The Value of Art
Philosophical discourse concerning the value of art is a discourse concerning what makes an artwork valuable qua its being an artwork. Whereas the concern of the critic is what makes the artwork a good artwork, the question for the aesthetician is why it is a good artwork. When we refer to a work’s value qua art, we mean those elements of it that contribute to or detract from that work’s value considered as an artwork. In this way, we aim to exclude those things that are valuable or useful about an artwork, such as a sculpture’s being a good doorstop, but that are not relevant for assessment in artistic terms. Philosophers of art, then, attempt to justify for the critic the categories or determinants with which they can make an appropriate and successful appraisal of an artwork.
What persons consider to be valuable about artworks has often tracked what they take artworks to be. In the humble beginnings of the artwork, artworks were taken to be accurate representations of the world or to be a beautiful, skillful creation that may also have served religious or political functions. Towards the eighteenth century, in light of Baumgarten’s introduction of the term aesthetics, alongside Hume’s and Kant’s treatises, the artwork’s definition and value moved toward the domains of aesthetic experience and judgments of beauty. Autonomy became desired, and political or moral commentary was supposedly inimical to value qua art. Contemporary art has pushed back against these boundaries—with social, ethical, political messages and criticism being drawn back into our artistic assessments.
Different artworks manifest different kinds of composite values. The philosopher of art’s task is to examine which values can appropriately be considered determinants of artistic value and, subsequently, what the value of art might be beyond these determinants. There is substantial disagreement about which, and how, determinants affect artistic value. Consequently, there is a vast catalogue of positions to which aestheticians subscribe, and the terminology can make it difficult to know who is talking about what. To provide some clarity to the reader in navigating this terminology and discourse, the end of this article includes an alphabetized summary of those positions. The various positions are cashed out in reference to mainly visual art, with some treatment of literature. Although some positions are easily transferred to other forms of art, some are not.
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Artistic Value
- The (Im-)Moral Value of Art
- The Cognitive Value of Art
- The Political Value of Art
- Summary of Available Positions and Accounts
- References and Further Reading
From the outset it should be clear that, when discussing the value of art in philosophical terms, we are not talking about the money one is willing to exchange for purchase of an artwork. In fact, this points to a rather peculiar feature about the value of art insofar as it is not a kind of quantifiable value as is, say, monetary value. If a dealer were to ask what the value of an artwork is, we could give them a particular (albeit negotiable) sum, a quantity, something we can pick out. Philosophically, it does not look like the value of art operates in the same way. Rather, artistic value just appears to be how good or bad something is as art. So, for the dealer, Da Vinci’s Salvator Mundi (1500) might be more valuable than Manet’s Spring (1881) simply because it has attracted more money at auction. In the way we’re using artistic value, however, Spring could be a better artwork than Salvator Mundi for a variety of reasons, thus having greater artistic value. Of course, there may be (quite significant) correlation between monetary and artistic value – at least, one would hope there is.
Recent work by Louise Hanson (2013, 2017) on the nature of artistic value is informative here. To capture that artistic value is not the same kind of value that other values, such as monetary, moral, or aesthetic values are, Hanson presents the analogy relating to the university category mistake. Consider your friend is giving you a tour of the University of Liverpool, showing you the sports centre, the philosophy department, the various libraries, introduces you to faculty and students, the pro-vice chancellors, and so on. Eventually, she finishes the tour and you ask, “OK, all those things are great, but where is the university?” In this case, you’re making a category mistake; there is nothing over, above, or beyond, the composite entities that your friend has shown you that constitutes the university (see Ryle, 1949/2009, p. 6 on category mistakes). The same thing is happening with artistic value, Hanson thinks. Artistic value is just a term we use to talk about something’s goodness or badness as art, and it is something comprised of (a number of) different determinant kinds of value, such as aesthetic, moral, cognitive, and political value.
In this way, artistic value is attributive goodness. It is just how good or bad something is in the category of artworks or, as philosophers like to say, qua art. Accordingly, in order for something to have artistic value, it must be an artwork; something that is not in the category of artworks cannot have artistic value if artistic value is the value (goodness) something has as art. Artistic value, then, is something all and only artworks have to the extent that they are good or bad artworks. Moreover, the assessment of artistic value constrains itself to the domain of artistic relevance: something might be good, but it does not necessarily follow that it is a good artwork. Conversely, something might be a good artwork, but not good simpliciter. That is, Nabokov’s Lolita might be a good artwork, it has high artistic value, but it is not good simpliciter. It might also make for a good coffee mug coaster, and so is good as coffee-mug-coaster, but this does not have bearing on its goodness as art. The reasons for assessing something as having high artistic value must be relevant to the category ‘artworks’, and so not all things valuable about an artwork are things that contribute to its artistic value.
Given art’s intimate tie to the aesthetic, a good place to start the inquiry into the value of art appears to be aesthetic value. We are concerned in this subsection with the nature of aesthetic value and what it is as a kind of value, whereas in 1.a.ii we will examine the contentious question concerning the relationship between aesthetic and artistic value, such as whether these are one and the same value. In terms of the value of art, that question is the most important for our purposes. However, in order to answer it, we need to get a hold on what aesthetic value actually is. So, what is aesthetic value? Many agree that this question actually involves two subsidiary questions: first, what makes aesthetic value aesthetic and, second, what makes aesthetic value a value? The former has been referred to as the demarcation or aesthetic question, the latter as the normative question, terminology that originates in Lopes (2018; see specifically pp. 41-43 for the proposing of the questions, and pp. 43-50 for a brief discussion of them) and adopted by subsequent work in philosophical aesthetics (e.g., Shelley, 2019 and Van der Berg, 2019 both provide assessments in terms of these questions). To be specific, the aesthetic question asks us why some merits are distinctively aesthetic merits instead of some other kind of merit, whilst the normative question asks what makes that value reason-giving: how does it “lend weight to what an agent aesthetically should do?” (Lopes, 2018, p. 42).
One possible, and popular, answer is that aesthetic value is co-extensive with, or has its roots within, the aesthetic experience, a certain kind of pleasure derived from experiencing an aesthetic phenomenon. This is known as aesthetic hedonism. As Van der Berg suggests, the theory enjoys “a generous share of intuitive plausibility” (2019, p. 1). Given that we are likely to pursue pleasurable things, aesthetic hedonism provides a plausible answer to the normative question because we do value seeking out pleasurable experiences. What makes the pleasure aesthetic, however, is murkier territory. The aesthetic hedonist needs to provide an account of what makes the pleasure found in aesthetic experiences a distinctively aesthetic pleasure, rather than just pleasure we might find, say, when we finish writing our last graduate school paper.
What makes an aesthetic experience an aesthetic experience can be answered through two main routes: it’s either the content of the experience, or the way something is experienced. Carroll (2015) refers to the former as content approaches, himself endorsing such an approach, and the latter as valuing approaches. The content approach suggests that what the experience is directed towards, the “one or a combination of features” that are aesthetic features, makes the experience aesthetic (Carroll, 2015, p. 172). As Carroll suggests, the view is relatively straightforward, and so obtains the benefit of parsimony. All experiences have content and so, insofar as it is an experience, an aesthetic experience has content. The best explanation for an aesthetic experience’s being an aesthetic experience should derive, therefore, from its content, that is, aesthetic properties. The view also aligns with our intuitions. What we find valuable about aesthetic phenomena is how they look, their aesthetic properties as gestalts of formal and perceptible properties. These are the content of, and give rise to, the kind of experience we have in response to them. Aesthetic value, then, becomes wrapped up with the aesthetic experience which, in turn, is wrapped up with the formal, perceptual properties of the work; aesthetic properties. Couching the value in terms of aesthetic properties carries the advantage of explaining the aesthetic value of non-artistic, but nonetheless aesthetic, phenomena such as nature and mathematical or scientific formulae. We often refer to sunsets and landscapes as beautiful or dull. Likewise, we might attribute an attractive symmetry to a certain equation, or an enchanting simplicity to the proof of an otherwise complex theorem. As the content theory answers the aesthetic question by pointing to the experience’s content – aesthetic properties – scientific and mathematical formulae with aesthetic properties can invite aesthetic experiences.
