Kristina Wasa (1626—1689)

WasaThe flamboyant life of Kristina, the Queen of Sweden, one of Europe’s most mercurial monarchs, has long overshadowed her contribution to philosophy. When histories of philosophy mention her at all, they usually present her as the pupil of Descartes and as the patron of philosophical salons. But Kristina’s relationship to philosophy transcends her auxiliary roles.  In her writings she makes her own distinctive contribution to moral and political philosophy. Her ethical texts explore the nature of virtue, defend gender equity, and posit criteria for religious truth. Her political works defend the civic tolerance of religious minorities. Like many a salonnière of the period, Kristina analyzes the nature and variations of love, but her theological and political interests provide her with a broader philosophical horizon than the predominantly romantic one of many French salons. Her philosophical work often explores the issue which bedeviled her political career: the nature and proper exercise of authority.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Critic of Descartes
    2. Moral Philosophy
      1. Critic of La Rochefoucauld
      2. Moral Psychology
      3. Sexual Equality
      4. Epistemology
      5. Political Philosophy
      6. Religious Philosophy
      7. Philosophical Eclecticism
    3. Apologist for Tolerance
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on December 8, 1626, Kristina Wasa belonged to the Swedish royal family. Her father was King Gustav II Adolf and her mother Maria Eleonora of Brandenburg. The mother disdained her daughter, having hoped for a boy who would become king, but her father cherished the child, insisting on an exacting education for her.

In 1630 the king presented Kristina to the Swedish Estates as his successor to the throne. The army and the Estates ratified King Gustav’s proposal. The king appointed Chancellor Axel Oxenstierna as the regent of Sweden, to govern the nation during the king’s frequent military absences and to supervise Kristina until she reached her majority. King Gustav insisted that Kristina be provided with the princely education that would have been accorded a male heir. Headed by the theologian Johannes Matthiae, a group of tutors undertook the education of the crown princess. An irenic (peace-seeking) theologian whose views on pan-Christian unity disturbed the more sectarian Lutherans at court, Matthiae helped to form the young queen’s views on religious tolerance.

Killed at the battle of Lutzen in 1632, King Gustav was succeeded by Kristina on the Swedish throne. The young queen inherited an empire which included Finland, Estonia, and parts of Norway, Germany, and Russia. Kristina’s education intensified. She mastered a series of foreign languages: Latin, German, French, Italian, and Spanish. There is even evidence she knew some  Hebrew and Arabic. French would become her preferred language of written communication. She studied the major works of classical philosophy, indicating a predilection for the writings of the Stoics, notably Epictetus and Seneca. She also mastered the disciplines considered essential for a warrior king: equestrianship, fencing, and military strategy.

In 1640 Queen Kristina began to participate in the national government and attend meetings of the cabinet of ministers. In 1644 she reached her majority and was formally crowned as monarch of Sweden. She quickly moved to limit the influence of the regent Oxenstierna, who she believed had unnecessarily restricted her power during her minority. A patron of the arts and sciences, she pursued her dream of turning Stockholm into the Athens of the North. Fascinated by modern technology, she founded the first Swedish newspaper in 1645.

In 1646 Kristina began a correspondence with Descartes through the mediation of Pierre Chanut, the French ambassador to Sweden. The letters explored the nature of love, the question of the universe’s infinity, and the nature of the sovereign good. In 1648 she played a crucial role in ending the Thirty Years’ War with the Treaty of Westphalia. The controversial treaty attempted to resolve the religious quarrel among Protestants and Catholics by declaring that the religion of the state should be the religion of the one who rules the state.

During this period she also began to constitute her personal court of palace scholars. Isaac Vossius headed the coterie, which included Samuel Bochart, Nicholas Heinsius, Christian Ravius, Claudius Salmsius, and Johannes Scheffer. This predominantly Dutch circle of scholars adhered to the neo-Stoic theories defended by Justus Lipsius at the University of Leyden.  Her prize court scholar was Descartes. Arriving in Stockholm at Kristina’s invitation in 1650, Descartes tutored the queen in philosophy during 5:00 A.M. sessions at the palace in the freezing winter. Within four months, Descartes had died of pneumonia.

Kristina had often guardedly expressed her skepticism at the tenets of Lutheranism, the official Swedish state religion. In 1651 she began clandestine communications with the Jesuits Francesco Malines and Paolo Casati. She became more withdrawn and began to consider the possibility of abdication, for reasons which remain obscure. In June 1654 Kristina abdicated the Swedish throne and named her cousin Charles X Gustav as her successor. As soon as she left Swedish territory, she began a wandering journey across Europe, often baffling observers with her use of male clothing.

In 1655 Kristina converted to Catholicism. Publicizing this conversion of a monarch from the heart of Lutheran Europe, Pope Alexander VII greeted her with lavish ceremonies in Rome. Vatican circles provided the queen with an apartment and other financial benefits. Although Kristina would remain a practicing Catholic, her increasingly erratic behavior in Rome and rumors of her private skeptical remarks about religion later alienated her from church authorities.

