Help Sheet for Copy Editing Articles

Each new IEP article should be copy edited by a copy editor. However, it is not the responsibility of a copy editor to turn a poorly written article into a well written article, but only to revise obvious errors and to enforce the Encyclopedia’s style guidelines. When you have completed your copy editing, save the file under a new name, and email it to the general editor Brad Dowden.

Table of Contents

  1. Copy Editing New Submissions
  2. Copy Editing Existing Articles
  3. Depth or Extent of Copy Editing
  4. Avoid Awkward Phrases
  5. Style Preferences
    1. Author Guidelines
    2. Opening Summary
    3. Article Title
    4. Headings
    5. Table of Contents
    6. Author Information
    7. American vs. British English
    8. References and Further Reading
    9. Hyperlinks (Links, Web Address, URLs)
    10. Footnotes and Endnotes
    11. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous
    12. Latin Abbreviations
    13. Referring to Yourself or Your Article
    14. Pejorative Terms
    15. Italics for Emphasis, Not Underlining or Boldface
    16. Dates
    17. Initials
    18. Using “Now” and “Recent”
    19. Quotations
    20. Quotation Marks
    21. Contractions
    22. Dashes and hyphens
    23. ‘is’ vs. ‘will be’

1. Copy Editing New Submissions

The name of the copy editor is never revealed either to the author. Here is an example of the copy editing process from the volunteer copy editor’s viewpoint. The general editor (probably Brad Dowden) will send you an original article that has been approved by the referees and modified by the author and perhaps the area editor. Normally this will be a Microsoft Word file. Make a copy of this file, and save it under a new name, perhaps by adding “copyedited” at the end of the file name. Your goal is to produce a copy edited version which you will send back to the general editor. The general editor will acknowledge receipt of your work, but if you do not get a response within a week, send a query.

Your new version of the article will then be approved, perhaps with a revision or two, and sent on to a formatter to produce a formatted version that is posted within the Encyclopedia. You will receive a notification when the article is posted. This notification will normally be a cc of an email to the area editor indicating that he or she can pass along the good news to the author. When you are in the mood to copy edit another article, write and say so.

When you are ready to begin copy editing, make a copy of the file and click on Review | Track changes ( assuming it is a Microsoft Word file). Then revise (that is, mark up) the document to improve it.

Your goal is to improve the English without affecting the philosophical content. But be a minimalist. Poor writers should live with most of the consequences of their writing ability, although the copy editor will make some minimal improvements to correct clear errors or violations of the Encyclopedia’s style requirements. If you have any doubts about whether something needs to be changed, then use the Comment feature of Word to describe the problem, or write to the person who sent you the article.

When you are done copy editing, send back to the general editor the marked-up copy of the article with all the Track Changes, so it is clear what changes you have made. But before sending your changes, do one last check by choosing Review | Tracking | No Markup [without accepting the changes] so you can see for yourself how the article would look if all your changes were accepted. That last step often helps to reveal small imperfections that still need to be fixed.

2. Copy Editing Existing Articles

For articles that already have been published, but for some reason were not properly copy edited, the general editors will advise you on the proper procedure for copy editing. Normally this involves using an html editor rather than a word processor.

3. Depth or Extent of Copy Editing

How much copy editing is appropriate? Don’t be too picky. Be a minimalist and change only what is clearly confusing or sloppy.  The bottom line is that authors who are weak writers must live with what they create.

Here is the list of rules that all good copy editors should follow:

1. Be more or less specific.
2. Use not bad grammars.
3. Proofread carefully to see if you any words out.
4. Don’t use no double negatives.
5. Avoid tumbling off the cliff of triteness into the dark abyss of overused metaphors.
6. Take care that your verb and your subject is in agreement.
7. No sentence fragments.
8. Placing a comma between subject and predicate, is not correct.
9. Who needs rhetorical questions?
10. Use the apostrophe in it’s proper place.
11. Avoid colloquial stuff, like totally.
12. Avoid those run-on sentences you know the ones they stop and then start again they should be separated with semicolons.
13. The passive voice should be used infrequently.
14. And don’t start sentences with a conjunction.
15. Excessive use of exclamation points can be disastrous!!!!
16. Exaggeration is a million times worse than understatement.
17. Stamp out and eliminate redundancy because, if you reread your work, you will find on rereading that a great deal of repetition can be avoided by rereading and editing, so reread your work and improve it by editing out the repetition you noticed during the rereading.
18. Tis incumbent upon one to employ the vernacular and eschew archaisms.
19. It’s not O.K. to use ampersands & abbreviations.
20. Parenthetical remarks (however relevant) are usually (but not always) an obstacle for readers (and make it harder on readers even if you’re being careful) who have the task of understanding your work (article, passage, document, and so forth).