One relatively significant objection to this, however, is that Carroll maintains a narrow approach to the concept of the aesthetic. That is, he bases aesthetic properties on formal, perceptible properties that give rise to the content of the work. Goldman criticizes this and instead endorses a broad notion of the aesthetic to include moral, political, and cognitive concerns. If our aesthetic experiences take on regard to these sorts of features, and their pleasurable nature is affected as such, then it looks like Carroll’s view is too narrow. Indeed, this kind of objection is leveled against those that think aesthetic value and artistic value are one and the same thing as we shall see later. It looks like we value art for more than just formal and perceptible properties; we say artworks can teach us, that they can provide moral commentary, and so on. That being said, if one does not commit to aesthetic value and artistic value’s identity, then that aesthetic experiences are characterized by their content as formal and perceptible properties looks convincing when one remembers we have aesthetic experiences of not just artworks, but also everyday phenomena including nature. Aesthetic value, therefore, needn’t include moral and cognitive concerns if it is also ascribed to things that are not artworks.
Valuing approaches, by contrast, vary in what they are committed to, but broadly-speaking suggest that aesthetic experiences have a particular character (that doesn’t necessarily rely on their content). This character is distinct from any other experience we might have, and so is unique to the aesthetic (thus answering the aesthetic question). They might be, for example, experiences ‘for their own sake’, or those that are emotionally rewarding on their own, without recourse to further utility, gain, or ends. The main task here is to account for how we get to an experience valued for its own sake, without necessarily referencing content, and in a way that can distinguish aesthetic pleasure from other, perhaps lesser, pleasures.
We can take a historical turn here: in his third Critique, Kant (1987) introduces the notion of disinterestedness to carve out the distinctive character of aesthetic experiences and judgements of beauty. Disinterestedness refers to the abstraction of ‘concepts’ in our judgement and experience of beautiful things. That is, when we view things aesthetically, we remove all constraints regarding what the thing is, how it is supposed to function, whether it makes any moral, political, or social claims, our own personal emotional states, and so on. A judgement of aesthetic value must also demarcate itself from ‘mere agreeableness’, which is perhaps the kind of aforementioned pleasure we have in submitting our final graduate school paper. Kant thinks this unique pleasure arises from our state of disinterestedness leading to the ‘free play’ of the imagination and understanding (see Kant, 1987, §1-§22; in contemporary aesthetics, the notion of disinterestedness has had greater uptake than the claim of ‘free play’). Something’s aesthetic value, on this account, is tied to the value of the experience we have of it without any instrumental, utilitarian, moral, or overall ‘conceptual’ concerns.
The notion of disinterestedness has sparked a lively scholarship, not least because it appears to give rise to a contradiction in Kant’s own Critique. After suggesting that judgements of beauty (perhaps, judgements of aesthetic value in contemporary terms) employ no concepts, therefore subscribing to disinterestedness, he also suggests that a species of beautiful judgements, termed dependent beauty, are in fact made with reference to concepts (see Kant, 1987, pp. §16). Additional scholarship has attempted to refine or recalibrate the notion of disinterestedness, specifically with regard to what the aesthetic attitude entails. For example, Stolnitz (1960, 1978) suggests that the aesthetic attitude, which allows us to make perceptual contact with something in order to retrieve an aesthetic experience, is encompassed by disinterested and sympathetic attention to the object for its own sake. Bullough (1912), likewise, invokes a kind of distancing to access the aesthetic experience: over-distance and you’ll be too removed to gain the pleasure, under-distance and you’ll be too involved. The aesthetic question is answered thus: what makes aesthetic value aesthetic is that it is derived from a pleasurable experience of something to which we have adopted the aesthetic attitude.
On these kinds of views, then, aesthetic value is co-extensive with the pleasurable, aesthetic experience gained from perceiving an artwork (or other phenomenon), in virtue of some particular mode of attending. However, the notion of the aesthetic attitude has received substantial criticism in general (Dickie, 1964, is the canonical instigator of such criticism). For example, it is questionable whether we really do alter our attention to things in a special way, that goes beyond merely paying attention or not paying attention, in order to gather an aesthetic experience (Dickie, 1964). At least, it’s not something we’re aware of: I don’t enter an art gallery and, prior to looking at any artworks, undergo some attentional ritual that is regarded as “adopting the aesthetic attitude”. Additionally, aesthetic attitude theory appears to render most anything a source of an aesthetic experience: if it’s down to me what I attend to in this peculiar way, then it’s down to me what can be the source of an aesthetic experience. If this is the case, and aesthetic value is proportionate to the quality of the aesthetic experience, then aesthetic value doesn’t appear all that unique; anything could give us an aesthetic experience. Moreover, the particularized views, and those derivative, of Stolnitz (1960, 1978) and Bullough (1912) have been subject to much discourse. For example, some think that Stolnitz’s (1960) notion of sympathetic disinterested attention is paradoxical. Being sympathetic to the object requires we have some idea of what the thing is and what it’s for, but disinterestedness defies this.
Most aestheticians are keen to carve out the aforementioned distinctions between a ‘broad’ and ‘narrow’ concept of the aesthetic. The narrow view limits the aesthetic to the detection of aesthetic properties: formal features of the work with some relationship to the perceptible properties (see, for example, Carroll, 2012). For example, the vivacity and vibrancy of Kandinsky’s Swinging (1925) are aesthetic properties arising from the formal and perceptible, perhaps ‘lower-level’, properties, which in turn invite an aesthetic experience, perhaps one of ‘movement’. The broad view captures within the aesthetic, say, moral features (see, for example, Gaut, 2007 and Goldman, 2013) as they arise from this form. For the formalist, or narrow aestheticist, aesthetic value refers to either aesthetic properties in themselves, or is a relational value referring to the experience we have of them. For the broad theorist, as moral, political, or cognitive content is brought about through, and directly impacts our response to the form of the work, they can interact and shape aesthetic value. In Goldman’s terms, cognitive and affective work, such as inference, theme detection, moral insight, and so on, are as much a part of the aesthetic experience as is the detection of aesthetic properties. Artworks “engage us on all levels” (Goldman, 2013, p. 331) and, in turn, their aesthetic value is affected as such.
In terms of the value of art, or artistic value, if we equate aesthetic value with artistic value, artistic value is going to be grounded in, too, the aesthetic, formal features of the work which is shaped by one’s narrow or broad view. If we’re not going to equate the two, then we can say that aesthetic value is one of many determinants of artistic value, bringing in other determinants such as cognitive value and moral value. These views come in nuanced forms, as we’ll now see.
For some aestheticians, the issue with coming to an adequate and appropriate account of the nature of artistic value and aesthetic value is derivative of the core issue of defining the very concepts aesthetic and artistic (in section 1.b, we’ll look at the relationship between the definition of art and the nature of artistic value). The thought is that if we construct an appropriate definition of, and relationship between, art and the aesthetic, all issues in aesthetics will slowly become enlightened.
The most succinct, yet still rigorous, assessment and discussion of the relationship between aesthetic and artistic value was brought about through an interlocution between a paper by Lopes (2011) and subsequent response from Hanson (2013). Lopes has attempted to show that any kind of non-aesthetic artistic value is a myth, whilst Hanson has attempted to show that a non-aesthetic, distinctively artistic value, is a reality (which paves the way for her later account of artistic value, which we saw earlier in section 1). Lopes thinks we only have two options: to embrace the trivial theory, or equate artistic value with aesthetic value. The trivial theory suggests that artworks can have many different values, but none are characteristically artistic. For example, an artwork might grant us some moral wisdom, which is something valuable about it. Other things, though, also grant us moral wisdom, so granting moral wisdom isn’t a characteristically artistic value, that is, a value of an artwork qua artwork. The trivial theory, therefore, is uninformative and doesn’t really tell us anything about the value of art. Lopes arrives at these two options after ploughing through definitions of artistic value that, so he thinks, fail to adequately grant a particular value’s being an artistic value. Thus, the conclusion reached is that something is a value of art if and only if it is an aesthetic value of that thing within the kind of art form, genre, or other art kind.
As Hanson identifies, it is difficult to place Lopes’ position and what it exactly amounts to, but broadly there are three kinds of positions one might take to get rid of (non-aesthetic) artistic value: error theory, eliminativism, and aestheticism. On the surface these might appear to be the same position, but there are subtle differences between the three, hence the confusion in Lopes’ positioning. An error theory would claim that we are mistaken to talk about artistic value as there is no such thing as artistic value: “it appeals to a concept that does not exist” (Hanson, 2013, p. 494). Aestheticism – as Hanson is using the term – is a claim about aesthetic value and artistic value’s identity, as well as a denial of pluralism about artistic value. Pluralism would allow for many values to be contributory towards artistic, and aesthetic in this case, value, for example, moral and cognitive value might interact with aesthetic value. The aestheticist, however, thinks aesthetic value and artistic value are the same, and that only aesthetic value is a determinant of artistic value. The use of aesthetic value, in this discussion, pertains only to formal, perceptible properties, rather than a broad construal that draws in cognitive and affective components as identified in section 1.a.i. The value of an artwork, then, is comprised by its aesthetic value and its aesthetic value only for the aestheticist. For the eliminativist, an identity relation is also placed between aesthetic value and artistic value as we are talking about the same thing. Talk of artistic value is redundant as it is just aesthetic value, rather than, as for the error theorist, talk of a non-existent concept. So, for the eliminativist, we have the concept of artistic value, but it’s the same thing as aesthetic value. This position is endorsed by Berys Gaut (2007): aesthetic value is comprised by a pluralism of many different values, and artistic value is aesthetic value. The denial of pluralism, therefore, sets the aestheticist (only the formal matters for aesthetic value) and the eliminativist (only aesthetic value matters for artistic value, but other values may impact, or be drawn out through, form, i.e., aesthetic value) apart. That being said, an eliminativist need not be committed to pluralism.
