subject matter are true. This consequence does not intuitively align with our practices of attributing understanding. The proponent of moderate factivity owes an explanation.
  • How should we distinguish between peripheral beliefs about a subject matter and beliefs that are not properly about the subject matter in question, while retaining a meaningful distinction between peripheral and central beliefs?

Although a moderate view of understanding’s factivity may look promising in comparison with competitor accounts, many important details remain left to be spelled out.

3. Coherence and the Grasping Condition

When considering interesting features that might set understanding apart from propositional knowledge, the idea of grasping something is often mentioned. For example, Kvanvig (2003) holds that understanding is particularly valuable in part because it requires a special “grasp of “explanatory and other coherence-making relationships.” Riggs (2003: 20) agrees, stating that understanding of a subject matter “requires a deep appreciation, grasp or awareness of how its parts fit together, what role each one plays in the context of the whole, and of the role it plays in the larger scheme of things” (italics added). Relatedly, Van Camp (2014) calls understanding a “higher level cognition” that involves recognizing connections between different pieces of knowledge, and Kosso (2007: 1) submits that inter-theoretic coherence is the hallmark of understanding, stating “knowledge of many facts does not amount to understanding unless one also has a sense of how the facts fit together.” While such remarks are made with objectual understanding (that is, understanding of a subject matter) in mind, there are similar comments about understanding-why (for example, Hills 2009) that suggest an overlapping need to consider connections between items of information, albeit on a smaller scale.

Such discussions, though they can be initially helpful, raise a nest of further questions. This in part for three principal reasons. Firstly, ‘grasping’ is often used in such a way such that it is not clear whether it should be understood metaphorically or literally. If the former, then this is unfortunate given the theoretical work the term is supposed to be doing in characterizing understanding. If the latter—that is, if we are to understand ‘grasping’ literally, then, also unfortunately, we are rarely given concrete details of its nature. A second reason that adverting to grasping-talk in the service of characterizing understanding raises further question is that it is often not clarified just what relationships or connections are being grasped, when they are grasped in a way that is distinctive of understanding. And, thirdly, two questions about what is involved in grasping can easily be run together, but should be kept separate. Call these, for short, the ‘relation question’ and the ‘object question’.

Relation question: What is the grasping relationship? (For example, is it a kind of knowledge, another kind of propositional attitude, an ability, and so on?)

Object question: What kinds of things are grasped? (For example, propositions, systems, bodies of information, the relationships thereof, and so on?)

Take first the object question. Since Kvanvig claims that the coherence-making relationships that are traditionally construed as necessary for justification on a coherentist picture are the very relations that one grasps (for example, the objects of grasping) when one understands, the justification literature may be a promising place to begin. Put generally, according to the coherentist family of proposals of the structure of justified belief, “a belief or set of beliefs is justified, or justifiably held, just in case the belief coheres with a set of beliefs, the set forms a coherent system, or some variation on these themes” (Olsson 2012: 1). Of course, many interrelated questions then emerge regarding coherence. For the purposes of thinking about understanding, some of the most important will include: (i) what makes a system of beliefs coherent? and (ii) what qualifies a group of beliefs as a system in the sense that is at issue when it is claimed that understanding involves grasping relationships or connections within a system of beliefs? For example, we might suppose that a system of beliefs contains only beliefs about a particular subject matter, and that these beliefs will ordinarily be sufficient for a rational believer who possesses them to answer questions about that subject matter reliably. Such a theory raises questions of its own, such as precisely what answering reliably, in the relevant sense, demands.

What is the grasping relation? Is it a kind of knowledge, another kind of propositional attitude, an ability, and so forth? Kvanvig does not spell out what grasping might involve, in the sense now under consideration, in his discussion of coherence, and the other remarks we considered above. He leaves grasping at the level of metaphor or uses it them literally but never develops it. Given the extent to which grasping is highly associated with understanding and left substantively unspecified, it is perhaps unsurprising that the matter of how to articulate grasping-related conditions on understanding has proven to be rather divisive. Kelp (2015) makes a helpful distinction between two broad camps here. On the one hand, we have manipulationists, who think understanding involves an ability (or abilities) to manipulate certain representations or concepts. On the other hand, there are explanationists, who argue that it is knowledge or evaluation of explanations that is doing the relevant work. However, it is not entirely clear that extant views on understanding fall so squarely into these two camps. Many seem to blend manipulationism with explanations, suggesting for example that what is required for understanding is an ability associated with mentally manipulating explanations. To complicate matters further, some of the philosophers who appear to endorse one approach over the other can elsewhere be seen considering a more mixed view (for example, Khalifa 2013b).

The next section considers some of the most prominent examples of attempts to expand on or replace a grasping condition on understanding. Some focus on understanding-why while others focus on objectual understanding.

a. Understanding as Representation Manipulability

Wilkenfeld (2013) offers the account that most clearly falls under Kelp’s characterization of manipulationist approaches to understanding. As Wilkenfeld sees it, understanding should be construed as “representational manipulability,” which is to say that understanding is, essentially, the possessing of some representation that can be manipulated in useful ways. Unlike de Regt and Dieks (2005), Wilkenfeld aims to propose an inclusive manipulation-based view that allows agents to have objectual understanding even if they do not have a theory of the phenomenon in question. His conception of mental representations defines these representations as “computational structures with content that are susceptible to mental transformations.” Wilkenfeld constructs a necessary condition on objectual understanding around this definition. His view is that understanding requires the agent to, in counterfactual situations salient to the context, be able to modify their mental representation of the subject matter. This allows the agent to produce a slightly different mental representation of the subject matter that “enables efficacious inferences” pertaining to (or manipulations of) the subject matter.

What is it to have this ability to modify some mental representation? Wilkenfeld suggests that this ability consists at least partly in being able to correct minor mistakes in one’s mental representation and use it to make assessments in similar cases. Though the demandingness of this ability need not be held fixed across practical circumstances. The context-sensitive element of Wilkenfeld’s account of understanding allows him to attribute adequate understanding to, for example, a student in an introductory history class and yet deny understanding to that student when the context shifts to place him in a room with a panel of experts.

There are three potential worries with this general style of approach. Firstly, Wilkenfeld’s context-sensitive approach is in tension with a more plausible diagnosis of the example just considered: rather than to withhold attributing understanding in the case where the student is surrounded by experts, why not—instead—and in a way that is congruous with the earlier observation that understanding comes in degrees—attribute understanding to the student surrounded by experts, but to a lesser degree (for example,  Tim has some understanding of physics, while the professor has a much more complete understanding). Carter (2014) argues that shifting to more demanding practical environments motivates attributing lower degrees of understanding rather than (as Wilkenfeld is suggests) withholding understanding.

Secondly, one might wonder if Wilkenfeld’s account of understanding as representation manipulation is too inclusive—that it rules in, as cases of bona fide understanding, representations that are based on inaccurate but internally consistent beliefs. If so, then the internally consistent delusion objection typically leveled against weakly nonfactive views raises its head. However, this concern might be abated with the addition of a moderate factivity constraint (for example, the constraint discussed in section two above) that rules out cases of mere intelligibility or subjective understanding).

Thirdly, Kelp (2015) has an objection that he thinks all who favor a manipulationist line should find worrying. Specifically, he points out that an omniscient agent who knows everything and intuitively therefore understands every phenomenon might do so while being entirely passive—not drawing interferences, making predictions or manipulating representations (in spite of knowing, for example, which propositions can be inferred from others). If Kelp’s thought experiment works, manipulation of representations cannot be a necessary condition of understanding after all. This objection is worth holding in mind when considering any further positions that incorporate representation manipulability as necessary. That said, for manipulationists who are not already inclined to accept the entailment from all-knowing to omni-understanding, the efficacy against the manipulationist is diffused as the example does not get off the ground. One reason a manipulationist will be inclined to escape the result in this fashion (by denying that all-knowing entails all-understanding) is precisely because one already (qua manipulationist) is not convinced that understanding can be attained simply through knowledge of propositions. In this respect, it seems Kelp’s move against the manipulationist might get off the ground only if certain premises are in play which manipulationists as such would themselves be inclined to resist.

b. Understanding and Knowledge of Causes

Grimm (2011) also advocates for a fairly straightforward manipulationist approach in earlier work. He suggests that manipulating the “system” allows the understander to “see” the way in which “the manipulation influences (or fails to influence) other parts of the system” (2011: 11). He argues that we can gain some traction on the nature of grasping significant to understanding if we view it along such manipulationist lines. So, on Grimm’s (2011) view, grasping the relationships between the relevant parts of the subject matter amounts to possessing the ability to work out how changing parts of that system would or would not impact on the overall system. He considers that grasping might be a “modal sense or ability” that allows the understander to, over and above registering how things are. Grasping also allows the understander to anticipate what would happen if things were relevantly different—namely, to make correct inferences about the ways in which relevant differences to the truth-values of the involved propositions would influence the inferences that obtain in the actual world. That said, Grimm’s more recent work (2014) expands on these earlier observations to form the basis of a view that spells out grasping in terms of a modal relationship between properties, objects or entities—a theory on which what is grasped when one has understanding-why will be how changes in one would lead (or fail to lead) to changes in the other. His central claim in his recent work is that understanding can be viewed as knowledge of causes, though appreciating how he is thinking of this takes some situating, given that the knowledge central to understanding is non-propositional.

