Critias (460—403 B.C.E.)

CritiasCritias, son of Callaeschrus, an Athenian philosopher, rhetorician, poet, historian, and political leader, was best known for his leading role in the pro-Spartan government of the Thirty (404-403 BC). But Critias also produced a broad range of works and was a noted poet and teacher in his own time. The fragments of three tragedies and a satyr play, a collection of elegies, books of homilies and aphorisms, a collection of epideictic speeches, and a number of constitutions of the city-states both in poetry and prose all have been passed down in the works of later authors. In spite of arguments over the authorship of certain works ascribed to him and the brevity of the fragments, few other classical Greek writers present such a breadth of literary output. Critias, the political figure, author, and philosopher, stands as one of the most controversial and enigmatic figures of fifth-century BC Athens.

Critias’ one significant and original contribution appears to have been a clear distinction between perception through the senses (aisthanomai) and understanding through the mind (gnômê). While there are indications that others (e.g., Empedocles and Heraclitus) may have shared in this differentiation, Critias’ statement is the earliest extant. Apart from this one exception, Critias does not appear to have been an original thinker.

Critias commented that “if you yourself were trained, so that you were sufficient in mind (gnômê), you would thus be least wronged by your own (senses)” (fr. 40). In this statement Critias appears to be in agreement with Protagoras and many other of his contemporaries in the sophistic idea that excellence is teachable. He was furthermore a materialist in his beliefs about the soul and its role in perception. Aristotle and later writers report that Critias believed that the soul (psychê) was the blood, and, in agreement with Empedocles, that the blood around the heart was the seat of perception (noêma) (fr. 23).

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Political Career
  3. Ancient Perspectives on Critias
  4. Relationship with Socrates
    1. Philosophical Views
    2. Distinction Between Sense and Understanding
    3. Views on Law and Morals
  5. Drama and Poetry
  6. Rhetoric
  7. Writings
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Critias’ first certain appearance in the historical record is as an alleged participant in the mutilation of the herms in 415 BC. Critias was released on the testimony of Andocides (On the Mysteries 47) in the course of the investigation of the crime, and nothing further is known of his involvement in the matter. There are also sporadic references to Critias’ participation in some of the major events of the last years of the Peloponnesian war. Whether he was a participant in the oligarchic reign of the Four Hundred in 411 BC is uncertain. He posthumously prosecuted Phrynicus, the radical oligarch and ringleader of the Four Hundred (Lycurgus, Against Leocrates 113) after the regime’s collapse in 410 BC.

2. Political Career

In the years that followed, Critias was actively involved in politics as an associate of Alcibiades. Critias proclaims in one of his elegiac poems that he proposed Alcibiades’ return from exile, probably around 408 BC (fragments 4 and 5). With the turn of Athenian popular opinion against Alcibiades, Critias probably followed Alcibiades into exile in 406 BC. During this time Critias became involved in an insurrection in Thessaly, but nothing certain is known of his activities there, apart from Theramenes’ enigmatic statement that Critias was “with Prometheus setting up a democracy and arming the peasants against their masters” (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.36). Too little is known of Thessalian history at that time to ascertain whom “Prometheus” was, or to determine the nature of any alleged “democratic” revolution in which Critias may have been involved.

Upon his return from exile in the spring of 404 BC, Critias was one of the “five ephors” who led the various oligarchic factions of post-war Athens (Lysias, Against Eratosthenes 43). Critias was also a leading member of the Thirty, whose brutal reign of terror in 404/403 BC was vividly depicted by Xenophon (Hellenica, Book 2). The reign of terror unleashed by the Thirty saw summary executions, property confiscations, and the exile of thousands of Athenian sycophants, democrats, and metics. Even Theramenes, one of the founding members of the Thirty, was executed without a trial after he dared to openly oppose Critias. Another apparent victim of the Thirty was the still-exiled Alcibiades, who remained in his fortified estates in Thrace. According to the report of Alcibiades’ later biographers-Cornelius Nepos (Alcibiades 10) and Plutarch (Alcibiades 38.5)-it was his old supporter and fellow Socratic companion Critias who gave the assassination order in 403 BC.

There are indications that Critias had some degree of personal control over the Athenian cavalry class and over the Eleven, who acted as executioners (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.4.8). Critias also appears to have been the guiding force behind the more extreme elements of the Thirty as well as their unquestioned leader after the execution of Theramenes in 403 BC. He also appears to have been one of the chief law-givers of the oligarchy (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.49).

Whatever plans that Critias and the Thirty had for the establishment of a new oligarchic regime in Athens were abruptly halted by the military successes of a group of pro-democratic exiles led by Thrasybulus at the Athenian border post at Phyle and in the port town of Piraeus. On a single day in May of 403 BC, in a pitched battle between the forces under the command of Thrasybulus and Critias and the supporters of the Thirty, the mastermind of the oligarchic movement fell. At that time, Critias, commander of the phalanx, opted for a deep line of fifty shields for his hoplites. The members of the Thirty themselves stood in the front ranks on the extreme left of the phalanx. Far from shunning the violent danger of the battlefield, Critias positioned himself in the left-most corner of the line. However, the arrangement of the phalanx in a deep column failed, the fighting bloody and costly. Critias was among the more than seventy who fell (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.11-13). Critias’ death left the remaining members of the Thirty and the Three Thousand leaderless and in confusion. Attempts at a new oligarchic government failed and the democracy was restored soon afterwards.

A memorial was later erected to Critias and the Thirty depicting a personified Oligarchy carrying torches and setting Democracy on fire. An inscription on the monument’s base, as recorded by a scholiast, read: “This is a memorial of those noble men who restrained the hubris of the accursed Athenian Demos a short time” (scholiast on Aeschines, Against Timarchus 39). The price of this “restraint” was the lives of at least 1,500 Athenians (Aristotle, Constitution of the Athenians 35.4).

As Plato admits in his Seventh Letter, the extreme behavior of his second cousin Critias-along with another cousin, Charmides, the leader of the Ten who governed the Piraeus during the rule of the Thirty-effectively ended any thoughts he had previously entertained about a future political career (Plato, Seventh Letter 324d).

3. Ancient Perspectives on Critias

Xenophon characterized Critias as a ruthless, amoral tyrant, whose crimes would eventually be the cause of Socrates’ death. This negative view of Critias was continued by Philostratus, who called him “the most evil… of all men” (Lives of the Sophists 1.16). On the other hand, Plato’s portrayal of his second cousin, Critias, in four dialogues (Lysis, Charmides, Critias, and Timaeus) presents Critias as a refined and well-educated member of one of Athens’ oldest and most distinguished aristocratic families and as a regular participant in Athenian philosophical culture.

Although these portrayals differ, they are not mutually exclusive. Critias’ family was among the most prominent of the old aristocratic Eupatrid clans that had ruled Athens before the advent of the democracy. No fewer than four of his direct ancestors had held the eponymous archonship (the highest office of the Athenian state)–one, a certain Dropides, in 645/644 BC. Solon was among his famous relatives (Plato, Charmides 155a), and both Solon and the poet Anacreon reportedly praised Critias’ ancestors in their poems (Plato, Charmides 157e and Solon, fr. 22 in Iambi et Elegi Graeci. 2nd ed. M.L. West, ed. Oxford 1992).

Although the literary tradition lacks detailed evidence about Critias’ youth, his biographer Philostratus (Lives of the Sophists 1.16) says that Critias’ “formal education was the of the most noble sort,” and Athenaeus (Deipnosophistae 4.84d) notes that his training as a flutist made him famous in his youth. A fragment of a dedication for two victories at the Isthmian games and two victories at the Nemean games in 438 BC by a [Critia]s, son of Callaeschrus, remains (IG I3 1022), but the restoration of the name remains uncertain. It does seem clear that Critias excelled in two of the most important elements of traditional Athenian education: music and athletics.

If Plato accurately reports the characters of historical figures in his dialogues–though surely in fictionalized situations that suited his philosophical ends–then perhaps these dialogues provide glimpses into Critias’ character and behavior. In Plato’s Protagoras, set in 433 BC, Critias appears among the leading sophists–Protagoras, Hippias, Prodicus, and Socrates–and the educated elite of Athens. In the Protagoras, Critias takes part in the dialogue alongside Alcibiades. This pairing is perhaps ironic, since Xenophon records that Athenian anger at the reckless and destructive behavior of Critias and Alcibiades, both associates of Socrates, was the real reason behind the execution of Socrates in 399 BC (Memoirs of Socrates 1.2.12). It is noteworthy that Critias’ only contribution to the philosophical discussion is a plea to the participants to be impartial and fair at a point in which those present increasingly appear either in favor of Socrates or Protagoras. In contrast to Xenophon’s portrayal of Critias as a ruthless tyrant, Plato’s presentation of Critias as a moderating force is a remarkable counterpoint.

Critias’ more substantial role in the Charmides, which opens with the return of Socrates from Potidaea in 432 BC, provides an equally stark contrast to the negative depiction of Xenophon and others. The dialogue centers on the meaning of sophrosyne (self-control), which Charmides–clearly following the lead of his cousin and guardian Critias–defines for Socrates at one point as “minding one’s own business” (Plato, Charmides 161b). Although this particular definition is abandoned in the discussion described in Charmides itself, it reappears in an expanded form as the ultimate meaning of dikaiosyne (justice) in the Republic (433a-b): “that each individual must act in the affairs of the city as each is best fitted by nature to do.” This definition of justice (dikaiosyne) is, of course, held by Plato to be the highest virtue and is central to his utopian conception of the ordering of the various social and political classes of the ideal state.

Critias is also a principal character in both the Timaeus and the Critias, which are set on the day after the events recorded in the Republic in 421 BC. Critias relates the story of Atlantis and its fabled war with Athens some 9,000 years earlier. He had heard this tale from his homonymous grandfather, who, in turn, had heard it from his relative the lawgiver Solon. The story, which Plato has Critias say was preserved by Egyptian priests, presents an idealized portrait of an ancient Athens that matches remarkably well the features of the utopian state described in the Republic. What is significant is that Plato has chosen Critias as the reporter of the Atlantis myth. By doing this Plato invests his second cousin with heightened importance as a man who knew the history of a past age, a time when governments resembled the utopia of the Republic and not the imperfect systems of fourth-century BC Greece.

4. Relationship with Socrates

Among the laws drafted by Critias was an edict forbidding “instruction in the art of words” (Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.31). Xenophon reports that Socrates responded with a sarcastic reply: “if someone was a herdsman and made his cattle fewer and more poor, would he not agree that he was a bad herdsman; yet it is a great wonder, if someone was a leader of a city and made his citizens fewer and poorer, that he would not be ashamed nor think himself a bad leader of a city” (Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.32). Although it is the relationship between Critias and his former teacher that Xenophon wants to deny, it is Charicles who threatens Socrates with punishment if he does not desist from making statements against the regime (Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.37-38). Critias remains in the background of the conversation, making only a withering remark about the philosopher’s affinity for “tanners, craftsmen, and bronze workers” (Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.37). In another tête-a-tête, Socrates crudely upbraids a lovestruck Critias for his apparently overzealous attraction to a handsome youth named Euthydemus by saying that he was rubbing against the young man “like a little pig scratching itself against a rock” (Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.29-30). These vignettes of Socrates and Critias are both amusing and make a point: Critias and Socrates knew each other, but also were often at odds with one another.

Despite the threats and obvious tension between the two, Socrates survived the terror and the subsequent civil war. Perhaps it was at Critias’ insistence that Socrates’ insubordinate behavior was overlooked during the terror. Whatever the reason, it is clear from the events of Socrates’ trial in 399 BC and the scattered rebukes in fourth- and third-century BC literature that the attachment between Critias and the philosopher held fast in the popular mind (e.g., Xenophon, Memoribilia 1.2.12; Aeschines, Against Timarchus 173; and comic fragment 3:122 in T. Kock, ed. Comicorum Atticorum Fragmenta. Teubner 1880-1888).

a. Philosophical Views

Although the tragic events of the last year of Critias’ life have left a vivid picture of a radical and brutal politician, it is important to remember that Critias was also a regular and leading participant in Athenian philosophical culture. As a scholiast on Plato’s Timaeus (20a) notes: “he was called an amateur among philosophers, and a philosopher among amateurs.” Here the term “amateur” clearly refers to Critias’ aristocratic background in the sense that aristocrats by nature are “amateurs”–or perhaps more accurately “those who do not take money for their work.”

While little remains of Critias’ philosophical writing, numerous quotations by later writers attest to multiple works on a variety of topics. Unfortunately, these fragments reflect neither a comprehensive nor a thorough understanding of his philosophy. Enough remains, however, to understand something of his practice as a philosopher, his epistemology, his conception of the soul, and his ethics.

Much of his philosophical teaching appears to have been presented in multiple books of Homilies and Aphorisms. It is tempting to imagine that the Homilies (which may be understood either as “lectures” or “conversations”) may have represented an early form of the dialogue, but an insufficient number of fragments survive to give a clear picture of their literary character. If Critias’ Homilies were indeed in dialogues, he may have influenced his cousin Plato in his choice of an innovative literary form for the presentation of philosophy.

b. Distinction Between Sense and Understanding

Critias’ one significant and original contribution appears to have been a clear distinction between perception through the senses (aisthanomai) and understanding through the mind (gnômê). While there are indications that others (e.g., Empedocles and Heraclitus) may have shared in this differentiation, Critias’ statement is the earliest extant. Apart from this one exception, Critias does not appear to have been an original thinker.

Critias commented that “if you yourself were trained, so that you were sufficient in mind (gnômê), you would thus be least wronged by your own (senses)” (fr. 40). In this statement Critias appears to be in agreement with Protagoras and many other of his contemporaries in the sophistic idea that excellence is teachable. He was furthermore a materialist in his beliefs about the soul and its role in perception. Aristotle and later writers report that Critias believed that the soul (psychê) was the blood, and, in agreement with Empedocles, that the blood around the heart was the seat of perception (noêma) (fr. 23).

A fragment of Critias’ tragedy Perithus illustrates more clearly the point of these fragments: “A noble character (chrêstos tropos) is more credible than law, for no orator can overcome it…” (fr. 22) As M. Untersteiner has argued, Critias believed that “the concrete manifestation of gnômê is realized in tropos, ‘character,’ where the idea of will and decision is included in the very root of the term.” An example of Critias putting his philosophical beliefs into practice may be found in the showdown with his political rival Theramenes before the other members of the Thirty and the Athenian councilors. At the very moment that Theramenes seems to be swaying the audience, Critias steps forward and says: “I believe the business of a leader should be that if he sees his comrades being deceived, he should not permit it.” Then, backed up by an armed bodyguard, Critias summarily sentences Theramenes to death and has him dragged from the altar in the council chamber (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.51).

c. Views on Law and Morals

Critias believed that law, order, and the divine are merely human creations that function as tyrants over humanity–thus, morality is relative to the individual and a trained, noble character should be regarded as superior to any law. This ethical preference for the educated individual over human law occurs in several of the other fragments of his work, but is best illustrated in the fragment from the satyr play Sisyphus, which is attributed to Critias. Authorship of the play continues to be disputed by scholars, but there is nothing in the one surviving fragment (fr. 25) that cannot be paralleled either in the other fragments or in what is known of Critias’ beliefs. In the play Critias describes the invention both of law and the gods by a clever and wise man (puknos kai sophos anêr) who wished to deceive and control the rest of humanity through fear of supernatural powers. If law and the gods are a human construct, it follows that they are no match for the learned individual. Although the quotation is clearly meant to be spoken by Sisyphus, who was condemned by the gods for his impious acts, the second-century AD medical doctor and skeptic Sextus Empiricus quotes this passage as evidence of Critias’ atheism.

Additional circumstantial evidence for Critias’ atheism may be found in his open blasphemy toward the gods at the climax of the condemnation of his political rival Theramenes (Xen. Hell. 2.3.52-55). Having taken refuge atop the sacred altar in the council house, Theramenes calls Critias and his followers “the most unholy of men.” At Critias’ behest, the herald orders the Eleven to drag Theramenes from the altar, and he is carried off to his execution “beseeching the gods to witness these events.”

5. Drama and Poetry

Apart from the surviving fragments of the plays and the elegiac and hexameter poetry attributed to him, nothing is known about Critias’ work as a playwright and poet. Only a single quote from the Tennes survives, the end of a hypothesis of the Rhadamanthys remains along with three brief fragments, and some nine fragments are extant from his Pirithous. A substantial fragment from the satyr play, Sisyphus, (discussed above) also remains.

In the sole surviving fragment of his hexameters, Critias celebrates the sixth-century BC poet Anacreon, who was reputed to be the lover of Critias’ homonymous grandfather (fr.1). This fragment also contains the earliest reference to the kottabos game, a favorite sport at aristocratic symposia; another fragment in elegaic couplets further records the Sicilian origins of the game (fr. 2). Critias’ apparent love for this drinking game, which included a brief prayer for one’s younger lover, is undoubtedly behind Theramenes’ famous last words at his execution in 403 BC. After having been compelled to drink hemlock, Theramenes reputedly tossed the dregs from his cup and in clear imitation of kottabos practice said: “This to Critias the fair” (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.56).

Two fragments of Critias’ elegies honor Alcibiades (fragments 4 and 5). One of the fragments, in fact, states emphatically that it was Critias who proposed the successful motion for Alcibiades’ return from exile (fr. 5).

Another brief pentameter line records the axiom: “More men are good from practice, than from nature” (fr. 9). The axiom fits well what is known of Critias’ emphasis on training in the building of character, but is perhaps striking when his own aristocratic pedigree is considered.

The remaining elegaic couplets, which record various customs and facts relating to the Spartans, apparently belonged to a “Politeia of the Lacedaemonians” in verse (fragments 5-7). Politeia is a term often best translated as “constitution,” but often refers more broadly to a “way of life” rather than strictly political matters. Critias appears to have been one of the first to compose such “constitutions” either in verse or prose. Critias reportedly believed that the Spartan politeia was the best (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.3.34), and so it is no accident that the majority of the fragments come from his constitutions of the Lacedaimonians (one in prose, the other in verse).

6. Rhetoric

In his rhetorical training, Critias was influenced by the grand, antithetical style of Gorgias and Antiphon and continued to be read by students of rhetoric such as Cicero (On Oratory 2.23.93) throughout antiquity. Furthermore, his work was remembered by later rhetoricians of the Second Sophistic as an excellent example of pure Attic oratory (see, for example, Philostratus, Lives of the Sophists 9.16 and 16.1.34-40). None of Critias’ speeches survive intact, although H.T. Wade-Gery has argued that a speech attributed to Herodes Atticus is a work of Critias. However, U. Albini’s careful and thorough study of the speech leaves no possibility for a date of composition of the “Herodes” speech earlier than the second century AD. More profitably, S. Usher has argued that the speeches given by Critias in Xenophon’s Hellenica are condensed versions of the originals. Xenophon almost certainly knew Critias and his rhetorical style personally, and may have been present to hear him attack Theramenes in the council chamber, but how precisely he recalled the words spoken must remain a matter of speculation.

7. Writings

Fragments of Constitutions of Thessaly (fr. 31) and Lacedaemon (frr. 32-37) written by Critias in prose are extant; A. Boeckh and other scholars have attributed to Critias a “Constitution of the Athenians” wrongly ascribed to Xenophon, but this argument has found little favor. Other extant fragments from unnamed prose works include biographical details of the lives of the poet Archilochus (fr. 44) and the Athenian statesmen Themistocles (fr. 45) and Cimon (fr. 52). In addition, the lexicographer Pollux cites words from Critias’ works on some twenty occasions–a testimony to Critias’ stature as a writer of pure Attic Greek and, perhaps, to his educated diction.

In the fragments from his “Constitution of the Lacedaimonians” Critias never fails to record his admiration for even the most mundane features of Spartan society. Along with Lacedaimonian moderation in drinking wine and toasting their fellows (fr. 6), Critias stated that the Laconian way of raising children (fr. 32), the shape of Laconian drinking cups, Laconian shoes, Laconian cloaks, and even Laconian furniture (fr. 34) were the best. He also recorded that “it was a Lacedaimonian, Chilon the wise, who once said, ‘Nothing too much, all beautiful things arrive at the proper moment'” (fr. 7).

Critias was one of the first to write histories of individual city states. It is likely that Xenophon used and perhaps even imitated Critias in the writing of his own “Constitution of the Lacedaemonians,” although he never says as much. It is also possible, if not certain, that Aristotle used Critias’ work in the composition of his “constitutions” of the Greek city-states, but this too must remain an open question.

The breadth of Critias’ work in philosophy, drama, poetry, historical writing, rhetoric, and politics is impressive. He was not a particularly original thinker, but generalists seldom are. His leadership of the Thirty–one of Athens’ darkest, bloodiest moments–has tended to overshadow his literary and philosophical work, but Critias was no ordinary despotic thug. A scion of one of Athens most noble families, highly-educated, cultured, a writer of poetry and prose, a powerful speaker, and brave, Critias was perhaps the greatest tragedy the city ever produced.

8. References and Further Reading

  • H. Diels and W. Kranz, eds. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. 10th ed. Berlin 1960-1961. Fragments of Critias’ works are cited above according to the numeration of Diels-Kranz.
  • U. Albini, [Erode Attico] peri politeias. introduzione, testo critico e commento. Florence 1968.
  • J.K. Davies, Athenian Propertied Families 600-300 B.C. Oxford 1971.
  • H.T. Wade-Gery, “Kritias and Herodes,” in Essays in Greek History. Oxford 1958 271-292.
  • W. Morison, The “Amateur” as Tyrant: A Socioeconomic Study of Kritias. Unpublished Masters Thesis: California State University, Fresno 1990
  • D. Stephans, Critias: Life and Literary Remains. Cincinnati 1939.
  • M. Untersteiner, The Sophists. New York 1954.
  • S. Usher, “Xenophon, Critias, and Theramenes,” Journal of Hellenic Studies 88 (1968) 128-135.

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

The Bakhtin Circle

bakhtinThe Bakhtin Circle was a 20th century school of Russian thought which centered on the work of Mikhail Mikhailovich Bakhtin (1895-1975). The circle addressed philosophically the social and cultural issues posed by the Russian Revolution and its degeneration into the Stalin dictatorship. Their work focused on the centrality of questions of significance in social life in general and artistic creation in particular, examining the way in which language registered the conflicts between social groups. The key views of the circle are that linguistic production is essentially dialogic, formed in the process of social interaction, and that this leads to the interaction of different social values being registered in terms of reaccentuation of the speech of others. While the ruling stratum tries to posit a single discourse as exemplary, the subordinate classes are inclined to subvert this monologic closure. In the sphere of literature, poetry and epics represent the centripetal forces within the cultural arena whereas the novel is the structurally elaborated expression of popular ideologiekritik, the radical criticism of society. Members of the circle included Matvei Isaevich Kagan (1889-1937); Pavel Nikolaevich Medvedev (1891-1938); Lev Vasilievich Pumpianskii (1891-1940); Ivan Ivanovich Sollertinskii (1902-1944); Valentin Nikolaevich Voloshinov (1895-1936); and others.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Early Works: 1919-1927
  3. The Concluding Works of the Bakhtin Circle: 1928-1929
  4. Bakhtin and the Theory of the Novel: 1933-1941
  5. Carnival, History And Popular Culture: Rabelais, Goethe And Dostoyevsky As Philosophers
  6. Bakhtin’s Last Works
  7. Conclusion

1. Introduction

M.M. Bakhtin and his circle began meeting in the Belorussian towns of Nevel and Vitebsk in 1918 before moving to Leningrad in 1924. Their group meetings were terminated due to the arrest of many of the group in 1929. From this time until his death in 1975, Bakhtin continued to work on the topics which had occupied his group, living in internal exile first in Kustanai (Kazakhstan, 1930-36), Savelovo (about 100 km from Moscow, 1937-45), Saransk (Mordovia, 1936-7, 1945-69) and finally moving in 1969 to Moscow, where he died at the age of eighty. In Saransk Bakhtin worked at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute (now University) until retirement in 1961.

The Bakhtin circle is reputed to have been initiated by Kagan on his return from Germany, where he had studied philosophy in Leipzig, Berlin and Marburg. He had been a pupil of the founder of Marburg Neo-Kantianism Herman Cohen and had attended lectures by Ernst Cassirer. Kagan established a “Kantian Seminar” at which various philosophical, religious and cultural issues were discussed. Kagan was a Jewish intellectual who had been a member of the Social Democratic Party (the precursor of the Bolsheviks and Mensheviks) and he may have been attracted to Cohen’s philosophy for its supposed affinity with Marxism (Cohen regarded his ethical philosophy as completely compatible with that of Marx), while rejecting the atheism of Russian Communism. Whatever the truth of the matter, the members of the circle did not restrict themselves to academic philosophy but became closely involved in the radical cultural activities of the time, activities which became more intense with the movement of the group to Vitebsk, where many important avant-garde artists such as Malevich and Chagall had settled to avoid the privations of the Civil War. One of the group, Pavel Medvedev, a graduate in law from Petrograd University, became rector of the Vitebsk Proletarian University, editing the town’s cultural journalIskusstvo (Art) to which he and Voloshinov contributed articles, while Bakhtin and Pumpianskii both gave public lectures on a variety of philosophical and cultural topics, as seen in recently published student notes. Pumpianskii, it is known, never finished his studies at Petrograd university, while it is doubtful whether Bakhtin had any formal higher education at all despite his claims, now disproven, to have graduated from the same University in 1918. It seems that Bakhtin attempted to gain acceptance in academic circles by adopting aspects of his older brother’s biography. Nikolai Bakhtin had a solid classical education from his German governess and graduated from Petrograd University, where he had been a pupil of the renowned classicist F.F. Zelinskii. Bakhtin had therefore been exposed to philosophical ideas since his youth. After Nikolai’s departure for the Crimea, and Mikhail’s move to Nevel, it seems that Kagan took the place of his brother as unofficial mentor, having an important influence on Bakhtin’s philosophy in a new and exciting cultural environment, although the two friends went their separate ways in 1921, the year Bakhtin married.

Kagan, however, moved to take up a teaching position at the newly established provincial university in Orel in 1921. While there he published the only sustained piece of philosophy to be published by a member of the group before the late 1920s entitled “Kak vozmozhna istoria” (How Is History Possible) in 1922. The same year he produced an obituary of Hermann Cohen in which he stressed the historical and sociological aspects of Cohen’s philosophy and wrote other unpublished works. 1922 also saw the publication of Pumpianskii’s paper “Dostoevskii i antichnost´” (Dostoyevsky and Antiquity), a theme that was to recur in Bakhtin’s work for many years. While Bakhtin himself did not publish any substantial work until 1929, he was clearly working on matters related to Neo-Kantian philosophy and the problem of authorship at this time. Bakhtin’s earliest published work is the two page “Iskusstvo i otvetstvennost´” (Art and Answerability) from 1919 and fragments of a larger project on moral philosophy written between 1920 and 1924, now usually referred to as K filosofii postupka (Towards a Philosophy of the Act).

Most of the group’s significant work was produced after their move to Leningrad in 1924. It seems that there the group became acutely aware of the challenge posed by Saussurean linguistics and its development in the work of the Formalists. Thus there emerges a new awareness of the importance of the philosophy of language in philosophy and poetics. The most significant work on the philosophy of language was published in the period 1926-1930 by Voloshinov: a series of articles and a book entitledMarksizm i filosofia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) (1929). Medvedev, who had been put in charge of the archive of the symbolist poet Aleksandr Blok, participated in the vigorous discussions between Marxist and formalist literary theorists with a series of articles and a book, Formal´lnyi metod v literaturovedenii (The Formal Method in Literary Scholarship) (1928) and the first book-length study of Blok’s work. Voloshinov also published an article and a book (1925, 1926) on the debate which raged around Freudianism at the time. In 1929 Bakhtin produced the first edition of his famous monograph Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Work), but many other works dating from 1924-9 remained unpublished and usually unfinished. Among these was a critical essay on formalism called “Problema soderzheniia i formy v slovesnom khudozhestvennom tvorchestve” (The Problem of Content, Material and Form in Verbal Artistic Creation) (1924) and a book length study called “Avtor i geroi v esteticheskoi deiatel´nosti” (Author and Hero in Aesthetic Activity) (1924-7).

Since the 1970s the works published under the names of Voloshinov and Medvedev have often been ascribed to Bakhtin, who neither consented nor objected. A voluminous, ideologically motivated, often bad-tempered and largely futile body of literature has grown up to contest the issue one way or another, but since there is no concrete evidence to suggest that the published authors were not responsible for the texts which bear their names, there seems no real case to answer. It seems much more likely that the materials were written as a result of lively group discussions around these issues, which group members wrote up according to their own perspectives afterwards. There are clearly many philosophical, ideological and stylistic discrepancies which, despite the presence of certain parallels and points of agreement, suggest these very different works were largely the work of different authors. In accordance with Bakhtin’s own philosophy, it seems logical to treat them as rejoinders in ongoing dialogues between group members on the one hand and between the group and other contemporary thinkers on the other.

The sharp deterioration in the situation of unorthodox intellectuals in the Soviet Union at the end of 1928 effectively broke the Bakhtin circle up. Bakhtin, whose health had already begun to deteriorate, was arrested, presumably because of his connection with the St. Petersburg Religious-Philosophical society, and was sentenced to ten years on the Solovetskii Islands. After vigorous intercession by Bakhtin’s friends, a favourable review of his Dostoyevsky book by Commissar of Enlightenment Lunacharskii and a personal appeal by Maksim Gor´kii, this was commuted to six years exile in Kazakhstan. With the tightening of censorship at the time, very little was published by Voloshinov, while Medvedev published a book on theories of authorship V laboratorii pisatelia (In the Laboratory of the Writer) in 1933 and a new version of the Formalism study, revised to fit in more closely with the ideological requirements of the time, in 1934. Medvedev was appointed full professor at the Leningrad Historico-Philological Institute but was arrested and disappeared during the terror of 1938. Voloshinov worked at the Herzen Pedagogical Institute in Leningrad until 1934 when he contracted tuberculosis. He died in a sanitorium two year later leaving unfinished a translation of the first volume of Ernst Cassirer’s The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, a book which is of considerable importance in the work of the circle. Kagan died of angina in 1937 after working as editor of an encyclopedic atlas of energy resources in the Soviet Union for many years. Pumpianskii pursued a successful career as Professor of Literature at Leningrad University, but published only short articles and introductions to works of Russian authors, most notably Turgenev. Sollertinskii joined the Leningrad Philharmonic in 1927 as a lecturer, but soon established himself as one of the leading Soviet musicologists, producing over two hundred articles, books and reviews. He died of a heart attack, probably resulting from the privations of the Leningrad blockade, in 1944.

While in Kazakhstan Bakhtin began work on his now famous theory of the novel which resulted in the now famous articles Slovo v romane (Discourse in the Novel) (1934-5), Iz predystorii romannogo slovo (From the Prehistory of Novelistic Discourse) (1940), Epos i roman (Epic and Novel) (1941),Formy vremeni i khronotopa v romane (Forms of Time and Chronotope in the Novel) (1937-8). Between 1936 and 1938 he completed a book on the Bildungsroman and its significance in the history of realism which was lost when the publishing house at which the manuscript was lying awaiting publication was destroyed in the early days of the German invasion of the Soviet Union in 1941. Voluminous, most still unpublished, preparatory material still exists, although part is lost, allegedly because Bakhtin used it for cigarette papers during the wartime paper shortage. Bakhtin’s exceptional productiveness at this time is further accentuated when one considers that one of his legs was amputated in February 1938. He had suffered from inflammation of the bone marrow, osteomyelitis, for many years, which gave him a lot of pain, high temperatures, and often confined him to bed for weeks on end. This had been a factor in the appeals of his friends and acquaintances for clemency when he was internally exiled, a factor that may well have saved his life. This did not, however, prevent him from presenting a now famous doctoral thesis on Rabelais to the Gor´kii Institute of World Literature in 1940. The work proved extremely controversial in the hostile ideological climate of the time and it was not until 1951 that Bakhtin was eventually granted the qualification of kandidat. It was not published in book form until 1965.

The period between the completion of the Rabelais study and the second edition of the Dostoyevsky study in 1963 is perhaps the least well known of Bakhtin’s life in terms of work produced. This has been recently (1996) rectified with the publication of archival materials from this period, when Bakhtin was working as a lecturer at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute. The most substantial work dating from this period is Problema rechevykh zhanrov (The Problem of Speech Genres) which was most likely produced in response to the reorganisation of Soviet linguistics in the wake of Stalin’s article Marksizm i voprosy iazykoznaniia (Marxism and Questions of Linguistics) of 1953. Many other fragments exist from this time, including notes for a planned article about Maiakovskii and more methodological comments on the study of the novel.

In the more liberal atmosphere of the so-called “thaw” following Khruschev’s accession, Bakhtin’s work on Dostoyevsky came to the attention of a group of younger scholars led by Vadim Kozhinov who, upon finding out that he was still alive, contacted Bakhtin and tried to convince him to republish the 1929 Dostoyevsky book. After some initial hesitation, Bakhtin responded by significantly expanding and fundamentally altering the overall project. It was accepted for publication in September 1963 and received a generally favourable reception. Publication of the Rabelais study, newly edited for purposes of acceptability (mainly the toning down of scatology and an analysis of a speech by Lenin) followed soon after. As Bakhtin’s health continued to decline, he was taken to hospital in Moscow in 1969 and in May 1970 he and his wife, who died a year later, were moved into a retirement home just outside Moscow. Bakhtin continued to work until just before his death in 1975, producing work of a mainly methodological character.

Since Bakhtin’s death, several collections of his work have appeared in Russian and many translations have followed. English language translations have been appearing since 1968, although the quality of translation and systematicity of publication has been uneven. Up to ten different translators have published work by a writer whose terminology is very specific, often rendering key concepts in a variety of different ways. This has exacerbated problems of interpretation and questions of theoretical heritage, especially since there is a quite sharp distinction between works written before and after the 1929 Dostoyevsky study. Another problem has been the questions of authorship of the Bakhtin circle and the extent to which a Marxist vocabulary in the works of Voloshinov and Medvedev should be taken at face value. Those, for example, who argue Bakhtin was the author of these works also tend to argue that the vocabulary is mere “window dressing” to facilitate publication, while those who support the authenticity of the original publications also tend to take the Marxist arguments seriously. As a result writers about Bakhtin have tended to choose one period of Bakhtin’s career and treat it as definitive, a practice which has produced a variety of divergent versions of “Bakhtinian” thought. The recent appearance of the first volume of a collected works in Russian might help to overcome the problems which have dogged Bakhtin studies.

2. The Early Works: 1919-1927

The work of the Bakhtin Circle should be regarded as a philosophy of culture. Questions which seem to be of very specific relevance, such as the modality of author-hero relations, actually involve questions of a much more general nature encompassing the value-laden relations between subject and object, subjects and other subjects. The phenomenological arguments presented by the young Bakhtin are directed against the abstractions of rationalist philosophy and contemporary positivism. He draws much of his conceptual structure from the work of the Marburg School (most notably Hermann Cohen (1842-1918), Paul Natorp (1854-1924) and Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950)) and German phenomenologists such as Max Scheler (1874-1928) and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). However, it is particularly difficult to trace the precise influence of these writers because Bakhtin was notoriously inconsistent in crediting his sources and was not averse to copying whole passages which he had translated from German into Russian in his works without reference to the original. This has led many commentators either to guess at influences on the young Bakhtin or to credit him with the invention of a philosophical vocabulary almost from nothing. However, recent archival work by Brian Poole has uncovered notebooks in which Bakhtin made copious notes from various German idealist philosophers which give us a better idea both of the sources of his ideas and the originality of the philosophical work which resulted from his fusion of disparate ideas.

The ideas of the Marburg School were undoubtedly filtered to Bakhtin through the works of Matvei Kagan on his return from Germany at the end of the First World War. In his obituary of Cohen Kagan stressed the religious, messianic aspects of the former’s philosophy, which emerges in his later work. For the late Cohen, “the unity of objective being, as an unending large process of the unity of being and concept demands the unending small unity of the singular individuum…. The whole problem of religion is contained in the problem of the individuum as in the question of God.” The continual relationship between the individuum and God is the absolute element of subjectivity and is the unity of monotheism. The individual does not combine with God but continually relates to God. This has social significance, for religion grows out of ethics: “the religion of the unity of humanity is monotheism…. Religion is everywhere, in all regions of culture…. Religion itself is philosophy.” Problems of intersubjectivity must be related to questions of historical development: “in our opinion, the problem of individual relationships, the problem of subjective consciousness, ontological subjectivity can be based on the pathos of the individual condition of the struggle of the historical life of culture, the person and humanity.” Kagan stresses the parallels between Cohen’s ethics and the traditions of Russian populism, a factor which recurs later in Bakhtin’s career when the novel becomes linked with a populist political process. (M. Kagan, German Kogen, 1922) The unity of the individual is dependent on the unity of the people and this is in turn dependent on the unity of God.

Whatever the difficulties of tracing his more immediate precursors, there is no doubt that Bakhtin’s philosophical project maintained a fundamental connection with the traditions of Enlightenment aesthetics and with Kantianism in particular. As for Kant, the aesthetic is distinguished by its “disinterestedness,” the uncoupling of purposiveness from representation of the end. Where Kant concentrated on aesthetic judgement, however, Bakhtin was interested in aesthetic activity which can help to establish a mode of reciprocal intersubjective relationships necessary to produce an intimate unity of individuals whose specificity is in no way endangered. This project, which remains constant throughout his work, adopts various forms. The aesthetic is the realm where now detached from the “open event of being” and “finalized” by virtue of the author’s “exteriority” (vnenakhodimost´), the value-laden essence of the hero’s deed is manifested. If the hero’s activity were not objectified by the author then he or she would remain in some perpetual stream of consciousness, completely oblivious to the wider significance of those deeds. However, in order to visualise the meaningful nature of those deeds, the author must also have an insight into the subjective world of the hero, his or her horizon, sphere of views and interests (krugozor). Only the appropriate mode of empathy and objectification can produce the sort of productive whole Bakhtin envisages.

Several problems arise from this model. The first is that Bakhtin seems to want to use the author-hero model as a reciprocal principle within society and as a model of relations in literary composition. In the first model authors and heroes change their roles constantly, the unique perspective of each subject allows the objectification of others except oneself, who is objectified by others. Although the concept hardly appears in the early works, from 1928 onwards dialogue becomes the model of such interactions: one gains an awareness of one’s own place within the whole through dialogue, which helps to bestow an awareness on others at the same time. This is a very pleasant model as long as relationships remain equal. Yet the author-hero model also assumes a fundamental inequality in that the hero of a work can never have a reciprocal vantage point from which to objectify the author and thus the creator. There is a crucial difference between a person-to-person and a person-to-God relationship which Bakhtin’s model seems to obscure.

Furthermore, Bakhtin’s model of the unique perspective of each author/hero, which is drawn from the Kantian model of an individual consciousness bearing a-priori categories encountering and giving form to the manifold of sense impressions, is seriously compromised when one admits a socio-linguistic dimension into the equation. This happens in Voloshinov’s 1926 article on discourse in life and poetry. The alternative adopted by Voloshinov foregrounds the intonational dimension of language which manifests the unique evaluative connections between subject and object. Language enmeshed within everyday practical activity is extracted, or liberated, from its connection with the “open event of being” by the author who then reflects upon it, from his or her own unique vantage point, manifesting its total intonational meaning. The hero’s language is alien to the author and therefore ripe for objectification; the crucial category is the latter’s exteriority. Stress on this intonational dimension allows the encounter of the two consciousnesses to be spoken about in phenomenological rather than linguistic terms and therefore allows Bakhtin to counter what he calls “theoreticism”, the tendency to consider the inner meaning of an action and its historical specificity in isolation from each other. This might include Hegel‘s tendency to view the particular incident as meaningful only as an instance of the unfolding of reason, Husserl‘s sublation of inter-subjective relations in transcendental subjectivity or the positivistic assumption that categorisation of a phenomenon is sufficient to explain that phenomenon.

The distinctively Bakhtinian approach to language only really begins to emerge in Voloshinov’s 1926 essay Slovo v zhizni i slovo v poezii: k voprosam sotsiologicheskoi poetiki (Discourse in Life and Discourse in Poetry: Questions of Sociological Poetics), written during his postgraduate studies at the Institute of Material, Artistic and Verbal Culture in Leningrad where L.P. Iakubinskii, the pioneer of the study of dialogic speech, was among his advisers. This work, which has been seen as the earliest example of pragmatics by more than one commentator, is the first work of the circle to be presented as an explicitly Marxist text. The author attempts to define the aesthetic as a specific form of social interaction characterised by its “completion by the creation of the artistic work and by its continual recreations in cocreative perception and it does not require any other objectifications”. In the artistic work unspoken social evaluations are “condensed” and determine artistic form. The deeper structural features of a particular social interaction are made manifest in a successful artistic work; as Voloshinov puts it, “form should be a convincing evaluation of the content” (Bakhtin School Papers ed. Shukman, Colchester 1983 p.9, 19, 20). The early Bakhtinian phenomenology is now recast in terms of discursive interaction, with a specifically sociological frame of reference.

Another of Voloshinov’s projects was a critical response to incipient psychoanalysis and contemporary attempts to attempt a fusion of Marxism and Freudianism. In 1927 he published his first book calledFreidizm: Kriticheskii ocherk (Freudianism a Critical Sketch), which continued the theme of an earlier article from 1925 Po tu storonu sotsial´nogo (Just Beyond the Social) in which Freud was accused of a biological reductionism and subjectivism quite alien to the spirit of Marxism. Leaning upon a sociological analysis of language and culture, Voloshinov stresses that intersubjectivity precedes subjectivity as such and that all meaning production and thus repression of meanings are socio-ideological rather than individual and biological as Freud supposed. It must be noted, however, that Voloshinov does not pay any attention to Freud’s later work on cultural phenomena and thus presents a rather one-sided view of contemporary psychology. Furthermore, Freudianism is treated as a manifestation of “bourgeois decay” very much in the spirit of the later Lukács. This indicates a turning towards a more Hegelian approach to questions of cultural and philosophical development, while the recasting of the Freudian superego in terms of the repression of unofficial ideologies by an official ideology anticipates one of the central themes that would occupy Bakhtin in the 1930s and 1940s.

3. The Concluding Works of the Bakhtin Circle: 1928-1929

In the late 1920s the sociological and linguistic turn signalled by Voloshinov’s article on discourse had begun to form into a distinct school of thought in which language was the index of social relations and embodiment of ideological worldview. While Voloshinov’s linguistic studies were undoubtedly crucial to this reorientation, one of the central influences on the group at the time was the work of Ernst Cassirer, whose ground-breaking Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (3 Vols) was published between 1923 and 1929. One of Voloshinov’s unfinished projects, which he began while at University, was a translation of the first volume of Cassirer’s work on language. This volume marked the culmination of Cassirer’s move away from Marburg Neo-Kantianism to a Hegelian rectification of Kant. Adopting Hegel’s dialectical orientation, evolutionary approach to human knowledge and existence and concentration of the totality of human activities, Cassirer sought to overcome the exclusivity of the Kantian focus on mankind’s rational thought processes. At the same time, however, Cassirer strove to resist the Hegelian subsumption of all realms of the human spirit into the Absolute by retaining the Kantian distinction between the “languages” of the human spirit. To this end Cassirer drew upon Herder and von Humboldt’s identification of thought and signification, viewing the “symbolic function” as the common element to all areas of knowledge, but which took a specific form in each of them. The truth, agreed Cassirer and Hegel, is whole, but the former understood this to mean that each of the perspectives offered by various symbolic forms is equally valid and must be progressively “unfolded” so as to fully articulate itself. This formulation, as we shall see, had a far reaching effect on the later work of Bakhtin, but there are signs of its influence almost immediately in the work of the group.

In 1928 P.N. Medvedev published a book-length critique of Russian Formalism. This work begins with a definition of literary scholarship as “one branch of the study of ideologies”, a study which “embraces all areas of man’s ideological creativity”. Medvedev goes on to argue that while Marxism has established the basis of such a study, including its relationship to economic factors, the study of “the distinctive features and qualitative individuality of each of the branches of ideological creation — science, art, ethics, religion, and so forth. — is still in the embryonic stage” (p.3). Despite the replacement of “symbolic forms” with “branches of ideological creation” the continuity of approach is clear. Where Cassirer sought to examine the symbolic function as “a factor which recurs in each basic cultural form but in no two takes exactly the same shape” (vol. 1, p.84), Medvedev sought to investigate the “sociological laws of development” which can be found in each “branch” of “ideological creation” but which manifests itself in specific ways. This sociological adaption of Cassirer’s work was to feature largely in Bakhtin’s work from the 1930s and 1940s, where, as Poole has demonstrated, many unattributed passages from the former’s work appear in Russian translation within the body of the latter’s work. Medvedev felt that the Formalists were correct in attempting to define the specific features of literary creation but fundamentally mistaken in the positivistic approach they took towards literary devices which tended to efface the ideological, meaning-bearing and thus sociological aspect of literary form. In conclusion Medvedev recommended that the formalists be treated respectfully and seriously, even if their fundamental premises were erroneous. Marxist criticism, he argued, should value Formalism as an object of serious criticism through which the bases of the former can be clarified.

While subjecting the Russian Formalists to intense criticism on the basis of their partisan alliance with the Futurist movement and their sharing its tendency towards a nihilistic destruction of meaning, Medvedev particularly praised Western “formalist art scholarship” such as the work of Hildebrand, Wölfflin and Worringer. These theorists were important for the development of the Bakhtin circle because they treated changes of artistic forms and styles as changes of “artistic volition”, that is, having ideological significance. Worringer saw art history to be marked by an alternation of naturalism (empathy) and abstraction (estrangement) which correlated to the harmony or otherwise in the relationship of man and his environment. While formal and evaluative aspects are not identical, they do tend to maintain a close affiliation and this, Medvedev concluded, can be applied to literary form as well as visual art. This particular chapter, along with some shorter extracts of the book were omitted from the second edition of the book published with the title Formalizm I formalisty (Formalism and the Formalists) in 1934. By this time a tolerant attitude towards the Formalists or Western scholarship was not permitted, and thus an additional and extremely hostile chapter called “The Collapse of Formalism” was included. Earlier writers on the Bakhtin Circle tended to ascribe the first edition to Bakhtin and the second to Medvedev, but it is clear that the body of the second edition is an expurgated version of the first.

Medvedev’s formulation was carried over into Bakhtin’s now famous study Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Work) published in 1929. Here the great nineteenth-century novelist’s own verbally affirmed and often reactionary ideology is downplayed in favour of his “form-shaping ideology” which is seen to be imbued with a profoundly democratic spirit. Bakhtin attacks those critics, such as Engelgardt, who characterised Dostoyevsky’s creative method as Hegelian. In such a scheme two positions struggle for ascendancy but are transformed into a synthesis at the end; however, according to Bakhtin, there is no merging of voices into a final, authoritative voice as in the Hegelian absolute. Dostoyevsky does not present an abstract dialectic but an unmerged dialogue of voices, each given equal rights. Bakhtin follows the nineteenth-century German novelist and critic Otto Ludwig in terming this type of dialogue “polyphonic dialogue”, which allows Cassirer’s insistence on a plurality of cultural forms to be extended to a plurality of discourses in society and the novel. In the course of Dostoyevsky’s novels, argues Bakhtin, very much in the spirit of Cassirer, the worldviews of Dostoyevsky’s heroes “unfold”, presenting their own unique perspective upon the world. The novelist does not, as is the case with Tolstoi, submerge all positions beneath a single authoritative perspective, but allows the voice of the narrator to reside beside the voices of the characters, bestowing no greater authority on that voice than on any of the others. Voices intersect and interact, mutually illuminating their ideological structures, potentialities, biases and limitations.

Bakhtin’s early phenomenology is now translated into discursive terms. Where Bakhtin was initially concerned with intersubjective relations and the modality of authorial and heroic interaction, this is now examined in terms of the way in which one language encounters another, reporting and modifying the utterance by reaccentuating it. Modes of interaction range from stylisation to explicit parody, which Bakhtin spends a considerable proportion of the book cataloguing. As only the later edition of the book (1963) has been published in English, there is a tendency to confuse the chronology of the emergence of Bakhtin’s key concepts. It should be noted that there is no reflection on carnival or on the Menippean Satire in the first edition of the Dostoyevsky study. These features only emerged in the next decade in relation to the history of the novel as a genre. The first edition of the Dostoyevsky study is a monograph on the work of the famous novelist in terms which in many respects embody the poetics of a significant portion of contemporary “fellow-traveller” writing. When considered in its historical context, the Dostoyevsky study can be seen as a sort of rearguard defence of liberality in the cultural arena against the encroachment of political control. The book was published on the eve of the destructive RAPP dictatorship, when bellicose advocates of “proletarian culture” were granted free reign by the newly victorious Stalinist leadership of the Soviet Communist Party. Formal experimentation and an inadequately tendentious narrative position was branded as reactionary, while Bakhtin’s work defended the presentation of a plurality of perspectives free from “monologic” closure. The formal characteristics of a work were themselves of ideological significance, but the reactionary tendency was in the imposition of a unitary perspective on a varied community of opinion.

The semiotic dimension of the new orientation of the Bakhtin Circle was developed at the same time by Voloshinov. In a series of articles between 1928 and 1930 punctuated by the appearance of the book-length Marksizm i filosofiia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) in 1929 (2nd edition 1930) Voloshinov published an analysis of the relationship between language and ideology unsurpassed for several decades. Voloshinov examines two contemporary accounts of language, what he calls “abstract objectivism”, whose leading exponent is Saussure, and “individualistic subjectivism”, developed from the work of Wilhelm von Humboldt by the romantic idealists Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Karl Vossler (1872-1942). Voloshinov argues that the two trends derive from rationalism and romanticism respectively and share both the strengths and weaknesses of those movements. While the former identifies the systematic and social character of language it mistakes the “system of self-identical forms” for the source of language usage in society; it abstracts language from the concrete historical context of its utilisation (Bakhtin’s “theoreticism”); the part is examined at the expense of the whole; the individual linguistic element is treated as a “thing” at the expense of the dynamics of speech; a unity of word meaning is assumed to the neglect of the multiplicity of meaning and accent and language is treated as a ready-made system whose developments are aberrations. The latter trend is correct in viewing language as a continuous generative process and asserting that this process is meaningful, but fundamentally wrong in identifying the laws of that creation with those of individual psychology, viewing the generative process as analogous with art and treating the system of signs as an inert crust of the creative process. These partial insights, Voloshinov argues that a stable system of linguistic signs is merely a scientific abstraction; the generative process of language is implemented in the social-verbal interaction of speakers; the laws of language generation are sociological laws; although linguistic and artistic creativity do not coincide, this creativity must be understood in relation to the ideological meanings and values that fill language and that the structure of each concrete utterance is a sociological structure.

Several commentators have noted how Voloshinov’s approach to language anticipates many of the criticisms of linguistic philosophy levelled by present day Poststructuralists, but does so without invoking the relativism of much of the latter or the nullity of Derrida‘s “hors texte.” Voloshinov firmly establishes the sign-bound nature of consciousness and the shifting nature of the language system, but instead of viewing the subject as fragmented by the reality of difference, he poses each utterance to be a microcosm of social conflict. This allows sociological structure and the plurality of discourse to be correlated according to a unitary historical development. In this sense Voloshinov’s critique bears a strong resemblance to the Italian Communist leader Antonio Gramsci’s account of hegemony in his Prison Notebooks. Like Voloshinov and Bakhtin, Gramsci drew upon the work of Croce and Vossler and Matteo Bartoli’s Saussurean “spatial linguistics”, and combined it with a Hegelian reading of Marxism. As we have seen, however, Voloshinov was heavily influenced by the work of Cassirer, whose admiration for the work of von Humboldt, the founder of generative linguistics, was substantial. Voloshinov’s critique thus tended towards the romantic pole of language study rather than taking up the equidistant position he claimed in his study. This can be seen in the tendency to see social groups as collective subjects rather than institutionally defined collectives and such assertions as those which suggest the meaning of a word is “totally determined” by its context. What Voloshinov effectively does is to supplement Humboldt’s recognition of individual and national linguistic variability with a sociological dimension. Humboldt’s “inner-form” of language is recast as the relationality of discourse, dialogism. Abandoning the Marxist distinction between base and superstructure, Voloshinov follows Cassirer and Hegel in seeing the variety of linguistic forms as expressions of a single essence. It is significant that Gramsci, who adopted a consistently pragmatist epistemology followed the same course and emerged with startlingly similar formulations.

This suggests that the relations between the work of the Bakhtin school and Marxism are ones which are complex and worthy of close scrutiny. Those who have tried to set up a Chinese wall between the two tendencies or who have tried to identify them, have consistently failed to do justice to this philosophical dialogue. Some have even gone so far as to see the work of the group as fundamentally anti-Hegelian, a charge which collapses as soon as one traces the use of terminology in the works from the late 1920s.

4. Bakhtin and the Theory of the Novel: 1933-1941

The shift in Bakhtin’s thought from Kant towards Hegel is nowhere clearer than in his central works on the novel. This can be seen in the new centrality Bakhtin grants to the history of literature to which Kant had been largely indifferent. As if to stress his indebtedness to German idealism, Bakhtin adopts all of the characteristics of the novel as a genre catalogued by Goethe, Schlegel and Hegel with little modification and traces how the “essence” of the genre “appears” over a course of time. The development of the novel is described in a way distinctly reminiscent of Cassirer’s “symbolic forms” which unfold to present their unique view of the world which is itself a modified version of Hegel’s characterisation of thePhenomenology of Spirit as the representation of “appearing knowledge”. At the same time, however, the novel adopts many of the features of the role of Hegel’s philosophy in its Cassireran guise as the philosophy of culture. Such a philosophy, argued Cassirer, does not attempt to go behind the various image worlds created by the human spirit but “to understand and elucidate their basic formative principle” (The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms vol. 1, Language p.113). The novel, according to the scheme developed by Bakhtin, elucidates this principle with regard both to other literary genres and socio-ideological discourses. The old idealist formulation of the novel’s imperative that it be a “full and comprehensive reflection of its era” is reformulated as “the novel must represent all the ideological voices of its era… all the era’s languages that have any claim to being significant” (411). The novel is a symbolic form, but a specific one in which the “basic formative principle” of symbolic forms becomes visible. The socially stratified national language, heteroglossia in itself, becomes heteroglossia for-itself rather as thought perceives itself as its own object at the climax of Hegel’s Phenomenology.

