Vienna Circle

The Vienna Circle is a group of philosophers who gathered around Moritz Schlick, after his coming in Vienna in 1922. They organized a philosophical association, named Verein Ernst Mach (Ernst Mach Association). However, meetings on philosophy of science and epistemology began as early as 1907, promoted by Frank, Hahn and Neurath, who later arranged to bring Schlick at the University of Vienna. Among Vienna Circle’s members were M. Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, H. Feigl, P. Frank, K. Gödel, H. Hahn, V. Kraft, O. Neurath, F. Waismann. Also K. R. Popper and H. Kelsen had many contacts with the Vienna Circle, although they did not belong to it. At the meetings, the Tractatus of Ludwig Wittgenstein was also discussed, and there were several meetings between Wittgenstein, Schlick, Waismann and Carnap. In 1929 Hahn, Neurath and Carnap published the manifesto of the circle: Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung. Der Wiener Kreis (A scientific world-view. The Vienna Circle).

Vienna Circle was very active in advertising the new philosophical ideas of logical positivism. Several congresses on epistemology and philosophy of science were organized, with the help of the Berlin Circle. There were some preparatory congresses: Prague (1929), Könisberg (1930), Prague (1934) and then the first congress on scientific philosophy held in Paris (1935), followed by congresses in Copenhagen (1936), Paris (1937), Cambridge, England (1938), Cambridge, Mass. (1939). The Könisberg congress (1930) was very important, because Gödel announced he had proved the completeness of first order logic and the incompleteness of arithmetic. Another very interesting congress was the one held in Copenhagen (1936), which was dedicated to quantum physics and causality.

Between 1928 and 1937, the Vienna Circle published ten books in a series named Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on the Scientific Worldview), edited by Schlick and Frank. Among these works was Logik der Forschung, 1935, which is the first book published by K. R. Popper. Seven works were published in another series, called Einheitswissenschaft (Unified Science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn’s death) and Morris (from 1938). In 1930 Carnap and Hans Reichenbach undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis, which was published between 1930 and 1940 (from 1939 the editors were Neurath, Carnap and Morris).

The following is the list of works published in the two series edited by the Vienna Circle.

(1) Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on scientific world-view), edit by Schlick and Frank.

  • R. von Mises, Wahrscheinlichkeit, Statistik und Wahrheit, 1928 (Probability, statistics, and truth, New York : Macmillan company, 1939)
  • R. Carnap, Abriss der Logistik, 1929
  • M. Schlick, Fragen der Ethik, 1930 (Problems of ethics, New York : Prentice-Hall, 1939)
  • O. Neurath, Empirische Soziologie, 1931
  • P. Frank, Das Kausalgesetz und seine Grenzen, 1932 (The law of causality and its limits, Dordrecth ; Boston : Kluwer, 1997)
  • O. Kant, Zur Biologie der Ethik, 1932
  • R. Carnap, Logische Syntax der Sprache, 1934 (The logical syntax of language, New York : Humanities, 1937)
  • K. R. Popper, Logik der Forschung, 1934 (The logic of scientific discovery, New York : Basic Books, 1959)
  • J. Schächeter, Prologomena zu einer kritischen Grammatik, 1935 (Prolegomena to a critical grammar, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1973)
  • V. Kraft, Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftliche Wertlehre, 1937 (Foundations for a scientific analysis of value, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1981)

(2) Einheitswissenschaft (Unified science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn’s death), Morris (from 1938)

  • H. Hahn, Logik, Mathematik und Naturerkennen, 1933
  • O. Neurath, Einheitswissenschaft und Psychologie, 1933
  • R. Carnap, Die Aufgabe der Wissenschaftlogik, 1934
  • P. Frank, Das Ende der mechanistichen Physik, 1935
  • O. Neurath, Was bedeutet rationale Wirtschaftsbetrachtung, 1935
  • O. Neurath, E. Brunswik, C. Hull, G. Mannoury, J. Woodger, Zur Enzyclopädie der Einheitswissenschaft. Vorträge, 1938
  • R. von Mises, Ernst Mach und die empiritische Wissenschaftauffasung, 1939

These works are translated in Unified science – The Vienna Circle monograph series originally edited by Otto Neurath, Kluwer, 1987.

The members of the Vienna Circle were dispersed when the Nazi Party came to power in Germany; many of them emigrated to the U.S.A., where they taught in several universities. Schlick remained in Austria, but in 1936 he was killed by a Nazi sympathizer student in the University of Vienna.

See also Carnap.

Author Information

Mauro Murzi