Although a large number of epistemologists hold that understanding is not a species of knowledge (e.g. Kvanvig 2003; Zagzebski 2001; Riggs 2003; Pritchard 2010), Grimm’s view is rooted in a view that comes from the philosophy of science and traces originally to Aristotle. Essentially, this view traditionally holds that understanding why X is the case is equivalent to knowing why X is the case (which is in turn supposed to be equivalent to knowing that X is the case because of Y). In short: understanding is causal propositional knowledge. Sliwa 2015, however, defends a stronger view, according to which propositional knowledge is necessary and sufficient for understanding. Although, many commentators suggest that understanding requires something further, that is something in additional to merely knowing a proposition or propositions, Grimm thinks we can update the “knowledge of causes” view so that this intuition is accommodated and explained. In particular, he wants to propose a non-propositional view that has at its heart “seeing or grasping, of the terms of the casual relata, their modal relatedness”, which he suggests amounts to seeing or grasping “how things might have been if certain conditions had been different.” To be clear, the nuanced view Grimm suggests is that while understanding is a kind of knowledge of causes, it is not propositional knowledge of causes but rather non-propositional knowledge of causes, where the non-propositional knowledge is itself unpacked as a kind of ability or know-how.

Grimm develops this original position via parity of reasoning, taking as a starting point that the debate about a priori knowledge, for example, knowledge of necessary truths, makes use of metaphors of “grasping” and “seeing” that are akin to the ones in the understanding debate. An important observation Grimm makes is that merely assenting to necessary truths is insufficient for knowing necessary truths a priori—one must also grasp orsee the necessity of the necessary truth. Grimm thinks the metaphor involves something like apprehending how things stand in modal space (that is, that there are no possible worlds in which the necessary truth is false). He argues that what is grasped or seen when one attains a priori knowledge is not a proposition but a certain modal relationship between properties, objects or identities. He suggests that the primary object of a priori knowledge is the modal reality itself that is grasped by the mind and that on this basis we go on to assent to the proposition that describes these relationships. Hence, he argues that any propositional knowledge is derivative.

In terms of parallels with the understanding debate, it is important to note that the knowledge of causes formula is not limited to the traditional propositional reading. The ambiguity between assenting to a necessary proposition and the grasping or seeing of certain properties and their necessary relatedness mirrors the ambiguity between assenting to a casual proposition and grasping or seeing of the terms of the causal relata: their modal relatedness. However, Grimm is quick to point out that defending one of these two similar views does not depend on the correctness of the other. His modal model of understanding fits with the intuition that we understand not propositions but “relations between parts to wholes” or “systems of various thoughts.”

Grimm has put his finger on an important commonality at issue in his argument from parity. However, Pritchard (2014) responds to Grimm’s latest proposal with a number of criticisms. Perhaps the strongest of these is his suggestion that while the faculty of rational insight is indispensable to the grasping account of a priori, it is actually essential to knowledge of causes that it not be grasped through rational insight. This is because we don’t learn about causes a priori. On this basis Pritchard insists that Grimm’s analogy breaks down.

This aside, can we consider extending Grimm’s conception of understanding as non-propositional knowledge of causes to the domain of objectual understanding? While his view fits well with understanding-why, it is less obvious that objectual understanding involves grasping how things came to be. For one thing, abstract objects, such as mathematical truths and other atemporal phenomena, can plausibly be understood even though our understanding of them does not seem to require an appreciation of their coming to existence. For example, I can understand the quadratic formula without knowing, or caring, about who introduced it. But more deeply, atemporal phenomena such as mathematical truths have, in one clear sense, never come to be at all, but have always been, to the extent that they are the case at all. This holds regardless of whether we are Platonists or nominalists about such entities.

Secondly, even subject matters that traffic in empirical rather than abstract atemporal phenomena (for example, pure mathematics), are not clearly such that understanding them should involve any appreciation for their coming to be, or their being caused to exist. Here is one potential example to illustrate this point: consider that it is not clear that people who desire to understand chemistry generally care about “the cause of chemistry”. A potential worry then is that the achievement one attains when one understands chemistry need not involve the subject working the subject matter—in this case, chemistry’s—cause.

Grimm anticipates this point and expresses a willingness to embrace a looser conception of dependence than causal dependence, one that includes (following Kim 1994) species of dependence such as mereological dependences (that is, dependence of a whole on its parts), evaluative dependences (that is, dependence of evaluative on non-evaluative), and so on. A restatement of Grimm’s view might accordingly be: understanding is knowledge of dependence relations. This broader interpretation seems well positioned to handle abstract object cases, for example, mathematical understanding, when the kind of understanding at issue is understanding-why. For, even if understanding why 2×2=4 does not require a grasp of any causal relation, it might nonetheless involve a grasp of some kind of more general dependence, for instance the kind of dependence picked out by the metaphysical grounding relation. However, it is less clear at least initially that retreating from causal dependence to more general dependence will be of use in the kinds of objectual understanding cases noted above. For example, when the issue is understanding mathematics, as opposed to understanding why 2×2=4, it is perhaps less obvious that dependence has a central role to play.

c. Understanding, Abilities and Know-How

Another seemingly promising line—one that engages with the relation question discussed above—views grasping as intimately connected with a certain set of abilities. Hills (2009) is an advocate of such a view of understanding-why in particular. Specifically, Hills outlines six different abilities that she takes to be involved in grasping the reasons why p—abilities which effectively constitute, on her view, six necessary conditions for understanding why p. These six abilities allow one to “be able to treat q as the reason why p, not merely believe or know that q is the reason why p.” They are as follows:

(i) an ability to follow another person’s explanation of why p,

(ii) an ability to explain p in one’s own words,

(iii) an ability to draw from the information that q the conclusion that p (or that probably p),

(iv) an ability to draw from the information q’ the conclusion that p’ (or probably p’),

(v) an ability to give q (the right explanation) when given the information that p, and

(vi) an ability to give q’ (the right explanation) when given the information p’.

On the most straightforward characterization of her proposal, one fails to possess understanding why, with respect to p, if one lacks any of the abilities outlined in (i-vi), with respect to p. Note that this is compatible with one failing to possess understanding why even if one possesses knowledge that involves, as virtue epistemologists will insist, some kinds of abilities or virtues. That said, Hills adds some qualifications. For one thing, she admits that these abilities can be possessed by degrees. Secondly, she concedes that it is possible that in some cases additional abilities must be added before the set of abilities will be jointly sufficient.

Hills thinks that mere propositional knowledge does not essentially involve any of these abilities even if (as per the point above) propositional knowledge requires other kinds of abilities. To defend the claim that possessing the kinds of abilities Hills draws attention to is not a matter of simply having extra items of knowledge—she notes that one could have the extra items of knowledge and still lack the ‘good judgment’ that allows you to form new, related true beliefs. The possession of such judgment plausibly lines up more closely with ability possession (that is, (i)-(vi)) than with propositional attitude possession.