We have seen reasons for thinking our talk of artistic value is conceptually and/or metaphysically mistaken just insofar as artistic value is not a kind of value in the same way all these determinant values are. Artistic value is something had by all and only artworks as a measure of how good (or bad) they are and, as such, “is just a handy linguistic construction that allows one to talk about the degree to which something is good art in a less cumbersome way than would otherwise be available” (Hanson, 2013, p. 500). In this way, artistic value is not the same kind of value as, but is indeed dependent upon, other kinds of value. With this reasoning in place, one can reject any position that places an identity claim between artistic value and aesthetic value because they are not kinds of value in the same way, and so cannot be identical. That being said, positions that acknowledge artistic value and aesthetic value’s distinct nature can claim that aesthetic value is the sole determinant of artistic value. So, for example, aestheticists might say that, yes, artistic value and aesthetic value are distinct values both in kind and nature, artistic value has determinants, and the only determinant of artistic value is aesthetic value.
Yet the task for the aestheticist (denying pluralism), arguing that aesthetic value is the sole determinant of artistic value, is rather difficult. Despite our intuitive inclinations towards the formal and the beautiful being significant determinants of artistic value, few would be inclined to suggest that art cannot provide moral, political, or social criticism, bestow knowledge upon us or clarify truths we already hold. Hence, in order to maintain their line, the aestheticist would either need to argue that (i) these other values interact with aesthetic value and, derivatively, affect artistic value (a form of eliminativism), or (ii) these other values are not values of art qua art. Route (i) is endorsed by those, such as Gaut, who see an intimate tie between aesthetic and other forms of value. Consider, for example, our labelling moral behavior beautiful and immoral behavior ugly. Known as the moral beauty view (see section 2.a for this view in greater detail), this looks like a good candidate for the interaction of aesthetic and other forms of value. The issue is that we can speak of the aesthetic value of lots of things, but those things need not be art, and often are not art, which puts pressure on the identity claim. It is mysterious to claim aesthetic value is value qua art whilst attributing aesthetic value to things that are not artworks.
One might then suggest that avenue (ii) stands a better chance at survival. We might argue that Guernica has exceptional aesthetic value, Picasso’s use of geometric forms is dramatic and imposing. We might also suggest that Guernica’s intent, the condemnation of the bombing of Guernica, is a merit of the work. However, we can consider these values separately: Guernica has high artistic value owing to its formalism, and it is a valuable thing owing to its ethico-political commentary, but the latter of these does not contribute to its value qua art. It might be valuable as art owing to its formal qualities, and valuable as a piece of ethico-political commentary, but we should not consider the latter in our assessment of its artistic value (this view, known as moderate autonomism, is explored in section 2). That is, an artwork can have many different valuable features, but the only one that determines its artistic value, its value qua art, is its aesthetic value.
Yet this just doesn’t appear to be how we view artworks. Instead, form and content work together to bear the value of the work qua art. Although content, like Guernica’s ethico-political criticism of war, is wrapped up with, and brought about through, the form of the work, it is not just that form that we value about the artwork as an artwork. We value Guernica qua art in part due to this political criticism which is drawn out through its jarring and unsettling composition, accentuating and confirming the critical attitude Picasso takes. Yet such an attitude and criticism is over and above simply the work’s being jarring and unsettling. More is needed beyond the form to access the content. If this political commentary, then, is something we find valuable about Guernica as an artwork (the denunciation of war, particularly the bombing of Guernica), and it is detachable from its aesthetic value (as jarring and unsettling), then our safest bet appears to be opting for Hanson’s line: artistic value is how good or bad something is as art, it is something had by all and only artworks, and it has a range of different determinant values one of which is, perhaps to a substantial but not wholly encompassing extent, its aesthetic value. In order to reach a full and proper understanding of the value of art, then, we need to explore these determinants and, importantly, how they interact. In sections two to five, we’ll look at some of the main values philosophers of art have thought to contribute to, or detract from, the value of an artwork.
Another issue for the aestheticist is the value we repeatedly attach to works that are deliberately anti-aesthetic. The predominant example here is conceptual art. Conceptual artworks do not bestow upon us aesthetic experiences, nor do they have any properties we would appropriately be willing to call aesthetic properties. Despite their anti-aesthetic nature, we willingly and consistently attribute to these works artistic value. If they lack any significant aesthetic value, as Stecker (2019) writes, but simultaneously possess rather substantial artistic value, then it doesn’t look like we can place an identity claim between aesthetic and artistic value, and to do so may be foolish. How can something with low aesthetic value have high artistic value if these two values are identical? In order to meet this objection, the aestheticist might wish to appeal to artistic-aesthetic holism or dependency. That is, anti-aesthetic artworks are valuable in a way that depends upon the concept of the aesthetic: it is only in virtue of the value placed on the aesthetic that anti-aesthetic art derives its reactionary value. This, however, places a burden on the aestheticist’s shoulders in trying to show how absence of something (aesthetic) gives rise to that something’s value (aesthetic value).
These perceptually indiscernible artworks might pose a different issue for the aestheticist albeit one that is closely related. The problem of conceptual art for the aestheticist is explaining how purportedly non-aesthetic art can have artistic value if artistic value is aesthetic value, and aesthetic value depends on aesthetic properties and/or experience. As Stecker (2019) identifies, the problem of indiscernible works is this: aesthetic value and artistic value cannot be one and the same thing if two perceptually indiscernible entities can have differing artistic value. Duchamp’s Fountain might be indiscernible from a ‘regular’ urinal. If aesthetic value is realized through perceptible features, then the regular urinal and Fountain have the same aesthetic value. However, it is highly unlikely that anyone would be willing to admit that Fountain and the regular urinal have precisely the same artistic value. Hence, we should be of the view that artistic value is something other than, but perhaps may indeed include, aesthetic value. To be clear, the two distinct issues are this: (1) how does the aestheticist account for the aesthetic value of non-aesthetic or deliberately anti-aesthetic art and thus, given the identity claim, their artistic value? (2) How does the aestheticist account for two indiscernible things having (presumably) identical aesthetic value—based on formal features—but distinct artistic value?
It should be noted that some do hold that artworks can bear non-perceptual aesthetic properties. Shelley (2003) constructs such a case, arguing that it is a route scarcely travelled by aestheticists in the face of conceptual art. Instead, aestheticists tend to deny that conceptual artworks are art (an alternative is to deny that all artworks have aesthetic properties, but this is not a good move for the aestheticist!). Shelley expands aesthetic properties from the usual list – “grace, elegance, and beauty” – to include “daring, impudence, and wit” (2003, p. 373). This he does by drawing on a Sibley-inspired notion of aesthetic properties as striking us, rather than being inferred, and recognizing that it is false to say that properties that strike us rely on perceptible properties. As he writes, “ordinary urinals do not strike us with daring or wit, but Fountain, which for practical purposes is perceptually indistinguishable from them, does” (Shelley, 2003, p. 373). See Carroll (2004) for the same conclusion reached via alternative argument.
Consider, then, a different case against the aestheticist: forgeries and fakes. It is not to our surprise that our valuing of something changes upon our discovery that it is a forgery, and it is often, presumably, the case that this value change is a diminishment. The (in-)famous case of van Meegren creating fake Vermeers is commonplace in the literature. Upon discovering that these ‘Vermeers’ were actually fakes produced by van Meegren, their value suffered. Despite this, the aesthetic properties, or the aesthetic experience had, presumably stays the same owing to the change not being at the level of the formal, perceptual properties of the work. Instead, it’s something else that changes; perhaps our valuing of it as, now, not an original, authentic work. Aestheticists might appeal to a change in the moral value or assessment of the work, but the best explanation for this kind of phenomenon appears to be that the aesthetic value, co-extensive with aesthetic experience or properties, remains the same, whereas the artistic value, which can include considerations such as originality, importance for art history, authenticity, and so on, changes. Indeed, it is precisely these problematic scenarios that lead Kulka (2005) to endorse what he terms aesthetic dualism: a divorce between aesthetic value and artistic value, where aesthetic value is gathered from the intrinsic properties of the work, and artistic value includes aesthetic value but also makes reference to extrinsic information such as originality and art-historical importance.