The novel, for Bakhtin, uncovers the formative principle of discourse, its relationality, dialogism, without presenting some final absolute language of truth such as that which constitutes Hegelian conceptualism. The novel develops into something akin to a visio intellectualis of the sort Cassirer found in the work of Nicholas Cusanus. This is a whole which includes all various viewpoints in its accidentiality and necessity, “the thing seen and the manner and direction of the seeing” (Cassirer The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy 1963, p.32). No individual perspective is adequate to the whole in itself, for only the concrete totality of perspectives can present the whole:

Languages of heteroglossia, like mirrors that face each other, each of which in its own way reflects a little piece, a tiny corner of the world, force us to guess at and grasp behind their inter-reflecting aspects for a world that is broader, more multi-levelled and multi-horizoned than would be available to one language, one mirror. (Bakhtin Voprosy literatury i estetikipp.225-26)

While this aspect of Bakhtin’s theory of the novel is most likely based on the philosophy of Cassirer, who developed his work as a defence of liberal values in the context of an increasingly chauvinistic atmosphere in Weimar Germany, a different political slant becomes markedly more apparent in Bakhtin’s work of the 1930s. The novelist now becomes the heir of an anti-authoritarian popular cultural strategy to deflate the pretensions of the official language and ideology and institute a popular-collective learning process. The antecedent of this strategy is not German bourgeois liberalism but Russian populism (narodnichestvo). Thus the dialectic of mythical and critical symbolic forms which Cassirer outlined in his philosophy now becomes fused with a dialectic of official and popular socio-cultural forces. On one side stand the forces of cultural centralisation and stabilisation: the “official strata”, unitary language, the literary canon and so on. On the other side stands the decentralising influence of popular culture: popular festivity and collective ridicule, literary parody, and the anti-canonic novel. The rise of the novel is correlated with the collapse of antique unity and the breaking down of cultural boundaries. Where the official culture developed a canon of poetic genres which posited a rarified language in opposition to the common spoken language, presented a monolithically serious worldview and epic accounts of a golden age and heroic beginnings, the novel parodies these features, ridiculing the official culture’s claims to universal validity and the ossified conventionality of canonic forms and language.

The novel is thus a literary expression of a whole socio-cultural process, but this process is rather too broad to be incorporated under the label Bakhtin gives to it without considerable problems with regard to conceptual accuracy. The adjective poetic becomes shorthand for the whole complex of institutional and cultural forms which can be included on the side of officialdom. Thus poetic denotes both a type of discourse used in artistic texts and a hierarchical relation between discourses which constitutes the hegemonic relationships of an unequal society. Correspondingly, novelistic describes both the character of a genre, multi-accented artistic discourse, and an anti-authoritarian relationship between discourses. Another pair of terms which is often used interchangeably with these two is monologic and dialogic. The former denotes a mono-accentual type of discourse and an authoritarian stance towards another discourse. The latter describes a multi-accentual discourse, the relationality of discourse, and an orientation on a monologic discourse which seeks to reveal the ideological structure lurking behind surface appearances. The ground between formal and political terms shifts before the reader, who is constantly reminded of the institutional co-ordinates for all discursive phenomena but is never presented with a sociological account of those co-ordinates. This might be explained both by the ideological restrictions placed on any writer in Stalin’s Russia and by the idealist frame of Bakhtin’s own theory. This ambiguity has allowed very different interpretations of Bakhtin’s work to be drawn, ranging from a tendency to reduce the whole argument to one of artistic forms, leading to a liberalistic formal criticism and attempts to correlate Bakhtin’s argument with the institutional forms of modern capitalist society. Bakhtin’s work has thus become a battleground between (mainly American) liberal academics and (mainly British) anti-Stalinist Marxists.

In its classical phase, Russian populism was, according to Walicki, “opposed to the “abstract intellectualism” of those revolutionaries who tried to teach the peasants, to impose on them the ideals of Western socialism, instead of learning what were their real needs and acting in the name of such interests and ideals of which the peasants had already become aware”. Yet it also suggested an opposition to those Second International Marxists who argued that capitalism was an unavoidable stage in the development of Russia (The Controversy Over Capitalism 1989 p.3). In one sense, then, it was a political ideology compatible with Third International Marxism, but in another it sought to reverse the hegemony of intellectuals over “the people”. Bakhtin’s poet is a hegemonic intellectual whose language relates in an authoritative fashion to the discourse of the masses, while the novelist aims to break and indeed reverse that hegemonic relationship. In Bakhtin’s formulation, the locus of critical forces of culture is the people, while the mythological forces of culture emerge from the official stratum.

Many of the central works on the novel were at least partially written in response to the theory of the novel developed by Georg Lukács. Bakhtin had begun to translate Lukács’ Theory of the Novel in the 1920s but abandoned the project upon learning that Lukács no longer liked the book but in the 1930s, when Lukács accommodated to the Stalin regime and essentially became a right Hegelian, his theory of the novel became canonical. Bakhtin agreed with Lukács that the novel represented the “essence of the age” and that irony constituted a central factor of the novelistic method, but rejected the latter’s assertion that unless the novel revealed the thread of rationality running through a seemingly anarchic world, that is, presented an authoritative perspective, the author had succumbed to bourgeois decadence. Modernist formal experimentation and the dominance of parody in modernist literature Lukács found to be a reflection of “bourgeois decay”, while Bakhtin strove to reveal its popular-democratic roots. The novel should not be seen as a compensation for the restlessness of contemporary society, uncovering the assured road to progress, but the embodiment of the dynamic forces that could shape society in a popular-democratic fashion. Thus where Lukács championed epic closure, Bakhtin highlighted novelistic openendedness; where Lukács advocated a strong narrative presence, Bakhtin advocated the maximalisation of multilingual intersection and the testing of discourse. Bakhtin takes a left Hegelian stance against Lukács; dialogism becomes analogous to Hegel’s Geist, both describing the social whole and standing in judgement over those eras in which the dialogic imperative is not realised.

5. Carnival, History And Popular Culture: Rabelais, Goethe And Dostoyevsky As Philosophers

The high point of Bakhtin’s populism can be seen in his now famous 1965 study of Rabelais and the heavily revised second edition of the 1929 Dostoyevsky book (1963). The former had been composed as Bakhtin’s doctoral dissertation which had been written in the late 1930s but was only prepared for publication when he emerged from obscurity in the 1960s. Tvorchestvo Fransua Rable i narodnaia kul´tura srednevekov´ia i renessansa (The work of François Rabelais and the Popular Culture of the Middle Ages and the Renaissance) is a remarkable work. Bakhtin concentrates on the collapse of the strict hierarchies of the Middle Ages and the beginning of the Renaissance by looking at the way in which ancient modes of living and working collectively, in accordance with the rhythms of nature, re-emerge in the forms of popular culture opposed to official culture. In Problemy poetiki Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Poetics) Bakhtin summarises the essence of the question thus:

It could be said (with certain reservations, of course) that a person of the Middle Ages lived, as it were, two lives: one that was the official life, monolithically serious and gloomy, subjugated to a strict hierarchical order, full of terror, dogmatism, reverence and piety; the other was the life of the carnival square, free and unrestricted, full of ambivalent laughter, blasphemy, the profanation of everything sacred, full of debasing and obscenities, familiar contact with everyone and everything. Both these lives were legitimate, but separated by strict temporal boundaries. (p.129-30)

The activities of the carnival square: collective ridicule of officialdom, inversion of hierarchy, violations of decorum and proportion, celebration of bodily excess and so on embody, for Bakhtin, an implicit popular conception of the world. This conception is not, however, able to become ideologically elaborated until the radical laughter of the square entered into the “world of great literature” (Rabelais p.96). The novel of Rabelais is seen as the epitome of this process of breaking down the rigid, hierarchical world of the Middle Ages and the birth of the modern era. Rabelais is much more than a novelist for Bakhtin: his work embodies a whole new philosophy of history, in which the world is viewed in the process of becoming. The grotesque is the image of this becoming, the boundaries between person and person, person and thing, are erased as the individual merges with the people and the whole cosmos. As the individual body is transcended, the biological body is negated and the “body of historical, progressing mankind” moves to the centre of the system of images. In the carnival focus on death and rebirth the individual body dies, but the body of the people lives and grows, biological life ends but historical life continues.

The carnivalesque becomes a set of image-borne strategies for destabilising the official worldview. In a recently published article written for inclusion in the Soviet Literaturnaia entsiklopediia (Literary Encyclopaedia) in 1940, Bakhtin defines the satirical attitude as the “image-borne negation” of contemporary actuality as inadequacy, which contains within itself a positive moment in which an improved actuality is affirmed. This affirmed actuality is the historical necessity implicit in contemporary actuality and which is implied by the grotesque image. The grotesque, argues Bakhtin, “discloses the potentiality of an entirely different world, of another order, another way of life. It leads man out of the confines of the apparent (false) unity, of the indisputable and stable” (Rabelais p.48). The grotesque image of the body, as an image which reveals incomplete metamorphosis no longer represents itself, it represents what Hegel called the “universal dialectic of life”.

The Renaissance birth of the historical world led to a new development in the Enlightenment. Where Rabelais was presented as the high point of Renaissance literary and philosophical development, the Enlightenment reaches one of its high points in the work of Goethe. The process dispersing the “residue of otherworldly cohesion and mythical unity” was completed at this time, helping “reality to gather itself together and condense into the visible whole of a new world” (Speech Genres and Other Late Essaysp.45). The Enlightenment, argues Bakhtin in a section which draws heavily on Cassirer (the corresponding passage is The Philosophy of the Enlightenment p.197), should no longer be considered an a-historical era, but “an epoch of great awakening of a sense of time, above all … in nature and human life” (p.26). But, argues Bakhtin “this process of preparing for the disclosure of historical time took place more rapidly, completely, and profoundly in literary creativity than in the abstract philosophical, ideological views of Enlightenment thinkers” (p.26). Goethe’s imagination was fundamentally chronotopic, he visualised time in space:

Time and space merge … into an inseparable unity … a definite and absolutely concrete locality serves at the starting point for the creative imagination… this is a piece of human history, historical time condensed into space. Therefore the plot (sum of depicted events) and the characters … are like those creative forces that formulated and humanised this landscape, they made it a speaking vestige of the movement of history (historical time), and, to a certain degree, predetermined its subsequent course as well, or like those creative forces a given locality needs in order to organise and continue the historical process embodied in it. (p.49)

Goethe wanted to “bring together and unite the present, past and future with the ring of necessity” (p.39), to make the present creative. Like Rabelais, Goethe was as much a philosopher as a writer.

The same pattern of analysis shapes the 1963 version of the Dostoyevsky study. Here Dostoyevsky is no longer treated, as in the 1929 version, as a totally original innovator, but as the heir to a tradition rooted in popular culture. The novelist stood poised at the threshold of a new era, as the rigidly hierarchical Russian Empire was poised to give way to the catastrophic arrival of capitalist anarchy and ultimately revolution. Dostoyevsky thus intersected with the threshold poetics of carnival at a different stage in its development, he sought to present the voices of his era in a “pure simultaneity” unrivalled since Dante. In contradistinction to that of Goethe this chronotope was one of visualising relations in terms of space not time and this leads to a philosophical bent that is distinctly messianic:

Only such things as can conceivably be linked at a single point in time are essential and are incorporated into Dostoevskii’s world; such things can be carried over into eternity, for in eternity, according to Dostoevskii, all is simultaneous, everything coexists…. Thus there is no causality in Dostoevskii’s novels, no genesis, no explanations based on the past, on the influences of the environment or of upbringing and so forth. Every act a character commits is in the present, and in this sense is not predetermined; it is conceived of and represented by the author as free. (p.29)

The roots of such a conception lie in carnival and, according to Bakhtin, in the carnivalised philosophical dialogues that constituted the Menippean Satire. This philosophico-literary genre reaches a new stage in Dostoyevsky’s work, where the roots of the novel as a genre stands out particularly clearly. One of those roots was the Socratic Dialogue, which was overwhelmed by the monologic Aristotelian treatise, but which continued to lead a subterranean life in the non-canonical minor satirical genres and then became a constitutive element of the novel form and, implicitly, literary modernism. This accounts for its philosophical importance.

6. Bakhtin’s Last Works

In his last years Bakhtin returned to the methodological questions that had preoccupied his earlier years, though now with a rather different perspective. This began with his work on speech genres in the 1950s, though apart from this study, did not yield any sustained texts until the 1970s. Bakhtin now began to stress the dialogic character of all study in the “human sciences”, the fact that one needs to deal with another “I” who can speak for and about his or herself in a fundamentally different way than with an inanimate and voiceless object. To this end he sought to differentiate his position from that of incipient Soviet structuralism, which adopted the “abstract objectivist” approach to language and the constitution of the subject. Bakhtin’s approach to subjectivity is dialogic, referring to the exchange of utterances rather than narrowly linguistic, and this extends to the analysis of texts which are always intertextual, meeting and illuminating each other. Just as texts have genres, “definite and relatively stable typical forms of construction of the whole” so too does speech. Thus the boundaries between complex genres such as those commonly regarded as literary and other less formalised genres should be seen as porous and flexible, allowing a dialogue of genres as well as styles.

7. Conclusion

The work of the Bakhtin circle is multifaceted and extremely pertinent to contemporary philosophical concerns. Yet their work moves beyond philosophy narrowly defined to encompass anthropology, literary studies, historiography and political theory. The vicissitudes of intellectual life in the Soviet Union have complicated assessment of the work of the circle, as has the way in which the works have been published and translated in recent years. On top of this, the works of the group have been read into a theoretical position framed by present-day concerns over poststructuralism and the fate of the subject in modern philosophy. A proper historical assessment of the work of the Bakhtin Circle will be much aided by the publication of Bakhtin’s Complete Works which will appear over the next few years. This will hopefully be followed by a harmonised English translation which will facilitate an informed assessment in the English speaking world.

Author Information

Craig Brandist
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

Francis Bacon (1561—1626)

bacon-francisSir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam and the Viscount St. Albans) was an English lawyer, statesman, essayist, historian, intellectual reformer, philosopher, and champion of modern science. Early in his career he claimed “all knowledge as his province” and afterwards dedicated himself to a wholesale revaluation and re-structuring of traditional learning. To take the place of the established tradition (a miscellany of Scholasticism, humanism, and natural magic), he proposed an entirely new system based on empirical and inductive principles and the active development of new arts and inventions, a system whose ultimate goal would be the production of practical knowledge for “the use and benefit of men” and the relief of the human condition.

At the same time that he was founding and promoting this new project for the advancement of learning, Bacon was also moving up the ladder of state service. His career aspirations had been largely disappointed under Elizabeth I, but with the ascension of James his political fortunes rose. Knighted in 1603, he was then steadily promoted to a series of offices, including Solicitor General (1607), Attorney General (1613), and eventually Lord Chancellor (1618). While serving as Chancellor, he was indicted on charges of bribery and forced to leave public office. He then retired to his estate where he devoted himself full time to his continuing literary, scientific, and philosophical work. He died in 1626, leaving behind a cultural legacy that, for better or worse, includes most of the foundation for the triumph of technology and for the modern world as we currently know it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Political Career
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Literary Works
    2. The New Atlantis
    3. Scientific and Philosophical Works
    4. The Great Instauration
    5. The Advancement of Learning
    6. The “Distempers” of Learning
    7. The Idea of Progress
    8. The Reclassification of Knowledge
    9. The New Organon
    10. The Idols
    11. Induction
  3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Political Career

Sir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam, the Viscount St. Albans, and Lord Chancellor of England) was born in London in 1561 to a prominent and well-connected family. His parents were Sir Nicholas Bacon, the Lord Keeper of the Seal, and Lady Anne Cooke, daughter of Sir Anthony Cooke, a knight and one-time tutor to the royal family. Lady Anne was a learned woman in her own right, having acquired Greek and Latin as well as Italian and French. She was a sister-in-law both to Sir Thomas Hoby, the esteemed English translator of Castiglione, and to Sir William Cecil (later Lord Burghley), Lord Treasurer, chief counselor to Elizabeth I, and from 1572-1598 the most powerful man in England.

Bacon was educated at home at the family estate at Gorhambury in Herfordshire. In 1573, at the age of just twelve, he entered Trinity College, Cambridge, where the stodgy Scholastic curriculum triggered his lifelong opposition to Aristotelianism (though not to the works of Aristotle himself).

In 1576 Bacon began reading law at Gray’s Inn. Yet only a year later he interrupted his studies in order to take a position in the diplomatic service in France as an assistant to the ambassador. In 1579, while he was still in France, his father died, leaving him (as the second son of a second marriage and the youngest of six heirs) virtually without support. With no position, no land, no income, and no immediate prospects, he returned to England and resumed the study of law.

Bacon completed his law degree in 1582, and in 1588 he was named lecturer in legal studies at Gray’s Inn. In the meantime, he was elected to Parliament in 1584 as a member for Melcombe in Dorsetshire. He would remain in Parliament as a representative for various constituencies for the next 36 years.

In 1593 his blunt criticism of a new tax levy resulted in an unfortunate setback to his career expectations, the Queen taking personal offense at his opposition. Any hopes he had of becoming Attorney General or Solicitor General during her reign were dashed, though Elizabeth eventually relented to the extent of appointing Bacon her Extraordinary Counsel in 1596.

It was around this time that Bacon entered the service of Robert Devereux, the Earl of Essex, a dashing courtier, soldier, plotter of intrigue, and sometime favorite of the Queen. No doubt Bacon viewed Essex as a rising star and a figure who could provide a much-needed boost to his own sagging career. Unfortunately, it was not long before Essex’s own fortunes plummeted following a series of military and political blunders culminating in a disastrous coup attempt. When the coup plot failed, Devereux was arrested, tried, and eventually executed, with Bacon, in his capacity as Queen’s Counsel, playing a vital role in the prosecution of the case.

In 1603, James I succeeded Elizabeth, and Bacon’s prospects for advancement dramatically improved. After being knighted by the king, he swiftly ascended the ladder of state and from 1604-1618 filled a succession of high-profile advisory positions:

  • 1604 – Appointed King’s Counsel.
  • 1607 – Named Solicitor General.
  • 1608 – Appointed Clerk of the Star Chamber.
  • 1613 – Appointed Attorney General.
  • 1616 – Made a member of the Privy Council.
  • 1617 – Appointed Lord Keeper of the Royal Seal (his father’s former office).
  • 1618 – Made Lord Chancellor.

As Lord Chancellor, Bacon wielded a degree of power and influence that he could only have imagined as a young lawyer seeking preferment. Yet it was at this point, while he stood at the very pinnacle of success, that he suffered his great Fall. In 1621 he was arrested and charged with bribery. After pleading guilty, he was heavily fined and sentenced to a prison term in the Tower of London. Although the fine was later waived and Bacon spent only four days in the Tower, he was never allowed to sit in Parliament or hold political office again.

The entire episode was a terrible disgrace for Bacon personally and a stigma that would cling to and injure his reputation for years to come. As various chroniclers of the case have pointed out, the accepting of gifts from suppliants in a law suit was a common practice in Bacon’s day, and it is also true that Bacon ended up judging against the two petitioners who had offered the fateful bribes. Yet the damage was done, and Bacon to his credit accepted the judgment against him without excuse. According to his own Essayes, or Counsels, he should have known and done better. (In this respect it is worth noting that during his forced retirement, Bacon revised and republished the Essayes, injecting an even greater degree of shrewdness into a collection already notable for its worldliness and keen political sense.) Macaulay in a lengthy essay declared Bacon a great intellect but (borrowing a phrase from Bacon’s own letters) a “most dishonest man,” and more than one writer has characterized him as cold, calculating, and arrogant. Yet whatever his flaws, even his enemies conceded that during his trial he accepted his punishment nobly, and moved on.

Bacon spent his remaining years working with renewed determination on his lifelong project: the reform of learning and the establishment of an intellectual community dedicated to the discovery of scientific knowledge for the “use and benefit of men.” The former Lord Chancellor died on 9 April, 1626, supposedly of a cold or pneumonia contracted while testing his theory of the preservative and insulating properties of snow.

2. Thought and Writings

In a way Bacon’s descent from political power was a fortunate fall, for it represented a liberation from the bondage of public life resulting in a remarkable final burst of literary and scientific activity. As Renaissance scholar and Bacon expert Brian Vickers has reminded us, Bacon’s earlier works, impressive as they are, were essentially products of his “spare time.” It was only during his last five years that he was able to concentrate exclusively on writing and produce, in addition to a handful of minor pieces:

  • Two substantial volumes of history and biography, The History of the Reign of King Henry the Seventh and The History of the Reign of King Henry the Eighth.
  • De Augmentis Scientiarum (an expanded Latin version of his earlier Advancement of Learning).
  • The final 1625 edition of his Essayes, or Counsels.
  • The remarkable Sylva Sylvarum, or A Natural History in Ten Centuries (a curious hodge-podge of scientific experiments, personal observations, speculations, ancient teachings, and analytical discussions on topics ranging from the causes of hiccups to explanations for the shortage of rain in Egypt). Artificially divided into ten “centuries” (that is, ten chapters, each consisting of one hundred items), the work was apparently intended to be included in Part Three of the Magna Instauratio.
  • His utopian science-fiction novel The New Atlantis, which was published in unfinished form a year after his death.
  • Various parts of his unfinished magnum opus Magna Instauratio (or Great Instauration), including a “Natural History of Winds” and a “Natural History of Life and Death.”

These late productions represented the capstone of a writing career that spanned more than four decades and encompassed virtually an entire curriculum of literary, scientific, and philosophical studies.

a. Literary Works

Despite the fanatical claims (and very un-Baconian credulity) of a few admirers, it is a virtual certainty that Bacon did not write the works traditionally attributed to William Shakespeare. Even so, the Lord Chancellor’s high place in the history of English literature as well as his influential role in the development of English prose style remain well-established and secure. Indeed even if Bacon had produced nothing else but his masterful Essayes (first published in 1597 and then revised and expanded in 1612 and 1625), he would still rate among the top echelon of 17th-century English authors. And so when we take into account his other writings, e.g., his histories, letters, and especially his major philosophical and scientific works, we must surely place him in the first rank of English literature’s great men of letters and among its finest masters (alongside names like Johnson, Mill, Carlyle, and Ruskin) of non-fiction prose.

Bacon’s style, though elegant, is by no means as simple as it seems or as it is often described. In fact it is actually a fairly complex affair that achieves its air of ease and clarity more through its balanced cadences, natural metaphors, and carefully arranged symmetries than through the use of plain words, commonplace ideas, and straightforward syntax. (In this connection it is noteworthy that in the revised versions of the essays Bacon seems to have deliberately disrupted many of his earlier balanced effects to produce a style that is actually more jagged and, in effect, more challenging to the casual reader.)

Furthermore, just as Bacon’s personal style and living habits were prone to extravagance and never particularly austere, so in his writing he was never quite able to resist the occasional grand word, magniloquent phrase, or orotund effect. (As Dr. Johnson observed, “A dictionary of the English language might be compiled from Bacon’s works alone.”) Bishop Sprat in his 1667 History of the Royal Society honored Bacon and praised the society membership for supposedly eschewing fine words and fancy metaphors and adhering instead to a natural lucidity and “mathematical plainness.” To write in such a way, Sprat suggested, was to follow true, scientific, Baconian principles. And while Bacon himself often expressed similar sentiments (praising blunt expression while condemning the seductions of figurative language), a reader would be hard pressed to find many examples of such spare technique in Bacon’s own writings. Of Bacon’s contemporary readers, at least one took exception to the view that his writing represented a perfect model of plain language and transparent meaning. After perusing the New Organon, King James (to whom Bacon had proudly dedicated the volume) reportedly pronounced the work “like the peace of God, which passeth all understanding.”

b. The New Atlantis

As a work of narrative fiction, Bacon’s novel New Atlantis may be classified as a literary rather than a scientific (or philosophical) work, though it effectively belongs to both categories. According to Bacon’s amanuensis and first biographer William Rawley, the novel represents the first part (showing the design of a great college or institute devoted to the interpretation of nature) of what was to have been a longer and more detailed project (depicting the entire legal structure and political organization of an ideal commonwealth). The work thus stands in the great tradition of the utopian-philosophical novel that stretches from Plato and More to Huxley and Skinner.

The thin plot or fable is little more than a fictional shell to contain the real meat of Bacon’s story: the elaborate description of Salomon’s House (also known as the College of the Six Days Works), a centrally organized research facility where specially trained teams of investigators collect data, conduct experiments, and (most importantly from Bacon’s point of view) apply the knowledge they gain to produce “things of use and practice for man’s life.” These new arts and inventions they eventually share with the outside world.

In terms of its sci-fi adventure elements, the New Atlantis is about as exciting as a government or university re-organization plan. But in terms of its historical impact, the novel has proven to be nothing less than revolutionary, having served not only as an effective inspiration and model for the British Royal Society, but also as an early blueprint and prophecy of the modern research center and international scientific community.

c. Scientific and Philosophical Works

It is never easy to summarize the thought of a prolific and wide-ranging philosopher. Yet Bacon somewhat simplifies the task by his own helpful habits of systematic classification and catchy mnemonic labeling. (Thus, for example, there are three “distempers” – or diseases – of learning,” eleven errors or “peccant humours,” four “Idols,” three primary mental faculties and categories of knowledge, etc.) In effect, by following Bacon’s own methods it is possible to produce a convenient outline or overview of his main scientific and philosophical ideas.

d. The Great Instauration

As early as 1592, in a famous letter to his uncle, Lord Burghley, Bacon declared “all knowledge” to be his province and vowed his personal commitment to a plan for the full-scale rehabilitation and reorganization of learning. In effect, he dedicated himself to a long-term project of intellectual reform, and the balance of his career can be viewed as a continuing effort to make good on that pledge. In 1620, while he was still at the peak of his political success, he published the preliminary description and plan for an enormous work that would fully answer to his earlier declared ambitions. The work, dedicated to James, was to be called Magna Instauratio (that is, the “grand edifice” or Great Instauration), and it would represent a kind of summa or culmination of all Bacon’s thought on subjects ranging from logic and epistemology to practical science (or what in Bacon’s day was called “natural philosophy,” the word science being then but a general synonym for “wisdom” or “learning”).

Like several of Bacon’s projects, the Instauratio in its contemplated form was never finished. Of the intended six parts, only the first two were completed, while the other portions were only partly finished or barely begun. Consequently, the work as we have it is less like the vast but well-sculpted monument that Bacon envisioned than a kind of philosophical miscellany or grab-bag. Part I of the project, De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (“Nine Books of the Dignity and Advancement of Learning”), was published in 1623. It is basically an enlarged version of the earlier Proficience and Advancement of Learning, which Bacon had presented to James in 1605. Part II, the Novum Organum (or “New Organon”) provides the author’s detailed explanation and demonstration of the correct procedure for interpreting nature. It first appeared in 1620. Together these two works present the essential elements of Bacon’s philosophy, including most of the major ideas and principles that we have come to associate with the terms “Baconian” and “Baconianism.”

e. The Advancement of Learning

Relatively early in his career Bacon judged that, owing mainly to an undue reverence for the past (as well as to an excessive absorption in cultural vanities and frivolities), the intellectual life of Europe had reached a kind of impasse or standstill. Yet he believed there was a way beyond this stagnation if persons of learning, armed with new methods and insights, would simply open their eyes and minds to the world around them. This at any rate was the basic argument of his seminal 1605 treatise The Proficience and Advancement of Learning, arguably the first important philosophical work to be published in English.

It is in this work that Bacon sketched out the main themes and ideas that he continued to refine and develop throughout his career, beginning with the notion that there are clear obstacles to or diseases of learning that must be avoided or purged before further progress is possible.

f. The “Distempers” of Learning

“There be therefore chiefly three vanities in studies, whereby learning hath been most traduced.” Thus Bacon, in the first book of the Advancement. He goes on to refer to these vanities as the three “distempers” of learning and identifies them (in his characteristically memorable fashion) as “fantastical learning,” “contentious learning,” and “delicate learning” (alternatively identified as “vain imaginations,” “vain altercations,” and “vain affectations”).

By fantastical learning (“vain imaginations”) Bacon had in mind what we would today call pseudo-science: i.e., a collection of ideas that lack any real or substantial foundation, that are professed mainly by occultists and charlatans, that are carefully shielded from outside criticism, and that are offered largely to an audience of credulous true believers. In Bacon’s day such “imaginative science” was familiar in the form of astrology, natural magic, and alchemy.

By contentious learning (“vain altercations”) Bacon was referring mainly to Aristotelian philosophy and theology and especially to the Scholastic tradition of logical hair-splitting and metaphysical quibbling. But the phrase applies to any intellectual endeavor in which the principal aim is not new knowledge or deeper understanding but endless debate cherished for its own sake.

Delicate learning (“vain affectations”) was Bacon’s label for the new humanism insofar as (in his view) it seemed concerned not with the actual recovery of ancient texts or the retrieval of past knowledge but merely with the revival of Ciceronian rhetorical embellishments and the reproduction of classical prose style. Such preoccupation with “words more than matter,” with “choiceness of phrase” and the “sweet falling of clauses” – in short, with style over substance – seemed to Bacon (a careful stylist in his own right) the most seductive and decadent literary vice of his age.

Here we may note that from Bacon’s point of view the “distempers” of learning share two main faults:

  1. Prodigal ingenuity – i.e., each distemper represents a lavish and regrettable waste of talent, as inventive minds that might be employed in more productive pursuits exhaust their energy on trivial or puerile enterprises instead.
  2. Sterile results – i.e., instead of contributing to the discovery of new knowledge (and thus to a practical “advancement of learning” and eventually to a better life for all), the distempers of learning are essentially exercises in personal vainglory that aim at little more than idle theorizing or the preservation of older forms of knowledge.

In short, in Bacon’s view the distempers impede genuine intellectual progress by beguiling talented thinkers into fruitless, illusory, or purely self-serving ventures. What is needed – and this is a theme reiterated in all his later writings on learning and human progress – is a program to re-channel that same creative energy into socially useful new discoveries.

g. The Idea of Progress

Though it is hard to pinpoint the birth of an idea, for all intents and purposes the modern idea of technological “progress” (in the sense of a steady, cumulative, historical advance in applied scientific knowledge) began with Bacon’s The Advancement of Learning and became fully articulated in his later works.

Knowledge is power, and when embodied in the form of new technical inventions and mechanical discoveries it is the force that drives history – this was Bacon’s key insight. In many respects this idea was his single greatest invention, and it is all the more remarkable for its having been conceived and promoted at a time when most English and European intellectuals were either reverencing the literary and philosophical achievements of the past or deploring the numerous signs of modern degradation and decline. Indeed, while Bacon was preaching progress and declaring a brave new dawn of scientific advance, many of his colleagues were persuaded that the world was at best creaking along towards a state of senile immobility and eventual darkness. “Our age is iron, and rusty too,” wrote John Donne, contemplating the signs of universal decay in a poem published six years after Bacon’s Advancement.

That history might in fact be progressive, i.e., an onward and upward ascent – and not, as Aristotle had taught, merely cyclical or, as cultural pessimists from Hesiod to Spengler have supposed, a descending or retrograde movement, became for Bacon an article of secular faith which he propounded with evangelical force and a sense of mission. In the Advancement, the idea is offered tentatively, as a kind of hopeful hypothesis. But in later works such as the New Organon, it becomes almost a promised destiny: Enlightenment and a better world, Bacon insists, lie within our power; they require only the cooperation of learned citizens and the active development of the arts and sciences.

h. The Reclassification of Knowledge

In Book II of De Dignitate (his expanded version of the Advancement) Bacon outlines his scheme for a new division of human knowledge into three primary categories: History, Poesy, and Philosophy (which he associates respectively with the three fundamental “faculties” of mind – memory, imagination, and reason). Although the exact motive behind this reclassification remains unclear, one of its main consequences seems unmistakable: it effectively promotes philosophy – and especially Baconian science – above the other two branches of knowledge, in essence defining history as the mere accumulation of brute facts, while reducing art and imaginative literature to the even more marginal status of “feigned history.”

Evidently Bacon believed that in order for a genuine advancement of learning to occur, the prestige of philosophy (and particularly natural philosophy) had to be elevated, while that of history and literature (in a word, humanism) needed to be reduced. Bacon’s scheme effectively accomplishes this by making history (the domain of fact, i.e., of everything that has happened) a virtual sub-species of philosophy (the domain of realistic possibility, i.e., of everything that can theoretically or actually occur). Meanwhile, poesy (the domain of everything that is imaginable or conceivable) is set off to the side as a mere illustrative vehicle. In essence, it becomes simply a means of recreating actual scenes or events from the past (as in history plays or heroic poetry) or of allegorizing or dramatizing new ideas or future possibilities (as in Bacon’s own interesting example of “parabolic poesy,” the New Atlantis.)

i. The New Organon

To the second part of his Great Instauration Bacon gave the title New Organon (or “True Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature”). The Greek word organon means “instrument” or “tool,” and Bacon clearly felt he was supplying a new instrument for guiding and correcting the mind in its quest for a true understanding of nature. The title also glances at Aristotle’s Organon (a collection that includes his Categories and his Prior and Posterior Analytics) and thus suggests a “new instrument” destined to transcend or replace the older, no longer serviceable one. (This notion of surpassing ancient authority is aptly illustrated on the frontispiece of the 1620 volume containing the New Organon by a ship boldly sailing beyond the mythical pillars of Hercules, which supposedly marked the end of the known world.)

The New Organon is presented not in the form of a treatise or methodical demonstration but as a series of aphorisms, a technique that Bacon came to favor as less legislative and dogmatic and more in the true spirit of scientific experiment and critical inquiry. Combined with his gift for illustrative metaphor and symbol, the aphoristic style makes the New Organon in many places the most readable and literary of all Bacon’s scientific and philosophical works.

j. The Idols

In Book I of the New Organon (Aphorisms 39-68), Bacon introduces his famous doctrine of the “idols.” These are characteristic errors, natural tendencies, or defects that beset the mind and prevent it from achieving a full and accurate understanding of nature. Bacon points out that recognizing and counteracting the idols is as important to the study of nature as the recognition and refutation of bad arguments is to logic. Incidentally, he uses the word “idol” – from the Greek eidolon (“image” or “phantom”) – not in the sense of a false god or heathen deity but rather in the sense employed in Epicurean physics. Thus a Baconian idol is a potential deception or source of misunderstanding, especially one that clouds or confuses our knowledge of external reality.

Bacon identifies four different classes of idol. Each arises from a different source, and each presents its own special hazards and difficulties.

1. The Idols of the Tribe.

These are the natural weaknesses and tendencies common to human nature. Because they are innate, they cannot be completely eliminated, but only recognized and compensated for. Some of Bacon’s examples are:

  • Our senses – which are inherently dull and easily deceivable. (Which is why Bacon prescribes instruments and strict investigative methods to correct them.)
  • Our tendency to discern (or even impose) more order in phenomena than is actually there. As Bacon points out, we are apt to find similitude where there is actually singularity, regularity where there is actually randomness, etc.
  • Our tendency towards “wishful thinking.” According to Bacon, we have a natural inclination to accept, believe, and even prove what we would prefer to be true.
  • Our tendency to rush to conclusions and make premature judgments (instead of gradually and painstakingly accumulating evidence).

2. The Idols of the Cave.

Unlike the idols of the tribe, which are common to all human beings, those of the cave vary from individual to individual. They arise, that is to say, not from nature but from culture and thus reflect the peculiar distortions, prejudices, and beliefs that we are all subject to owing to our different family backgrounds, childhood experiences, education, training, gender, religion, social class, etc. Examples include:

  • Special allegiance to a particular discipline or theory.
  • High esteem for a few select authorities.
  • A “cookie-cutter” mentality – that is, a tendency to reduce or confine phenomena within the terms of our own narrow training or discipline.

3. The Idols of the Market Place.

These are hindrances to clear thinking that arise, Bacon says, from the “intercourse and association of men with each other.” The main culprit here is language, though not just common speech, but also (and perhaps particularly) the special discourses, vocabularies, and jargons of various academic communities and disciplines. He points out that “the idols imposed by words on the understanding are of two kinds”: “they are either names of things that do not exist” (e.g., the crystalline spheres of Aristotelian cosmology) or faulty, vague, or misleading names for things that do exist (according to Bacon, abstract qualities and value terms – e.g., “moist,” “useful,” etc. – can be a particular source of confusion).

4. The Idols of the Theatre.

Like the idols of the cave, those of the theatre are culturally acquired rather than innate. And although the metaphor of a theatre suggests an artificial imitation of truth, as in drama or fiction, Bacon makes it clear that these idols derive mainly from grand schemes or systems of philosophy – and especially from three particular types of philosophy:

  • Sophistical Philosophy – that is, philosophical systems based only on a few casually observed instances (or on no experimental evidence at all) and thus constructed mainly out of abstract argument and speculation. Bacon cites Scholasticism as a conspicuous example.
  • Empirical Philosophy – that is, a philosophical system ultimately based on a single key insight (or on a very narrow base of research), which is then erected into a model or paradigm to explain phenomena of all kinds. Bacon cites the example of William Gilbert, whose experiments with the lodestone persuaded him that magnetism operated as the hidden force behind virtually all earthly phenomena.
  • Superstitious Philosophy – this is Bacon’s phrase for any system of thought that mixes theology and philosophy. He cites Pythagoras and Plato as guilty of this practice, but also points his finger at pious contemporary efforts, similar to those of Creationists today, to found systems of natural philosophy on Genesis or the book of Job.

k. Induction

At the beginning of the Magna Instauratio and in Book II of the New Organon, Bacon introduces his system of “true and perfect Induction,” which he proposes as the essential foundation of scientific method and a necessary tool for the proper interpretation of nature. (This system was to have been more fully explained and demonstrated in Part IV of the Instauratio in a section titled “The Ladder of the Intellect,” but unfortunately the work never got beyond an introduction.)

According to Bacon, his system differs not only from the deductive logic and mania for syllogisms of the Schoolmen, but also from the classic induction of Aristotle and other logicians. As Bacon explains it, classic induction proceeds “at once from . . . sense and particulars up to the most general propositions” and then works backward (via deduction) to arrive at intermediate propositions. Thus, for example, from a few observations one might conclude (via induction) that “all new cars are shiny.” One would then be entitled to proceed backward from this general axiom to deduce such middle-level axioms as “all new Lexuses are shiny,” “all new Jeeps are shiny,” etc. – axioms that presumably would not need to be verified empirically since their truth would be logically guaranteed as long as the original generalization (“all new cars are shiny”) is true.

As Bacon rightly points out, one problem with this procedure is that if the general axioms prove false, all the intermediate axioms may be false as well. All it takes is one contradictory instance (in this case one new car with a dull finish) and “the whole edifice tumbles.” For this reason Bacon prescribes a different path. His method is to proceed “regularly and gradually from one axiom to another, so that the most general are not reached till the last.” In other words, each axiom – i.e., each step up “the ladder of intellect” – is thoroughly tested by observation and experimentation before the next step is taken. In effect, each confirmed axiom becomes a foothold to a higher truth, with the most general axioms representing the last stage of the process.

Thus, in the example described, the Baconian investigator would be obliged to examine a full inventory of new Chevrolets, Lexuses, Jeeps, etc., before reaching any conclusions about new cars in general. And while Bacon admits that such a method can be laborious, he argues that it eventually produces a stable edifice of knowledge instead of a rickety structure that collapses with the appearance of a single disconfirming instance. (Indeed, according to Bacon, when one follows his inductive procedure, a negative instance actually becomes something to be welcomed rather than feared. For instead of threatening an entire assembly, the discovery of a false generalization actually saves the investigator the trouble of having to proceed further in a particular direction or line of inquiry. Meanwhile the structure of truth that he has already built remains intact.)

Is Bacon’s system, then, a sound and reliable procedure, a strong ladder leading from carefully observed particulars to true and “inevitable” conclusions? Although he himself firmly believed in the utility and overall superiority of his method, many of his commentators and critics have had doubts. For one thing, it is not clear that the Baconian procedure, taken by itself, leads conclusively to any general propositions, much less to scientific principles or theoretical statements that we can accept as universally true. For at what point is the Baconian investigator willing to make the leap from observed particulars to abstract generalizations? After a dozen instances? A thousand? The fact is, Bacon’s method provides nothing to guide the investigator in this determination other than sheer instinct or professional judgment, and thus the tendency is for the investigation of particulars – the steady observation and collection of data – to go on continuously, and in effect endlessly.

One can thus easily imagine a scenario in which the piling up of instances becomes not just the initial stage in a process, but the very essence of the process itself; in effect, a zealous foraging after facts (in the New Organon Bacon famously compares the ideal Baconian researcher to a busy bee) becomes not only a means to knowledge, but an activity vigorously pursued for its own sake. Every scientist and academic person knows how tempting it is to put off the hard work of imaginative thinking in order to continue doing some form of rote research. Every investigator knows how easy it is to become wrapped up in data – with the unhappy result that one’s intended ascent up the Baconian ladder gets stuck in mundane matters of fact and never quite gets off the ground.

It was no doubt considerations like these that prompted the English physician (and neo-Aristotelian) William Harvey, of circulation-of-the-blood fame, to quip that Bacon wrote of natural philosophy “like a Lord Chancellor” – indeed like a politician or legislator rather than a practitioner. The assessment is just to the extent that Bacon in the New Organon does indeed prescribe a new and extremely rigid procedure for the investigation of nature rather than describe the more or less instinctive and improvisational – and by no means exclusively empirical – method that Kepler, Galileo, Harvey himself, and other working scientists were actually employing. In fact, other than Tycho Brahe, the Danish astronomer who, overseeing a team of assistants, faithfully observed and then painstakingly recorded entire volumes of astronomical data in tidy, systematically arranged tables, it is doubtful that there is another major figure in the history of science who can be legitimately termed an authentic, true-blooded Baconian. (Darwin, it is true, claimed that The Origin of Species was based on “Baconian principles.” However, it is one thing to collect instances in order to compare species and show a relationship among them; it is quite another to theorize a mechanism, namely evolution by mutation and natural selection, that elegantly and powerfully explains their entire history and variety.)

Science, that is to say, does not, and has probably never advanced according to the strict, gradual, ever-plodding method of Baconian observation and induction. It proceeds instead by unpredictable – and often intuitive and even (though Bacon would cringe at the word) imaginative – leaps and bounds. Kepler used Tycho’s scrupulously gathered data to support his own heart-felt and even occult belief that the movements of celestial bodies are regular and symmetrical, composing a true harmony of the spheres. Galileo tossed unequal weights from the Leaning Tower as a mere public demonstration of the fact (contrary to Aristotle) that they would fall at the same rate. He had long before satisfied himself that this would happen via the very un-Bacon-like method of mathematical reasoning and deductive thought-experiment. Harvey, by a similar process of quantitative analysis and deductive logic, knew that the blood must circulate, and it was only to provide proof of this fact that he set himself the secondary task of amassing empirical evidence and establishing the actual method by which it did so.

One could enumerate – in true Baconian fashion – a host of further instances. But the point is already made: advances in scientific knowledge have not been achieved for the most part via Baconian induction (which amounts to a kind of systematic and exhaustive survey of nature supposedly leading to ultimate insights) but rather by shrewd hints and guesses – in a word by hypotheses – that are then either corroborated or (in Karl Popper’s important term) falsified by subsequent research.

In summary, then, it can be said that Bacon underestimated the role of imagination and hypothesis (and overestimated the value of minute observation and bee-like data collection) in the production of new scientific knowledge. And in this respect it is true that he wrote of science like a Lord Chancellor, regally proclaiming the benefits of his own new and supposedly foolproof technique instead of recognizing and adapting procedures that had already been tested and approved. On the other hand, it must be added that Bacon did not present himself (or his method) as the final authority on the investigation of nature or, for that matter, on any other topic or issue relating to the advance of knowledge. By his own admission, he was but the Buccinator, or “trumpeter,” of such a revolutionary advance – not the founder or builder of a vast new system, but only the herald or announcing messenger of a new world to come.

3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy

If anyone deserves the title “universal genius” or “Renaissance man” (accolades traditionally reserved for those who make significant, original contributions to more than one professional discipline or area of learning), Bacon clearly merits the designation. Like Leonardo and Goethe, he produced important work in both the arts and sciences. Like Cicero, Marcus Aurelius, Benjamin Franklin, and Thomas Jefferson, he combined wide and ample intellectual and literary interests (from practical rhetoric and the study of nature to moral philosophy and educational reform) with a substantial political career. Like his near contemporary Machiavelli, he excelled in a variety of literary genres – from learned treatises to light entertainments – though, also like the great Florentine writer, he thought of himself mainly as a political statesman and practical visionary: a man whose primary goal was less to obtain literary laurels for himself than to mold the agendas and guide the policy decisions of powerful nobles and heads of state.

In our own era Bacon would be acclaimed as a “public intellectual,” though his personal record of service and authorship would certainly dwarf the achievements of most academic and political leaders today. Like nearly all public figures, he was controversial. His chaplain and first biographer William Rawley declared him “the glory of his age and nation” and portrayed him as an angel of enlightenment and social vision. His admirers in the Royal Society (an organization that traced its own inspiration and lineage to the Lord Chancellor’s writings) viewed him as nothing less than the daring originator of a new intellectual era. The poet Abraham Cowley called him a “Moses” and portrayed him as an exalted leader who virtually all by himself had set learning on a bold, firm, and entirely new path:

Bacon at last, a mighty Man, arose

Whom a wise King and Nature chose

Lord Chancellour of both their Lawes. . . .

The barren Wilderness he past,

Did on the very Border stand

Of the great promis’d Land,

And from the Mountains Top of his Exalted Wit,

Saw it himself and shew’d us it. . . .

Similarly adulatory if more prosaic assessments were offered by learned contemporaries or near contemporaries from Descartes and Gassendi to Robert Hooke and Robert Boyle. Leibniz was particularly generous and observed that, compared to Bacon’s philosophical range and lofty vision, even a great genius like Descartes “creeps on the ground.” On the other hand, Spinoza, another close contemporary, dismissed Bacon’s work (especially his inductive theories) completely and in effect denied that the supposedly grand philosophical revolution decreed by Bacon, and welcomed by his partisans, had ever occurred.

The response of the later Enlightenment was similarly divided, with a majority of thinkers lavishly praising Bacon while a dissenting minority castigated or even ridiculed him. The French encyclopedists Jean d’Alembert and Denis Diderot sounded the keynote of this 18th-century re-assessment, essentially hailing Bacon as a founding father of the modern era and emblazoning his name on the front page of the Encyclopedia. In a similar gesture, Kant dedicated his Critique of Pure Reason to Bacon and likewise saluted him as an early architect of modernity. Hegel, on the other hand, took a dimmer view. In his “Lectures on the History of Philosophy” he congratulated Bacon on his worldly sophistication and shrewdness of mind, but ultimately judged him to be a person of depraved character and a mere “coiner of mottoes.” In his view, the Lord Chancellor was a decidedly low-minded (read typically English and utilitarian) philosopher whose instruction was fit mainly for “civil servants and shopkeepers.”

Probably the fullest and most perceptive Enlightenment account of Bacon’s achievement and place in history was Voltaire’s laudatory essay in his Letters on the English. After referring to Bacon as the father of experimental philosophy, he went on to assess his literary merits, judging him to be an elegant, instructive, and witty writer, though too much given to “fustian.”

Bacon’s reputation and legacy remain controversial even today. While no historian of science or philosophy doubts his immense importance both as a proselytizer on behalf of the empirical method and as an advocate of sweeping intellectual reform, opinion varies widely as to the actual social value and moral significance of the ideas that he represented and effectively bequeathed to us. The issue basically comes down to one’s estimate of or sympathy for the entire Enlightenment/Utilitarian project. Those who for the most part share Bacon’s view that nature exists mainly for human use and benefit, and who furthermore endorse his opinion that scientific inquiry should aim first and foremost at the amelioration of the human condition and the “relief of man’s estate,” generally applaud him as a great social visionary. On the other hand, those who view nature as an entity in its own right, a higher-order estate of which the human community is only a part, tend to perceive him as a kind of arch-villain – the evil originator of the idea of science as the instrument of global imperialism and technological conquest.

On the one side, then, we have figures like the anthropologist and science writer Loren Eiseley, who portrays Bacon (whom he calls “the man who saw through time”) as a kind of Promethean culture hero. He praises Bacon as the great inventor of the idea of science as both a communal enterprise and a practical discipline in the service of humanity. On the other side, we have writers, from Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer, and Lewis Mumford to, more recently, Jeremy Rifkin and eco-feminist Carolyn Merchant, who have represented him as one of the main culprits behind what they perceive as western science’s continuing legacy of alienation, exploitation, and ecological oppression.

Clearly somewhere in between this ardent Baconolotry on the one hand and strident demonization of Bacon on the other lies the real Lord Chancellor: a Colossus with feet of clay. He was by no means a great system-builder (indeed his Magna Instauratio turned out to be less of a “grand edifice” than a magnificent heap) but rather, as he more modestly portrayed himself, a great spokesman for the reform of learning and a champion of modern science. In the end we can say that he was one of the giant figures of intellectual history – and as brilliant, and flawed, a philosopher as he was a statesman.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: The standard edition of Bacon’s Works and Letters and Life is still that of James Spedding, et. al., (14 volumes, London, 1857- 1874), also available in a facsimile reprint (Stuttgart, 1989).

  • Adorno, Theodor and Max Horkheimer. The Dialectic of Enlightenment. 1944.
  • Anderson, F. H. Francis Bacon: His Career and His Thought. Los Angeles: University of Southern California Press, 1962.
  • Bury, J.B. The Idea of Progress. London: MacMillan, 1920.
  • Eiseley, Loren. The Man Who Saw Through Time. New York: Scribners, 1973.
  • Fish, Stanley E. “The Experience of Bacon’s Essays.” In Self-Consuming Artifacts. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1972.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen. Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-modern Philosophy. Cambridge, U.K. ; New York : Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Merchant, Carolyn. The Death of Nature: Women, Ecology, and the Scientific Revolution. San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1980.
  • Mumford, Lewis. Technics and Civilization. 1934.
  • Lampert, Laurence. Nietzsche and Modern Times : A Study of Bacon, Descartes, and Nietzsche. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Rifkin, Jeremy. Biosphere Politics. New York: Crown, 1991.
  • Rossi, Paolo. Francis Bacon: from Magic to Science. Trans. Sacha Rabinovitch. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1968.
  • Vickers, Brian. Francis Bacon. Harlow, UK: Longman Group, 1978.
  • Vickers, Brian, Ed. Francis Bacon. New York : Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Whitney, Charles. Francis Bacon and Modernity. New Haven, CN: Yale University Press, 1986.

Author Information

David Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.


The Cyrenaics are one of the minor Socratic schools. The school was founded by Aristippus, a follower of Socrates. The Cyrenaics are notable mainly for their empiricist and skeptical epistemology and their sensualist hedonism. They believe that we can have certain knowledge of our immediate states of perceptual awareness, for example, that I am seeing white now. However, we cannot go beyond these experiences to gain any knowledge about the objects themselves that cause these experiences or about the external world in general. Some of their arguments prefigure the positions of later Greek skeptics, and their distinction between the incorrigibility of immediate perceptual states versus the uncertainty of belief about the external world became key to the epistemological problems confronting philosophers of the ‘modern’ period, such as Descartes and Hume. In ethics, they advocate pleasure as the highest good. Furthermore, bodily pleasures are preferable to mental pleasures, and we should pursue whatever will bring us pleasure now, rather than deferring present pleasures for the sake of achieving better long-term consequences. In all these respects, their iconoclastic and ‘crude’ hedonism stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, and their theories were often contrasted with Epicurus’ more moderate hedonism.

Table of Contents

  1. History
  2. Epistemology
    1. Experiences and Their Causes
      1. The Relativity of Perception
      2. The Privacy of Experience and the Problem of Other Minds
    2. The Cyrenaics, Relativism, and Skepticism
      1. The Cyrenaics and Protagoras
      2. The Cyrenaics and Pyrrhonian Skeptics
  3. Ethics
    1. The Value and Nature of Pleasure
    2. Pleasure, Happiness, and Prudence
      1. Personal Identity and Momentary Pleasure
      2. The Self-Defeating Nature of Future-Concern
      3. Present Preferences and Future-Concern
    3. Custom, Morality, and Friendship
    4. Later Cyrenaics
      1. Hegesias
      2. Anniceris
      3. Theodorus
  4. Ancient Sources
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History

The Cyrenaic school was founded by Aristippus (c. 435-356 B.C.), a follower of Socrates and a rough contemporary of Plato. The name ‘Cyrenaic’ comes from Cyrene, Aristippus’ home town, a Greek colony in Northern Africa. Aristippus taught philosophy to his daughter Arete, who in turn taught philosophy to her son Aristippus. Aristippus the younger formulated many of the theories of the Cyrenaic school, so that some scholars count him as being more properly the founder of the school, with Aristippus the Elder being merely the school’s figurehead. However, disentangling the exact contributions of the two to the Cyrenaic philosophy is difficult. Later Cyrenaics, notably Hegesias, Anniceris, and Theodorus, who were rough contemporaries of Epicurus, modified the Cyrenaic ethical doctrines in different directions, and the school died out shortly afterwards, around the middle of the 3rd century B.C. However, it did have some influence on later philosophers. Epicurus most likely developed some of the distinctive features of his ascetic hedonism in order to avoid what he saw as the unpalatable consequences of Cyrenaic hedonism, and many of the Cyrenaic arguments against the possibility of gaining knowledge of the external world were appropriated by later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics.

2. Epistemology

The Cyrenaics are empiricists and skeptics. As empiricists, they believe that all that we have access to as a potential source of knowledge are our own experiences. These experiences are private to each of us. We can have incorrigible knowledge of our experiences (that is, it impossible to be mistaken about what we are currently experiencing), but not of the objects that cause us to have these experiences. This results in their skepticism—their conviction that we cannot have knowledge of the external world.

a. Experiences and Their Causes

The Cyrenaics affirm that pathê–affections, or experiences–are the criterion of knowledge. They distinguish sharply between the experiences that one has– for example, that I am now seeing gray–and the objects that cause one to have these experiences– for example, the computer screen.

We can have infallible knowledge of our own experiences, since we have immediate access to them, but we do not have access to objects and qualities in the external world. As the Cyrenaics put it, “The experience which takes place in us reveals to us nothing more than itself.” The Cyrenaics reinforce this point by saying that, strictly speaking, we should not say, “I am seeing something yellow,” for instance, but “I am being yellowed,” or “I am being moved by something yellowly,” since the latter statements make it clear that we are reporting only our immediate perceptual state. (In this respect, the Cyrenaics bear a striking resemblance to some modern epistemologists, who resort to locutions like “I am being appeared to redly now” as describing accurately what is immediately given to us in experience.)