If Hills is right about this connection between grasping and possessing abilities, it might seem as though understanding-why is, at the end of the day, very similar to knowing-how (see, however, Sullivan 2017 for resistance to this suggestion).. This is a view to which Grimm (2010) is also sympathetic, remarking that the object of objectual understanding “can be profitably viewed along the lines of the object of know-how,” where Grimm has in mind here an anti-intellectualist interpretation of know-how according to which knowing how to do something is a matter of possessing abilities rather than knowing facts (compare, Stanley & Williamson 2001; Stanley 2011). Grimm (2014) also notes that his modal view of understanding fits well with the idea that understanding involves a kind of ability or know-how, as one who sees or grasps how certain propositions are modally related has the ability to answer a wide variety of questions about how things could have been different. Grimm does not make the further claim that understanding is a kind of know-how—he merely says that there is similarity regarding the object, which does not guarantee that the “activity” of understanding and know-how are so closely related.

However, if understanding-why actually is a type of knowing how then this means that intellectualist arguments to the effect that knowing how is a kind of propositional knowledge might apply, mutatis mutandis, to understanding-why as well (see Carter and Pritchard 2013). Hills herself does not believe that understanding-why is some kind of propositional knowledge, but she points out that even if it is there is nonetheless good cause to think that understanding-why is very unlike ordinary propositional knowledge. Drawing from Stanley and Williamson, she makes the distinction between knowing a proposition “under a practical mode of presentation” and knowing it “under a theoretical mode of presentation.” Stanley and Williamson admit that the former is especially tough to spell out (see Glick 2014 for a recent discussion), but it must surely involve having complex dispositions, and so it is perhaps possible to know some proposition under only one of these modes of presentation (that is, by lacking the relevant dispositions, or something else). Hills thinks that moral understanding, if it were any kind of propositional knowledge at all, would be knowing a proposition under a practical mode and “not necessarily under a theoretical mode.”

d. Understanding as Explanation

The group designated “explanationists” by Kelp (2015) share a general commitment to the idea that knowledge of explanations should play a key role in a theory of understanding (for example, Hempel 1965; Salmon 1989; Khalifa 2012; 2013). For those who wonder about whether the often-discussed “grasping” associated with understanding might just amount to the possession of further beliefs (rather than, say, the possession of manipulative abilities), this type of view may seem particularly attractive (and comparatively less mysterious). On such a view, grasping talk could simply be jettisoned altogether. However, the core explanationist insight also offers the resources to supplement a grasping account.  On such an interpretation, explanationism can be construed as offering a simple answer to the object question discussed above: the object of understanding-relevant grasping would, on this view, be explanations. As it turns out, not all philosophers who give explanation a central role in an account of understanding want to dispense with talk of grasping altogether, and this is especially so in the case of objectual understanding.

Khalifa’s (2013) view of understanding is a form of explanatory idealism. While Khalifa favors earlier accounts of scientific understanding to the more recent views that have been submitted by epistemologists, he is aware that some criticisms (for example, Lipton (2009) and Pritchard (2010)) to the effect that requiring knowledge of an explanation is too strong a necessary condition on understanding-why. His alternative suggestion is to propose explanation as the ideal of understanding, a suggestion that has as a consequence that one should measure degrees of understanding according to how well one “approximate[s] the benefits provided by knowing a good and correct explanation.” Khalifa submits that this line is supported by the existence of a correct and reasonably good explanation in the background of all cases of understanding-why that does not involve knowledge of an explanation—a background explanation that would, if known, provide a greater degree of understanding-why.

This line merits discussion not least because the idea that understanding-why comes by degrees is often ignored in favor of discussing the more obvious point that understanding a subject matter clearly comes by degrees. One issue worth bringing into sharper focus is whether knowing a good and correct explanation is really the ideal form of understanding-why. In particular, one might be tempted to suggest that some of the objections raised to Grimm’s non-propositional knowledge-of-causes model could be recast as objections to Khalifa’s own explanation-based view. For example, we might suppose an agent has a maximally complete explanation of how Michelangelo’s David came into existence between 1501 and 1504, what methods were used to craft it, what Michelangelo’s motivating reasons were at the time, how much clay was used, and so on. But when the object of understanding why   is essentially evaluative—for example, understanding why the statue is beautiful—it seems that the quality of one’s understanding could vary dramatically even when we hold fixed that one possesses a correct and complete explanation of how the statue came to be (that is, both a physical and social description of these causes). To the extent that this is correct, there is some cause for reservation about measuring degrees of understanding according to how well they “approximate the benefits provided by knowing a good and correct explanation.” A proponent of Khalifa’s position might, however, view the preceding response as question-begging. For if the view is correct, then an explanation for why one’s understanding why the painting is beautiful is richer, when it is, will simply be in terms of one’s possession of a correct answer to the question of why it is beautiful.

It is moreover of interest to note that Khalifa (2013b) also sees a potential place for the notion of ‘grasping’ in an account of understanding, though in a qualified sense. On the view he recommends, the ability to grasp explanatory or evidential connections is an ability that is central to understanding only if the relevant grasping ability is understood as involving reliable explanatory evaluation. Khalifa’s indispensability argument—which he calls the ‘Grasping Argument’ runs as follows:

  1. Understanding entails true beliefs of the form q explains p.
  2. Understanding entails that such beliefs must be the result of exercising reliable cognitive abilities.
  3. If understanding entails true beliefs of the form q explains p, and also entails that such beliefs must be the result of exercising reliable cognitive abilities, then these abilities involve evaluating (or discriminating between) explanations.
  4. So understanding entails that beliefs of the form q explains p are the result of exercising a reliable cognitive ability to evaluate explanations. (Khalifa 2013b: 5)

Khalifa is, in this argument stipulating that (1) is a “ground rule for discussion” (2013b: 5). One point that could potentially invite criticism is the move from (1) and (2) to (3). A worry about this move can be put abstractly: consider that if understanding entails true beliefs of form <q explains>, and that beliefs of form <q explains p> must themselves be the result of exercising reliable cognitive abilities, it might still be that one’s reliable <q explains p>-generating abilities are exercised in a bad environment. For example, an environment where one’s abilities so easily could generate false beliefs of form <q explains p> despite issuing (luckily) true beliefs of the form <q explains p> on this occasion. Contrary to premise (3), such abilities (of the sort referenced by Khalifa in premise 2 and 3) arguably need not involve discriminating between explanations, so long as one supposes that discriminating between explanations is something one has the reliable ability to do only if one could not very easily form a belief of the form <q explains p> when this is false.

More generally, though, it is important to note that Khalifa, via his grasping argument, is defending reliable explanatory evaluation as merely a necessary—though not sufficient—component of grasping. In so doing, he notes that the reader may be inclined to add further internalist requirements to his reliability requirement, of the sort put forward by Kvanvig (2003). As such, Khalifa is not attempting to provide an analysis of grasping.

It is worth considering how and in what way a plausible grasping condition on understanding should be held to something like a factivity or accuracy constraint. If a grasping condition is necessary for understanding, does one satisfy this condition only when one exercises a grasping ability to reflect how things are in the world? Or, should we adopt a more relaxed view of what would be required to satisfy this condition—namely, a view that focuses on the way the agent connects information.

Strevens (2013) focuses on scientific understanding in his discussion of grasping. He also suggests, like Khalifa, that grasping be linked with correct explanations. As such, his commentary here is particularly relevant to the question of whether gasping is factive. Riggs (2003: 21-22) asks whether an explanation has to be true to provide understanding, and Strevens thinks that it is implied that grasping is factive.

However, Strevens nonetheless offers a rough outline of a parallel, non-factive account of grasping, what he calls ‘grasping*’. He wants us to suppose that grasping has two components—one that is a purely psychological (that is, narrow) component and one that is the actual obtaining of the state of affairs that is grasped. He gives the name ‘grasping*’ to the purely psychological component that would continue to be satisfied even if, say, an evil demon made it the case at the moment of your grasping that there was only an appearance of the thing that appears to you to be the case. This would be the non-factive parallel to the standard view of grasping. Strevens, however, holds that than an explanation is only correct if its constitutive propositions are true, and therefore the reformulation of grasping that he provides is not intended by Strevens to be used in an actual account of understanding. The idea of grasping* is useful insofar as it makes clearer the cognitive feat involved in intelligibility, which is similar to understanding in the sense that it “implies a grasping of order, pattern and connection” between propositions (Riggs, 2004), but it does not require those propositions to be true. Just as we draw a distinction between this epistemic state (that is, intelligibility, or what Grimm calls ‘subjective understanding’) and understanding (which has a much stricter factivity requirement), it makes sense to draw a line between grasping* and grasping where one is factive and the other is not.