Notwithstanding, the conceptual and empirical dependency of the artistic upon the aesthetic is a popular view. Frank Sibley (1959; and, 2001 for a collected volume of his papers) proposed a priority of the aesthetic over the artistic: all that is artistic depends upon the concept of the aesthetic. Therefore, Sibley does indeed endorse the claim that anti-aesthetic art, by its very nature, depends on the concept of the aesthetic in order to retrieve its value as art. Andy Hamilton (2006), too, endorses a link of conceptual necessity between the aesthetic and the artistic. What he calls the reciprocity thesis is a conceptual holism between artistic and aesthetic; we cannot understand, or have the concept arise, of the artistic without the aesthetic. His case is that it is unfathomable to conceive of a settling community that views a sunset and does not at the same time decorate their homes with ornaments and fanciful designs.
As we can see, many aestheticians appear to support with good reason the idea that aesthetic value and artistic value are not identical. However, we should not assume that the case is too one-sided and that proponents of the aesthetic-artistic value distinction do not have any burdens to meet. For example, in the remainder of this article we’ll look at some values philosophers of art take to be values of art, but the question is: how do we know these are values of artworks qua their being artworks, rather than values artworks have just adventitiously? How do we support the idea, for example, that an artwork’s teaching us something is a value of that work qua art, but an artwork’s covering up a crack in the wall is not a value of that work qua art? This is the main contention of Lopes’ argument against non-aesthetic artistic value: there is no non-trivial way of declaring that a value is an artistic value, that is, a value qua art.
Before engaging such questions, we should examine the relationship between the definition of art and the value of art. As stated in the introduction, what we have taken artworks to be and what we value about them have been considered somewhat simultaneous. Rather than historically trace the definition of art and its correspondence with art’s value, we will focus here on some issues arising from the relationship between defining art and the value of art, in keeping with the article’s scope and purpose. First, a theory of art that picks out artworks based on what we deem to be valuable about them is called a value definition. It is more likely than not that this definition will also be a functional theory/definition of art, according to Davies’ (1990, 1991) delineation of functional and procedural theories of art. A functional theory defines artworks in terms of what they do, whereas a procedural theory defines artworks in terms of how they are brought about. Aesthetic theories, for example, are functional theories. The institutional theory, on the contrary, is a procedural theory. It is presumably not the case that we value artworks because they are those things picked out as candidates for appreciation by the art world (the institutional theory), but it might be the case that we value artworks because they are sources of aesthetic experiences (a version of the aesthetic theory).
Consequently, functional theories are often taken to have an advantage over procedural theories in terms of explanatory power. They tell us what an artwork is, alongside telling us why art matters to us. Indeed, it is often, then, a criticism of procedural theories that they do not go on to show us why and how we care about artworks. Although procedural theories might have a greater time encompassing more artworks under their definition (the institutional theory is praised for its extensional adequacy), they fail to meet an important desideratum of theories of art. One must be cautious, however, in approaching both the definition and value of art along the same track. If one takes what is valuable about an artwork to be the sole determinant of artistic value and that artworks are those things that have this value, then one runs into a conceptual conundrum. Such definitions perform, for Hanson (2017), definition-evaluation parallelism. These theories are unable to accommodate the existence of bad art.
Hanson cites the theories of Bell and Collingwood as falling into this trap. For Bell, artworks have significant form, and this is the determinant of their artistic value. For Collingwood, art is expressive, and their expression is the determinant of their artistic value. The puzzle, however, is this: if artworks are valuable only because of their significant form, and are artworks because of their significant form, then all artworks are valuable. Something that doesn’t have significant form cannot be artistically valuable, nor can it be deemed art. As such, the existence of bad art becomes a contradiction, given that all artworks, insofar as they are artworks, possess the valuable feature. The same can be said of Collingwood’s expressive theory, substituting expression for significant form in this example. What it would take for an artwork to be bad, i.e., lacking the valuable thing about art, would also remove its artistic status. Hence, there can be no bad art.
Not all value definitions fall into the trap of definition-evaluation parallelism. It is possible, for example, to argue that all artworks have some value x, but this value is not the sole determinant of the value of art. Instead, a multitude of values constitute the value of art, it’s just that x is also what makes artworks, artworks. If they follow this trajectory, theories of art are able to meet the desideratum of being able to at once explain what artworks are and why we value them. As Hanson points out, it has been a mistake by previous aestheticians to think of the issue of bad art as “a knock-down objection to value definitions” (2017, p. 424). Instead, it’s a burden only for those value definitions that at the same time invoke definition-evaluation parallelism.
In addition, it is not the case that one needs to pick the explanatory side they deem more praiseworthy in cases of defining art procedurally or functionally, for one can commit to, as Abell (2012) does, a hybrid theory of art. A hybrid theory of art would be one that is both functional and procedural at the same time. The motivation for a hybrid (procedural and functional) theory is that it can potentially take on the extensional power of a procedural theory (encompassing within the category of artworks the right kind of thing) as well as the explanatory power of a functional theory (letting us know how and why we care about art).
The previous discussions setup, and invite, consideration of what other forms of value we consider to be contributory to, or detracting from, the value of an artwork qua art. Throughout the following considerations, the reader should consider whether the position and its commitments make claims about two different concerns: whether the value in question impacts the value of the work as a work of art, or whether we can assess the artwork in terms of that value, but the value doesn’t impact the value of a work of art as a work of art. The nature of such an interaction is cashed out with great intricacy in the numerous positions espoused in considerations of the (im-)moral value of art, and so it is to this value that we now turn as a good starting point.
The interaction between moral and aesthetic and/or artistic value has received extensive treatment in the literature and with extensive treatment comes an extensive list of positions one might adopt. Another entry of the IEP also considers these positions: Ethical Criticism of Art. Nonetheless, the interaction is a considerable source of tension in philosophical aesthetics, and so I shall highlight and assess the key positions here. Roughly, the main positions are as follows. Radical Autonomists think that moral assessments of artworks are inappropriate in their entirety, that is, one should not engage in moral debate about, through, or from artworks. Moderate Autonomists think that artworks can be assessed in terms of their moral character and/or criticism, but this does not bear weight upon their value qua art, that is, their artistic value. Moralists think that a work’s moral value is a determinant of its artistic value. Radical Moralists think that the moral assessment of an artwork is the sole determinant of its artistic value. Ethicists think that, necessarily, a moral defect in a work is an aesthetic defect, and a moral merit is an aesthetic merit. Immoralists think that moral defects, or immoral properties, can be valuable for an artwork qua art, they can contribute positively to artistic value.
It should be clear from this brief exposition that the varying terminology renders the debate rather murky. Some, such as Gaut, are arguing about moral value’s encroachment on aesthetic value, whereas others are making claims in particular about artistic value. Todd (2007), for example, identifies that a significant part of the tension of ethical interaction is sourced from conflating aesthetic and artistic value. In addition, in different literature we see talk of moral value, moral properties, the morality of the artist, moral defects, aesthetic merits, artistic merits, and so on. In fact, it has been pointed out that the debate regarding immoralism (the claim that moral defects can be aesthetic/artistic merits) is marred precisely owing to the lack of consensus and terminological mud that is flown throughout the debate: no one has declared precisely what a moral defect is, and upon whom or what it falls (McGregor, 2014). A moral defect might be in the audience if they take up a flawed perspective, or it might be in the work’s suggestion that that response be taken up, or it might be in the display of immoral acts, and so on. In keeping with the focus of this article, I will consider the debate in terms of artistic value, where someone who thinks aesthetic value and artistic value are one and the same thing will be claiming that there is an interaction between (im-)moral properties and aesthetic value (as artistic value). That is, we will keep in line with the general agreement that what is at stake is the effect of (im-)moral properties on the value of artworks qua artwork. I will refer to moral and immoral aspects of the work in terms of properties and defects/merits.