The Cyrenaics have two main arguments for why it is impossible to make inferences about the qualities of objects in the external world on the basis of our experiences:

i. The Relativity of Perception

The Cyrenaics note that the same object can cause different perceivers to experience different sensible qualities, depending on the bodily condition of the perceivers. For instance, honey will taste sweet to most people, but bitter to somebody with an illness, and the same wall that appears white to one person will look yellow to somebody with jaundice. And if a person presses his eye, he sees double.

From the fact that the wall appears white to me and yellow to you, the Cyrenaics think we should infer that we cannot know which quality the wall itself has on the basis of our experience of it, presumably because we have no criterion outside of our experiences to use to adjudicate which one (if either) of our experiences is correct. Such arguments from the relativity of perception are common in ancient Greek philosophy, and other thinkers draw different conclusions; for example, Protagoras says we should conclude that the wall is both white (for me) and yellow (for you), while Democritus thinks that we should conclude that it is neither white nor yellow.

ii. The Privacy of Experience and the Problem of Other Minds

Even if all people were to agree on the perceptual quality that some object has–for instance, that a wall appears white–the Cyrenaics still think that we could not confidently say that we are having the same experience. This is because each of us has access only to our own experiences, not to those of other people, and so the mere fact that each of us calls the wall ‘white’ does not show us that we are all having the same experience that I am having when I use the word ‘white.’

This argument of the Cyrenaics anticipates the problem of other minds—that is, how can I know that other people have a mind like I do, since I only observe their behavior (if even that), not the mental states that might or might not cause that behavior?

b. The Cyrenaics, Relativism, and Skepticism

The Cyrenaic position bears some striking resemblance to the relativistic epistemology of the sophist Protagoras, as depicted in Plato’s dialogue Theaetetus, and to the skeptical epistemology of the Pyrrhonists. Because of this, the Cyrenaics’ epistemology is sometimes wrongly assimilated that of Protagoras or the Pyrrhonists. However, the Cyrenaics’ subjectivism is quite different from those positions, and explaining their differences will help bring out what is distinctive about the Cyrenaics.

i. The Cyrenaics and Protagoras

The Cyrenaics and Protagoras do have similar starting-points. Protagoras also says that knowledge comes from perception. He uses basically the same arguments from relativity that the Cyrenaics use, and on their basis asserts that each of us infallibly has knowledge of how things appear to us. So, if I feel that the wind is hot, and judge that “the wind is hot,” I am judging truly (for me) how the wind is. And if the wind feels not-hot to you, and you judge that “the wind is not hot,” you are also judging truly (for you) how the wind is. These apparently contradictory statements can both betrue, since each of us is judging only about how things appear to us.

However, there are important differences between Protagoras’ relativism and the Cyrenaics’ subjectivism. The Cyrenaics would more likely want to say “that the wind appears hot to me is true” (simpliciter) rather than “‘The wind is hot’ is true-for-me.” The Cyrenaic position retains the possibility of error whenever you go beyond the immediate content of your experience, whereas Protagoras says that however things appear to you is ‘true for you.’ According to the Cyrenaics, I may know infallibly that “I am being appeared to hotly now,” but if I were to say that the wind itself were hot, I might be mistaken, and if I were to judge that “You are being appeared to hotly now,” whereas in fact you were having a chilly experience, I would be mistaken. Protagoras, as depicted in the Theaetetus, does away with the possibility of people genuinely contradicting one another, since all statements are about how things appear to the individual making the statement, and hence all (sincere) statements turn out to be true–for that individual, at that time.

Also, when Protagoras says that each us can judge infallibly how things ‘appear’ to us, the sense of ‘appearance’ that Protagoras is using extends beyond the initial restricted sense of phenomenal appearances, for example, a wind feeling hot or a wall seeming white, to cover beliefs generally. That is, if I believe that “the laws of Athens are just,” then Protagoras would say that this is equivalent to “it seems to me that the laws of Athens are just.” And since each of us can judge infallibly about our own appearances, I can also know that it is true (for me) that “the laws of Athens are just.” The Cyrenaics retain the more restricted sense of ‘appearance,’ where each of can know infallibly our immediate perceptual states, for instance, knowing that I am having a red experience, but this does not extend to knowledge of laws ‘appearing’ to be just, or the future ‘appearing’ to be hopeful.

ii. The Cyrenaics and Pyrrhonian Skeptics

The later academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics make use of arguments from the relativity of perception to try to refute the position of dogmatists, like the Stoics and the Epicureans, who claim that we can gain knowledge of the external world on the basis of sense-perception. However, although the Cyrenaics might properly be called ‘skeptics,’ their skepticism differs from the skepticism of the Pyrrhonists in at least three respects.

The first difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that we can have knowledge of the contents of our experiences, while the Pyrrhonists disavow any knowledge whatsoever. However, this difference might not be as significant as it seems, since the Pyrrhonists do acknowledge that we can accurately report how things appear to us– for example, that the wind appears hot. However, they refuse to say that this qualifies as knowledge, since knowledge concerns how things are, not merely how they appear to us.

The second difference is that the Cyrenaics claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of the external world, while the Pyrrhonists claim neither that one can nor that one cannot gain such knowledge. The Pyrrhonists would label the Cyrenaic position as a form of ‘negative dogmatism,’ since the Cyrenaics do advance assertions about the impossibility of knowledge of the external world. This is a type of second-order purported ‘knowledge’ about the limits of our knowledge, and the Pyrrhonists, as true skeptics, do not make even these types of pronouncements.

Third, although the Cyrenaics do claim that it is impossible to gain knowledge of what the external world is like, it is not as clear that they doubt that there exists an external world, which the Pyrrhonists do. Some sources ascribe to the Cyrenaics the position that whether there is an external world is not known, while others ascribe to them the position that we can know that there is an external world that is the cause of our experiences, but that we cannot know what this world is like. The latter position fits in more smoothly with the way the Cyrenaics conceive of experiences, as effects of external causes (“I am being yellowed”), but has obvious difficulties of its own. (For instance, if we can know nothing about what characteristics objects in the external world have, what basis do we have to think that these objects exist?) However, if this is what the Cyrenaics think, a parallel can be drawn between their position and what Immanuel Kant says about the existence of the noumenal world of ‘things in themselves,’ which is the unknowable source of the data which ultimately forms our experiences.

Finally, the Cyrenaic position, at least in the limited reports we have concerning it, does not appear to be as fully-developed as that of the later skeptics. The academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics engaged in long controversies with the dogmatists, and as a result, they needed to answer the objections of the dogmatists, for example, that it is impossible to live as a skeptic, or that skepticism is self-refuting. The Cyrenaics, as far as we know, do not address these questions.

3. Ethics

The Cyrenaics are unabashed sensual hedonists: the highest good is my own pleasure, with all else being valuable only as a means to securing my own pleasure, and bodily pleasures are better than mental pleasures. Their iconoclastic theory stands well outside the mainstream of Greek ethical thought, with the traditional virtues of moderation, justice, and friendship being disparaged by them.

a. The Value and Nature of Pleasure

The Cyrenaics start from the Greek ethical commonplace that the highest good is what we all seek for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else. This they identify as pleasure, because we instinctively seek pleasure for its own sake, and when we achieve pleasure, we want nothing more. Similarly, pain is bad because we shun it.

When the Cyrenaics say that ‘pleasure’ is the highest good, they do not mean that pleasure in general in good, so that we should seek to maximize the overall amount of pleasure in the world, as utilitarians say. Instead, they mean that, for each of us, our own pleasure is what is valuable to us, because that is what each of us seeks. Also, each of us can only experience our own pleasures, and not the pleasures of other people. Thus, the Cyrenaic view is a form of egoistic hedonism.

Pleasure and pain are both ‘movements,’ according to the Cyrenaics: pleasure a smooth motion, and pain a rough motion. The absence of either type of motion is an intermediate state which is neither pleasurable nor painful. This is directed against Epicurus’ theory that thehomeostatic state of being free of pain, need and worry is itself most pleasant. The Cyrenaics make fun of the Epicurean theory by saying that this state of being free of desires and pain is the condition of a corpse.

The Cyrenaics admit that there are both bodily pleasures (for example, sexual gratification) and mental pleasures ( for example, delight at the prosperity of one’s country), and they maintain, against the Epicureans, that not all mental pleasures are based upon bodily pleasures. However, they exalt bodily over mental pleasures, presumably because bodily pleasures are much more vivid than mental pleasures. They also assert that bodily pains are worse than mental pains, and give as evidence for this claim that criminals are punished with bodily instead of mental pains.

b. Pleasure, Happiness, and Prudence

One of the most striking features of Cyrenaic ethics is their assertion that it is pleasure, and not happiness, which is the highest good. Almost all other Greek theorists agree that happiness is the highest good, but disagree about what happiness consists in. Even Epicurus, who is a hedonist, remains within this tradition by asserting that happiness is the same as leading a pleasant life. The Cyrenaics, however, say that what we really seek are individual pleasures, for example, the pleasure of eating a steak. Happiness, which is thought of as the sum of all of these individual pleasures, is valuable only because of the value of each of the individual pleasures that make it up.

Another striking feature of the Cyrenaic theory is its lack of future-concern. The Cyrenaics advocate going after whatever will bring one pleasure now, enjoying the pleasure while one is experiencing it, and not worrying too much about what the future will bring. Although the Cyrenaics say that prudence is valuable for attaining pleasure, they do not seem much concerned with exercising self-control in pursuing pleasure, or with deferring present pleasures (or undergoing present pains) for the sake of experiencing greater pleasure (or avoiding greater pains) in the future.

This lack of future-concern is not a direct consequence of their hedonism, nor of their privileging of bodily over mental pleasures. If pleasure is the highest good, and one wants to maximize the pleasure in one’s life, then the natural position to take is the one Socrates lays out in Plato’s dialogue the Protagoras. Socrates describes a type of hedonism in which one uses a ‘measuring art’ to weigh equally all of the future pleasures and pains one would experience . Although present pleasures might seem more alluring than distant ones, Socrates maintains that this is like an optical illusion in which nearer objects seem larger than distant ones, and that one must correct for this distortion if one is going to plan one’s life rationally. Epicurus, likewise, says that the wise person is willing to forgo some particular pleasure if that pleasure will bring one greater pain in the future. Simply indulging in whatever pleasures are close at hand will ultimately bring one unhappiness.

The texts we have do not allow us to obtain with any degree of confidence the reasons that the Cyrenaics have for their advocacy of the pleasures of the moment. There are at least three plausible speculations, however:

i. Personal Identity and Momentary Pleasure

The first reason that the Cyrenaics might have for rejecting long-term planning about one’s pursuits is that they are skeptical about personal identity across time. If all I have access to are momentary, fluctuating experiences, what reason do I have to think that the ‘self’ that exists today will be the same ‘self’ as the person who will bear my name 30 years hence? After all, in most respects, a person at 30 years old is almost completely different from that ‘same’ person at 10, and the ‘same’ person at 50 will also be much changed. So, if what I desire is pleasure for myself, what reason do I have to sacrifice my pleasures for the sake of the pleasures of that ‘other’ person down the temporal stream from myself? Nursing a hangover, or deep in debt, that future self might curse the past self for his intemperance, but what concern is that of mine?

If the Cyrenaics do believe that personal identity does not persist over time, their position would be similar to one espoused by Protagoras in the Theaetetus. Because of the similarities between the Protagorean and Cyrenaic epistemologies, as well as the fact that having such a position would help make sense of the Cyrenaics’ focus on pursuing present pleasures, some scholars have attributed this view of personal identity to the Cyrenaics. However, there is little direct evidence that they held such a view, and the way they describe people and objects seems, indeed, to presuppose their identity across time.

ii. The Self-Defeating Nature of Future-Concern

The Cyrenaics may also think that planning for the future, and trying to assure happiness by foregoing present pleasures for the sake of the future, is self-defeating. If this is right, then it is not the case that the Cyrenaics think that future pleasures and pains are unimportant, it is simply that they believe that worrying about the future is futile. One gains happiness, and maximizes the pleasure in one’s life, not by anxiously planning one’s future out, and toiling on behalf of the future, but simply by enjoying whatever pleasures are immediately at hand, without worrying about the long-term consequences.

The Cyrenaics think that “to pile up the pleasures which produce happiness is most unpleasant,” because one will need to be choosing things which are painful for the sake of future pleasures. The Cyrenaics instead aim at enjoying the pleasures that are present, without letting themselves be troubled at what is not present, that is, the past and future. Epicurus thinks that the memory of past pleasures, and the expectation of future pleasures, are themselves most pleasant, and hence he emphasizes the importance of careful planning in arranging what one will experience in the future. The Cyrenaics, however, deny this, saying that pleasures are pleasant only when actually being experienced.

iii. Present Preferences and Future-Concern

Finally, the Cyrenaics lack of future-concern may result from radically relativizing the good to one’s present preferences. It’s reported that Aristippus “discerned the good by the single present time alone,” and later Cyrenaics assert that there is no telos–goal or good–to life asa whole; instead, particular actions and desires each aim at some particular pleasure. So the notion of some overall goal or good for one’s entire life is rejected and is replaced by a succession of short-terms goals. As one’s desires change over time, what is good for you at that time likewise changes, and at each moment, it makes sense to try to satisfy the desires that one has at that time, without regard to the desires one may happen to have in the future.

If the Cyrenaics thought that to choose rationally is to endeavor to maximize the fulfillment of one’s present preferences, their position would be analogous to the model of economic rationality put forward by current philosophers like David Gauthier.

c. Custom, Morality, and Friendship

In ancient times, the Cyrenaics were among the most dismissive of traditional Greek morality. They say that nothing is just or base by nature: what is just or base is set entirely by the customs and conventions of particular societies. So, for instance, there is nothing in the world or in human nature that makes incest, or stealing, or parricide wrong in themselves. However, these things become base in a particular society because the laws and customs of that society designate those practices as base. You should normally refrain from wrong-doing, not because wrong-doing is bad in itself, but because of the punishments that you will suffer if you are caught.

Many of the stories surrounding Aristippus stress his willingness to do things that were considered demeaning or shocking, like putting on a woman’s robes when the king commands it, or exposing his child to die with no remorse when it was an inconvenience. Although most of these stories are malicious and probably untrue, they do seem to have a basis in the Cyrenaics’ disregard of conventions of propriety when they think they can get away with it. All pleasures are good, they say, even ones that result from unseemly behavior.

The Cyrenaic attitude toward friendship also is consistent with their egoistic hedonism and well outside the traditional attitudes toward friendship. Friendship, according to the Cyrenaics, is entered into for self-interested motives. That is, we obtain friends simply because we believe that by doing so we will be in a better position to obtain pleasure for ourselves, not because we think that the friendship is valuable for its own sake, or because we love our friend for his own sake.

d. Later Cyrenaics

Around the time of Epicurus, a number of offshoot sects of Cyrenaicism sprung up. They seemed to have been concerned mainly with modifying or elaborating Cyrenaic ethics.

i. Hegesias

Hegesias is an extremely pessimistic philosopher. He maintains that happiness is impossible to achieve, because the body and mind are subject to a great deal of suffering, and what happens to us is a result of fortune and not under our control. Pleasure is good, and pain evil, but life as such is neither good nor evil. It is reported (maybe spuriously) that Hegesias was known as the ‘death-persuader,’ and that he was forbidden to lecture because so many members of his audience would kill themselves after listening to him.

Hegesias stresses that every action is done for entirely self-interested motives, and because of this, he denies that friendship exists. This assumes, of course, that one cannot truly be a friend if one enters into the friendship for entirely self-interested reasons.

ii. Anniceris

Anniceris moderated the extreme psychological egoism of Hegesias. He says that friendship does exist, that we should not cherish our friends merely for the sake of their usefulness to us, and that we will willingly deprive ourselves of pleasures because of our love of our friends.

He also says, however, that our end is our own pleasure, and that the happiness of our friend is not desirable for its own sake, since we feel only our own pleasure, not that of our friend. It is not clear how he makes these different parts of his theory consistent with one another.

iii. Theodorus

Theodorus was a pupil of Anniceris. His main innovation is the rejection of the thesis that pleasure and pain are the things that are intrinsically good and evil. Instead, he says that these are intermediates, and that the experience of joy is the highest good, and the feeling of grief the worst evil. (Theodorus may mean to relegate only bodily pleasures and pains to the status of intermediates, since it is natural to think of joy as a mental pleasure and grief as a mental pain.)

He also believes that friendship does not exist, since wise people are self-sufficient and do not need friends, while the unwise enter into friendship merely to satisfy their needs (and hence are not really friends). He also says that acts like adultery, theft and sacrilege are sometimes allowable, since these acts are not bad by nature, but are simply looked down upon because of societal prejudices, which are engendered in order to keep the masses in line.

4. Ancient Sources

None of Cyrenaics’ own writings survive. Thus, in order to reconstruct their views, we need to rely on secondary and tertiary sources which summarize the outlines of Cyrenaic doctrines, or mention the Cyrenaics in passing while discussing some other topic. These sources are not always reliable, and they are often sketchy, so our knowledge of the Cyrenaics is incomplete and tentative. In particular, our sources often mention what the philosophical position of a Cyrenaic is, without recording what his arguments were for that position.

Our main source for Cyrenaic epistemology is Sextus Empiricus, a doctor and Pyrrhonian skeptic who probably lived in the second century A.D. He is a careful and intelligent writer, although he is a fairly late source and is also sometimes polemical. He mentions the Cyrenaics in several places, but his most extended discussion of them occurs in Against the Professors VII 190-200. Another important source for Cyrenaic epistemology is the treatise Against Colotes, by the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 A.D.), a Platonist. The main topic of the essay is an attack on Epicurean epistemology, but Plutarch also deals with the Epicurean criticisms of the Cyrenaics in 1120c-1121e.

Our main source for the lives and ethics of the Cyrenaics is Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century A.D. His 10-book Lives of the Philosophers is a gossipy compendium of what other people have said about the lives and thought of many philosophers. Book 2 includes a discussion of Aristippus and the Cyrenaics. It is stuffed with reports of the Cyrenaics’ scandalous behavior and witty repartee, almost all of which are probably scurrilous, but it also has a valuable summary of the Cyrenaics’ ethical doctrines.

5. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it’s a selection of a few recent books and articles to read for those who want to learn more about the Cyrenaics. The books and articles listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

  • The Epistemology of the Cyrenaic School, by Voula Tsouna, Cambridge University Press. 1998.
    • This is the only book-length study of Cyrenaic epistemology available in English. It is written for an audience of specialists in ancient philosophy, and hence gets a little technical at places for the non-specialist. However, the discussion is very clear overall, and Tsouna does an excellent job of assessing the sources we have and of relating the Cyrenaic’s position to those of both ancient and modern philosophers. There is also an appendix which contains translations of almost all of the ancient sources we have that are significant for understanding Cyrenaic epistemology.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press. 1993.
    • There are no recent books in English available which focus on the Cyrenaic’s ethics. This book deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but it is still a good introduction to Cyrenaic ethics. Annas concentrates on the respects in which the Cyrenaics are out of step with other ancient ethical theories.
  • “The Cyrenaics on Pleasure, Happiness, and Future-Concern,” by Tim O’Keefe, Phronesis, vol. 47 no. 4 (2002), 395-416.
    • This article explores the question of why the Cyrenaics, alone among ancient Greek ethical theorists, claim that happiness is not the highest good, but particular pleasures are instead, and that one should not worry about the long-term consequences of one’s actions but instead concentrate on obtaining pleasures that are near at hand.

Author Information

Tim O’Keefe
Email: (see web page)
Georgia State University
U. S. A.

Bhartrihari (c. 450—510 C.E.)

Bhartrihari may be considered one of the most original philosophers of language and religion in ancient India. He is known primarily as a grammarian, but his works have great philosophical significance, especially with regard to the connections they posit between grammar, logic, semantics, and ontology. His thought may be characterized as part of the shabdadvaita (word monistic) school of thought, which asserts that cognition and language at an ultimate level are ontologically identical concepts that refer to one supreme reality, Brahman. Bhartrihari interprets the notion of the originary word (shabda) as transcending the bounds of spoken and written language and meaning. Understood as shabda tattva-the “word principle,” this complex idea explains the nature of consciousness, the awareness of all forms of phenomenal appearances, and posits an identity obtains between these, which is none other than Brahman. It is thus language as a fundamentally ontological principle that accounts for how we are able to conceptualize and communicate the awareness of objects. The metaphysical notion of shabda Brahman posits the unity of all existence as the foundation for all linguistically designated individual phenomena.

Table of Contents

  1. Bhartrihari’s Life and Works
  2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics
  3. Brahman, Language, and the World
  4. Bhartrihari’s Grammar
  5. The Sphota Theory of Language
  6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of ShabdaBrahman
  7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Bhartrihari’s Life and Works

Bhartrihari’s works were so widely known that even the Chinese traveler Yijing (I-Tsing) (635-713 CE) mentions the grammarian-philosopher, mistaking him for a Buddhist. Unfortunately, we do not know much about his personal history and his works do not throw much light on the matter. There are some narratives referring to his background but they are not supported by historical data. In these somewhat dubious accounts, he is said to have been existentially torn between two kinds of life: the path of pleasure and that of the monastic yogi. Although he believed that he should renounce the world of material pleasures (reflected in poetry attributed to him by scholars), it took many attempts to finally achieve the life of dispassion. His hedonism and philosophical acumen led him, according to his legend, to produce works of great breadth, depth and beauty.

Bhartrihari credits some of the theories in his work Vâkyapadîya to his teacher, who was probably one of Candrâcârya’s contemporaries, Vasurata. To be more precise, the noted scholar T.R.V. Murti proposes the following chronology: Vasurata, followed by Bhartrihari (450-510 CE) and Dinnâga (Dignâga) (480-540 CE). Among the major works attributed to Bhartrihari are his main philosophical treatise, Vâkyapadîya (On Sentences and Words) kândas I, II, and III, Mahâbhâshyatîkâ (a commentary on the Mahâbhâshya of Patanjali), Vâkyapadîyavrtti (a commentary on the Vâkyapadîya kândas I and II), and shabdadhâtusamîksha. Since 1884, the Vâkyapadîya, containing approximately 635 verses, has been edited and published several times in English translation.

The first two chapters of the Vâkyapadîya discuss the nature of creation, the relationship of Brahman, world, language, the individual soul (jîva), and the manifestation and comprehension of the meanings of words and sentences. In addition, the literary works attributed by some to Bhartrihari (not mentioned here) have made an impact on the growing popular Hindu devotional (bhakti) movements. More importantly, his philosophical work was recognized and addressed by schools of Hindu scriptural exegesis (Mîmâmsâ), Vedânta (mystical Vedism) and Buddhism.

2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics

In ancient India, grammarians saw their task as establishing the foundations of the Vedas, but their work often resulted in the development of their own philosophical systems. Patanjali, in his Mahâbhâshya, explains that the study of grammar (vyâkaranam) was meant to maintain the truth of the Vedas, to guide the use of Vedic speech in ritual contexts, and to aid in the clear interpretations of individual human speech. Both Pânini and Patanjali, two major Sanksrit grammarians, were the first to provide a systematic and formal analysis of the grammatical bases of all intended meanings. Pânini (7th century BCE) developed the Ashtâdhyâyî (Eight-Chapters) for the grammarians. This impressive work contains a thorough analysis of the rules of Sanskrit language down into its nominal and verbal components; it contains a science of language, applicable to the Vedas, also comprised of sets of operational rules and meta -rules that interpret the former. Among these “rules for interpretation” of Vedic texts, we are given a “universal grammar. Pânini’s approach is not like the Mîmâmsâ, which focuses on the study of Vedic language. Instead, Pânini deals with spoken and Vedic languages as if they are of the same genre.

Pânini’s Ashtâdhyâyî, its commentaries, and the Vâkyapadîya of Bhartrihari are said to constitute the fundamental texts for the school of Pânini’s grammar, whose object of study was ultimately Vedic. Around 150 BCE, Patanjali wrote the Mahâbhâshya, an interpretation of some of Pânini’s rules written in dialogue form, and it is this work that is the basis for later commentaries on grammar and philosophy. It is of interest to note here that the Dharmashâstras or Treatises on Law, including the well-known Laws of Manu, were composed between 322 and 183 BCE. J.N. Mohanty points out that these treatises can be seen as attempts on the part of orthodox Brahminism to preserve itself against the anti-Vedic philosophies. However, he considers Pânini’s grammar and Patanjali’s commentary to carry greater weight in the Indian philosophical tradition.

With the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari moves grammatical analysis squarely into the realm of philosophy, arguing that grammar can be consider a darshana, a “view,” or an official philosophical school, providing perspective and insight into ultimate reality. The first verse articulates the fundamental view of his newly envisaged school:

The Brahman is without beginning and end, whose essence is the Word, who is the cause of the manifested phonemes, who appears as the objects, from whom the creation of the world proceeds.

It is the project of the Vâkyapadîya to explain this verse, with all of its philosophical, linguistic, and metaphysical implications. At base, we contextualize Bhartrihari’s philosophical inquiry into language as being conditioned by the Indian culture and scriptural tradition, in which this type of intellectual pursuit had a soteriological purpose -the realization of absolute knowledge and the spiritual liberation which ensues; thus, it is a distinctively ontological reflection on language which Bhartrihari added to the thought of earlier grammarians.

3. Brahman, Language, and the World

The Brahminic view of the cosmos put forth in the Vedas is one of constant and cyclical creation and dissolution. At the dissolution of each creative cycle a seed or trace (samskâra) is left behind out of which the next cycle arises. What is significant here is that the nature of the seed from which each cycle of creation bursts forth is expressed as “Divine Word” (Daivi Vâk). If language is of divine origin, it can be conceived as Being Brahman expressing and embodying itself in the plurality of phenomena that is creation.

Bhartrihari considers Brahman, the basis of reality, to be “without beginning and end” (anâdi nidhânam), as a concept that is not subject to the attributes of temporal sequences of events, either externally or in the succession of mental events that form cognitions. The word principle, shabda Brahman, is not defined in terms of the temporal nature of our cognitive states, because it functions as the inherent, primordial ground of all cognitions. Thus, against the Hindu logicians, the Nyâyas, for whom particular forms of human speech may be expressed in conventional terms for practical purposes, language itself is not something which arises or is created in time by God or humans. As B.K. Matilal states, “To talk of an absolute beginning of language is untenable. Language is continuous and co-terminus with human existence or the existence of any sentient being.”

There has been some scholarly debate regarding the meaning of the term “eternal” or “akshara” as Bhartrihari applies it to the word-principle. While some interpret this to refer to an all-pervading entity, existing in opposition to the multiplicity of objects in space and time, others see it as Bhartrihari’s specialized way of referring to phonemes, the minimal units of meaningful sound. It seems that phonemes understood in this way explain how it is the case that Word appears as objects. Eternity is “that which appears as objects, and from whom the creation of the world proceeds.” Phonemes are thus the eternally possible elements that can be combined in inexhaustible ways to manifest the plurality of nature.

This principle accounts for creation on a number of levels: it is the origin of consciousness, of cognition, sensation, language use, cognitive and experiential aspects of the world. In other words, objects of thought and the relations between them are word-determined, regardless of whether they are objects of perception, inference or any other kind of knowledge. When we perceptually apprehend external reality, we always do so in terms of names, for without names objects are neither identifiable nor knowable.

Furthermore, when we consider phenomenal concepts, we see that they do not exist or hold any meaning aside from the words through which they are expressed; we might say that our concepts are “word-loaded” and from this we can infer that the word principle causes the world. Bhartrihari’s causal claim is in keeping with the traditional philosophical discussions on the nature of causality and inference as he applies it to the word-principle:

Just as other thinkers, while explaining causality, saw that the properties of cause continue in the effects….in the same way in the scriptures also, the word in which the power of Enjoyer and Enjoyed are submerged has been declared as the cause of the world.

4. Bhartrihari’s Grammar

In the Vâkyapadîya, kânda I, Bhartrihari defines the scope of his inquiry as the subjects of grammar. Our speech takes the form of the basic structures of language, and grammar deals with this communicatively spoken language. The correct understanding of speech can take us to the limits of our conventional and spiritual capacities, and so language analysis must operate at all the following levels: 1. sentences and words, 2. meanings corresponding to sentences and words, 3. the fitness or compatibility between sound and sense, and 4. the spiritual merit obtained by using the correct language.

In the Sanskrit grammatical tradition, the “elite” are defined as those who use the correct language; we arrive at this standard language by abstracting from communicative language, or “language-in-use.” In his linguistic theory, Bhartrihari distinguishes between two forms of language, the spoken, or “language-in-use” and the analytic. The analytic or formal language emerges from a formal, abstract analysis of communicative language. If we were to gather and compare various sentences and words from different contexts of use, we would logically infer the basic segments (roots, stems, suffixes) that account for a common logical or formal basis of denotation.

This hierarchical conception of language use and language meaning can be understood in the following way, taking off from a representation of Matilal, with the term on the far right of each column understood as the originator of the term in the middle, and the term in the middle being the originator of the term on the left. In other words, Bhartrihari’s conception of utterance and understanding can be grasped with the following schema under the rubric of:

Product Producer Derivative Element
Linguistic Components Language-in-Use Analytic Language
sentences and words word stems, suffixes, etc..
sense sentence meaning and word meaning stem meaning and suffix meaning
sound and sense relations fitness compatibility causality relations
purpose spiritual merit correct knowledge

There is debate about the ontological and epistemological status of relations between these levels of language, and Bhartrihari’s commentary on grammar includes a review of several theories and ultimately he seems to favor the “naturalist view.” In the first chapter of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari explains the naturalist view. Following the pâdavâdins (those who regard the word as the primary indivisible unit) who consider word-constituents, such as roots and suffixes, to be mere fictitious abstractions from words, so also the vâkyavâdins (those who regard the sentence as the indivisible unit) consider words to be imaginary abstractions from the sentence. The naturalists, such as Pânini, believe that language has an invariant form expressed in grammar. They therefore give epistemic primacy to spoken language; formal language is only an “appearance” and secondary aid to understanding. The conventionalists, on the other hand, hold that the analytic language is primary in that it contains within it all the structural features that may be used to create meaningful speech.

5. The Sphota Theory of Language

Bhartrihari’s theory occupies an interesting place in the ongoing Hindu-Buddhist debates about meaning and reference. For the Buddhists, meaning is a function of social and linguistic convention and reference is ultimately a projection of imaginative consciousness. For the Brahminic Nyâyas or Logicians, words have meaning because they refer to external objects; words can be combined in sentences just like things exist in relation to one another in external reality. With Advaita Vedânta, words mask the meaning of the Absolute Self (Âtman) which is Brahman, so that, when a person predicates categories to their identity such as in the sentence “I am tall,” this predication masks the all-inclusive nature of the eternal Self, which is beyond categorization. Bhartrihari puts forth a theory of language which, rather than starting by taking fundamental ontological, epistemological or social sides in these well-established debates, starts from the question of how meaning happens, how it emerges from the acts of both speaker and audience, and, constructing this theory first, what he believes to be appropriate metaphysical, epistemological and soteriological implications are drawn from it.

For Bhartrihari, linguistic meaning cannot be conveyed or accounted for by the physical utterance and perception of sounds, so he puts forth the sphota theory: the theory which posits the meaning-unit, which for him is the sentence, as a single entity. The term “sphota” dates back to Pânini’s reference to “sphotâyana” in his treatise Ashtâdhyâyî, however it was Patanjali who explicitly discusses sphota in his Mahâbhâshya. According to him sphota signifies spoken language, with the audible sound (dhvani) as its special quality. In Bhartrihari’s treatment of this concept, while the audible noise may vary depending on the speaker’s mode of utterance, sphota as the meaning unit of speech is not subject to such variations. This is so because for Bhartrihari, meaning is conveyed by the sentence. To explicate this theory, Bhartrihari depends on the root of sphota, namely sphut, meaning “to burst forth…” as in the “idea that spews forth” (in an internal mental state) when a meaningful sound, the sentence as a whole, is uttered.

The meaning of the sentence, the speech-unit, is one entire cognitive content (samvit). The sentence is indivisible (akhanda) and owes its cognitive value to the meaning-whole. Thus, its meaning is not reducible to its parts, the individual words which are distinguished only for the purposes of convention or expression. The differentiated word-meanings, which are also ontological categories, are the abstracted “pieces” we produce using imaginative construction, or vikalpa. Sphota entails a kind of mental perception which is described as a moment of recognition, an instantaneous flash (pratibhâ), whereby the hearer is made conscious, through hearing sounds, of the latent meaning unit already present in his consciousness (unconscious). The sentence employs analyzable units to express its meaning, but that meaning emerges out of the particular concatenation of those units, not because those units are meaningful in themselves. We analyze language by splitting it up into words, prefixes, suffixes, etc….but this is indicative of the fact that we “misunderstand” the fundamental oneness of the speech-unit. Words are only abstracted meaning possibilities in this sense, whereas the uttered sentence is the realization of a meaning-whole irreducible to those parts in themselves. This fundamental unity seems to apply, also, to any language taken as a whole. Matilal explains: “it is only those who do not know the language thoroughly who analyze it into words, in order to get a connected meaning.” As this scholar suggests, it is rather remarkable that Bhartrihari’s recognition of the theoretical indivisibility of the sentence resonates with the contemporary linguistic view of learning sentences as wholes (at a later stage of development we build new sentences from learned first sentences through analogical reasoning).

Sphota is therefore the cause of manifested language, which is meant to convey meaning. Sphota is more specifically identified as the underlying totality of linguistic capability, or “potency” and secondarily as the cause of two differentiated aspects of manifested meaning: applied meaning expressed as dhvani, the audible sound patterns of speech and artha-language as meaning-bearing. The grammatical/syntactical parts of the underlying sphota can only be heard and understood through its phonetic elements. Bhartrihari explains that the apparent difference between sphota and dhvani arises as we utter words. Initially, the word exists in the mind of the speaker as a unity but is manifested as a sequence of different sounds-thus giving the appearance of differentiation. dhvanis may be more specifically described as merely the audible possibility of meaning, a necessary but hardly sufficient condition of meaning.

We might think of this unit of linguistic potency, the sphota, as the cognitive/propositional whole content of meaning that can be transposed into different languages, while the actual word-sounds comprise the contents of the “speech-act”. But what holds the act to its ability to convey intended meanings? The words sounded by a plurality of speakers comprise the physical manifestation of vâk or vaikharîvâk and it is upon this form of vâk that physical objects as objective forms are modeled. The unity that underlies these objective referents and meanings, however, is known as the intuited vâkpashyativâk, which makes possible the unmediated understanding of a complete linguistic expression. This intuitive level of understanding, constitutive of the sphota, is teleological in its nature and structure in that it contains all potential possibilities of meaning-bearing dhvanis and their order of manifestation.

But, what guarantees that the hearer of speech properly comprehends what is uttered? In the second book of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari states:

Sentence meaning is produced by word meanings but is not constituted by them. Its form is that Intuition, that innate “know how” awareness (pratibhâ) possessed by all beings. It is a cognitive state evident to the hearer…not describable or definable, but all practical activities depend on it directly or through recollection of it.

Pratibhâ intuition can be characterized as shabda, the very same speech principle externalized in the utterances of speakers, as it operates within the hearer, causing her to instantaneously comprehend the meaning of the utterance. However, linguistic convention, shared by speaker and hearer, cannot account for the flash of comprehension. If that were the case, we would not have instances where communication breaks down in spite of the shared language between speaker and hearer. The comprehension of meaning lies in the sphota that is already present in the hearer’s awareness. As she hears the succession of audible phonemes, the latent and undifferentiated language potency within her is brought to “fruition” in the form of grasping the speaker’s meaning. Thus, while the audible words are necessary for such verbal comprehension to occur in the hearer, they are not sufficient. It is her own ability to understand meaning referred to by these words, by virtue of sharing the same sphota with the speaker, which completes the act of cognition.

It is at this point that the philosophy of language has for Bhartrihari religious implications of both ontological and interpretive scope. Just as various sentences might sound different in the mouths of different speakers and yet convey the same meanings, various Vedas may seem different in form and style, but there is a unity carried by the underlying sphota, which ensures that it is the same truth, or dharma that is expressed throughout the texts. Bearing in mind that Brahman is the ultimate referent of all speech forms, this higher reality is manifested in the sacred texts-whose efficacy (ritual, soteriological, epistemological) depends upon our ability to correctly apprehend its meaning. The sphota concept makes such interpretation possible. Again, the sphota expresses a meaning-whole behind individual letters and words. The implication for the truth of Vedic discourse is clear, for that truth is already present in the speaker (the Veda) and is potentially present in the consciousness of the hearers (the practitioners).

According to Bhartrihari’s theory, we can justify this particular philosophical method as revelatory by using the concept of shabdapramâna. The implications of this method are explained in the following section; here, we examine the source of our cognitions. But in order for one to give their assent to a worldview that renders to language the cosmic and salvific roles Bhartrihari does, a theory that posits that language is the medium of ultimate knowledge, one must be convinced that language in general has the capacity to yield ordinary knowledge. Given the way Bhartrihari conceptualizes language, as not primarily referent directed, but instead as referent-constructing, we need to look at how the grammarian thematizes the knowledge-conferring power of language within his own peculiarly unique framework.

6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of Shabda-Brahman

Sphota may be characterized as the intersubjective, universal “store-house” of meaning, the ground of all linguistic activity and communication. Sphota is the unifying principle that connects the word, the grammatical form of the word, and the meaning. Furthermore, just as words and sentences represent “pieces” of the meaning extracted from the whole, the objects and states of affairs these pieces represent actually refer to a “whole of objects meant” or an entire reality.

In classical Indian thought, objects are thought to be constituted of substance (dravya), but in Bhartrihari and especially in his first major commentator Helârâja, substance can be distinguished into two kinds, the substance of all things, which is Brahman, and the other individual, empirical substances. The empirical notion of substance here may be derived from the grammatical operation of ekashesha, explained by Pânini as using individual word-tokens to refer to individual objects-substances. Thus, names or singular terms are said by the earliest grammarians to refer to one substance at a time, therefore substance is defined through the relation of reference, and the nature of each substance is so specific that we cannot posit any general properties possessed by all of them. For example, each time we say the word ‘cow’ we refer to a different cow, and each cow is actually a different wholly individual entity.

Bhartrihari defines “actual” or empirical substance as that which we refer to by using indexicals and quantifiers, which refer to anything in our ontological reality: ‘this’ ‘that’ ‘something’ or ‘anything.’ The term ‘this’ points out an existence given to perception, while ‘that’ refers to something whose existence can be validated by some other means of knowledge but which is not available to perception. Bhartrihari also acknowledges the pragmatic and common sense view of “substance” as “a relative concept being dependent on our concept of quality (guna). A substance is that which is said to be distinguished and a quality is that which distinguishes the substance.

But Bhartrihari’s contribution to this debate changes the very notion of substance into a much more inclusive and general concept, since anything we refer to using a name or substantive term, even generic properties and verbs, become substances in that they are distinguished by words, as Matilal illustrates: “Thus, cooking would refer to the fact of cooking and ‘walking’ to the fact of walking as long as the speaker intends to distinguish the act of cooking from the act of walking.” “In the third book of the Vâkyapadîya, he defines the concept of ‘quality’/guna as dependent upon, as arising from substance. He rejects the Vaisheshika view that substances and qualities belong to entirely different categories (padârtha-s), and espouses the revolutionary view that the latter arises from the former. For him, qualities, existing in relation to substances serve to further differentiate those substances by “delimiting their scope.” But how does he account for such a radical revisioning?

Bhartrihari’s contribution of his particular theory of the “imaginative construction” of perceptions and language once again emerges within the context of debates with competing theories of knowledge. The Buddhist idealistic claim also argued that the world of experience or phenomena is at base a product of the human imaginative faculty. The Buddhists claim that our cognitive experiences construct our reality; these are modes of consciousness containing cognitive contents and in the final analysis, do not yield any knowledge about reality as it may be outside of themselves. It is consciousness that posits the (apparent) externality of objects, not the “objects themselves.” This form of phenomenal-idealism is developed as a counterclaim to the Hindu realist position, which affirms the existence of external reality. For the Buddhist, objects are only the external contents of the human imagination. Interestingly enough, Bhartrihari’s sphota theory of language and cognition is sometimes understood as an extension of the Buddhist position; according to the grammarian, cognition is entirely language-dependent in that the structure of our cognitive states is determined by grammar. But Bhartrihari’s theory posits knowledge as a matter of specifically linguistic construction. The concept of vikalpa for him implies the following: the structure of language shapes how we categorize the objects of our experience and our descriptions of reality as a whole. Even at the most immediate levels of awareness), we must conceptualize and therefore interpret the contents of sense perception. Thus, at the level of pure sensation, the sensory core is already saturated, as it were, with the “deep structure” of language. In this respect, Bhartrihari’s position differs from the Buddhist position rather dramatically. The Buddhists clearly distinguish between pure perception (nirvikalpa-pratyaksha), which is pre-conceptual, unverbalizable and correspondent to reality, and constructed perception (savikalpa-pratyakasha) that is conceptual and may therefore be considered a verbalized interpretation of the real. For the Buddhist, the pure sensory core is the real locus of perception. Bhartrihari, as an ontological monist, does not distinguish between a pure perception and a constructed perception such that the former is concept-free and ineffable and the latter concept-loaded and autonomously constructed, because he thinks that perception is inherently verbal. Not only are sense data and linguistic units non-different, but they are expressive of the unitary principle of Brahman-which is differentiated into the plurality of linguistic objects that make up the world.

Bhartrihari’s notion of vikalpa is also directed against the early Nyaiyayikas, who, while agreeing on the correspondence between word and thing, uphold the distinction between language and its object-referents. These Hindu Logicians held that the perceptual apprehension of the object could be distinguished from naming the object. For the Nyâyas, who are ontological pluralists and materialists, words refer to distinct generic properties of and relations between objects. Perception is a two-step process involving the initial apprehension of the object and then the subsequent apperception/awareness that results in mental and syntactic/linguistic representations of the first moment of awareness. Here, linguistic categories originate in the different substances and attributes that exist in the world. Bhartrihari counters them by arguing that the act of perception, rather than acquiring linguistic clothing after the bare particular has already been presented to consciousness, can only be aware of the object before it as a ‘this’ or ‘that’, that is, as an awareness of something only as a particular and as such, identifiable. That is to say, significantly enough, that for Bhartrihari, the word makes the thing an individual, and as one moves further and further along the refined categories of what is conventionally known as denotation, the word makes the thing what it is. For Bhartrihari, the difference the Logicians posit between the ontological and the linguistic would make meanings of all kinds, mundane ones and religious ones, contingent on the circumstances and speaker. But if perception is innately verbal, no perilous bridge need be suspended over some supposed abyss between vision and truth, both in our mundane lives and for the rishis who pronounced the Vedas. The word then makes the thing, and Brahman makes the world, and so it is entirely proper to speak of words as the creator of all things (shabdaBrahman).

7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy

Although previous Bhartrihari scholarship has progressed rather slowly due to numerous difficulties, within the last decade or so his work has garnered attention from Western scholars. Bhartrihari’s explorations into the relations between language, thought and reality reflect contemporary philosophical concerns with meaning, language use, and communication, particularly in the work of Chomsky, Wittgenstein, Grice, and Austin. His theory of language recognizes that meaning is conveyed in formalist terms where meaning is organized along syntactical rules. But it makes the leap, not made by modern Western philosophers, that such a view of language does not merely serve our mundane communicative purposes and see to the achievement of practical goals, but leads to paramount metaphysical knowledge, a knowledge carrying with it a palpable salvific value.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bhartrihari. The Vâkyapadîya, Critical texts of Cantos I and II with English Translation. Trans. K. Pillai. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1971.
  • Coward, Harold G. The Sphota Theory of Language: A Philosophical Analysis . Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1980.
  • Coward, Harold G., and K. Kunjunni Raja, eds. The Philosophy of the Grammarians (Volume V of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • Herzberger, Radhika. Bhartrihari and the Buddhists. Dordrecht: D. Reidel/Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1986.
  • Houben, Jan E.M. The Sambanda Samuddesha and Bhartrihari’s Philosophy of Language. Groningen: Egbert Forsten, 1995.
  • Iyer, Soubramania, K.A. Bhartrihari. A Study of Vâkyapadîya in the Light of Ancient Commentaries. Poona: Deccan College Postgraduate Research Institute, 1997.
  • Matilal, B.K. Mind, Language, and World. Ed. J. Ganeri. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 2002. (See “What Bhartrihari Would Have Said About Quine.”)
  • Matilal, B.K. The Word and the World: India’s Contribution to the Study of Language. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception: An Essay on Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986. (See chapter 12.)
  • Matilal, B.K. Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis. The Hague: Mouton, 1971.
  • Potter, Karl, ed. The Tradition of the Nyâya-Vaisheshika up to Gangesha (Volume II of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1977.
  • Shah, K.J. “Bhartrihari and Wittgenstein.” Perspectives on the Philosophy of Meaning 1/1 (1990): 80-95.

Author Information

Stephanie Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Michael Dummett (1925—2011)

Michael DummettMichael Dummett was one of the most influential British philosophers of his generation.  His philosophical reputation is based partly on his studies of the history of analytical philosophy and partly on his own contributions to the philosophical study of logic, language, mathematics and metaphysics. The article deals first with the historical work, then with his on-going project, concluding with a brief discussion of his influence.

Of his historical work, it is his commentaries on Gottlob Frege that are of outstanding importance. Frege was primarily a mathematician, and Dummett has devoted a book to Frege’s philosophy of mathematics. More controversially, Dummett has argued that analytical philosophy is based on Frege’s insight that the correct way to study thought is to study language. He holds that Frege advocated a realist semantic theory. According to such a theory, every sentence (and thus every thought we are capable of expressing) is determinately true or false, even though we may not have any means of discovering which it is.

Dummett’s most celebrated original work lies in his development of anti-realism, based on the idea that to understand a sentence is to be capable of recognizing what would count as evidence for or against it. According to anti-realism, there is no guarantee that every declarative sentence is determinately true or false. This means that the realist and the anti-realist support rival systems of logic. Dummett argues that we should think in terms of a series of independent debates between realists and anti-realists, each concerned with a different type of language—so one might be an anti-realist about arithmetic but a realist, say, about the past. Dummett’s main philosophical project is to demonstrate that philosophy of language is capable of providing a definitive resolution of such metaphysical debates.  His work on realism and anti-realism involves all of the following fields: philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of logic, philosophy of language and metaphysics.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Information
  2. Dummett and Other Philosophers
    1. Wittgenstein: Meaning as Use
    2. Intuitionism: the Significance of Bivalence
    3. Frege and Dummett
      1. Frege: the Significance of Philosophy of Language
      2. Frege and the Origins of Semantics
      3. Frege’s Unfinished Business
  3. Dummett on Realism and Anti-Realism
    1. Justifying Logical Laws by a Semantic Theory
    2. The Role of Proof-Theoretic Justification
    3. Justifying a Semantic Theory by Means of a Meaning-Theory
    4. Justificationist Semantics
    5. God
  4. On Immigration
  5. Dummett’s Influence
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Biographical Information

Michael Dummett attended Sandroyd School and Winchester College, and served in the armed forces from 1943 to 1947. Although he was educated within the traditions of the Anglican Church at Winchester, by the age of 13 he regarded himself as an atheist. In 1944 however, he was received into the Roman Catholic Church, and he remains a practising Catholic. After his military service, he studied at Christ Church College, Oxford, graduating with First Class Honours in Philosophy, Politics and Economics in 1950 and then attained a fellowship at All Souls College. An All Souls fellowship is perhaps the ultimate academic prize open to Oxford graduates, providing an ideal opportunity to engage in research without any of the pressure that comes from having to teach, or to produce a doctoral thesis within a set period of time. From 1950 to 1951, Dummett was also Assistant Lecturer in Philosophy in Birmingham University. In Oxford, he was Reader in Philosophy of Mathematics from 1962 until 1974.

His first philosophical article was a book review, published in Mind in 1953. He has published many more articles since, most of which have been collected into three volumes. Several of the articles published in the 1950s and 1960s are considered by some to be classics, but, at this time, some members of the philosophical community worried that his published output would never match his true potential. This was partly because of his perfectionism, and partly because, from 1965 to 1968, he and his wife Ann chose to devote much of their time and energy to the fight against racism. In 1965, they helped to found the Oxford Committee for Racial Integration, which soon affiliated to a newly formed national organization, the Committee Against Racial Discrimination on whose national executive committee he served. However, CARD was wracked with internal divisions, and after an acrimonious annual convention in 1967 Dummett concluded that a white person could play only an ancillary role in the fight against racism. He did found a new organization, the Joint Council for the Welfare of Immigrants which focused specifically on immigration rights, but by 1969, his work as an activist had been reduced sufficiently to allow a return to philosophical research, and he resumed the task of writing his first major work, Frege: Philosophy of Language.

The book was eventually published in 1973 and it was a watershed in the study of Frege. Even so, the first edition was deficient in containing hardly any references to the text of Frege’s work, a fault that was remedied in the second edition in 1981, published concurrently with The Interpretation of Frege’s Philosophy, a book whose title is self-explanatory.

Between the first and second editions of Frege: Philosophy of Language, Dummett also published Elements of Intuitionism in 1977 (a second edition was published in 2000), and his first collection of papers, Truth and Other Enigmas in 1978. In 1979, he accepted the position of Wykeham Professor of Logic at Oxford, which he held until his retirement in 1992. Although Dummett had been connected with Oxford for the whole of his professional career, he has also taught and studied outside England. He held various visiting positions at Berkeley, Ghana, Stanford, Minnesota, Princeton, Rockefeller, Munster, Bologna and Harvard. The William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard in 1976 were published in 1991 as The Logical Basis of Metaphysics, his most detailed study of the debates between realists and anti-realists. In the same year, he published his second collection of papers, Frege and Other Philosophers, and Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, his long-awaited sequel to Frege: Philosophy of Language. His third collection of papers, The Seas of Language, was published in 1993.

The lectures he delivered at Bologna in 1987, entitled Origins of Analytical Philosophy, were published in 1988 in the journal Lingua e Stile. A translation into German was made by Joachim Schulte, and this was published along with Schulte’s interview with Dummett in 1988, as Ursprünge der analytischen Philosophie. The book was subsequently published in Italian in 1990, in French in 1991, and in English in 1993. In 1996-1997, he delivered the Gifford Lectures in St. Andrews University, and these were published as Thought and Reality in 2006. He also gave the John Dewey Lectures at Columbia University in 2002, which were published as Truth and the Past in 2004. In 2001, he published On Immigration and Refugees, which is in part a contribution to moral and political philosophy. He also published works on voting systems and the history of card games, all of them subjects on which he was an authority. He received a Knighthood in 1999 in recognition of his efforts to fight racism, as well as for his philosophical work.

2. Dummett and Other Philosophers

There is an intimate connection between Dummett’s studies of the history of analytical philosophy and his own contributions to the field. Much of his own work can only be understood as a response to other thinkers, who, he thinks, have set the agenda that analytical philosophers ought to follow. To understand anything of his work it is necessary to understand the significance that Wittgenstein, the intuitionists, and above all Gottlob Frege have for him.

a. Wittgenstein: Meaning as Use

Dummett states that early in his career (before he published the work on which his reputation rests), “I regarded myself, doubtless wrongly, as a Wittgensteinian” (Dummett, 1993a 171). The most important idea that Dummett took from the later works of Wittgenstein, is that “meaning is use”. To know the meaning of a word is to understand that word, and to understand it is to be able to use it correctly. Of course, in order to be able to determine the significance of the claim that meaning is use, we must be able to spell out precisely what is involved in being able to use a word correctly: this is a task to which Dummett devoted a considerable amount of effort.

Wittgenstein also asserted in his later works that the task of philosophy is not to increase the sum of human knowledge, but to release us from the grip of confused metaphysical notions by drawing our attention to certain facts about meaning. Philosophy should limit itself to describing what we do in other areas of life, and should never attempt to alter our practices. Dummett states that, “I have never been able to sympathise with that idea,” (Dummett, 1993a, 174) and, as he has noted, a Catholic philosopher could hardly be content to say that metaphysics is impossible (Dummett, 1978, 435). However, there seems to be a connection between Wittgenstein’s suggestion that meaning is use and his rejection of metaphysics.

In Zettel, Wittgenstein asks the reader to consider two philosophers, one an idealist, the other a realist, who are raising their children to share their philosophical beliefs. An idealist holds that physical objects only exist in so far as they are perceived; talk of unperceived physical objects is merely a means to making predictions about future observations. The realist holds that physical objects exist independently of our capacity to perceive them. Wittgenstein suggests that both philosophers will teach their children how to use vocabulary about physical objects in exactly the same way, except, perhaps, that one child will be taught to say, “Physical objects exist independently of our perceptions,” and the other will be taught to deny this. If this is the only difference between the two children, says Wittgenstein, “Won’t the difference be one only of battle-cry?” (Wittgenstein, 1967, 74). For Wittgenstein, to understand the use of a word, in the manner that is relevant to philosophy, it is necessary to understand the role that sentences involving that word play in our lives. His claim in this case is that those sentences which philosophers take to express substantive statements about realism and idealism play no role whatsoever in our lives. The metaphysical sentences have no use, and so there is nothing to be understood—they are strings of words without a meaning. Wittgenstein’s hope is that once we see that, in a given metaphysical dispute, both sides are divided by nothing more than their different battle cries, both parties will realize that there is nothing to fight about and so give up fighting.

The argument presented above for the conclusion that metaphysical disputes are arguments about nothing does not follow just from the doctrine that meaning is use: a necessary part of the argument was the controversial observation that one’s stance on a particular metaphysical issue has no possible relevance to any practices in which one engages outside the arcane practice of arguing with other metaphysicians. This would have to be demonstrated for each metaphysical dispute in turn. Dummett accepts that meaning is use, but not that metaphysical problems need to be abandoned rather than solved. Therefore, he is faced with the challenge of explaining what content metaphysical statements have, by pointing out the exact connection between metaphysical doctrines and other practices in which we engage. Dummett met this challenge by focusing upon a disagreement in philosophy of mathematics, the dispute between intuitionists and Platonists.

b. Intuitionism: the Significance of Bivalence

In philosophy of mathematics, the term “platonism” is used to describe the belief that at least some mathematical objects (for example, the natural numbers) exist independently of human reasoning and perception. The Platonist is a realist about numbers. There are various forms of opposition to platonism. One form of anti-realism about mathematical objects is known as intuitionism.