The list is not original with the IEP.

4. Avoid Awkward Phrases

Notice this sentence:

If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-affects, then one has to wonder how human experience can be anything but an ineffectual, spectatorial undergoing.

The last two words are confusing. Rewrite them this way:

…spectator process.

Maybe you also noticed that the term “after-affects” should be “after-effects.”

5. Style Preferences

a. Author Guidelines

Become familiar with the author guidelines so that you have a good sense of what we expect from our authors. You are the enforcer of those guidelines. The IEP prefers the Chicago Manual of Style for its documentation style, but if your author has already written it in APA style or some other coherent style, then you can leave it as is. Our standards are lax, especially for the final section called “References and Further Reading,” so you can focus more on clarity than style here.

b. Opening Summary

All articles should begin with a 200-500 word summary (synopsis). If the summary is absent, or not within this range, then contact the person who sent you the article. The summary should not contain a heading or subheadings or internal links to the table of contents. It is OK for it to be broken into paragraphs. Quotations in the summary (or even in the body of the article) do not need accompanying citations other than the speaker’s name. In this sense we are more like encyclopedias or Scientific American Magazine than like philosophy journal articles. The IEP style is to refer to one of its own articles not as an “entry” but as an “article.” Avoid the future tense; have the summary say the article covers topic X rather than say it will cover topic X.

c. Article Title

Capitalize words as if the title is the name of a book. For articles on an individual philosopher, do not omit the philosopher’s first name. For an article on an individual philosopher, include the birth date and, if the philosopher has died, the death date, else leave the death date blank. Use an em-dash (—) and not a hyphen (-) between the two dates. Use no blanks around the em dash. Use periods in “B.C.E.” and “C.E.” without blanks. Use “C.E.” only if the year’s number is less than 500. Abbreviate “circa” as “c.” rather than “ca” or “CA.” Do not insert a blank between “c.” and the date, as in Anaxagoras (c.500—428 B.C.E.). If both the birth date and the death date are guesses, then use two circas as in: Anaxarchus (c.380—c.320 B.C.E.), or use question marks as in: Anaxarchus (380?—320? B.C.E.). Abbreviate “century” as “cn.” and separate this from the date number with a blank, as in the following: Alexander Polyhistor (1st cn. B.C.E.). If an article about a philosopher contains both a second spelling and a date, then insert the second spelling, a comma, a blank, and the date within parentheses, as in : Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu, 369—298 B.C.E.).

d. Headings

Make sure the headings in the article match the headings in the table of contents. Trust the table of contents when you discover a disagreement. All article titles, headings and sub-headings should be in caps and smalls. Many authors will use full caps; but change these in order to conform to our style. Capitalize the first word of any title and all major words but not prepositions (for, between, about), articles (a, the), coordinating conjunctions (but, and, yet, or, so), or the “to” in infinitives. Note the exception for the article “a” below. Examples:

There Is More Than One

Questions about the Meaning of Life

I Want to Hold Your Hand

It’s between Here and There

Losing a Theater: A Manifesto

e. Table of Contents

The opening summary should be followed by a table of contents that indicates the section headings and sub-headings of the article. Contact the editor if this isn’t the case in the article you are copy editing. Make sure the headings in the table of contents match the headings within the article.

One of the most common errors made by authors is to begin their article with a table of contents, then to change the heading of some section during composition of the article and then to forget to go back and also revise the table of contents. For headings, the IEP formatter program pays attention only to the headings in the table of contents, and never to any heading within the article (so you don’t need to bother making corrections in them). If a section is added into the article by the author but is not mentioned in the table of contents, then this causes a large problem if no one catches the error before it is published. It causes tedious revising of the computer code.

The table of contents can either be flat (for example in Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds) or hierarchical (indented), with main sections and then sub-sections within them (for example in Aztec Philosophy). In either case, the table of contents must use the following structure and labeling convention.

