Universals are a class of mind-independent entities, usually contrasted with individuals (or so-called “particulars”), postulated to ground and explain relations of qualitative identity and resemblance among individuals. Individuals are said to be similar in virtue of sharing universals. An apple and a ruby are both red, for example, and their common redness results from sharing a universal. If they are both red at the same time, the universal, red, must be in two places at once. This makes universals quite different from individuals; and it makes them controversial.

Whether universals are in fact required to explain relations of qualitative identity and resemblance among individuals has engaged metaphysicians for two thousand years. Disputants fall into one of three broad camps. Realists endorse universals. Conceptualists and Nominalists, on the other hand, refuse to accept universals and deny that they are needed. Conceptualists explain similarity among individuals by appealing to general concepts or ideas, things that exist only in minds. Nominalists, in contrast, are content to leave relations of qualitative resemblance brute and ungrounded. Numerous versions of Nominalism have been proposed, some with a great deal of sophistication. Contemporary philosophy has seen the rise of a new form of Nominalism, one that makes use of a special class of individuals, known as tropes. Familiar individuals have many properties, but tropes are single property instances. Whether Trope Nominalism improves on earlier Nominalist theories is the subject of much recent debate. In general, questions surrounding universals touch upon some of the oldest, deepest, and most abstract of philosophical issues.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. The Nature of Universals
    2. Reasons to Postulate Universals
    3. The Problem of Universals
  2. Versions of Realism
    1. Extreme Realism
    2. Strong Realism
    3. Objections to Realism
  3. Versions of Anti-Realism
    1. Predicate Nominalism
    2. Resemblance Nominalism
    3. Trope Nominalism
    4. Conceptualism
  4. Concluding Thoughts
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

An inventory of reality’s most fundamental entities would almost certainly include individuals. Individuals are singular objects. They can exist over time, but in only one place at a time. Individuals also have properties (also called qualities), at least most of which can vary over time. A ripening apple goes from being green to being red, for instance. Almost everyone agrees that individual apples exist, and that they are colored, but are redness and greenness entities themselves? If so, what are they like? And if redness and greenness are not real entities, how could our apple be colored at all? Without its distinctive qualities, an apple wouldn’t even be an apple.

Let us use the term “universal” for properties (or qualities).  In a philosophical tone of voice we can now ask, “Are there really such universals? If so, what is their nature? How are they related to individuals?” These questions start us down a road philosophers have been exploring since philosophy itself was young.

We can approach the question about the existence of universals from a linguistic perspective. Consider how often we speak of things having properties: “That apple is red;” “The oven is hot;” or “My shirt is dirty.” Such sentences have a subject-predicate structure. The subject term refers to the individual described in the sentence. The predicate, on the other hand, describes; it tells us something about the way that individual is, how it is qualified. Do predicates also refer? Some philosophers think they do. Alongside the individuals picked out by subject terms of sentences, it is thought, there are entities of a different kind, picked out by predicates. Once again we can call these “universals”.

Prima facie, there seems to be every reason to believe in universals. They look to be just as much a part of our experience as individuals are. Philosophical questions and problems arise, however, when we try to specify their natures. If universals are real, but are not individuals, what are they? Some philosophers contend that universals are too strange to accept into our world view. In a similar vein, it has been alleged that any philosophical work done by universals can be done just as well without them; whether they are strange or not, many argue, universals are simply unnecessary. Of course, it would need to be shown that universals really can be dispensed with, and we’ll return to this controversy. But first we will examine competing Realist conceptions of the nature of universals.

a. The Nature of Universals

In fundamental debates in metaphysics, it can be useful to understand the type of entity or concept in contrastive terms. For instance, it is helpful to understand universals by contrasting them with individuals. What then, is an individual, or a particular, in the philosophical or metaphysical sense of the term?

Traditionally, the term “individual” is used to pick out members of a certain category of existents, each member of which is said to be unique. More precisely, individuals are said to be non-repeatable (not multi-exemplifiable), which means that they can’t be in more than one place at a time. Examples include the familiar objects of sense-experience, such as chairs or tigers. A room may contain many chairs that are virtually alike in their intrinsic qualities, but each chair is nonetheless a distinct thing in one place at one time. By contrast, the universal “chair” is repeated around the room.

