The Upaniṣads

The Upaniṣads are ancient texts from India that were composed orally in Sanskrit between about 700 B.C.E. and 300 B.C.E. There are thirteen major Upaniṣads, many of which were likely composed by multiple authors and are comprised of a variety of styles. As part of a larger group of texts, known as the Vedas, the Upaniṣads were composed in a ritual context, yet they mark the beginning of a reasoned enquiry into a number of perennial philosophical questions concerning the nature of being, the nature of the self, the foundation of life, what happens to the self at the time of death, the good life, and ways of interacting with others. As such, the Upaniṣads are often considered to be the fountainhead of the subsequent rich and varied philosophical tradition in India. The Upaniṣads contain some of the oldest discussions about key philosophical terms such as ātman (the self), brahman (ultimate reality), karma, and yoga, as well as saṃsāra (worldly existence), mokṣa (enlightenment), puruṣa (person), and prakṛti (nature)—all of which would continue to be central to the philosophical vocabulary of later traditions. In addition to contributing to the development of a discursive language, the Upaniṣads further frame later philosophical debates by their exploration of a number of means of attaining knowledge, including deduction, comparison, introspection, and debate.

Table of Contents

  1. The Upaniṣads and the Vedas
    1. Main Upaniṣads
    2. Minor Upaniṣads
  2. From Ritual to Philosophy
  3. The Self
  4. Ātman and Brahman
  5. Karma, Saṃsāra, and Mokṣa
  6. Ethics and the Upaniṣads
  7. The Upaniṣads and Hindu Darśanas before Vedānta
  8. The Upaniṣads and Vedānta
  9. The Upaniṣads as Philosophy
  10. The Upaniṣads in the Modern Period
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Upaniṣads and the Vedas

a. Main Upaniṣads

The Upaniṣads are the fourth and final section of a larger group of texts called the Vedas. There are four different collections of Vedic texts, the Ṛgveda, Yajurveda, Sāmaveda, and Atharvaveda, with each of these collections containing four different layers of textual material: the Saṃhitās, Brāhmaṇas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads. Although each of these textual layers has a variety of orientations, the Saṃhitās are known to be largely comprised of  hymns praising gods and the Brāhmaṇas are mostly concerned with describing and explaining Vedic rituals. The Āraṇyakas and Upaniṣads are also firmly rooted in ritual, but with both groups of texts there is an increasing emphasis on understanding the meaning of ritual, while some sections of the Upaniṣads seem to move completely away from the ritual setting into naturalistic and philosophical inquiry about the processes of life and death, the workings of the body, and the nature of reality.

The Vedic Upaniṣads are widely recognized as being composed during two chronological stages. The texts of the first period, which would include the Bṛhadāraṇyaka (BU), Chāndogya (CU), Taittirīya (TU), Aitareya (AU) and Kauṣītakī (KsU), are generally dated between 700 and 500 B.C.E., and are considered to predate the emergence of the so-called heterodox traditions, such as the Buddhists, Jains, and Ājīvikas. Scholarly consensus dates the second stage of Vedic Upaniṣads, which includes the Kena (KeU), Kaṭha (KaU), Īśā (IU), Śvetāśvatara (SU), Praśna (PU), Muṇḍaka (MuU), Māṇḍūkya (MaU), and Maitrī (MtU), between 300-100 B.C.E. (Olivelle 1998: 12-13). The older Upaniṣads are primarily composed in prose, while the later ones tend to be in metrical form, but any individual text may contain a diversity of compositional styles. Additionally, many individual Upaniṣads consist of various types of material, including creation myths, interpretations of ritual actions, lineages of teachers and students, magical formulae, procreation rites, and narratives and dialogues about famous teachers, students, and kings.

The so-called Hindu darśanas—Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā, and Vedānta—do not adhere to the chronology above, as they regard all the Vedic Upaniṣads as śruti, meaning a timeless revealed knowledge. The remaining two Hindu darśanas—Sāṃkhya and Yoga—are usually read as supporting the Vedas.  However, when tracing the historical development of philosophical ideas, it is helpful to note some differences in orientation between the two stages of Upanishadic material. While all the Upaniṣads devote considerable attention to topics such as the self (ātman) and ultimate reality (brahman), as well as assume some version of the karma doctrine, the earlier texts tend to characterize ultimate reality in abstract and impersonal ways, while the later Upaniṣads, particularly the Īśā and Śvetāśvatara, are more theistic in orientation. Meanwhile, the later Upaniṣads explicitly address a number of key topics such as yoga, mokṣa, and saṃsāra, all of which would continue to be central aspects of subsequent Indian philosophy.

b. Minor Upaniṣads

In addition to those affiliated with the Vedas, there are literally hundreds of other texts bearing the name “Upaniṣad.” These texts have been grouped together by scholars according to common themes, such as the Yoga Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on Yoga), the Saṃnyāsa Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on Renunciation), the Śaiva Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on the Hindu God Śiva), and the Vaiṣṇava Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on the Hindu God Viṣṇu) (see Deussen 1980 and Olivelle 1992). The majority of these texts were composed between the 2nd and 15th centuries CE, although texts referred to as  “upaniṣad” have continued to be composed up to the present day. Many of the post-Vedic Upaniṣads further develop core concepts from the Vedic Upaniṣads, such as ātman, brahman, karma, and mokṣa. In addition to a shared conceptual world, the post-Vedic Upaniṣads often quote extensively from the earlier texts and feature many of the same teachers and students, such as Yājñavalkya, Janaka, and Śaunaka.