Let’s start with the autonomist’s claim. Two strands of autonomism are prominent: radical and moderate. The former suggests that any and all moral assessment of an artwork is completely irrelevant to the artistic domain. It is a conceptual fallacy to suggest that morality and aesthetics interact in any substantive way. The artwork is a pure, formal phenomenon that exists in a realm divorced from concerns such as morality and politics. Clearly, however, this view has become outdated. It may have been convincing in the heydays of movements such as art for art’s sake, however, art has historically and, even more so in contemporary forms, been wrapped up with moral and political commentary, serving to criticize specific events, movements, and agendas. The latter strand, moderate autonomism, might find itself more palatable. This is the claim that the moral properties of a work have no interaction with its artistic value, but artworks can still be assessed in light of morality. On this view, then, Riefenstahl’s Triumph of the Will is good art, it is aesthetically and artistically valuable. However, in contrast to the radical autonomist, we may wish to assess the artwork in terms of a moral system, in which case Triumph of the Will is (very) flawed, but this does not have weight on our assessment of the film-documentary as art. The only thing that is relevant to the artistic value of Triumph of the Will is its aesthetic value, and on this view it is a good artwork.
There are two significant attractions to this view. Firstly, as mentioned in preceding sections, the idea that the aesthetic qualities of artworks are those things for which we value artworks is intuitively appealing; we praise artworks for their beauty, their form, and their use of this form to wrap up their content. Fundamentally, the autonomist says, we value artworks for how they look, and this is the ‘common-sense’ view of how and why we value art. Secondly, the claims that moral merits and defects do not impede upon artistic value is supported by the common-denominator argument, first proposed by Carroll. If a value is a value qua art, then it must feature as a relevant value for assessment in the consideration of all artworks. However, there are a multitude of artworks for which moral assessment is inappropriate and/or irrelevant. Abstract works, for example, in their majority do not lay claim to moral criticism or commentary, and so assessing them as artworks in terms of such value is inappropriate. Moral assessment, then, is not a common denominator amongst all artworks and so is not appropriate for assessment of an artwork qua art.
However, there are two interrelated and concerning issues for the autonomist. Firstly, the view may be problematic in the light of the fact that artworks are valued for many reasons beyond their form and aesthetic qualities. Indeed, take the earlier examples of genres of art that proceed from an anti-aesthetic standpoint. Secondly, and more importantly, it is standard practice in art criticism to produce an assessment of (some) artworks in terms of their moral and immoral claims, and this seems indubitably relevant for their assessment as artworks, or, qua art. Producing a critical review of Lolita as a work of artistic literature, for example, that made no reference to the immorality of Humbert Humbert and the relevance of this for its value as an artwork (rather than just its nature as an artwork) would be simply to have missed the plot of Lolita. Similarly, Guernica may be an exceptional, revolutionary use of form, but its assessment as an artwork just intuitively must involve its commentary on civil war and its repercussions for civilians. Likewise, it seems to be relevant to its assessment as art that Triumph of the Will was a propagandistic film endorsing the abhorrent, accentuated narrative of the Nazi party.
The moralist, who thinks an interaction exists between moral value and artistic value, is likely to use these latter examples as motivations for their own view. In these cases, it looks like the very form of the work is in some sense determined by the moral attitudes and values explored. As such, the moralist will claim that “moral presuppositions [can] play a structural role in the design of many artworks” (Carroll, 1996, p. 233). Hence, if we’re going to value artworks for their form and content, and in some cases this is dependent upon the moral claims, views, or theories employed in the work, then we need to accept that the moral value of a work is going to affect its value as an artwork.
Moralists are divided on whether their rule about moral properties (that moral merits can be aesthetic merits) is one of necessity; that is, that moral merits are always going to lead to aesthetic merits. For example, moderate moralism suggests that sometimes, but not always, moral properties can impinge upon, or contribute to, artistic value (see, for example, Carroll, 1996). In contrast, the ethicist necessitates the relationship between moral merits and aesthetic merits. For the ethicist, each and every instance of a moral merit in a work of art is an aesthetic merit. This position was made prominent by Gaut (2007), who as we saw also thinks that aesthetic value and artistic value are one and the same value. As such, a proper and appropriate formulation of ethicism would be the following: moral merits are in every case aesthetic merits, and as such moral merits always contribute to the value of an artwork as art. A caveat here is that the moral merits are core features of the artwork, rather than extraneous elements coinciding with the work. For example, the moral actions of Forrest in Forrest Gump may be aesthetically relevant, but moral claims made by the film studio in the DVD leaflet are not.
Clearly, this is a very strong claim and so requires significant motivation. Gaut bases the endorsement of ethicism upon three arguments: the merited response, moral beauty, and a cognitivist argument, the first and second I explore here. A dominant version of the merited response argument runs as follows: artworks prescribe responses in their spectators/perceivers/readers derivative of their content, and their aesthetic success is determined by, at least in part, such a response to the work being merited. One way a response might be unmerited, at least in part, is if such a response is unethical. As the unethical response is the cause of a response being unmerited, and an artwork’s success depends upon the response being merited, ethical defects are aesthetic defects and ethical merits are aesthetic merits (Gaut, 2007; Sauchelli, 2012). In sum, there is a direct correlation between a response being merited and the moral prescriptions such a response holds. The second argument, the moral beauty view, identifies that “moral virtues are beautiful, and moral vices are ugly” (Gaut, 2007, p. 115). From here, we can suggest that if a work has moral virtues—it has “ethically good attitudes”—then it has a kind of beauty. Beauty is, of course, canonically and paradigmatically an aesthetic value. Therefore, moral value contributes to aesthetic value. The argument, as Gaut suggests himself, is straightforward. To assess it requires an evaluation of the link between moral character and beauty which falls beyond the scope of this article. Readers should note Gaut provides a powerful case for the relation: see Gaut (2007, chapter six).
There is something intuitively appealing about the claim that moral merits in artworks can be artistic merits and, as such, contribute to the value of art. The same, however, cannot be said of moral defects as meritorious contributions to the value of art. It seems odd to think that an artwork could be better in part, or wholly, because of the immoral properties it possesses. Immoralism, generally, is the position in aesthetics that holds that moral defects in a work of art can be artistic merits. Despite the instinctive resistance to such a claim, we need not look far afield to find examples of artworks that might fit this sort of bill. Consider, for example, Nabokov’s Lolita, Harvey’s Myra, and Todd Phillips’ Joker. The value of these works seems to be sourced from, or tied to, their inclusion of immoral properties, acts, or events. The issue is that we do not value immoral properties in general, or simpliciter, so why do they sometimes contribute to value qua art?
The cognitive immoralist (Kieran, 2003) suggests that we value immoral properties in artworks because they invite a cognitive and epistemic gain. That is, immoral properties are artistically virtuous insofar as they allow us to access, gain an understanding of, cement, or cultivate our moral understanding. Lolita’s immoral properties are valuable because they provide further scaffolding to our understanding of the immorality of pedophilia. By accessing the perspective of the pedophile, we garner a more complete understanding of why the actions are wrong. In this way, it has been argued that we have an epistemic duty to seek out these artworks for the resultant moral-cognitive gain, for the more comprehensive understanding of goodness and badness. Just as, so Kieran argues, the subordination of another can help us understand why a bully bullies, that is, to gain pleasure from the subordination of others, so too can artworks offer us the perspectives of perpetrators that can improve our understanding. Importantly, however, this epistemic duty does not extend to the real world. It is the imaginative experience that indirectly and informatively entertains immorality through the suspension of our natural beliefs and attitudes.
The robust immoralist, by contrast, focuses on the aesthetic and artistic achievements upheld by the ability of a work to gather our appreciation of immoral characters (Eaton, 2012). Termed rough-heroes, these characters take on immoral adventures or acts in films, novels, TV shows, and so on, but for some reason we empathize with them, we like them, we might even fancy them. For example, we might sympathize with a character that is at the same time a murderer. For the robust immoralist, it is a formidable artistic achievement to place us into this juxtaposed attitude and, hence, morally defective works can be artistically valuable just insofar as they excel within this artistic technique (Eaton, 2012).
The immoralist falls into a similar issue to the moralist, however, insofar as they need to show that it is the immoral qualities qua immoral qualities that contribute to the artistic value (Paris, 2019; this paper represents a considerable attack on immoralism). For example, some have argued that there is a two-step relation between immoral qualities and artistic value. Against the cognitive immoralist, they argue that it is the cognitive value that contributes to the artistic value, rather than the immoral qualities themselves. Similarly, we might argue that it is the aesthetic achievement of the robust immoralist, and hence aesthetic value, that contributes to the artistic value, rather than the immoral qualities themselves. Hence, immoral qualities qua immoral qualities do not contribute to artistic value. Moreover, on this criticism, we could suggest that replacing the immoral qualities with qualities (perhaps moral qualities) that give rise to the same sort of aesthetic value and/or cognitive value will produce the same influence upon artistic value and so, again, it is not immoral qualities qua immoral qualities. An intriguing consequence of this kind of criticism of immoralism is that it penetrates the veracity of theories that argue moral properties contribute to artistic value. The artistic value is not located in the moral qualities qua moral qualities (since, presumably, they are replaceable with some properties that gather the same cognitive or aesthetic gain, too).