The individuals familiar from experience are also said to be material: they fill regions of space with impenetrable “stuff,” and are locatable in space and time. Some philosophers are committed to other types of individuals, as well: immaterial ones (such as souls and sense-data) and even ones that are also outside space and time (such as numbers and God). The crucial contrast for our purposes, however, is between what are repeatable (universals) and what are not (individuals).

Although individuals are nonrepeatable, universals can serve their characteristic functions only if they differ from individuals in this respect. In order to ground relations of qualitative identity, for instance, universals must be multi-exemplifiable (or repeatable), able to be here and there at the same time. My apple and yours are both individuals, and this implies that each can be in only one place at a time. But if the redness they share is a universal, then the redness they share is a real non-individual, literally in both. The apples are similar in virtue of sharing this universal, redness. And if redness is shared in this way, then it is in at least two places at once.

As we proceed we will get more precise about these characterizations, and explore variations that have been defended in opposing Realist accounts. But we can appreciate already why some philosophers balk at the existence of universals. For, as just noted, all defenders want to say that universals are repeatable. It seems, however, that defenders of universals must also say that universals are wholly present in each of the places they exist.

To explain, suppose we were to destroy one of the apples considered above. We’d have one fewer individual, to be sure. Would there be a diminishment of redness itself? It doesn’t seem so, since redness is held to be an entity in its own right. Nor does it seem to make sense to say that redness increases when another apple ripens and turns red. These considerations suggest that a universal is wholly present in each of its instances, and that the existence of a universal at one place is unrelated to its simultaneous existence at any other place. It’s not clear, however, how universals could be both wholly present in each of the places they exist, and, at the same time, present in many different places at once. This certainly would make them unusual, to say the least.

Moreover, it seems to be a mark of materiality that a material thing can be in only one place at a time. If so, then universals cannot be material. This in turn creates a problem when it comes to causation. For as we usually understand causal relations, one thing affects another by interacting with it, say by colliding with it. But that seems possible only if the entities in question are material. For these reasons it is difficult to explain how universals interact with other things that exist. The puzzle becomes more acute when we wonder how we can know universals at all. Don’t they have to interact with our brains for us to know them? If they are not material, this interaction is quite mysterious.

In summation, we’ve seen that universals are quite different from individuals, and in ways that make them odd. Philosophers with low tolerance for strangeness tend to dismiss them for these reasons. Why, then, do some philosophers continue to believe in them, despite their unusual natures?

b. Reasons to Postulate Universals

Universals are called on to serve many philosophical functions. For most of this article, we’ll focus on one particularly famous one – the role universals play in professed solutions to what has come to be called “The Problem of Universals.”

First, a word or two about postulating entities is in order. Here we might compare the philosophical enterprise of deciding whether universals exist with the scientific enterprise of deciding whether strange unobservable entities, like quarks or neutrinos, exist. The scientific case is itself controversial, but many scientists and philosophers believe in the existence of unobservables, provided the theories that postulate them best explain the observable phenomena under study. For example, many believe the universe contains what physicists call “black holes,” in part because the best (perhaps only) way to explain a range of stellar phenomena is to suppose that black holes are responsible. Again, this is controversial, but if the explanation provided is the best (or only) explanation, many scientists and philosophers claim a right to believe the postulated unobservables exist.

In parallel, we now ask, “Are there any philosophical puzzles or problems that can best be solved by believing in universals?” In fact, universals have been called on to answer a range of philosophical questions. Recall our points about subjects, predicates and reference. Prima facie, a name wouldn’t be a name if there weren’t something for it to refer to. Some philosophers think that the meaning of a name just is its referent. What about general terms, terms that can be said of many things, such as “red“ or “wise”? What gives those terms meaning? Some have said that predicates must have referents to be meaningful, and universals fit the bill.

Universals have also been called on to solve problems in the theory of knowledge. Plato, for instance, said that for us to know something, that which is known must be unchanging. Since material individuals are subject to change, Plato argued, there must be things that don’t change, suitable as objects of genuine knowledge, not just belief. Universals might fit the bill here, too.