2. From Ritual to Philosophy

Despite their significant contribution to subsequent Indian philosophical traditions, there has been disagreement about whether or not the Upaniṣads themselves constitute philosophy. Much of this debate depends, of course, on how one defines philosophy. A recurring argument as to why the Upaniṣads might not be considered philosophy is because they do not contain a unified or a systematic position. This, however, largely reflects the composite and fragmented nature of the texts. Rather than being characterized as unsystematic, the diversity of teachings can be better understood when considering the fact that different texts were composed within the context of separate and often competing scholarly traditions or schools (śākhas). Accordingly, the Upaniṣads do not have a unified philosophical system, but rather contain a number of overlapping themes and mutual interests. Nonetheless, there can be considerable uniformity within a particular text or within a group of texts ascribed to the same school, and even more so according to the lessons ascribed to any particular teacher. In addition to the distinct philosophical agendas of different texts, we see different teachers articulate their teachings within the context of competition over recruiting students, securing patronage, and debating with rivals in public contests. With this context in mind, it is not surprising to find various, sometimes conflicting, teachings throughout the texts.

Due to their connection with previous Vedic material, the Upaniṣads generally assume a ritual context, containing many passages that explain the significance of ritual actions or interpret mantras (sacred verses) uttered during the ritual. One of the most prevalent tendencies to continue from the ritual texts is an attempt to identify the underlying connections (bandhus) that exist among different orders of reality. Often these connections were made among three spheres: the cosmos, the body of the sponsor of the ritual (yajamāna), and the ritual grounds—in other words, between the macrocosm, the microcosm, and the ritual. An illustrative example appears at the beginning of the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, where the different body parts of the horse in the sacrifice (aśvamedha) are compared to the different elements, regions, and intervals of time in the cosmos (BU 1.1). The implication is that by reflecting on the relational composition of the horse, one can understand the structure of the universe.

There have been some debates regarding the meaning of the word “upaniṣad,” with the components of the word (upa + ni + sad) suggesting texts that were to be learned ‘sitting down near’ one’s teacher. However, the word is not employed in this way in the texts, nor in existing commentaries. Rather, in its earliest textual contexts, the word “upaniṣad” takes on a meaning similar to bandhu, describing a connection between things, often presented in a hierarchical relationship. In these contexts, upaniṣad is often interpreted as the most essential or most fundamental connection. Moreover, “upaniṣad” designates equivalences between components of different realms of reality that were not considered to be observable by the senses, but remained concealed and obscured, and required special knowledge or understanding. On several occasions, “upaniṣad” means ‘secret teaching’ (that is, CU 1.1.10; 1.13.4; 8.8.4; 4.2.1; 5.5.3-4), a notion that is reinforced by the use of other formulations such as guhyā ādeśā (‘hidden instruction’; BU 3.5.2) and para guhya (‘supreme secret’; KaU 3.17; SU 6.22). In the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, the word “upaniṣad” is equated with the formulation satyasya satyam (BU 2.2.20)—‘the truth behind the truth’— an expression suggesting that an upaniṣad is a truth or reality beyond that which appears to be true.

Whether discussing the essence of life or the source of a king’s power, the Upaniṣads show an interest in establishing a firm foundation or an ontological grounding for different aspects of reality, and ultimately, for reality as a whole. One of the terms most associated with these discussions is brahman. The oldest usages of the word are closely connected with the power of speech, with brahman meaning a truthful utterance or powerful statement. In the Upaniṣads, brahman retains this connection with speech, but also comes to refer to the underlying reality or the ontological foundation. In some passages brahman is associated with truth (TU 1.1), while on other occasions its is linked with immortality (CU 2.23.1) or characterized as a heavenly abode (BU 4.4.7-8).

3. The Self

One of the most widely discussed topics throughout both the early and late Upaniṣads is the self (ātman). The word “ātman” is a reflexive pronoun, likely derived from √an (to breathe). Even in the Ṛgveda (c.1200 B.C.E.), the earliest textual source from ancient India, ātman had already a wide range of lexical meanings, including ‘breath’, ‘spirit’, and ‘body’. By the time of the Upaniṣads, the word was used in a variety of ways, sometimes referring to the material body, but often designating something like an essence, a life-force, consciousness, or ultimate reality.

One of the most well known teachings of ātman appears in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (6.1-16), as the instruction of the brahmin Uddālaka Āruṇi to his son Śvetaketu. Uddālaka begins by explaining that one can know the universal of a material substance from a particular object made of that substance: by means of something made of clay, one can know clay; by means of an ornament made of copper, one can know copper; by means of a nail cutter made of iron, one can know iron. Uddālaka uses these examples to explain that objects are not created from nothing, but rather that creation is a process of transformation from an original being (sat) which emerges into the multiplicity of forms that characterizes our everyday experiences. Uddālaka’s explanation of creation is often assumed to have influenced the satkāryavāda theory—the theory that the effect exists within the cause—which was accepted by the Sāṃkhya, Yoga, and Vedānta darśanas.

Later in his instruction to Śvetaketu, Uddālaka makes a series of inferences from comparisons with empirically observable natural phenomena to explain that the self is a non-material essence present in all living beings. He first uses the example of nectar, collected by bees from different sources, but when gathered together becomes an undifferentiated whole. Similarly, water flowing from different rivers merges together without distinction when reaching the ocean. Uddālaka then asks Śvetaketu to conduct two simple experiments. In the first he instructs his son to cut a banyan fruit, and then the seed within the fruit, only for his son to find that he cannot observe anything inside the seed. Uddālaka compares the fine essence of the seed, which cannot even be seen, to the self. Uddālaka then tells Śvetaketu to place some salt in water. When returning the next day, Śvetaketu cannot see the salt anywhere in the water, but by tasting the water he perceives that it is equally distributed throughout. Uddālaka concludes that, like salt in water, the self is not immediately discernible, but yet permeates the entire body. After each of these comparisons with natural phenomena Uddālaka brings attention back to Śvetaketu, emphasizing that the self operates the same way in him as it does in all living beings. Repeating the phrase ‘you are that’ (tat tvam asi) throughout his discourse, the thrust of Uddālaka’s teaching is that the self is both the essence that connects parts with the whole and the constant that remains the same even while taking on different forms. Thus, he offers an organic understanding of ātman, characterizing the self in terms of the life force that animates all living beings.