Intuitionism was founded by L. E. J. Brouwer (1881-1966). The intuitionists argued that mathematical objects are constructed, and statements of arithmetic are reports by mathematicians of what they have constructed, each mathematician carrying out his or her own construction in his or her own mind. A concise statement of this case may be found in a lecture delivered by Brouwer in 1912 (Brouwer, 1983). This process of construction involves what Kant called “intuition”, hence the name “intuitionism”. Dummett does not, in fact, find the case presented by Brouwer very convincing, relying as it does on the idea that a mathematical construction is a process carried out by the individual mathematician within the privacy of his or her own mind. This seems to identify the meaning that one attaches to a mathematical term with a private mental object to which only that person has access. For Dummett, the significance of Brouwer lies not so much in the way that he and his immediate followers argued for their position, as in their exploration of the implications of their philosophical position for mathematical logic (Dummett, 1978, 215-247).

From an intuitionistic perspective, to claim that some mathematical proposition, P, is true is to claim that there is a proof of P, that is, that ‘we’ have access to a proof of P. It is the task of the mathematician to construct such proofs. To claim that the negation of P is true is to claim there is a proof that it is impossible to prove P. Of course, there is no guarantee that, for any arbitrary mathematical proposition, we will have either a proof of that proposition or a proof that no proof is possible. From the perspective of platonism, whether or not we have a proof, we know that P must be either true or false: mathematical reality guarantees that it has one of these two truth-values. From an intuitionist perspective, we have no such guarantee.

Consider, for example, Goldbach’s conjecture, the conjecture that every even number is the sum of two primes. So far, nobody has discovered either a proof or a counter-example. It makes sense, from a realist perspective, to suppose that this conjecture might be true because every one of the infinite series of even numbers is a sum or two primes, even though there might be no proof to be discovered. As far as the intuitionist is concerned, the only thing that could make it true that all even numbers are the sum of two primes is that there be a proof. For all we know, according to the intuitionist, there might be no proof and no counter-example, in which case there is nothing to give the conjecture a truth-value.

The belief that every proposition is determinately true or false is the principle of bivalence. If we assert that the principle of bivalence holds of some set of propositions, even though we do not know whether, for every proposition in that set, there is sufficient evidence to confirm or refute that proposition, then our assertion of bivalence must be based on the belief that truth can transcend evidence. In dealing with mathematics, to have sufficient evidence to confirm a proposition is to have a proof of that proposition. So we see that, in the dispute between platonists (realists about numbers), and intuitionists (anti-realists about numbers), the realist affirms the principles of bivalence and that truth may transcend evidence, and the anti-realist denies these two principles.

Intuitionism is a doctrine that has clear implications for mathematical practice: the realist considers certain inferences to be valid which the intuitionist considers to be invalid. Suppose, for example, we have a proof that ‘P implies R’, and that ‘not-P implies R’. In the form of logic favored by the realist, classical logic, we then have a proof of R, because we can apply the law of excluded middle, which tells us that ‘P or not-P’. The intuitionist cannot appeal to the law of excluded middle. In order to derive R from ‘P implies R’ and ‘not-P implies R’, the intuitionist would also have to prove either P or not-P. In virtue of these clear implications for mathematical practice, the difference between the Platonist and the intuitionist can hardly be dismissed as merely one of battle-cry.

Dummett has suggested that certain other philosophical debates between realists and anti-realists should take the same form, once both sides properly understand the nature of the debate. The example taken from Wittgenstein concerned a debate between a realist and an idealist concerning physical objects. According to Dummett, the idealist’s opposition to the view that physical objects exist independently of our perceptions of them should result in the rejection of both evidence-transcendent truth and bivalence. The idealist will be proposing some reform of classical logic, although it might not be exactly the same as that proposed by the intuitionist, since it will have to incorporate an account of what counts as sufficient evidence to confirm or refute a statement about physical objects. The important point to note is that the issue at stake will be which logical laws we should accept. If Dummett is correct, the great insight of the intuitionists was to realize that metaphysical disputes were really disputes about logical laws. However, we have also seen that he does not find the arguments of Brouwer and others in favor of this revision of classical logic to be compelling. He believed that the thinker who provided the tools that will enable us to solve such disputes was Gottlob Frege, not Brouwer.

c. Frege and Dummett

i. Frege: the Significance of Philosophy of Language

Gottlob Frege (1848-1925) was a mathematician by profession, whose work on the foundations of mathematics carried him deep into philosophical territory. His ultimate goal, for most of his career, was to demonstrate that all truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical premises. This position is known as “logicism.” Frege’s attempted proof of logicism was a failure, and, thanks to Kurt Gödel, we know that no single axiomatic system can suffice for the proof of all truths of arithmetic. In Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics Dummett attempts to pinpoint exactly where Frege went wrong. For current purposes, it is more important to understand the extent to which Dummett approves of Frege’s work. Dummett has probably been the most important commentator on Frege. His interpretation of Frege’s work is by no means universally accepted, but serious students of Frege’s work can hardly afford to ignore it.

According to Dummett, Frege’s unsuccessful project had two important by-products. In order to vindicate his logicism, Frege had to invent a language in which numbers could be defined by means of a more primitive logical vocabulary, and by means of which statements of arithmetic could be either proved or disproved. This Frege achieved in 1879, the major technical innovation being the use of quantifiers to handle statements involving multiple generality. In other words, Frege invented a formal language in which it is possible to display the difference between “Everybody loves somebody”, and “There is somebody whom everybody loves”, and to demonstrate clearly how different conclusions can be derived from each these. This was a major achievement, and all current formal languages, rely upon Frege’s method for expressing such statements. Consequently, Frege has been crowned as the founder of modern formal logic.

It is hardly surprising that, having used logic to investigate the foundations of mathematics, Frege should also have been interested in the nature of logic itself. Frege wrote a variety of papers on the nature of thought, meaning and truth; and on a number of occasions, he attempted to combine these into a comprehensive treatise on logic. Dummett adopts the label “philosophy of language” for this aspect of Frege’s work, and he views it as the second important by-product of Frege’s failed project (Dummett, 1981b, 37).

Why does Dummett reject Frege’s own term for this field of study, “logic”, and instead describe it as “philosophy of language”, a label whose accuracy has been disputed? Dummett rejects the label “logic” because he prefers to use that word in the narrow Aristotelian sense of the study of principles of inference (Dummett, 1981b, 37). That alone does not explain why he chooses “philosophy of language” as an alternative label, rather than, for example, “philosophy of thought.” This label is adopted because he thinks that Frege’s work made it natural for philosophers to take the “linguistic turn“, and thus to become analytical philosophers, although Dummett acknowledges that Frege himself did not explicitly make this turn, and that some of his statements seem to be antithetical to it (Dummett, 1993a, 7). According to Dummett, the linguistic turn is taken when one recognizes

[F]irst, that a philosophical account of thought can be attained through a philosophical account of language, and, secondly, that a comprehensive account can only be so attained. (Dummett, 1993a, 4)

As an example of how Frege’s approach to philosophical questions anticipated the explicit acknowledgement of the priority of language over thought, Dummett refers to Frege’s use of the context principle in Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, published in 1884. When faced with the question of what number words mean, Frege invokes the context principle, which is characterized by Dummett as

[T]he thesis that it is only in the context of a sentence that a word has a meaning: the investigation therefore takes the form of asking how we can fix the senses of sentences containing words for numbers. (Dummett, 1993a, 5)

It should be noted that the term that Dummett here translates as “sentence”, Satz, is, in this passage, (p. x of Frege’s original text) translated as “proposition” by J.L. Austin (Frege, 1980a, x) and Michael Beaney (Frege, 1997, 90). Dummett’s translation is more favorable to his interpretation of the context principle as a linguistic principle than that of Austin and Beaney.

What is important, for Dummett, is that Frege does not approach the question of numbers by focusing on what is happening inside our heads when we think of a number. Frege, even if he did not explicitly embrace the linguistic turn, rejected psychologism—the view that would have us understand logic by studying private mental processes. Dummett holds that the rejection of psychologism leads more or less inevitably to the linguistic turn (Dummett, 1993a, 25).

On Dummett’s view, the contrast between Brouwer and Frege could be put as follows. Brouwer introspected, and found that he had intuitions of proofs, but not of numbers. Frege focused on sentences containing numerical terms, asking whether the numerical terms functioned as names, and whether there was a guarantee that such sentences were all determinately true or false, holding that an affirmative answer to each of these two questions would be sufficient to establish that numbers are objects—the presence or absence of any private mental ideas or intuitions being irrelevant.

Even if the use Frege makes of the context principle in the Grundlagen makes a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, that need not in itself be seen as a contribution to philosophy of language. Indeed, Dummett himself writes as follows of the Grundlagen:

Realism is a metaphysical doctrine; but it stands or falls with the viability of a corresponding semantic theory. There is no general semantic theory in, or underlying the Grundlagen; the context principle repudiates semantics. That principle, as understood in the Grundlagen, ought therefore not to be invoked as underpinning realism, but as dismissing the issue as spurious. (Dummett, 1991a, 198)

Dummett holds that Frege did supply a semantic theory in his writings after the Grundlagen, indeed, a few lines after the paragraph cited above, he adds:

Full-fledged realism depends on—indeed, may be identified with—an undiluted application to sentences of the relevant kind a straightforward two-valued classical semantics: a Fregean semantics in fact.

A “straightforward two-valued classical semantics” involves a commitment to bivalence, and we have already seen why Dummett views this as the defining feature of realism. Commentators who do not accept Dummett’s characterization of realism would not necessarily agree with his characterization of Frege as a realist, since it is not a label that Frege himself adopts. We must now consider what it was that Frege added to his philosophy after the Grundlagen that constitutes, on Dummett’s view, a general semantic theory incorporating the principle of bivalence. If the Grundlagen can be used by Dummett as evidence that Frege’s work made a turn to philosophy of language inevitable, it is to his later writings that he turns for evidence of Frege’s contributions to philosophy of language.

ii. Frege and the Origins of Semantics

Dummett describes Frege as a realist in virtue of his semantic theory. Frege never explicitly described himself as a realist, and never explicitly stated that he was advancing a semantic theory. Dummett’s interpretation provides a framework for evaluating the views that Frege did explicitly advance. To understand Dummett’s interpretation of Frege, it will be useful to see how this interpretation can be used to make sense of the views advanced in Frege’s most influential paper, “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” (Frege, 1892). The translation of Bedeutung has been a controversial question; a guide is given in Beaney’s preface to (Frege, 1997, 36-46). Dummett’s preferred translation is “reference” (Dummett, 1981a, 84), so that the title of the article would be “On Sense and Reference”. The standard English translations (Frege, 1980b, 56-79 and Frege, 1997, 151-172) both include page references to the original text of 1892.

Frege introduces the distinction between sense and reference by the example of proper names. It is frequently informative to be told that two names stand for the same object: it was, for example, a significant discovery that the evening star is the morning star. In such a case, Frege says that we are discovering that two names that have a different sense have the same reference. They have the same reference because they stand for the same object, they have a different sense because, in each case, the object is presented in a different way (Frege, 1892, 26). Frege then asserts that, in indirect speech, rather than using a name to speak of the object referred to, as is usual, we speak about the sense. If “the morning star” and “the evening star” really do designate one and the same object, then any true statement that includes the phrase “the morning star” can be converted into a true statement in which the phrase “the evening star” is substituted for “the morning star” throughout. An obvious exception to this rule would be a statement such as “Before it was discovered by the Babylonians that the morning star is the evening star, people did not believe the evening star was visible in the morning” (Frege, 1892, 28). Frege’s claim is that the sense is that which is understood by users of a word. When we talk about pre-Babylonian astronomical beliefs, what is relevant to the truth of what we say is the understanding people then had of “the morning star”, and not, as is more usual, the morning star itself.

Frege is very clear that the sense of a word is something objective: two people grasp one and the same sense of a word, just as two people may view the moon through one and the same telescope (Frege, 1892, 31). Frege then introduces a new piece of terminology: a name designates its reference, but expresses its sense (Frege, 1892, 32).

Having introduced the distinction between sense and reference, Frege then asks whether a sentence has a reference (Frege, 1892, 32). He starts by asserting that a sentence expresses a thought. This implies, of course, that a thought is the sense of a sentence, because what is expressed is a sense. He also observes that when we alter the sense of any part of a sentence, the sense of the whole sentence is altered (Frege, 1892, 32). So, just as two people can both grasp the sense of a particular name, they can also grasp the sense of a particular sentence: that is, different people can think the very same thought. Now that it is established that a sentence has a sense, and that the sense of the sentence depends upon the sense of the parts of the sentence, Frege argues that if the sentence has a reference, this too would depend on the reference of the parts. If a proper name lacks a bearer, then it will not have a reference, and one would expect that a sentence that contains a name without a bearer would lack a reference. Frege considers an example of a sentence that contains a name without a bearer, a sentence from The Odyssey about Odysseus—Frege is supposing that there is no such person as Odysseus. Frege asserts that such a sentence fails to be true or false: what the sentence lacks is a truth-value (Frege, 1892, 33). This leads Frege to conclude that the reference of a sentence is its truth-value: he states that the True and the False are objects, and truth-values, and that all sentences either name one of these two objects, or else they are names that fail to name anything (Frege, 1892, 34).

Frege then finds further support for this conclusion. He has already stated that if two names stand for the same object, one name may be substituted for the other without changing the truth of what is said, unless, as in indirect speech, we are using a name to designate the sense that that name usually bears. Frege claims that the same applies to sentences. When one sentence contains another as its part, the truth-value of the larger sentence is unchanged when the sentence that forms a part is replaced by another sentence that bears the same truth-value, unless we are dealing with indirect speech (Frege, 1892, 36). Frege proceeds to defend this claim in the rest of the article, analyzing particular cases.

Dummett holds that there are two guiding principles that we need in order to understand Frege’s work on sense and reference. The first is that Frege is offering a semantic theory, in which the reference of an expression is its semantic value, the second is that to understand the relationship between a word and its referent, we must take as a model the relationship between a name and its bearer (Dummett, 1981a, 190).

A semantic theory explains how the truth-value of a sentence is determined by its parts. In a semantic theory, every simple expression is assigned a semantic value, and the semantic value of a complex expression is determined by the semantic value of the simple expressions from which it is composed. The truth-value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts.

Consider, for example, the expressions “George Lucas”, “Gottlob Frege”, “contributed to mathematical logic”, and “directed a famous film”. The sentence “Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic” is true, but the sentence “George Lucas contributed to mathematical logic” is not true. This is because “Gottlob Frege” and “George Lucas” each have a different semantic value, or, in plain English, “Gottlob Frege” and “George Lucas” are not two different names for the same person (and George Lucas made no independent contribution to mathematical logic). Similarly, from the fact that “Gottlob Frege contributed to mathematical logic” is true, but “Gottlob Frege directed a famous film” is not true, we can conclude that “… directed a famous film” and “… contributed to mathematical logic” do not share the same semantic value.

Semantic theories have a role in the justification of systems of formal logic. Dummett holds that Frege used his work on sense and reference to justify his formal system in exactly the way that logicians today use what is explicitly described as a semantic explanation. Indeed, Dummett sees Frege’s work as providing the foundations for all current work in semantics of natural language (Dummett, 1981a, 81-83).

Dummett does not just claim that Frege had a semantic theory; he claims that he had a realist semantic theory. The semantic theory is realist because the prototype of a term’s semantic value is the object designated by a name: a term’s having a semantic value is equated with its picking out non-linguistic reality, and the failure to pick out non-linguistic reality would result in a failure to have a semantic value (Dummett, Frege: Philosophy of Language, 1981a, 404). From Frege’s perspective, if an expression lacks a semantic value, then that really is a failure: a semantic value is something that no expression should be without. If a (declarative) sentence lacks a truth-value, that is because something has gone wrong: all (declarative) sentences should be either true or false, because their components should all denote bits of reality.

iii. Frege’s Unfinished Business

Dummett holds that it was an important turning point when Frege described a sentence as a proper name for a truth-value. He thinks that, at this point, Frege lost sight of an important insight embodied in the context principle: the importance of the sentence as the smallest unit of language that can be used to say something. Once a sentence is treated as just a proper name, and a truth-value as just another object, there is no acknowledgement that there is something special about the role of a sentence in language (Dummett, 1981a, 195-196).

Dummett is also unsatisfied by Frege’s account of sense. We have seen that, for Frege, several people may grasp the sense of one word or of one thought, and that just as the sense of a name denotes an object, the sense of a thought denotes a truth-value. But what is involved in grasping a sense?

Frege’s answer is that senses are neither part of the world of spatio-temporal objects, nor do they exist inside the minds of individuals. They belong to a “third realm”, a timeless world, to which all of us have access. Dummett is far from endorsing the suggestion that thoughts occupy a third realm beyond time and space. He describes this doctrine as a piece of “ontological mythology”, the term “mythology” here being used in a purely pejorative sense (Dummett, 1993a, 25). Dummett thinks that these two loose ends should be tied together. Rather than being content to describe the act of understanding as involving a mysterious connection between our minds and timeless entities known as senses, we should focus on the practice of using sentences in a language. This, in turn requires us to think about the purpose of classifying sentences as true or false, and that requires that we think about the purposes for which we use a language (Dummett, 1981a, 413). The result of this process might be to vindicate Frege’s semantics, or it might vindicate the intuitionist position. Dummett’s most influential contribution to philosophy can be understood as an attempt to resolve this unfinished business.

3. Dummett on Realism and Anti-Realism

Along with his historical work, Dummett is known for his on-going work on a grand metaphysical project. The aim of this project is to find a means of resolving a number of debates, each of which has a common form but a different subject matter. In each debate, there is a realist, and an anti-realist, and they differ concerning which logical principles they apply to statements of the type that are under dispute—as it may be, statements of arithmetic, statements about the past, about the future, about the physical world, about possible worlds, and so forth. To decide in favor of anti-realism in one instance does not mean that one must always decide in favor of anti-realism, and the same is true for realism.

Some of Dummett’s papers deal with arguments that are quite specific to one particular debate—for example, he discusses the charge that anti-realism about the past is ultimately self-defeating, since what is now the present will be the past (Dummett, “The Reality of the Past”, in his 1978), and he has advanced an argument about the nature of names for non-existent natural-kinds that is intended to undercut David Lewis’s argument for the thesis that all possible worlds are real (Dummett, “Could There Be Unicorns?” in his 1993b). However, he is best known for advancing a generic line of argument that the anti-realist in any particular debate could appeal to. That does not mean that he thinks that the anti-realist will always be successful. In his valedictory lecture as Wykeham Professor of Logic, he stated:

I saw the matter, rather, as the posing of a question how far, and in what contexts, a certain generic line of argument could be pushed, where the answers ‘No distance at all’ and ‘In no context at all’ could not be credibly entertained, and the answers ‘To the bitter end’ and ‘In all conceivable contexts’ were almost as unlikely to be right. (Dummett, 1993b, 464)

The difference between the realist and the anti-realist, in each case, concerns the correct logical laws, because, for reasons explained in section 2.2, Dummett thinks that metaphysical debates are properly understood as debates about logical laws. Dummett’s most complete statement of the nature of such metaphysical debates, and the means by which they can be resolved was The Logical Basis of Metaphysics (Dummett, 1991b).

a. Justifying Logical Laws by a Semantic Theory

According to Dummett, to find out how to resolve metaphysical disputes, we must find out how to justify a logic—that is, a set of principles of inference. Logic is the study of validity—an inference is valid if, and only if, the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. The logician wants to be able to recognize such truth-preserving inferences by their structure. More precision can be achieved by presenting inferences in a formal system (Dummett, 1991b, 185), and precision comes to be of vital importance when we are trying to choose between rival logical systems.

The logician wants to be able to recognize, from the structure of one set of sentences, that the members of another set of sentences are true. One method of validating rules of inference is by means of a semantic theory. In such a theory, every expression is assigned a semantic value, and an account is offered of how the semantic value of a complex expression is based upon the semantic value of its components. The aim of the semantic theory is to explain how the parts of a sentence determine the truth-value of that sentence (Dummett, 1991b, 23-25), as was explained above.

At this point, it may be helpful to focus upon a particular inference and a particular semantic theory. Suppose that we assign the following semantic values to symbols in the following way. P and Q stand for atomic sentences, which have either the value true, or the value false, and never both values. The symbol “~” when followed by a symbol which stands for an atomic sentence has the opposite value of the value of that atomic sentence. The symbol “(x v y)”, where x and y are replaced by symbols which stand for atomic sentences has the value true when at least one of those atomic sentences has the value true. Otherwise, it has the value false. Next, we consider the following argument:

(1) (P v Q)
(2) ~Q
Therefore P.

To validate this inference, we must show that if (1) and (2) are true, then the conclusion, P, must also be true. If (2) is true, then Q is false. If Q is false, then if (1) is true, it must be in virtue of the truth of P, since if both P and Q were false, (1) could not be true. So we must suppose that P is true, and that is what we were trying to demonstrate.

In this case, the semantic theory used incorporated the principle of bivalence: every sentence was assigned either the value true or the value false. For reasons explained in sections 2.2 and 2.3.2, Dummett considers this to be characteristic of realist semantics. There is no one simple alternative to the principle of bivalence. One could depart from bivalence in virtue of having more than two truth-values, or in virtue of admitting that there are sentences without a truth-value, or in virtue of believing that we have no guarantee that all sentences will have one of the two values true or false. Just as there are many alternatives to bivalence, there are many alternatives to classical logic. Although Dummett’s work on deduction has its roots in the debate over intuitionism, it does not necessarily follow that, in every case, the alternative logic advocated by a Dummett-style anti-realist would be intuitionistic logic. The correct logical principles should become clear once the correct semantic theory is established.

Of course, in this case, it probably was not necessary to offer a semantic theory in order to convince the reader of the validity of the inference. Indeed, the astute reader might well wonder whether such a procedure can serve to justify a logical law at all. Did we not invoke logical laws when explaining how the inference under discussion was justified?

The answer is that we did—but this need not render the justification circular. Dummett is clear that he is not trying to show how deductive practices could be justified to someone who is completely skeptical about the possibility of deduction; rather, he is considering how we might decide whether a particular rule of inference, which is accepted by some logicians but not by others, is justifiable. As long as no logical law that is under dispute is used in the semantic theory, it will be possible to offer a justification that does not beg the question. It is important to note that the set of logical laws that are used in the semantic theory need not be co-extensive with the set of logical laws that are justified thereby (Dummett, 1991b, 204).

b. The Role of Proof-Theoretic Justification

Dummett devotes considerable attention to establishing a procedure that can be used to show that a law is beyond dispute, a procedure that he terms “third-grade proof-theoretic justification.” These are the logical laws that can be used in the semantic theory without fear of controversy. It is not possible to explain the procedure in full here, only to outline the basic principles on which the procedure is based.

As we have seen, logic deals with our ability to recognize that one set of sentences implies that all the members of some other set of sentences are true, in virtue of the structure of the sentences. The task of a system of formal logic is to display the structure, or form, in virtue of which such inferences are possible. Within such a system, the principal operator in a sentence indicates which other sentences may be derived from that sentence, possibly in conjunction with other sentences. For example, the symbol “&” may be used to indicate conjunction: if it is true to assert P & Q, then we know that it is true to assert P and true to assert Q. When we derive, for example, P from P & Q, we are said to be applying an elimination rule for “&”: a rule which states how to derive from a sentence which contains “&” a sentence which does not contain “&”. As well as elimination rules, a logical constant also has introduction rules. We apply an introduction rule for “&” if, having derived P from one formula, and Q from another, we then assert P & Q.

Let us assume (and this assumption is not trivial), that, whenever we assert a sentence containing “&”, that sentence could have been derived by means of the introduction rule. Given the set of introduction and elimination rules for “&”, along with our assumption, it will be clear that, if we add the constant “&” to a language, the only sentences that we can now assert, although we were not entitled to assert them before, are sentences which contain “&”. When we derive some new sentence from a sentence containing “&”, by applying the elimination rule, the final sentence will be one that we could have asserted anyway. In technical terms, this means that if we extend the language by adding the term “&”, we have only a conservative extension. Dummett is in agreement with Belnap’s thesis is that if we can show, for some rule, that adding this rule to a language involves only a conservative extension, then we have a reason for supposing that the addition of this rule has been justified (Dummett, 1991b, 217-220).

The assumption that, when we have a sentence containing a logical constant, that sentence could have been derived using the introduction rule for the constant, is referred to by Dummett as “the fundamental assumption”. It is necessary to consider, for each logical constant whose introduction and elimination rules we wish to justify, whether the fundamental assumption is correct for it. Consider, for example, disjunction, “v“—that is, the logical constant which is more or less equivalent in meaning to “or”. The standard introduction rule for disjunction is that, if one can assert P, one can assert “P v Q”, and if one can assert Q, then one can assert “P v Q”. To decide whether the fundamental assumption is true in this case, it is necessary to consider whether, if I see a child running across the street and say “A boy or a girl is running across the street,” it is always true that I could have looked more closely, and been in a position to say either “A boy is running across the street,” or “A girl is running across the street.” It is a difficult task to spell out the precise content of “could have”, and thus a difficult task to determine whether the fundamental assumption should be accepted for each constant (Dummett, 1991b, 270).

Even if we accept the fundamental assumption, not every alleged logical rule involves making merely a conservative extension to the language. Suppose we know that “If P, then Q” is true and also “If not-P, then Q”, and from this, we derive “Q”. Here, we are applying an elimination rule that does not involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it could be that the truth of “Q” was not used in deriving either of the two conditional statements.

The technical apparatus for examining whether adding some constant to the language involves a conservative or non-conservative extension is known as “proof-theory”. It was pioneered by Gerhard Gentzen. Dummett’s third-grade proof theoretic justification builds on the work of Dag Prawitz. Dummett’s requirements are, in fact, more stringent than that adding an operator to a language involve a merely conservative extension of the language, because it is necessary to take into account that two or more operators each of which, taken on its own, involves a conservative extension might, taken together, involve a non-conservative extension, (Dummett, 1991b, 286-290), but we cannot discuss all those details fully here.

It must be remembered that Dummett is not arguing that we should accept only those logical laws which can be justified by these means—rather, he is suggesting that these logical laws are the ones which can be taken for granted when trying to justify more controversial principles. Logical constants that are justified by third-grade proof-theoretic justification are above reproach. Other logical constants may be justified, if at all, by a semantic theory. Proof-theoretic justification is not sufficient to settle disputes about logical laws: it is a useful means of showing that an inference is valid, but it is less useful as a test for invalidity. The set of logical laws that are justified by a semantic theory need not be the same as the set of logical laws that are appealed to in explaining that theory (Dummett, 1991b, 301).

So, we settle a debate about a logical law by offering a semantic theory—but that just pushes the problem back one stage further; we must still consider how to settle debates about rival semantic theories. Dummett’s answer is that just as a logic may be justified by a semantic theory, a semantic theory may, in turn be justified by being made the basis of a meaning-theory.

c. Justifying a Semantic Theory by Means of a Meaning-Theory

A meaning-theory is an explanation of the skill that anyone who understands a language has. As language-users, we are faced, continually, with sentences that we have never before encountered. It seems that there must be some set of rules of which we have implicit knowledge, which enable us to deduce the meaning of new sentences. Dummett is by no means alone in seeking for such a theory: in particular, there is a certain amount of overlap between Dummett’s thinking and that of Donald Davidson, although it would be well beyond the scope of this article to examine the similarities and differences between these two thinkers in detail.

One suggestion, which Davidson has advocated strongly, is that a meaning-theory would specify a set of rules from which we could derive, for any sentence, a knowledge of the conditions under which that sentence is true. The suggestion is that, if you know of some sentence of a foreign language that the sentence is true if the cat is on the mat, and false if the cat is not on the mat, then you know that the sentence in question means “The cat is on the mat.”

Dummett endorses the proposal that this is the best suggestion currently on offer for constructing a meaning-theory (Dummett, 1991b, 164), and notes that such a theory must be built on foundations laid by Frege. However, he distinguishes between a strong and a weak sense in which truth can be the central notion of a meaning-theory. In the strong sense, meaning is to be explained in terms of truth-conditions, as above, and it is simply taken for granted that we know what truth is. If truth is central to the meaning-theory only in the weak sense, then although knowledge of the meaning of a sentence is equated with knowledge of its truth-conditions, some further explanation is offered of what it is for a sentence to be true (Dummett, 1991b 113, 161-163). For example, an intuitionist would say that to understand some mathematical formula, it is necessary to be able to distinguish between those mathematical constructions which do and those which do not constitute proofs of the formula in question: truth is here being explained in terms of provability. If truth is central to the meaning-theory in the strong sense, however, grasp of truth-conditions is not explained in terms of any more fundamental notion: we are just told that to understand the meaning is to understand the truth-conditions, it being assumed that, for every sentence, there is something which renders it either true or false.

The connection between a semantic theory and a meaning-theory should now be apparent. Both the realist and the anti-realist offer semantic theories that explain how the semantic value of a sentence is determined by the semantic value of its parts. A meaning-theory of the type favored by Dummett will explain how, when we see what words are used in a sentence and the order in which they are put together, we are enabled to understand the truth-conditions for that sentence. The realist, adhering to the principle of bivalence, supposes that all the sentences will be determinately true or false. The anti-realist, on the other hand, can bring other notions into play to explain what it is for a sentence to be true.

So, the logic is justified by a semantics; the semantics is justified by a meaning-theory. How is the meaning-theory to be justified? A meaning-theory is judged to be successful according to whether it provides us with a satisfactory explanation of what it is to understand a language. It is important to note that Dummett requires that the meaning-theory provide us with a genuine explanation of what understanding is. He points out that while it is, no doubt, correct to say that someone understands the meaning of “Davidson has a toothache” if, and only if, they know that an utterance of this sentence is true if, and only if, Davidson has a toothache, this account fails to provide us with a non-circular explanation of what it is to understand the utterance. We want to be told exactly what it is to know that such an utterance is true. Meaning-theories of this type are classified by Dummett as “modest”, and he urges other philosophers to set about the harder task of providing more ambitious meaning-theories, meaning-theories that are, in his terminology, “full-blooded.” A full-blooded theory offers an explanation of understanding, which does not rely on a prior grasp of concepts such as “understanding”, or “knowing the truth-conditions” (Dummett, 1991b, 113, 136).

d. Justificationist Semantics

We are now in a position to consider the “generic line of argument” that Dummett considers can be advanced by the anti-realist. This argument makes use of the Wittgensteinian principle that meaning is use. Dummett takes this to mean that there can be no element in linguistic understanding that is not manifested in the way a word is used in practice. When we recognize that a sentence is true, we are manifesting that we have a certain ability—the ability to recognize that the sentence has been verified. The same holds when we recognize that a sentence has been decisively refuted. According to an anti-realist meaning-theory ( in which justification is central), the ability to recognize when a sentence has been decisively confirmed or refuted is constitutive of knowing the meaning. (Dummett terms this a justificationist semantics). According to the realist, knowledge of how a sentence may be confirmed or refuted is answerable to a prior knowledge of the meaning.

Dummett is aware that the realist suggestion is far more intuitively compelling. However, he argues that it may yet prove to be mistaken. He offers several arguments, of which I will summaries one. Suppose that realism is correct. In that case, our ability to agree about what things are yellow is dependent upon our shared understanding of what makes it true that something is yellow. It would therefore be possible that, tomorrow, everything which is yellow becomes orange and vice versa, and that, at the same time, we all undergo a collective psychological change, so that things which are really yellow now appear to us to be orange, and vice versa. In other words, a major change would have taken place in reality, and yet none of us would notice it. Given that we had not altered the truth-conditions of sentences involving “yellow” and “orange”, we would now be making many false utterances using these words. Yet this widespread falsity would pass entirely unnoticed; indeed, it would be entirely inconsequential. Our assertions would be fulfilling perfectly every purpose that they have, and yet would be false. If we admit this possibility, it seems incorrect to say, as Dummett thinks we should, that truth is the goal of our assertions. Truth and falsity would have lost their connection with practice.

Alternatively, one might argue that we would still be making true statements using “yellow” and “orange”, but that the meanings of the words “yellow” and “orange” would have been altered. In that case, meaning has been altered, even though there is no observable difference in the practice, and so meaning has lost its connection with practice.

For the anti-realist, this possibility cannot arise, because there is no gap between what makes an assertion correct, and the most direct means that we have of checking that assertion. Dummett does allow that there will be indirect means of confirming a sentence, that is, methods for showing that, had we applied our most direct, or canonical method of verification, it would have been successful (Dummett, 1991b, 313-314).

It is by this type of argument that Dummett hopes to persuade us to rethink our attachment to realism. Of course, he does not think that we will know whether to be a realist or an anti-realist about a specific subject matter until we have a well-worked out meaning-theory. He does not assert that in all cases the correct meaning-theory will be an anti-realist one. Indeed, he has also offered reasons for supposing that “global anti-realism”—the thesis that anti-realism is always correct—is untenable (for example, Dummett, 1978, 367). Dummett’s anti-realism was first formulated as a thesis about arithmetic, and, as he points out, applying it to empirical discourse is not a straightforward matter:

The fundamental difference between the two lies in the fact that, whereas a means of deciding a range of mathematical statements or any other effective mathematical procedure, if available at all, is permanently available, the opportunity to decide whether or not an empirical statement holds good may be lost: what can be effectively decidable now will no longer be effectively decidable next year, nor, perhaps, next week. (Dummett, 2004, 42)

The most extreme form of anti-realism would be the theory that a statement about the past is rendered true or false only by evidence available to the speaker at the time of asserting it. This would imply that if the only evidence for the occurrence of an event is that some individual remembers it, and that individual takes the memory to their grave, then when the witness dies it ceases to be true that the event took place. However, it is basic to Dummett’s whole approach that meaning is determined by how a community uses the language; an individual acting alone cannot confer a meaning. Justification is therefore a collective enterprise; what matters is not whether I can verify a statement, but whether we can verify it, where ‘we’ are a community that includes people who are now dead. Dummett therefore rejects this most extreme form of anti-realism about the past as being too solipsistic. (Dummett, 2004, 67-68)
For this reason, Dummett accepts that some concession must be made to realism when it comes to dealing with statements about the past. He has made different suggestions about how much should be conceded: in his Gifford lectures, he argued that a proposition is true if and only if we are or were in a position to establish its truth, in the Dewey lectures that a proposition is true if and only if someone suitably placed would have been able to do so. The latter implies that statements concerning times before any human being existed have a determinate truth-value on the grounds that, if someone had existed then, they would have been able to confirm or deny such statements. (Dummett, 2006, vii-viii) These two lecture series offer quite different views about the nature of time.

It should be noted that the philosophical motivation for making a concession to realism is the attempt to do justice to the manner in which statements about the past are justified. Dummett’s justificationist approach to semantics does not imply a dogmatic insistence on anti-realism. Rather, he advocates a method for spelling out what it is to grasp truth-conditions by focusing on the way in which that grasp of truth-conditions is manifested. His central objection to truth-conditional semantics is that their advocates presuppose that we know what it is for something to be true, yet they never explain what constitutes such knowledge. This he regards as an act of faith that stands in need of a rational foundation. (Dummett, 2006, 55) Whatever concessions the justificationist may make to the realist, this central principle is not compromised.

e. God

In his Gifford Lectures, Dummett presents an argument for the existence of God that depends on his justificationist semantics. According to justificationist semantics, any account of the way the world is must be an account of the way the world is perceived by someone. We know that different animals perceive the world in different ways, and we aspire to break out of the limitations of merely human perception, and perceive the world as it is in itself—the single reality that underlies the very different perceptions that constitute the world of dogs and the world of humans.

By means of science, we have made some progress towards understanding the world as it is in itself—we can point to ways in which scientific descriptions of the world are improvements on the description based on our bare perceptions, so our aspiration to know the world as it is in itself cannot be dismissed as an incoherent longing. But insofar as this aspiration is coherent, “in itself” cannot mean “without reference to the perceptions of any being.”

We might be led to suppose that perceptions had been successfully eliminated from our account of how the world is if we focus on abstract mathematical models used by scientists, but this is an error. Abstract mathematical models are a necessary part of science, but many such structures exist as models for mathematicians to study. We must be saying something further when we say of one such structure that it is not merely an object of mathematical study, but a true description of the way the world is. This ‘something further’ would include an explanation of how to apply the favored mathematical description, and that would mean matching the abstract mathematical description to perceptions.

Dummett concludes that the single world that underlies the different perceptions of humans and other species can only be understood as being the world as apprehended by a being whose knowledge constitutes the way things are—in other words, the world as apprehended by God. (Dummett, 2006, 103) Dummett thinks that this demonstrates that there exists a Creator who controls and sustains the universe, but he concedes that it is hard to reconcile Biblical statements about God’s goodness with the presence of evil in the world. (Dummett, 2006, 106)

4. On Immigration

Dummett’s work against racism was not motivated by philosophy, but it did result in his publishing a work of moral and political philosophy in 2001. The book, On Immigration and Refugees is aimed at a wide audience. In the first half, Dummett argues for a set of general principles concerning rights of immigrants and refugees. In the second half, he examines the recent history of the United Kingdom (with some discussion of other nations), analyzing the reasons why successive governments have failed to live up to the moral standards defended in the first part of the book.

Dummett’s starting point is that everyone is under an obligation to behave justly in the sense of giving people what they are due, which includes the necessities for living a fully human life. He argues that political philosophy has usually focused on the duties that a state has to its citizens, overlooking the fact that a state also represents its citizens to the outside world. Forming a corporation of any kind does not remove normal human obligations, or grant any right to be selfish, so it is immoral to congratulate politicians for upholding the interests of their own citizens at the expense of giving others what is due to them. One basic human right is to be a “first-class citizen” of some state, that is, a citizen of a state whose values one shares and where one does not face unjust persecution.

Starting from these premises, Dummett argued that there should be a presumption in favor of the right to migrate. The state has a right to refuse entry to criminals, or to halt mass immigration to prevent over-population or the submergence of its culture and language. He emphasized that in practice these conditions are rarely met, and argued that although British colonial authorities encouraged immigration policies that submerged the native population in Fiji and Malaya, the claim that British culture is being “swamped” by immigrants is merely a cover for racism. He also argued that those who are stateless have the right to become citizens of another state. Dummett recommended the creation of a commission run by the United Nations to handle such cases.

5. Dummett’s Influence

A few philosophers, notably Crispin Wright (Wright, 1983) and Neil Tennant (Tennant, 1987, 1997), have attempted to extend the project of providing anti-realist semantics for empirical language. More commonly, philosophers have reacted to Dummett’s work by attempting to demonstrate that his anti-realist arguments are not successful. Even if they are not, it may yet be that he has provided the correct account of what is at stake in metaphysical disputes concerning realism, and the correct account of the proper framework for resolving disputes about fundamental logical laws. Of course, not all philosophers who have considered the matter are agreed even upon that. How often do philosophers agree about anything?

This lack of agreement may not be surprising, but one of Dummett’s early ambitions was to show how philosophers could achieve agreement. His claim was that, once the contributions of Frege are fully appreciated, it would be possible to formulate a method for achieving generally agreed resolutions to problems concerning theories of meaning, and that such work should be viewed as providing the foundations for all future work in philosophy.

He himself pointed out that the similar claims have been made for the work of Husserl, Kant, Spinoza and Descartes, to name but a few, and that, in each case, such claims proved false:

[B]y far the safest bet would be that I am suffering from a similar illusion in making this claim about Frege. To this, I can offer only the banal reply which any prophet has to make to any sceptic: time will tell. (Dummett, 1978, 458)

It may be too early to judge, but so far the passage of time has favored the skeptics rather than the prophet; there does not seem to be a general consensus about how to resolve disputes in philosophy of language, even among analytical philosophers. However, one does not have to agree with Dummett to appreciate that his work is important. His historical work has been devoted towards formulating the basic premises that underlie much contemporary philosophy, including his own. In so doing, he has provided a useful service for critics; those who find themselves out of sympathy with analytical philosophy at least know where to direct their attacks. One does not have to find Dummett’s challenge to classical logic successful to accept that it is worth taking seriously.

It is widely acknowledged that Dummett’s work is not easy to read. His work has been influential despite this. Indeed, his influence may be attributed, in part, to some of those factors that make his work hard to read, such as his refusal to accept superficial solutions, and his skill in unearthing hidden complexities. These features make for work that is daunting to beginners, but rewarding for experts. To read Dummett’s work is to be reminded continuously that anyone who is serious about wanting to discover the answers to deep philosophical questions must be prepared to work very hard. That is a lesson well worth learning.

6. References and Further Reading

Works by Dummett in English

  • (Co-edited with John Crossley): Formal Systems and Recursive Functions: Proceedings of the Eighth Logic Colloquium, Oxford 1963 (Amsterdam: North-Holland, 1965)
  • Frege: Philosophy of Language (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1st ed. 1973; 2nd ed. 1981a)
  • Elements of Intuitionism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1st ed. 1977; 2nd ed. 2000)
  • Truth and Other Enigmas (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1978)
  • Catholicism and the World Order: Some Reflections on the 1978 Reith Lectures (London: Catholic Institute for International Relations, 1979)
  • (with Sylvia Mann): The Game of Tarot: from Ferrara to Salt Lake City (London: Duckworth, 1980)
  • Twelve Tarot Games (London: Duckworth, 1980)
  • Immigration: Where the Debate Goes Wrong (2nd ed, London, 1981)
  • The Interpretation of Frege’s Philosophy (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1981b)
  • Voting Procedures (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1984)
  • The Visconti-Sforza Tarot Cards (New York: George Braziller, 1986)
  • Frege and Other Philosophers (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991)
  • Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1991a)
  • The Logical Basis of Metaphysics (London: Duckworth, and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1991b)
  • Grammar and Style for Examination Candidates and Others (London: Duckworth, 1993)
  • Origins of Analytical Philosophy (London: Duckworth and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1993a)
  • The Seas of Language (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993b)
  • (with Ronald Decker and Thierry Depaulis): A Wicked Pack of Cards (London: Duckworth, 1996)
  • Principles of Electoral Reform (Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1997)
  • Grammar and Style for Examination Candidates and Others (London: Duckworth, 1993)
  • Origins of Analytical Philosophy (London: Duckworth and Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1993a)
  • The Seas of Language (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993b)
  • (with Ronald Decker and Thierry Depaulis): A Wicked Pack of Cards (London: Duckworth, 1996)
  • Principles of Electoral Reform (Oxford University Press, Oxford: 1997)
  • On Immigration and Refugees (London: Taylor and Francis, 2001)
  • Truth and the Past (New York: Columbia University Press, 2004)
  • Thought and Reality (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006)

A complete bibliography of Dummett’s writings may be found in Randall E. Auxier and Lewis Edwin Hahn (eds.) The Philosophy of Michael Dummett: The Library of Living Philosophers, Volume XXXI (Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 2007)

Books about Dummett

  • Barry Taylor (ed.) Michael Dummett, Contributions to Philosophy (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1987)
  • B. McGuinnes and G. Oliveri (eds.) The Philosophy of Michael Dummett (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994)
  • Richard Heck (ed.) Language, Thought and Truth (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998)
  • Johannes L. Brandl and Peter Sullivan (eds.) New Essays on the Philosophy of Michael Dummett (Amsterdam: Rodolpi, 1998)
  • Darryl Gunson, Michael Dummett and the Theory of Meaning (Aldershot: Ashgate, 1998)
  • Karen Green, Dummett: Philosophy of Language (Oxford: Blackwell, 2001)
  • Bernhard Weiss, Michael Dummett: Philosophy Now (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2002)

Other Works Cited

  • L. E. J. Brouwer, ‘Intuitionism and Formalism’, in P. Benacerraf and H. Putnam (eds.) Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd ed. 1983)
  • Gottlob Frege, “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 1892.
  • Gottlob Frege, (trans. J. L. Austin) The Foundations of Arithmetic (Oxford: Blackwell, 1950, 1953, 1980a)
  • Gottlob Frege, (ed. Peter Geach and Max Black), Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege (Oxford: Blackwell, 1952, 1960, 3rd ed. 1980b)
  • Gottlob Frege, (trans. and ed. M. Beaney), The Frege Reader (Oxford: Blackwell, 1997)
  • Neil Tennant, Anti-Realism and Logic (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987)
  • Neil Tennant, The Taming of the True (Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1997)
  • Ludwig Wittgenstein, (ed. G. E. M. Anscombe and G. H. von Wright; trans. G. E. M. Anscombe), Zettel (Oxford: Blackwell, 1967)
  • Crispin Wright, Realism, Meaning and Truth (Oxford: Blackwell, 1987, 2nd ed. 1993)

Author Information

Benjamin Murphy
Florida State University, Panama City
U. S. A.

Juan Donoso Cortés (1809—1853)

CortesJDJuan Donoso Cortés, parliamentary statesman, diplomat, government minister, royal counselor, theologian, and political theorist, may not be well known among modern political philosophers. However, his ideas had an enormous influence in the spheres of politics and religion in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Donoso’s theories were uniquely influential in shaping the ideological trajectory that began with the reaction against the Enlightenment and the French Revolution in the eighteenth century and culminated in the rise of fascism in the twentieth century. This Spanish Catholic and conservative thinker was the philosophical heir of Joseph de Maistre, one of the most prominent reactionary conservative thinkers of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Even though his life was short and his works few in number, Donoso’s contribution to modern political philosophy and theology cannot be ignored if we wish to have a more complete understanding of the ideas and actions that have shaped Europe and the Roman Church in recent centuries. His most notable idea—the theory on dictatorship—was Donoso’s most significant and unique contribution to modern political thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Philosophical Development and Context
  2. View of Human Nature
  3. Theory of Dictatorship
    1. Religious Dictatorship
    2. Political Dictatorship
  4. Views on Violence
  5. Views on History
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Philosophical Development and Context

In the early years of his life, Donoso’s thinking was deeply influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment. His education was thoroughly grounded in the study of such Enlightenment thinkers as Rousseau, Montesquieu, Voltaire, and Diderot. It was only in the last years of his life that Donoso distinguished himself as a standard bearer of an ideological camp that stood in complete opposition to the philosophes. By the year 1848 Donoso was firmly in the camp of such contre-philosophes as Joseph de Maistre and Louis de Bonald.

Until the European revolution of 1848, the primary concern of reactionary conservative thinkers was the restoration of the pre-1789 monarchical ancien régime. The authority and hierarchical order that were the centerpieces of conservative thought, were seen only in the context of restoring and preserving a monarchical régime. The revolution of 1848 exposed the inability of many of the European monarchies to maintain authority and hierarchical order. Donoso was one of the first and most vociferous of conservative thinkers to acknowledge this. While like de Maistre he was something of a romantic medievalist who advocated a hierarchical social order, with the Pope of Rome at the head of that order wielding absolute spiritual and temporal power while all other temporal and ecclesiastical authorities ruled as his deputies, he was also a realist who could strategically adapt his ideology to contemporary exigencies. He was the first conservative thinker to develop an alternative theory that posited a different model of régime calculated to achieve the restoration and maintenance of the authority and hierarchical order that all conservatives saw as the foundation of civilization. This was his theory on dictatorship. Even though Donoso was always an ardent monarchist, like his precursor de Maistre, he was also enough of a political realist to know that the ultimate goal of a stable social order based on obedience to infallible authority and adherence to a rigid hierarchy of rank and privilege could be achieved by other means, if necessary. If monarchies were too feeble to maintain such a social order, then other forms of government, more harsh in nature, need to be instituted in order to subjugate human beings.

2. View of Human Nature

Like de Maistre, Donoso viewed human beings as essentially and naturally depraved and irrational. To Donoso, human beings are so irredeemably corrupt in moral capacity and intellectually drawn to absurdity that they must be ruled with an iron fist. All social and religious order depends upon the will of those who rule to demand and impose obedience to their dictates and belief in their teachings as well as upon the willingness of subjects to obey and believe their rulers, both secular and religious. Civilization, according to Donoso, can only be preserved through the imposition and acceptance of political and religious commands and dogmas. These commands and dogmas are the repressive mechanisms Donoso held as essential to the survival and preservation of civilization, especially that mode of civilization which Donoso called “Catholic.” Repression, said Donoso, is one of the most essential elements of civilization. For Donoso, no amount of free and open discussion could ever arrive at any modicum of truth. He saw truth as revealed by God and mediated through God’s chosen instrument, the Catholic Church and it’s Supreme Pontiff. Discussion only opens the door to doubt, confusion, and discord thus preparing the ground for socialism. Discussion, which Donoso held as the cornerstone of liberalism, creates a belief vacuum that can only be filled by Christ or Antichrist, by Catholicism or socialism. In a begrudging sort of way, Donoso respected socialism more than liberalism because he saw the former as more akin to Catholicism, as something offering human beings a set of dogmatic beliefs. Liberalism can only offer doubt and uncertainty.

3. Theory of Dictatorship

In his Speech on Dictatorship, Donoso described two different types of repression which he saw as necessary for the survival and maintenance of civilization—political and religious. These two forms of repression must exist in an equilibrium in order to be effective. With a decline in religious repression must come a corresponding and proportional rise in political repression, and vice versa. As the “thermometer” of religious repression falls, the “thermometer” of political repression must rise; and as the “thermometer” of political repression falls, so the “thermometer” of religious repression must rise. All political and religious régimes must be repressive if political and religious order are to endure. Donoso emphasized that the legitimacy of a régime is not based upon heredity, but upon the capacity of a régime to be repressive. This constituted a major shift in conservative thinking. Concern was not focused as much on who should rule, but on how rule is to be exercised. While authority and hierarchical order remained the conservative ideal, Donoso introduced a degree of realistic pragmatism to how this ideal could be achieved and preserved. This shift had ominous consequences in the twentieth century since the door was opened to more radical and ruthless forms of political and religious control.

a. Religious Dictatorship

In the religious arena, Donoso’s ideas on authority influenced the life of the Roman Catholic Church for over a century. Again echoing the views of de Maistre, Donoso thought that infallibility is an essential characteristic of authority. Authority is synonymous with infallibility. The power to command behavior and impose beliefs is not subject to error and must not be seen as subject to error. Without the exercise of and belief in infallible authority, Donoso thought that people and societies would sink into a morass of confusion, doubt, and error.

Donoso’s theory on infallibility helped to lay the foundation for the doctrine of papal infallibility that was promulgated by Pope Pius IX in 1870 at the end of the First Vatican Council. His advice was sought by Pius IX through the papal nuncio to France in the early 1850s, Rafaello Cardinal Fornari, with regard to the drawing up of a list of religious and philosophical propositions that were to be condemned as heretical. Donoso’s loathing for democracy, freedom of thought, freedom of speech, freedom of religion, rationalism, liberalism, socialism, pluralism, freedom of expression, and tolerance was reflected in his Letter to Cardinal Fornari. The ideas asserted in this letter appeared in Pius IX’s decree the Syllabus of Errors.

The repressive methods of governance advocated by Donoso in his theory on dictatorship also influenced the development of a papal régime that rested upon the absolute exercise of power by the pope over the Church. Donoso’s theories contributed to the development of a totalitarian ideology of papal supremacy and authority that dominated the Church until the Second Vatican Council in the early 1960s. A dictatorial papal régime was established by Pius IX that lasted through and reached its zenith during the pontificate of Pius XII. The Church endured a form of régime and a vision that pitted it in a holy war against modernity. His theories helped to shape the ideas and vocabulary that justified the establishment of a strong and centralized papal régime and the persecution of dissident and progressive Catholic thinkers—”modernists”— who sought to bring about a reconciliation between Christianity and the modern world.

b. Political Dictatorship

In the political arena, Donoso’s influence was just as ominous. His theory of dictatorship and his critique of liberal democratic parliamentarianism significantly influenced the thinking of the twentieth century German conservative political theorist Carl Schmitt. Schmitt figured prominently in the development of the legal principles and structures of the Nazi régime. Schmitt’s critique of parliamentary democracy rests heavily upon arguments first developed by Donoso. Furthermore, Schmitt’s depiction of politics as a constant struggle of friends against enemies reflects Donoso’s quasi-Manichæan view of politics as a war between Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization. Donoso’s notion of infallible authority resonated in the Nazi Führerprinzip, the Italian fascist principle of Ducismo, and the principle of Caudillaje of the Franco régime in Spain (1936-75). The emphasis Donoso placed on infallible authority, his contempt of parliamentary democracy, and his support of dictatorial rule were common features of both conservative authoritarian as well as fascist régimes. Donoso’s ideas were held in high esteem in Spain during the time of the Franco dictatorship and were also reflected in other conservative authoritarian régimes in Portugal under Salazar and Caetano, France under Pétain (the Vichy régime), Austria under Dollfuss and Schuschnigg, and Hungary under Horthy.

4. Views on Violence

Donoso’s theory on sacrifices, developed in his Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo, endorsed violence as a social necessity. The spilling of blood by the State is essential in keeping the repressive equilibrium required to maintain a society. For every drop of blood spilled in crime, there must be an equal amount of blood spilled in the name of justice if authority and order are to be preserved. Criminal violence must be balanced with just violence; the violence that promotes evil must be met with the violence that promotes the good. Donoso saw human beings as so morally depraved and feeble in intellect that they require dictatorial rulers to regulate their behavior, priests to tell then what to believe and think, and executioners to punish them when they waver or depart from the commanded norms of behavior, thought, and belief. Kings, priests, and executioners are the pillars of civilization.

5. Views on History

Donoso’s view of history reflect the influence of St. Augustine, Vico, and Hegel. It combines the eschatological perspective of Augustine with the historical cycles of Vico and the dialectical process of Hegel. History is a process of the unfolding of a divine plan guided by Providence toward a specific end, which is the triumph of good over evil, of Catholic civilization over philosophical civilization. The process advances in cycles wherein the recurrent theme of good against evil is played out in a dialectical manner until the end is reached. Each cycle in the dialectical process ends with what Donoso called the “supernatural triumph of good over evil.” The action of divine Providence is essential in this process. Just as the executioner turns an evil into a good by replacing criminal violence with just violence, so Providence turns the natural triumph of evil into the supernatural triumph of the good. Donoso saw the natural triumph of evil in Jesus’ death as a supernatural triumph at the same time. The evil of the crucifixion accomplished the good of human redemption. The evil that afflicts can also be a good that strengthens and saves. The evil of sin allows God to display the good that is manifested in his justice and his mercy. History is the playing out of this drama in a cyclic and dialectically structured process guided by divine Providence toward a definite conclusion-the ultimate triumph of good over evil. Catholic civilization, which Donoso depicted as totally good, will ultimately crush and triumph over that evil he called philosophical civilization.

Donoso can also be seen as a modern-day Cassandra uttering prophecies of apocalyptic doom. He saw the development of modern technology, symbolized by the telegraph for him, and the establishment of mass permanent armies and police forces as potential instruments in the hands of a future godless and socialistic tyranny. All of his efforts in the arenas of politics, philosophy, and religion were aimed at preventing the rise of such an evil. Revolution had to be met with counterrevolution, anarchy with dictatorship, freethinking with dogma, doubt with certainty, and discussion with decree. The ultimate battle for Donoso was to be a quasi-Manichæan struggle between Catholicism and socialism, or Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization, two systems of belief in a combat to the death for the control of societies and souls.