Relatedly, some philosophers have argued that we need universals to understand the stable, unchanging laws of nature that govern individuals’ changes. Indeed, it has been argued that a law of nature just is a relation among universals, by which one universal brings about, or necessitates, others.

Our focus in this essay concerns another role for universals, perhaps the most famous one. They are said to answer what seems a very simple question, but which turns out to be one of the most famous and long-standing issues in philosophy. This returns us to the so-called “Problem of Universals.”

c. The Problem of Universals

Often we predicate properties of individuals. When we say that both cherries and rubies are red, for instance, we seem to say individuals share common properties, those that make cherries cherries, those that make rubies rubies, and those that make both red. Predicates are said of many subjects, then, but is there anything in reality to match the linguistic one-over-many? Are there general truths? Is there commonality in nature, in reality; or is commonality imagined and illusory, perhaps a mere product of language? If the latter, how can we accommodate the intuition that it is the world, and not our conventions, that make predications true or false? The Problem of Universals arises when we ask these questions. Attempts to solve this problem divide into three broad strategies: Realism, Nominalism, and Conceptualism. We’ll take these in turn, and consider the pros and cons of each.

2. Versions of Realism

We’ll begin by examining versions of Realism, all of which claim that yes, there are universals; yes, there are truths about the general; yes, there is commonality in nature. Unless we accept universals into our world view, the Realist argues, we will be unable to explain a fundamental and apparent fact, namely, that there is genuine commonality and systematicity in nature. Again, experience suggests that the individuals we encounter share properties with other individuals. Some are red, and some are not; some are blue, and some are not; some are emeralds, and some are not. Realists claim what makes it the case that these individuals seem to share properties is that in fact they do. There is an entity, a universal, present in each of these individuals at once, which in turn explains our right to say that they are qualitatively identical.

a. Extreme Realism

The oldest, and most famous, variant of Realism comes from Plato. Plato’s position is that in order to explain the qualitative identity of distinct individuals, we must accept that there is another entity besides the resembling individuals, an entity we’ve called a universal, and which Plato would call a Form. If two apples, for example, are both red, this is because there is a Form of Red that is able to manifest itself in both those apples at once.

Really there are three different components in this picture. There is the individual, a particular apple; there is the red of that apple – which exists right “in” or with that apple; and finally, there is the Form of Red, which manifests itself in the red of this apple (and of course, the red of other apples). What, then, is the nature of the Form itself, which provides for the bit of red we see in this apple or in that?

On Plato’s view, Forms are immaterial. They are also outside of space and time altogether. They are wholly abstract, we might say. Of course, for the Form of Red to make an individual apple red, the Form must somehow be related to the apple. Plato postulates a relation of participation to meet this need, and speaks of things “participating” in Forms, and getting their qualities by virtue of this relation of participation. One last point about the nature of Forms proves crucial. For the Form of Red to explain or ground the redness of an apple, the Form of Red must itself be red, or so it seems. How could a Form make an apple red, if the Form were not itself red?

As we noted, Plato’s account of generality was the first one, and it has held great appeal ever since. But it is also subject to serious criticisms. Interestingly, one of the most devastating objections to the theory of Forms comes from Plato himself. We will return later to this famous objection, which has come to be known as the Third Man Argument. Because of the power of this argument, many philosophers sympathetic to Realism have looked elsewhere for a solution to the Problem of Universals. We’ll explore one alternative now.

b. Strong Realism

Although the first position is credited to Plato, this next one is widely thought to be inspired by Aristotle. The key in this position is its rejection of independently existing Forms. As we noted in Section 2a., Extreme Realists posit an explanatory triad involving an individual, the quality of this individual, and the Form that grounds the quality of this individual (and that one, and others). Strong Realists, in contrast, resist this triad. When an individual has a quality, there is simply the individual and its quality. No third, independent thing is needed to ground possession of the quality. A universal, on this view, just is the quality that is in this individual and any other qualitatively identical individuals. The universal red, for example, is in this apple, that apple, and all apples that are similarly red. It is not distinct and independent from the individuals that have this color. Because it is a universal it can exist in many places at once. According to Strong Realism, the universal red in my apple is numerically identical to the red in yours; one universal is in two individuals at once. It is wholly present in each place where it exists.