After her Roman triumph, Kristina resumed her wandering through Europe. In 1656 she held a conference in France to debate issues concerning the essence and variations of love. She shocked public opinion with a visit to the most notorious courtesan of Paris, the Epicurean Ninon de Lenclos. In 1657 her political ambitions resurfaced. She plotted to take the throne of Naples. During a stay at Fontainebleau, she learned that one of her servants, Monaldeschi, had revealed her plot to her critics. She ordered the execution of the traitor in her presence, an act which shocked public opinion and intensified speculation on the former queen’s mental balance.

In 1660 Kristina visited her estates in Sweden. She later received tutorials in astronomy from Lubenitz. In 1667 she returned to Sweden with a new political project: a plan to have herself crowned the new queen of Poland. When the plan collapsed, she returned permanently to Rome and pursued her life as a writer and patron of the arts and sciences. In 1670 she began writing her maxim collections, Reasonable Sentiments and Heroic Sentiments. In 1686 her letter defending tolerance of the Huguenots was published in Pierre Bayle’s Nouvelles de la République des Lettres; she also wrote a manifesto defending tolerance for Roman Jews. She installed an astronomical observatory in her apartment and conducted a scientific academy which featured the astronomer Cassini and the physiologist Borelli. She founded a philosophical academy, served as a patron of the musicians Scarlatti and Corelli, and commissioned a book defending the controversial architect Bernini. Spiritually later in life, she indicated a sympathy for Quietism, a controversial mystical movement then agitating the Catholic world.

On April 19, 1689 Kristina died in Rome.

2. Works

A prolific writer, Kristina of Sweden left behind her a disparate collection of texts, written principally in French. Her immense correspondence includes epistolary exchanges with numerous philosophers, notably Descartes, Pascal, Gassendi, and Grotius. The many female correspondents include Anna Maria Van Schurman and Madeleine de Scudéry. Her uncompleted autobiography, modestly entitled The Life of Queen Kristina, Written by Herself, Dedicated to God, must be read with caution. Many incidents in the queen’s life are altered or embellished to suit the hagiographic purposes of the book. Kristina’s moral philosophy appears in three collections of maxims, laconic aphorisms inspired by the maxime literature of the salon of Madame de Sablé. They are Commentaries on the Maxims of La Rochefoucauld, Commonplace Book: Reasonable Sentiments, and Heroic Sentiments. In many ways the most typical of Kristina’s writings are two historical essays: Reflections on the Life and Actions of Alexander the Great and Reflections on the Life and Works of Caesar. They celebrate the historic models of the heroic life which Kristina considered the moral ideal of the monarch. Only with the edition of Johann Arckenholtz (1750-60) were the writings of Kristina presented as a unified canon.

3. Philosophical Themes

Kristina’s philosophical preoccupations are primarily ethical in nature. Like other salon philosophers, her interest in moral psychology pivots around the question of love and friendship. As a monarch, her virtue theory focuses on the heroic virtues which she believes essential for the successful ruler. Her political theory and religious philosophy emphasize the issue of authority and the legitimate use of power. Embedded in her moral philosophy are secondary epistemological and metaphysical concerns.

a. Critic of Descartes

Kristina’s philosophical dialogue with Descartes is pursued principally through the intermediary of Pierre Chanut, French ambassador to Sweden. Starting in 1646, a series of letters between Descartes and the monarch reveals Kristina as a critic of several key points of Cartesian philosophy.

The initial dialogue concerns the nature of love. Chanut presents Kristina in a vaguely Cartesian light as a being liberated from the constraints of tradition: “having the wonderful disposition of being freed from the servitude of popular opinion” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; December 1, 1646]. He then poses Kristina’s question on love: “When we  use love or hatred poorly, which is the worse of these disorders or poor usages?  The term ‘love’ must be understood in a philosophical manner and not the way it is often understood in girlish talk” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; December 1, 1646].

Descartes’s lengthy response is a veritable treatise on love. He subdivides Kristina’s question into three considerations: “1. What love is. 2. Whether the natural light alone teaches us to love God. 3. Which of the disorders and poor usages is worse: love or hate?” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; February 1, 1647]. His response theologizes the questions. In presenting his theory of love, certain distinctive themes of Cartesian philosophy emerge. Inasmuch as love is simply a passion, it is only a mechanical response of the body to some desired external object. Love can become properly intellectual and more than a passion when human reason decides that some spiritual object should be possessed and deliberates on the means to possess it. The love of God is a particularly thorny issue since the divine attributes detected by natural reason alone (that is, reason unaided by supernatural revelation, faith, and grace) are minimal. Nonetheless, the human experience of free will enables the human agent to acquire some knowledge and love of God, since it is in the will that human beings most closely resemble God. Finally, disordered love is more dangerous than disordered hatred because disordered love more easily distorts our judgment.