6. References and Further Reading

Works by Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Juan Donoso Cortés, Antologia de Juan Donoso Cortés, edited by Francisco Elías de Tejada (Madrid: Editorial Tradicionalista, 1953)
  • Artículos políticos en “El Porvenir,” edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1992
  • Donoso Cortés y la fundación de “El Heraldo” y “El Sol,” edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1986)
  • Essai sur le catholicisme, le libéralisme et le socialisme, introduction by Arnaud Imatz (Bouère: Editions Dominique Martin Morin, 1986).
    • French translation of the Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo
  • Essay on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Order, translated by Madeleine Vincent Goddard, edited J. C. Reville (New York: Joseph F. Wagner, 1925).
    • English translation of the Ensayo
  • Essays on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Socialism, translated by Rev. William McDonald (Dublin: M. H. Gill and Son, 1879).
    • The second English translation of the Ensayo
  • Der Staat Gottes, translated by Ludwig Fischer (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1966).
    • German translation of the Ensayo
  • Obras completas de Don Juan Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Juan Juretschke (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1946)
  • Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J., (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970)
  • Selected Works of Juan Donoso Cortés, translated, edited, and introduced by Jeffrey P. Johnson (Wesport: Greenwood Press, 2000)
  • “Speech on Dictatorship,” in Catholic Political Thought: 1789-1848, edited by Bela Menczer (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1962).

Works on Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Gabriel de Armas, Donoso Cortés: su sentido trascendente de la vida (Madrid: Colección Cálamo, 1953)
  • Orestes Brownson, Orestes Brownson: Selected Essays, edited by Russell Kirk (Chicago: Regnery, 1955)
  • Catholic Encyclopedia, 1909 edition, s.v. “Donoso Cortés,” by Condé B. Pallen; Jules Chaix-Ruy Donoso Cortés: Théologien de l’histoire et prophète (Paris: Beauchesne, 1956)
  • Alois Dempf, Christliche Staatsphilosophie in Spanien (Salzburg: Verlag Anton Pustet, 1937)
  • John T. Graham, Donoso Cortés: Utopian Romanticist and Political Realist (Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 1974)
  • R. A. Herrera, Donoso Cortés: Cassandra of the Age (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1995)
  • Ramon Menéndez Pidal, La historia de España: la era Isabelina y el sexenio democrático (1834-1874), vol. XXXIV (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1981)
  • Raúl Sánchez Abelenda, La teoría del poder en el pensamiento político de Juan Donoso Cortés (Buenos Aires: Editorial Universitaria de Buenos Aires, 1969)
  • Carl Schmitt, La interpretación europea de Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1953); Political Theology, translated by George Schwab (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1985)
  • Edmund Schramm, Donoso Cortés: ejemplo del pensamiento de la tradición, (Madrid: Publicaciones Españolas, 1961); Donoso Cortés: Su vida y su pensamiento (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1936)
  • Federico Súarez Verdeger, Introducción a Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1964)
  • Carlos Valverde, S.J., “Introducción” in Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, vol. 1, edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J. ( Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970); Dietmar Westemeyer, Donoso Cortés, hombre de estado y teólogo, translated by J. S. Mazpule (Madrid: Editora Nacional, 1957)
  • Frederick D. Wilhelmsen, Christianity and Political Philosophy (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1978); Francis G. Wilson, Political Thought in National Spain (Champaign: Stipes, 1967).

Author Information

Jeffrey P. Johnson
U. S. A.

John Dewey (1859—1952)

deweyJohn Dewey was a leading proponent of the American school of thought known as pragmatism, a view that rejected the dualistic epistemology and metaphysics of modern philosophy in favor of a naturalistic approach that viewed knowledge as arising from an active adaptation of the human organism to its environment. On this view, inquiry should not be understood as consisting of a mind passively observing the world and drawing from this ideas that if true correspond to reality, but rather as a process which initiates with a check or obstacle to successful human action, proceeds to active manipulation of the environment to test hypotheses, and issues in a re-adaptation of organism to environment that allows once again for human action to proceed. With this view as his starting point, Dewey developed a broad body of work encompassing virtually all of the main areas of philosophical concern in his day. He also wrote extensively on social issues in such popular publications as the New Republic, thereby gaining a reputation as a leading social commentator of his time.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Theory of Knowledge
  3. Metaphysics
  4. Ethical and Social Theory
  5. Aesthetics
  6. Critical Reception and Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

John Dewey was born on October 20, 1859, the third of four sons born to Archibald Sprague Dewey and Lucina Artemesia Rich of Burlington, Vermont. The eldest sibling died in infancy, but the three surviving brothers attended the public school and the University of Vermont in Burlington with John. While at the University of Vermont, Dewey was exposed to evolutionary theory through the teaching of G.H. Perkins and Lessons in Elementary Physiology, a text by T.H. Huxley, the famous English evolutionist. The theory of natural selection continued to have a life-long impact upon Dewey’s thought, suggesting the barrenness of static models of nature, and the importance of focusing on the interaction between the human organism and its environment when considering questions of psychology and the theory of knowledge. The formal teaching in philosophy at the University of Vermont was confined for the most part to the school of Scottish realism, a school of thought that Dewey soon rejected, but his close contact both before and after graduation with his teacher of philosophy, H.A.P. Torrey, a learned scholar with broader philosophical interests and sympathies, was later accounted by Dewey himself as “decisive” to his philosophical development.

After graduation in 1879, Dewey taught high school for two years, during which the idea of pursuing a career in philosophy took hold. With this nascent ambition in mind, he sent a philosophical essay to W.T. Harris, then editor of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, and the most prominent of the St. Louis Hegelians. Harris’s acceptance of the essay gave Dewey the confirmation he needed of his promise as a philosopher. With this encouragement he traveled to Baltimore to enroll as a graduate student at Johns Hopkins University.

At Johns Hopkins Dewey came under the tutelage of two powerful and engaging intellects who were to have a lasting influence on him. George Sylvester Morris, a German-trained Hegelian philosopher, exposed Dewey to the organic model of nature characteristic of German idealism. G. Stanley Hall, one of the most prominent American experimental psychologists at the time, provided Dewey with an appreciation of the power of scientific methodology as applied to the human sciences. The confluence of these viewpoints propelled Dewey’s early thought, and established the general tenor of his ideas throughout his philosophical career.

Upon obtaining his doctorate in 1884, Dewey accepted a teaching post at the University of Michigan, a post he was to hold for ten years, with the exception of a year at the University of Minnesota in 1888. While at Michigan Dewey wrote his first two books: Psychology (1887), and Leibniz’s New Essays Concerning the Human Understanding (1888). Both works expressed Dewey’s early commitment to Hegelian idealism, while the Psychology explored the synthesis between this idealism and experimental science that Dewey was then attempting to effect. At Michigan Dewey also met one of his important philosophical collaborators, James Hayden Tufts, with whom he would later author Ethics (1908; revised ed. 1932).

In 1894, Dewey followed Tufts to the recently founded University of Chicago. It was during his years at Chicago that Dewey’s early idealism gave way to an empirically based theory of knowledge that was in concert with the then developing American school of thought known as pragmatism. This change in view finally coalesced into a series of four essays entitled collectively “Thought and its Subject-Matter,” which was published along with a number of other essays by Dewey’s colleagues and students at Chicago under the title Studies in Logical Theory (1903). Dewey also founded and directed a laboratory school at Chicago, where he was afforded an opportunity to apply directly his developing ideas on pedagogical method. This experience provided the material for his first major work on education, The School and Society (1899).

Disagreements with the administration over the status of the Laboratory School led to Dewey’s resignation from his post at Chicago in 1904. His philosophical reputation now secured, he was quickly invited to join the Department of Philosophy at Columbia University. Dewey spent the rest of his professional life at Columbia. Now in New York, located in the midst of the Northeastern universities that housed many of the brightest minds of American philosophy, Dewey developed close contacts with many philosophers working from divergent points of view, an intellectually stimulating atmosphere which served to nurture and enrich his thought.

During his first decade at Columbia Dewey wrote a great number of articles in the theory of knowledge and metaphysics, many of which were published in two important books: The Influence of Darwin on Philosophy and Other Essays in Contemporary Thought (1910) and Essays in Experimental Logic(1916). His interest in educational theory also continued during these years, fostered by his work at Teachers College at Columbia. This led to the publication of How We Think (1910; revised ed. 1933), an application of his theory of knowledge to education, and Democracy and Education (1916), perhaps his most important work in the field.

During his years at Columbia Dewey’s reputation grew not only as a leading philosopher and educational theorist, but also in the public mind as an important commentator on contemporary issues, the latter due to his frequent contributions to popular magazines such as The New Republic and Nation, as well as his ongoing political involvement in a variety of causes, such as women’s suffrage and the unionization of teachers. One outcome of this fame was numerous invitations to lecture in both academic and popular venues. Many of his most significant writings during these years were the result of such lectures, includingReconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Human Nature and Conduct (1922), Experience and Nature(1925), The Public and its Problems (1927), and The Quest for Certainty (1929).

Dewey’s retirement from active teaching in 1930 did not curtail his activity either as a public figure or productive philosopher. Of special note in his public life was his participation in the Commission of Inquiry into the Charges Against Leon Trotsky at the Moscow Trial, which exposed Stalin’s political machinations behind the Moscow trials of the mid-1930s, and his defense of fellow philosopher Bertrand Russell against an attempt by conservatives to remove him from his chair at the College of the City of New York in 1940. A primary focus of Dewey’s philosophical pursuits during the 1930s was the preparation of a final formulation of his logical theory, published as Logic: The Theory of Inquiry in 1938. Dewey’s other significant works during his retirement years include Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith(1934), Freedom and Culture (1939), Theory of Valuation (1939), and Knowing and the Known(1949), the last coauthored with Arthur F. Bentley. Dewey continued to work vigorously throughout his retirement until his death on June 2, 1952, at the age of ninety-two.

2. Theory of Knowledge

The central focus of Dewey’s philosophical interests throughout his career was what has been traditionally called “epistemology,” or the “theory of knowledge.” It is indicative, however, of Dewey’s critical stance toward past efforts in this area that he expressly rejected the term “epistemology,” preferring the “theory of inquiry” or “experimental logic” as more representative of his own approach.

In Dewey’s view, traditional epistemologies, whether rationalist or empiricist, had drawn too stark a distinction between thought, the domain of knowledge, and the world of fact to which thought purportedly referred: thought was believed to exist apart from the world, epistemically as the object of immediate awareness, ontologically as the unique aspect of the self. The commitment of modern rationalism, stemming from Descartes, to a doctrine of innate ideas, ideas constituted from birth in the very nature of the mind itself, had effected this dichotomy; but the modern empiricists, beginning with Locke, had done the same just as markedly by their commitment to an introspective methodology and a representational theory of ideas. The resulting view makes a mystery of the relevance of thought to the world: if thought constitutes a domain that stands apart from the world, how can its accuracy as an account of the world ever be established? For Dewey a new model, rejecting traditional presumptions, was wanting, a model that Dewey endeavored to develop and refine throughout his years of writing and reflection.

In his early writings on these issues, such as “Is Logic a Dualistic Science?” (1890) and “The Present Position of Logical Theory” (1891), Dewey offered a solution to epistemological issues mainly along the lines of his early acceptance of Hegelian idealism: the world of fact does not stand apart from thought, but is itself defined within thought as its objective manifestation. But during the succeeding decade Dewey gradually came to reject this solution as confused and inadequate.

A number of influences have bearing on Dewey’s change of view. For one, Hegelian idealism was not conducive to accommodating the methodologies and results of experimental science which he accepted and admired. Dewey himself had attempted to effect such an accommodation between experimental psychology and idealism in his early Psychology (1887), but the publication of William James’ Principles of Psychology (1891), written from a more thoroughgoing naturalistic stance, suggested the superfluity of idealist principles in the treatment of the subject.

Second, Darwin’s theory of natural selection suggested in a more particular way the form which a naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge should take. Darwin’s theory had renounced supernatural explanations of the origins of species by accounting for the morphology of living organisms as a product of a natural, temporal process of the adaptation of lineages of organisms to their environments, environments which, Darwin understood, were significantly determined by the organisms that occupied them. The key to the naturalistic account of species was a consideration of the complex interrelationships between organisms and environments. In a similar way, Dewey came to believe that a productive, naturalistic approach to the theory of knowledge must begin with a consideration of the development of knowledge as an adaptive human response to environing conditions aimed at an active restructuring of these conditions. Unlike traditional approaches in the theory of knowledge, which saw thought as a subjective primitive out of which knowledge was composed, Dewey’s approach understood thought genetically, as the product of the interaction between organism and environment, and knowledge as having practical instrumentality in the guidance and control of that interaction. Thus Dewey adopted the term “instrumentalism” as a descriptive appellation for his new approach.

Dewey’s first significant application of this new naturalistic understanding was offered in his seminal article “The Reflex Arc Concept in Psychology” (1896). In this article, Dewey argued that the dominant conception of the reflex arc in the psychology of his day, which was thought to begin with the passive stimulation of the organism, causing a conscious act of awareness eventuating in a response, was a carry-over of the old, and errant, mind-body dualism. Dewey argued for an alternative view: the organism interacts with the world through self-guided activity that coordinates and integrates sensory and motor responses. The implication for the theory of knowledge was clear: the world is not passively perceived and thereby known; active manipulation of the environment is involved integrally in the process of learning from the start.

Dewey first applied this interactive naturalism in an explicit manner to the theory of knowledge in his four introductory essays in Studies in Logical Theory. Dewey identified the view expressed in Studies with the school of pragmatism, crediting William James as its progenitor. James, for his part, in an article appearing in the Psychological Bulletin, proclaimed the work as the expression of a new school of thought, acknowledging its originality.

A detailed genetic analysis of the process of inquiry was Dewey’s signal contribution to Studies. Dewey distinguished three phases of the process. It begins with the problematic situation, a situation where instinctive or habitual responses of the human organism to the environment are inadequate for the continuation of ongoing activity in pursuit of the fulfillment of needs and desires. Dewey stressed inStudies and subsequent writings that the uncertainty of the problematic situation is not inherently cognitive, but practical and existential. Cognitive elements enter into the process as a response to precognitive maladjustment.

The second phase of the process involves the isolation of the data or subject matter which defines the parameters within which the reconstruction of the initiating situation must be addressed. In the third, reflective phase of the process, the cognitive elements of inquiry (ideas, suppositions, theories, etc.) are entertained as hypothetical solutions to the originating impediment of the problematic situation, the implications of which are pursued in the abstract. The final test of the adequacy of these solutions comes with their employment in action. If a reconstruction of the antecedent situation conducive to fluid activity is achieved, then the solution no longer retains the character of the hypothetical that marks cognitive thought; rather, it becomes a part of the existential circumstances of human life.

The error of modern epistemologists, as Dewey saw it, was that they isolated the reflective stages of this process, and hypostatized the elements of those stages (sensations, ideas, etc.) into pre-existing constituents of a subjective mind in their search for an incorrigible foundation of knowledge. For Dewey, the hypostatization was as groundless as the search for incorrigibility was barren. Rejecting foundationalism, Dewey accepted the fallibilism that was characteristic of the school of pragmatism: the view that any proposition accepted as an item of knowledge has this status only provisionally, contingent upon its adequacy in providing a coherent understanding of the world as the basis for human action.

Dewey defended this general outline of the process of inquiry throughout his long career, insisting that it was the only proper way to understand the means by which we attain knowledge, whether it be the commonsense knowledge that guides the ordinary affairs of our lives, or the sophisticated knowledge arising from scientific inquiry. The latter is only distinguished from the former by the precision of its methods for controlling data, and the refinement of its hypotheses. In his writings in the theory of inquiry subsequent to Studies, Dewey endeavored to develop and deepen instrumentalism by considering a number of central issues of traditional epistemology from its perspective, and responding to some of the more trenchant criticisms of the view.

One traditional question that Dewey addressed in a series of essays between 1906 and 1909 was that of the meaning of truth. Dewey at that time considered the pragmatic theory of truth as central to the pragmatic school of thought, and vigorously defended its viability. Both Dewey and William James, in his book Pragmatism (1907), argued that the traditional correspondence theory of truth, according to which the true idea is one that agrees or corresponds to reality, only begs the question of what the “agreement” or “correspondence” of idea with reality is. Dewey and James maintained that an idea agrees with reality, and is therefore true, if and only if it is successfully employed in human action in pursuit of human goals and interests, that is, if it leads to the resolution of a problematic situation in Dewey’s terms. The pragmatic theory of truth met with strong opposition among its critics, perhaps most notably from the British logician and philosopher Bertrand Russell. Dewey later began to suspect that the issues surrounding the conditions of truth, as well as knowledge, were hopelessly obscured by the accretion of traditional, and in his view misguided, meanings to the terms, resulting in confusing ambiguity. He later abandoned these terms in favor of “warranted assertiblity” to describe the distinctive property of ideas that results from successful inquiry.

One of the most important developments of his later writings in the theory of knowledge was the application of the principles of instrumentalism to the traditional conceptions and formal apparatus of logical theory. Dewey made significant headway in this endeavor in his lengthy introduction to Essays in Experimental Logic, but the project reached full fruition in Logic: The Theory of Inquiry.

The basis of Dewey’s discussion in the Logic is the continuity of intelligent inquiry with the adaptive responses of pre-human organisms to their environments in circumstances that check efficient activity in the fulfillment of organic needs. What is distinctive about intelligent inquiry is that it is facilitated by the use of language, which allows, by its symbolic meanings and implication relationships, the hypothetical rehearsal of adaptive behaviors before their employment under actual, prevailing conditions for the purpose of resolving problematic situations. Logical form, the specialized subject matter of traditional logic, owes its genesis not to rational intuition, as had often been assumed by logicians, but due to its functional value in (1) managing factual evidence pertaining to the problematic situation that elicits inquiry, and (2) controlling the procedures involved in the conceptualized entertainment of hypothetical solutions. As Dewey puts it, “logical forms accrue to subject-matter when the latter is subjected to controlled inquiry.”

From this new perspective, Dewey reconsiders many of the topics of traditional logic, such as the distinction between deductive and inductive inference, propositional form, and the nature of logical necessity. One important outcome of this work was a new theory of propositions. Traditional views in logic had held that the logical import of propositions is defined wholly by their syntactical form (e.g., “All As are Bs,” “Some Bs are Cs”). In contrast, Dewey maintained that statements of identical propositional form can play significantly different functional roles in the process of inquiry. Thus in keeping with his distinction between the factual and conceptual elements of inquiry, he replaced the accepted distinctions between universal, particular, and singular propositions based on syntactical meaning with a distinction between existential and ideational propositions, a distinction that largely cuts across traditional classifications. The same general approach is taken throughout the work: the aim is to offer functional analyses of logical principles and techniques that exhibit their operative utility in the process of inquiry as Dewey understood it.

The breadth of topics treated and the depth and continuity of the discussion of these topics mark theLogic as Dewey’s decisive statement in logical theory. The recognition of the work’s importance within the philosophical community of the time can be gauged by the fact that the Journal of Philosophy, the most prominent American journal in the field, dedicated an entire issue to a discussion of the work, including contributions by such philosophical luminaries as C. I. Lewis of Harvard University, and Ernest Nagel, Dewey’s colleague at Columbia University. Although many of his critics did question, and continue to question, the assumptions of his approach, one that is certainly unique in the development of twentieth century logical theory, there is no doubt that the work was and continues to be an important contribution to the field.

3. Metaphysics

Dewey’s naturalistic metaphysics first took shape in articles that he wrote during the decade after the publication of Studies in Logical Theory, a period when he was attempting to elucidate the implications of instrumentalism. Dewey disagreed with William James’s assessment that pragmatic principles were metaphysically neutral. (He discusses this disagreement in “What Does Pragmatism Mean by Practical,” published in 1908.) Dewey’s view was based in part on an assessment of the motivations behind traditional metaphysics: a central aim of the metaphysical tradition had been the discovery of an immutable cognitive object that could serve as a foundation for knowledge. The pragmatic theory, by showing that knowledge is a product of an activity directed to the fulfillment of human purposes, and that a true (or warranted) belief is known to be such by the consequences of its employment rather than by any psychological or ontological foundations, rendered this longstanding aim of metaphysics, in Dewey’s view, moot, and opened the door to renewed metaphysical discussion grounded firmly on an empirical basis.

Dewey begins to define the general form that an empirical metaphysics should take in a number of articles, including “The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” (1905) and “Does Reality Possess Practical Character?” (1908). In the former article, Dewey asserts that things experienced empirically “are what they are experienced as.” Dewey uses as an example a noise heard in a darkened room that is initially experienced as fearsome. Subsequent inquiry (e.g., turning on the lights and looking about) reveals that the noise was caused by a shade tapping against a window, and thus innocuous. But the subsequent inquiry, Dewey argues, does not change the initial status of the noise: it was experienced as fearsome, and in fact was fearsome. The point stems from the naturalistic roots of Dewey’s logic. Our experience of the world is constituted by our interrelationship with it, a relationship that is imbued with practical import. The initial fearsomeness of the noise is the experiential correlate of the uncertain, problematic character of the situation, an uncertainty that is not merely subjective or mental, but a product of the potential inadequacy of previously established modes of behavior to deal effectively with the pragmatic demands of present circumstances. The subsequent inquiry does not, therefore, uncover a reality (the innocuousness of the noise) underlying a mere appearance (its fearsomeness), but by settling the demands of the situation, it effects a change in the inter-dynamics of the organism-environment relationship of the initial situation–a change in reality.

There are two important implications of this line of thought that distinguish it from the metaphysical tradition. First, although inquiry is aimed at resolving the precarious and confusing aspects of experience to provide a stable basis for action, this does not imply the unreality of the unstable and contingent, nor justify its relegation to the status of mere appearance. Thus, for example, the usefulness and reliability of utilizing certain stable features of things encountered in our experience as a basis for classification does not justify according ultimate reality to essences or Platonic forms any more than, as rationalist metaphysicians in the modern era have thought, the similar usefulness of mathematical reasoning in understanding natural processes justifies the conclusion that the world can be exhaustively defined mathematically.

Second, the fact that the meanings we attribute to natural events might change in any particular in the future as renewed inquiries lead to more adequate understandings of natural events (as was implied by Dewey’s fallibilism) does not entail that our experience of the world at any given time may as a whole be errant. Thus the implicit skepticism that underlies the representational theory of ideas and raises questions concerning the veracity of perceptual experience as such is unwarranted. Dewey stresses the point that sensations, hypotheses, ideas, etc., come into play to mediate our encounter with the world only in the context of active inquiry. Once inquiry is successful in resolving a problematic situation, mediatory sensations and ideas, as Dewey says, “drop out; and things are present to the agent in the most naively realistic fashion.”

These contentions positioned Dewey’s metaphysics within the territory of a naive realism, and in a number of his articles, such as “The Realism of Pragmatism” (1905), “Brief Studies in Realism” (1911), and “The Existence of the World as a Logical Problem” (1915), it is this view that Dewey expressly avows (a view that he carefully distinguishes from what he calls “presentational realism,” which he attributes to a number of the other realists of his day). Opposing narrow-minded positions that would accord full ontological status only to certain, typically the most stable or reliable, aspects of experience, Dewey argues for a position that recognizes the real significance of the multifarious richness of human experience.

Dewey offered a fuller statement of his metaphysics in 1925, with the publication of one of his most significant philosophical works, Experience and Nature. In the introductory chapter, Dewey stresses a familiar theme from his earlier writings: that previous metaphysicians, guided by unavowed biases for those aspects of experience that are relatively stable and secure, have illicitly reified these biases into narrow ontological presumptions, such as the temporal identity of substance, or the ultimate reality of forms or essences. Dewey finds this procedure so pervasive in the history of thought that he calls it simplythe philosophic fallacy, and signals his intention to eschew the disastrous consequences of this approach by offering a descriptive account of all of the various generic features of human experience, whatever their character.

Dewey begins with the observation that the world as we experience it both individually and collectively is an admixture of the precarious, the transitory and contingent aspect of things, and the stable, the patterned regularity of natural processes that allows for prediction and human intervention. Honest metaphysical description must take into account both of these elements of experience. Dewey endeavors to do this by an event ontology. The world, rather than being comprised of things or, in more traditional terms, substances, is comprised of happenings or occurrences that admit of both episodic uniqueness and general, structured order. Intrinsically events have an ineffable qualitative character by which they are immediately enjoyed or suffered, thus providing the basis for experienced value and aesthetic appreciation. Extrinsically events are connected to one another by patterns of change and development; any given event arises out of determinant prior conditions and leads to probable consequences. The patterns of these temporal processes is the proper subject matter of human knowledge–we know the world in terms of causal laws and mathematical relationships–but the instrumental value of understanding and controlling them should not blind us to the immediate, qualitative aspect of events; indeed, the value of scientific understanding is most significantly realized in the facility it affords for controlling the circumstances under which immediate enjoyments may be realized.

It is in terms of the distinction between qualitative immediacy and the structured order of events that Dewey understands the general pattern of human life and action. This understanding is captured by James’ suggestive metaphor that human experience consists of an alternation of flights and perchings, an alternation of concentrated effort directed toward the achievement of foreseen aims, what Dewey calls “ends-in-view,” with the fruition of effort in the immediate satisfaction of “consummatory experience.” Dewey’s insistence that human life follows the patterns of nature, as a part of nature, is the core tenet of his naturalistic outlook.

Dewey also addresses the social aspect of human experience facilitated by symbolic activity, particularly that of language. For Dewey the question of the nature of social relationships is a significant matter not only for social theory, but metaphysics as well, for it is from collective human activity, and specifically the development of shared meanings that govern this activity, that the mind arises. Thus rather than understanding the mind as a primitive and individual human endowment, and a precondition of conscious and intentional action, as was typical in the philosophical tradition since Descartes, Dewey offers a genetic analysis of mind as an emerging aspect of cooperative activity mediated by linguistic communication. Consciousness, in turn, is not to be understood as a domain of private awareness, but rather as the fulcrum point of the organism’s readjustment to the challenge of novel conditions where the meanings and attitudes that formulate habitual behavioral responses to the environment fail to be adequate. Thus Dewey offers in the better part of a number of chapters of Experience and Nature a response to the traditional mind-body problem of the metaphysical tradition, a response that understands the mind as an emergent issue of natural processes, more particularly the web of interactive relationships between human beings and the world in which they live.

4. Ethical and Social Theory

Dewey’s mature thought in ethics and social theory is not only intimately linked to the theory of knowledge in its founding conceptual framework and naturalistic standpoint, but also complementary to it in its emphasis on the social dimension of inquiry both in its processes and its consequences. In fact, it would be reasonable to claim that Dewey’s theory of inquiry cannot be fully understood either in the meaning of its central tenets or the significance of its originality without considering how it applies to social aims and values, the central concern of his ethical and social theory.

Dewey rejected the atomistic understanding of society of the Hobbesian social contract theory, according to which the social, cooperative aspect of human life was grounded in the logically prior and fully articulated rational interests of individuals. Dewey’s claim in Experience and Nature that the collection of meanings that constitute the mind have a social origin expresses the basic contention, one that he maintained throughout his career, that the human individual is a social being from the start, and that individual satisfaction and achievement can be realized only within the context of social habits and institutions that promote it.

Moral and social problems, for Dewey, are concerned with the guidance of human action to the achievement of socially defined ends that are productive of a satisfying life for individuals within the social context. Regarding the nature of what constitutes a satisfying life, Dewey was intentionally vague, out of his conviction that specific ends or goods can be defined only in particular socio-historical contexts. In theEthics (1932) he speaks of the ends simply as the cultivation of interests in goods that recommend themselves in the light of calm reflection. In other works, such as Human Nature and Conduct and Art as Experience, he speaks of (1) the harmonizing of experience (the resolution of conflicts of habit and interest both within the individual and within society), (2) the release from tedium in favor of the enjoyment of variety and creative action, and (3) the expansion of meaning (the enrichment of the individual’s appreciation of his or her circumstances within human culture and the world at large). The attunement of individual efforts to the promotion of these social ends constitutes, for Dewey, the central issue of ethical concern of the individual; the collective means for their realization is the paramount question of political policy.

Conceived in this manner, the appropriate method for solving moral and social questions is the same as that required for solving questions concerning matters of fact: an empirical method that is tied to an examination of problematic situations, the gathering of relevant facts, and the imaginative consideration of possible solutions that, when utilized, bring about a reconstruction and resolution of the original situations. Dewey, throughout his ethical and social writings, stressed the need for an open-ended, flexible, and experimental approach to problems of practice aimed at the determination of the conditions for the attainment of human goods and a critical examination of the consequences of means adopted to promote them, an approach that he called the “method of intelligence.”

The central focus of Dewey’s criticism of the tradition of ethical thought is its tendency to seek solutions to moral and social problems in dogmatic principles and simplistic criteria which in his view were incapable of dealing effectively with the changing requirements of human events. In Reconstruction of Philosophyand The Quest for Certainty, Dewey located the motivation of traditional dogmatic approaches in philosophy in the forlorn hope for security in an uncertain world, forlorn because the conservatism of these approaches has the effect of inhibiting the intelligent adaptation of human practice to the ineluctable changes in the physical and social environment. Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress, and Dewey argues that philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation.

In large part, then, Dewey’s ideas in ethics and social theory were programmatic rather than substantive, defining the direction that he believed human thought and action must take in order to identify the conditions that promote the human good in its fullest sense, rather than specifying particular formulae or principles for individual and social action. He studiously avoided participating in what he regarded as the unfortunate practice of previous moral philosophers of offering general rules that legislate universal standards of conduct. But there are strong suggestions in a number of his works of basic ethical and social positions. In Human Nature and Conduct Dewey approaches ethical inquiry through an analysis of human character informed by the principles of scientific psychology. The analysis is reminiscent of Aristotelian ethics, concentrating on the central role of habit in formulating the dispositions of action that comprise character, and the importance of reflective intelligence as a means of modifying habits and controlling disruptive desires and impulses in the pursuit of worthwhile ends.

The social condition for the flexible adaptation that Dewey believed was crucial for human advancement is a democratic form of life, not instituted merely by democratic forms of governance, but by the inculcation of democratic habits of cooperation and public spiritedness, productive of an organized, self-conscious community of individuals responding to society’s needs by experimental and inventive, rather than dogmatic, means. The development of these democratic habits, Dewey argues in School and Society andDemocracy and Education, must begin in the earliest years of a child’s educational experience. Dewey rejected the notion that a child’s education should be viewed as merely a preparation for civil life, during which disjoint facts and ideas are conveyed by the teacher and memorized by the student only to be utilized later on. The school should rather be viewed as an extension of civil society and continuous with it, and the student encouraged to operate as a member of a community, actively pursuing interests in cooperation with others. It is by a process of self-directed learning, guided by the cultural resources provided by teachers, that Dewey believed a child is best prepared for the demands of responsible membership within the democratic community.

5. Aesthetics

Dewey’s one significant treatment of aesthetic theory is offered in Art as Experience, a book that was based on the William James Lectures that he delivered at Harvard University in 1931. The book stands out as a diversion into uncommon philosophical territory for Dewey, adumbrated only by a somewhat sketchy and tangential treatment of art in one chapter of Experience and Nature. The unique status of the work in Dewey’s corpus evoked some criticism from Dewey’s followers, most notably Stephen Pepper, who believed that it marked an unfortunate departure from the naturalistic standpoint of his instrumentalism, and a return to the idealistic viewpoints of his youth. On close reading, however, Art as Experience reveals a considerable continuity of Dewey’s views on art with the main themes of his previous philosophical work, while offering an important and useful extension of those themes. Dewey had always stressed the importance of recognizing the significance and integrity of all aspects of human experience. His repeated complaint against the partiality and bias of the philosophical tradition expresses this theme. Consistent with this theme, Dewey took account of qualitative immediacy in Experience and Nature, and incorporated it into his view of the developmental nature of experience, for it is in the enjoyment of the immediacy of an integration and harmonization of meanings, in the “consummatory phase” of experience that, in Dewey’s view, the fruition of the re-adaptation of the individual with environment is realized. These central themes are enriched and deepened in Art as Experience, making it one of Dewey’s most significant works.

The roots of aesthetic experience lie, Dewey argues, in commonplace experience, in the consummatory experiences that are ubiquitous in the course of human life. There is no legitimacy to the conceit cherished by some art enthusiasts that aesthetic enjoyment is the privileged endowment of the few. Whenever there is a coalesence into an immediately enjoyed qualitative unity of meanings and values drawn from previous experience and present circumstances, life then takes on an aesthetic quality–what Dewey called having “an experience.” Nor is the creative work of the artist, in its broad parameters, unique. The process of intelligent use of materials and the imaginative development of possible solutions to problems issuing in a reconstruction of experience that affords immediate satisfaction, the process found in the creative work of artists, is also to be found in all intelligent and creative human activity. What distinguishes artistic creation is the relative stress laid upon the immediate enjoyment of unified qualitative complexity as the rationalizing aim of the activity itself, and the ability of the artist to achieve this aim by marshalling and refining the massive resources of human life, meanings, and values.

The senses play a key role in artistic creation and aesthetic appreciation. Dewey, however, argues against the view, stemming historically from the sensationalistic empiricism of David Hume, that interprets the content of sense experience simply in terms of the traditionally codified list of sense qualities, such as color, odor, texture, etc., divorced from the funded meanings of past experience. It is not only the sensible qualities present in the physical media the artist uses, but the wealth of meaning that attaches to these qualities, that constitute the material that is refined and unified in the process of artistic expression. The artist concentrates, clarifies, and vivifies these meanings in the artwork. The unifying element in this process is emotion–not the emotion of raw passion and outburst, but emotion that is reflected upon and used as a guide to the overall character of the artwork. Although Dewey insisted that emotion is not the significant content of the work of art, he clearly understands it to be the crucial tool of the artist’s creative activity.

Dewey repeatedly returns in Art as Experience to a familiar theme of his critical reflections upon the history of ideas, namely that a distinction too strongly drawn too often sacrifices accuracy of account for a misguided simplicity. Two applications of this theme are worth mentioning here. Dewey rejects the sharp distinction often made in aesthetics between the matter and the form of an artwork. What Dewey objected to was the implicit suggestion that matter and form stand side by side, as it were, in the artwork as distinct and precisely distinguishable elements. For Dewey, form is better understood in a dynamic sense as the coordination and adjustment of the qualities and associated meanings that are integrated within the artwork.

A second misguided distinction that Dewey rejects is that between the artist as the active creator and the audience as the passive recipient of art. This distinction artificially truncates the artistic process by in effect suggesting that the process ends with the final artifact of the artist’s creativity. Dewey argues that, to the contrary, the process is barren without the agency of the appreciator, whose active assimilation of the artist’s work requires a recapitulation of many of the same processes of discrimination, comparison, and integration that are present in the artist’s initial work, but now guided by the artist’s perception and skill. Dewey underscores the point by distinguishing between the “art product,” the painting, sculpture, etc., created by the artist, and the “work of art” proper, which is only realized through the active engagement of an astute audience.

Ever concerned with the interrelationships between the various domains of human activity and concern, Dewey ends Art as Experience with a chapter devoted to the social implications of the arts. Art is a product of culture, and it is through art that the people of a given culture express the significance of their lives, as well as their hopes and ideals. Because art has its roots in the consummatory values experienced in the course of human life, its values have an affinity to commonplace values, an affinity that accords to art a critical office in relation to prevailing social conditions. Insofar as the possibility for a meaningful and satisfying life disclosed in the values embodied in art is not realized in the lives of the members of a society, the social relationships that preclude this realization are condemned. Dewey’s specific target in this chapter was the conditions of workers in industrialized society, conditions which force upon the worker the performance of repetitive tasks that are devoid of personal interest and afford no satisfaction in personal accomplishment. The degree to which this critical function of art is ignored is a further indication of what Dewey regarded as the unfortunate distancing of the arts from the common pursuits and interests of ordinary life. The realization of art’s social function requires the closure of this bifurcation.

6. Critical Reception and Influence

Dewey’s philosophical work received varied responses from his philosophical colleagues during his lifetime. There were many philosophers who saw his work, as Dewey himself understood it, as a genuine attempt to apply the principles of an empirical naturalism to the perennial questions of philosophy, providing a beneficial clarification of issues and the concepts used to address them. Dewey’s critics, however, often expressed the opinion that his views were more confusing than clarifying, and that they appeared to be more akin to idealism than the scientifically based naturalism Dewey expressly avowed. Notable in this connection are Dewey’s disputes concerning the relation of the knowing subject to known objects with the realists Bertrand Russell, A. O. Lovejoy, and Evander Bradley McGilvery. Whereas these philosophers argued that the object of knowledge must be understood as existing apart from the knowing subject, setting the truth conditions for propositions, Dewey defended the view that things understood as isolated from any relationship with the human organism could not be objects of knowledge at all.

Dewey was sensitive and responsive to the criticisms brought against his views. He often attributed them to misinterpretations based on the traditional, philosophical connotations that some of his readers would attach to his terminology. This was clearly a fair assessment with respect to some of his critics. To take one example, Dewey used the term “experience,” found throughout his philosophical writings, to denote the broad context of the human organism’s interrelationship with its environment, not the domain of human thought alone, as some of his critics read him to mean. Dewey’s concern for clarity of expression motivated efforts in his later writings to revise his terminology. Thus, for example, he later substituted “transaction” for his earlier “interaction” to denote the relationship between organism and environment, since the former better suggested a dynamic interdependence between the two, and in a new introduction to Experience and Nature, never published during his lifetime, he offered the term “culture” as an alternative to “experience.” Late in his career he attempted a more sweeping revision of philosophical terminology in Knowing and the Known, written in collaboration with Arthur F. Bentley.

The influence of Dewey’s work, along with that of the pragmatic school of thought itself, although considerable in the first few decades of the twentieth century, was gradually eclipsed during the middle part of the century as other philosophical methods, such as those of the analytic school in England and America and phenomenology in continental Europe, grew to ascendency. Recent trends in philosophy, however, leading to the dissolution of these rigid paradigms, have led to approaches that continue and expand on the themes of Dewey’s work. W. V. O. Quine’s project of naturalizing epistemology works upon naturalistic presumptions anticipated in Dewey’s own naturalistic theory of inquiry. The social dimension and function of belief systems, explored by Dewey and other pragmatists, has received renewed attention by such writers as Richard Rorty and Jürgen Habermas. American phenomenologists such as Sandra Rosenthal and James Edie have considered the affinities of phenomenology and pragmatism, and Hilary Putnam, an analytically trained philosophy, has recently acknowledged the affinity of his own approach to ethics to that of Dewey’s. The renewed openness and pluralism of recent philosophical discussion has meant a renewed interest in Dewey’s philosophy, an interest that promises to continue for some time to come.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All of the published writings of John Dewey have been newly edited and published in The Collected Works of John Dewey, Jo Ann Boydston, ed., 37 volumes (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1967-1991).

Dewey’s complete correspondence has know been published in electronic form in The Correspondence of John Dewey, 3 vols., Larry Hickman, ed. (Charlottesville, Va: Intelex Corporation).

An authoritative collection of Dewey’s writings is The Essential Dewey, 2 vols., Larry Hickman and Thomas M. Alexander, eds. (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Thomas M. The Horizons of Feeling: John Dewey’s Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. Dewey’s Metaphysics. New York: Fordham University Press, 1988.
  • Boisvert, Raymond D. John Dewey: Rethinking Our Time. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Bullert, Gary. The Politics of John Dewey. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1983.
  • Campbell, James. Understanding John Dewey: Nature and Cooperative Intelligence. Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 1995.
  • Damico, Alfonso J. Individuality and Community: The Social and Political Thought of John Dewey. Gainesville, FL: University Presses of Florida, 1978.
  • Dykhuizen, George. The Life and Mind of John Dewey. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1973.
  • Eames, S. Morris. Experience and Value: Essays on John Dewey and Pragmatic Naturalism.Elizabeth R. Eames and Richard W. Field, eds. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 2003.
  • Eldridge, Michael. Transforming Experience: John Dewey’s Cultural Instrumentalism. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998.
  • Gouinlock, James. John Dewey’s Philosophy of Value. New York: Humanities Press, 1972.
  • Hickman, Larry. John Dewey’s Pragmatic Technology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990.
  • Hickman, Larry A., ed. Reading Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1998.
  • Hook, Sidney. John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait. New York: John Day Co., 1939; New York: Prometheus Books, 1995.
  • Jackson, Philip W. John Dewey and the Lessons of Art. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998.
  • Haskins, Casey and David I. Seiple, eds. Dewey Reconfigured: Essays on Deweyan Pragmatism.Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
  • Levine, Barbara. Works about John Dewey: 1886-1995. Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1996.
  • Rockefeller, Steven C. John Dewey: Religious Faith and Democratic Humanism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur and Lewis Edwin Hahn, eds. The Philosophy of John Dewey, The Library of Living Philosophers, vol. 1. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Sleeper, Ralph. The Necessity of Pragmatism: John Dewey’s Conception of Philosophy. New York: Yale University Press, 1987.
  • Thayer, H. S. The Logic of Pragmatism: An Examination of John Dewey’s Logic. New York: Humanities Press, 1952.
  • Tiles, J. E. Dewey. London: Routledge, 1988.
  • Welchman, Jennifer. Dewey’s Ethical Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.

Author Information

Richard Field
Email: rfield(at)
Northwest Missouri State University
U. S. A.

Confucius (551—479 B.C.E.)

confuciusBetter known in China as “Master Kong” (Chinese: Kongzi), Confucius was a fifth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose influence upon East Asian intellectual and social history is immeasurable. As a culturally symbolic figure, he has been alternately idealized, deified, dismissed, vilified, and rehabilitated over the millennia by both Asian and non-Asian thinkers and regimes. Given his extraordinary impact on Chinese, Korean, Japanese, and Vietnamese thought, it is ironic that so little can be known about Confucius. The tradition that bears his name – “Confucianism” (Chinese: Rujia) – ultimately traces itself to the sayings and biographical fragments recorded in the text known as the Analects (Chinese: Lunyu). As with the person of Confucius himself, scholars disagree about the origins and character of the Analects, but it remains the traditional source for information about Confucius’ life and teaching. Most scholars remain confident that it is possible to extract from the Analects several philosophical themes and views that may be safely attributed to this ancient Chinese sage. These are primarily ethical, rather than analytical-logical or metaphysical in nature, and include Confucius’ claim that Tian (“Heaven”) is aligned with moral order but dependent upon human agents to actualize its will; his concern for li (ritual propriety) as the instrument through which the family, the state, and the world may be aligned with Tian’s moral order; and his belief in the “contagious” nature of moral force (de), by which moral rulers diffuse morality to their subjects, moral parents raise moral children, and so forth.

Table of Contents

  1. The Confucius of History
  2. The Confucius of the Analects
  3. Theodicy
  4. Harmonious order
  5. Moral force
  6. Self-cultivation
  7. The Confucius of Myth
  8. The Confucius of the State
  9. Key Interpreters of Confucius
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Confucius of History

Sources for the historical recovery of Confucius’ life and thought are limited to texts that postdate his traditional lifetime (551-479 BCE) by a few decades at least and several centuries at most. Confucius’ appearances in Chinese texts are a sign of his popularity and utility among literate elites during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), Qin (221-206 BCE), and Han (206 BCE-220 CE) periods. These texts vary in character and function, from collections of biographical and pedagogical fragments such as the Analects to dynastic histories and works by later Confucian thinkers.

The historical Confucius, born in the small state of Lu on the Shandong peninsula in northeastern China, was a product of the “Spring and Autumn Period” (770-481 BCE). We know him mostly from texts that date to the “Warring States Period” (403-221 BCE). During these eras, China enjoyed no political unity and suffered from the internecine warfare of small states, remnants of the once-great Zhou polity that collapsed after “barbarian” invasions in 771 BCE. For more than three hundred years after the alleged year of Confucius’ birth, the Chinese would fight each other for mastery of the empire lost by the Zhou. In the process, life became difficult, especially for the shi (“retainer” or “knight”) class, from which Confucius himself arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.

Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Confucius is said to have held office for only a short time before withdrawing into scholarly retirement. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples – young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life. It is precisely such master-and-disciple exchanges between Confucius and his students that the Analects claims to record.

2. The Confucius of the Analects

Above all else, the Analects depicts Confucius as someone who “transmits, but does not innovate” (7.1). What Confucius claimed to transmit was the Dao (Way) of the sages of Zhou antiquity; in the Analects, he is the erudite guardian of tradition who challenges his disciples to emulate the sages of the past and restore the moral integrity of the state. Although readers of the Analects often assume that Confucius’ views are presented as a coherent and consistent system within the text, a careful reading reveals several different sets of philosophical concerns which do not conflict so much as they complement one another. These complimentary sets of concerns can be categorized into four groups:

  • Theodicy
  • Harmonious order
  • Moral force
  • Self-cultivation

3. Theodicy

Those familiar with Enlightenment-influenced presentations of Confucius as an austere humanist who did not discuss the supernatural may be surprised to encounter the term “theodicy” as a framework for understanding Confucius’ philosophical concerns. Confucius’ record of silence on the subject of the divine is attested by the Analects (5.13, 7.21, 11.12). In fact, as a child of the late Zhou world, Confucius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, “The Lord on High” (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian (“Sky” or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming (“the mandate of Heaven”). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.By the time of Confucius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly. For one thing, the ritual complex of Zhou diviners, which served to ascertain the will of Tian for the benefit of the king, had collapsed with Zhou rule itself. At the same time, the network of religious obligations to manifold divinities, local spirits, and ancestors does not seem to have ceased with the fall of the Zhou, and Confucius appears to uphold sacrifices to “gods and ghosts” as consistent with “transmitting” noble tradition. Yet, in the Analects, a new aspect of Tian emerges. For the Confucius of the Analects, discerning the will of Tian and reconciling it with his own moral compass sometimes proves to be a troubling exercise:

If Heaven is about to abandon this culture, those who die afterwards will not get to share in it; if Heaven has not yet abandoned this culture, what can the men of Guang [Confucius’ adversaries in this instance] do to me? (9.5)

There is no one who recognizes me…. I neither resent Heaven nor blame humanity. In learning about the lower I have understood the higher. The one who recognizes me – wouldn’t that be Heaven? (14.35)

Heaven has abandoned me! Heaven has abandoned me! (11.9)

As A. C. Graham has noted, Confucius seems to be of two minds about Tian. At times, he is convinced that he enjoys the personal protection and sanction of Tian, and thus defies his mortal opponents as he wages his campaign of moral instruction and reform. At other moments, however, he seems caught in the throes of existential despair, wondering if he has lost his divine backer at last. Tian seems to participate in functions of “fate” and “nature” as well as those of “deity.” What remains consistent throughout Confucius’ discourses on Tian is his threefold assumption about this extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. Thus, to the extent that the Confucius of the Analects is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deeply in the Chinese past.

4. Harmonious order

The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for Confucius’ insistence on moral, political, social, and even religious activism. In one passage (17.19), Confucius seems to believe that, just as Tian does not speak but yet accomplishes its will for the cosmos, so too can he remain “silent” (in the sense of being out of office, perhaps) and yet effective in promoting his principles, possibly through the many disciples he trained for government service. At any rate, much of Confucius’ teaching is directed toward the maintenance of three interlocking kinds of order: (1) aesthetic, (2) moral, and (3) social. The instrument for effecting and emulating all three is li (ritual propriety).

Do not look at, do not listen to, do not speak of, do not do whatever is contrary to ritual propriety. (12.1)

In this passage, Confucius underscores the crucial importance of rigorous attention to li as a kind of self-replicating blueprint for good manners and taste, morality, and social order. In his view, the appropriate use of a quotation from the Classic of Poetry (Shijing), the perfect execution of guest-host etiquette, and the correct performance of court ritual all serve a common end: they regulate and maintain order. The nature of this order is, as mentioned above, threefold. It is aesthetic — quoting the Shijing upholds the cultural hegemony of Zhou literature and the conventions of elite good taste. Moreover, it is moral — good manners demonstrate both concern for others and a sense of one’s place. Finally, it is social — rituals properly performed duplicate ideal hierarchies of power, whether between ruler and subject, parent and child, or husband and wife. For Confucius, the paramount example of harmonious social order seems to be xiao (filial piety), of which jing (reverence) is the key quality:

Observe what a person has in mind to do when his father is alive, and then observe what he does when his father is dead. If, for three years, he makes no changes to his father’s ways, he can be said to be a good son. (1.11)

[The disciple] Ziyu asked about filial piety. The Master said, “Nowadays, for a person to be filial means no more than that he is able to provide his parents with food. Even dogs and horses are provided with food. If a person shows no reverence, where is the difference?” (2.7)

In serving your father and mother, you ought to dissuade them from doing wrong in the gentlest way. If you see your advice being ignored, you should not become disobedient but should remain reverent. You should not complain even if you are distressed. (4.18)

The character of this threefold order is deeper than mere conventions such as taste and decorum, as the above quotations demonstrate. Labeling it “aesthetic” might appear to demean or trivialize it, but to draw this conclusion is to fail to reflect on the peculiar way in which many Western thinkers tend to devalue the aesthetic. As David Hall and Roger Ames have argued, this “aesthetic” Confucian order is understood to be both intrinsically moral and profoundly harmonious, whether for a shi household, the court of a Warring States king, or the cosmos at large. When persons and things are in their proper places – and here tradition is the measure of propriety – relations are smooth, operations are effortless, and the good is sought and done voluntarily. In the hierarchical political and social conception of Confucius (and all of his Chinese contemporaries), what is below takes its cues from what is above. A moral ruler will diffuse morality to those under his sway; a moral parent will raise a moral child:

Let the ruler be a ruler, the subject a subject, a father a father, and a son a son. (12.11)

Direct the people with moral force and regulate them with ritual, and they will possess shame, and moreover, they will be righteous. (2.3)

5. Moral force

The last quotation from the Analects introduces a term perhaps most famously associated with a very different early Chinese text, the Laozi (Lao-tzu) or Daodejing (Tao Te Ching)de (te), “moral force.” Like Tian, de is heavily freighted with a long train of cultural and religious baggage, extending far back into the mists of early Chinese history. During the early Zhou period, de seems to have been a kind of amoral, almost magical power attributed to various persons – seductive women, charismatic leaders, etc. For Confucius, de seems to be just as magically efficacious, but stringently moral. It is both a quality, and a virtue of, the successful ruler:

One who rules by moral force may be compared to the North Star – it occupies its place and all the stars pay homage to it. (2.1)

De is a quality of the successful ruler, because he rules at the pleasure of Tian, which for Confucius is resolutely allied with morality, and to which he attributes his own inner de (7.23). De is the virtue of the successful ruler, without which he could not rule at all.

Confucius’ vision of order unites aesthetic concerns for harmony and symmetry (li) with moral force (de) in pursuit of social goals: a well-ordered family, a well-ordered state, and a well-ordered world. Such an aesthetic, moral, and social program begins at home, with the cultivation of the individual.

6. Self-Cultivation

In the Analects, two types of persons are opposed to one another – not in terms of basic potential (for, in 17.2, Confucius says all human beings are alike at birth), but in terms of developed potential. These are the junzi (literally, “lord’s son” or “gentleman”; Tu Wei-ming has originated the useful translation “profound person,” which will be used here) and the xiaoren (“small person”):

The profound person understands what is moral. The small person understands what is profitable. (4.16)

The junzi is the person who always manifests the quality of ren (jen) in his person and the displays the quality of yi (i) in his actions (4.5). The character for ren is composed of two graphic elements, one representing a human being and the other representing the number two. Based on this, one often hears that ren means “how two people should treat one another.” While such folk etymologies are common in discussions of Chinese characters, they often are as misleading as they are entertaining. In the case of ren – usually translated as “benevolence” or “humaneness” – the graphic elements of a human being and the number two really are instructive, so much so that Peter Boodberg suggested an evocative translation of ren as “co-humanity.” The way in which the junzi relates to his fellow human beings, however, highlights Confucius’ fundamentally hierarchical model of relations:

The moral force of the profound person is like the wind; the moral force of the small person is like the grass. Let the wind blow over the grass and it is sure to bend. (12.19)

D. C. Lau has pointed out that ren is an attribute of agents, while yi (literally, “what is fitting” — “rightness,” “righteousness”) is an attribute of actions. This helps to make clear the conceptual links between li, de, and the junzi. The junzi qua junzi exerts de, moral force, according to what is yi, fitting (that is, what is aesthetically, morally, and socially proper), and thus manifests ren, or the virtue of co-humanity in an interdependent, hierarchical universe over which Tian presides.

Two passages from the Analects go a long way in indicating the path toward self-cultivation that Confucius taught would-be junzi in fifth century BCE China:

From the age of fifteen on, I have been intent upon learning; from thirty on, I have established myself; from forty on, I have not been confused; from fifty on, I have known the mandate of Heaven; from sixty on, my ear has been attuned; from seventy on, I have followed my heart’s desire without transgressing what is right. (2.4)

The Master’s Way is nothing but other-regard and self-reflection. (4.15)

The first passage illustrates the gradual and long-term scale of the process of self-cultivation. It begins during one’s teenaged years, and extends well into old age; it proceeds incrementally from intention (zhi) to learning (xue), from knowing the mandate of Heaven (Tianming) to doing both what is desired (yu) and what is right (yi). In his disciple Zengzi (Tseng-tzu)’s summary of his “Way” (Dao), Confucius teaches only “other-regard” (zhong) and “self-reflection” (shu). These terms merit their own discussion.

The conventional meaning of “other-regard” (zhong) in classical Chinese is “loyalty,” especially loyalty to a ruler on the part of a minister. In the Analects, Confucius extends the meaning of the term to include exercising oneself to the fullest in all relationships, including relationships with those below oneself as well as with one’s betters. “Self-reflection” (shu) is explained by Confucius as a negatively-phrased version of the “Golden Rule”: “What you do not desire for yourself, do not do to others.” (15.24) When one reflects upon oneself, one realizes the necessity of concern for others. The self as conceptualized by Confucius is a deeply relational self that responds to inner reflection with outer virtue.

Similarly, the self that Confucius wishes to cultivate in his own person and in his disciples is one that looks within and compares itself with the aesthetic, moral, and social canons of tradition. Aware of its source in Tian, it seeks to maximize ren through apprenticeship to li so as to exercise de in a manner befitting a junzi. Because Confucius (and early Chinese thought in general) does not suffer from the Cartesian “mind-body problem” (as Herbert Fingarette has demonstrated), there is no dichotomy between inner and outer, self and whole, and thus the cumulative effect of Confucian self-cultivation is not merely personal, but collectively social and even cosmic.