Relatedly, some have argued that it is only insofar as these immoral qualities are accompanied by aesthetic and or cognitive gain that then masks or covers up the immoral qualities that they are deemed artistically valuable (Paris, 2019). That something else – retribution of the character, epistemic gain, aesthetic success – derives from these immoral properties suggests that they would not be valuable on their own. Since they require covering or masking in terms of aesthetic or epistemic success, they are actually shown to be detrimental to artistic value. That is, without the masking or covering up of the immoral qualities, we wouldn’t actually find the work artistically valuable. It is as though, says the critic of immoralism, the immoral qualities require covering up or redemption in order to succeed in the artistic domain. This puts them a far cry away from being valuable as art qua themselves.
Lastly, and this is a particular criticism of cognitive immoralism, it is hard to find works for which the status of the properties is genuinely immoral. If the reason we find immoral properties valuable is because of the ensuing cognitive, epistemic, moral cultivation — for example, Lolita helps us to verify and scaffold our understanding of pedophilia as immoral — then, upon calculation, the properties might not turn out to be immoral. That is, the subsequent moral cultivation outweighs the immorality of the fictional wrongs, and so the properties of the artwork are not, all things considered, immoral. The benefits outweigh the costs. If the artwork does not exhibit immoral properties, then there are no immoral properties in the first place out of which we can argue artistic value arises.
What the discussions of moralism and immoralism show is that for a property, quality, or value to legitimately be considered a determinant of artistic value, it must affect the value of the work qua art. In several different instances outlined, it doesn’t look like the moral and/or immoral property/value is affecting the work’s value qua art, but is instead determining some other value that we take to be valuable qua art. For example, some properties (moral or immoral) affect aesthetic value, which transitions to affect artistic value. It is, therefore, aesthetic value, not moral value, that influences artistic value. Or, some properties of artworks look to teach us things or cultivate our understanding, therefore there is a particular cognitive value about them, which has an effect on the artistic value.
The trouble that arises from this kind of thinking is which values are we willing to take as fully and finally valuable qua art and not just because they determine some other value? Perhaps this can be cast as a significant motivator for aestheticism, and indeed Lopes’ claim of the myth of non-aesthetic artistic value. Aesthetic value appears to be the only value on which there is universal consensus regarding its status as an artistic value. For moral/immoral interaction, it almost looks as if the burden always falls on the interactionist (who thinks that moral and aesthetic/artistic value interact) rather than the autonomist (who thinks they do not), in some unfair way.
Such a concern has been legitimated by Hanson (2019), who suggests that two dogmas have been pervasively present in the interaction debate: two conditions that an interactionist must meet, but that together are incompatible. Let’s refer to these as the directness problem and the qua problem. Roughly, the directness problem highlights that those engaging in the interaction debate have implicitly assumed that the only way an interactionist can show that moral/immoral properties bear on the value of art is if they influence some other value, that subsequently influences artistic value. Hence, if the interactionist shows that moral properties gather cognitive value, which bring about artistic value, then they have proposed an indirect strategy. A direct strategy would be, say, the cognitive case, where cognitive value directly bears on artistic value. The second condition that the interactionist must meet is that it must show that it is the (im-)moral properties qua (im-)moral properties that bear the value of art (the qua problem). That is, not some other, intermediary value. Clearly, however, it is logically impossible to propose that something can affect something qua itself indirectly. That is, one cannot conjure an interactionist theory that suggest moral properties are indirectly contributory to artistic value whilst at the same time maintaining that it is the moral properties qua moral properties that contribute to artistic value. One cannot, then, conjure an interactionist theory that meets these simultaneous requirements, or dogmas.
What, then, is the resolution? In order to not beg the question against the interactionist, aestheticians need to refrain from implicitly advancing both the directness and qua problem simultaneously, and instead only level one or neither. In her proposal, Hanson suggests we should take direct strategies seriously, with the caveat that this does not necessitate endorsing the qua constraint. Taking direct strategies seriously is legitimated because, well, we allow direct strategies in other cases. Consider aesthetic value, or cognitive value, or the value of originality, influence on subsequent art, and so on. All these values take on the stance of directly influencing artistic value, so why not moral value? Indeed, as Hanson suggests, we need to admit that at least some values are directly impactful on artistic value lest we enter an infinite regress. That is, if some value only contributes to artistic value via some other value, then does the latter contribute to artistic value directly? If not, then another value needs to be affected, which subsequently affects artistic value, to which the same question can be posed, and so on ad infinitum. Clearly, there must be a break in this chain somewhere such that some value(s) is (are) contributory, directly, to artistic value. As Hanson suggests, we should begin to take direct strategies more seriously, and the prospects look a lot “rosier” when we begin to do so.
Cognitive immoralism rests decisively on the claim that artistic value can be upheld, indeed augmented, by the cognitive value of an artwork. That is, the claim that artworks can be valuable insofar as they engender some form of cognitive gain. Indeed, a familiar endorsement of art is that it has something to teach us. These claims would be endorsed by a cognitivist about the arts: art can teach us, and it is aesthetically or artistically valuable in doing so. When discussing the cognitive value of art, it is crucial to get at what exactly the claim of “teaching us” amounts to: what is being taught and how are we being taught this? Rather usefully, Gibson (2008) has delineated the claims of different strands of artistic cognitivism. Gibson suggests that the cognitivist could argue for artworks granting us three kinds of knowledge: (i) propositional knowledge, (ii) experiential knowledge, or (iii) improvement/clarification. Other options are available for the cognitivist, such as a general increase in cognitive capacities, as we saw with cognitive immoralism. Another significant position is that art can train our empathic understanding. We’ll focus on Gibson’s assessment of cognitivism due to its informativity, before moving to Currie’s more recent analyses of cognitivism and, specifically, the enhancement of empathy.
The cognitivist endorsing (i) would suggest that artworks can give us knowledge that, such as x is y, or tomatoes are red. Artworks, for example, might serve as something akin to philosophical thought experiments, from which we can extrapolate some new truth. This strand of thought might argue that Guernica grants us propositional knowledge that civil wars affect citizens as much as infantry, and so are morally bankrupt, as seen through the bombing of Guernica. By endorsing (ii), the cognitivist is claiming that we can access “a region of human experience that would otherwise remain unknown” (Gibson, 2008, p. 583). For example, one might claim that Guernica offers us some form of access to what civilians experienced during the bombing of Guernica. In endorsing (iii), the cognitivist – Gibson labels this the neo-cognitivist position – would claim that artworks don’t teach us anything new, nor do they grant us access to otherwise inaccessible scenarios, but instead that they confirm, clarify, or accentuate knowledge we already hold. For example, we all know that war has consequences for citizens, that bombings are bad, and Guernica can shed light on, or improve our knowledge of, these facts.
There are four kinds of issue that cognitivists must overcome, with some addressing these different strands in a more targeted fashion. Gibson refers to these as the problem of unclaimed truths, missing tools of inquiry, the problem of fiction, and the nature of artistic creativity. The problem of unclaimed truths suggests that the truths found in artworks are borrowed from reality rather than revelatory of it. On this criticism, Guernica can’t grant us knowledge about the bombing of Guernica because, simply, the bombing of Guernica needed to take place in order for the artwork to borrow from such a reality. The missing tools of inquiry objection suggests that, in contrast to other cognitive pursuits, artworks don’t show us how to reach the knowledge, nor do they justify their truths, they merely show them. Picasso’s Guernica, then, can say that bombing in civil wars can lead to civilian deaths which is an immoral circumstance, but it cannot tell us why. The problem of fiction argues that the truths artworks disclose, if they do at all, are truths of the fictional world of the artwork, rather than truths that come into contact with reality. Hence, Guernica can show us that bombing cities in civil wars is wrong in the fictional world of the painting, rather than in our world of reality; the leap from fiction to reality is too large a leap to make. Relatedly, the nature of artistic creativity objection argues that artists create artefacts that are meant for “moment[s] of emancipation from reality” (Gibson, 2008, p. 578), and so praising the artistic discipline requires distancing ourselves from reality. Artworks, then, should not be valued for their cognitive gain because it is precisely the purpose of art to detach us from reality, rather than impart knowledge about it.