As we’ll see, Strong Realism is immune to the Third Man Argument. It also reduces the strangeness of Realism. We need not have Forms that are abstract, in the sense of being outside of space and time, mysteriously grounding the qualities of material individuals. The Strong Realist’s universals are in space and time, and are able to be in many places at once. Multiple exemplification may be considered strange, but it not as strange as existence outside space and time.

c. Objections to Realism

We turn now to objections. We’ve already seen what might be called the Strangeness Objection. This is the intuition some philosophers have that universals are just too odd-natured to be accepted into our world view. These philosophers typically countenance only what is material, spatiotemporal, and nonrepeatable; and universals just don’t fit the bill. Philosophers who believe in only individuals are known as Nominalists. We’ll return to them later. We should note, however, that there are other versions of Realism in addition to the two we’ve discussed. Medieval philosophers spent much time exploring these issues, and formulated many versions of Realism. This introduction to the Problem of Universals will not explore these other variants, though they too are vulnerable to the objection that closes this section.

Extreme Realism is challenged by the Third Man Argument. Recall the essentials of that position, in particular, what is said about the nature of the Forms. For any given quality had by an individual there is a Form of that quality, one that exists separately from individuals, and also from the quality found in each particular individual. There is the apple, the red of this apple (and the red of that apple), and the Form of Red. By participating in the Form of Red, the apple gets its particular bit of redness. And finally, as we saw, the Form Red must itself be red. Otherwise it couldn’t provide for the redness of the apple. Suppose we now ask, “What explains the red of the Form of Red, which itself, as we said, is red?” Coming to believe in the existence of Forms begins with the urge to explain the redness of apples and other material individuals, but once this step is taken, the Extreme Realist is forced to explain the redness of the Form of Red itself.

To explain the redness of the Form of Red, in Extreme Realist fashion, we will have to say that the Form of Red participates in a Form. After all, a fundamental tenet of Extreme Realism is that possession of a quality always results from participation in a Form. Presumably, a Form cannot participate in itself. Therefore, if the redness of the Form of Red is to be explained, we’ll need to say that the Form of Red participates in a higher-order Form, Red2 . Moreover, participation in Red2 will explain the redness of Red1 only if the higher-order Form, Red2, is itself red. Of course, now we will have to explain the redness of the Form of Red2, and that will require us to introduce yet another Form, in this case, the Form of Red3, which the Form of Red2 participates in to get its redness.

It is clear that this will go on indefinitely. So it seems that we will never have an explanation of why or how the Form of Red is actually red. That means we’ll never be able to explain why our original apple is red. That was what we wanted initially, and so it seems that Plato’s theory is unable to provide an answer. This has led many to reject Plato’s theory. (There is, not surprisingly, a large body of secondary literature which explores whether Plato’s theory can survive this objection and what Plato himself thought about it, since, as we’ve mentioned, it was Plato himself who first raised the objection.)

The Third Man Argument threatens only Extreme Realism. Strong Realists do not rely on independently existing Forms to explain the redness of individuals, and so they need not explain why an independent existent – the Form of Red – is itself red. Instead, Strong Realists can simply note that the universal present in each apple is itself red, and the red of this universal explains the red of each apple, and also their similarity with respect to color.

However, the objection to which we now turn threatens all variants of Realism. This final objection is not so much an argument that Realism is intrinsically flawed, but rather that Realism is unnecessary. A general principle governing many metaphysical debates is that, other things being equal, the fewer types or kinds of entities in one’s ontology, the better. Those opposed to Realism argue that they can meet the explanatory demands we’ve discussed without relying on universals. If qualitative resemblance and identity can be accounted for without universals, and if any other work done with universals can be done as well without them, then, the opponents of Realism argue, we should do without them. We will then have fewer categories in our ontology, which, other things being equal, is to be preferred.