7. The Confucius of Myth

While the Analects is valuable, albeit not infallible, as a source for the reconstruction of Confucius’ thought, it is far from being the only text to which Chinese readers have turned in their quest for discovering his identity. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE), numerous hagiographical accounts of Confucius’ origins and deeds were produced, many of which would startle readers familiar only with the Analects. According to various texts, Confucius was a superhuman figure destined to rule as the “uncrowned king” of pre-imperial China. At birth, his body was said to have displayed special markings indicating his exemplary status. After his death, he was alleged to have revealed himself in a glorified state to his living disciples, who then received further esoteric teachings from their apotheosized master. Eventually, and perhaps inevitably, he was recognized as a deity and a cult organized itself around his worship. Feng Youlan has suggested that, had these Han images of Confucius prevailed, Confucius would have become a figure comparable to Jesus Christ in the history of China, and there would have been no arguments among scholars about whether or not Confucianism was a religion like Christianity.

To both ancient modern eyes, fantastic and improbable myths of Confucius should be added more recent myths about the sage that date from the earliest sustained contact between China and the West during the early modern period. The Latinization of Kong(fu)zi to “Confucius” originates with the interpretation of Chinese culture and thought by Jesuit missionaries for their Western audiences, supporters, and critics. Jesuits steeped in Renaissance humanism saw in Confucius a Renaissance humanist; German thinkers such as Leibniz or Wolff recognized in him an Enlightenment sage. Hegel condemned Confucius for exemplifying those whom he saw as “the people without history”; Mao castigated Confucius for imprisoning China in a cage of feudal archaism and oppression. Each remade Confucius in his own image for his own ends – a process that continues throughout the modern era, creating great heat and little light where the historical Confucius himself is concerned. Each mythologizer has seen Confucius as a symbol of whatever s/he loves or hates about China. As H. G. Creel once put it, once a figure like Confucius has become a cultural hero, stories about him tell us more about the values of the storytellers than about Confucius himself.

8. The Confucius of the State

Such mythmaking was very important to the emerging imperial Chinese state, however, as it struggled to impose cultural unity on a vast and fractious territory during the final few centuries BCE and beyond into the Common Era. After the initial persecution of Confucians during the short-lived Qin dynasty (221-202 BCE), the succeeding Han emperors and their ministers seized upon Confucius as a vehicle for the legitimation of their rule and the social control of their subjects. The “Five Classics” – five ancient texts associated with Confucius – were established as the basis for the imperial civil service examinations in 136 BCE, making memorization of these texts and their orthodox Confucian interpretations mandatory for all who wished to obtain official positions in the Han government. The state’s love affair with Confucius carried on through the end of the Han in 220 CE, after which Confucius fell out of official favor as a series of warring factions struggled for control of China during the “Period of Disunity” (220-589 CE) and foreign and indigenous religious traditions such as Buddhism and Daoism rivaled Confucianism for the attentions of the elite.

After the restoration of unified imperial government with the Tang dynasty (618-907 CE), however, the future of Confucius as a symbol of the Chinese cultural and political establishment became increasingly secure. State-sponsored sacrifices to him formed part of the official religious complex of temple rituals, from the national to the local level, and orthodox hagiography and history cemented his reputation as cultural hero among the masses. The Song dynasty (969-1279 CE) Confucian scholar Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) institutionalized the study of the Analects as one of “Four Books” required for the redesigned imperial civil service examinations, and aspiring officials continued to memorize the text and orthodox commentaries on it until the early twentieth century.

With the fall of the last Chinese imperial government in 1911, Confucius also fell from his position of state-imposed grandeur – but not for long. Within a short time of the abdication of the last emperor, monarchists were plotting to restore a Confucian ruler to the throne. Although these plans did not materialize, the Nationalist regime in mainland China and later in Taiwan has promoted Confucius and Confucianism in a variety of ways in order to distinguish itself from the iconoclastic Communists who followed Mao to victory and control over most of China in 1949. Even the Communist regime in China has bowed reverentially to Confucius on occasion, although not without vilifying him first, especially during the anti-traditional “Cultural Revolution” campaigns of the late 1960s and early 1970s.

Today, the Communist government of China spends a great deal of money on the reconstruction and restoration of old imperial temples to Confucius across the country, and has even erected many new statues of Confucius in areas likely to be frequented by tourists from overseas. Predictably, Confucius, as a philosopher, has been rehabilitated by culturally Chinese regimes across Asia, from Singapore to Beijing, as what Wm. Th. de Bary has called “the East Asian challenge for human rights” has prompted attempts to ground “human rights with Chinese characteristics” in an authentically traditional source. In short, Confucius seems far from dead, although one wonders if the authentic spirit of his fifth century BCE thought ever will live again.

9. Key Interpreters of Confucius

Detailed discussion of Confucius’ key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.

The two best known early interpreters of Confucius’ thought – besides the compilers of the Analects themselves, who worked gradually from the time of Confucius’ death until sometime during the former Han dynasty – are the Warring States philosophers “Mencius” or Mengzi (Meng-tzu, 372-289 BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Neither knew Confucius personally, nor did they know one another, except retrospectively, as in the case of Xunzi commenting on Mencius. The two usually are cast as being opposed to one another because of their disagreement over human nature – a subject on which Confucius was notably silent (Analects 5.13).

Mencius illustrates a pattern typical of Confucius’ interpreters in that he claims to be doing nothing more than “transmitting” Confucius’ thought while introducing new ideas of his own. For Mencius, renxing (human nature) is congenitally disposed toward ren, but requires cultivation through li as well as yogic disciplines related to one’s qi (vital energy), and may be stunted (although never destroyed) through neglect or negative environmental influence. Confucius does not use the term renxing in the Analects, nor does he describe qi in Mencius’ sense, and nowhere does he provide an account of the basic goodness of human beings. Nonetheless, it is Mencius’ interpretation of Confucius’ thought – especially after the ascendancy of Zhu Xi’s brand of Confucianism in the twelfth century CE – that became regarded as orthodox by most Chinese thinkers.

Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius’ thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing. Although Xunzi condemns Mencius’ arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines.

Later interpreters of Confucius’ thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of “Neo-Confucianism.” This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE), and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius’ understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the “Five Classics” and “Four Books” associated with Confucius as authoritative sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. These thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which isolates them from the Confucius of the Analects, and betrays the influence of Buddhism and Daoism – two movements with little or no popular following in Confucius’ China — on their thought.

This cursory review of some seminal interpreters of Confucius’ thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Confucius’ philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. All sources for reconstructing Confucius’ views, from the Analects on down, postdate the master and come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fifth century BCE China.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Allan, Sarah. The Way of Water and Sprouts of Virtue. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Allinson, Robert E. “The Golden Rule as the Core Value in Confucianism and Christianity: Ethical Similarities and Differences.” Asian Philosophy 2/2 (1992): 173-185.
  • Ames, Roger T., and Henry Rosemont, Jr., trans. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballatine, 1998.
  • Ames, Roger T. “The Focus-Field Self in Classical Confucianism,” in Self as Person in Asian Theory and Practice, ed. Roger T. Ames (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994), 187-212.
  • Berthrong, John. “Trends in the Interpretation of Confucian Religiosity,” in The Confucian-Christian Encounter in Historical and Contemporary Perspective, ed. Peter K. H. Lee (Lewiston, ME: Edwin Mellen Press, 1991), 226-254.
  • Boodberg, Peter A. “The Semasiology of Some Primary Confucian Concepts,” in Selected Works of Peter A. Boodberg, ed. Alvin P. Cohen (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1979), 26-40.
  • Brooks, E. Bruce and A. Taeko, trans. The Original Analects: Sayings of Confucius and His Successors. New York: Columbia University Press, 1998.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Cheng, Anne. “Lun-yü,” in Early Chinese Texts: A Bibliographical Guide, ed. Michael Loewe (Berkeley: Society for the Study of Early China and the Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California, Berkeley, 1993), 313-323.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. Confucius and the Chinese Way. New York: Harper and Row, 1949.
  • Creel, Herrlee G. “Was Confucius Agnostic?” T’oung Pao 29 (1935): 55-99.
  • Csikszentmihalyi, Mark. “Confucius and the Analects in the Hàn,” in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 134-162.
  • Eno, Robert. The Confucian Creation of Heaven. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Fingarette, Herbert. Confucius — The Secular as Sacred. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1972.
  • Graham, A. C. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1989.
  • Hall, David L., and Roger T. Ames. Thinking Through Confucius. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. “Whose Confucius? Which Analects?” in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 119-133.
  • Lau, D.C., trans. Confucius — The Analects. 2nd ed. Hong Kong: Chinese University Press, 1992.
  • Legge, James, trans. Confucius — Confucian Analects, The Great Learning, and the Doctrine of the Mean. New York: Dover Publications, 1971.
  • Munro, Donald J. The Concept of Man In Early China. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Nivison, David S. “The Classical Philosophical Writings,” in The Cambridge History of Ancient China: From the Origins of Civilization to 221 B.C., ed. Michael Loewe and Edward L. Shaughnessy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), 745-812.
  • Nivison, David S. The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy. Ed. Bryan W. Van Norden. Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1996.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin I. The World of Thought in Ancient China. Cambridge, MA: The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Shryock, John K. The Origin and Development of the State Cult of Confucius. New York: Century Company, 1932.
  • Taylor, Rodney L. “The Religious Character of the Confucian Tradition.” Philosophy East and West 48/1 (January 1998): 80-107.
  • Tu, Wei-ming. “Li as a Process of Humanization,” in Tu, Humanity and Self-Cultivation: Essays in Confucian Thought (Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1979), 17-34.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. “Introduction,” in Confucius and the Analects: New Essays, ed. Bryan W. Van Norden (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002), 3-38.
  • Waley, Arthur, trans. The Analects of Confucius. New York: The MacMillan Company, 1938.

Author Information

Jeff Richey
Berea College
U. S. A.

Cicero (106—43 B.C.E.)

cicero-02Marcus Tullius Cicero was born on January 3, 106 B.C.E. and was murdered on December 7, 43 B.C.E. His life coincided with the decline and fall of the Roman Republic, and he was an important actor in many of the significant political events of his time, and his writings are now a valuable source of information to us about those events. He was, among other things, an orator, lawyer, politician, and philosopher. Making sense of his writings and understanding his philosophy requires us to keep that in mind. He placed politics above philosophical study; the latter was valuable in its own right but was even more valuable as the means to more effective political action. The only periods of his life in which he wrote philosophical works were the times he was forcibly prevented from taking part in politics.

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine’s claim that it was Cicero’s Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero’s definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians.

Table of Contents

  1. Cicero’s life
  2. Cicero’s influence
  3. Cicero’s thought
  4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics
  5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism
  6. Cicero and Epicureanism
  7. Cicero’s writings
    1. On Invention
    2. On the Orator
    3. On the Republic
    4. On the Laws
    5. Brutus
    6. Stoic Paradoxes
    7. The Orator
    8. Consolation
    9. Hortensius
    10. Academics
    11. On Ends
    12. Tusculan Disputations
    13. On the Nature of the Gods
    14. On Divination
    15. On Fate
    16. On Old Age
    17. On Friendship
    18. Topics
    19. On Duties
  8. Further reading on Cicero’s life
  9. Further reading on Cicero’s philosophy
    1. Texts by Cicero
    2. Texts about Cicero

1. Cicero’s life

Cicero’s political career was a remarkable one. At the time, high political offices in Rome, though technically achieved by winning elections, were almost exclusively controlled by a group of wealthy aristocratic families that had held them for many generations. Cicero’s family, though aristocratic, was not one of them, nor did it have great wealth. But Cicero had a great deal of political ambition; at a very young age he chose as his motto the same one Achilles was said to have had: to always be the best and overtop the rest. Lacking the advantages of a proper ancestry, there were essentially only two career options open to him. One was a military career, since military success was thought to result from exceptional personal qualities and could lead to popularity and therefore political opportunity (as was the case much later for American presidents Ulysses S. Grant and Dwight D. Eisenhower). Cicero, however, was no soldier. He hated war, and served in the military only very briefly as a young man.

Instead, Cicero chose a career in the law. To prepare for this career, he studied jurisprudence, rhetoric, and philosophy. When he felt he was ready, he began taking part in legal cases. A career in the law could lead to political success for several reasons, all of which are still relevant today. First, a lawyer would gain a great deal of experience in making speeches. Second, he (there were no female lawyers in Rome) could also gain exposure and popularity from high-profile cases. Finally, a successful lawyer would build up a network of political connections, which is important now but was even more important in Cicero’s time, when political competition was not conducted along party lines or on the basis of ideology, but instead was based on loose, shifting networks of personal friendships and commitments. Cicero proved to be an excellent orator and lawyer, and a shrewd politician. He was elected to each of the principal Roman offices (quaestor, aedile, praetor, and consul) on his first try and at the earliest age at which he was legally allowed to run for them. Having held office made him a member of the Roman Senate. This body had no formal authority — it could only offer advice — but its advice was almost always followed. He was, as can be imagined, very proud of his successes. (Though this is not the place for a long discussion of Roman government, it should be noted that the Roman republic was not a democracy. It was really more of an oligarchy than anything else, with a few men wielding almost all economic and political power).

During his term as consul (the highest Roman office) in 63 B.C.E. he was responsible for unraveling and exposing the conspiracy of Catiline, which aimed at taking over the Roman state by force, and five of the conspirators were put to death without trial on Cicero’s orders. Cicero was proud of this too, claiming that he had singlehandedly saved the commonwealth; many of his contemporaries and many later commentators have suggested that he exaggerated the magnitude of his success. But there can be little doubt that Cicero enjoyed widespread popularity at this time – though his policy regarding the Catilinarian conspirators had also made him enemies, and the executions without trial gave them an opening.

The next few years were very turbulent, and in 60 B.C.E. Julius Caesar, Pompey, and Crassus (often referred to today as the First Triumvirate) combined their resources and took control of Roman politics. Recognizing his popularity and talents, they made several attempts to get Cicero to join them, but Cicero hesitated and eventually refused, preferring to remain loyal to the Senate and the idea of the Republic. This left him open to attacks by his enemies, and in January of 58 B.C.E. one of them, the tribune Clodius (a follower of Caesar’s), proposed a law to be applied retroactively stating that anyone who killed a Roman citizen without trial would be stripped of their citizenship and forced into exile. This proposal led to rioting and physical attacks on Cicero, who fled the city. The law passed. Cicero was forbidden to live within 500 miles of Italy, and all his property was confiscated. This exile, during which Cicero could not take part in politics, provided the time for his first period of sustained philosophical study as an adult. After roughly a year and a half of exile, the political conditions changed, his property was restored to him, and he was allowed to return to Rome, which he did to great popular approval, claiming that the Republic was restored with him. This was also treated by many as an absurd exaggeration.

Cicero owed a debt to the triumvirate for ending his exile (and for not killing him), and for the next eight years he repaid that debt as a lawyer. Because he still could not engage in politics, he also had time to continue his studies of philosophy, and between 55 and 51 he wrote On the Orator, On the Republic, and On the Laws. The triumvirate, inherently unstable, collapsed with the death of Crassus and in 49 B.C.E. Caesar crossed the Rubicon River, entering Italy with his army and igniting a civil war between himself and Pompey (Caesar’s own account of this war still survives). Cicero was on Pompey’s side, though halfheartedly. He felt that at this point the question was not whether Rome would be a republic or an empire but whether Pompey or Caesar would be Emperor, and he believed that it would make little difference, for it would be a disaster in either case. Caesar and his forces won in 48 B.C.E., and Caesar became the first Roman emperor. He gave Cicero a pardon and allowed him to return to Rome in July of 47 B.C.E., but Cicero was forced to stay out of politics. Most of the rest of his life was devoted to studying and writing about philosophy, and he produced the rest of his philosophical writings during this time.

Caesar was murdered by a group of senators on the Ides of March in 44 B.C.E. Cicero was a witness to the murder, though he was not a part of the conspiracy. The murder led to another power struggle in which Mark Antony (of “Antony and Cleopatra” fame), Marcus Lepidus, and Octavian (later called Augustus) were the key players. It also gave Cicero, who still hoped that the Republic could be restored, the opportunity for what is considered his finest hour as a politician. With Caesar dead, the Senate once again mattered, and it was to the Senate that Cicero made the series of speeches known as the Philippics (named after the speeches the Greek orator Demosthenes made to rouse the Athenians to fight Philip of Macedon). These speeches called for the Senate to aid Octavian in overcoming Antony (Cicero believed that Octavian, still a teenager, would prove to be a useful tool who could be discarded by the Senate once his purpose was served).

However, Antony, Lepidus, and Octavian were able to come to terms and agreed to share power. Each of them had enemies that he wanted eliminated, and as part of the power-sharing deal each got to eliminate those enemies. Antony put not only Cicero but also his son, his brother, and his nephew on the list of those to be killed (the Philippics are not very nice to him at all, especially the Second Philippic). Though Octavian owed his success in part to Cicero, he chose not to extend his protection to Cicero and his family. Cicero, his brother, and his nephew tried somewhat belatedly to flee Italy. His brother and nephew turned aside to collect more money for the trip, and were killed. Cicero kept going. Plutarch describes the end of Cicero’s life: “Cicero heard [his pursuers] coming and ordered his servants to set the litter [in which he was being carried] down where they were. He…looked steadfastly at his murderers. He was all covered in dust; his hair was long and disordered, and his face was pinched and wasted with his anxieties – so that most of those who stood by covered their faces while Herennius was killing him. His throat was cut as he stretched his neck out from the litter….By Antony’s orders Herennius cut off his head and his hands.” Antony then had Cicero’s head and hands nailed to the speaker’s podium in the Senate as a warning to others. Cicero’s son, also named Marcus, who was in Greece at this time, was not executed. He became consul in 30 B.C.E. under Octavian, who had defeated Antony after the Second Triumvirate collapsed. As consul, the younger Marcus got to announce Antony’s suicide to the Senate. It is unfortunate that we have no record of this speech.

2. Cicero’s influence

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine’s claim that it was Cicero’s Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero’s definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians. Further discussion of Cicero’s influence on later philosophers can be found in MacKendrick, Chapter 20 and Appendix.

3. Cicero’s thought

Cicero subordinated philosophy to politics, so it should not surprise us to discover that his philosophy had a political purpose: the defense, and if possible the improvement, of the Roman Republic. The politicians of his time, he believed, were corrupt and no longer possessed the virtuous character that had been the main attribute of Romans in the earlier days of Roman history. This loss of virtue was, he believed, the cause of the Republic’s difficulties. He hoped that the leaders of Rome, especially in the Senate, would listen to his pleas to renew the Republic. This could only happen if the Roman elite chose to improve their characters and place commitments to individual virtue and social stability ahead of their desires for fame, wealth, and power. Having done this, the elite would enact legislation that would force others to adhere to similar standards, and the Republic would flourish once again. Whether this belief shows an admirable commitment to the principles of virtue and nobility or a blindness to the nature of the exceedingly turbulent and violent politics of his time, or perhaps both, is impossible to say with certainty.

Cicero, therefore, tried to use philosophy to bring about his political goals. Like most intellectual endeavors in Cicero’s time, philosophy was an activity in which Greece (and especially Athens) still held the lead. The Romans were more interested in practical matters of law, governance, and military strategy than they were in philosophy and art (many of Cicero’s writings include justifications for his study of philosophy and arguments that it ought to be taken seriously). But for Cicero to really use philosophy effectively, he needed to make it accessible to a Roman audience. He did this in part by translating Greek works into Latin, including inventing Latin words where none seemed suitable for Greek concepts (including the Latin words which give us the English words morals, property, individual, science, image, and appetite), and in part by drawing on and idealizing Roman history to provide examples of appropriate conduct and to illustrate the arguments of philosophy. He also summarized in Latin many of the beliefs of the primary Greek philosophical schools of the time (and he is the source of much of our knowledge about these schools). These included the Academic Skeptics, >Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans. Cicero was well acquainted with all these schools, and had teachers in each of them at different times of his life. But he professed allegiance throughout his life to the Academy.

4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics

In Cicero’s time there were in fact two schools claiming to be descended from the First Academy, established by Plato. Cicero studied briefly in both the Old Academy and the New Academy; the differences between the two need not concern us. What they shared was their basic commitment to skepticism: a belief that human beings cannot be certain in their knowledge about the world, and therefore no philosophy can be said to be true. The Academic Skeptics offered little in the way of positive argument themselves; they mostly criticized the arguments of others.

This can be annoying, but it requires real mental abilities, including the ability to see all sides of an issue and to understand and accept that any belief, no matter how cherished, is only provisional and subject to change later if a better argument presents itself. It is the approach which underlies the modern scientific method, though the Academics did not use it in that way. Even something like evolution, for which there is mountains of evidence and seemingly no resonable alternative, is treated as a theory subject to change if needed rather than an eternal truth.

And it is this approach which Cicero embraced. This is not surprising if we consider again why he was interested in philosophy in the first place. As a lawyer, he would need to see as many sides of an argument as possible in order to argue his clients’ cases effectively. He would have to marshal all the available evidence in a methodical way, so as to make the strongest possible case, and he would have to accept that he might at any time have to deal with new evidence or new issues, forcing him to totally reconsider his strategies. As a politician, he would need a similar grasp of the issues and a similar degree of flexibility in order to speak and to act effectively. A lawyer or politician who fanatically sticks to a particular point of view and cannot change is not likely to be successful. Adopting the teachings of the Academy also allowed Cicero to pick and choose whatever he wanted from the other philosophical schools, and he claims to do this at various points in his writings. Finally, his allegiance to the Academy helps to explain his use of the dialogue form: it enables Cicero to put a number of arguments in the mouths of others without having to endorse any particular position himself.

However, Cicero did not consistently write as a member of the Academy. Skepticism can, if taken to extremes, lead to complete inaction (if we can’t be certain of the correctness of our decisions or of our actions, why do anything at all?) which was incompatible with Cicero’s commitment to political activity. Even if it isn’t taken that far, it can still be dangerous. It may not be a problem if trained, knowledgeable philosophers are skeptical about things like whether the gods exist or whether the laws are just. But if people in general are skeptical about these things, they may end up behaving lawlessly and immorally (see Aristophanes’ Clouds for a portrayal of this). Thus, while Cicero is willing to accept Academic Skepticism in some areas, he is not willing to do so when it comes to ethics and politics. For doctrines in these areas, he turns to the Stoics and Peripatetics.

5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism

Cicero believed that these two schools taught essentially the same things, and that the difference between them was whether virtue was the only thing human beings should pursue or whether it was merely the best thing to be pursued. According to the first view, things like money and health have no value; according to the second, they have value but nowhere near enough to justify turning away from virtue to attain them. This was a difference with little practical consequence, so far as Cicero was concerned, and there is no need to take it up here.

Since, according to the teachings of the Academy, Cicero was free to accept any argument that he found convincing, he could readily make use of Stoic teachings, and he did so particularly when discussing politics and ethics. In the Laws, for example, he explicitly says that he is setting aside his skepticism, for it is dangerous if people do not believe unhesitatingly in the sanctity of the laws and of justice. Thus he will rely on Stoicism instead. He puts forth Stoic doctrines not dogmatically, as absolutely and always true, but as the best set of beliefs so far developed. We ought to adhere to them because our lives, both individually and collectively, will be better if we do. It is essentially Stoic ethical teachings that Cicero urges the Roman elite to adopt.

Stoicism as Cicero understood it held that the gods existed and loved human beings. Both during and after a person’s life, the gods rewarded or punished human beings according to their conduct in life. The gods had also provided human beings with the gift of reason. Since humans have this in common with the gods, but animals share our love of pleasure, the Stoics argued, as Socrates had, that the best, most virtuous, and most divine life was one lived according to reason, not according to the search for pleasure. This did not mean that humans had to shun pleasure, only that it must be enjoyed in the right way. For example, it was fine to enjoy sex, but not with another man’s wife. It was fine to enjoy wine, but not to the point of shameful drunkenness. Finally, the Stoics believed that human beings were all meant to follow natural law, which arises from reason. The natural law is also the source of all properly made human laws and communities. Because human beings share reason and the natural law, humanity as a whole can be thought of as a kind of community, and because each of us is part of a group of human beings with shared human laws, each of us is also part of a political community. This being the case, we have duties to each of these communities, and the Stoics recognized an obligation to take part in politics (so far as is possible) in order to discharge those duties. The Stoic enters politics not for public approval, wealth, or power (which are meaningless) but in order to improve the communities of which they are a part. If politics is painful, as it would often prove to be for Cicero, that’s not important. What matters is that the virtuous life requires it.

6. Cicero and Epicureanism

For the Epicurean philosophy Cicero had only disdain throughout most of his life, though his best friend Atticus was an Epicurean. This disdain leads him to seriously misrepresent its teachings as being based on the shameless pursuit of base pleasures, such as food, sex, and wine (the modern day equivalent being sex, drugs, and rock’n’roll). However, this is not what Epicurus, who founded the school, or his later followers actually taught. Epicurus did claim that nature teaches us that pleasure is the only human good, and that life should therefore be guided by the pursuit of pleasure. But he meant by pleasure the absence of pain, including the pain caused by desires for wealth, fame, or power. This did not mean living life as one long Bacchanalia. Instead it meant withdrawing from politics and public life and living quietly with friends, engaged in the study of philosophy, which provided the highest pleasure possible (think of a monastery without the Bible and the rigorous discipline). The notion that the life of philosophy is the most pleasant life, of course, also comes from Socrates. Epicureans were also publicly atheists. Their atheism was based on a theory of atomism, which they were the first to propose. Everything in the universe, they argued, was made up of atoms, including the heavenly bodies; the gods did not exist. This knowledge was not a cause of despair but a cause of joy, they believed, since one of the greatest human pains is the pain caused by the fear of death and what lies beyond it. According to the Epicureans, death simply meant the end of sensation, as one’s atoms came apart. Thus there was no reason to fear it, because there was no divine judgment or afterlife. The best known Epicurean is Lucretius, a contemporary of Cicero’s at Rome who Cicero may have known personally. Lucretius’ On the Nature of Things, available online, sets out Epicurean teachings.

It is easy to see why Cicero, a man deeply involved in politics and the pursuit of glory, would find any doctrine that advocated the rejection of public life repulsive. It is also easy to see why someone concerned with the reform of character and conduct would reject public atheism, since fear of divine punishment often prevents people from acting immorally. During his forced exile from politics at the end of his life, however, some of his letters claim that he has gone over to Epicureanism, presumably for the reasons he hated it previously. No longer able to take part in public life, the best he could hope for was the cultivation of private life and the pleasures that it had to offer. Since Cicero abandoned this idea as soon as the opportunity to return to public life arose, there is no reason to take his professed conversion seriously – unless we wish to see in it an example of changing his beliefs to reflect changing circumstances, and thus an example of his commitment to the Academy.

7. Cicero’s writings

Cicero’s written work can be sorted into three categories. None can be said to represent the “true” Cicero, and all of Cicero’s work, we must remember, has a political purpose. This does not make it worthless as philosophy, but it should make us cautious about proclaiming anything in particular to be what Cicero “really thought.” Also, as an Academic skeptic, Cicero felt free to change his mind about something when a better position presented itself, and this makes it even more difficult to bring his writing together into a coherent whole.

The first category of Cicero’s work is his philosophic writings, many of which were patterned after Plato’s or Aristotle’s dialogues. These writings, in chronological order, include On Invention, On the Orator, On the Republic, On the Laws, Brutus, Stoic Paradoxes, The Orator, Consolation, Hortensius, Academics, On Ends, Tusculan Disputations, On the Nature of the Gods, On Divination, On Fate, On Old Age, On Friendship, Topics, On Glory, and On Duties. Unfortunately, several of them have been lost almost entirely (Hortensius, on the value of philosophy, the Consolation, which Cicero wrote to himself on the death of his beloved daughter Tullia in order to overcome his grief, and On Glory, almost totally lost) and several of the others are available only in fragmentary condition (notably the Laws, which Cicero may never have finished, and the Republic, fragments of which were only discovered in 1820 in the Vatican). These will be discussed in more detail below. While each of them is dedicated and addressed to a particular individual or two, they were intended to be read by a wide audience, and even at the end of his life Cicero never gave up entirely on the hope that the Republic and his influence would be restored. Hence these are not purely philosophical writings, but were designed with a political purpose in mind, and we are entitled to wonder whether Cicero is being entirely candid in the opinions that he expresses. Also, the dialogue form is useful for an author who wishes to express a number of opinions without having to endorse one. As we have seen, Cicero’s skepticism would have made this an especially attractive style. We should not assume too quickly that a particular character speaks for Cicero. Instead we should assume that, unless he explicitly says otherwise, Cicero wanted all the viewpoints presented to be considered seriously, even if some or all of them have weaknesses.

The second category is the speeches Cicero made as a lawyer and as a Senator, about 60 of which remain. These speeches provide many insights into Roman cultural, political, social, and intellectual life, as well as glimpses of Cicero’s philosophy. Many of them also describe the corruption and immorality of the Roman elite. However, they have to be taken with a grain of salt, because Cicero was writing and delivering them in order to achieve some legal outcome and/or political goal and by his own admission was not above saying misleading or inaccurate things if he thought they would be effective. In addition, the speeches that we have are not verbatim recordings of what Cicero actually said, but are versions that he polished later for publication (the modern American analogy would be to the Congressional Record, which allows members of Congress the opportunity to revise the text of their speeches before they are published in the Record). In some cases (such as the Second Philippic) the speech was never delivered at all, but was merely published in written form, again with some political goal in mind.

Finally, roughly 900 letters to and from (mostly from) Cicero have been preserved. Most of them were addressed to his close friend Atticus or his brother Quintius, but some correspondence to and from some other Romans including famous Romans such as Caesar has also been preserved. The letters often make an interesting contrast to the philosophic dialogues, as they deal for the most part not with lofty philosophical matters but with the mundane calculations, compromises, flatteries, and manipulations that were part of politics in Rome and which would be familiar to any politician today. It is important to be cautious in drawing conclusions from them about Cicero’s “true” beliefs since they rely on an understanding between the sender and recipient not available to others, because they are often not the result of full reflection or an attempt at complete clarity and precision (after all, a friend can be counted on to know what you mean), and because many of them, like the speeches, were written with a political purpose in mind that may make them less than fully truthful and straightforward.

Space does not allow us to discuss Cicero’s speeches and letters. The serious student of Cicero, however, will not want to ignore them. What follows is a brief summary of the main points each of Cicero’s philosophical works.

a. On Invention

Written while Cicero was still a teenager, it is a handbook on oratory. Cicero later dismissed it and argued that his other oratorical works had superceded it.

b. On the Orator

A lengthy treatise, in the form of a dialogue, on the ideal orator. While it is full of detail which can be tedious to those who are not deeply interested in the theory of rhetoric, it also contains useful discussions of the nature of and the relationships among law, philosophy, and rhetoric. Cicero places rhetoric above both law and philosophy, arguing that the ideal orator would have mastered both law and philosophy (including natural philosophy) and would add eloquence besides. He argues that in the old days philosophy and rhetoric were taught together, and that it is unfortunate that they have now been separated. The best orator would also be the best human being, who would understand the correct way to live, act upon it by taking a leading role in politics, and instruct others in it through speeches, through the example of his life, and through making good laws.

c. On the Republic

This dialogue is, unfortunately, in an extremely mutilated condition. It describes the ideal commonwealth, such as might be brought about by the orator described in On the Orator. In doing so it tries to provide philosophical underpinnings for existing Roman institutions and to demonstrate that Roman history has been essentially the increasing perfection of the Republic, which is superior to any other government because it is a mixed government. By this Cicero means that it combines elements of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy in the right balance; the contemporary reader may well disagree. But even this government can be destroyed and is being destroyed by the moral decay of the aristocracy. Thus Cicero describes the importance of an active life of virtue, the foundations of community, including the community of all human beings, the role of the statesman, and the concept of natural law. It also includes the famous Dream of Scipio.

d. On the Laws

This dialogue is also badly mutilated, and may never have been finished. In it Cicero lays out the laws that would be followed in the ideal commonwealth described in On the Republic. Finding the source of law and justice, he says, requires explaining “what nature has given to humans; what a quantity of wonderful things the human mind embraces; for the sake of performing and fulfilling what function we are born and brought into the world; what serves to unite people; and what natural bond there is between them.” Philosophy teaches us that by nature human beings have reason, that reason enables us to discover the principles of justice, and that justice gives us law. Therefore any valid law is rooted in nature, and any law not rooted in nature (such as a law made by a tyrant) is no law at all. The gods also share in reason, and because of this they can be said to be part of a community with humanity. They care for us, and punish and reward us as appropriate. Much of what remains of this dialogue is devoted to religious law.

e. Brutus

This dialogue too is in a mutilated condition. It is a history of oratory in Greece and Rome, listing hundreds of orators and their distinguishing characteristics, weaknesses as well as strengths. There is also some discussion of oratory in the abstract. Cicero says that the orator must “instruct his listener, give him pleasure, [and] stir his emotions,” and, as in On the Orator, that the true orator needs to have instruction in philosophy, history, and law. Such a person will have the tools necessary to become a leader of the commonwealth. This dialogue is less inclined to the argument that the orator must be a good man; for example, Cicero says that orators must be allowed to “distort history [i.e. lie] in order to give more point to their narrative.”

f. Stoic Paradoxes

Not a dialogue; Cicero lays out six Stoic principles (called paradoxes) which the average listener would not be likely to agree with and tries to make them both understandable and persuasive to such a listener. It is, he says, an exercise in turning the specialized jargon of the Stoics into plain speech for his own amusement (which obviously does not require Cicero to actually agree with any of the Stoic beliefs). The beliefs discussed are as follows: moral worth is the only good; virtue is sufficient for happiness; all sins and virtues are equal; every fool is insane; only the wise man is really free; only the wise man is really rich. These topics are largely taken up again in the Tusculan Disputations. MacKendrick argues strenuously that this work is far more than an idle amusement, and that it showcases Cicero’s rhetorical skills as well as being an attack on his enemies.

g. The Orator

Written in the form of a letter on the topic of the perfect orator, it includes a defense of Cicero’s own oratorical style (Cicero was never known for his modesty). It emphasizes that the orator must be able to prove things to the audience, please them, and sway their emotions. It also includes the famous quote “To be ignorant of what occurred before you were born is to remain always a child.”

h. Consolation

This text is lost except for fragments cited by other authors. Cicero wrote it to diminish his grief over the death of his daughter Tullia through the use of philosophy. From his letters we know that it was not entirely successful.

i. Hortensius

his text is heavily fragmented and we can determine little more than its broad outline. It is written in order to praise philosophy, which alone can bring true happiness through the development of reason and the overcoming of passions. In antiquity it was widely read and very popular; it was instrumental in converting St. Augustine to Christianity.

j. Academics

The positions of the various philosophical schools on epistemology (how we can perceive and understand the world) and the possibility of knowing truth are set out and refuted by the participants in this dialogue (of which we have different parts of two editions). Cicero also incorporates a detailed history of the development of these schools following the death of Socrates (diagrammed nicely in MacKendrick; see below). The nature of Cicero’s own skepticism can be found in this work; the reader is left to choose the argument that is most persuasive.

k. On Ends

A dialogue which sets out the case, pro and con, of the several philosophic schools on the question of the end or purpose (what Aristotle called the telos) of human life. For Cicero, and arguably for ancient philosophy generally, this was the most important question: “What is the end, the final and ultimate aim, which gives the standard for all principles of right living and of good conduct?” Today many are inclined to believe that an answer to this question, if an answer exists at all, must be found in religion, but Cicero held that it was a question for philosophy, and this text was meant to popularize among the Romans the various answers that were being offered at the time. As with Academics, the reader must decide which case is most persuasive.

l. Tusculan Disputations

Another attempt to popularize philosophy at Rome and demonstrate that the Romans and their language had the potential to achieve the very highest levels of philosophy. The first book presents the argument that death is an evil; this argument is then refuted. The second book presents and refutes the argument that pain is an evil. The third book argues that the wise man will not suffer from anxiety and fear. In the fourth book Cicero demonstrates that the wise man does not suffer from excessive joy or lust. And in the fifth and final book Cicero argues that virtue, found through philosophy, is sufficient for a happy life. These positions are all compatible with Stoicism.

m. On the Nature of the Gods

This dialogue, along with the next two, was intended by Cicero to form a trilogy on religious questions. It offers desciptions of literally dozens of varieties of religion. Emphasis is especially placed on the Epicurean view (the gods exist but are indifferent about human beings), which is described and then refuted, and the Stoic view (the gods govern the world, love human beings, and after death reward the good and punish the bad), which is similarly stated and refuted. At the end of the dialogue the characters have not reached agreement. This is perhaps the dialogue that best illustrates Cicero’s skeptical method.

n. On Divination

This dialogue too, according to Cicero, is meant to set out arguments both for and against a topic, in this case the validity of divination (predicting the future through methods such as astrology, reading animal entrails, watching the flight of birds, etc.) without asserting that either side is correct. The case for the validity of divination is presented in the first book and then crushed in the second (in which Cicero himself is the main speaker). While Cicero explicitly says that he reserves judgment, it is hard to conclude that Cicero approved of divination, which he saw as drawing on superstition rather than religion. Religion was useful because it helped to control human behavior and could be used as a tool for public policy; and in this context divination could be useful too (as when an unwise political decision was prevented by the announcement that the omens were unfavorable).

o. On Fate

The text is fragmented. The topic discussed is whether or not human beings can be said to have free will, so much of the book deals with theories of causation and the meaning of truth and falsehood. Cicero apparently rejects the idea that fate determines all our actions and argues that human beings, to a significant extent, have free will.

p. On Old Age

In this dialogue, we learn that the sufferings of old age do not affect everyone equally but in fact are dependent on character; old men of good character continue to enjoy life, though in different ways than in their youth, while men of bad character have new miseries added to their previous ones. Nothing is more natural than to age and die, and if we are to live in accordance with nature (a Stoic teaching) we should face death calmly. If one has lived well, there are many pleasant memories to enjoy, as well as prestige and the intellectual pleasures that are highest of all.

q. On Friendship

This dialogue describes the nature of true friendship, which is possible only between good men, who are virtuous and follow nature. This friendship is based on virtue, and while it offers material advantages it does not aim at them or even seek them. The dialogue goes on to describe the bonds of friendship among lesser men, which are stronger the more closely they are related but which exist even in more distant relationships. The conclusion is reached that all human beings are bonded together, along with the gods, in a community made up of the cosmos as a whole and based on shared reason. There is, however, awareness of the fact that in the real world friendship can be a difficult thing to maintain due to political pressures and adversity. It also includes the assertion that Cato was better than Socrates because he is praised for deeds, not words, which is perhaps the center of Cicero’s personal philosophy (recall that he only wrote about philosophy, rhetoric and so on when political participation was denied to him by force), as well as the claim that love is not compatible with fear – a claim that Machiavelli found significant enough to explicitly reject in The Prince.

r. Topics

A toolkit for orators on the science of argument, touching on the law, rhetoric, and philosophy, and setting out the various kinds of arguments available to the orator, rules of logic, and the kinds of questions he may find himself facing. It has similarities to Aristotle’s Topics and part of his Rhetoric.

s. On Duties

Written in the form of a letter to his son Marcus, then in his late teens and studying philosophy in Athens (though, we can gather from the letters, not studying it all that seriously), but intended from the start to reach a wider audience. Cicero addresses the topic of duty (including both the final purpose of life, which defines our duties, and the way in which duties should be performed), and says that he will follow the Stoics in this area, but only as his judgment requires. More explicitly, the letter discusses how to determine what is honorable, and which of two honorable things is more honorable; how to determine what is expedient and how to judge between two expedient things; and what to do when the honorable and the expedient seem to conflict. Cicero asserts that they can only seem to conflict; in reality they never do, and if they seem to it simply shows that we do not understand the situation properly. The honorable action is the expedient and vice-versa. The bonds among all human beings are described, and young Marcus is urged to follow nature and wisdom, along with whatever political activity might still be possible, rather than seeking pleasure and indolence. On Duties, written at the end of Cicero’s life, in his own name, for the use of his son, pulls together a wide range of material, and is probably the best starting place for someone wanting to get acquainted with Cicero’s philosophic works.

8. Further reading on Cicero’s life

Plutarch’s “Life of Cicero” is the source of much of our knowledge of Cicero’s life. It should be kept in mind that Plutarch is writing a century after Cicero’s death and has no firsthand knowledge of the events he describes. He also writes to offer moral lessons, rather than simply record events. The Roman historian Sallust’s Conspiracy of Catiline offers a description of that conspiracy, written twenty years after it took place, which fails to give Cicero the same degree of importance he gave himself. Both of these texts are available online and in inexpensive Penguin editions. D.R. Shackleton Bailey, Cicero, incorporates many of Cicero’s own letters in describing Cicero and the events of his life; the reader gets a firsthand look at events and a taste of Cicero’s enjoyable prose style through these letters. Manfred Fuhrmann, Cicero and the Roman Republic, uses the same approach and also includes material from speeches and the philosophical writings. Christian Habicht, Cicero the Politician, is a short (99 pages of text) history of Cicero’s life and times. Its brevity makes it a useful starting point and overview. Even shorter (84 pages of text) is Thomas Wiedemann, Cicero and the End of the Roman Republic. Weidemann even finds room for photographs and drawings, which makes this book perhaps too short. R.E. Smith, Cicero the Statesman, focuses on the period from 71 B.C.E.-43 B.C.E., which is the most active part of Cicero’s life. He gives a very clear exposition of Roman politics as well as Cicero’s part in it. Thomas Mitchell’s two volumes, Cicero, the Ascending Years (which covers Cicero’s life up to the end of his consulship) and Cicero the Senior Statesman (which covers the years from the end of his consulship to his death), in his words, aim to “provide a detailed and fully documented account of Cicero’s political life that combines the story of his career with a comprehensive discussion of the political ideas and events that helped shape it.” He succeeds admirably. There are also available a large number of general histories of the Roman Republic and empire which the reader is encouraged to explore.

9. Further reading on Cicero’s philosophy

a. Texts by Cicero

The standard versions of Cicero’s writings in English are still the Loeb editions of the Harvard University Press. They include the Latin text on the left hand pages and the English translation on the right hand pages, which is obviously of particular use to one who knows or is learning Latin. There are Loeb editions of all of Cicero’s speeches, letters, and philosophical writings known to exist, and they were the main sources for this article. The Perseus Project includes Cicero’s writings in its online archives. The series of Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought has recently added editions of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (in one volume, edited by James E.G. Zetzel) and On Duties (edited by M.T. Griffin and E.M. Atkins). These volumes include the Cambridge series’ usual excellent introductions and background material and were also helpful in preparing this article. The Oxford World’s Classics series has recently released a new translation of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (edited by Jonathan Powell and Niall Rudd); while its supplemental material is not as thorough as that of the Cambridge edition, it is still worth reading.

b. Texts by Cicero

Perhaps the best starting point is Neal Wood, Cicero’s Social and Political Thought. It includes chapters on Cicero’s life and times and then discusses Cicero’s thought in a number of areas (for example there are chapters entitled “The Idea of the State” and “The Art of Politics”); admittedly its focus de-emphasizes Cicero’s thought on religion, oratorical theory, and so on. A wider range of essays, which can best be appreciated after reading Cicero’s texts, can be found in J.G.F. Powell, editor, Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers. Andrew R. Dyck, A Commentary on Cicero, De Officiis (On Duty), is exactly what it says; it is massive (654 pages), detailed, relies on the reader’s knowing Latin, and is of interest almost exclusively to the specialist. Paul MacKendrick, The Philosophical Books of Cicero, offers detailed summaries of each of Cicero’s philosophical writings, as well as brief discussions which include the issue of Cicero’s sources and originality for each text (Cicero is defended against the charges of unoriginality commonly made against him). It was extremely helpful in the preparation of this article. The final two chapters, as mentioned above, trace Cicero’s influence down through the centuries and conclude with the observation that “Americans, though denied by their educational system a widespread knowledge of the classics in the original, share with Cicero a sturdy set of ethical values, which it is to be hoped they will, in true Ciceronian fashion, still cleave to in time of crisis.”

Author Information

Edward Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Theories of Explanation

Within the philosophy of science there have been competing ideas about what an explanation is. Historically, explanation has been associated with causation: to explain an event or phenomenon is to identify its cause. But with the growth and development of philosophy of science in the 20th century, the concept of explanation began to receive more rigorous and specific analysis. Of particular concern were theories that posited the existence of unobservable entities and processes (atoms, fields, genes, and so forth). These posed a dilemma: on the one hand, the staunch empiricist had to reject unobservable entities as a matter of principle; on the other, theories that appealed to unobservable entities were clearly producing revolutionary results. Thus philosophers of science sought some way to characterize the obvious value of these theories without abandoning the empiricist principles deemed central to scientific rationality.

A theory of explanation might treat explanations in either a realist or an epistemic (that is, anti-realist) sense. A realist interpretation of explanation holds that the entities or processes an explanation posits actually exist–the explanation is a literal description of external reality. An epistemic interpretation, on the contrary, holds that such entities or processes do not necessarily exist in any literal sense but are simply useful for organizing human experience and the results of scientific experiments–the point of an explanation is only to facilitate the construction of a consistent empirical model, not to furnish a literal description of reality. Thus Hempel‘s epistemic theory of explanation deals only in logical form, making no mention of any actual physical connection between the phenomenon to be explained and the facts purported to explain it, whereas Salmon’s realist account emphasizes that real processes and entities are conceptually necessary for understanding exactly why an explanation works.

In contrast to these theoretical and primarily scientific approaches, some philosophers have favored a theory of explanation grounded in the way people actually perform explanation. Ordinary Language Philosophy stresses the communicative or linguistic aspect of an explanation, its utility in answering questions and furthering understanding between two individuals, while an approach based in cognitive science maintains that explaining is a purely cognitive activity and that an explanation is a certain kind of mental representation that results from or aids in this activity. It is a matter of contention within cognitive science whether explanation is properly conceived as the process and results of belief revision or as the activation of patterns within a neural network.

This article focuses on the way thinking about explanation within the philosophy of science has changed since 1950. It begins by discussing the philosophical concerns that gave rise to the first theory of explanation, the deductive-nomological model. Discussions of this theory and standard criticisms of it are followed by an examination of attempts to amend, extend or replace this first model. There is particular emphasis on the most general aspects of explanation and on the extent to which later developments reflect the priorities and presuppositions of different philosophical traditions. There are many important aspects of explanation not covered, most notably the relation between the different types of explanation such as teleological, functional, reductive, psychological, and historical explanation — that are employed in various branches of human inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Hempel’s Theory of Explanation
  3. Standard Criticisms of Hempel’s Theory of Explanation
  4. Contemporary Developments in the Theory of Explanation
    1. Explanation and Causal Realism
    2. Explanation and Constructive Empiricism
    3. Explanation and Ordinary Language Philosophy
    4. Explanation and Cognitive Science
    5. Explanation, Naturalism and Scientific Realism
  5. The Current State of the Theory of Explanation
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Most people, philosophers included, think of explanation in terms of causation. Very roughly, to explain an event or phenomenon is to identify its cause. The nature of causation is one of the perennial problems of philosophy, so on the basis of this connection one might reasonably attempt to trace thinking about the nature of explanation to antiquity. (Among the ancients, for example, Aristotle’s theory of causation is plausibly regarded as a theory of explanation.) But the idea that the concept of explanation warrants independent analysis really did not begin to take hold until the 20th century. Generally, this change occurred as the result of the linguistic turn in philosophy. More specifically, it was the result of philosophers of science attempting to understand the nature of modern theoretical science.

Of particular concern were theories that posited the existence of unobservable entities and processes (for example, atoms, fields, genes, etc.). These posed a dilemma. On the one hand, the staunch empiricist had to reject unobservable entities as a matter of principle; on the other hand, theories that appealed to unobservables were clearly producing revolutionary results. A way was needed to characterize the obvious value of these theories without abandoning the empiricist principles deemed central to scientific rationality.

In this context it became common to distinguish between the literal truth of a theory and its power to explain observable phenomena. Although the distinction between truth and explanatory power is important, it is susceptible to multiple interpretations, and this remains a source of confusion even today. The problem is this: In philosophy the terms “truth” and “explanation” have both realist and epistemic interpretations. On a realist interpretation the truth and explanatory power of a theory are matters of the correspondence of language with an external reality. A theory that is both true and explanatory gives us insight into the causal structure of the world. On an epistemic interpretation, however, these terms express only the power of a theory to order our experience. A true and explanatory theory orders our experience to a greater degree than a false non-explanatory one. Hence, someone who denies that scientific theories are explanatory in the realist sense of the term may or may not be denying that they are explanatory in the epistemic sense. Conversely, someone who asserts that scientific theories are explanatory in the epistemic sense may or may not be claiming that they are explanatory in the realist sense. The failure to distinguish these senses of “explanation” can and does foster disagreements that are purely semantic in nature.

One common way of employing the distinction between truth and explanation is to say that theories that refer to unobservable entities may explain the phenomena, but they are not literally true. A second way is to say that these theories are true, but they do not really explain the phenomena. Although these statements are superficially contradictory, they can both be made in support of the same basic view of the nature of scientific theories. This, it is now easy to see, is because the terms ‘truth’ and ‘explanation’ are being used differently in each statement. In the first, ‘explanation’ is being used epistemically and ‘truth’ realistically; in the second, ‘explanation’ is being used realistically and ‘truth’ epistemically. But both statements are saying roughly the same thing, namely, that a scientific theory may be accepted as having a certain epistemic value without necessarily accepting that the unobservable entities it refers to actually exist. (This view is known as anti-realism.) One early 20th century philosopher scientist, Pierre Duhem, expressed himself according to the latter interpretation when he claimed:

A physical theory is not an explanation. It is a system of mathematical propositions, deduced from a small number of principles, which aim to represent as simply, as completely, and as exactly as possible a set of experimental laws. ([1906] 1962: p7)

Duhem claimed that:

To explain is to strip the reality of the appearances covering it like a veil, in order to see the bare reality itself. (op.cit.: p19)

Explanation was the task of metaphysics, not science. Science, according to Duhem, does not comprehend reality, but only gives order to appearance. However, the subsequent rise of analytic philosophy and, in particular, logical positivism made Duhem’s acceptance of classical metaphysics unpopular. The conviction grew that, far from being explanatory, metaphysics was meaningless insofar as it issued claims that had no implications for experience. By the time Carl Hempel (who, as a logical positivist, was still fundamentally an anti-realist about unobservable entities) articulated the first real theory of explanation (1948) the explanatory power of science could be stipulated.

To explain the phenomena in the world of our experience, to answer the question “Why?” rather than only the question “What?”, is one of the foremost objectives of all rational inquiry; and especially scientific research, in its various branches strives to go beyond a mere description of its subject matter by providing an explanation of the phenomena it investigates. (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948: p8)

For Hempel, answering the question “Why?” did not, as for Duhem, involve an appeal to a reality beyond all experience. Hempel employs the epistemic sense of explanation. For him the question “Why?” was an expression of the need to gain predictive control over our future experiences, and the value of a scientific theory was to be measured in terms of its capacity to produce this result.

2. Hempel’s Theory of Explanation

According to Hempel, an explanation is:

…an argument to the effect that the phenomenon to be explained …was to be expected in virtue of certain explanatory facts. (1965 p. 336)

Hempel claimed that there are two types of explanation, what he called ‘deductive-nomological’ (DN) and ‘inductive-statistical’ (IS) respectively.” Both IS and DN arguments have the same structure. Their premises each contain statements of two types: (1) initial conditions C, and (2) law-like generalizations L. In each, the conclusion is the event E to be explained:

C1, C2, C3,…Cn

L1, L2, L3,…Ln



The only difference between the two is that the laws in a DN explanation are universal generalizations, whereas the laws in IS explanations have the form of statistical generalizations. An example of a DN explanation containing one initial condition and one law-like generalization is:

C. The infant’s cells have three copies of chromosome 21.

L. Any infant whose cells have three copies of chromosome 21 has Down’s Syndrome.


E. The infant has Down’s Syndrome.

An example of an IS explanation is:

C. The man’s brain was deprived of oxygen for five continuous minutes.

L. Almost anyone whose brain is deprived of oxygen for five continuous minutes will sustain brain damage.


E. The man has brain damage.

For Hempel, DN explanations were always to be preferred to IS explanations. There were two reasons for this.

First, the deductive relationship between premises and conclusion maximized the predictive value of the explanation. Hempel accepted IS arguments as explanatory just to the extent that they approximated DN explanations by conferring a high probability on the event to be explained.

Second, Hempel understood the concept of explanation as something that should be understood fundamentally in terms of logical form. True premises are, of course, essential to something being a good DN explanation, but to qualify as a DN explanation (what he sometimes called a potential DN explanation) an argument need only exhibit the deductive-nomological structure. (This requirement placed Hempel squarely within the logical positivist tradition, which was committed to analyzing all of the epistemically significant concepts of science in logical terms.) There is, however, no corresponding concept of a potential IS explanation. Unlike DN explanations, the inductive character of IS explanations means that the relation between premises and conclusion can always be undermined by the addition of new information. (For example, the probability of brain damage, given that a man is deprived of oxygen for 7 minutes, is lowered somewhat by the information that the man spent this time at the bottom of a very cold lake.) Consequently, it is always possible that a proposed IS explanation, even if the premises are true, would fail to predict the fact in question, and thus have no explanatory significance for the case at hand.

3. Standard Criticisms of Hempel’s Theory of Explanation

Hempel’s dissatisfaction with statistical explanation was at odds with modern science, for which the explanatory use of statistics had become indispensable. Moreover, Hempel’s requirement that IS explanations approximate the predictive power of DN explanations has the counterintuitive implication that for inherently low probability events no explanations are possible. For example, since smoking two packs of cigarettes a day for 40 years does not actually make it probable that a person will contract lung cancer, it follows from Hempel’s theory that a statistical law about smoking will not be involved in an IS explanation of the occurrence of lung cancer. Hempel’s view might be defended here by claiming that when our theories do not allow us to predict a phenomenon with a high degree of accuracy, it is because we have incomplete knowledge of the initial conditions. However, this seems to require us to base a theory of explanation on the now dubious metaphysical position that all events have determinate causes.

Another important criticism of Hempel’s theory is that many DN arguments with true premises do not appear to be explanatory. Wesley Salmon raised the problem of relevance with the following example:

C1. Butch takes birth control pills.

C2: Butch is a man.

L: No man who takes birth control pills becomes pregnant.


E: Butch has not become pregnant.