Yājñavalkya, the most prominent teacher in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, characterizes ātman more in terms of consciousness than as a life-giving essence. In a debate that pits him against Uddālaka—his senior colleague and, by some accounts, his former teacher (BU 6.3.7; 6.5.3)—Yājñavalkya explains that the self is the inner controller (antaryāmin), present within all sensing and cognizing, yet at the same time distinct (BU 3.7.23). Here, Yājñavalkya characterizes the self as that which has mastery over the otherwise distinct psycho-physical capacities. He goes on to explain that we know the existence of the self through actions of the self, through what the self does, not through our senses—that the self, as consciousness, cannot be an object of consciousness.

Another recurring theme in Yājñavalkya’s discussion with Janaka is that the self is described as consisting of various parts, but not reducible to any (e.g BU 4.4.5; see also TU 2.2.1). Similarly, in a creation myth at the beginning of the Āitareya Upaniṣad, ātman is cast as a creator god, who creates the various elements and bodily functions from himself (ĀU 1.3.11). As with Yājñavalkya’s teaching, in this passage the functions of the body and cognitive capacities are seen to be components of the self and even evidence of the self, but the self cannot be reduced to any particular part. Such examples emphasize that an understanding of the self cannot be attained through observing how the self operates in just one faculty, but by means of observing the self in relation to a number of psycho-physical faculties, and their relationship with each other. In addition to being portrayed as the agent or inner controller (antaryāmin) of sensing and cognizing, the self is characterized as an underlying base or foundation (pratiṣṭha) of all the sense and cognitive faculties. Throughout his teachings Yājñavalkya describes the self as being hidden or behind that which is immediately perceptible, suggesting that the self cannot be known by rational thought or described in conventional language because it can never be the object of thought or knowledge. Here, Yājñavalkya draws attention to the limitations of language, suggesting that because the self cannot be an object of knowledge it cannot have attributes, and therefore can only be described by using negative propositions.

Another prominent teacher of the self is Prajāpati, the creator god of Vedic ritual texts, who is recast in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad as a typically aloof guru, who is reluctant to disseminate his teachings (CU 8.7-12). Similar to Yājñavalkya, Prajāpati conceptualizes the self in terms of consciousness, describing ātman as the agent responsible for sensing and cognizing: ātman is ‘the one who is aware’ (CU 8.12.4-5). However, despite some similarities with Yājñavalkya’s teaching of ātman, Prajāpati seems to reject some of his positions. Prajāpati’s teaching is presented in the context of his instruction to the god Indra, taking place during several episodes over a period of more than one hundred years. In his first teaching Prajāpati defines the self as the material body, and sends Indra away thinking he has learned the true teaching. Before going back to the other gods, however, Indra realizes that this teaching cannot be true, and returns to Prajāpati to learn more. This pattern continues several times, before Prajāpati finally presents ātman as the ‘one who is aware’ of his final and true teaching. One of the teachings that Prajāpati presents as false, or at least as incomplete, is a description of ātman in terms of dreamless sleep, a teaching of the self that Yājñavalkya describes as the ‘highest goal’ and ‘the highest bliss’ in his instruction to King Janaka in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (4.3.32).

Despite the diversity among these teachings, most of the discussions represent a different set of concerns than those found in earlier Vedic texts, with many teachings focusing on the human body and individual person as opposed to the primordial or ideal body, as often discussed in Vedic rituals. Rather than assuming a correspondence between the human body and the universe, some of the teachings about the self in the Upaniṣads begin to show an interest in the fundamental essence of life.

4. Ātman and Brahman

Perhaps the most famous teaching of the self, the identification of ātman and brahman, is delivered by Śāṇḍilya in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad. After describing ātman in various ways, Śāṇḍilya equates ātman with brahman (CU 3.14.4), implying that if one understands brahman as the entire world, and one understands that the self is brahman, then one becomes the entire world at the time of death.

Although Śāṇḍilya’s teaching of ātman and brahman is often considered the central doctrine of the Upaniṣads, it is important to remember that this is not the only characterization either of the self or of ultimate reality. While some teachers, such as Yājñavalkya, also equate ātman with brahman (BU 4.4.5), others, such as Uddālaka Āruṇi, do not make this identification. Indeed, Uddālaka, whose famous phrase tat tvam asi is later taken by Śaṅkara to be a statement of the identity of ātman and brahman, never uses the term “brahman”—neither in his instruction to his son Śvetaketu, nor on any other of his many appearances in the Upaniṣads. Moreover, it is often unclear, even in Śāṇḍilya’s teaching, whether linking ātman with brahman refers to the complete identity of the self and ultimate reality, or if ātman is considered an aspect or quality of brahman. Such debates about how to interpret the teachings of the Upaniṣads have continued throughout the Indian philosophical tradition, and are particularly characteristic of the Vedānta darśana.

Furthermore, while most teachings about brahman assume that the world emerged from one undifferentiated abstract cosmic principle, there are a number of passages explaining creation in terms of a more materialist point of view, describing the world as coming forth from an initial natural element, such as water or air. The Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (5.1), for example, contains a teaching attributed to the son of Kauravyāyanī, depicting brahman as space. This same section of the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (5.5.1) includes a passage describing the world as beginning from water. Similarly, in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (4.3.1-2), Raikva traces the beginning of the world to wind in the cosmic sphere, and breath in the microcosm.

Returning to the self, and keeping in mind later philosophical developments, it is also worth noting that the Upaniṣads often present ātman in ways that contrast with the changeless and inactive descriptions of the self as articulated by traditions such as Sāṃkhya, Yoga, and Advaita Vedānta. As we have seen, the self can be characterized as both active and dynamic: as the inner controller (antaryāmin), the self is depicted as the agent or actor behind all sensing and cognizing faculties (for example, BU 3.7.23); while as a creator god, ātman is cast as a personal deity—closely resembling Prajāpati—from whom all creation emanates (BU 1.4.1; 1.4.17; TU 2.1; AU 1.1).