Likewise, just as all understanding will presumably involve achieving intelligibility even though intelligibility does not entail understanding, so too will all grasping involve grasping* even though grasping* does not entail grasping. Consider, on this point, that a conspiracy theorist might very well grasp* the connection between (false) propositions so as to achieve a coherent, intelligible, though wildly off-base, picture. The conspiracy theorist possesses something which one who grasps (rather than grasps*) a correct theory also possesses, and yet one who fails to grasp* even the conspiracy theory (for example, a would-be conspiracy theorist who has yet to form a coherent picture of how the false propositions fit together) lacks.

e. Understanding as Well-Connected Knowledge

Assuming that we need an account of degrees of understanding if we are going to give an account of outright understanding (as opposed to working the other way around, as he thinks many others are inclined to do), Kelp (2015) suggests we adopt a knowledge based account of objectual understanding according to which “maximal understanding of a given phenomenon” is to be cashed out in terms of fully comprehensive and maximally well-connected knowledge of that phenomenon. Kelp’s account, then, explains our attributions of degrees of understanding in terms of approximations to such well-connected knowledge. He says that knowledge about a phenomenon (P) is maximally well-connected when “the basing relations that obtain between the agent’s beliefs about P reflect the agent’s knowledge about the explanatory and support relations that obtain between the members of the full account of P” (2015: 12).

This view, he notes, can make sense of the example (see §3(b))—which he utilizes against manipulationists accounts—of the omniscient, omni-understanding agent who is passive (that is, an omni-understanding agent who is not actively drawing explanatory inferences) as one would likely attribute to this agent maximally well-connected knowledge in spite of that passivity. Meanwhile, when discussing outright (as opposed to ideal) understanding, Kelp suggests that we adopt a contextualist perspective. In a given context, then, one understands some subject matter P only if one approximates fully comprehensive and maximally well-connected knowledge of P “closely enough” that one is sufficiently likely to successfully perform any task relating to P that is determined by the context, assuming that one “has the skills needed to do so and to exercise them in suitably favorable conditions”. Kelp points out that this type of view is not so restrictive as to deny understanding to, for example, novice students and young children.  It should be noted that Hills 2009: 7 is also sympathetic to a similar thought, suggesting that the threshold for understanding might be contextually determined. However, Kelp admits that he wonders how his account will make sense of the link between understanding and explanation, and one might also wonder whether it is too strict to say that understanding requires knowledge as opposed to justified belief or justified true belief.

4. Understanding and Epistemic Luck

With a wide range of subtly different accounts of understanding (both objectual and understanding-why) on the table, it will be helpful to consider how understanding interfaces with certain key debates in epistemology. One natural place to start will be to examine the relationship between understanding and epistemic luck. Many epistemologists have sought to distinguish understanding from knowledge on the basis of alleged differences in the extent to which knowledge and understanding are susceptible to being undermined by certain kinds of epistemic luck.

While the matter of how to think about the incompatibility of knowledge with epistemic luck remains a contentious point—for instance, here modal accounts (for example, Pritchard 2005) are at odds with lack-of-control accounts (for example, Riggs 2007), few contemporary epistemologists dissent from the comparatively less controversial claim that knowledge excludes luck in a way that true beliefs and sometimes even justified true beliefs do not (see  Hetherington (2013) for a dissenting position). That said, the question of whether, and if so to what extent, understanding is compatible with epistemic luck, lacks any contemporary consensus, though this is an aspect of understanding that is receiving increased attention.

Zagzebski (2001) and Kvanvig (2003), have suggested that understanding’s immunity to being undermined by the kinds of epistemic luck which undermine knowledge is one of the most important ways in which understanding differs from knowledge. Riaz (2015), Rohwer (2014) and Morris (2012) have continued to uphold this line on understanding’s compatibility with epistemic luck and defend this line against some of the objections that are examined below. However, Pritchard’s work on epistemic luck (for example, 2005) and how it is incompatible with knowledge leads him to reason that understanding is immune to some but not all forms of malignant luck (that is, luck which is incompatible with knowledge). Finally, on the other side of the spectrum from Zagzebski and Kvanvig, and also in opposition with Pritchard, is the view that understanding’s immunity to epistemic luck is isomorphic to knowledge’s immunity to epistemic luck. This view, embraced by DePaul and Grimm (2009), implies that to the extent that understanding and knowledge come apart, it is not with respect to a difference in susceptibility to being undermined by epistemic luck.

a. Understanding as (Partially) Compatible with Epistemic Luck

Consider the view that the kinds of epistemic luck that suffice to undermine knowledge do not also undermine understanding. As Kvanvig sees it, knowing requires non-accidental links between (internal) mental states and external events in just the right way. But, the chief requirement of understanding, for him, is instead that there be the right coherence-making relations in some agent’s collection of information (that is, that the agent has a grasp of how all this related information fits together. In order to illustrate this point, Kvanvig invites us to imagine a case where an individual reads a book on the Comanche tribe, and she thereby acquires a belief set about the Comanche. In such a case, Kvanvig says, this individual acquires an “historical understanding of the Comanche dominance of the Southern plains of North America from the late 17th until the late 19th century” (2003: 197). Kvanvig stipulates that there are no falsehoods in the relevant class of beliefs that this individual has acquired from the book, and also that she can correctly answer all relevant questions whilst confidently believing that she is expressing the truth. He claims that while we would generally expect her to have knowledge of her relevant beliefs, this is not essential for her understanding and as a result it would not matter if these true beliefs had been Gettierised (and were therefore merely accidentally true). In short, then, Kvanvig wants to insist that the true beliefs that one attains in acquiring one’s understanding can all be Gettiered, even though the Gettier-style luck which prevents these beliefs from qualifying as knowledge does not undermine the understanding this individual acquires. So, understanding is compatible with a kind of epistemic luck that knowledge excludes.

Pritchard, meanwhile, claims that the matter of understanding’s compatibility with epistemic luck can be appreciated only against the background of a distinction between two kinds of epistemic luck—intervening and environmental—both of which are incompatible with knowledge. Both are “veritic” types of luck on Pritchard’s view—they are present when, given how one came to have one’s true belief, it is a matter of luck that this belief is true (Pritchard 2005: 146). Intervening epistemic luck is the sort present in the Gettier’s original cases (1963) which convinced most epistemologists to abandon the traditional account of knowledge as justified true belief. Cases of intervening luck take—to use a simple example—the familiar pattern of Chisholm’s “sheep in a field case”, where an agent sees a sheep-shaped rock which looks just like a sheep, and forms the belief “There is a sheep”. The agent’s belief is justified and true, thanks to the fact that there is a genuine sheep hiding behind the rock, but the belief is not knowledge, as it could easily have been false. It is just dumb luck the genuine sheep happened to be in the field. By contrast, the paradigmatic case of environmental epistemic luck is the famous ‘barn façade’ case (for example, Ginet 1975; Goldman 1979), a case where what an agent looks at is a genuine barn which unbeknownst to the individual is surrounded by façades which are indistinguishable to the agent from the genuine barn. Here, and unlike in the case of intervening epistemic luck, nothing actually goes awry, and the fact that the belief could easily have been false is owed entirely to the agent’s being in a bad environment, one with façades nearby.

Armed with this distinction, Pritchard criticizes Kvanvig’s assessment of the Comanche case by suggesting that just how we should regard understanding as being compatible or incompatible with epistemic luck depends on how we fill out the details of Kvanvig’s case, which is potentially ambiguous between two kinds of readings.  In order to make this point clear, Pritchard suggests that we first consider two versions of a case analogous with Kvanvig’s. In the first version, we are to imagine that the agent gets her beliefs from a faux-academic book filled with mere rumors that turn out to be luckily true. In this Gettier-style case, she has good reason to believe her true beliefs, but the source of these beliefs (for example, the rumor mill) is highly unreliable and this makes her beliefs only luckily true, in the sense of intervening epistemic luck. Contrast this—call it the ‘intervening reading’ of the case—with Pritchard’s corresponding environmental reading of the case, where we are to imagine that the agent is reading a reliable academic book which is the source of many true beliefs she acquires about the Comanche. But in this version of the case, suppose that, although the book is entirely authoritative, genuine and reliable, it is the only trustworthy book on the Comanche on the shelves—every book on the shelves nearby, which she easily could have grabbed rather than the genuine authoritative book, was filled with rumors and ungrounded suppositions. Pritchard’s verdict is that we should deny understanding in the intervening case and attribute it in the environmental case. Pritchard’s assessment then of whether understanding is compatible with epistemic luck that is incompatible with knowledge depends on which kind of epistemic luck incompatible with knowledge one is discussing.