Kristina’s response to the Cartesian theory of love is a mitigated assent. She admits that she could not respond properly to Descartes’s theory of love as a passion because “never having personally experienced this passion, she could not render a good judgment concerning a portrait when she had never known the original” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; May 11, 1647]. However, Kristina agrees with Descartes’ theory of intellectual love since it closely resembles the love of virtue she has long tried to cultivate. “Nothing prevented her from examining what Monsieur Descartes said about intellectual love, which considers a good [that is] purified and separated from sensible things, since she could at least feel within herself the love of virtue” [Letter of Chanut to Descartes; May 11, 1647]. The Cartesian concept of intellectual love touched on the question of the sovereign good which had long interested the queen.

Kristina moves from the question of love to a new question concerning Descartes’ doctrine of the infinity of the world. Does not this theory dangerously confuse the difference between God and the creature?  Are not all created things, including the cosmos itself, strictly finite?  And does not such a theory contradict the clear teaching of the Church and Scripture on the finite nature of the world?

Descartes provides a cautious response to this fraught theological question. First, he insists that perfectly orthodox theologians, such as Nicolas of Cusa, have supported the theory of the world’s infinity. “I argue that the Cardinal of Cusa and several other theological doctors have believed the world to be infinite without any correction by the Church on this subject. On the contrary, it is actually honoring God to conceive His works in terms of such greatness” [Letter from Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647]. Second, he insists that he only supported the theory of the world’s indefiniteness, not its infinity. “I do not say that the world is infinite; I only say that it is indefinite. There is a very important difference here. To say that the world is infinite, one must have some reason in order to know it as such; one could only receive this from God. But to say that the world is indefinite, it is sufficient that one simply find no reasons by which one could prove it has limits” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647].

Descartes also answers Kristina’s previous ancillary question on love: How does one explain the experience of loving one person over another, especially the experience of spontaneous friendship, where one immediately loves a person one has never known?  Descartes’ response again draws on his mechanistic theory of the body and the brain. “[This attraction] consists in the disposition of the parts of our brain….The objects which touch our senses move through the intermediary of the nerves to some part of our brain….When we are drawn to love someone without knowing the cause, we can believe that this comes from something in the object which is similar to what was in a previous object we once loved” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; June 6, 1647].

Kristina’s next question concerns the nature of the sovereign good. What is the supreme good for humanity?  Descartes’ answer hedges. He admits that properly speaking, only God is the sovereign good of humanity, but he is skeptical that this good could be grasped outside the light of faith. He argues that the sovereign good could be understood in another, secular manner. The sovereign good here is a collection of those goods a human agent could possess; preeminent among them is a good will. “It seems to me that the sovereign good of all human beings together is a collection or an assemblage of all the goods, whether of the body or of the soul or of fortune, which could exist in anyone…and the most important consists in a firm will to do what is right and to seek the happiness which this produces” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; November 20, 1647].

In later correspondence, Descartes recognize that Kristina does not share all of his views on the sovereign good, despite their common interest in the Stoic literature where it had been previously explored. “The grand esteem that I have for this incomparable princess [Kristina] gives me the occasion to fear that having already taken the trouble to see it [the letter on the sovereign good], as you have stated, she still did not want to give me her opinion of it” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; May, 1648]. Descartes fears that Kristina’s non-response indicates disapproval and that he might have erred in the opinions he defended concerning the sovereign good. “I see so many other people who are mistaken in their opinions and their judgments that it seems to me a universal illness” [Letter of Descartes to Chanut; May 1648].

In their few direct epistolary exchanges, Kristina and Descartes express the highest regard for each other. In the philosophical dialogue carried out through the intermediary of Chanut, however, the disagreements between the two thinkers are stronger than their agreements. Kristina clearly expresses her skepticism concerning Cartesian dualism, religious orthodoxy, and virtue theory.

b. Moral Philosophy

Kristina’s moral philosophy emerges in three works tied to the maxime literature of the salon. These are her Commentaries on the Maxims of La Rochefoucauld [CMLR] and her two collections of personal maxims, Reasonable Sentiments [RS] and Heroic Sentiments [HS]. Although the three works examine a number of ethical issues, they concentrate on questions of moral psychology, such as the virtues and the passions. They also reflect Kristina’s longstanding theological and political preoccupations.

i. Critic of La Rochefoucauld

In her commentary on La Rochefoucauld’s maxims, Kristina often indicates her agreement with his skeptical exposure of virtue as a mask for vice. But in many passages she indicates her opposition and sketches an alternative theory of human nature.

Kristina disagrees with La Rochefoucauld’s negative account of the passions. While La Rochefoucauld considers the passions strong emotions which distort human reason, Kristina places the passions at the summit of human perfection. “’Passion often turns the brightest man into a fool and often makes the greatest fools bright.’ I think that passion perfects everything” [CMLR no.1]. She also criticizes his misogynistic interpretation of how women deal with the passions. “’Women often believe they love although they do not love. Preoccupation with some intrigue, the heightened emotions of a romance, the natural inclination toward the pleasure of being loved and the pain of being refused such love convinces them they possess passion when they only experience some coquettishness.’  This could be true of either sex. There are very few people who are capable of authentic passion” [CMLR no.73]. The stereotype of the emotional woman opposed to the rational man is critiqued. Both genders are equally susceptible to passion and capable of rational reflection.