One feature of the self that is quite consistent throughout the Upaniṣads and continues to be shared by a number of subsequent schools of Hindu philosophy is that knowledge of ātman can lead to some sort of liberation or ultimate freedom. While the Sāṃkhya and Yoga school would conceptualize such emancipation as kaivalya—abstraction, autonomy from nature—and Advaita Vedāntins as freedom from ignorance (avidya),  in the Upaniṣads the ultimate goal achieved through knowledge of the self is primarily freedom from death. Nonetheless, a prominent philosophical strand in the Upaniṣads, particularly in the teachings of Yājñavalkya, is that ātman dwells within the body when it is alive, that ātman, in one way or another, is responsible for the body being alive, and that ātman does not die when the body dies, but rather finds a dwelling place in another body. Such depictions seem to have been a catalyst for or been developed alongside early Buddhist conceptions of selfhood. The Buddhists explicitly rejected any notion of an indivisible and unchanging self, not only introducing the term “not-self” (anātman in Sanskrit; anattā in Pāli) to describe the lack of any fixed essence, but also explaining karmic continuity from one lifetime to the next in terms of the five skandhas—a theory maintaining that what Upanishadic thinkers take to be a unified self is really made of five components, all of which are subject to change.

5. Karma, Saṃsāra, and Mokṣa

Karma (“karman”) is another central concept in the Indian philosophical tradition that finds some of its first philosophical articulations in the Upaniṣads. Literally meaning ‘action’, karma emerges out of a ritual context where it refers to any ritual action, which, if performed correctly, yields beneficial results, but if performed incorrectly, brings about negative consequences. The Upaniṣads do not offer any explicit theory of karma, but do contain a number of teachings that seem to extend the notion of karma beyond the ritual context to more general understandings of moral retribution and of causality. Yājñavalkya, for example, when asked by Ārtabhāga about what happens to a person after death, responds that a person becomes good by good action and bad by bad action (BU 3.2.13). Here and elsewhere, one of Yājñavalkya’s fundamental assumptions is that present actions have consequences in the future and that our present circumstances have been shaped by our past actions. While this law-like character of karma suggests that the consequences of one’s actions shape one’s future, Yājñavalkya does not give any indication that the future is completely determined. Rather, he seems to suggest that one can create good consequences in the future by performing good actions in the present. In other words, Yājñavalkya presents karma more as a theory to promote good actions, than as a fatalistic doctrine in which the future is fixed.

While Yājñavalkya assumes that karma takes place across lifetimes, he does not attempt to explain the mechanisms of rebirth. In the Chāndogya Upaniṣad, however, King Pravāhaṇa Jaivali is more specific about how karma and rebirth operate, describing the link between them in terms of a naturalistic philosophy (CU 5.4-10). In a dialogue that also appears in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (BU 6.2.9-16), but without the explicit connection to karma, Pravāhaṇa discloses the teaching of the five fires (pañcāgnividyā) to Uddālaka Āruṇi. Pravāhaṇa’s instruction describes human life as part of a cycle of regeneration, whereby the essence of life takes on different forms as it passes through different levels of existence: when humans die, they are cremated and travel in the form of smoke to the other world (the first fire), where they become soma; as soma they enter a rain cloud (the second fire) and become rain; as rain they return to earth (the third fire), where they become food; as food they enter man (the fourth fire), where they become semen; as semen they enter a woman (the fifth fire) and become an embryo. According to Pravāhaṇa, those who know the teaching of the five fires follow the path of the gods and enter the world of brahman, but those who do not know this teaching, will follow the path of the ancestors and continue to be reborn.

Pravāhaṇa states that knowledge of the teaching of the five fires will affect the conditions of one’s future births. He explains that people who are pleasant will enter a ‘pleasant womb’ such as the womb of a brahmin, a kṣatriya, or a vaiśya. But that people of foul behavior can expect to enter the womb of a dog, a pig, or an outcaste (CU 5.10.7). In this teaching, Pravāhaṇa demonstrates the link between karma and rebirth by specifying different types of animals (dogs, pigs) and different types of matter (smoke, rain, food, semen) through which karma operates. By implication, karma not only applies to the causes and effects of human actions, but also includes non-human animals and other forms of organic and inorganic matter. Moreover, karma is not directed by a divine being, but rather is described as an independent, natural process. As such, karma is presented as an impersonal moral force that operates throughout the totality of existence, balancing out the consequences of good and bad action. Here, we see that Uddālaka Āruṇi’s teaching implies that everyone’s actions have moral consequences and that all the actions of humans and non-humans are interconnected.

Such discussions linking actions in one lifetime to consequences in a future one would become widely accepted in subsequent philosophical discourse—not only among Hindus, but also by Buddhists and Jains, and, to a certain extent, by the Ājīvikas. In subsequent developments across these traditions, karma would often be conceptualized in terms of intention and much of what we might describe as ethics was to be focused on ways to cultivate a state of mind that would generate positive rather than negative intentions.

Despite the development of ideas about karma, the earliest Upaniṣads generally do not contain the assumption that life is suffering (duḥkha), or illusion (māyā), or ignorance (avidyā)—views that would later dominate discussions of karma and rebirth. Nonetheless, we do see the introduction of the term “saṃsāra” in the comparatively late Kaṭha (3.7) and Śvetāśvatara (6.16) Upaniṣads. Literally meaning, ‘that which turns around forever’, saṃsāra refers to the cycle of birth, life, death, and rebirth. All living creatures, including the gods, are considered to be a part of saṃsāra. Accordingly, death is not considered to be final, and rebirth is an essential aspect of existence.

Closely related to saṃsāra is mokṣa, the concept that one can escape or be released from the endless cycle of repeated births. Similar to saṃsāra, the Upaniṣads do not contain an explicit theory about mokṣa, with the term “mokṣa” only assuming its connotations of liberation in the later texts (that is, SU 6.16). The Hindu darśanas would subsequently consider mokṣa to be a fundamental teaching of all the Upaniṣads, but the texts themselves, particularly the early ones, focus much more attention on securing wealth, status, and power in this lifetime than on describing existence as an endless cycle. They also tend to present life as desirable, and not as a condition from which people need release or escape. One of the most common soteriological goals is immortality, amṛta, which literally means ‘not dying’. The Upaniṣads describe immortality in different ways, including having a long life span, surviving death in the heavenly world, becoming one with the essential being of the universe, and being preserved in the social memory.