While Pritchard’s point here is revealed in his diagnosis of Kvanvig’s reading of the Comanche case, he in several places prefers to illustrate the idea with reference to the case in which an agent asks a real (that is, genuine, authoritative) fire officer about the cause of a house fire and receives a correct explanation. Suppose further that the agent could have easily ended up with a made-up and incorrect explanation because (unbeknownst to the agent) everyone in the vicinity of the genuine fire officer who is consulted is dressed up as fire officers and would have given the wrong story (whilst failing to disclose that they were merely in costume). Pritchard maintains that it is intuitive that in the case just described understanding is attained—you have consulted a genuine fire officer and have received all the true beliefs required for understanding why your house burned down, and acquire this understanding in the right way. Meanwhile, he suggests that were you to ask a fake fire officer who appeared to you to be a real officer and just happened to give the correct answer, it is no longer plausible (by Pritchard’s lights) that you have understanding-why.

For a less concessionary critique of Kvanvig’s Comanche case, however, see Grimm (2006). According to Grimm, cases like Kvanvig admit of a more general characterisation, depending on how the details are filled in. Grimm puts the template formulation as follows: “A Comanche-style case is one in which we form true beliefs on the basis of trusting some source, and either (a) the source is unreliable, or (b) the source is reliable, but in the current environment one might easily have chosen an unreliable source.” After analysing variations of the Comanche case so conceived, Grimm argues that in neither (a)- or (b)-style Comanche cases do knowledge and understanding come apart. If this is right, then at least one prominent case used to illustrate a luck-based difference between knowledge and understanding does not hold up to scrutiny.

b. Newer Defenses of Understanding’s Compatibility with Epistemic Luck

In contrast with Pritchard’s “partial compatibility” view of the relationship between understanding and epistemic luck, where understanding is compatible with environmental but not with intervening luck, Rohwer (2014) defends understanding’s full compatibility with veritic epistemic luck (that is, of both intervening and environmental varieties). Rohwer argues that counterexamples like Pritchard’s intervening luck cases only appear plausible because the beliefs that make up the agent’s understanding come exclusively from a bad source. For example, Pritchard’s case of the ­fake fire officer—which recall is one in which he thinks understanding (as well as knowledge) is lacking—is one in which Rower points out taht all of the true beliefs and grasped connections between those beliefs are from a bad source. Rohwer’s inventive move involves a contrast case featuring “unifying understanding”, that is, understanding that is furnished from multiple sources, some good and some bad. Such cases she claims feature intervening luck that is compatible with understanding. While Pritchard can agree with Rohwer’s conclusion that understanding (and specifically as Rohwer is interested in, scientific understanding) is not a species of knowledge, the issue of adjudicating between Rohwer’s intuition in the case of unifying understanding and the diagnosis Pritchard will be committed to in such a case is complicated. An important question is whether there are philosophical considerations beyond simply intuition to adjudicate in a principled way why we should think about unifying understanding cases in one way rather than the other.

Morris (2012), like Rohwer, also defends lucky understanding—in particular, understanding-why, or what he calls “explanatory understanding”). He argues that intuitions that rule against lucky understanding can be explained away. For example, he attempts to explain the intuitions in Pritchard’s intervening luck spin on Kvanvig’s Comanche case by noting that some of the temptation to deny understanding here relates to the writer of the luckily-true book himself lacking the relevant understanding. Morris challenges the assumption that hearers cannot gain understanding through the testimony of those who lack understanding, and accordingly, embraces a kind of understanding transmission principle that parallels the kind of knowledge transmission principle that is presently a topic of controversy in the epistemology of testimony. Morris suggests that the writer of the Comanche book might lack understanding due to failing to endorse the relevant propositions, while the reader might have understanding because she does endorse the relevant proposition. He claims further that this description of the case undermines the intuition that the writer’s lack of understanding entails the reader’s lack of understanding. Of course, though, just as Lackey (2007) raises ‘creationist teacher’ style cases against knowledge transmission principles, one might as well raise a parallel kind of creationist teacher case against the thesis that one cannot attain understanding from a source who herself lacks it. In such a parallel case, we simply modify Lackey’s original case and suppose that Stella, a creationist teacher, who does not believe in evolution, nonetheless teaches it reliably and in accordance with the highest professional standards. As Lackey thinks students can come to know evolutionary theory from this teacher despite the teacher not knowing the propositions she asserts (given that the Stella fails the belief condition for knowledge), we might likewise think, and contra Morris, that Stella might fail to understand evolution. This is because Stella lacks beliefs on the matter, even though the students can gain understanding from her. To the extent that such a move is available, one has reason to resist Morris’s rationale for resisting Pritchard’s diagnosis of Kvanvig’s case.

5. Understanding and Epistemic Value

The topic of epistemic value has only relatively recently received sustained attention in mainstream epistemology. Even so, and especially over the past decade, there has been agreement amongst most epistemologists working on epistemic value that that understanding is particularly valuable (though see Janvid 2012 for a rare dissenting voice). It is also becoming an increasingly popular position to hold that understanding is more epistemically valuable than knowledge (see Kvanvig 2003; Pritchard 2010). Although the analysis of the value of epistemic states has roots in Plato and Aristotle, this renewed and more intense interest was initially inspired by two coinciding trends in epistemology. On the one hand, there is the increasing support for virtue epistemology that began in the 1980s, and on the other there is growing dissatisfaction with the ever-complicated attempt to generate an account of knowledge that is appropriately immune to Gettier-style counterexamples (see, for example, DePaul 2009).

Unsurprisingly, the comparison between the nature of understanding as opposed to knowledge has coincided with comparisons of their respective epistemic value, particularly since Kvanvig (2003) first defended the epistemic value of the latter to the former. For example, in Whitcomb (2010: 8), we find the observation that “understanding is widely taken to be a ‘higher’ epistemic good: a state that is like knowledge and true belief, but even better, epistemically speaking.” Meanwhile, Pritchard (2009: 11) notes “as we might be tempted to put the point, we would surely rather understand than merely know.” A helpful clarification here comes from Grimm (2012: 105), who in surveying the literature on the value of understanding points out that the suggestion seems to be that understanding (of “a complex of some kind”) is better than the corresponding item of propositional knowledge. This type of a view is a revisionist theory of epistemic value (see, for example, Pritchard 2010), which suggests that one would be warranted in turning more attention to an epistemic state other than propositional knowledge—specifically, according to Pritchard—understanding. The following sections consider why understanding might have such additional value.

a. Transparency

According to Zagzebski (2001), the epistemic value of understanding is tied not to elements of its factivity, but rather to its transparency. She claims, “it may be possible to know without knowing one knows, but it is impossible to understand without understanding one understands” (2001: 246) and suggests that this property of understanding might insulate it from skepticism. Zagzebski does not mean to say that to understand X, one must also understand one’s own understanding of X (as this threatens a psychologically implausible regress), but rather, that to understand X one must also understand that one understands X. Thus, given that understanding that p and knowing that p can in ordinary contexts be used synonymously (for example, understanding that it will rain is just to know that it will rain) we can paraphrase Zagzebski’s point with no loss as: understanding X entails knowing that one understands X. To the extent that this is right, Zagzebski is endorsing a kind of ‘KU’ principle (compare: KK).

Grimm (2006) and Pritchard (2010) counter that many of the most desirable instances of potential understanding, such as when we understand another person’s psychology or understand how the world works, are not transparent. In other words, they claim that one cannot always tell that one understands. Consider, for instance, the felicity of the question: “Am I understanding this correctly?” and “I do not know if I understand my own defense mechanisms; I think I understand them, but I am not sure.” The other side of the coin is that one often can think that one understands things that one does not (for example, Trout 2007). Consider how some people think they grasp the ways in which their zodiac sign has an influence on their life path, yet their sense of understanding is at odds with the facts of the matter. More generally, as this line of criticism goes, sometimes we simply mistake mere (non-factive) intelligibility for understanding. As it were, from “the inside”, these can be indistinguishable much as, from the first-person perspective, mere true belief and knowledge can be indistinguishable. To the extent that these worries with transparency are apt, a potential obstacle emerges for the prospects of accounting for the value of understanding in terms of its transparency. Examples of the sort considered suggest that—even if understanding has some important internalist component to it—transparency of the sort Zagzebski is suggesting when putting forward the ‘KU’ claim, is an accidental property of only some cases of understanding and not essential to understanding.

b. Cognitive Achievement

Pritchard’s (2010) account of the distinctive value of understanding is, in short, that understanding essentially involves a strong kind of finally valuable cognitive achievement, and secondly, that while knowledge comes apart from cognitive achievement in both directions, understanding does not. If, as robust virtue epistemologists have often insisted, cognitive achievement is finally valuable (that is, as an instance of achievements more generally), and understanding necessarily lines up with cognitive achievement but knowledge only sometimes does, then the result is a revisionary story about epistemic value. In other words, one mistakenly take knowledge to be distinctively valuable only because knowledge often does have something—cognitive achievement—which is essential to understanding and which is finally valuable.