Kristina challenges the link established by La Rochefoucauld between passion and virtue. She does not believe that disordered emotion could cause or strengthen moral virtue. “’Passions often engender what is contrary to them. Avarice sometimes produces generosity and generosity avarice. We are often firm because we are weak and audacious out of timidity.’  I do not believe this at all” [CMLR no.4]. Not only is La Rochefoucauld’s link between virtue and passion faulty; Kristina challenges his concept of virtue itself. “’Virtue would not go so far if vanity did not hold company with it.’  Talking this way shows a poor knowledge of virtue. Virtue and vanity never find themselves housed together” [CMLR no.56]. Kristina rejects La Rochefoucauld’s witty paradoxes. Just as virtue is not a passion, it is not a vice nor does it share a mysterious kinship with the vices.

Similarly, Kristina corrects La Rochefoucauld’s account of the principal human passion: love. Against La Rochefoucauld’s cynical sociological account, Kristina emphasizes the power of love and its presence in the fundamental structure of the human person. “’There are people who would never have experienced loving feelings if they had never heard others speak about love.’  This is false. Love does not enter by the ear; it enters by the eye” [CMLR no.46]. Similarly, friendship deserves greater esteem than that given by La Rochefoucauld. Betrayal by a friend constitutes a grave injustice which justifies a thorough distrust of the former friend. “’It is more shameful to distrust one’s friends than to be betrayed by them.’ I do not agree. There are times when one may and one must distrust one’s friends without offending either friend or friendship. To be a traitor is the shame of those who do the betraying but to undergo the betrayal is our shame” [CMLR no.34]. Literary critics have long pointed out that many sympathetic female commentators on La Rochefoucauld strongly disagreed with his cynical account of love and friendship. Kristina’s critique is one example of this gendered dissent from La Rochefoucald’s theory of the emotions surrounding friendship.

Certain Cartesian phrases punctuate Kristina’s critique of La Rochefoucauld. The mechanistic theory of human nature is reflected in her discussion of La Rochefoucauld’s thesis that mental states are tightly linked to corporeal causes. “’Strength and weakness of mind are not well named. In fact, they are only the good or bad disposition of the organs of the body.’  There is such a great union between body and soul that even if some small thing is bothering this machine, everything goes wrong” [CMLR no.14]. The problem of the nature of the interaction between mind and body is raised.

ii. Moral Psychology

In Reasonable Sentiments and Heroic Sentiments, Kristina presents her own reflections on a series of moral, theological, and political issues. These collections of maxims must be interpreted with caution. The brief statements are fragmentary and often opaque. Like her political life, the maxims contain contradictions and abrupt transitions. Nonetheless, the hundreds of maxims indicate a pattern in Kristina’s thought on moral psychology and on questions of authority in politics and religion.

The theory of moral virtue defended by Kristina stresses the heroic virtues. The outsized virtues of conquerors represent the summit of moral habits. “Magnificence and liberality are the virtues of conquerors. They impress everyone” [RS no. 323]. Similarly, military courage inspires awe. “Invincible courage is troubled by nothing” [RS no.59]. The virtues of the heroic are not limited to the martial virtues displayed in public moments of triumph; the heroic moral agent often displays discreet virtues in the face of adversity. The capacity to accept ingratitude is one of the quieter virtues. “There is a type of pleasure in suffering ingratitude which is reserved to great souls, who alone are capable of relishing it” [RS no.31].

Her treatment of vices similarly focuses upon the world of the politically powerful. While the line between virtue and vice is clear, certain vices typical of rulers actually promote the common good in society. One such vice would be luxuriousness. While a taste for luxurious possessions might corrupt a ruler, it could embellish a society where the ruler acts as a patron of the arts and sciences. “Luxuriousness does not destroy states; it enriches and civilizes them” [RS no.338]. Despite its potential for personal corruption, the vice could have a charitable effect. “Luxuriousness is a type of secret alms” [RS no.239].

The passions constitute a particularly powerful influence upon the moral agent. Not only are they necessary; they provide a positive vitality to the human person. “The passions are the salt of life. Life would be insupportable without them” [RS no.148]. Kristina criticizes those neo-Stoic philosophers who consider it possible and desirable for the soul to live in a state of equanimity freed from all emotion. “This tranquility so vaunted by philosophers is a dull and insipid mental state” [RS no.149]. Even momentary liberation from the sway of passion is rare. “We only triumph over our passions when they are weak” [RS no.160]. Despite their central and positive role in human psychology, the passions can easily mislead the moral agent. Certain passions easily align themselves with vice. “Avarice and envy are ridiculous passions” [RS no.161]. Even hope, a passion often aligned with theological virtue, can bitterly disappoint a moral agent possessed by it. “Hope is the passion which gives the falsest pleasure and the truest sadness” [RS no.153].