Unfortunately, this reasoning qualifies as explanatory on Hempel’s theory despite the fact that the premises seem to be explanatorily irrelevant to the conclusion.

Sylvain Bromberger raised the problem of asymmetry by pointing out that, while on Hempel’s model one can explain the period of a pendulum in terms of the length of the pendulum together with the law of simple periodic motion, one can just as easily explain the length of a pendulum in terms of its period in accord with the same law. Our intuitions tell us that the first is explanatory, but the second is not. The same point is made by the following example:

C: The barometer is falling rapidly.

L: Whenever the barometer falls rapidly, a storm is approaching.


E: A storm is approaching.

While the falling barometer is a trustworthy indicator of an approaching storm, it is counterintuitive to say that the barometer explains the occurrence of the storm. Rather, it is the approaching storm that explains the falling barometer.

These two problems, relevance and asymmetry, expose the difficulty of developing a theory of explanation that makes no reference to causal relations. Reference to causal relations is not an option for Hempel, however, since causation heads the anti-realist’s list of metaphysically suspect concepts. It would also undermine his view that explanation should be understood as an epistemic rather than a metaphysical relationship. Hempel’s response to these problems was that they raise purely pragmatic issues. His model countenances many explanations that prove to be useless, but whether an explanation has any practical value is not, in Hempel’s view, something that can be determined by philosophical analysis. This is a perfectly cogent reply, but it has not generally been regarded as an adequate one. Virtually all subsequent attempts to improve upon Hempel’s theory accept the above criticisms as legitimate.

As noted above, Hempel’s model requires that an explanation make use of at least one law-like generalization. This presents another sort of problem for the DN model. Hempel was careful to distinguish law-like generalizations from accidental generalizations. The latter are generalizations that may be true, but not in virtue of any law of nature. (for example, “All of my shirts are stained with coffee” may be true, but it is- I hope- just an accidental fact, not a law of nature.) Although the idea that explanation consists in subsuming events under natural laws has wide appeal in the philosophy of science, it is doubtful whether this requirement can be made consistent with Hempel’s epistemic view of explanation. The reason is simply that no one has ever articulated an epistemically sound criterion for distinguishing between law-like generalizations and accidental generalizations. This is essentially just Hume’s problem of induction, namely, that no finite number of observations can justify the claim that a regularity in nature is due to an natural necessity. In the absence of such a criterion, Hempel’s model seems to violate the spirit of the epistemic view of explanation, as well as the idea that explanation can be understood in purely logical terms.

4. Contemporary Developments in the Theory of Explanation

Contemporary developments in the theory of explanation in many ways reflect the fragmented state of analytic philosophy since the decline of logical positivism. In this article we will look briefly at examples of how explanation has been conceived within the following five traditions: (1) Causal Realism, (2) Constructive Empiricism, (3) Ordinary Language Philosophy, (4) Cognitive Science and (5) Naturalism and Scientific Realism.

a. Explanation and Causal Realism

With the decline of logical positivism and the gathering success of modern theoretical science, philosophers began to regard continued skepticism about the reality of unobservable entities and processes as pointless. Different varieties of realism were articulated and against this background several different causal theories of explanation were developed. The idea behind them is the ordinary intuition noted at the beginning of this essay: to explain is to attribute a cause. Michael Scriven argued this point with notable force:

Let us take a case where we can be sure beyond any reasonable doubt that we have a correct explanation. As you reach for the dictionary, your knee catches the edge of the table and thus turns over the ink bottle, the contents of which proceed to run over the table’s edge and ruin the carpet. If you are subsequently asked to explain how the carpet was damaged you have a complete explanation. You did it by knocking over the ink. The certainty of this explanation is primeval…This capacity for identifying causes is learnt, is better developed in some people than in others, can be tested, and is the basis for what we call judgments. (1959: p. 456)

Wesley Salmon’s causal theory of explanation is perhaps the most influential developed within the realist tradition. Salmon had earlier developed a fundamentally epistemic view according to which an explanation is a list of statistically relevant factors. However he later rejected this, and any epistemic theory, as inadequate. His reason was that all epistemic theories are incapable of showing how explanations produce scientific understanding. This is because scientific understanding is not only a matter of having justified beliefs about the future. Salmon now insists that even a Laplacean Demon whose knowledge of the laws and initial conditions of the universe were so precise and complete as to issue in perfect predictive knowledge would lack scientific understanding. Specifically, he would lack the concepts of causal relevance and causal asymmetry and he could not distinguish between true causal processes and pseudo-processes. (As an example of the latter, consider the beam of a search light as it describes an arc through the sky. The movement of the beam is a pseudo-process since earlier stages of the beam do not cause later stages. By contrast, the electrical generation of the light itself, and the movement of the lamp housing are true causal processes.)

Salmon defends his causal realism by rejecting the Humean conception of causation as linked chains of events, and by attempting to articulate an epistemologically sound theory of continuous causal processes and causal interactions to replace it. The theory itself is detailed and does not lend itself to compression. It reads not so much as an analysis of the term ‘explanation’ as a set of instructions for producing an explanation of a particular phenomenon or event. One begins by compiling a list of statistically relevant factors and analyzing the list by a variety of methods. The procedure terminates in the creation of causal models of these statistical relationships and empirical testing to determine which of these models is best supported by the evidence.

Insofar as Salmon’s theory insists that an adequate explanation has not been achieved until the fundamental causal mechanisms of a phenomenon have been articulated, it is deeply reductionistic. It is not clear, for example, how Salmon’s model of explanation could ever generate meaningful explanations of mental events, which supervene on, but do not seem to be reducible to a unique set of causal relationships. Salmon’s theory is also similar to Hempel’s in at least one sense, and that is that both champion ideal forms of explanation, rather than anything that scientists or ordinary people are likely to achieve in the workaday world. This type of theorizing clearly has its place, but it has also been criticized by those who see explanation primarily as a form of communication between individuals. On this view, simplicity and ease of communication are not merely pragmatic, but essential to the creation of human understanding.

b. Explanation and Constructive Empiricism

In his book The Scientific Image (1980) Bas van Fraassen produced an influential defense of anti-realism. Terming his view “constructive empiricism” van Fraassen claimed that theoretical science was properly construed as a creative process of model construction rather than one of discovering truths about the unobservable world. While avoiding the fatal excesses of logical positivism he argued strongly against the realistic interpretation of theoretical terms, claiming that contemporary scientific realism is predicated on a dire misunderstanding of the nature of explanation. (See “Naturalism and Scientific Realism” below). In support of his constructive empiricism van Fraassen produced an epistemic theory of explanation that draws on the logic of why-questions and draws on a Bayesian interpretation of probability.

Like Hempel, van Fraassen seeks to explicate explanation as a purely logical concept. However, the logical relation is not that of premises to conclusion, but one of question to answer. Following Bromberger, van Fraassen characterizes explanation as an answer to a why-question. Why-questions, for him, are essentially contrastive. That is, they always, implicitly or explicitly, ask: Why Pk, rather than some set of alternatives X= ? Why-questions also implicitly stipulate a relevance relation R, which is the explanatory relation (for example, causation) any answer must bear to the ordered pair .

Van Fraassen follows Hempel in addressing explanatory asymmetry and explanatory relevance as pragmatic issues. However, van Fraassen’s question-answering model makes this view a bit more intuitive. The relevance relation is defined by the interests of the person posing the question. For example, an individual who asks for an explanation of an airline accident in terms of the human decisions that led to it can not be forced to accept an explanation solely in terms of the weather. van Fraassen deals with the problem of explanatory asymmetry by showing that this, too, is a function of context. For example, most people would say that bad weather explains plane crashes, but plane crashes don’t explain bad weather. However, there are conditions (for example, unstable atmospheric conditions, an airplane carrying highly explosive cargo) that could combine to supply the latter explanation with an appropriate context.

Van Fraassen’s model also avoids Hempel’s problematic requirement of high probability for IS explanation. For van Fraassen, an answer will be potentially explanatory if it “favors” Pk over all the other members of the contrast class. This means roughly that the answer must confer greater probability on Pk than on any other Pi. It does not require that Pk actually be probable, or even that the probability of Pk be raised as a result of the answer, since favoring can actually result from an answer that lowers the probability of all other Pi relative to Pk. For van Fraassen, the essential tool for calculating the explanatory value of a theory is Bayes’ Rule, which allows one to calculate the probability of a particular event relative to a set of background assumptions and some new information. From a Bayesian point of view, the rationality of a belief is relative to a set of background assumptions which are not themselves the subject of evaluation. Van Fraassen’s theory of explanation is therefore deeply subjectivist: what counts as a good explanation for one person may not count as a good explanation for another, since their background assumptions may differ.

Van Fraassen’s pragmatic account of explanation buttresses his anti-realist position, by showing that when properly analyzed there is nothing about the concept of explanation that demands a realistic interpretation of causal processes or unobservables. Van Fraassen does not make the positivist mistake of claiming that talk of such things is metaphysical nonsense. He claims only that a full appreciation of science does not depend on a realistic interpretation. His pragmatism also offers an alternative account of Salmon’s Laplacean Demon. van Fraassen agrees with Salmon that an individual with perfect knowledge of the laws and initial conditions of the universe lacks something, but what he lacks is not objective knowledge of the difference between causal processes and pseudo processes. Rather, he simply lacks the human interests that make causation a useful concept.

c. Explanation and Ordinary Language Philosophy

Although van Fraassen’s theory of explanation is based on the view that explanation is a process of communication, he still chooses to explicate the concept of explanation as a logical relationship between question and answer, rather than as a communicative relationship between two individuals. Ordinary Language Philosophy tends to emphasize this latter quality, rejecting traditional epistemology and metaphysics and focusing on the requirements of effective communication. For this school, philosophical problems do not arise because ordinary language is defective, but because we are in some way ignoring the communicative function of language. Consequently, the point of ordinary language analysis is not to improve upon ordinary usage by clarifying the meanings of terms for use in some ideal vocabulary, but rather to bring the full ordinary meanings of the terms to light.

Within this tradition Peter Achinstein (1983) developed an illocutionary theory of explanation. Like Salmon, Achinstein characterizes explanation as the pursuit of understanding. He defines the act of explanation as the attempt by one person to produce understanding in another by answering a certain kind of question in a certain kind of way. Achinstein rejects Salmon’s narrow association of understanding with causation, as well as van Fraassen’s analysis in terms of why-questions. For Achinstein there are many different kinds of questions that we ordinarily regard as attempts to gain understanding (for example, who-, what-, when-, and where-questions) and it follows that the act of answering any of these is properly regarded as an act of explanation.

According to Achinstein’s theory S (a person) explains q (an interrogative expressing some question Q) by uttering u only if:

S utters u with the intention that his utterance of u render q understandable by producing the knowledge of the proposition expressed by u that it is a correct answer to Q. (1983: p.13)

Achinstein’s approach is an interesting departure from the types of theory discussed above in that it draws freely both on the concept of intention as well as the irreducibly causal notion of “producing knowledge.” This move clearly can not be countenanced by someone who sees explanation as a fundamentally logical concept. Even the causal realist who believes that explanations make essential reference to causes does not construe explanation itself in causal terms. Indeed, Achinstein’s approach is so different from theories that we have discussed so far that it might be best construed as addressing a very different question. Whereas traditional theories have attempted to explicate the logic of explanation, Achinstein’s theory may be best understood as an attempt to describe the process of explanation itself.

Like van Fraassen’s theory, Achinstein’s theory is deeply pragmatic. He stipulates that all explanations are given relative to a set of instructions (cf. van Fraassen’s relevance relations) and indicates that these instructions are ultimately determined by the individual asking the question. So, for example, a person who ask for an explanation why the electrical power in the house has gone out implicitly instructs that the question be answered in a way that would be relevant to the goal of turning the electricity back on. An answer that explained the absence of an electrical current in scientific terms, say by reference to Maxwell’s equations, would be inappropriate in this case.

Achinstein attempts to avoid van Fraassen’s subjectivism, by identifying understanding with knowledge that a certain kind of proposition is true. These, he calls “content giving propositions” which are to be contrasted with propositions that have no real cognitive significance. For example, Achinstein would want to rule out as non-explanatory, answers to questions that are purely tautological, such as: Mr. Pheeper died because Mr. Pheeper ceased to live. Achinstein also counts as non explanatory the scientifically correct answer to a question like: What is the speed of light in a vacuum? For him 186,000 miles/ second is not explanatory because, as it stands, it is just an incomprehensibly large number offering no basis of comparison with velocities that are cognitively significant. This does not mean that speed of light in a vacuum can not be explained. For example, a more cognitively significant answer to the above question might be that light can travel 7 1/2 times around the earth in one second. (Thanks to Professor Norman Swartz for this example)

One of the main difficulties with Achinstein’s theory is that the idea of a content-giving proposition remains too vague. His refusal to narrow the list of questions that qualify as requests for explanation makes it very difficult to identify any interesting property that an act of explanation must have in order to produce understanding. Moreover, Achinstein’s theory suffers from epistemological problems of its own. His theory of explanation makes essential reference to the intention to produce a certain kind of knowledge-state, but it is unclear from what Achinstein says how a knowledge state can be the result of an illocutionary act simpliciter. Certainly, such acts can produce beliefs, but not all beliefs so produced will count as knowledge, and Achinstein’s theory does not distinguish between the kinds of explanatory acts that are likely to result in such knowledge, and the kinds that will not.

d. Explanation and Cognitive Science

While explanation may be fruitfully regarded as an act of communication, still another departure from the standard relational analysis is to think of explaining as a purely cognitive activity, and an explanation as a certain kind of mental representation that results from or aids in this activity. Considered in this way, explaining (sometimes called ‘abduction’) is a universal phenomenon. It may be conscious, deliberative, and explicitly propositional in nature, but it may also be unconscious, instinctive, and involve no explicit propositional knowledge whatsoever. For example: a father, hearing a high-pitched wail coming from the next room, rushes to his daughter’s aid. Whether he reacted instinctively, or on the basis of an explicit inference, we can say that the father’s behavior was the result of his having explained the wailing sound as the cry of his daughter.

From this perspective the term ‘explanation’ is neither a meta-logical nor a metaphysical relation. Rather, the term has been given a theoretical status and an explanatory function of its own; that is, we explain a person’s behavior by reference to the fact that he is in possession of an explanation. Put differently, ‘explanation’ has been subsumed into the theoretical vocabulary of science (with explanation itself being one of the problematic unobservables) an understanding of which was the very purpose of the theory of explanation in the first place.

Cognitive science is a diverse discipline and there are many different ways of approaching the concept of explanation within it. One major rift within the discipline concerns the question whether “folk psychology” with its reference to mental entities like intentions, beliefs and desires is fundamentally sound. Cognitive scientists in the artificial intelligence (AI) tradition argue that it is sound, and that the task of cognitive science is to develop a theory that preserves the basic integrity of belief-desire explanation. On this view, explaining is a process of belief revision, and explanatory understanding is understood by reference to the set of beliefs that result from that process. Cognitive scientists in the neuroscience tradition, in contrast, argue that folk psychology is not explanatory at all: in its completed state all reference to beliefs and desires will be eliminated from the vocabulary of cognitive science in favor of a vocabulary that allows us to explain behavior by reference to models of neural activity. On this view explaining is a fundamentally neurological process, and explanatory understanding is understood by reference to activation patterns within a neural network.

One popular approach that incorporates aspects of both traditional AI and neuroscience makes use of the idea of a mental model (cf. Holland et al. [1986]) Mental models are internal representations that occur as a result of the activation of some part of a network of condition-action (or if-then) type rules. These rules are clustered in such a way that when a certain number of conditions becomes active, some action results. For example, here is a small cluster of rules that a simple cognitive system might use to distinguish different types of small furry mammals in a backyard environment.

(i) If [large, scurries, meows] then [cat].

(ii) If [small, scurries, squeaks] then [rat].

(iii) If [small, hops, chirps] then [squirrel].

(iv) If [squirrel or rat] then [flees].

(v) If [cat] then [approaches].

A mental model of a squirrel, then, can be described as an activation of rule (iii).

A key concept within the mental models framework is that of a default hierarchy. A set of rules such as those above, state a standard set of default conditions. When these are met, a set of expectations is generated. For example, the activation of rule (iii) generates expectations of type (iv). However, a viable representational system must be able to revise prior rule activations when expectations are contradicted by future experience. In the mental models framework, this is achieved by incorporating a hierarchy of rules below the default condition with more specific conditions at lower levels of the model whose actions will defeat default expectations. For example, default rule (iii) might be defeated by another rule as follows:

3. Level 1: If [small, hops, chirps] then [squirrel].

Level 2: If [flies] then [bird].

In other words, a system that identifies a small, hopping chirping animal as a squirrel generates a set of expectations about its future behavior. If these expectations are contradicted by, for example, the putative squirrel flying, then the system will descend to a lower level of the hierarchy thereby allowing the system to reclassify the object as a bird.

Although this is just a cursory characterization of the mental models framework it is enough to show how explanation can be handled within it. In this context it is natural to think of explanation as a process that is triggered by a predictive failure. Essentially, when the expectations activated at Level 1 of the default hierarchy fail, the system searches lower levels of the hierarchy to find out why. If the above example were formulated in explicitly propositional terms, we would say that the failure of Level 1 expectations generated the question: Why did the animal, which I previously identified as a squirrel, fly? The answer supplied at level 2 is: Because the animal is not a squirrel, but a bird. Of course, Level 2 rules produce their own set of expectations, which must themselves be corroborated with future experience or defeated by future explanations. Clearly, the above example is a rudimentary form of explanation. Any viable system must incorporate learning algorithms which allow it to modify both the content and structure of the default hierarchy when its expectations are repeatedly undermined by experience. This will necessarily involve the ability to generalize over past experiences and activate entirely new rules at every level of the default hierarchy.

One can reasonably doubt whether philosophical questions about the nature of explanation are addressed by defining and ultimately engineering systems capable of explanatory cognition. To the extent that these questions are understood in purely normative terms, they obviously arise in regard to systems built by humans with at least as much force as they arise for humans themselves. In defense of the cognitive science approach, however, one might assert that the simple philosophical question “What is explanation?” is not well-formed. If we accept some form of epistemic relativity, the proper form of such a question is always “What is explanation in cognitive system S?” Hence, doubts about the significance of explanatory cognition in some system S are best expressed as doubts about whether system S-type explanation models human cognition accurately enough to have any real significance for human beings.

e. Explanation, Naturalism and Scientific Realism

Historically, naturalism is associated with the inclination to reject any kind of explanation of natural phenomena that makes essential reference to unnatural phenomena. Insofar as this view is understood simply as the rejection of supernatural phenomena (for example the actions of gods, irreducibly spiritual substances, etc.) it is uncontroversial within the philosophy of science. However, when it is understood to entail the rejection of irreducibly non-natural properties, (that is, the normative properties of ‘rightness’ and ‘wrongness’ that we appeal to in making evaluative judgments about human thought and behavior), it is deeply problematic. The problem is just that the aim of the philosophy of science has always been to establish an a priori basis for making precisely these evaluative judgments about scientific inquiry itself. If they can not be made, then it follows that the goals of philosophical inquiry have been badly misconceived.

Most contemporary naturalists do not regard this as an insurmountable problem. Rather, they just reject the idea that philosophical inquiry can occur from a vantage point outside of science, and they deny that evaluative judgments we make about scientific reasoning and scientific concepts have any a priori status. Put differently, they think philosophical inquiry should be seen as a very abstract form of scientific inquiry, and they see the normative aspirations of philosophers as something that must be achieved by using the very tools and methods that philosophers have traditionally sought to justify.

The relevance of naturalism to the theory of explanation can be understood briefly as follows. Naturalism undermines the idea that knowledge is prior to understanding. If it is true that there will never be an inductive logic that can provide an a priori basis for calling an observed regularity a natural law, then there is, in fact, no independent way of establishing what is the case prior to understanding why it is the case. Because of this, some naturalists (for example, Sellars) have suggested a different way of thinking about the epistemic significance of explanation. The idea, basically, is that explanation is not something that occurs on the basis of pre-confirmed truths. Rather, successful explanation is actually part of the process of confirmation itself:

Our aim [is] to manipulate the three basic components of a world picture: (a) observed objects and events, (b) unobserved objects and events, (c) nomological connections, so as to achieve a maximum of “explanatory coherence.” In this reshuffle no item is sacred. (Sellars, 1962: p356)

Many naturalists have since embraced this idea of “inference to the best explanation” (IBE) as a fundamental principle of scientific reasoning. Moreover, they have put this principle to work as an argument for realism. Briefly, the idea is that if we treat the claim that unobservable entities exist as a scientific hypothesis, then it can be seen as providing an explanation of the success of theories that employ them: namely, the theories are successful because they are (approximately) true. Anti-realism, by contrast, can provide no such explanation; on this view theories that make reference to unobservables are not literally true and so the success of scientific theories remains mysterious. It should be noted here that scientific realism has a very different flavor from the more foundational form of realism discussed above. Traditional realists do not think of realism as a scientific hypothesis, but as an independent metaphysical thesis.

Although IBE has won many converts in recent years it is deeply problematic precisely because of the way it employs the concept of explanation. While most people find IBE to be intuitively plausible, the fact remains that no theory of explanation discussed above can make sense of the idea that we accept a claim on the basis of its explanatory power. Rather, every such view stipulates as a condition of having explanatory power at all that a statement must be true or well-confirmed. Moreover, van Fraassen has argued that even if we can make sense of IBE, it remains a highly dubious principle of inductive inference. The reason is that “inference to the best explanation” really can only mean “inference to the best explanation given to date.” We are unable to compare proposed explanations to others that no one has yet thought of, and for this reason the property of being the best explanation can not be an objective measure of the likelihood that it is true.

One way of responding to these criticisms is to observe that Sellars’ concept of explanatory coherence is based on a view about the nature of understanding that simply eludes the standard models of explanation. According to this view an explanation increases our understanding, not simply by being the correct answer to a particular question, but by increasing the coherence of our entire belief system. This view has been developed in the context of traditional epistemology (Harman, Lehrer) as well as the philosophy of science (Thagard, Kitcher). In the latter context, the terms “explanatory unification” and “consilience” have been introduced to promote the idea that good explanations necessarily tend to produce a more unified body of knowledge. Although traditionalists will insist that there is no a priori basis for thinking that a unified or coherent set of beliefs is more likely to be true, (counterexamples are, in fact, easy to produce) this misses the point that most naturalists reject the possibility of establishing IBE, or any other inductive principle, on purely a priori grounds.

For critiques of naturalism, see the Social Science article.

5. The Current State of the Theory of Explanation

This brief summary may leave the reader with the impression that philosophers are hopelessly divided on the nature of explanation, but this is not really the case. Most philosophers of science would agree that our understanding of explanation is far better now than it was in 1948 when Hempel and Oppenheim published “Studies in the Logic of Explanation.” While it serves expository purposes to represent the DN model and each of its successors as fatally flawed, this should not obscure the fact that these theories have brought real advances in understanding which succeeding models are required to preserve. At this point, fundamental disagreements on the nature of explanation fall into one of two categories. First, there are metaphysical disagreements. Realists and anti-realists continue to differ over what sort of ontological commitments one makes in accepting an explanation. Second, there are meta-philosophical disagreements. Naturalists and non-naturalists remain at odds concerning the relevance of scientific inquiry ( namely, inquiry into the way scientists, ordinary people and computers actually think) to a philosophical theory of explanation. These disputes are unlikely to be resolved anytime soon. Fortunately, however, the significance of further research into the logical and cognitive structure of explanation does not depend on their outcome.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Achinstein, Peter (1983) The Nature of Explanation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Belnap and Steele (1976) The Logic of Questions and Answers. New Haven: Yale University
  • Bromberger, Sylvain (1966) “Why-Questions,” In Baruch A. Brody, ed., Readings in the Philosophy of Science, 66-84. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall, Inc..
  • Brody, Baruch A. (1970) Readings in the Philosophy of Science. Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice Hall
  • Duhem, Pierre (1962) The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory. New York:
  • Friedman, Michael (1974 ) “Explanation and Scientific Understanding.” Journal of Philosophy 71: 5-19.
  • Harman, Gilbert (1965) “The Inference to the Best Explanation.” Philosophical Review, 74: 88-95.
  • Hempel, Carl G. and Oppenheim, Paul (1948) “Studies in the Logic of Explanation.” In Brody p. 8-38.
  • Hempel, Carl G. (1965) Aspects of Scientific Explanation and other Essays in the Philosophy of Science. New York: Free Press.
  • Holland, John; Holyoak, Keith; Nisbett, Richard; Thagard, Paul (1986) Induction: Processes of Inference, Learning, and Discovery. Cambridge: MIT Press
  • Hume, David (1977) An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Indianapolis: Hackett
  • Kitcher, Philip (1981) “Explanatory Unification.” Philosophy of Science 48:507-531.
  • Lehrer, Keith (1990) Theory of Knowledge. Boulder: West View Press.
  • Pitt, Joseph C. (1988) Theories of Explanation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1969) “Epistemology Naturalized.” In Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press: 69-90.
  • Salmon, Wesley (1984) Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Salmon, Wesley (1990) Four Decades of Scientific Explanation. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Scriven, M (1959) “Truisms as the Grounds for Historical Explanations.” In P. Gardiner (Ed.), Theories of History: Readings from Classical and Contemporary Sources, New York: Free Press, pp. 443-475.
  • Sellars, Wilfred (1962) Science, Perception, and Reality. New York: Humanities Press.
  • Stich, Stephen (1983) From Folk Psychology to Cognitive Science. Cambridge: The MIT Press.
  • Thagard, Paul (1988) Computational Philosophy of Science. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • van Fraassen, Bas C. (1980) The Scientific Image. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • van Fraassen, Bas C. (1989) Laws and Symmetry. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Author Information

G. Randolph Mayes
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Logical Problem of Evil

The existence of evil and suffering in our world seems to pose a serious challenge to belief in the existence of a perfect God. If God were all-knowing, it seems that God would know about all of the horrible things that happen in our world. If God were all-powerful, God would be able to do something about all of the evil and suffering. Furthermore, if God were morally perfect, then surely God would want to do something about it. And yet we find that our world is filled with countless instances of evil and suffering.  These facts about evil and suffering seem to conflict with the orthodox theist claim that there exists a perfectly good God. The challenged posed by this apparent conflict has come to be known as the problem of evil.

This article addresses one form of that problem that is prominent in recent philosophical discussions–that the conflict that exists between the claims of orthodox theism and the facts about evil and suffering in our world is a logical one. This is the “logical problem of evil.”

The article clarifies the nature of the logical problem of evil and considers various theistic responses to the problem. Special attention is given to the free will defense, which has been the most widely discussed theistic response to the logical problem of evil.

Table of Contents

  1. Introducing the Problem
  2. Logical Consistency
  3. Logical Consistency and the Logical Problem of Evil
  4. Plantinga’s Free Will Defense
  5. Divine Omnipotence and the Free Will Defense
  6. An Objection: Free Will and Natural Evil
  7. Evaluating the Free Will Defense
  8. Was Plantinga’s Victory Too Easy?
  9. Other Responses to the Logical Problem of Evil
  10. Problems with the Free Will Defense
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Introducing the Problem

Journalist and best-selling author Lee Strobel commissioned George Barna, the public-opinion pollster, to conduct a nationwide survey. The survey included the question “If you could ask God only one question and you knew he would give you an answer, what would you ask?” The most common response, offered by 17% of those who could think of a question was “Why is there pain and suffering in the world?” (Strobel 2000, p. 29). If God is all-powerful, all-knowing and perfectly good, why does he let so many bad things happen? This question raises what philosophers call “the problem of evil.”

It would be one thing if the only people who suffered debilitating diseases or tragic losses were the likes of Adolf Hitler, Joseph Stalin or Osama Bin Laden. As it is, however, thousands of good-hearted, innocent people experience the ravages of violent crime, terminal disease, and other evils. Michael Peterson (1998, p. 1) writes,

Something is dreadfully wrong with our world. An earthquake kills hundreds in Peru. A pancreatic cancer patient suffers prolonged, excruciating pain and dies. A pit bull attacks a two-year-old child, angrily ripping his flesh and killing him. Countless multitudes suffer the ravages of war in Somalia. A crazed cult leader pushes eighty-five people to their deaths in Waco, Texas. Millions starve and die in North Korea as famine ravages the land. Horrible things of all kinds happen in our world—and that has been the story since the dawn of civilization.

Peterson (1998, p. 9) claims that the problem of evil is a kind of “moral protest.” In asking “How could God let this happen?” people are often claiming “It’s not fair that God has let this happen.” Many atheists try to turn the existence of evil and suffering into an argument against the existence of God. They claim that, since there is something morally problematic about a morally perfect God allowing all of the evil and suffering we see, there must not be a morally perfect God after all. The popularity of this kind of argument has led Hans Küng (1976, p. 432) to call the problem of evil “the rock of atheism.” This essay examines one form the argument from evil has taken, which is known as “the logical problem of evil.”

In the second half of the twentieth century, atheologians (that is, persons who try to prove the non-existence of God) commonly claimed that the problem of evil was a problem of logical inconsistency. J. L. Mackie (1955, p. 200), for example, claimed,

Here it can be shown, not that religious beliefs lack rational support, but that they are positively irrational, that several parts of the essential theological doctrine are inconsistent with one another.

H. J. McCloskey (1960, p. 97) wrote,

Evil is a problem, for the theist, in that a contradiction is involved in the fact of evil on the one hand and belief in the omnipotence and omniscience of God on the other.

Mackie and McCloskey can be understood as claiming that it is impossible for all of the following statements to be true at the same time:

(1) God is omnipotent (that is, all-powerful).

(2) God is omniscient (that is, all-knowing).

(3) God is perfectly good.

(4) Evil exists.

Any two or three of them might be true at the same time; but there is no way that all of them could be true. In other words, (1) through (4) form a logically inconsistent set. What does it mean to say that something is logically inconsistent?

(5) A set of statements is logically inconsistent if and only if: (a) that set includes a direct contradiction of the form “p & not-p”; or (b) a direct contradiction can be deduced from that set.

None of the statements in (1) through (4) directly contradicts any other, so if the set is logically inconsistent, it must be because we can deduce a contradiction from it. This is precisely what atheologians claim to be able to do.

Atheologians claim that a contradiction can easily be deduced from (1) through (4) once we think through the implications of the divine attributes cited in (1) through (3). They reason as follows:

(6) If God is omnipotent, he would be able to prevent all of the evil and suffering in the world.

(7) If God is omniscient, he would know about all of the evil and suffering in the world and would know how to eliminate or prevent it.

(8) If God is perfectly good, he would want to prevent all of the evil and suffering in the world.

Statements (6) through (8) jointly imply that if the perfect God of theism really existed, there would not be any evil or suffering. However, as we all know, our world is filled with a staggering amount of evil and suffering. Atheologians claim that, if we reflect upon (6) through (8) in light of the fact of evil and suffering in our world, we should be led to the following conclusions:

(9) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering in the world, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, is powerful enough to prevent it, and yet does not prevent it, he must not be perfectly good.

(10) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, wants to prevent it, and yet does not do so, he must not be all- powerful.

(11) If God is powerful enough to prevent all of the evil and suffering, wants to do so, and yet does not, he must not know about all of the suffering or know how to eliminate or prevent it—that is, he must not be all-knowing.

From (9) through (11) we can infer:

(12) If evil and suffering exist, then God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.

Since evil and suffering obviously do exist, we get:

(13) God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.

Putting the point more bluntly, this line of argument suggests that—in light of the evil and suffering we find in our world—if God exists, he is either impotent, ignorant or wicked. It should be obvious that (13) conflicts with (1) through (3) above. To make the conflict more clear, we can combine (1), (2) and (3) into the following single statement.

(14) God is omnipotent, omniscient and perfectly good.

There is no way that (13) and (14) could both be true at the same time. These statements are logically inconsistent or contradictory.

Statement (14) is simply the conjunction of (1) through (3) and expresses the central belief of classical theism. However, atheologians claim that statement ( 13) can also be derived from (1) through (3). [Statements (6) through (12) purport to show how this is done.] (13) and (14), however, are logically contradictory. Because a contradiction can be deduced from statements (1) through (4) and because all theists believe (1) through (4), atheologians claim that theists have logically inconsistent beliefs. They note that philosophers have always believed it is never rational to believe something contradictory. So, the existence of evil and suffering makes theists’ belief in the existence of a perfect God irrational.

Can the believer in God escape from this dilemma? In his best-selling book When Bad Things Happen to Good People, Rabbi Harold Kushner (1981) offers the following escape route for the theist: deny the truth of (1). According to this proposal, God is not ignoring your suffering when he doesn’t act to prevent it because—as an all-knowing God—he knows about all of your suffering. As a perfectly good God, he also feels your pain. The problem is that he can’t do anything about it because he’s not omnipotent. According to Kushner’s portrayal, God is something of a kind-hearted wimp. He’d like to help, but he doesn’t have the power to do anything about evil and suffering. Denying the truth of either (1), (2), (3) or ( 4) is certainly one way for the theist to escape from the logical problem of evil, but it would not be a very palatable option to many theists. In the remainder of this essay, we will examine some theistic responses to the logical problem of evil that do not require the abandonment of any central tenet of theism.

2. Logical Consistency

Theists who want to rebut the logical problem of evil need to find a way to show that (1) through (4)—perhaps despite initial appearances—are consistent after all. We said above that a set of statements is logically inconsistent if and only if that set includes a direct contradiction or a direct contradiction can be deduced from that set. That means that a set of statements is logically consistent if and only if that set does not include a direct contradiction and a direct contradiction cannot be deduced from that set. In other words,

(15) A set of statements is logically consistent if and only if it is possible for all of them to be true at the same time.

Notice that (15) does not say that consistent statements must actually be true at the same time. They may all be false or some may be true and others false. Consistency only requires that it be possible for all of the statements to be true (even if that possibility is never actualized). (15) also doesn’t say anything about plausibility. It does not require the joint of a consistent set of statements to be plausible. It may be exceedingly unlikely or improbable that a certain set of statements should all be true at the same time. But improbability is not the same thing as impossibility. As long as there is nothing contradictory about their conjunction, it will be possible (even if unlikely) for them all to be true at the same time.

This brief discussion allows us to see that the atheological claim that statements (1) through (4) are logically inconsistent is a rather strong one. The atheologian is maintaining that statements (1) through (4) couldn’t possibly all be true at the same time. In other words,

(16) It is not possible for God and evil to co-exist.

The logical problem of evil claims that God’s omnipotence, omniscience and supreme goodness would completely rule out the possibility of evil and that the existence of evil would do the same for the existence of a supreme being.

3. Logical Consistency and the Logical Problem of Evil

How might a theist go about demonstrating that (16) is false? Some theists suggest that perhaps God has a good reason for allowing the evil and suffering that he does. Not just any old reason can justify God’s allowing all of the evil and suffering we see. Mass murderers and serial killers typically have reasons for why they commit horrible crimes, but they do not have good reasons. It’s only when people have morally good reasons that we excuse or condone their behavior. Philosophers of religion have called the kind of reason that could morally justify God’s allowing evil and suffering a “morally sufficient reason.”

Consider the following statement.

(17) It is possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.

If God were to have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, would it be possible for God to be omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, and yet for there to be evil and suffering? Many theists answer “Yes.” If (17) were true, (9) through (12) would have to be modified to read:

(9′) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering in the world, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, is powerful enough to prevent it, and yet does not prevent it, he must not be perfectly good—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.

(10′) If God knows about all of the evil and suffering, knows how to eliminate or prevent it, wants to prevent it, and yet does not do so, he must not be all-powerful—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.

(11′) If God is powerful enough to prevent all of the evil and suffering, wants to do so, and yet does not, he must not know about all of the suffering or know how to eliminate or prevent it (that is, he must not be all-knowing)—unless he has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.

(12′) If evil and suffering exist, then either: a) God is not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good; or b) God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil.

From (9′) through (12′), it is not possible to conclude that God does not exist. The most that can be concluded is that either God does not exist or God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil. So, some theists suggest that the real question behind the logical problem of evil is whether (17) is true.

If it is possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil and suffering to occur, then the logical problem of evil fails to prove the non-existence of God. If, however, it is not possible that God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, then it seems that (13) would be true: God is either not omnipotent, not omniscient, or not perfectly good.

An implicit assumption behind this part of the debate over the logical problem of evil is the following:

(18) It is not morally permissible for God to allow evil and suffering to occur unless he has a morally sufficient reason for doing so.

Is (18) correct? Many philosophers think so. It is difficult to see how a God who allowed bad things to happen just for the heck of it could be worthy of reverence, faith and worship. If God had no morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, then if we made it to the pearly gates some day and asked God why he allowed so many bad things to happen, he would simply have to shrug his shoulders and say “There was no reason or point to all of that suffering you endured. I just felt like letting it happen.” This callous image of God is difficult to reconcile with orthodox theism’s portrayal of God as a loving Father who cares deeply about his creation. (18), combined with the assumption that God does not have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil, yields

(19) God is doing something morally inappropriate or blameworthy in allowing evil to occur,


(20) If God is doing something morally inappropriate or blameworthy, then God is not perfectly good.

If (19) and (20) are true, then the God of orthodox theism does not exist.

What would it look like for God to have a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil? Let’s first consider a down-to-earth example of a morally sufficient reason a human being might have before moving on to the case of God. Suppose a gossipy neighbor were to tell you that Mrs. Jones just allowed someone to inflict unwanted pain upon her child. Your first reaction to this news might be one of horror. But once you find out that the pain was caused by a shot that immunized Mrs. Jones’ infant daughter against polio, you would no longer view Mrs. Jones as a danger to society. Generally, we believe the following moral principle to be true.

(21) Parents should not inflict unwanted pain upon their children.

In the immunization case, Mrs. Jones has a morally sufficient reason for overriding or suspending this principle. A higher moral duty—namely, the duty of protecting the long-term health of her child—trumps the lesser duty expressed by (21). If God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil and suffering, theists claim, it will probably look something like Mrs. Jones’.

4. Plantinga’s Free Will Defense

What might God’s reason be for allowing evil and suffering to occur? Alvin Plantinga (1974, 1977) has offered the most famous contemporary philosophical response to this question. He suggests the following as a possible morally sufficient reason:

(MSR1) God’s creation of persons with morally significant free will is something of tremendous value. God could not eliminate much of the evil and suffering in this world without thereby eliminating the greater good of having created persons with free will with whom he could have relationships and who are able to love one another and do good deeds.

(MSR1) claims that God allows some evils to occur that are smaller in value than a greater good to which they are intimately connected. If God eliminated the evil, he would have to eliminate the greater good as well. God is pictured as being in a situation much like that of Mrs. Jones: she allowed a small evil (the pain of a needle) to be inflicted upon her child because that pain was necessary for bringing about a greater good (immunization against polio). Before we try to decide whether (MSR1) can justify God in allowing evil and suffering to occur, some of its key terms need to be explained.

To begin with, (MSR1) presupposes the view of free will known as “libertarianism”:

(22) Libertarianism=df the view that a person is free with respect to a given action if and only if that person is both free to perform that action and free to refrain from performing that action; in other words, that person is not determined to perform or refrain from that action by any prior causal forces.

Although the term “libertarianism” isn’t exactly a household name, the view it expresses is commonly taken to be the average person’s view of free will. It is the view that causal determinism is false, that—unlike robots or other machines—we can make choices that are genuinely free.

According to Plantinga, libertarian free will is a morally significant kind of free will. An action is morally significant just when it is appropriate to evaluate that action from a moral perspective (for example, by ascribing moral praise or blame). Persons have morally significant free will if they are able to perform actions that are morally significant. Imagine a possible world where God creates creatures with a very limited kind of freedom. Suppose that the persons in this world can only choose good options and are incapable of choosing bad options. So, if one of them were faced with three possible courses of action—two of which were morally good and one of which was morally bad—this person would not be free with respect to the morally bad option. That is, that person would not be able to choose any bad option even if they wanted to. Our hypothetical person does, however, have complete freedom to decide which of the two good courses of action to take. Plantinga would deny that any such person has morally significant free will. People in this world always perform morally good actions, but they deserve no credit for doing so. It is impossible for them to do wrong. So, when they do perform right actions, they should not be praised. It would be ridiculous to give moral praise to a robot for putting your soda can in the recycle bin rather than the trash can, if that is what it was programmed to do. Given the program running inside the robot and its exposure to an empty soda can, it’s going to take the can to the recycle bin. It has no choice about the matter. Similarly, the people in the possible world under consideration have no choice about being good. Since they are pre-programmed to be good, they deserve no praise for it.

According to Plantinga, people in the actual world are free in the most robust sense of that term. They are fully free and responsible for their actions and decisions. Because of this, when they do what is right, they can properly be praised. Moreover, when they do wrong, they can be rightly blamed or punished for their actions.

It is important to note that (MSR1) directly conflicts with a common assumption about what kind of world God could have created. Many atheologians believe that God could have created a world that was populated with free creatures and yet did not contain any evil or suffering. Since this is something that God could have done and since a world with free creatures and no evil is better than a world with free creatures and evil, this is something God should have done. Since he did not do so, God did something blameworthy by not preventing or eliminating evil and suffering (if indeed God exists at all). In response to this charge, Plantinga maintains that there are some worlds God cannot create. In particular, he cannot do the logically impossible. (MSR1) claims that God cannot get rid of much of the evil and suffering in the world without also getting rid of morally significant free will. (The question of whether God’s omnipotence is compatible with the claim that God cannot do the logically impossible will be addressed below.)

Consider the following descriptions of various worlds. We need to determine which ones describe worlds that are logically possible and which ones describe impossible worlds. The worlds described will be possible if the descriptions of those worlds are logically consistent. If the descriptions of those worlds are inconsistent or contradictory, the worlds in question will be impossible.

W1: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will;
(b) God does not causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and
(c) There is evil and suffering in W1.
W2: (a) God does not create persons with morally significant free will;
(b) God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and
(c) There is no evil or suffering in W2.
W3: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will;
(b) God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and
(c) There is no evil or suffering in W3.
W4: (a) God creates persons with morally significant free will;
(b) God does not causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong; and
(c) There is no evil or suffering in W4.

Let’s figure out which of these worlds are possible. Is W1 possible? Yes. In fact, on the assumption that God exists, it seems to describe the actual world. People have free will in this world and there is evil and suffering. God has obviously not causally determined people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong because there would be no evil or suffering if he had. So, W1 is clearly possible.

What about W2? Granting Plantinga’s assumption that human beings are genuinely free creatures, the first thing to notice about W2 is that you and I would not exist in such a world. We are creatures with morally significant free will. If you took away our free will, we would no longer be the kinds of creatures we are. We would not be human in that world. Returning to the main issue, there does not seem to be anything impossible about God causally determining people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. It seems clearly possible that whatever creatures God were to make in such a world would not have morally significant free will and that there would be no evil or suffering. W2, then, is also possible.

Now let’s consider the philosophically more important world W3. Is W3 possible? Plantinga says, “No.” Parts (a) and (b) of the description of W3 are, he claims, logically inconsistent. In W3 God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. People in this world couldn’t do morally bad things if they wanted to. And yet part of what it means for creatures to have morally significant free will is that they can do morally bad things whenever they want to. Think about what it would be like to live in W3. If you wanted to tell a lie, you would not be able to do so. Causal forces beyond your control would make you tell the truth on every occasion. You would also be physically incapable of stealing your neighbor’s belongings. In fact, since W3 is a world without evil of any kind and since merely wanting to lie or steal is itself a bad thing, the people in W3 would not even be able to have morally bad thoughts or desires. If God is going to causally determine people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong in W3, there is no way that he could allow them to be free in a morally significant sense. Peterson (1998, p. 39) writes,

if a person is free with respect to an action A, then God does not bring it about or cause it to be the case that she does A or refrains from doing A. For if God brings it about or causes it to be the case in any manner whatsoever that the person either does A or does not do A, then that person is not really free.

God can’t have it both ways. He can create a world with free creatures or he can causally determine creatures to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong every time; but he can’t do both. God can forcibly eliminate evil and suffering (as in W2) only at the cost of getting rid of free will.

The fact that W3 is impossible is centrally important to Plantinga’s Free Will Defense. Atheologians, as we saw above, claim that God is doing something morally blameworthy by allowing evil and suffering to exist in our world. They charge that a good God would and should eliminate all evil and suffering. The assumption behind this charge is that, in so doing, God could leave human free will untouched. Plantinga claims that when we think through what robust free will really amounts to, we can see that atheologians are (unbeknownst to themselves) asking God to do the logically impossible. Being upset that God has not done something that is logically impossible is, according to Plantinga, misguided. He might say, “Of course he hasn’t done that. It’s logically impossible!” As we will see in section V below, Plantinga maintains that divine omnipotence involves an ability to do anything that is logically possible, but it does not include the ability to do the logically impossible.

Consider W4. Is it possible? Yes! Most people are tempted to answer “No” when first exposed to this description, but think carefully about it. Although there is no evil and suffering in this world, it is not because God causally determines people in every situation to choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. In this world God has given creatures morally significant free will without any strings attached. If there is nothing bad in this world, it can only be because the free creatures that inhabit this world have—by their own free will—always chosen to do the right thing. Is this kind of situation really possible? Yes. Something is logically possible just when it can be conceived without contradiction. There is nothing contradictory about supposing that there is a possible world where free creatures always make the right choices and never go wrong. Of course, it’s highly improbable, given what we know about human nature. But improbability and impossibility, as we said above, are two different things. In fact, according to the Judeo-Christian story of Adam and Eve, it was God’s will that significantly free human beings would live in the Garden of Eden and always obey God’s commands. If Adam and Eve had followed God’s plan, then W4 would have been the actual world.

It is important to note certain similarities between W1 and W4. Both worlds are populated by creatures with free will and in neither world does God causally determine people to always choose what is right and to avoid what is wrong. The only difference is that, in W1, the free creatures choose to do wrong at least some of the time, and in W4, the free creatures always make morally good decisions. In other words, whether there is immorality in either one of these worlds depends upon the persons living in these worlds—not upon God. According to Plantinga’s Free Will Defense, there is evil and suffering in this world because people do immoral things. People deserve the blame for the bad things that happen—not God. Plantinga (1974, p. 190) writes,

The essential point of the Free Will Defense is that the creation of a world containing moral good is a cooperative venture; it requires the uncoerced concurrence of significantly free creatures. But then the actualization of a world W containing moral good is not up to God alone; it also depends upon what the significantly free creatures of W would do.

Atheist philosophers such as Anthony Flew and J. L. Mackie have argued that an omnipotent God should be able to create a world containing moral good but no moral evil. As Flew (1955, p. 149) put it, “If there is no contradiction here then Omnipotence might have made a world inhabited by perfectly virtuous people.” Mackie (1955, p. 209) writes,

If God has made men such that in their free choices they sometimes prefer what is good and sometimes what is evil, why could he not have made men such that they always freely choose the good? If there is no logical impossibility in a man’s choosing the good on one, or on several occasions, there cannot be a logical impossibility in his freely choosing the good on every occasion. God was not, then, faced with a choice between making innocent automata and making beings who, in acting freely, would sometimes go wrong: there was open to him the obviously better possibility of making beings who would act freely but always go right. Clearly, his failure to avail himself of this possibility is inconsistent with his being both omnipotent and perfectly good.

According to Plantinga, Mackie is correct in thinking that there is nothing impossible about a world in which people always freely choose to do right. That’s W4. He is also correct in thinking that God’s only options were not “making innocent automata and making beings who, in acting freely, would sometimes go wrong.” In other words, worlds like W1 and W2 are not the only logically possible worlds. But Plantinga thinks he is mistaken in thinking that W3 is possible and in not recognizing important differences between W3 and W4. People can freely choose to do what is right only when their actions are not causally determined.

We might wonder why God would choose to risk populating his new creation with free creatures if he knew there was a chance that human immorality could foul the whole thing up. C. S. Lewis (1943, p. 52) offers the following answer to this question:

Why, then, did God give them free will? Because free will, though it makes evil possible, is also the only thing that makes possible any love or goodness or joy worth having. A world of automata—of creatures that worked like machines—would hardly be worth creating. The happiness which God designs for His higher creatures is the happiness of being freely, voluntarily united to Him and to each other…. And for that they must be free. Of course, God knew what would happen if they used their freedom the wrong way: apparently He thought it worth the risk.

Plantinga concurs. He writes,

A world containing creatures who are sometimes significantly free (and freely perform more good than evil actions) is more valuable, all else being equal, than a world containing no free creatures at all. Now God can create free creatures, but he cannot cause or determine them to do only what is right. For if he does so, then they are not significantly free after all; they do not do what is right freely. To create creatures capable of moral good, therefore, he must create creatures capable of moral evil; and he cannot leave these creatures free to perform evil and at the same time prevent them from doing so…. The fact that these free creatures sometimes go wrong, however, counts neither against God’s omnipotence nor against his goodness; for he could have forestalled the occurrence of moral evil only by excising the possibility of moral good. (Plantinga 1974, pp. 166-167)

According to his Free Will Defense, God could not eliminate the possibility of moral evil without at the same time eliminating some greater good.

5. Divine Omnipotence and the Free Will Defense

Some scholars maintain that Plantinga has rejected the idea of an omnipotent God because he claims there are some things God cannot do—namely, logically impossible things. Plantinga, however, doesn’t take God’s omnipotence to include the power to do the logically impossible. He reasons as follows. Can God create a round square? Can he make 2 + 2 = 5? Can he create a stick that is not as long as itself? Can he make contradictory statements true? Can he make a rock so big he can’t lift it? In response to each of these questions, Plantinga’s answer is “No.” Each of the scenarios depicted in these questions is impossible: the objects or events in question couldn’t possibly exist. Omnipotence, according to Plantinga, is the power to do anything that is logically possible. The fact that God cannot do the logically impossible is not, Plantinga claims, a genuine limitation of God’s power. He would urge those uncomfortable with the idea of limitations on God’s power to think carefully about the absurd implications of a God who can do the logically impossible. If you think God really can make a round square, Plantinga would like to know what such a shape would look like. If God can make 2 + 2 = 5, then what would 2 + 3 equal? If God can make a rock so big that he can’t lift it, exactly how big would that rock be? What Plantinga would really like to see is a stick that is not as long as itself. Each of these things seems to be absolutely, positively impossible.

Many theists maintain that it is a mistake to think that God’s omnipotence requires that the blank in the following sentence must never be filled in:

(23) God is not able to ______________.

According to orthodox theism, all of the following statements (and many more like them) are true.

(24) God is not able to lie.

(25) God is not able to cheat.

(26) God is not able to steal.

(27) God is not able to be unjust.

(28) God is not able to be envious.

(29) God is not able to fail to know what is right.

(30) God is not able to fail to do what he knows to be right.

(31) God is not able to have false beliefs about anything.

(32) God is not able to be ignorant.

(33) God is not able to be unwise.

(34) God is not able to cease to exist.

(35) God is not able to make a mistake of any kind.

According to classical theism, the fact that God cannot do any of these things is not a sign of weakness. On the contrary, theists claim, it is an indication of his supremacy and uniqueness. These facts reveal that God is, in St. Anselm’s (1033-1109 A.D.) words, “that being than which none greater can be conceived.” Plantinga adds the following two items to the list of things God cannot do.

(36) God is not able to contradict himself.

(37) God is not able to make significantly free creatures and to causally determine that they will always choose what is right and avoid what is wrong.

These inabilities follow not from God’s omnipotence alone but from his omnipotence in combination with his omniscience, moral perfection and the other divine perfections God possesses.

6. An Objection: Free Will and Natural Evil

At this point, someone might raise the following objection.

Plantinga can’t put all the blame for pain and suffering on human beings. Although much of the evil in this world results from the free choices people make, some of it does not. Cancer, AIDS, famines, earthquakes, tornadoes, and many other kinds of diseases and natural disasters are things that happen without anybody choosing to bring them about. Plantinga’s Free Will Defense, then, cannot serve as a morally sufficient reason for God’s allowing disease and natural disasters.

This objection leads us to draw a distinction between the following two kinds of evil and suffering:

(38) Moral evil =df evil or suffering that results from the immoral choices of free creatures.

(39) Natural evil =df evil or suffering that results from the operations of nature or nature gone awry.

According to Edward Madden and Peter Hare (1968, p. 6), natural evil includes

the terrible pain, suffering, and untimely death caused by events like fire, flood, landslide, hurricane, earthquake, tidal wave, and famine and by diseases like cancer, leprosy and tetanus—as well as crippling defects and deformities like blindness, deafness, dumbness, shriveled limbs, and insanity by which so many sentient beings are cheated of the full benefits of life.

Moral evil, they continue, includes

both moral wrong-doing such as lying, cheating, stealing, torturing, and murdering and character defects like greed, deceit, cruelty, wantonness, cowardice, and selfishness. (ibid.)

It seems that, although Plantinga’s Free Will Defense may be able to explain why God allows moral evil to occur, it cannot explain why he allows natural evil. If God is going to allow people to be free, it seems plausible to claim that they need to have the capacity to commit crimes and to be immoral. However, it is not clear that human freedom requires the existence of natural evils like deadly viruses and natural disasters. How would my free will be compromised if tomorrow God completely eliminated cancer from the face of the Earth? Do people really need to die from heart disease and flash floods in order for us to have morally significant free will? It is difficult to see that they do. So, the objection goes, even if Plantinga’s Free Will Defense explains why God allows moral evil, it does not explain why he allows natural evil.

Plantinga, however, thinks that his Free Will Defense can be used to solve the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil. Here is a possible reason God might have for allowing natural evil:

(MSR2) God allowed natural evil to enter the world as part of Adam and Eve’s punishment for their sin in the Garden of Eden.

(Those familiar with Plantinga’s work will notice that this is not the same reason Plantinga offers for God’s allowing natural evil. They will also be able to guess why a different reason was chosen in this article.) The sin of Adam and Eve was a moral evil. (MSR2) claims that all natural evil followed as the result of the world’s first moral evil. So, if it is plausible to think that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense solves the logical problem of evil as it pertains to moral evil, the current suggestion is that it is plausible also to think that it solves the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil because all of the worlds evils have their source in moral evil.

(MSR2) represents a common Jewish and Christian response to the challenge posed by natural evil. Death, disease, pain and even the tiresome labor involved in gleaning food from the soil came into the world as a direct result of Adam and Eve’s sin. The emotional pain of separation, shame and broken relationships are also consequences that first instance of moral evil. In fact, according to the first chapter of Genesis, animals in the Garden of Eden didn’t even kill each other for food before the Fall. In the description of the sixth day of creation God says to Adam and Eve,

I give you every seed-bearing plant on the face of the whole earth and every tree that has fruit with seed in it. They will be yours for food. And to all the beasts of the earth and all the birds of the air and all the creatures that move on the ground—everything that has the breath of life in it—I give every green plant for food. (Gen. 1:29-30, NIV)

In other words, the Garden of Eden is pictured as a peaceful, vegetarian commune until moral evil entered the world and brought natural evil with it. It seems, then, that the Free Will Defense might be adapted to rebut the logical problem of natural evil after all.