6. Ethics and the Upaniṣads

Philosophy in the Upaniṣads does not merely consist of abstract claims about the nature of reality, but is also presented as a way of living one’s life. In Yājñavalkya’s teaching to Janaka, for example, knowledge of ātman is associated with a change in one’s disposition and behavior. As we have seen, karma is characterized as a natural moral process, with knowledge of the self as a way out of that process. In this respect, a fundamental assumption throughout many teachings of the self is that it is untouched by karma. Yājñavalkya teaches Janaka that knowledge of the self is beyond virtuous (kalyāṇa) and evil (pāpa)—that, through knowledge of the self one reaches the world of brahman, where the good or bad actions of one’s life do not follow (BU 4.4.22).

Yājñavalkya explains that in the world of brahman a thief is not a thief, a murderer is not a murderer, an outcaste not an outcaste, a mixed-caste person (paulkasa) is not a mixed-caste person, a renunciate (śramaṇa) is not a renunciate, and an ascetic not an ascetic, that neither the good (puṇya) nor the evil (pāpa) follow him (BU 4.3.22; see also TU 2.9.1). In using these examples Yājñavalkya illustrates the degree to which knowledge of the self is beyond everyday notions of moral behavior. In other words, he seems to be saying that even if one has committed evil deeds, one can still be liberated from karma by means of knowing the self. Yet Yājñavalkya is not suggesting that one can continue to perform ‘evil’ deeds without suffering karmic retribution. Rather, as he asserts later in his discussion with Janaka: when one is knowledgeable, one necessarily acts morally. Yājñavalkya explains that a man who has proper knowledge becomes calm (śānta), restrained (dānta), withdrawn (uparata), patient (titikṣu), and composed (samāhita) (BU 4.4.23). Here Yājñavalkya characterizes knowledge of the self as a change in one’s disposition. In other words, one who is a knower of the self becomes a person of good character and—by definition—would not perform an evil action.

While Yājñavalkya talks about becoming calm, restrained, withdrawn, patient, and composed, these dispositions are not presented as virtues to cultivate for the sake of knowledge, but rather as consequences of knowing ātman. Subsequent texts would devote considerable attention to how one should cultivate oneself in order to achieve the highest knowledge. For example, both the eight-fold path of the Buddhist Nikāyas and the eight limbs in the Yoga Sūtra suggest that one needs to live a moral life in order to achieve true knowledge. In Yājñavalkya’s teaching about ātman, however, there is more attention paid to the objective of knowing the self than the ethical means of controlling the self.

Despite the lack of details about the path to knowledge, Yājñavalkya nevertheless connects  knowledge of ātman with particular practices, explaining to Janaka that brahmins seek to know ātman by means of vedic recitation (vedānuvacana), sacrifice (yajña), gift-giving (dāna), austerity (tapas), and fasting (BU 4.4.22). Yājñavalkya elaborates, claiming that by knowing the self, one becomes a sage (muni), undertaking an ascetic and peripatetic lifestyle (BU 4.4.22). Here, Yājñavalkya implies that those who come to know ātman will become renunciates—that knowledge of the self not only brings about certain dispositions or a certain character, but also provokes a particular lifestyle. Similarly, in the Muṇḍaka Upaniṣad, Aṅgiras teaches Śaunaka that the self can be mastered by means of asceticism and celibacy, among other practices (MU 3.1.5).

With the connection between knowledge and lifestyle, there are notable gender implications of Upanishadic teachings. Yājñavalkya, for example, assumes that the main knowers of the self will be brahmin men, even claiming that through knowledge of the self one can become a brahmin (BU 4.4.23). The word “ātman” is grammatically masculine and teachings of the self are directed specifically towards a male audience and articulated in overtly androcentric metaphors (Black 2007: 135-41). Nonetheless, a number of teachings of the self suggest that true knowledge goes beyond gender distinctions. As we have seen, Uddālaka Āruṇi describes the self as an organic, universal life-force, while Yājñavalkya teaches that one who knows the self will see the self in all living beings (BU 4.4.23). It is also noteworthy that the Upaniṣads depict several women—such as Gārgī and Maitreyī—as participating in philosophical discussions and debates (Black 2007: 48-67; Lindquist 2008).

7. The Upaniṣads and Hindu Darśanas before Vedānta

The influence of the Upaniṣads on the so-called ‘Hindu’ darśanas is more oblique than explicit, with few direct references, yet with many of the dominant terms and concepts seemingly inherited from them. Many of the six main Hindu schools officially recognize the Upaniṣads as a source of philosophy in so far as they recognize śabda as a valid means for attaining knowledge. Śabda literally means ‘word’, but in philosophical discourse it refers to verbal testimony or reliable authority, and is sometimes taken to refer specifically to śruti. Despite the nominal acceptance of śabda as a pramāṇa, however, the Upaniṣads are only cited occasionally in the surviving texts, and rarely as a source to validate fundamental arguments, before the emergence of the Vedānta school in the 7th century.

Notably, the Upanishadic notion of self—as a spiritual essence separate from the physical body—is generally accepted by the classical Hindu philosophical schools. The Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā darśanas, for example, which do not cite the Upaniṣads to prove its existence, nevertheless describe the self as an immaterial substance that resides in and acts through the body. In addition to conceptual similarities with certain passages from the Upaniṣads, both schools seem to consider the Upaniṣads as texts that specialize in the self. The Nyāya philosopher Vātsyāyana (c. 350-450 C.E.), for instance, characterizes the Upaniṣads as dealing with the self.