The passion receiving the most extensive analysis by Kristina is love. Love possesses an incomparable intensity and duration. Even when it has faded, it permanently marks the moral subject. “Whether love is happy or unhappy, it always endures” [HS no. 71]. Love is so powerful that it defines the personality of the one who loves. “As our love is so we are” ([RS no.15]. Despite its power, love is rare. The greatest of affective relationships, friendship is difficult to find and sustain. “Great friendships are as rare as great loves” [RS no.182].

According to Kristina, authentic love is ultimately religious. Only in God can the human lover find the perfect and imperishable object of love’s drive. “Love and ambition must have God as their aim. Only in Him can they find what will abundantly and worthily satisfy them” [HS no.62]. Love can never remain at the level of the purely intra-human. The dynamic transcendence of love toward the most infinite and lovable of beings inevitably leads it to a religious object. “When a heart is capable of love, it is impossible that sooner or later it will not love God, Who alone is capable of fulfilling it and lifting it up” [HS no.84].

In light of her theory of love, Kristina severely criticizes the institution of marriage. The practice of arranged marriages for the sake of social prestige or economic gain guarantees that marriage will usually be loveless. “There are no happy marriages because the spouses do not truly love each other” [RS no.168]. The lack of affection between spouses renders marital commitment impossible to bear. “Marriage is insupportable because it is nearly always incompatible with love” [RS no.169]. So bereft of love are most marriages in the society of the period that the existence of a happy marriage is a moral miracle. “It would be too much happiness to be both married and in love” [RS no.168].

Kristina builds her critique of marriage into a defense of the superiority of the single life. “Socrates said, ‘Whether you are married or unmarried, you will be sorry.’ Personally, I believe infallibly that everyone who marries will regret doing so, but I do not see why anyone who is unmarried will regret it. I am the example from experience” [HS no.111]. In her praise of the single life, Kristina’s philosophical argument becomes autobiographical.

iii. Sexual Equality

In her treatment of the relationship between the sexes, Kristina’s maxims show a marked ambiguity. Many maxims insist upon strict gender equality, but several maxims argue that women are not fit to serve as political rulers.

In the more egalitarian maxims Kristina insists that the biological difference between men and women neither indicates any intellectual difference nor dictates any particular social role for either sex. Seat of the intellect and will, the soul has no gender. “It is true that the soul has no sex” [RS no.268]. So separate is the soul from the body that the traditional social roles assigned to each sex are easily violated. “There are men who are as much women as their mothers and women who are as much men as their fathers, because the soul has no sex” [RS no.266]. The observable differences in intellectual achievement and social position between men and women can be explained by social institutions, especially by the period’s educational institutions. “Temperament and education explain all the differences one can observe between the two sexes” [RS no.270]. The argument for gender equity carries echoes of the Cartesian thesis that the mind remains a completely separate substance from the body and thus unmarked by gender.

In other passages, however, Kristina insists that one type of work should be closed to women: that of political governance. “Women must not reign” [RS no.261]. The rule of women in the past is dismissed as untypical; the exceptions of female political rule in the past only prove the wisdom of limiting rule to men. “If in the past there were queens who gloriously reigned, these examples are so rare that we shouldn’t rely on such miracles” [RS no.263]. The political rule of women in the present is only the occasion for mockery. “Nothing is more ridiculous than government by women. I knew several cases which reduced me and still reduce me to pity” [RS no.264]. Given Kristina’s own efforts to exercise political sovereignty in Naples and Poland, these maxims against female rule are difficult to explain. They clearly reflect her own contrarian spirit or possibly her bitter experience of rule during her tenure as queen of Sweden. Still, they stand in counterpoint to the sexual equality she champions in her broader reflections on gender.

iv. Epistemology

In Kristina’s theory of knowledge, practical is to be preferred to speculative knowledge. Despite her interest in recent scientific discoveries, empirical science seems to be of little value. “The sciences are only pompous titles for human ignorance. One is not any wiser for knowing them” [RS no.46]. Only moral knowledge can truly render human beings wise and direct them to genuine happiness. “Everything which does not render humanity wiser and happier is useless in the area of science” [RS no.47]. The supreme science is that which teaches a certain wisdom of life. “Knowing how to live well and die well is the science of sciences” [RS no.48].

In this science of wise living, one diplomatic art is pre-eminent: the art of being able to understand the psychological motivation of others. This art provides the key to effective government of others. “The art of penetrating other human beings is rare, but those who possess it are made to rule” [RS no.82]. Even when used by a mature agent, this psychological science is difficult to wield successfully. “One must employ this art with discretion and not believe it to be infallible” [RS no.83]. Historical knowledge can also assist the moral agent who is attempting to govern others through the use of psychological insight. “The science of the past is very useful for the future” [RS no.81].