  1. Heading One
    1. Subheading One
      1. Subsubheading One
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
      2. Subsubheading Two
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
    2. Subheading Two
  2. Heading Two
  3. Heading Three
  4. References and Further Reading

Minimize the use of italics, but italics are OK in headers for book titles or foreign words. Never allow your author to use boldface or underlines in the table of contents.

f. Author Information

Remove all titles from the author’s name such as “Dr.” or “Professor.”  Delete the department name and the university’s address. Remove the city. Add the country without abbreviation, except for “U. S. A.” (and use blanks after the periods in this abbreviation). For example, change

Sir Michael Dummett, professor
Dept. of Philosophy
College of Arts & Sciences
Univ. of Geneva
2010 La Mer Avenue
Boston, Massachusetts
United States


Michael Dummett
University of Geneva
U. S. A.

Use the English translation of the University’s name.

g. American vs. British English

The IEP prefers American English, but British English is acceptable; just be consistent throughout the article.

British spelling: Aristotelean, favourite, defence, sceptic, behaviour, realisation

American spelling: Aristotelian, favorite, defense, skeptic, behavior, realization

British punctuation:  ‘.  “.
American punctuation: .’  .”

Do not change any words if they occur within the correct titles of books or articles or quotations. In an American article, do not change the reference “The Foetus: Its Defence” (for a book published in the U.K.) even though its title would be “The Fetus: Its Defense” if it were published in the U.S.A.  Regarding punctuation, American English uses double quote marks around direct quotations, names of journal articles, mentioned terms, and scare quotes. British English uses single quote marks for all these.

h. References and Further Reading

The Encyclopedia recommends that authors use the MLA style of references and in-text citations; however, the IEP does not enforce this recommendation and allows almost any style that is coherent.  The last main section of every table of contents must be named “References and Further Reading.” Articles from authors will very often contain an ending section called “Sources” or “Bibliography” or “References” or “Readings,” or “Notes.” Change these to “References and Further Reading.” This section can have sub-headings such as “Original Sources,” “More Advanced Studies,” and so forth. The entries in the list  may or may not be annotated (see Defeaters in Epistemology for an example). The entire section should not exceed about 1,500 words, especially if it is not annotated. Let us know if it does. When there are more than two entries for the same author, repeat the author’s name in the second and subsequent entries. The MLA and many authors use a dash in place of the author’s name when it occurs a second time; replace all these dashes with the author’s actual name. Do not permit authors to say an article is forthcoming; highlight these occurrences with a comment, and the general editor will decide what to do about them.

i. Hyperlinks (Links, Web Addresses, URLs)

Hyperlinks, links, web addresses, and URLs are the same thing. Links to other articles within the Encyclopedia are always encouraged. Some authors are overly eager to include these links and will ask for a hyperlink for every occurrence of the term, but you should allow them to include only one link per term, usually upon the term’s first occurrence in the body of the article. Usually you will want to avoid using hyperlinks in the opening summary. If the article comes with hyperlinks there, then move them into the main body of the article. We have a rather vague policy about linking to articles outside of the IEP. We allow only stable links. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy and a professional society’s collection of Wittgenstein’s original correspondence are two examples of sites with stable URLs, but a link to an article on someone’s personal Webpage would not be stable because it would be too likely to become broken over the next fifty years. It is optional whether to add a date accessed in their section on References and Further Reading.

j. Footnotes and Endnotes

Articles should contain neither footnotes nor endnotes. If you notice that your article contains them, and you haven’t been told explicitly to include them, then write the editor about what to do.

k. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous

In journal articles, authors regularly thank their colleagues for help in writing the article.  Doing this is not proper for our encyclopedia articles.  The authors should thank their colleagues privately.  The copy editor should remove all the thank yous and acknowledgments.

l. Latin abbreviations

Avoid most Latin abbreviations. Here are the replacements:

cf. | compare
e.g. | for example
et. al. | and others
etc. | and so forth
i.e. | that is
NB | note
viz. | namely

It is OK to use “ibid.” and “op. cit.”

m. Referring to Yourself or Your Article

Revise these sorts of self-referential terms:

  • We will show in the next section… [The next section shows…]
  • This concludes what I take to be the major influences on Mitchell’s thought. [This concludes the major influences on Mitchell’s thought.]
  • My book about him says… [Jones (2005) says…]
  • I believe Passmore’s description is right. [Passmore’s description is generally accepted.]

n. Pejorative Terms

Do not permit your authors to use pejorative phrases such as “the idealist curse” and “which certain irrational philosophers still believe.” Do not allow personal attacks or snide remarks.

o. Use Italics, Not Underlining

Do not allow authors to use underlining anywhere. Use italics. Avoid boldface, too. The reason is that underlines and boldface are gaudy.