This final criticism can be launched against nearly all strands of cognitivism: if artworks should not be valued for the engendered cognitive gain, and artistic value is the value of something qua art, then cognitive value is not an artistic value. The problems of unclaimed truths and fiction penetrate the propositional and experiential knowledge accounts of artistic cognitivism. If the propositional or experiential knowledge qualifies the fictional world and can’t be transferred to reality, then that’s not a very valuable circumstance. Likewise, if this proposition or experience is something borrowed from reality, then again there’s no real teaching going on, for the knowledge needs to be in place in the first place for the artwork to borrow. Moreover, the fictionality objection hits the experiential account particularly hard: to put it simply, nothing is as good as the real thing. Gibson gives the example of a fictional tale about love; going to a library and reading it is not going to give the same experiential access as, should I be so lucky, finding love in reality!
The idea that artworks can give us propositional knowledge has been met with equal criticism. Consider our claim that, in order for something to contribute to artistic value, it must be valuable qua the artwork, that is, it must be something about or in the artwork that is valuable. Against the cognitivist endorsing the propositional knowledge view, one might suggest that the cognitive gain is made subsequent to engagement with the artwork. Just as with philosophical thought experiments, the knowledge isn’t held within the fiction, it is derivative of the cognitive efforts of the beholder. Guernica, considered as a thought experiment, doesn’t give us the knowledge qua itself as an artwork, but rather we extrapolate the moral propositions subsequent to our engagement. That is, Guernica doesn’t say “the killing of innocent civilians is bad”, but instead gives us a pictorial representation of the bombing of Guernica via which we subsequently undergo some cognitive work to get at this claim. Hence, the cognitive gain is not found within the artwork itself, and so cannot be a value qua art.
It looks like the strongest weapon in the cognitivist arsenal is what Gibson calls neo-cognitivism: the view that artworks clarify, accentuate, enhance, or improve knowledge that we already hold. The cognitive value of art, then, is not its offering of discrete propositional knowledge, but its amplificatory role in our cognitive lives. It offers, for example, a new way of getting at some truth. This is the kind of view many aestheticians hold. Diffey (1995) offers a view he calls moderate anti-cognitivism, based on a middle point between Stolnitz’s (1992) claim that there are no distinctive artistic truths and the cognitivist claim that new knowledge is gained through art. Diffey thinks, instead, that artworks can serve as ways of getting at a new contemplation of states of affairs. Thomson-Jones (2005), likewise suggests that artworks can grant us access to new ways of looking at some circumstances and/or states of affairs, particularly in the ethical and/or political domain. Indeed, Gibson, whose paper has been the substantial informant of this section, concurs that neo-cognitivism is the most promising way forward for the cognitivist.
In recent work, Currie (2020) has penetrated the claims of the cognitivist in a variety of forms, from the thought-experiment theorist, to the empathy cultivator, to those that think we can gain propositional knowledge, particularly in the context of literary fiction. Currie suggests a move away from knowledge acquisition in cognitivism to the more “guarded” term “learning” (2020, p. 217), arguing that the thought experiments contained within philosophical and scientific discourse offer an epistemic gain with which literary fiction cannot gain parity. He also casts significant doubt on the reliability of truths extracted from fiction, such as doubts of the expertise of authors, evidence of the disconnection between creativity and understanding, and the little support there is for “the practices and institutions of fiction” being bearers of truths (Currie, 2020, p. 198). Ultimately, Currie’s conclusion suggests that “essential features of literary fiction – narrative complexity and the centrality of literary style – seriously detract from any substantial or epistemically rewarding parallel” (Lamarque, 2021), and hence that pursuit of the claim that “’fiction teaches us stuff’ needs to be abandoned” (Currie, 2020, p. 218). Notwithstanding, Currie is sure to emphasize that he does not think that literary fiction cannot grant us knowledge tout court. Rather, the point is that learning can take place through fiction, but often this is marred with an increase in “ignorance, error, or blunted sensibility” (Currie, 2020, p. 216). Where learning does successfully take place, Currie does suggest that such cognitive gain is contributory to literary value.
With regard to empathic understanding and its improvement via literary fiction, Currie notes that empathy for fictional characters should not be taken in similar light to that of empathy in ‘reality’. When empathizing with fictional characters, the success of such empathy is dependent upon our getting it right as the narrative tells of the characters (Currie, 2020, p. 201). A further distinction that should be drawn, Currie suggests, is that between on the one hand an increase in empathy, and on the other an increase in the capacity for this empathy to be used discriminatively and in a positive way (Currie, 2020, p. 204). Drawing on empirical literature, Currie argues the evidence of gain in positive empathic discriminatory capacities is lacking and so we should not be overly optimistic (Currie, 2020, pp. 207-209). Again, though, he does not exclude the possibility of positive gain being made in empathy as a result of fiction. Some may improve, some may not; some may grant a positive effect, some negative. One work could produce empathic gain for some individual, loss for another (Currie, 2020, p. 215-6). Currie’s agenda regarding empathy cultivation through literature, therefore, is to warn against an over-optimism, as it was in his above cases about more classical cognitivist claims.
In light of the continued skepticism about what the cognitivist can and cannot claim, the views that art can give us experiential and/or propositional knowledge have decreased in popularity. However, in the context of contributions to political-epistemic progress, Simoniti (2021) has claimed that some art not only gives us propositional knowledge of the same standard as objective means (such as textbooks) of getting at epistemic progress, but that art sometimes has an advantage over these other forms. Put simply, Simoniti thinks that artworks can target political discourse and engender similar kinds of knowledge as do textbooks or news articles, without invoking special or peculiar art-specific knowledge – a now relatively unpopular view – alongside being able to plug a gap that objective discourse leaves open.
This is because objective discourse must deal with generalizations: people, events, political parties, and so on, are categorized and essentialized such that a view about the general commands the scope of the whole group. Through art, we come into contact with particularized, individual narratives and characters, following their stories or depictions. Consequently, artworks point out that sometimes the ‘ideal spectator’, abstracted away and taking an encompassing view of states of affairs, events, and groups, is not always the most beneficial standpoint. By allowing us to focus on individuals, artworks can become genuine contributions to epistemic progress through reducing over-confidence in our positions, recalibrating our critical capacities, and facilitating a neutral position (Simoniti, 2021, p. 569-570).
Indeed, the view that artworks can serve as pieces of political criticism or commentary is not an unpopular view. Guernica, to which we have repeatedly referred, contains political content in its denunciation of war. Rivera’s Man at the Crossroads (1934) had political motivations in its content, commissioning, and subsequent destruction. Banksy, the enigmatic graffiti street artist is renowned for the political undertones of their art. Guerilla Girls’ critical works on the Met Museum, repetitively showing the injustice of female artists’ entry into the Met other than nude depictions, are raw forms of political commentary. The core question for philosophers looking at the value of art is whether political value is a genuine determinant of artistic value.
Most aestheticians would be willing to say that art can serve as political commentary or criticism, but not that this represents a specific value in and of itself. Rather, in similar fashion to Simoniti, it looks like the aesthetician would claim that this kind of value is cognitive value. That is, artworks contribute to our knowledge and understanding of politically meritorious and demeritorious states of affairs, raising our consciousness and awareness about them, and hopefully recalibrating our attitudes so as to realize the most sociopolitically beneficial states of affairs possible. This engenders, then, the assessment above regarding the interaction between cognitive value and artistic value, including whether art can genuinely bestow knowledge upon us. Alternatively, we might consider some political aspects of artworks to have effect upon their moral value, or indeed both the cognitive and moral value of the work.
One crucial import into this debate is the nature of aesthetic and/or artistic autonomy, which might be helpfully viewed as a recasting of the interaction debates considered above. This debate has encroached with particular force upon the political power of art. The idea concerns whether art can and whether it should provide criticism or commentary on political states of affairs. Although there is scholarship on the matter, we are not concerned here with political autonomy in terms of the restraint of the state from censoring or interfering with the production and dissemination of particular artworks. Rather, we are concerned with political autonomy in terms of whether art should be viewed politically. For example, if one is a formalist (or a radical autonomist as described above), one is going to suggest that art should not be assessed in terms of its political content. If one thinks that artistic value can be determined to some extent by cognitive and moral factors, then one is likely to allow political criticism and commentary to feature in the assessment of the value of an artwork.