Unsurprisingly, for Kristina the supreme knowledge is the science of governing others well. This knowledge rests upon a combination of psychological and historical science. Given its capacity to promote human happiness, the science of government enjoys a pre-eminence over other sciences, whose truths have little direct impact upon the practical life of humanity.

v. Political Philosophy

Kristina’s political philosophy focuses on the question of authority and sovereignty. The prosperity of the state depends upon the character and skill of its ruler. The ideal political regime is an absolutist one where an audacious ruler has acquired heroic virtues.

Moral character determines the political power of a ruler. “It is personal merit, not differences between states, which explains the difference between kings” [HS no.30]. In the constellation of personal virtues a sense of grandeur is the most indispensable for a successful reign. “Princes must love their grandeur above all things” [RS no.315].

History has provided a series of rulers who demonstrate this political grandeur to a heroic level. “If [Julius] Caesar, Alexander [the Great], and Cyrus [of Persia] once succeeded in making themselves masters of a part of the world, it is because they had all the necessary qualities to a heroic degree” [HS no.128]. Despite her censure of women who exercise political rule, Kristina includes female rulers in her catalogue of heroic governance. “Semiramis and Cleopatra and so many others earned esteem and admiration despite their personal faults” [RS no.275].

In exercising rule, the monarch must not fail to use absolute authority. This can even include the execution of members of his own family if the security of the state is at stake. The controversial action of Spain’s Phillip II in authorizing the death of his son receives Kristina’s praise. “If it is true that Phillip II brought about the death of his only son either out of reasons of jealous love or out of reasons of state, that is a great gesture” [RS no.316]. The praised action carries an eerie echo of the controversial execution of Monaldeschi at Kristina’s command.

The absolute authority of the monarch is not arbitrary. A heroic ruler must represent the interests of the entire nation he governs and must refuse to be the agent of one partisan faction. The ruler can only encourage justice by publicly acting justly. “A prince must be perfectly neutral. His only concern should be to reign and to render justice according to the merit of each subject, thus obliging everyone through proper punishments and rewards, but chiefly by his own example, to do one’s duty with care, application, and fidelity” [RS no.120]. To ensure this commitment to the common rather than the partisan good, the ruler must consult as widely as possible. “A prince must give everyone access to him. He must be as publicly exposed to everyone’s gaze as is the sun. He must not let himself be isolated by either his ministers or his favorites” [RS no.121].

The ideal ruler must be cultured as well as virtuous. A commitment to personal learning is essential for the success of a political reign. “It is the duty of the prince to give some of his time to the reading of good books. These times are not taken away from his public duties because they instruct and correct princes” [HS no.42]. The daily moments of retreat must also serve to permit the ruler to engage in personal reflection on his conduct in office. “No matter how busy the prince is, it is necessary for him to put aside several hours of retreat each day. This time must be used to reflect on his conduct, to correct his faults, and to ask strength and grace from God, without which nothing valuable can be done” [HS no.122]. The ruler must not only develop a personal intellectual and spiritual culture; the ruler must act as a patron of arts in the conduct of government. “It is necessary to know how to use cultured people as if they were living libraries, esteem them, reward them liberally, employ them and consult them on what they know” [HS no.123]. This portrait of the ruler as cultured patron of the arts is the standard Renaissance portrait of the good prince. It is also a self-portrait of Kristina in her ambition to be both a learned monarch and to transform her nation into a center for European high culture.

The absolute authority of the ruler has religious limits. The good ruler must recognize that political authority comes from God and that God will demand an account from each ruler on how that authority has been used. “A prince who rules must make God rule everywhere where he exercises command. He must give back to God all his greatness and all his glory and all his works. He must make of them a perpetual homage to God” [HS no.12]. Authentic political rule is thus a kind of regency; the source and end of the authority exercised by the political ruler resides in God alone.

vi. Religious Philosophy

Like her political philosophy, Kristina’s religious philosophy focuses on the issue of authority. The truth of Catholicism is found in the authority with which God has vested it. Salvation is found only in submission to the Church’s authority. “God only explains His will by his unique oracle, which is the Roman Catholic Church, outside of which there is no salvation. One must submit oneself blindly and without reservation to all of its decrees” [HS no.1].

Her concept of ecclesiastical authority is militantly ultramontane; it is papal authority which is supreme in the Church’s governance. Unlike other Catholic authors of the period, who considered ecumenical councils equal with or superior to the pope in the Church’s government, Kristina exalts the monarchial governance of the Church in the person of the bishop of Rome. “God wanted to give authority to the pope and the Church in such an admirable way, by so many miracles, so many councils, and so many other marvels that no reasonable person can doubt the fulfillment of the magnificent promise God made that Church will prevail over hell until the end of time. He wanted the government of His Church to be monarchial. He has given His infallibility to the pope and not to councils. The pope is everything without them and they are nothing without him” [HS no.2]. As in the political order, where the monarch exercises absolute authority, the pope alone must exercise absolute authority in the religious order. The pope is only accountable to God for his actions.

The submission of intellect and will to the teachings of the Church is accompanied by a spiritual abandonment of the soul to God’s will. Echoing the Quietist movement which had interested her for a time, abandonment to divine providence is a central spiritual posture. “One must blindly resign oneself to God’s will in time and in eternity” [RS no.349]. This abandonment is so important and difficult that Kristina describes it as a type of martyrdom to divine providence.