p. Dates

Unlike in article titles, in the article body and section titles and the table of contents please separate a range of dates with a hyphen (-) and not an em dash (—). Use “B.C.E.” rather than “B.C.” or “BC” or “BCE” for dates before the birth of Jesus. “B.C.E.” stands for “Before the Common Era.” The IEP is multicultural, so we do not want to place all events on a Christian timeline that uses AD and BC.  Change “Pliny (A.D. 62-113)” to “Pliny (62-113 C.E.).”  We use C.E. only when it might be unclear whether the date is before or after the beginning of the Christian era; normally we wouldn’t use “C.E.” for any date after 500 C.E. Do not use any blanks in “B.C.E.” but rather insert a blank between the number and the “B.C.E.” Regarding approximate dates, our style is to use either “Ramanuja (c.1017-c.1137)” or “Ramanuja (1017?-1137?).” It is OK to insert extra blanks as in “Ramanuja (c. 1017-c. 1137). Use “c.” for “circa” and “cn.” for “century.” Do not use “ca” for “circa.”  When separating two dates, use a hyphen within the body of the article and the title of a section and the table of contents, but use an em-dash in the title of the entire article. Use no blanks around the hyphen or dash in any of those places. For disputed dates within a definite range, do not use circa or question marks, but instead use this style: “Ramanuja (1017/21-1137).” If only a death date is known, then use “Ramanuja (d. 1137)” with a blank after the period.

Chicago style prefers “fourth century” to “4th century,” but both are allowed in the IEP so long as the article’s style is consistent.

q. Initials

Use periods after initials, and use a blank between initials; for example, change both “CI Lewis” and “C.I. Lewis” to “C. I. Lewis.”

r. Using “Now” and “Recent”

With certain exceptions, do not allow authors to use the terms “now” or “recent” or “recently” or “a few years ago.” For example, if an author says, “Recently this topic has become attractive to philosophers of mathematics,” this can be changed to, “In the early 21st century, this topic became attractive to philosophers of mathematics.” An exception would be if the author were saying “The ‘now’ is real, but the future is not.”

s. Quotations

Long quotations, those longer than three published lines, should be indented. Remove the outer quotation marks. Unlike in journal articles, citations for all quotations are not required in IEP articles.

Although American-style double quotation marks are preferred, the IEP accepts the British-style, or single quotes when the entire article is written in British English rather than American English.

Emphasis can be added to a term by placing it either within quotation marks or in italics, although italics is preferred, as when a philosopher says mathematical existence statements should be taken literally. Do not use quotation marks merely to draw attention to slang, to disown trite expressions, or to justify an attempt at humor.

Incorrect: The mind contains the “stuff of thought.”
Correct: The mind contains the stuff of thought.

t. Quotation Marks

For American usage of quotations , the commas and periods always go inside the quotation marks while semicolons and colons always go outside.

Example for quotations: The French philosophers said, “yes,” “no,” and “maybe.” Kant said “yes”; Kripke agreed.

Notice that the commas separating the quotations are inside the quotation marks. So is the period.

The above rule may or may not be followed for names, but be consistent throughout the entire article. If the above rule is not followed, then follow this alternative rule: bring the commas and periods inside the quotation marks, as follows:

Example for names: Philosophers have named them “entities”, “things”, and “objects”.

Notice that the commas separating the names are outside the quotation marks, as is the period at the end.

Regarding semicolons and colons, be sure they fall outside the quotation marks.

Example for semicolon: Kant wrote, “There is no fact of the matter here”; Kripke disagreed with him. Then Kant wrote, “There is a fact of the matter here,” and Kripke agreed with him.

Notice that after the word “here” in the first sentence we used quote-semicolon, but after the word “here” in the second sentence we used comma-quote.

For quotations that contain exclamation points or question marks, do not add commas. Treat the situation as in these examples:

“Notice what that is,” said Kant.

“Notice that!” said Kant.

“What is that?” asked Kripke.

u. Contractions

Unpack contractions that are not direct quotations. For example, change “don’t” to “do not.”

v. Dashes and Hyphens

When separating a clause or phrase from the rest of the sentence, always use an em dash (—), and not a double hyphen (–), nor an en dash (–). Do not use a blank space before or after the em dash.

w. ‘is’ vs. ‘will be’

Sentences referring to what is coming next within the article should use the present tense rather than the future tense. For example, use sentence (1) rather than (2):

  1. Both act and rule utilitarianism are discussed in the next section.
  2. Both act and rule utilitarianism will be discussed in the next section.

There are additional grammar guidelines available at:

Help Sheet for Copy Editing Articles

An encyclopedia of philosophy articles written by professional philosophers.