Yet the debate regarding the political autonomy of art can become one that is much more entrenched. In this form, the debate concerns not whether artworks should be assessed in terms of their political content, but whether artists can or should involve political criticism or comment in the first place. The idea here is that the domain of art is supposed to be a realm of detachment from reality, not rendered ‘impure’ by external factors. Artworks are a source of disinterested pleasure, a way of escaping everyday life and the perils and anxieties we draw from it, appreciated solely for their form and the experiences that arise thereof. According to this kind of autonomist, artworks should not involve themselves with, and therefore feature, any political content. The task of art is to creatively detach from reality and serving political ends will only diminish that endeavor (for an edited collection on aesthetic and artistic autonomy, see Hulatt, 2013).
For some, such as W. E. B. Du Bois, the artwork and the political are inextricable: “all Art is propaganda and ever must be, despite the wailing of the purists” (Du Bois, 1926, 29). For Du Bois, art – especially at the time of his writing during the Harlem Renaissance – should be used for “furthering the cause of racial equality for African Americans” (Horton, 2013, p. 307), rather than being constructed to “pander to white audiences for the purposes of publication” (Horton, 2013, p. 308). The artist and their work cannot be severed from the ethical, political, and social environment within which they produce and operate, and the proposal of a detachment of the aesthetic and political is inimical to the cementing of extant progress in racial equality and rights (Horton, 2013). Art, then, should not be an autonomous avenue wherein politics is avoided and instead should be used as a political device.
Some artworks make an explicit and direct contribution to political progress and the rectification of social issues and problems. These works are taken to be generally captured by the terms socially engaged art and relational aesthetics. Relational aesthetics (see Bourriaud, 2002, for the seminal work that introduces this term) tends to refer to those works that do not take on traditional artistic qualities, devices, practices, mediums, or techniques, but instead take as their form the interpersonal relations that they affect. For example, Rirkrit Tiravanija has conducted a series of relational works in different galleries and exhibitions, constructing makeshift kitchens that serve Thai food to visitors and staff alike, fostering dialogue between them and establishing (or furthering) social bonds. Socially engaged works are executed in ways very similar to social work by engendering direct socially facilitative effects. This might include Oda Projesi’s workshops and picnics for children in the community, Women on Waves, the Dorchester Housing Projects, or the works of 2015 Turner Prize winning collective Assemble. In each instance, the artist(s) make a direct contribution to the resolution or easing of some social issue. In this way, their goals are pragmatic, rooted in tangible, actualized progress, rather than beautiful or formal as we often take artworks to be.
These works are (i) accepted as works of art, and (ii) have value therein. As such, they have artistic value. Simoniti suggests that they “worryingly disregard the confines of the artworld” (2018, p. 72) by lacking the employment of traditional artistic and aesthetic form or values. In fact, it is precisely in their nature that they deviate from, as we have seen, traditional forms of artistic production and merit. As a consequence, Simoniti introduces an account of artistic value that can capture the social-work-esque achievements of these works and capture these achievements as valuable qua art. Called the pragmatic account of artistic value, it is used to explain only the value of these works, and states that value v, possessed by an artwork, is an artistic value if v is the positive political, cognitive, or ethical impact of the work (Simoniti, 2018, p. 76). That is, the value of these works, as artworks, is found in the positive, pragmatic contribution they make to sociopolitical progress. It should be qualified that Simoniti does not think the pragmatic view should be extended to all forms of art when assessing their value. Instead, it is the sensible option to take with regard to the artistic value of specific forms of art, such as socially engaged art or relational art. Other forms of art, of course, can have their artistic value assessed in terms of the positions we have already explored.
There are some concerns one might wish to raise with these pragmatic works. Firstly, one might question whether we should be referring to these as artworks. If they make no attempt at semblance of traditional artistic forms or value, then why call them artworks? Indeed, if they operate closer to the sphere of social work than art, and indeed have no traditionally artistic qualities, we might want to call them social-works rather than art-works. The relevance here for our task – concerning artistic value – is that if artistic value is something’s value qua or as art, then it needs to be art to have it! Simoniti appeals to the institutional and historicist theories of art to meet this objection. A related concern regards the nature of artistic value as a comparative notion; it is just how good or bad an artwork is. If socially engaged works have a specific account of artistic value that applies to them, then it doesn’t look like we can provide a legitimate comparison of them to more traditional artistic forms. Moreover, as this particular domain of value assessment perhaps aligns with social work more so than art, we might argue that the comparison should take place between socially engaged works and, well, social work, rather than artworks. If this is the case, then we might wonder if the value assessment is actually about the works qua art, or some other domain, that is, social work.
Finally, one might suggest that extant accounts of artistic value may indeed capture the artistic value of these works. Consider, for example, the moral beauty view of Gaut that we saw earlier. If we can observe an interaction between ethically meritorious character and action and aesthetic value, suggesting that the former are beautiful, then this could be used to apply to the ethically meritorious character and action of these relational works. Likewise, the functional beauty view, endorsed in particular by Parsons and Carlson (2008), suggests that aesthetic value can be attributed on the basis of something’s appearance corresponding to its intended function. For example, a flat tyre is aesthetically displeasing because it appears as inhibiting the function of a car (Bueno, 2009, p. 47). Perhaps, we might claim, socially engaged works appear in a way that corresponds to their intended function. These two brief parses might suggest that the introduction of a specialized notion of artistic value may not be needed.
There is a wealth of available views regarding artistic value, its determinants, its relationship to the value of art, its relationship to aesthetic value, whether and how determinants can affect it, and so on. Here, I want to provide a brief outline of the views discussed and available positions/accounts. The purpose is to provide a brief, working statement about the views at hand. This is especially useful as sometimes multiple different views can adopt the same heading term. This set is by no means exhaustive, may be incomplete, and will be updated as is seen fit.
Aestheticism – aesthetic value and artistic value are one and the same value, and only aesthetic value matters for determining artistic value (things like cognitive value, moral value, political value, don’t matter for an assessment qua art).
Anti-cognitivism – there is no such thing as a distinctively artistic truth, or a truth that only art can teach us (see Stolnitz, 1992).
Cognitivism – artworks have something to grant to us in terms of knowledge. This might be new propositional knowledge, experiential knowledge, specifically artistic knowledge, or the artwork may clarify or strengthen already-held truths.
Cognitive Immoralism – moral defects in an artwork can be artistically valuable insofar as they provide some cognitive value (for example, cultivation of our moral understanding).
Definition-Evaluation Parallelism – what makes an artwork an artwork is x, x is a value of art, and the value of art is determined by one sole value, x. Not all value definitions of art conform to definition-evaluation parallelism.
Eliminativism – aesthetic value and artistic value are one and the same thing, and as such talk of artistic value is redundant (things like cognitive value, moral value, and political value might matter for the eliminativist, if they commit to a broad notion of aesthetic value).
Error-theory about artistic value – aesthetic value is what we mean by value qua art, there is no such thing as artistic value. We are in error when we talk about it.
Ethicism – moral merits are always aesthetic merits, and moral defects are always aesthetic defects.
Immoralism – moral defects in an artwork can be aesthetic/artistic merits.
Interactionist – (about moral value) someone who thinks that the moral value of an artwork interacts with that artwork’s aesthetic/artistic value.
Moderate Autonomism – aesthetic value is all that matters for artistic value, but artworks might be assessed with reference to the moral domain. However, the latter has no bearing on the artistic value of the work (its value qua art)
Moderate Moralism – in some cases, a work of art is susceptible to treatment in the moral domain, and this can affect its artistic value (its value qua art).
Neo-cognitivism – artworks can be cognitively valuable, and their artistic value augmented as a result, insofar as they can serve to clarify or improve knowledge we already possess.
Pluralism about artistic value – there are many determinants of artistic value, such as aesthetic value, cognitive value, moral value, and political value.
Pragmatic View of Artistic Value – artistic value, explicitly and solely for the set of socially engaged artworks, is the positive cognitive, ethical, or political effect they entail. This view should not be used to apply to other kinds of art, such as painting, sculpture, music, and so on (see Simoniti, 2018).
Radical Autonomism – aesthetic value is all that matters for artistic value, and any assessment of morality with regard to an artwork is inappropriate even if one does not think it bears weight on artistic value.
Radical Moralism – the artistic value of a work of art is determined by, or reducible to, its moral value.
Robust Immoralism – moral defects in an artwork give rise to artistic value insofar as a work achieves aesthetic success through aesthetic properties that arise because of them. For example, fictional murder may be valuable insofar as it invites excitement, vivacity, or mystery.
The Trivial Theory (of artistic value) – artworks have lots of different determinant values, none of which are specific to, or characteristic of, art.
Value Definitions of Art – what makes an artwork an artwork is x, and x is also a (or the) value of art. If x is the sole determinant of the value of art, then the value definition is an instance of definition-evaluation parallelism.
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