Firstly, achievement is often defined as success that is because of ability (see, for example, Greco 2007), where the most sensible interpretation of this claim is to see the ‘because’ as signifying a casual-explanatory relationship—this is, at least, the dominant view. The thought is that, in cases of achievement, the relevant success must be primarily creditable to the exercise of the agent’s abilities, rather than to some other factor (for example, luck). Achievements, unlike mere successes, are regarded as valuable for their own sake, mainly because of the way in which these special sorts of successes come to be.

It is helpful to consider an example. If we consider some goal—such as the successful completion of a coronary bypass—it is obvious that our attitude towards the successful coronary bypass is different when the completion is a matter of ability as opposed to luck. Assume that the surgeon is suffering from the onset of some degenerative mental disease and the first symptom is his forgetting which blood vessel he should be using to bypass the narrowed section of the coronary artery. The surgeon’s successful bypass is valued differently when one is made aware that it was by luck that he picked an appropriate blood vessel for the bypass. Given that the result is the same (that is, the patient’s heart muscle blood supply is improved) regardless of whether he successfully completes the operation by luck or by skill, the instrumental value of the action is the same. Given that the instrumental value is the same, our reaction to the two contrasting bypass cases seems to count in favor of the final value of successes because of ability—achievements. So too does the fact that one would rather have a success involving an achievement than a mere success, even when this difference has no pragmatic consequences. To borrow a case from Riggs, stealing an Olympic medal or otherwise cheating to attain it lacks the kind of value one associates with earning the medal, through one’s own skill. Achievements are thought of as being intrinsically good, though the existence of evil achievements (for example, skillfully committing genocide) and trivial achievements (for example, competently counting the blades of grass on a lawn) shows that we are thinking of successes that have distinctive value as achievements (Pritchard 2010: 30) rather than successes that have all-things-considered value.

Due to the possibility of overly simple or passive successes qualifying as cognitive achievements (for example, coming to truly believe that it is dark just by looking out of the window in normal conditions after 10pm), Pritchard cautions that we should distinguish between two classes of cognitive achievement—strong and weak:

Weak cognitive achievement: Cognitive success that is because of one’s cognitive ability.

Strong cognitive achievement: Cognitive success that is because of one’s cognitive ability where the success in question either involves the overcoming of a significant obstacle or the exercise of a significant level of cognitive ability.

On the basis of considerations Pritchard argues for in various places (2010; 2012; 2013; 2014), relating to cognitive achievement’s presence in the absence of knowledge (for example. in barn façade cases, where environmental luck is incompatible with knowledge but compatible with cognitive achievement) and the absence of cognitive achievement in the presence of knowledge (e.g. as in testimony cases in friendly environments, where knowledge acquisition demands very little on the part of the agent), he argues that cognitive achievement is not essentially wedded to knowledge (as robust virtue epistemologists would hold). In fact, he claims, the two come apart in both directions: yielding knowledge without strong cognitive achievement and—as in the case of understanding that lacks corresponding knowledge—strong cognitive achievement without knowledge. By contrast, Pritchard believes that understanding always involves strong cognitive achievement, that is, an achievement that necessarily involves either a significant exercise of skill or the overcoming of a significant obstacle. If Pritchard is right to claim that understanding is always a strong cognitive achievement, then understanding is always finally valuable if cognitive achievement is also always finally valuable, and moreover, valuable in a way that knowledge is not. See, however, Carter & Gordon (2014) for a recent criticism on the point of identifying understanding with strong cognitive achievement. See further Bradford (2013; 2015) for resistance to the very suggestion that there can be weak achievements on Pritchard’s sense—namely, achievements that do not necessarily involve great effort, regardless of whether they are primarily due to ability.

c. Curiosity

Taking curiosity to be of epistemic significance is not a new idea. Whitcomb (2010) notes that Goldman (1999)  has considered that the significance or value of some item of knowledge might be at least in part determined by whether, and to what extent, it provides the knower with answers to questions that they are curious about. Whitcomb also cites Alston (2005) as endorsing a stronger view, according to which true belief or knowledge gets at least some of its epistemic value from its connection to, and satisfaction of, curiosity.

What is curiosity? According to Goldman (1991) curiosity is a desire for true belief; by contrast, Williamson views curiosity as a desire for knowledge. Kvanvig (2013) claims that both of these views are mistaken, and in the course of doing so, locates curiosity at the center of his account of understanding’s value. More specifically, Kvanvig aims to support the contention that objectual understanding has a special value knowledge lacks by arguing that the nature of curiosity—the “motivational element that drives cognitive machinery” (2013: 152)—underwrites a way of vindicating understanding’s final value.

The notion of curiosity that plays a role in Kvanvig’s line is a broadly inclusive one that is meant to include not just obvious problem-solving examples but also what he calls more “spontaneous” examples, such as turning around to see what caused a noise you just heard. He takes his account to be roughly in line with the layman’s concept of curiosity. His central claim is that curiosity “provides hope for a response-dependent or behaviour-centred explanation of the value of whatever curiosity involves or aims at”. This is explained in the following way: “If it is central to ordinary cognitive function that one is motivated to pursue X, then X has value in virtue of its place in this functional story.” Regarding the comparison between the value of understanding and the value of knowledge, then, he will say that if understanding is fundamental to curiosity then this provides at least a partial explanation for why it is superior to the value of knowledge. Kvanvig identifies the main opponent to his view, that the scope of curiosity is enough to support the unrestricted value of understanding, to be one on which knowledge is what is fundamental to curiosity.  Specifically, he takes his opponent’s view to be that knowledge through direct experience is what sates curiosity, a view that traces to Aristotle. A central component of Kvanvig’s argument is negative; he regards knowledge as ill-suited to play the role of satisfying curiosity, and in particular, by rejecting three arguments from Whitcomb to this effect. According to his positive proposal, objectual understanding is the goal and what typically sates the “appetite” associated with curiosity. He concedes, though, that sometimes curiosity on a smaller scale can be sated by epistemic justification, and that what seems like understanding, but is actually just intelligibility, can sate the appetite when one is deceived.

Grimm (2012) has wondered whether this view might get things “explanatorily backwards”. This is because we might be tempted to say instead that we desire to make sense of things because it is good to do so rather than saying that it is good to make sense of things because we desire it. He also suggests that what epistemic agents want is not just to feel like they are making sense of things but to actually make sense of them. Owing to Kvanvig’s use of the words “perceived achievement”, Grimm thinks that the curiosity account of understanding’s value suggests that subjective understanding (or what is referred to as ‘intelligibility’ above) can satisfy the desire to make sense of the world or “really marks the legitimate end of inquiry.”

6. Future Research on Understanding

Where should an investigation of understanding in epistemology take us next? Although a range of epistemologists highlighting some of the important features of understanding-why and objectual understanding have been discussed, there are many interesting topics that warrant further research. For one thing, if understanding is both a factive and strongly internalist notion then a radical skeptical argument that threatens to show that we have no understanding is a very intimidating prospect (as Pritchard 2010:86 points out). This skeptical argument is worth engaging with, presumably with the goal of showing that understanding does not turn out to be internally indistinguishable from mere intelligibility.

Secondly, there is plenty of scope for understanding to play a more significant role in social epistemology. For example, Carter and Gordon (2011) consider that there might be cases in which understanding, and not just knowledge, is the required epistemic credential to warrant assertion. Questions about when and what type of understanding is required for permissible assertion connect with issues related to expertise. In particular, how we might define expertise and who has it. And, relatedly in social epistemology, we might wonder what if any testimonial transmission principles hold for understanding, and whether there are any special hearer conditions demanded by testimonial understanding acquisition that are not shared in cases of testimonial knowledge acquisition.