For this reason, opponents of Realism try to solve the Problem of Universals without universals. The question we will track is whether such solutions are in fact adequate. If not, perhaps commitment to universals, however unpalatable, is necessary.

3. Versions of Anti-Realism

We’ll call any proposed solution to the Problem of Universals that doesn’t endorse universals a version of “Anti-Realism”. Anti-Realists divide into two camps: Nominalists and Conceptualists. Nominalists maintain that only individuals exist. They argue that the Problem of Universals can be solved through proper thinking about individuals, and by appeal to nothing more than the natures of, and relations among, individuals. Conceptualists, in contrast, deny that individuals suffice to solve the Problem, but they also resist appealing to mind-independent universals. Instead, qualitative identity and resemblance are explained by reference to concepts or ideas. We will explore this Conceptualist strategy at the conclusion of our discussion of Anti-Realism. First we will survey a range of Nominalist theories.

a. Predicate Nominalism

How can we explain the qualitative identity of distinct individuals without relying on universals? One strategy begins by giving an account of what makes a single individual, which we will call “Tom,” red. A minimal, but perhaps sufficient answer is to say that Tom is red because the predicate “is red” can be truly said of Tom. As for the predicate “is red” itself, it is just a particular string of words on a page (or this screen), or else a string of spoken sounds. Expanding this strategy we get the view that two individuals, say Tom and Bob, are red simply because the linguistic expression, the predicate “is red,” is truly said of both. We account for commonality in nature by reference to individuals—in this case the individuals Bob and Tom, and also linguistic expressions such as the predicate “is red.”

On this view then, all that exist are individuals and words for talking about those individuals. This seems metaphysically innocuous, but many philosophers charge that Predicate Nominalism ignores the Problem of Universals, and does not solve it. Why is it true to say that both Bob and Tom are red, for instance, and not green or blue? What is it about the world, the individuals, that explains why they are that way and not some other way? What explains their similarity? Predicate Nominalists just leave it as a brute fact that some things are red (or blue, or green). More precisely, what they leave brute is the fact that, for any given individual, some predicates correctly apply and others don’t. But when it comes to explaining these facts, Predicate Nominalism will go no further. This refusal to take the Problem of Universals seriously has even landed Predicate Nominalism the label “Ostrich Nominalism.”

b. Resemblance Nominalism

Another Nominalist strategy is to collect individuals into sets based on resemblance relations, and then account for qualitative identity and resemblance by appeal to commonalities of set membership. An individual’s redness, for example, is explained by the fact that it belongs to the set of red things. The fact that two individuals are both red is explained by their both belonging to the same set of red things. A given set, such as the set of red things, is constructed by adding to it individuals that resemble each other more closely than they resemble any nonmembers, that is, the individuals that aren’t red. In this way, Resemblance Nominalists explain individuals’ supposed shared qualities by talking only about resemblance relations. Things that resemble each other belong to a common set. Membership in a certain set defines what it is to have a certain property, and two members of a set can be said to share a property, or be qualitatively identical, in virtue of simply belonging to the same set of resembling individuals.

In the course of trying to account for two distinct properties, however, Resemblance Nominalists can end up constructing the same set twice. If two distinct properties were to pick out the same set, however, this would cause a serious problem. For instance, it is thought that everything that has a heart also has a kidney. If so, the set of individuals constructed for the property “has a heart” will have the same members as the set constructed for the property “has a kidney.” Two sets with the same members are really just one set, not two, by the very definition of “set,” so Resemblance Nominalists are forced to say that having a heart is one and the same property as having a kidney. But that is clearly false.

A second problem for the Resemblance Nominalist arises when we wonder about the method of set construction. Accounting for an individual’s redness requires building a set with that individual and other resembling individuals as members. But, unfortunately for Resemblance Nominalism, some members of the red-set actually turn out to not be red at all. To explain, remember that the construction of the set proceeds by grouping particulars that resemble each other, and, importantly, things can resemble each other in various respects. Our red apple resembles other red apples, red stop signs, and red books, and all those things would thus get into the set. But our red apple also resembles a green apple, of the same type, which isn’t ripe yet. So that green apple would go in the set. Other things, too, will resemble our apple, but not by being red. As such, it seems that Resemblance Nominalism “explains” our individual’s being red by reference to a set containing non-red things, which is just to say it doesn’t explain it at all.