Similarly, the early texts of the Sāṃkhya and Yoga darśanas do not refer to the Upaniṣads when making their fundamental arguments, but do seem to inherit much of their terminology, as well as some of their views, from them. At the beginning of Uddālaka Āruṇi’s instruction to Śvetaketu in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (6.2-5), for instance, he describes existence (sat) as consisting of three forms (rūpas): fire (red), water (white), and food (black)—a scheme that closely resembles the later Sāṃkhya doctrine of prakṛti and the three guṇas. The Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad (4.5), the oldest extant text to use the word “sāṃkhya” (5.2), seems to build on Uddālaka’s three-fold scheme when describing the unborn as red, white, and black. Also, a number of core terms in Sāṃkhya philosophy first appear in the Upaniṣads, such as ahaṃkāra (CU 7.25.1) and the tattvas (BU 4.5.12), while some passages contain groups of terms appearing together in ways that are similar to how they appear in later Sāṃkhya texts: the Kaṭha Upaniṣad (3.10-11), for example, lists a hierarchy of principles including person (puruṣa), discernment (buddhi), mind (manas), and the sense capacities (indriyas).

A number of details about the practice of yoga, which would become more systematized by the Yoga darśana, are also first found in the Upaniṣads. The Kaṭha (3.3-13; 6.7-11) and Śvetāśvatara (2.8-11) Upaniṣads both contain some of the earliest descriptions of exercises for controlling the senses, breathing techniques, and bodily postures, with the Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad (for example, 2.15-17) making explicit connections between yogic practice and union with a personal god—a connection that would be of central importance in the Yoga darśana. The Maitrī Upaniṣad (6-7) has the most extensive and systematic discussion of yoga in the Upaniṣads, containing a number of parallels with the Yoga Sūtra.

In addition to employing terms and concepts from the Upaniṣads, there are occasions when classical Indian philosophers refer to the Upaniṣads directly. Vātsyāyana, of the Nyāya school, quotes passages from the Bṛhadāraṇyaka and Chāndogya Upaniṣads when discussing mokṣa, the means of attaining it, and the stages of life. Additionally, the grammarian Patañjali (c.150 B.C.E.) argues that the study of grammar is useful for a correct understanding of passages from the Upaniṣads, and thus for attaining mokṣa.

Such examples indicate that the philosophers of classical Hindu philosophy knew the Upaniṣads quite well and would dip into the texts from time to time to provide an analogy or, occasionally, to support one of their arguments. However, the early surviving texts of the Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā, Sāṃkhya, and Yoga schools do not tend to use the Upaniṣads to validate their core positions. The Vaiśeṣika Sūtra (3.2.8), for example, agrees that the self is discussed in the Upaniṣads, but then argues that the proof of the existence of the self should not be established exclusively by means of śruti, but also can be determined through inference. Additionally, none of the early schools produced a commentary on the Upaniṣads, nor did any of them aim to offer an interpretation on the Upaniṣads as a whole. As such, the Upaniṣads provided a general philosophical framework, as well as serving as a repository for terms and analogies, but none of the early schools claimed the texts for themselves.

An interesting illustration of this point is that competing schools would sometimes recognize that their rival’s positions were also to be found in the Upaniṣads. The Nyāya philosopher Jayanta Bhaṭṭa even finds the positions of the heterodox Lokāyata darśana, or Materialist school, in the Upaniṣads. In the context of criticizing the validity of śabda as a pramāṇa, Bhaṭṭa argues that if śabda were a valid means for establishing knowledge, then even the doctrines of the Lokāyatas must be true, because their doctrines can be found in the Upaniṣads. Due to a lack of sources from the Lokāyata school, we do not know if they ever referred to the Upaniṣads in their own texts, but Bhaṭṭa’s argument is illustrative of a general reluctance of most of the early schools to put too much stake in śruti as a means of knowledge. His comments are also an acknowledgement that the Upaniṣads contain a variety of viewpoints.

8. The Upaniṣads and Vedānta

The oldest surviving systematic interpretation of the Upaniṣads is the Brahma Sūtra (200 B.C.E.—200 C.E.), attributed to Bādarāyaṇa. Although technically not a commentary (that is, it is a sūtra rather than a bhāṣya), the Brahma Sūtra is an explanation of the philosophy of the Upaniṣads, treating the texts as the source for knowledge about brahman. Despite being considered a Vedānta text, the Brahma Sūtra (a.k.a. Vedānta Sūtra) was composed centuries before the establishment of Vedānta as a philosophical school. The Brahma Sūtra uses the Upaniṣads to refute the position of dualism, as put forth by the Sāṃkhya school. Like Śaṅkara does later, the Brahma Sūtra (1.1.3-4) states that śruti is the source of all knowledge about brahman. Additionally, the Brahma Sūtra maintains that mokṣa is the ultimate goal as opposed to action or sacrifice.

Centuries later, the Vedānta darśana was the first philosophical school to attempt to present the Upaniṣads as holding a unified philosophical position. Vedānta means ‘end of the Vedas’ and is often used to refer specifically to the Upaniṣads. The school divides the Vedas into two sections: karmakānda, the section of spiritual exegesis (consisting of the Saṃhitās and the Brāhmaṇas), and jñānakānda, the section of knowledge (consisting of the Upaniṣads, and to a certain extent, the Āraṇyakas). According to the Vedānta school, the ritual section contains detailed instructions of how to perform the rituals, whereas the Upaniṣads contain transcendent knowledge for the sake of achieving mokṣa. There are three main branches of the Vedānta school: Advaita Vedānta, Viśiṣtādvaita Vedānta, and Dvaita Vedānta. Although these branches would put forth distinct philosophical positions, they all took śabda as the exclusive means to knowledge about its central doctrines and considered the Upaniṣads, the Brahma Sūtra, and Bhagavad Gītā as its core texts (prasthānatraya). Despite disagreeing with each other, all three of the most well known philosophers of the Vedānta school—Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja, and Madhva—wrote commentaries on the Upaniṣads, presenting them as having a single, and consistent philosophical position.