Despite her enthusiasm for Catholicism in its most Roman forms, Kristina criticizes the omnipresent abuses of religion. The devout who want to believe in supernatural occurrences beyond those essential to the Catholic creed easily fall into superstition. An enlightened faith can never be confused with credulity. Many maxims denounce the hypocrisy of the overly devout. “Bigots are very concerned about the sins of their neighbors but they show little concern about their own” [RS no.374]. Kristina expresses skepticism about members of religious orders. “Too many people are making vows of chastity to be able to keep them actually” [RS no.379]. She also criticizes the clericalism of the devout. The vogue of many cultured Catholics for long interviews with spiritual directors illegitimately reduces personal freedom. “We should not be the dupes of confessors or of spiritual directors” [RS no.366]. Kristina’s enthusiasm for the institution of the papacy does not eliminate her rationalist skepticism toward certain practices of her new religious community.

vii. Philosophical Eclecticism

In the presentation of her moral positions in the maxims, Kristina reveals her indebtedness to other philosophers. Strikingly, Kristina makes no mention of Descartes or of the other modern philosophers she had clearly known or read. She references only classical philosophers. Although the philosophers cited represent an eclectic group of thinkers defending some mutually exclusive theories, Kristina leans toward the more Stoic philosophers as her guides.

The philosophers praised by Kristina are eclectic in their orientation. “Among philosophers, Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, Diogenes, Epicurus, and Epictetus merit admiration” [RS no.63]. Few students of philosophy simultaneously admire both Plato and Aristotle, both Epicureans and Stoics. “Among philosophers, Socrates, Aristippus, and Diogenes are strongly to my taste” [HS no. 33]. Few philosophers believe that the dialectics of Socrates, the Cyrenaic philosophy of Aristippus, and the Cynicism of Diogenes can be reconciled. Kristina’s philosophical heroes indicate the somewhat contradictory philosophical eclecticism she often espoused in her writings.

In other maxims, Kristina indicates a preference for the Stoic strand of classical philosophy. The Stoic philosopher Epictetus is singled out for particular praise. “Born a slave, the wise Epictetus proved himself so illustrious that he made his slave irons more glorious than many others have made their scepters” [HS no.142]. Kristina’s emphasis on the will and its virtuous fortification against adversity indicate her sympathy with the neo-Stoicism of the period.

c. Apologist for Tolerance

Despite the absolutism of her political philosophy, Krisitina emerged as a major European theorist of religious tolerance. In her final years she defended two persecuted religious minorities: French Protestants and Roman Jews. Published by Pierre Bayle, her celebrated letter condemning the persecution of French Huguenots indicates the humanitarian and pragmatic nature of her theory of tolerance.

First, the renewed persecution of the Protestants contradicts the sentiments of charity and compassion which should be the preeminent virtues of the Catholic Church and its adherents. “I pity so many ruined families, so many honest people reduced to dependence on charity. I cannot look at what is happening today in France without being deeply shaken. I feel sorry that these people were born in religious error, but they seem to me more worthy of pity than of hatred. Just as I would not share their error for all the kingdoms of the world, I would not want to cause them any unhappiness” [Letter of Kristina to Terlon; February 2, 1686].

Second, this violent policy of forced conversion will only damage rather than benefit the church. The military campaign against the Huguenots will harden the image of the church as a persecutor and ultimately drive would-be converts away from it. “Because you want to know my sentiments concerning the alleged wiping out of heresy in France, I am delighted to tell you what I think…..I frankly admit that I am not at all convinced of the success of that great plan. I cannot perceive in it anything which will bring a benefit to our holy religion. On the contrary, I can only envision the prejudice against the Church which this novel way of proceeding will give rise to” [Letter of Kristina to Terlon; February 2, 1686]. The apparent military victory in forcing religious conversions only discredits religion.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of Kristina of Sweden has been both popular and scholarly. Even before her death, the dark legend of Queen Kristina had begun to circulate. Her execution of Monaldeschi, a legal punishment of a traitor by a reigning monarch (due to her sovereignty over several fiefs she maintained in Sweden after her abdication), was presented as the irrational deed of a bloodthirsty tyrant. Her taste for male attire was attacked as a sign of lesbianism. Her Platonic friendship with Cardinal Azzolino was denounced as a sordid liaison within the walls of the Vatican. Countless anti-Catholic Swedish pamphlets decried Kristina’s conversion to Catholicism as part of a Jesuit plot to destroy Protestantism in Scandinavia.

The image of Kristina as an irrational virago has influenced popular artistic portraits of her. Countless novels and fictionalized biographies have emphasized the willfulness and eccentricities of her personality. August Strindberg’s play Kristina (1901), Rouben Mamoulian’s film Queen Christina (1933), Anthony Harvey’s film The Abdication (1974), and Laura Ruohonen’s play Queen C (2002) circulate some of the fictitious elements of the legendary Kristina.