The tempting reply here is, “Sure, the green apple does resemble our red apple, but not in the right way. If you stop building sets with the wrong kinds of resemblance, you won’t let non-red members into the set.” The problem with this reply is that the only way to stop these “bad” resemblances is to include in the set only things that are red. But remember, being red is what the Nominalist is trying to explain in the first place, and so we can’t use being red to guide set construction. To do so would be circular.

A third objection arises when we consider the resemblance relation itself. Resemblance Nominalism cannot succeed without this relation; it bears most of the explanatory load. Arguably, then, the position is committed to the existence of resemblance relations. This seems to generate a serious problem. Individuals resemble one another, of course, but resemblance itself is not an individual. So, if the position is committed to resemblance relations, and if resemblance relations are not individuals, then it seems that Resemblance Nominalism is a misnomer. Upon close inspection, the position looks to be a kind of Realism. Suppose three things (a, b, and c) resemble one another, and belong in the same set. We have three individuals in this case, but what about the instances of resemblance that hold among those individuals? Are they the same kind of resemblance? They had better be, if the previous objection is to be avoided! Resemblance Nominalists, then, need to posit instances of, and kinds of, resemblance, all of which suggests we actually have a universal here—namely, the resemblance relation that holds between a and b, between b and c, and between a and c. If resemblance itself is a universal, Resemblance Nominalists are committed to at least one universal. Perhaps they should make life easier (if not simpler) and let them all in!

The above objections have moved some Nominalists to develop alternative accounts. Many have turned to Trope Nominalism, which we will discuss next. Trope Nominalism is committed to a new kind of entity, tropes. This may seem surprising, since Nominalists insist on ontological simplicity. But while Nominalists allow only individuals into their ontology, this doesn’t preclude explanatory appeals to tropes. For tropes, as we will see, are a class of individuals. Perhaps with this innovation Nominalists will fare better.

c. Trope Nominalism

Though they were known to Medieval philosophers, tropes are relatively new to contemporary metaphysics, and have been called on to address a number of very different philosophical issues, including the Problem of Universals. Trope theory can be understood, somewhat paradoxically, as making properties into particulars. Tropes are a type of individual. While ordinary individuals are qualitatively complex, a trope is qualitatively simple, and is, in fact, a particular property instance. The blue of the sky is a particular trope numerically distinct from the blue-trope of your T-shirt, even if the two tropes are qualitatively identical.

For the tropist, ordinary individual objects can be conceived as bundles or collections of tropes; and an ordinary object, which is a complex particular, has a certain quality in virtue of having, as a member of the complex, a particular trope, which is that particular character. An apple thus is a complex of tropes—a red trope plus an apple-shape trope, plus a sweet trope, plus a crisp trope, and so forth. If the apple is red, that is because there is a red trope, a red individual, that is a member of that bundle or complex. Red is not a property the trope has; rather, the red trope is the red itself. (Instead of treating an ordinary object as nothing more than a bundle of tropes, another option is to treat an individual as a substance that possesses a bundle of tropes. For simplicity, we will set that option aside. Whether an object is, or instead has, a bundle of tropes, the coming points hold.)

Trope Nominalism explains qualitative identity between two distinct ordinary individuals by saying that the first individual has a constituent trope that is qualitatively identical to, but numerically distinct from, a trope had as constituent by the second individual. Two apples are red, for instance, because each has a red trope “in” them, and these tropes themselves are individuals that exactly resemble each other. Importantly, because this is a version of Nominalism, we don’t say the tropes resemble each other because they share a universal. Instead, they simply resemble each other. If we like, we can expand on the claim that red tropes resemble each other by constructing sets of resembling individuals. In this case, we would have a set of red tropes, the members of which resemble each other more closely than they resemble any other tropes. In summary, then, by appeal to qualitatively identical, but numerically distinct tropes, we can explain qualitative similarities among ordinary objects, all without reliance on universals.