The most well-known philosopher of the Vedānta school was Śaṅkara (c. 700 C.E.), whose interpretations of the Upaniṣads made a major impact on the Indian philosophical tradition in the centuries after his lifetime and continued to dominate readings of the texts throughout the 19th and early 20th centuries. Śaṅkara was the main proponent of Advaita Vedānta, which put forth a position of non-dualism. According to Śaṅkara the fundamental teaching of the Upaniṣads is that ātman and brahman are one and the same.

For Śaṅkara, the Upaniṣads are not merely sources to back up his claims, but they also provide him with techniques for making his arguments. Śaṅkara takes the Upaniṣads as outlining methods for their own interpretation, following a number of literary criteria as clues for how to read the texts (Hirst 2005: 59-64). Consequently, even when he uses examples not found in the Upaniṣads, Śaṅkara can maintain that his arguments are based on scripture, for as long as he argues in the same way that the Upaniṣads do,  he can claim that his arguments are based on his sources.

Despite the significance of Śaṅkara’s philosophy, it is important to note that his interpretation of the Upaniṣads was not the only one accepted by philosophers of the Vedānta school. Rāmānuja (c. 1000 C.E.), the main proponent of a form of Vedānta known as Viśiṣtādvaita, or qualified non-dualism, used the Upaniṣads to argue that ātman is not identical with brahman, but an aspect of brahman. Rāmānuja also found in the Upaniṣads a source for bhakti, as he identified the Upanishadic brahman with God. Two centuries later, Madhva (c. 1200 C.E.) used the Upaniṣads as a source for a dualist branch of the school, known as Dvaita Vedānta. Madhva interpreted brahman as an infinite and independent God, with the self as finite and dependent. As such, ātman is dependent upon brahman, but they are not exactly the same.

It is well known that the Vedānta school became extremely influential in shaping subsequent philosophical debates, and we may conjecture that the tendency for various Vedānta philosophers to use the Upaniṣads in support of their own positions, as well as in their criticisms of rival schools, prompted other schools to engage with the Upaniṣads more closely. This is illustrated by the fact that schools such as Nyāya and Sāṃkhya, which previously seem to have relied very little on the Upaniṣads, began invoking them to counter the claims of Advaita Vedānta.

The Nyāya philosopher Bhāsarvajña (c. 850-950 CE), for example, quotes some verses from the Upaniṣads to support his position of a distinction between the ordinary and supreme sense of self when arguing with the Advaita position of non-dualism. Another Nyāya philosopher, Gaṅgeśa (c. 1300 C.E.), seems to be quoting from the Upaniṣads to back up the claim that karmic retribution is not binding for those who know the self—a position stated by Yājñavalkya (BU 4.4.23). Moreover, a number of Sāṃkhya and Yoga philosophers use the Upaniṣads in an attempt to make their schools more compatible with Vedānta. The Sāṃkhya philosopher Nāgeśa (c. 1700-1750), for example, draws from the Upaniṣads—as well as the other two source texts of the Vedānta school, the Bhagavad Gītā and Brahma Sūtra—to argue that the Vedānta and Sāṃkhya schools do not contradict each other. This trend can also be found in the Sāṃkhyasūtra (c. 1400-1500 C.E.), which argues that the identification of brahman and ātman was a qualitative identity, but not a numerical one—seemingly defending Sāṃkhya against Śaṅkara’s criticism that the Sāṃkhya doctrine of multiple selves contradicts the Upaniṣads. Interestingly, this argument suggests that Sāṃkhya philosophers not only felt the need to show that their positions did not contradict the Upaniṣads, but also that they basically accepted the Advaita Vedānta reading of the Upaniṣads.

9. The Upaniṣads as Philosophy

As noted above, many of the Upaniṣads are composite and fragmented, and therefore lacking a coherent philosophical position. Moreover, the teachers portrayed in the Upaniṣads do not seem to make linear arguments that start with premises and build to larger conclusions, but rather tend to make points through analogies and metaphors, with many core ideas presented as truths or insights known to particular teachers, not as logical propositions that can be independently verified. Nonetheless, in a number of sections of the texts, there appear to be implicit philosophical methods in place.. We have already noted that Yājñavalkya’s discussion of the self is based on a reflective introspection (see also MuU 3.1.8-9). The early Upaniṣads do not contain passages explicitly articulating method, but with the development of yoga and meditation in the later texts, introspection begins to be formalized as a philosophical mode of enquiry.  Also, many of Uddālaka Āruṇi’s descriptions of ātman are derived from his observations of the natural world.

In addition to providing a repository of terms, concepts, and, to a certain degree, philosophical methods, from which subsequent philosophical schools would draw, the Upaniṣads were also influential in the development of the practice of debates, which would become the defining social practice of Indian philosophy. Although the texts do not discuss debate reflectively, a number of the most important teachings are articulated within the context of discussions between teachers and students, and verbal disputes among rival brahmins. In some dialogues, there is a dialectical relationship between the arguments of competing interlocutors, indicating that the dialogical presentation of teachings was a way of formulating philosophical rhetoric (Black 2015). In this way, debate is another way by which the Upaniṣads extend ideas first articulated in the context of the Vedic ritual into a more philosophical discourse.

10. The Upaniṣads in the Modern Period

The Upaniṣads are some of the most well-known Indian sources outside of India. Their first known translation into a non-Indian language was initiated by the Mughal prince Dārā Shūkōh, son of the emperor Shah Jahan. This Persian translation, known as the Sirr-i Akbar (the Great Secret), consisted of fifty texts, including the Vedic upaniṣads, many of the yoga, renunciate, and devotional upaniṣads, as well as other texts, such as the Puruṣa Sūkta hymn of the Ṛgveda and some material from unidentified sources. Dārā Shūkōh considered the Upaniṣads to be the sources of Indian monotheism and he was convinced that the Koran itself referred to the Upaniṣads.

Henry Thomas Colebrooke’s translation of the Aitareya Upaniṣads in 1805 was the first rendering of an upaniṣad into English. Rammohan Roy subsequently translated the Kena, Īśā, Kāṭha, and Muṇḍaka Upaniṣads into English, while his Bengali translation of the Kena Upaniṣad in 1816 was the first rendering of an upaniṣad into a modern Indian language.