A more scholarly approach began with Johann Arckenholtz’s edition (1750-60) of writings by and about Kristina. This multivolume work permitted readers to study the actual writings of Kristina and to counter the legends surrounding the queen by reading eyewitness testimonies by close associates. Varied philosophical interpretations of Kristina’s thought have been offered. Gaukroger’s biography of Descartes (1995) stresses the personal philosophical culture of Kristina as well as her relationship with Descartes. Raymond (1993) emphasizes the centrality of the concept of sacred royalty in his study of the Descartes-Kristina relationship. Pintard (1943) and Åckerman (1991) analyze the libertine and skeptical dimensions of Kristina’s philosophy. Åckerman also stresses the Stoic character of the queen’s philosophical outlook. Børresen (1996, 2007) studies her religious thought, with attention to its paradoxical nature. Kristina’s heroic concept of moral virtue invites further research.

5. References and Further Reading

Translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Christine de Suède. Mémoires concernant Christine, Reine de Suède, 4 vols., ed. Johann Arckenholtz. Amsterdam: Mortier, 1750-60.
    • This groundbreaking collection of writings by and about Kristina challenged the legends which had grown up around her since her death. A digital version of this work is available in the Gallica section of the webpage of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Christine de Suède. Apologies: Christine de Suède, ed. Jean-François de Raymond. Paris: Cerf, 1994.
    • This contemporary edition of Kristina’s French writings is a useful introduction to her work, especially her unreliable autobiography.
  • Christine de Suède. Maximes, ed. Chantal Thomas. Paris: Payot & Rivages, 1996.
    • Thomas’ introduction ably underscores the absolutist nature of Kristina’s thought.
  • Christina of Sweden, The works of Christina, Queen of Sweden, Containing maxims and sentences, in twelve centuries: and reflections on the actions of Alexander the Great; first translation from the French. Farmington Hills, MI: Gale ECCO, 2010; reprint of London 1753 translation.
    • This reprint of the 1753 English translation of Kristina’s works contains her maxims and historical essays.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Åckerman, Susanna. “Kristina Wasa, Queen of Sweden,” in A History of Women Philosophers, Vol. 3, ed. Mary Ellen Waithe. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991: 21-40.
    • This study stresses the neo-Stoic roots of Kristina’s philosophy but the effort to present Kristina as a religious skeptic is less convincing.
  • Åckerman, Susanna. Queen Christina of Sweden and her Circle: The Transformation of a Seventeenth-Century Philosophical Libertine. Leiden: Brill, 1991.
    • This monograph contextualizes the philosophy of Kristina by placing it within the broader libertine circle of her associates.
  • Børessen, Kari Elisabeth, “Concordia Discors: La pensée de Christine de Suède sur Dieu et l’humanité,” Augustinianum 36 (1996): 237-254.
    • This study draws out the paradoxical nature of Kristina’s religious philosophy.
  • Børessen, Kari Elisabeth, “Christine de Suède: Autonomie et foi rationelle,” in Scandinavian Critique of Anglo-American Feminist Theology, eds. Stenström, Vuola, Bieberstein, and Rapp. Leuven: Peters, 2007: 163-176.
    • This essay interprets Kristina’s abdication and conversion as an effort to develop a personal, autonomous faith which corresponds to her own free use of reason rather than to the demands of Swedish royal tradition.
  • Cassirer, Ernst. Descartes, Corneille, Kristina. Paris: Vrin, 1942.
    • Written during his professorship at Gothenburg University in Sweden (1935-41), Cassirer’s study emphasizes Descartes’s influence on Kristina’s religious convictions. It tends to exaggerate Descartes’s role in the queen’s conversion to Catholicism.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen. Descartes: An Intellectual Biography. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995: 412-16.
    • Gaukroger’s sketch of Kristina stresses the complexity of her philosophical culture by the time she entered into dialogue with Descartes.
  • Pintard, René. Le libertinage érudit dans la première moitié du XVIIe siècle, 2 vols. Paris: Buin, 1943.
    • Pintard characterizes Kristina’s philosophy as libertine and skeptical.
  • Raymond, Jean-François de. La reine et le philosophe: Descartes et Christine de Suède. Paris: Lettres Modernes, 1993.
    • Raymond’s interpretation of the Kristina-Descartes relationship explores how Kristina’s understanding of the sacral nature of royalty influenced her approach to philosophy.
  • Rodén, Marie-Louise. Church Politics in Seventeenth-Century Rome: Cardinal Decio Azzolino, Queen Christina of Sweden and the Squadrone Volante. Stockholm: Almqvist & Wichsell, 2000.
    • This monograph contextualizes Kristina’s philosophy by situating it within the theological and political concerns of the Roman ecclesiastical coterie in which Kristina participated.
  • Rodén, Marie-Louise. Queen Christina. Stockholm: Swedish Institute, 1998.
    • This biography is a solid introduction to Kristina from a literary perspective.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.