Thirdly, even if one accepts something like a moderate factivity requirement on objectual understanding—and thus demand of at least a certain class of beliefs one has of a subject matter that they be true—one can also ask further and more nuanced questions about the epistemic status of these true beliefs. Must they be known or can they be Gettiered true beliefs? Or—and this is a point that has received little attention—even more weakly, can the true beliefs be themselves unreliably formed or held on the basis of bad reasons. For example, if I competently grasp the relevant coherence-making and explanatory relations between propositions about chemistry which I believe and which are true but which I believed on an improper basis. For example, by trusting someone I should not have trusted, or even worse, by reading tea leaves which happened to afford me true beliefs about chemistry. Would this impede one’s understanding? If so, why, and if not why not? Relatedly, if framed in terms of credence, what credence threshold must be met, with respect to propositions in some set, for the agent to understand that subject matter? One helpful way to think about this is as follows: if one takes a paradigmatic case of an individual who understands a subject matter thoroughly, and manipulates the credence the agent has toward the propositions constituting the subject matter, how low can one go before the agent no longer understands the subject matter in question?

Fourthly, a relatively fertile area for further research concerns the semantics of understanding attribution. To what extent do the advantages and disadvantages of, for example, sensitive invariantist, contextualist, insensitive invariantist and relativist approaches to knowledge attributions find parallels in the case of understanding attributions. Is it problematic to embrace, for example, a contextualist semantics for knowledge attributions while embracing, say, invariantism about understanding?

Fifthly, to what extent might active externalist approaches (for example, extended mind and extended cognition) in epistemology, the ramifications of which have recently been brought to bear on the theory of knowledge (see Carter, et. al 2014), have for understanding? Toon (2015) has recently suggested, with reference to the hypothesis of extended cognition, that understanding can be located partly outside the head. Are the prospects of extending understanding via active externalism on a par with the prospects for extending knowledge, or is understanding essentially internal in a way that knowledge need not be?