Roy used the introductions of his translations into both Bengali and English to promote the reformation of Hinduism, endorsing the values of reason and religious tolerance, while criticizing practices such as idolatry and caste hierarchy. Roy felt that contemporary religion in India was in decline and hoped that his translations could provide Hindus with direct access to what he considered to be the true doctrines of Hinduism. The Upaniṣads first reached Europe in the modern period through the French philologist Abraham Hyacinthe Anquetil-Dupperon’s translation of the Sirr-i Akbar into Latin, which was published in 1804. It was Anquetil-Dupperon’s text, known as the Oupnek’hat. which was read by the German philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer, the first major European thinker to engage explicitly with Indian sources. Schopenhauer considered the Upaniṣads, Plato, and Kant to be the three major influences on his work and is known to have kept a copy of Anquetil-Dupperon’s translation by his bedside table, reflecting that the Upaniṣads were his consolation in life and would equally be his consolation in death.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Buitenen, J. A. B. van, tr. 1962. The Maitrāyaṇīya Upaniṣad: A Critical Essay with Text. Translation & Commentary. The Hague: Mouton & Co.
  • Deussen, Paul, tr. 1980 (originally published in 1897). Sixty Upaniṣads of the Veda, translated by V. M. Bedekar and G. B. Palsule. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Eggeling, Julius, tr. 1994 (originally published in 1882-97). Śatapatha Brāhmaṇa, Vols. 12, 26, 41, 43 and 44 (5 parts of the Sacred Books of the East; Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass).
  • Hume, Robert, tr. 1975 (originally published in 1921). The Thirteen Principal Upanishads. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Keith, A. B., tr. 1995 (originally published in 1909). Aitareya Āraṇyaka. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Müller, F. Max, tr. 2000 (originally published in 1897). The Upanishads Parts 1-2. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1992. Saṃnyāsa Upaniṣads. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1996. The Upaniṣads. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1998. The Early Upaniṣads: Annotated Text and Translation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Oertel, H., tr. 1897. ‘The Jaiminīya or Talavakāra Upaniṣad Brāhmaṇa’. Journal of the American Oriental Society 16: 79-260.
  • Radhakrishnan, Sarvepalli, tr. 1992 (originally published in 1953). The Principal Upaniṣads. New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Roebuck, Valerie, tr. 2004. Upaniṣads. Harmondsworth: Penguin.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Black, Brian. 2007. The Character of the Self in Ancient India: Priests, Kings, and Women in the early Upaniṣads. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Black, Brian. 2011. “Ambaṭṭha and Śvetaketu: Literary Connections between the Upaniṣads and Early Buddhist Narratives.” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, Vol. 79, No. 1: 136–161
  • Black, Brian. 2011. “The Rhetoric of Secrecy in the Upaniṣads.” Essays in Honor of Patrick Olivelle, edited by Steven Lindquist. Florence: Florence University Press: 101-125.
  • Black, Brian 2015. “Dialogue and Difference: Encountering the Other in Indian Religious and Philosophical Sources.” Dialogue in Early South Asian Religions: Hindu, Buddhist, and Jain Traditions, edited by Brian Black and Laurie Patton Farnham, UK: Ashgate: pp. 243-257.
  • Brereton, Joel. 1990. “The Upanishads.” Approaches to the Asian Classics, edited by Wm. T. de Bary and I. Bloom. New York: Columbia University: 115-135.
  • Cohen, Signe. 2008. Text and Authority in the Older Upaniṣads. Leiden: Brill.
  • Deussen, Paul. 2000 (originally published 1919). The Philosophy of the Upanishads. Delhi: Oriental Publishers.
  • Ganeri, Jonardon. 2007. The Concealed Art of the Soul: Theories of Self and Practices of Truth in Indian Ethics and Epistemology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hirst, J. G. Suthren. 2005. Śaṃkara’s Advaita Vedānta: A Way of Teaching, London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Killingley, Dermot. 1997. “The Paths of the Dead and the Five Fires.” Indian Insights: Buddhism, Brahmanism and Bhakti: Papers from the Annual Spalding Symposium on Indian Religions, edited by Peter Connolly and Sue Hamilton. London: Luzac Oriental.
  • Lindquist, Steven. 2008. “Gender at Janaka’s  Court: Women in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad Reconsidered.” Journal of Indian Philosophy. Vol. 36, No. 3: 405-426.
  • Lindquist, Steven. 2011. “Literary Lives and a Literal Death: Yājñavalkya, Śākalya, and an Upaniṣadic Death Sentence.” Journal of the American Academy of Religion. Vol. 79, No. 1: 33-57.
  • Olivelle, Patrick. 1999. “Young Śvetaketu: A Literary Study of an Upaniṣadic Story.” Journal of the American Oriental Society. Vol. 119, No.1: 46-70.
  • Olivelle, Patrick. 2009. “Upaniṣads and Āraṇyakas.” Brill’s Encyclopaedia of Hinduism, edited by Knut Jacobsen. Leiden: Brill 41-55.
  • Olivelle, Patrick. 2012. “Kings, Ascetics and Brahmins: the Socio-Political Context of Ancient Indian Religions.” Dynamics in the History of Religions between Asia and Europe, edited by Volkhard Krech and Marion Steinicke. Leiden: Brill: 117-136.
  • Patton, Laurie. 2004. “Veda and Upaniṣad.” The Hindu World, edited by Sushil Mittal and Gene Thursby. London: Routledge: 37-51.
  • Thapar, Romila. 1993. “Sacrifice, Surplus, and the Soul.” History of Religions. Vol. 33, No. 4: 305-324.
  • Witzel, Michael. 2003. “Vedas and Upaniṣads.” The Blackwell Companion to Hinduism, edited by Gavin Flood. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing: 68-98.


Author Information

Brian Black
Lancaster University
United Kingdom