How is this better than Resemblance Nominalism? Remember that Resemblance Nominalism was vulnerable because it explained qualitative identity of individuals by reference to sets of resembling individuals. The trouble was that the individuals collected into sets are ordinary objects, ones that have many properties, so they can resemble each other in many ways. For this reason, no noncircular criterion of set construction could exclude members with the wrong property. Tropes, however, have only one property, so if individual tropes are collected into sets, there won’t be members that don’t belong. The set of red tropes will have only red tropes in it. Trope Nominalists can now make unproblematic appeal to “resemblance among individuals.” This has convinced many that Trope Nominalism is a serious contender against Realism.

As well, recall that Resemblance Nominalism faced the charge that only a resemblance universal could account for resemblance relations among individuals. Trope Nominalism has a reply here too. (As always, in any complex philosophical discussion, there are various ways to reply to objections, just as there are many objections. We outline here just one of the ways Trope theories have responded to this objection.) Whereas Resemblance Nominalists seemed forced to countenance a resemblance universal, Trope Nominalists can appeal to resemblance tropes! Should we have, for example, three identical red tropes, then there will be a resemblance relation between a and b, a similar relation between b and c, and a similar relation between a and c. Trope Nominalism can treat each of these resemblances as distinct tropes. When three red tropes are mutually resembling, then, in addition to the red tropes themselves, there are three resemblance tropes. And just as the resemblance among the three red individuals is a basic fact, so too is the resemblance among these resemblance relations. Not all resemblances are alike, of course, but in this case they are. All properties are tropes, and properties include not just ones like “red,” but also ones like “resembles.”

But there are still problems, perhaps, for Trope Nominalism. Recall that we began by wondering how distinct ordinary things could be said to be qualitatively identical without introducing a universal common to both. Tropists instruct us to view ordinary particulars as complexes of tropes, and allow that there can be qualitatively similar but numerically distinct tropes present in different complexes. Qualitative similarity among ordinary objects is explained by the qualitative similarities of their constituent tropes. Finally, the qualitative similarity among distinct tropes is explained by the fact that some (for example, red) tropes resemble each other more closely than other (for example, non-red) tropes. The last point is the crucial one. We are told that it is simply a brute fact that some tropes resemble each other, and that others don’t. That is just the way things are, and there is no further explanation to be given. But tropes were meant to do explanatory work; so, at the level of tropes, we want and expect an account of generality. If trope theories are presented as a solution to the Problem of Universals, they should explain how there can be truths to explain the appearance of generality in reality. What we end up with, though, is brute and ungrounded qualitative identity among distinct tropes. In essence then, the tropist dismisses, but does not solve, a question about the nature of generality, by making generality a brute fact. Unlike Predicate Nominalism, the tropist goes to great lengths to develop a theory, but in the end seems to offer no more explanation of generality. We know that our original objects resemble each other. Why? Because they have tropes that resemble each other. But the latter resemblance is not explained. And so it seems we’ve not gone very far in explaining our original resemblance. What we want is an explanation of qualitative similarity. Accounting for it in terms of qualitative similarity—now at the level of tropes—does no more than relocate the question. The very relation we sought to understand reappears as our answer.

Again, qualitative similarity across ordinary particulars is explained by the relation of qualitative similarity holding among the tropes that constitute those particulars. But that seems either to postpone answering the question, or to answer it by appealing to the very fact we wanted explained. At best, this explanation is unsatisfying; at worst, it is circular. We are left with qualitative identity as a brute, unexplained phenomenon, triggering the reasonable question: What then have we really gained with trope theories?

d. Conceptualism

A final strategy for avoiding universals comes by making generality not a feature of reality, but instead a feature of our minds and the concepts or ideas in minds. Conceptualism thus seeks a third way, as they see it, between the excesses of Realism, and the unilluminating resemblance relations of Nominalism. Because many individuals can fall under the same concept, Conceptualism hopes to accommodate the intuition that qualitative identity and resemblance are grounded in the sharing of something, but in a way that doesn’t appeal to dubious items such as universals. According to this view, individuals a and b are red because the concept of redness applies to both. The concept red is general, not because it denotes a real non-individual, but only because many diverse particulars fall under, or conform to, that concept.