Finally, there is fruitful work to do concerning the relationship between understanding and wisdom. For example, in Whitcomb (2011) we find the suggestion that theoretical wisdom is a form of particularly deep understanding. Whether wisdom might be a type of understanding or understanding might be a component of wisdom is a fascinating question that can draw on both work in virtue ethics and epistemology.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. Beyond ‘Justification’: Dimensions of Epistemic Evaluation. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 2005.
    • Includes Alston’s view of curiosity, according to which the epistemic value of true belief and knowledge partially comes from a link to curiosity.
  • Baker, L. R. “Third Person Understanding” in A. Sanford (ed.), The Nature and Limits of Human Understanding. London: Continuum, 2003.
    • Outlines a view on which understanding something requires making reasonable sense of it.
  • Batterman, R. W. “Idealization and modelling.” Synthese, 169(3) (2009): 427-446.
    • Endorses the idea that when we consider how things would be if something was true, we increase our access to further truths.
  • Bradford, G. “The Value of Achievements.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 94(2) (2013): 204-224.
    • Resists Pritchard’s claim that there can be weak achievements, that is, ones that do not necessarily involve great effort.
  • Bradford, G. Achievement. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015.
    • A monograph that explores the nature and value of achievements in great depth.
  • Carter, J. A. and Gordon, E. C. “Norms of Assertion: The Quantity and Quality of Epistemic Support.” Philosophia 39(4) (2011): 615-635.
    • Argues that a type of understanding might be the norm that warrants assertion in a restricted class of cases.
  • Carter, J. A. and Gordon, E. C. “On Pritchard, Objectual Understanding and the Value Problem.” American Philosophical Quarterly 51 (2014): 1-14.
    • Criticizes the claim that understanding-why should be identified with strong cognitive achievement.
  • Carter, J. A., Kallestrup, J. Palermos, S.O. and Pritchard, D. “Varieties of Externalism.” Philosophical Issues 41(1) (2014): 63-109.
    • Considers some of the ramifications that active externalist approaches might have for epistemology.
  • Carter, J. A. and Pritchard, D. “Knowledge-How and Epistemic Luck.” Noûs (2013).
    • Discusses whether intellectualist arguments for reducing know-how to propositional knowledge might also apply to understanding-why (if it is a type of knowing how).
  • DePaul, M. “Ugly Analysis and Value” in A. Haddock, A. Millar and D. Pritchard (eds.), Epistemic Value. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Looks at the increasing dissatisfaction with ever-more complicated attempts to generate a theory of knowledge immune to counterexamples.
  • Elgin, C. Z. “True enough.” Philosophical issues, 14(1) (2004): 113-131.
    • Includes further discussion of the role of acceptance and belief in her view of understanding.
  • Elgin, C. “Understanding and the Facts.” Philosophical Studies 132 (2007): 33-42.
    • Argues against a factive conception of scientific understanding.
  • Elgin, C. “Exemplification, Idealization, and Understanding” in M. Suárez (ed.), Fictions in Science: Essays on Idealization and Modeling. London: Routledge, 2009.
    • Explores the epistemological role of exemplification and aims to illuminate the relationship between understanding and scientific idealizations construed as fictions.
  • DePaul, M. and Grimm, S. “Review Essay: Kvanvig’s The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 74 (2007): 498-514.
    • Includes criticism of Kvanvig’s line on epistemic luck and understanding.
  • De Regt, H. and Dieks, D. “A Contextual Approach to Scientific Understanding.” Synthese 144 (2005): 137-170.
    • Offers an account of understanding that requires having a theory of the relevant phenomenon.
  • Gettier, E. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23 (6) (1963). 121-132.
    • Contains the famous counterexamples to the Justified True Belief account of knowledge.
  • Ginet, C. Knowledge, Perception and Memory. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1975.
    • Contains the paradigmatic case of environmental epistemic luck (that is, the fake barn case).
  • Goldman, A. “What is Justified Belief?” In G. S. Pappas (ed.), Justification and Knowledge. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1979.
    • Often-cited discussion of the fake barn counterexample to traditional accounts of knowledge that focus on justified true belief.
  • Goldman, A. “Stephen P. Stitch: The Fragmentation of Reason.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 51(1) (1991): 189-193.
    • Discusses the connection between curiosity and true belief.
  • Goldman, A. Knowledge in a Social World. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
    • Contains exploration of whether the value knowledge may be in part determined by the extent to which it provides answers to questions one is curious about.
  • Gordon, E. C. “Is There Propositional Understanding?” Logos & Episteme 3 (2012): 181-192.
    • Examines reasons to suppose that attributions of understanding are typically attributions of knowledge, understanding-why or objectual understanding.
  • Greco, J. “The Nature of Ability and the Purpose of Knowledge.” Philosophical Issues 17 (2007): 57-69.
    • Discusses and defines ability in the sense often appealed to in work on cognitive ability and the value of knowledge.
  • Grimm, S. “Is Understanding a Species of Knowledge?” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 57 (2006): 515-535.
    • Analyzes Kvanvig’s Comanche case and argues that knowledge and understanding do not come apart in this example.
  • Grimm, S. “Understanding” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard (eds.), The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. New York: Routledge, 2011.
    • An overview of the object, psychology, and normativity of understanding.
  • Grimm, S. “The Value of Understanding.” Philosophy Compass 7(2) (2012): 103-177.
    • Gives an overview of recent arguments for revisionist theories of epistemic value that suggest understanding is more valuable than knowledge.
  • Grimm, S. “Understanding as Knowledge of Causes” in A. Fairweather (ed.), Virtue Epistemology Naturalized: Bridges Between Virtue Epistemology and Philosophy of Science. Dordrecht: Springer, 2014.
    • A novel interpretation of the traditional view according to which understanding-why can be explained in terms of knowledge of causes.
  • Hazlett, A. “The Myth of Factive Verbs.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 80:3 (2010): 497-522.
    • Argues that the ordinary concept of knowledge is not factive and that epistemologists should therefore not concern themselves with said ordinary concept.
  • Hempel, C. Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Other Essays in the Philosophy of Science. New York: Free Press, 1965.
    • Early defence of explanation’s key role in understanding.
  • Hetherington, S. “There Can be Lucky Knowledge” in M. Steup, J. Turri and E. Sosa (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Epistemology (2nd Edition). Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2013.
    • A paper in which it is argued that (contrary to popular opinion) knowledge does not exclude luck.
  • Hills, A. “Moral Testimony and Moral Epistemology.” Ethics 120 (2009): 94-127.
    • In looking at moral understanding-why, outlines some key abilities that may be necessary to the “grasping” component of understanding.
  • Janvid, M. “Knowledge versus Understanding: The Cost of Avoiding Gettier.” Acta Analytica 27 (2012): 183-197.
    • Disputes the popular claim that understanding is more epistemically valuable than knowledge.
  • Kim, J. “Explanatory Knowledge and Metaphysical Dependence.” In his Essays in the Metaphysics of Mind. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • Contains Kim’s classic discussion of species of dependence (for example, mereological dependence).
  • Kelp, C. “Understanding Phenomena.” Synthese (2015).
    • Divides recent views of understanding according to whether they are “manipulationist” or “explanationst”; argues for a different view according to which understanding is maximally well-connected knowledge.
  • Khalifa, K. Inaugurating understanding or repackaging explanation. Philosophy of Science, 79(1) (2012): 15-37.
    • Argues that we should replace the main developed accounts of understanding with earlier accounts of scientific explanation.
  • Khalifa, K. “Is Understanding Explanatory or Objectual?” Synthese 190(6) (2013a): 1153-1171.
    • Proposes a framework for reducing objectual understanding to what he calls explanatory understanding.
  • Khalifa, K. “Understanding, Grasping and Luck.” Episteme 10 (1) (2013b): 1-17.
    • Argues against compatibility between understanding and epistemic luck.
  • Kvanvig, J. The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • The root of the recent resurgence of interest in understanding in epistemology. This paper proposes a revisionist view of epistemic value and an outline of different types of understanding.
  • Kvanvig, J. “The Value of Understanding” In D. Pritchard, A. Haddock and A. Millar (eds.), Epistemic Value. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Argues that the concerns plaguing theories of knowledge do not cause problems for a theory of understanding.
  • Kvanvig, J. “Curiosity and a Response-Dependent Account of the Value of Understanding.” In T. Henning and D. Schweikard (eds.), Knowledge, Virtue and Action. Boston: Routledge, 2013.
    • Proposes an account of understanding’s value that is related to its connection with curiosity.
  • Lackey, J. “Why We Don’t Deserve Credit for Everything We Know.” Synthese 156 (2007).
    • Contains Lackey’s counterexamples to the knowledge transmission principles.
  • Lipton, P. “Understanding Without Explanation” in H. de Regt, S. Leonelli, and K. Eigner (eds.), Scientific Understanding: Philosophical Perspectives. Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2009.
    • Argues that requiring knowledge of an explanation is too strong a condition on understanding-why.
  • Longworth, G. “Linguistic Understanding and Knowledge.” Nous 42 (2008): 50-79.
    • A discussion of whether linguistic understanding is a form of knowledge.
  • Morris, K. “A Defense of Lucky Understanding.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 63 (2012): 357-371.
    • Attempts to explain away the intuitions suggesting that lucky understanding is incompatible with epistemic luck.
  • Olsson, E. “Coherentist Theories of Epistemic Justification” in E. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Enclopedia of Philosophy.
    • An overview of coherentism that can be useful when considering how theories of coherence might be used to flesh out the grasping condition on understanding.
  • Pritchard, D. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • An in-depth exploration of different types of epistemic luck.
  • Pritchard, D. “Recent Work on Epistemic Value.” American Philosophical Quarterly 44 (2007): 85-110.
    • Looks at understanding’s role in recent debates about epistemic value and contains key arguments against Elgin’s non-factive view of understanding.
  • Pritchard, D. “Knowing the Answer, Understanding and Epistemic Value.” Grazer Philosophische Studien 77 (2008): 325-39.
    • Explores understanding as the proper goal of inquiry, in addition to discussing understanding’s distinctive value.
  • Pritchard, D. “Knowledge, Understanding and Epistemic Value” In A. O’Hear (ed.), Epistemology (Royal Institute of Philosophy Lectures). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
    • Argues that understanding (unlike knowledge) is a type of cognitive achievement and therefore of distinctive value.
  • Pritchard, D. “The Value of Knowledge: Understanding.” In A. Haddock, A. Millar and D. Pritchard (eds.), The Nature and Value of Knowledge: Three Investigations. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • A longer discussion of the nature of understanding and its distinctive value (in relation to the value of knowledge) than in his related papers.
  • Pritchard, D. “Knowledge and Understanding” in A. Fairweather (ed.), Virtue Epistemology Naturalized: Bridges Between Virtue Epistemology and Philosophy of Science. Dordecht: Springer, 2014.
    • Criticizes Grimm’s view of understanding as knowledge of causes.
  • Riaz, A. “Moral Understanding and Knowledge.” Philosophical Studies 172(2) (2015): 113-128.
    • Argues against the view that moral understanding can be immune to luck while moral knowledge is not.
  • Riggs, W. “Understanding Virtue and the Virtue of Understanding” In M. DePaul and L. Zagzebski (eds.), Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • Introduces intelligibility as an epistemic state similar to understanding but less valuable.
  • Riggs, W. “Why Epistemologists Are So Down on Their Luck.” Synthese 158 (3) (2007): 329-344.
    • Defends a lack of control account of luck.
  • Rohwer, Y. “Lucky Understanding Without Knowledge.” Synthese 191 (2014): 945-959.
    • Claims that understanding is entirely compatible with both intervening and environmental forms of veritic luck.
  • Salmon, W. “Four Decades of Scientific Explanation.” In Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. 13. Eds. Philip Kitcher and Wesley Salmon. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
    • Another significant paper endorsing the claim that knowledge of explanations should play a vital role in our theories of understanding.
  • Sliwa, P. IV—Understanding and Knowing. In Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Hardback) (Vol. 115, No. 1pt1): pp. 57-74, 2015.
    • Defends the strong claim that propositional knowledge is necessary and sufficient for understanding.
  • Stanley, J. Know How. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011.
    • Outlines and evaluates the anti-intellectualist and intellectualist views of know-how.
  • Stanley, J and Williamson, T. “Knowing How.” Journal of Philosophy 98(8) (2001): 411-444.
    • An earlier paper defending the intellectualist view of know-how.
  • Strevens, M. “No Understanding Without Explanation.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 44 (2013): 510-515.
    • Defends views that hold explanation as indispensable for account of understanding and discusses what a non-factive account of grasping would look like.
  • Sullivan, E. “Understanding: Not Know-How.” Philosohpical Studies (2017). https://doi.org/10.1007/s11098-017-0863-z
    • Resists the alleged similarity between understanding and knowing-how.
  • Toon, A. “Where is the Understanding?” Synthese, 2015.
    • Uses the hypothesis of extended cognition to argue that understanding can be located (at least partly) outside the head.
  • Trout, J.D. “The Psychology of Scientific Explanation.” Philosophy Compass 2(3) (2007): 564-591.
    • Contains a discussion of the fact that we often take ourselves to understand things we do not.
  • Van Camp, W. “Explaining Understanding (or Understanding Explanation.” European Journal for Philosophy of Science 4(1) (2014): 95-114.
    • Uses the concept of understanding to underwrite a theory of explanation.
  • Whitcomb, D. “Wisdom.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard (eds.), The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. New York: Routledge, 2011.
    • An overview of wisdom, including its potential relationship to understanding.
  • Whitcomb, D. “Epistemic Value” In A. Cullison (ed.), The Continuum Companion to Epistemology. London: Continuum, 2012.
    • An overview of issues relating to epistemic value, including discussion of understanding as a “higher” epistemic state.
  • Wilkenfeld, D. “Understanding as Representation Manipulability.” Synthese 190 (2013): 997-1016.
    • Builds an account of understanding according to which understanding a subject matter involves possessing a representation that could be manipulated in a useful way.
  • Zagzebski, L. “Recovering Understanding” In M. Steup (ed.), Knowledge, Truth and Obligation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
    • Incudes arguments for the position that understanding need not be factive.
  • Zagzebski, L. On Epistemology. CA: Wadsworth, 2009.
    • An overview of the background, development and recent issues in epistemology, including a chapter on understanding as an epistemic good.


Author Information

Emma C. Gordon
Email: emma.gordon@ed.ac.uk
University of Edinburgh
Scotland, U.K.