As tidy as this seems, it too suffers from problems. To see this, we need to realize that concepts can be misapplied in some cases, such as when we say of a cat that it is a dog. And misapplied concepts explain nothing deep about generality. Conceptualism’s appeal to concept application must concern only correct concept application. As such, it is fair to ask, “What makes it the case that the concept red is rightly applied to both a and b, but not of some third individual, c?” To treat this fact as brute and inexplicable is to revert to problematic Predicate Nominalism. So it seems the Conceptualist must say that the concept red applies to a and b, but not c, because a and b share a common feature, a feature c lacks. Otherwise, the application of red is unconstrained by the individuals to which it applies. But simply noting that a and b resemble each other isn’t going to help, because that just is the fact we originally sought to explain, put differently. The Conceptualist might now say that a and b share a property. But if this isn’t to amount to a restatement of the original datum, it must now be interpreted as the claim that some entity is in both a and b. That, of course, turns our supposed Conceptualist strategy back into Realism.

Critics say Conceptualism solves no problems on its own. In trying to ground our right to predicate the concept red of a and b, we are driven back to facts about a and b themselves and that leaves Conceptualism as an unstable position. It teeters back and forth between Realism, on the one hand, and Nominalism, on the other.

4. Concluding Thoughts

As with many issues in philosophy, we started with a fairly simple question and found it difficult to reach a satisfactory answer. Qualitative similarity is a seemingly undeniable feature of our experience of the world. And there seems to be every reason to expect an explanation for this common fact. But upon closer inspection we find that we must either accept some rather unusual items into our world view, or go through some fairly elaborate theorizing to reach an answer. And that elaborate theorizing itself seems full of problems.

Perhaps this explains why the Problem of Universals has had such a hold on philosophers for all these years. We sense that there must be an adequate solution to be found, but our failure to find one prods our reason and imagination. Of course, we’ve only skimmed the surface of this debate in this essay, and nearly every move we’ve discussed has been debated, reformulated, argued for and against, analyzed, accepted as obviously true and rejected as obviously false. A consensus does seem to be emerging though, as one of the main contributors to the debate in recent decades has articulated, that two genuine contenders are left: Strong Realism and Trope Nominalism. As always, there is much work to be done on this issue, despite its distinguished heritage. We hope this introduction to the problem has inspired you to seek a new path, to find a flaw in our reasoning, to note what hasn’t been noted before. You might turn out to be the next Plato.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D.M. Universals: An Opinionated Introduction (Boulder: Westview Press, 1989).
    • An excellent survey of nearly every position in the debate over universals, by one of the most important contributors to this century’s version of the debate.
  • Armstrong, D.M. What is a Law of Nature? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).
    • An overview of the debate over the laws of nature, with a defense of univerals as the required elements in an adequate account.
  • Campbell, K. Abstract Particulars (Oxford: Basil Blackwell Ltd., 1990).
    • An important introduction to the theory of tropes, showing the versatility and potential of this metaphysical category.
  • Loux, M. Metaphysics: A Contemporary Introduction (London: Routledge, 1998).
    • Covers foundational debates on a number of areas, with particular attention to the Problem of Universals.
  • Simons, P. “Particulars in Particular Clothing: Three Trope Theories of Substance,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 54 (1994), pp. 553-75.
    • A sophisticated exploration of various trope theories with important proposals for advancing this theory. Reveals the potential power of this position as an alternative to Realism.
  • Spade, P.V. (trans.) Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1994).
    • Indispensable collection of important Medieval texts with useful guides and comments.
  • Vlastos, G., “The Third Man Argument in the Parmenides,” Philosophical Review 63 (1954), pp. 319-49.
    • A landmark article on Plato’s Third Man Argument, one that rekindled widespread interest in Plato’s metaphysics.

Author Information

Mary C. MacLeod
Email: mmacleod@iup.edu
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.


Eric M. Rubenstein
Email: erubenst@iup.edu
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.