Some might think that (MSR2) is simply too far-fetched to be taken seriously. [If you think (MSR2) is far-fetched, see Plantinga’s (1974, pp. 191-193) own suggestions about who is responsible for natural evil.] Natural disasters, it will be said, bear no essential connection to human wrongdoing, so it is absurd to think that moral evil could somehow bring natural evil into the world. Moreover, (MSR2) would have us believe that there were real persons named Adam and Eve and that they actually performed the misdeeds attributed to them in the book of Genesis. (MSR2) seems to be asking us to believe things that only a certain kind of theist would believe. The implausibility of (MSR2) is taken by some to be a serious defect.

7. Evaluating the Free Will Defense

What should we make of Plantinga’s Free Will Defense? Does it succeed in solving the logical problem of evil as it pertains to either moral or natural evil? In order to answer these questions, let’s briefly consider what it would take for any response to the logical problem of evil to be successful. Recall that the logical problem of evil can be summarized as the following claim:

(16) It is not possible for God and evil to co-exist.

When someone claims

(40) Situation x is impossible,

what is the least that you would have to prove in order to show that (40) is false? If you could point to an actual instance of the type of situation in question, that would certainly prove that (40) is false. But you don’t even need to trouble yourself with finding an actual x. All you need is a possible x. The claim

(41) Situation x is possible

is the contradictory of (40). The two claims are logical opposites. If one is true, the other is false; if one is false, the other is true. If you can show that x is merely possible, you will have refuted (40).

How would you go about finding a logically possible x? Philosophers claim that you only need to use your imagination. If you can conceive of a state of affairs without there being anything contradictory about what you’re imagining, then that state of affairs must be possible. In a word, conceivability is your guide to possibility.

Since the logical problem of evil claims that it is logically impossible for God and evil to co-exist, all that Plantinga (or any other theist) needs to do to combat this claim is to describe a possible situation in which God and evil co-exist. That situation doesn’t need to be actual or even realistic. Plantinga doesn’t need to have a single shred of evidence supporting the truth of his suggestion. All he needs to do is give a logically consistent description of a way that God and evil can co-exist. Plantinga claims God and evil could co-exist if God had a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil. He suggests that God’s morally sufficient reason might have something to do with humans being granted morally significant free will and with the greater goods this freedom makes possible. All that Plantinga needs to claim on behalf of (MSR1) and (MSR2) is that they are logically possible (that is, not contradictory).

Does Plantinga’s Free Will Defense succeed in describing a possible state of affairs in which God has a morally sufficient reason for allowing evil? It certainly seems so. In fact, it appears that even the most hardened atheist must admit that (MSR1) and (MSR2) are possible reasons God might have for allowing moral and natural evil. They may not represent God’s actual reasons, but for the purpose of blocking the logical problem of evil, it is not necessary that Plantinga discover God’s actual reasons. In the last section we noted that many people will find (MSR2)’s explanation of natural evil extremely difficult to believe because it assumes the literal existence of Adam and Eve and the literal occurrence of the Fall. However, since (MSR2) deals with the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil (which claims that it is logically impossible for God and natural evil to co-exist), it only needs to sketch a possible way for God and natural evil to co-exist. The fact that (MSR2) may be implausible does not keep it from being possible. Since the situation described by (MSR2) is clearly possible, it appears that it successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil as it pertains to natural evil.

Since (MSR1) and (MSR2) together seem to show contra the claims of the logical problem of evil how it is possible for God and (moral and natural) evil to co-exist, it seems that the Free Will Defense successfully defeats the logical problem of evil.

8. Was Plantinga’s Victory Too Easy?

Some philosophers feel that Plantinga’s apparent victory over the logical problem of evil was somehow too easy. His solution to the logical problem of evil leaves them feeling unsatisfied and suspicious that they have been taken in by some kind of sleight of hand. For example, J. L. Mackie one of the most prominent atheist philosophers of the mid-twentieth-century and a key exponent of the logical problem of evil has this to say about Plantinga’s Free Will Defense:

Since this defense is formally [that is, logically] possible, and its principle involves no real abandonment of our ordinary view of the opposition between good and evil, we can concede that the problem of evil does not, after all, show that the central doctrines of theism are logically inconsistent with one another. But whether this offers a real solution of the problem is another question. (Mackie 1982, p. 154)

Mackie admits that Plantinga’s defense shows how God and evil can co-exist, that is, it shows that “the central doctrines of theism” are logically consistent after all. However, Mackie is reluctant to attribute much significance to Plantinga’s accomplishment. He expresses doubt about whether Plantinga has adequately dealt with the problem of evil.

Part of Mackie’s dissatisfaction probably stems from the fact that Plantinga only gives a possible reason for why God might have for allowing evil and suffering and does not provide any evidence for his claims or in any way try to make them plausible. Although sketching out mere possibilities without giving them any evidential support is typically an unsatisfactory thing to do in philosophy, it is not clear that Mackie’s unhappiness with Plantinga is completely warranted. It was, after all, Mackie himself who characterized the problem of evil as one of logical inconsistency:

Here it can be shown, not that religious beliefs lack rational support, but that they are positively irrational, that several parts of the essential theological doctrine are inconsistent with one another. (Mackie 1955, p. 200)

In response to this formulation of the problem of evil, Plantinga showed that this charge of inconsistency was mistaken. Even Mackie admits that Plantinga solved the problem of evil, if that problem is understood as one of inconsistency. It is, therefore, difficult to see why Plantinga’s Free Will Defense should be found wanting if that defense is seen as a response to the logical problem of evil. As an attempt to rebut the logical problem of evil, it is strikingly successful.

The dissatisfaction many have felt with Plantinga’s solution may stem from a desire to see Plantinga’s Free Will Defense respond more generally to the problem of evil and not merely to a single formulation of the problem. As an all-around response to the problem of evil, the Free Will Defense does not offer us much in the way of explanation. It leaves several of the most important questions about God and evil unanswered. The desire to see a theistic response to the problem of evil go beyond merely undermining a particular atheological argument is understandable. However, we should keep in mind that all parties admit that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil as it was formulated by atheists during the mid-twentieth-century.

If there is any blame that needs to go around, it may be that some of it should go to Mackie and other atheologians for claiming that the problem of evil was a problem of inconsistency. The ease with which Plantinga undermined that formulation of the problem suggests that the logical formulation did not adequately capture the difficult and perplexing issue concerning God and evil that has been so hotly debated by philosophers and theologians. In fact, this is precisely the message that many philosophers took away from the debate between Plantinga and the defenders of the logical problem of evil. They reasoned that there must be more to the problem of evil than what is captured in the logical formulation of the problem. It is now widely agreed that this intuition is correct. Current discussions of the problem focus on what is called “the probabilistic problem of evil” or “the evidential problem of evil.” According to this formulation of the problem, the evil and suffering (or, in some cases, the amounts, kinds and distributions of evil and suffering) that we find in the world count as evidence against the existence of God (or make it improbable that God exists). Responding to this formulation of the problem requires much more than simply describing a logically possible scenario in which God and evil co-exist.

9. Other Responses to the Logical Problem of Evil

Plantinga’s Free Will Defense has been the most famous theistic response to the logical problem of evil because he did more to clarify the issues surrounding the logical problem than anyone else. It has not, however, been the only such response. Other solutions to the problem include John Hick’s (1977) soul-making theodicy. Hick rejects the traditional view of the Fall, which pictures humans as being created in a finitely perfect and finished state from which they disastrously fell away. Instead, Hick claims that human beings are unfinished and in the midst of being made all that God intended them to be. The long evolutionary process made humans into a distinguishable species capable of reasoning and responsibility, but they must now (as individuals) go through a second process of “spiritualization” or “soul-making,” during which they become “children of God.” According to Hick, the suffering and travails of this life are part of the divine plan of soul-making. A world full of suffering, trials and temptations is more conducive to the process of soul-making than a world full of constant pleasure and the complete absence of pain. Hick (1977, pp. 255-256) writes,

The value-judgment that is implicitly being invoked here is that one who has attained to goodness by meeting and eventually mastering temptations, and thus by rightly making responsible choices in concrete situations, is good in a richer and more valuable sense than would be one created ab initio in a state either of innocence or of virtue…. I suggest, then, that it is an ethically reasonable judgment… that human goodness slowly built up through personal histories of moral effort has a value in the eyes of the Creator which justifies even the long travail of the soul-making process.

Unlike Plantinga’s response to the logical problem of evil, which is merely a “defense” (that is, a negative attempt to undermine a certain atheological argument without offering a positive account of why God allows evil and suffering), Hick’s response is a “theodicy” (that is, a more comprehensive attempt to account for why God is justified in allowing evil and suffering).

Eleonore Stump (1985) offers another response to the problem of evil that brings a range of distinctively Christian theological commitments to bear on the issue. She claims that a world full of evil and suffering is “conducive to bringing about both the initial human [receipt of God’s gift of salvation] and also the subsequent process of sanctification” (Stump 1985, p. 409). She writes,

Natural evil—the pain of disease, the intermittent and unpredictable destruction of natural disasters, the decay of old age, the imminence of death—takes away a person’s satisfaction with himself. It tends to humble him, show him his frailty, make him reflect on the transience of temporal goods, and turn his affections towards other-worldly things, away from the things of this world. No amount of moral or natural evil, of course, can guarantee that a man will [place his faith in God]…. But evil of this sort is the best hope, I think, and maybe the only effective means, for bringing men to such a state. (Stump 1985, p. 409)

Stump claims that, although the sin of Adam—and not any act of God—first brought moral and natural evil into this world, God providentially uses both kinds of evil in order to bring about the greatest good that a fallen, sinful human being can experience: a repaired will and eternal union with God.

The responses of both Hick and Stump are intended to cover not only the logical problem of evil but also any other formulation of the problem as well. Thus, some of those dissatisfied with Plantinga’s merely defensive response to the problem of evil may find these more constructive, alternative responses more attractive. Regardless of the details of these alternatives, the fact remains that all they need to do in order to rebut the logical problem of evil is to describe a logically possible way that God and evil can co-exist. A variety of morally sufficient reasons can be proposed as possible explanations of why a perfect God might allow evil and suffering to exist. Because the suggestions of Hick and Stump are clearly logically possible, they, too, succeed in undermining the logical problem of evil.

10. Problems with the Free Will Defense

A. Even though it is widely agreed that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense describes a state of affairs that is logically possible, some of the details of his defense seem to conflict with important theistic doctrines. One point of conflict concerns the possibility of human free will in heaven. Plantinga claims that if someone is incapable of doing evil, that person cannot have morally significant free will. He also maintains that part of what makes us the creatures we are is that we possess morally significant freedom. If that freedom were to be taken away, we might very well cease to be the creatures we are. However, consider the sort of freedom enjoyed by the redeemed in heaven. According to classical theism, believers in heaven will somehow be changed so that they will no longer commit any sins. It is not that they will contingently always do what is right and contingently always avoid what is wrong. They will somehow no longer be capable of doing wrong. In other words, their good behavior will be necessary rather than contingent.

This orthodox view of heaven poses the following significant challenges to Plantinga’s view:

(i) If heavenly dwellers do not possess morally significant free will and yet their existence is something of tremendous value, it is not clear that God was justified in creating persons here on Earth with the capacity for rape, murder, torture, sexual molestation, and nuclear war. It seems that God could have actualized whatever greater goods are made possible by the existence of persons without allowing horrible instances of evil and suffering to exist in this world.

(ii) If possessing morally significant free will is essential to human nature, it is not clear how the redeemed can lose their morally significant freedom when they get to heaven and still be the same people they were before.

(iii) If despite initial appearances heavenly dwellers do possess morally significant free will, then it seems that it is not impossible for God to create genuinely free creatures who always (of necessity) do what is right.

In other words, it appears that W3 isn’t impossible after all. If W3 is possible, an important plank in Plantinga’s Free Will Defense is removed. None of these challenges undermines the basic point established above that Plantinga’s Free Will Defense successfully rebuts the logical problem of evil. However, they reveal that some of the central claims of his defense conflict with other important theistic doctrines. Although Plantinga claimed that his Free Will Defense offered merely possible and not necessarily actual reasons God might have for allowing evil and suffering, it may be difficult for other theists to embrace his defense if it runs contrary to what theism says is actually the case in heaven.

B. Another problem facing Plantinga’s Free Will Defense concerns the question of God’s free will. God, it seems, is incapable of doing anything wrong. Thus, it does not appear that, with respect to any choice of morally good and morally bad options, God is free to choose a bad option. He seems constitutionally incapable of choosing (or even wanting) to do what is wrong. According to Plantinga’s description of morally significant free will, it does not seem that God would be significantly free. Plantinga suggests that morally significant freedom is necessary in order for one’s actions to be assessed as being morally good or bad. But then it seems that God’s actions could not carry any moral significance. They could never be praiseworthy. That certainly runs contrary to central doctrines of theism.

If, as theists must surely maintain, God does possess morally significant freedom, then perhaps this sort of freedom does not preclude an inability to choose what is wrong. But if it is possible for God to possess morally significant freedom and for him to be unable to do wrong, then W3 once again appears to be possible after all. Originally, Plantinga claimed that W3 is not a logically possible world because the description of that world is logically inconsistent. If W3 is possible, then the complaint lodged by Flew and Mackie above that God could (and therefore should) have created a world full of creatures who always did what is right is not answered.

There may be ways for Plantinga to resolve the difficulties sketched above, so that the Free Will Defense can be shown to be compatible with theistic doctrines about heaven and divine freedom. As it stands, however, some important challenges to the Free Will Defense remain unanswered. It is also important to note that, simply because Plantinga’s particular use of free will in fashioning a response to the problem of evil runs into certain difficulties, that does not mean that other theistic uses of free will in distinct kinds of defenses or theodicies would face the same difficulties.

11. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Clark, Kelly James. 1990. Return to Reason: A Critique of Enlightenment Evidentialism and a Defense of Reason and Belief in God. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Flew, Anthony. 1955. “Divine Omnipotence and Human Freedom.” In Anthony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre (eds.) New Essays in Philosophical Theology. New York: Macmillan.
  • Hick, John. 1977. Evil and the God of Love, revised ed. New York: Harper & Row.
  • Küng, Hans. 1976. On Being a Christian, trans. Edward Quinn. Garden City, New York: Doubleday.
  • Kushner, Harold S. 1981. When Bad Things Happen to Good People. New York: Schocken Books.
  • Lewis, C. S. 1943. Mere Christianity. New York: Macmillan.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1982. The Miracle of Theism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1955. “Evil and Omnipotence.” Mind 64: 200-212.
  • Madden, Edward and Peter Hare. 1968. Evil and the Concept of God. Springfield, IL: Charles C. Thomas.
  • McCloskey, H. J. 1960. “God and Evil.” Philosophical Quarterly 10: 97-114.
  • Peterson, Michael L. 1998. God and Evil: An Introduction to the Issues. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1974. The Nature of Necessary. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1977. God, Freedom, and Evil. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Strobel, Lee. 2000. The Case for Faith: A Journalist Investigates the Toughest Objections to Christianity. Grand Rapids, MI: Zondervan.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1985. “The Problem of Evil.” Faith and Philosophy 2: 392-423.

b. Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew and Marilyn McCord Adams, eds. 1990. The Problem of Evil. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, ed. 1996. The Evidential Argument from Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Peterson, Michael L., ed. 1992. The Problem of Evil: Selected Readings. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.

Author Information

James R. Beebe
Email: beebe “at” yahoo “dot” com
University at Buffalo
U. S. A.

Evolutionary Ethics

Evolutionary ethics tries to bridge the gap between philosophy and the natural sciences by arguing that natural selection has instilled human beings with a moral sense, a disposition to be good. If this were true, morality could be understood as a phenomenon that arises automatically during the evolution of sociable, intelligent beings and not, as theologians or philosophers might argue, as the result of divine revelation or the application of our rational faculties. Morality would be interpreted as a useful adaptation that increases the fitness of its holders by providing a selective advantage. This is certainly the view of Edward O. Wilson, the “father” of sociobiology, who believes that “scientists and humanists should consider together the possibility that the time has come for ethics to be removed temporarily from the hands of the philosophers and biologicized” (Wilson, 1975: 27). The challenge for evolutionary biologists such as Wilson is to define goodness with reference to evolutionary theory and then explain why human beings ought to be good.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures and Key Concepts
    1. Charles Darwin
    2. Herbert Spencer
    3. The Is-Ought Problem
    4. The Naturalistic Fallacy
    5. Sociobiology
  2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory
  3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures and Key Concepts

a. Charles Darwin

The biologization of ethics started with the publication of The Descent of Man by Charles Darwin (1809-1882) in 1871. In this follow-up to On the Origin of Species, Darwin applied his ideas about evolutionary development to human beings. He argued that humans must have descended from a less highly organized form–in fact, from a “hairy, tailed quadruped … inhabitant of the Old World” (Darwin, 1930: 231). The main difficulty Darwin saw with this explanation is the high standard of moral qualities apparent in humans. Faced with this puzzle, Darwin devoted a large chapter of the book to evolutionary explanations of the moral sense, which he argued must have evolved in two main steps.

First, the root for human morality lies in the social instincts (ibid. 232). Building on this claim by Darwin, today’s biologists would explain this as follows. Sociability is a trait whose phylogenetic origins can be traced back to the time when birds “invented” brooding, hatching, and caring for young offspring. To render beings able to fulfill parental responsibilities required social mechanisms unnecessary at earlier stages of evolutionary history. For example, neither amoebae (which reproduce by division) nor frogs (which leave their tadpole-offspring to fend for themselves) need the social instincts present in birds. At the same time as facilitating the raising of offspring, social instincts counterbalanced innate aggression. It became possible to distinguish between “them” and “us” and aim aggression towards individuals that did not belong to one’s group. This behavior is clearly adaptive in the sense of ensuring the survival of one’s family.

Second, with the development of intellectual faculties, human beings were able to reflect on past actions and their motives and thus approve or disapprove of others as well as themselves. This led to the development of a conscience which became “the supreme judge and monitor” of all actions (ibid. 235). Being influenced by utilitarianism, Darwin believed that the greatest-happiness principle will inevitably come to be regarded as a standard for right and wrong (ibid. 134) by social beings with highly evolved intellectual capacities and a conscience.

Based on these claims, can Darwin answer the two essential questions in ethics? First, how can we distinguish between good and evil? And second, why should we be good? If all his claims were true, they would indeed support answers to the above questions. Darwin’s distinction between good and evil is identical with the distinction made by hedonistic utilitarians. Darwin accepts the greatest-happiness principle as a standard of right and wrong. Hence, an action can be judged as good if it improves the greatest happiness of the greatest number, by either increasing pleasure or decreasing pain. And the second question–why we should be good–does not pose itself for Darwin with the same urgency as it did, for instance, for Plato (Thrasymachus famously asked Socrates in the Republic why the strong, who are not in need of aid, should accept the Golden Rule as a directive for action). Darwin would say that humans are biologically inclined to be sympathetic, altruistic, and moral as this proved to be an advantage in the struggle for existence (ibid. 141).

b. Herbert Spencer

The next important contribution to evolutionary ethics was by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), the most fervent defender of that theory and the creator of the theory of Social Darwinism. Spencer’s theory can be summarized in three steps. As did Darwin, Spencer believed in the theory of hedonistic utilitarianism as proposed by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. In his view, gaining pleasure and avoiding pain directs all human action. Hence, moral good can be equated with facilitating human pleasure. Second, pleasure can be achieved in two ways, first by satisfying self-regarding impulses and second by satisfying other-regarding impulses. This means that eating one’s favorite food and giving food to others are both pleasurable experiences for humans. Third, mutual cooperation between humans is required to coordinate self- and other-regarding impulses, which is why humans develop principles of equity to bring altruistic and egoistic traits into balance (Fieser, 2001, 214).

However, Spencer did not become known for his theory of mutual cooperation. On the contrary, his account of Social Darwinism is contentious to date because it is mostly understood as “an apology for some of the most vile social systems that humankind has ever known,” for instance German Nazism (Ruse, 1995: 228). In short, Spencer elevated alleged biological facts (struggle for existence, natural selection, survival of the fittest) to prescriptions for moral conduct (ibid. 225). For instance, he suggested that life is a struggle for human beings and that, in order for the best to survive, it is necessary to pursue a policy of non-aid for the weak: “to aid the bad in multiplying, is, in effect, the same as maliciously providing for our descendants a multitude of enemies” (Spencer, 1874: 346). Spencer’s philosophy was widely popular, particularly in North America in the 19th century, but declined significantly in the 20th century.

Which answers could he give to the two essential questions in ethics? How can we distinguish between good and evil and why should we be good? Spencer’s answer to question one is identical to Darwin’s (see above) as they both supported hedonistic utilitarianism. However, his answer to question two is interesting, if untenable. Spencer alleged that evolution equaled progress for the better (in the moral sense of the word) and that anything which supported evolutionary forces would therefore be good (Maxwell, 1984: 231). The reasoning behind this was that nature shows us what is good by moving towards it; and hence, “evolution is a process which, in itself, generates value” (Ruse, 1995: 231). If evolution advances the moral good, we ought to support it out of self-interest. Moral good was previously identified with universal human pleasure and happiness by Spencer. If the evolutionary process directs us towards this universal pleasure, we have an egoistic reason for being moral, namely that we want universal happiness. However, to equate development with moral progress for the better was a major value judgement which cannot be held without further evidence, and most evolutionary theorists have given up on the claim (Ruse, 1995: 233; Woolcock, 1999: 299). It also is subject to more conceptual objections, namely deriving “ought” from “is,” and committing the naturalistic fallacy.

c. The Is-Ought Problem

The first philosopher who persistently argued that normative rules cannot be derived from empirical facts was David Hume (1711-1776) (1978: 469):

In every system of morality, which I have hitherto met with, I have always remark’d, that the author proceeds for some time in the ordinary way of reasoning, and establishes the being of a God or makes observations concerning human affairs; when of a sudden I am surpriz’d to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought, or an ought not. This change is imperceptible; but is, however, of the last consequence.

It is this unexplained, imperceptible change from “is” to “ought” which Hume deplores in moral systems. To say what is the case and to say what ought to be the case are two unrelated matters, according to him. On the one hand, empirical facts do not contain normative statements, otherwise they would not be purely empirical. On the other hand, if there are no normative elements in the facts, they cannot suddenly surface in the conclusions because a conclusion is only deductively valid if all necessary information is present in the premises.

How do Darwin and Spencer derive “ought” from “is”? Let us look at Darwin first, using an example which he could have supported.

  1. Child A is dying from starvation.
  2. The parents of child A are not in a position to feed their child.
  3. The parents of child A are very unhappy that their child is dying from starvation.
  4. Therefore, fellow humans ought morally to provide food for child A.

Darwin (1930: 234) writes that “happiness is an essential part of the general good.” Therefore, those who want to be moral ought to promote happiness, and hence, in the above case, provide food. However, the imperceptible move from “is” to “ought” which Hume found in moral systems, is also present in this example. Thus, Darwin derives ought from is when he moves from the empirical fact of unhappiness to the normative claim of a duty to relieve unhappiness.

The same can be said for Spencer whose above argument about the survival of the fittest could be represented as follows:

  1. Natural selection will ensure the survival of the fittest.
  2. Person B is dying from starvation because he is ill, old, and poor.
  3. Therefore, fellow humans ought to morally avoid helping person B so that the survival of the fittest is guaranteed.

Even if both premises were shown to be true, it does not follow that we ought to morally support the survival of the fittest. An additional normative claim equating survival skills with moral goodness would be required to make the argument tenable. Again, this normative part of the argument is not included in the premises. Hence, Spencer also derives “ought” from “is.” Thomas Huxley (1906: 80) objects to evolutionary ethics on these grounds when he writes:

The thief and the murderer follow nature just as much as the philantropist. Cosmic evolution may teach us how the good and the evil tendencies of man may have come about; but, in itself, it is incompetent to furnish any better reason why what we call good is preferable to what we call evil than we had before.

d. The Naturalistic Fallacy

But evolutionary ethics was not only attacked by those who supported Hume’s claim that normative statements cannot be derived from empirical facts. A related argument against evolutionary ethics was voiced by British philosopher G.E. Moore (1873-1958). In 1903, he published a ground-breaking book, Principia Ethica, which created one of the most challenging problems for evolutionary ethics: the “naturalistic fallacy.” According to Michael Ruse (1995), when dealing with evolutionary ethics, “it has been enough for the student to murmur the magical phrase ‘naturalistic fallacy,’ and then he or she can move on to the next question, confident of having gained full marks thus far on the exam” (p. 223). So, what is the naturalistic fallacy and why does it pose a problem for evolutionary ethics?

Moore was interested in the definition of “good” and particularly in whether the property good is simple or complex. Simple properties, according to Moore, are indefinable as they cannot be described further using more basic properties. Complex properties, on the other hand, can be defined by outlining their basic properties. Hence, “yellow” cannot be defined in terms of its constituent parts, whereas “colored” can be explained further as it consists of several individual colors.

“Good,” according to Moore, is a simple property which cannot be described using more basic properties. Committing the naturalistic fallacy is attempting to define “good” with reference to other natural, i.e. empirically verifiable, properties. This understanding of “good” creates serious problems for both Darwin and Spencer. Following Bentham and Mill, both identify moral goodness with “pleasure.” This means they commit the naturalistic fallacy as good and pleasant are not identical. In addition, Spencer identifies goodness with “highly evolved,” committing the naturalistic fallacy again. (Both Moore’s claim in itself as well as his criticism of evolutionary ethics can be attacked, but this would fall outside the scope of this entry.)

e. Sociobiology

Despite the continuing challenge of the naturalistic fallacy, evolutionary ethics has moved on with the advent of sociobiology. In 1948, at a conference in New York, scientists decided to initiate new interdisciplinary research between zoologists and sociologists. “Sociobiology” was the name given to the new discipline aiming to find universally valid regularities in the social behavior of animals and humans. Emphasis was put on the study of biological, i.e. non-cultural, behavior. The field did, however, not get off the ground until Edward Wilson published his Sociobiology: The New Synthesis in 1975. According to Wilson (1975: 4), “sociobiology is defined as the systematic study of the biological basis of all social behavior.”

In Wilson’s view, sociobiology makes philosophers, at least temporarily, redundant, when it comes to questions of ethics (see quote in introduction). He believes that ethics can be explained biologically when he writes (ibid. 3, emphasis added):

The hypothalamus and limbic system … flood our consciousness with all the emotions – hate, love, guilt, fear, and others – that are consulted by ethical philosophers who wish to intuit the standards of good and evil. What, we are then compelled to ask, made the hypothalamus and the limbic system? They evolved by natural selection. That simple biological statement must be pursued to explain ethics.

Ethics, following this understanding, evolved under the pressure of natural selection. Sociability, altruism, cooperation, mutual aid, etc. are all explicable in terms of the biological roots of human social behavior. Moral conduct aided the long-term survival of the morally inclined species of humans. According to Wilson (ibid. 175), the prevalence of egoistic individuals will make a community vulnerable and ultimately lead to the extinction of the whole group. Mary Midgley agrees. In her view, egoism pays very badly in genetic terms, and a “consistently egoistic species would be either solitary or extinct” (Midgley, 1980: 94).

Wilson avoids the naturalistic fallacy in Sociobiology by not equating goodness with another natural property such as pleasantness, as Darwin did. This means that he does not give an answer to our first essential question in ethics. What is good? However, like Darwin he gives an answer to question two. Why should we be moral? Because we are genetically inclined to be moral. It is a heritage of earlier times when less morally inclined and more morally inclined species came under pressure from natural selection. Hence, we do not need divine revelation or strong will to be good; we are simply genetically wired to be good. The emphasis in this answer is not on the should, as it is not our free will which makes us decide to be good but our genetic heritage.

One of the main problems evolutionary ethics faces is that ethics is not a single field with a single quest. Instead, it can be separated into various areas, and evolutionary ethics might not be able to contribute to all of them. Let us therefore look at a possible classification for evolutionary ethics, which maps it on the field of traditional ethics, before concluding with possible criticisms.

2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory

For philosophy students, ethics is usually divided into three areas: metaethics, normative ethical theory, and applied ethics. Metaethics looks for possible foundations of ethics. Are there any moral facts out there from which we can deduce our moral theories? Normative ethical theories suggest principles or sets of principles to distinguish morally good from morally bad actions. Applied ethics looks at particular moral issues, such as euthanasia or bribery.

However, this classification is not adequate to accommodate evolutionary ethics in its entirety. Instead, a different three-fold distinction of ethics seems appropriate: descriptive ethics, normative ethics, and metaethics. Descriptive ethics outlines ethical beliefs as held by various people and tries to explain why they are held. For instance, almost all human cultures believe that incest is morally wrong. This belief developed, it could be argued, because it provides a survival advantage to the group that entertains it. Normative ethical theories develop standards to judge which actions are good and which actions are bad. The standard as defended by evolutionary ethics would be something like “Actions that increase the long-term capacity of survival in evolutionary terms are good and actions that decrease this capacity are bad.” However, the field has not yet established itself credibly in normative ethics. Consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics, and social contracts still dominate debates. This is partly due to the excesses of Social Darwinism but also due to the unintuitive nature of the above or similar standards. Evolutionary ethics has been more successful in providing interesting answers in metaethics. Michael Ruse (1995: 250), for instance, argues that morality is a “collective illusion of the genes, bringing us all in…. We need to believe in morality, and so, thanks to our biology, we do believe in morality. There is no foundation “out there” beyond human nature.”

Descriptive ethics seems, as yet, the most interesting area for evolutionary ethics, a topic particularly suitable for anthropological and sociological research. Which ethical beliefs do people hold and why? But in all three areas, challenges are to be faced.

3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics

The following are some lingering challenges for evolutionary ethics:

  • How can a trait that was developed under the pressure of natural selection explain moral actions that go far beyond reciprocal altruism or enlightened self-interest? How can, for instance, the action of Maximilian Kolbe be explained from a biological point of view? (Kolbe was a Polish priest who starved himself to death in a concentration camp to rescue a fellow prisoner.)
  • Could not human beings have moved beyond their biological roots and transcended their evolutionary origins, in which case they would be able to formulate goals in the pursuit of goodness, beauty, and truth that “have nothing to do directly with survival, and which may at times militate against survival?” (O’Hear, 1997: 203).
  • Morality is universal, whereas biologically useful altruism is particular favoring the family or the group over others. “Do not kill” does not only refer to one’s own son, but also to the son of strangers. How can evolutionary ethics cope with universality?
  • Normative ethics aims to be action-guiding. How could humans ever judge an action to be ensuring long-term survival? (This is a practical rather than conceptual problem for evolutionary ethics.)
  • Hume’s “is-ought” problem still remains a challenge for evolutionary ethics. How can one move from “is” (findings from the natural sciences, including biology and sociobiology) to “ought”?
  • Similarly, despite the length of time that has passed since the publication of Principia Ethica, the challenge of the “naturalistic fallacy” remains.

Evolutionary ethics is, on a philosopher’s time-scale, a very new approach to ethics. Though interdisciplinary approaches between scientists and philosophers have the potential to generate important new ideas, evolutionary ethics still has a long way to go.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles (1871, 1930) The Descent of Man, Watts & Co., London.
  • Fieser, James (2001) Moral Philosophy through the Ages, Mayfield Publishing Company, Mountain View California), Chapter 12 “Evolutionary Ethics.”
  • Hume, David (1740, 1978) A Treatise of Human Nature, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Maxwell, Mary (1984) Human Evolution: A Philosophical Anthropology, Croom Helm, London.
  • Midgley, Mary (1980) Beast and Man: The Roots of Human Nature, Methuen, London.
  • O’Hear, Anthony (1997) Beyond Evolution: Human Nature and the Limits of Evolutionary Explanation, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Ruse, Michael (1995) Evolutionary Naturalism, Routledge, London.
  • Spencer, Herbert (1874) The Study of Sociology, Williams & Norgate, London.
  • Wilson, Edward O. (1975) Sociobiology: The New Synthesis, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Woolcock, Peter G. (1999) “The Case Against Evolutionary Ethics Today,” in: Maienschein, Jane and Ruse, Michael (eds) Biology and the Foundation of Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, pp. 276-306.

Author Information

Doris Schroeder
Lancaster University, United Kingdom

Gilles Deleuze (1925–1995)

DeleuzeDeleuze is a key figure in postmodern French philosophy. Considering himself an empiricist and a vitalist, his body of work, which rests upon concepts such as multiplicity, constructivism, difference, and desire, stands at a substantial remove from the main traditions of 20th century Continental thought. His thought locates him as an influential figure in present-day considerations of society, creativity and subjectivity.  Notably, within his metaphysics he favored a Spinozian concept of a plane of immanence with everything a mode of one substance, and thus on the same level of existence.  He argued, then, that there is no good and evil, but rather only relationships which are beneficial or harmful to the particular individuals.  This ethics influences his approach to society and politics, especially as he was so politically active in struggles for rights and freedoms.  Later in his career he wrote some of the more infamous texts of the period, in particular, Anti-Oedipus and A Thousand Plateaus. These texts are collaborative works with the radical psychoanalyst Félix Guattari, and they exhibit Deleuze’s social and political commitment.

Gilles Deleuze began his career with a number of idiosyncratic yet rigorous historical studies of figures outside of the Continental tradition in vogue at the time. His first book, Empirisism and Subjectivity, isa study of Hume, interpreted by Deleuze to be a radical subjectivist. Deleuze became known for writing about other philosophers with new insights and different readings, interested as he was in liberating philosophical history from the hegemony of one perspective. He wrote on Spinoza, Nietzche, Kant, Leibniz and others, including literary authors and works, cinema, and art.   Deleuze claimed that he did not write “about” art, literature, or cinema, but, rather, undertook philosophical “encounters” that led him to new concepts.  As a constructivist, he was adamant that philosophers are creators, and that each reading of philosophy, or each philosophical encounter, ought to inspire new concepts. Additionally, according to Deleuze and his concepts of difference, there is no identity, and in repetition, nothing is ever the same.  Rather, there is only difference: copies are something new, everything is constantly changing, and reality is a becoming, not a being.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The History Of Philosophy
    1. Two Examples: Kant and Leibniz
  3. A New Empiricism
    1. Hume
    2. Spinoza
    3. Nietzsche
    4. Deleuze’s Central Empiricist Concepts
  4. Difference And Repetition
    1. Difference-in-itself
    2. Contra-Hegel
    3. Repetition and Time
    4. The Image of Thought
  5. Capitalism And Schizophrenia – Deleuze And Guattari
  6. Literature, Cinema, Painting
    1. Literature
      1. Marcel Proust
      2. Leopold von Sacher-masoch
      3. Franz Kafka
    2. Cinema
    3. Painting
  7. What Is Philosophy?
    1. Early Reflections – Naturalism
    2. “What is Philosophy?” – Constructivism
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Main texts
    2. Secondary texts
      1. Books and Collections of Essays
      2. Additional Uncollected Articles

1. Biography

Gilles Deleuze was born in the 17th arrondisment of Paris, a district that, excepting periods in his youth, he lived in for the whole of his life. He was the son of an conservative, anti-Semitic engineer, a veteran of World War I. Deleuze’s brother was arrested by Germans during the Nazi occupation of France for alleged resistance activities, and died on the way to Auschwitz.

Due to his families’ lack of money, Deleuze was schooled at a public school before the war. When the Germans invaded France, Deleuze was on vacation in Normandy and spent a year being schooled there. In Normandy, he was inspired by a teacher, under whose influence he read Gide, Baudelaire and others, becoming for the first time interested in his studies. In a late interview, he states that after this experience, he never had any trouble academically. After returning to Paris and finishing his high school education, Deleuze attended the Lycée Henri IV, where he did his kâgne, an intensive year of study for students of promise, in 1945, and then studied philosophy at the Sorbonne with figures such as Jean Hippolyte and Georges Canguilheim. He passed his agrégation in 1948, necessary for entry into the teaching profession, and taught in a number of high schools until 1956. In this year, he also married Denise Paul “Fanny” Grandjouan, a French translator of D.H. Lawrence. His first book, Empiricism and Subjectivity, on David Hume, was published in 1953, when he was 28.

Over the next ten years, Deleuze held a number of assistant teaching positions in French universities, publishing his important text on Nietzsche (Nietzsche and Philosophy) in 1962. It was also around this time that he met Michel Foucault, with whom he had a long and important friendship. When Foucault died, Deleuze dedicated a book-length study to his work (Foucault 1986). In 1968, Deleuze’s doctoral thesis, comprising of Difference and Repetition and Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza were published. This was also the period of the first major incidence of pulmonary illness that would plague Deleuze for the rest of his life.

In 1969, Deleuze took up a teaching post at the ‘experimental’ University of Paris VII, where he taught until his retirement in 1987. In the same year, he met Félix Guattari, with whom he wrote a number of influential texts, notably the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia, Anti-Oedipus (1972) and A Thousand Plateaus (1980). These texts were considered by many (including Deleuze) to be an expression in part of the political ferment in France during May 1968. During the seventies, Deleuze was politically active in a number of causes, including membership in the Groupe d’information sur les prisons (formed, with others, by Michel Foucault), and had an engaged concern with homosexual rights and the Palestinian liberation movement.

In the eighties, Deleuze wrote a number of books on cinema (the influential studies The Movement-Image (1983) and The Time-Image (1985)) and on painting (Francis Bacon (1981)). Deleuze’s final collaboration with Guattari, What is Philosophy?, was published in 1991 (Guattari died in 1992).

Deleuze’s last book, a collection of essays on literature and related philosophical questions, Essays Critical and Clinical, was published in 1993. Deleuze’s pulmonary illness, by 1993, had confined him quite severely, even making it difficult for him to write. He took his own life on November 4th, 1995.

2. The History Of Philosophy

Deleuze’s whole intellectual trajectory can be traced by his shifting relationship to the history of philosophy. While in later years, he became quite critical of both the style of thought implied in narrow reproductions of past thinkers and the institutional pressures to think on this basis, Deleuze never lost any enthusiasm for writing books about other philosophers, if in a new way. Most of his publications contain the name of another philosopher as part of the title: Hume, Kant, Spinoza, Nietzsche, Bergson, Leibniz, Foucault.

Deleuze expresses two main problems with the traditional style and institutional location of the history of philosophy. The first concerns a politics of the tradition:

The history of philosophy has always been the agent of power in philosophy, and even in thought. It has played the repressors role: how can you think without having read Plato, Descartes, Kant and Heidegger, and so-and-so’s book about them? A formidable school of intimidation which manufactures specialists in thought – but which also makes those who stay outside conform all the more to this specialism which they despise. An image of thought called philosophy has been formed historically and it effectively stops people from thinking. (D 13)

This hegemony of thought recurrently comes under attack later in Deleuze’s career, notably in What is Philosophy? This criticism also sits well with a general theme throughout his writings, which is the immediate politicisation of all thought. Philosophy and its history is not separated from the fortunes of the wider world, for Deleuze, but intimately linked to it, and to the forces at work there.

The second criticism directed at the traditional style of history of philosophy, the construction of specialists and expertise, leads directly to the foremost positive aspect of Deleuze’s particular method: “What we should in fact do, is stop allowing philosophers to reflect ‘on’ things. The philosopher creates, he doesn’t reflect.” (N122) And this creation, with regard to other writers, takes the form of a portrait:

The history of philosophy isn’t a particularly reflective discipline. It’s rather like portraiture in painting. Producing mental, conceptual portraits. As in painting, you have to create a likeness, but in a different material: the likeness is something you have to produce, rather than a way of reproducing anything (which comes down to just repeating what a philosopher says). (N 136)

Perhaps such a method does not seem extremely creative, or perhaps only in a relatively passive sense. For Deleuze, however, the history of philosophy also embraces a much more active, constructive sense. Each reading of a philosopher, an artist, a writer should be undertaken, Deleuze tells us, in order to provide an impetus for creating new concepts that do not pre-exist (DR vii).

Thus the works that Deleuze studies are seen by him as inspirational, but also as a resource, from which the philosopher can gather the concepts that seem the most useful and give them a new life, along with the force to develop new, non-preexistent concepts.

In an important sense, Deleuze’s whole modus operandi is based in this revaluation of the role of other thinkers, and the means by which one can use them: each of his books either centers around one philosopher, or derives much of its texture from references to others. In any case, new concepts are derived from others’ works, or old ones are recreated or ‘awakened’, and put to a new service.

a. Two examples: Kant and Leibniz

Deleuze’s book on Kant, his third publication (1963) in general conforms with the standards of an academic philosophical study. Aside from its surprising breadth, covering as it does all three of Kant’s Critiques in a slender volume, it focuses on a problem that is clearly of concern to both Kant himself and the traditional reading of his work, that of the relationship between the faculties. Deleuze himself, later reflecting on Kant’s Critical Philosophy, distinguishes it from the other, more constructivist historical studies:

My book on Kant’s different; I like it, I did it as a book about an enemy that tries to show how his system works, its various cogs – the tribunal of Reason, the legitimate exercises of the faculties. (N 6)

There are, however, some distinctively creative elements even to this apparently sober study, which reflect Deleuze’s general interests, two in particular. In this text on Kant, these reveal themselves by way of emphasis, rather than out-and-out creation.

The first of these is his emphasis on Kant’s rejections of transcendentality at key points in the Critiques, in favour of a generalised pragmatism of reason. While Deleuze himself locates in Kant the development of the concept of the transcendental at the root of modern philosophy (DR 135), he is quick to insist that, even as transcendental faculties in Kant, understanding, reason and imagination act only in an immanent fashion to achieve their own ends:

. . . the so-called transcendental method is always the determination of an immanent employment of reason, conforming to one of its interests. The Critique of Pure Reason thus condemns the transcendent employment of a speculative reason which claims to legislate by itself; the Critique of Practical Reason condemns the transcendent employment of practical reason which, instead of legislating by itself, lets itself be empirically conditioned. (KCP 36-7; cf. KCP 24-5; NP 91)

Deleuze, then, insists on the critical activity of Kant’s philosophy as not only a critique of reason used wrongly, but specifies this critique in pragmatic and empiricist terms.

The second Deleuzian feature of Kant’s Critical Philosophy is its insistence on the creative and affirmative nature of the Critique of Judgement. This runs counter not just to a number of Kant scholars, who suggest that the third Critique is a defected work as a result of Kant’s age and decaying mental abilities when he wrote it, but also other prominent French philosophers of Deleuze’s generation, notably Jean-Francois Lyotard and Jacques Derrida, who both consider this text primarily in terms of its aporetic nature.

Deleuze, to the contrary, insists on its central importance to Kant’s philosophy. He argues not only that there are conflicts between the activity of the faculties, and thus between the first two Critiques, a moot point in reading Kant, but that the Critique of Judgement solves this problem (already a controversial perspective) by positing a genesis of free accord between the faculties deeper than their conflicts. Not only are the struggles between the faculties not insoluble: there is in fact an affirmative creation of a resolution that does not rely upon any transcendental faculty.

When we turn to consider a much later text, The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque, we find Deleuze’s constructivist practice of the history of philosophy developed to its fullest. This text is not only a “portrait” of Leibniz’s thought, but uses concepts drawn from it, along with new concepts based in a philosophical ‘take’ on mathematics, art, and music, to characterise the Baroque period, and indeed vice versa. Leibniz, Deleuze argues, is the philosopher whose point of view can be best used to understand the Baroque period, and Baroque architecture, music and art give us a unique and illuminating vantage point for reading Leibniz. In fact, one of the more astonishing claims that Deleuze makes is that the one cannot be understood properly without the other:

It is impossible to understand the Leibnizian monad, and its light-mirror-point of view-interior decoration system, if we do not come to terms with these elements in Baroque architecture. (FLB 39; translation altered)

How is such a statement to be demonstrated? Instead of claiming that in fact there is an a priori link between Leibniz and the Baroque, Deleuze creates a new concept, and reads both of them through it: this is the concept of the fold. In keeping with Leibniz’s theory of the monad, that the whole universe is contained within each being, like the Baroque church, Deleuze argues that the process of folding constitutes the basic unit of existence. While there are elements of the fold already in Leibniz and the architecture and art of the period, as Deleuze points out (N 157), it gains a new consistency and significance when used as a creative term in this manner. Throughout the book, and later, in Foucault, Deleuze uses the concept of the fold to describe the nature of the human subject as the outside folded in: an immanently political, social, embedded subject.

In addition, in The Fold, we see a remarkable cross-section of Deleuze’s whole work, expressed in a new way through the material that he analyses. Chapters 4 and 6 give a succinct formulation of the relationship between the event and the subject (one of Deleuze’s perennial interests), which leads to a new formulation of the nature of sufficient reason in line with Deleuze’s concept of the virtual. We also see a return to the question of the body that he examines with Guattari in Capitalism and Schizophrenia. (FLB sec III: ‘Having a body’), which reinstates the work of Leibniz on the level of the material, rather than in the realm of idealism.

Deleuze thus provides a reading of Leibniz that strikes the reader as eccentric and certainly at odds with the traditional approach, and yet which holds to both the text (in all his historical studies, Deleuze cites quite exhaustively), and to the new direction that he is working in.

3. A New Empiricism

In the English preface to the Dialogues, Deleuze writes the following:

I have always felt that I am an empiricist . . . [My empiricism] is derived from the two characteristics by which Whitehead defined empiricism: the abstract does not explain, but must itself be explained; and the aim is not to rediscover the eternal or the universal, but to find the conditions under which something new is produced (creativeness). (D vii; cf. N 88; WP 7)

One can see that such a definition of empiricism differs sharply, at least apparently, from the traditional understanding canonised by Anglo-American histories of philosophy. Such a history would have us believe that empiricism is above all the doctrine that whatever knowledge that we possess is derived from the senses and the senses alone – the well-known rejection of innate ideas. Modern views of science embrace such a doctrine, and apply it as a tool to derive facts about the physical world.

Deleuze’s empiricism is both an extreme radicalisation and rejection of this sense-data model: “Empiricism is by no means . . . a simple appeal to lived experience.” (DR xx; cf. PI 35). Rather, it takes a standpoint regarding the transcendental in general. Writing of Hume, he states that, We can now see the special ground of empiricism: . . . nothing is ever transcendental.” (ES 24) To claim that knowledge is derived from the senses alone and not from ideas which exist in the mind prior to experience (as is argued in a long tradition from Plato to Descartes and beyond, lingering in the discourse of modern science) is indeed a rejection of a certain transcendentality of the mind, but for Deleuze, this is only the very first moment of a radical displacement of all transcendentals that is central in all of his work: questioning the supremacy of reason as the a priori privileged way of relating to the world, questioning the link between freedom and will, attempting to abolish dualisms from ontology, reinstating politics prior to Being.

To return to the citation from the Dialogues, there are two aspects of Deleuze’s empiricist philosophy. The first is the rejection of all transcendentals, but the second is an active element: for Deleuze, empiricism is always about creating. In terms of philosophy, the creation par excellence is the creation of concepts: “Empiricism is by no means a reaction against concepts . . . On the contrary, it undertakes the most insane creation of concepts ever.” (DR xx) This idea of philosophy as an empiricist creation of concepts, or constructivism, is taken up again in What is Philosophy?, and is present, as noted above, in all of his historical studies of philosophers.

These two facets of empiricism are throughout Deleuze’s work, and it is in this sense that his claim about being such a philosopher is clearly true. Deleuze primarily developed this point of view through the texts he wrote prior to 1968, and particularly through three other philosophers, who he reads as empiricists in the sense mentioned: Hume, Spinoza and Nietzsche.

a. Hume

Deleuze’s first publication, Empiricism and Subjectivity (1953) is a book about David Hume, who is generally considered the foremost and most rigorous British empiricist, according to the general ‘sense-data’ model described above. Deleuze, however, takes Hume to be far more radical than he is normally considered to be. While this text very carefully reads Hume’s works, especially the Treatise of Human Nature, the portrait that emerges is quite strikingly idiosyncratic.

On Deleuze’s account, Hume is above all a philosopher of subjectivity. His central concern is to establish the basis upon which the subject is formed. All the well-known arguments about habit, causation and miracles reveal a more profound question: if there is nothing transcendental, how are we to understand the self-aware, creative self who seems to govern the nature that he somehow has sprung up from? Deleuze argues then that the relation between human nature and nature is Hume’s central concern (ES 109).

Deleuze develops this argument by asserting precisely the opposite of the traditional reading of Hume:

According to Hume, and also Kant, the principles of knowledge are not derived from experience. But in the case of Hume, nothing is transcendental, because these principles are simply principles of our nature . . . (ES 111-2)

Kant proposed transcendental operations of categories in order to make experience possible, criticising Hume for thinking that we could have unified knowledge of an empirical flux that we only passively receive. On Deleuze’s reading, however, Hume did not suppose that there were no unifying processes at work, on the contrary. The difference is that for Hume, these principles are natural; they do not rely upon the postulation of a priori structures of experience.

The question of the subject is resolved by Hume, according to Deleuze, by the creation of a number of key concepts: association, belief, and the externality of relations. Association is the principle of nature which operates by establishing a relation between two things. The imagination is affected by this principle to create a new unity, which can in turn be used later on to come to conclusions about other ideas that this unity resembles, is closely related to, or seems to cause. If we consider the traditional example of the balls on a pool table, the process of association allows a subject to form a relation of causality between one ball and the next, so that the next time one ball comes into contact with another, an expectation that the second ball will move is created.

Thus Hume, for Deleuze, considers the mind to be a system of associations alone, a network of tendencies (ES 25): “We are habits, nothing but habits – the habit of saying ‘I’. Perhaps there is no more striking answer to the problem of the Self.” (ES x.) The mind, affected by the natural principle of association, becomes human nature, from the ground up:

Empirical subjectivity is constituted in the mind under the influence of the principles affecting it; the mind therefore does not have the characteristics of a preexisting subject. (ES 29)

These associations account not only for experience in the basic sense, but up to the highest level of social and cultural life: this is the basis for Hume’s rejection of a social contract model of society (such as Hobbes’), in favour of convention alone. Morals, feelings, bodily comportment, all of these elements of subjectivity are explained, not by transcendental structures, such as Kant will propose, but the immanent activity of association.

Once this habitual structure of the self is in place, Deleuze suggests, the Humean concept of belief comes into play, which is resolutely a central part of human nature. It describes the particularly human way of going beyond the given. When we expect the sun to come up tomorrow, we do not do so because we know that it will, but because of a belief based on a habit. This in turn reverses the hierarchy of knowledge and belief, and results, for Deleuze, in a, “great conversion of theory to practice.” (PI 36) Every act of belief is a practical application of habit, without any reference to an a priori ability to judge. Not only is the human being thus habitual, on Deleuze’s reading, but also creative, even in the most mundane moments of life.

Finally, Deleuze insists that one of Hume’s greatest contributions to modern philosophy is his insistence that all relations are external to their terms: this is the essence of Hume’s anti-transcendental stance. Human nature cannot unite itself, there is no ‘I’ which stands before experience, but only moments of experience themselves, unattached and meaningless without any necessary relation to each other. A flash of red, a movement, a gust of wind, these elements must be externally related to each other to create the sensation of a tree in autumn. In the social world, this externality attests to the always-already interested nature of life: no relation is necessary, or governed by neutral laws, so every relation has a localised and passional motive. The ways in which habits are formed attests to the desires at the heart of our social milieu.

Subjectivity, as Deleuze describes it through his reading of Hume, is a practical, passional, empiricist concept, immediately located at the heart of the conventional, which is to say the social.

b. Spinoza

While Hume may not be a contentious name to link with a deepened empiricism, Benedict de Spinoza certainly is. Generally considered the arch-rationalist par excellence, Spinoza is most well known for the first main thesis proposed in his Ethics: that there is one substance, God or Nature, and that everything that exists is merely a modulation of this substance. His style of writing, known as the ‘geometric method’, is composed by propositions, proofs, and axioms. Such a point of view hardly seems consistent with a radical construction of concepts, and an essential pragmatism: and yet this is what Deleuze’s interpretation of Spinoza, which has been very influential (as recent texts such as those by Geneveive Lloyd and Moira Gatens demonstrate), argues.

Spinoza is without a doubt the philosopher most praised and referred to by Deleuze, often with words that are rarely a part of philosophical writing. For example:

Spinoza is, for me, the ‘prince’ of philosophers. (EPS 11)

Spinoza is the Christ of philosophers, and the greatest philosophers are hardly more than apostles who distance themselves from or draw near to this mystery. (WP 60)

Spinoza: the absolute philosopher, whose Ethics is the foremost book on concepts. (N 140)

Spinoza’s greatness for Deleuze comes precisely from his development of a philosophy based on the two features of empiricism discussed above. Indeed, for Deleuze, Spinoza combines the two things into one movement: a rejection of the transcendental in the action of creating a plane of absolute immanence upon which all that exists situate themselves. In more Spinozist language, we can refer to the thesis of a single substance instead of a plane of immanence; all bodies (beings) are modal expressions of the one substance (SPP 122).

But not only is The Ethics for Deleuze the creation of a plane of immanence, it is the creation of a whole regime of new concepts that revolve around the rejection of the transcendental in all spheres of life. The unity of the ontological and the ethical is crucial, for Deleuze, in understanding Spinoza, that is:

Spinoza didn’t entitle his book Ontology, he’s too shrewd for that, he entitles it Ethics. Which is a way of saying that, whatever the importance of my speculative propositions may be, you can only judge them at the level of the ethics that they envelope or imply [impliquer].

In short, as the title of one of Deleuze’s books, Spinoza: Practical Philosophy, indicates, the Ethics is only understood when it is seen, at one and the same time, to be theoretical and practical. Deleuze considers there to be three primary theoretico-practical points in the Ethics:

The great theories of the Ethics . . . cannot be treated apart from the three practical theses concerning consciousness, values and the sad passions (SPP 28)

First of all, the illusion of consciousness. Spinoza argues that we are not the cause of our thoughts and actions, but only assume that we are based on their affects upon us. This leads to dualisms of substance (such as Descartes’ mind/body split). Deleuze insists on this point because he sees Spinoza bypassing an important illusion of subjectivity: we suppose that we are causes and not effects.

The illusion of consciousness, for Spinoza a result of inadequate knowledge and sad affects, allows us to posit a transcendental consciousness supposedly free from the interventions of the world (as in Descartes). This is in fact a blind-spot which precludes us from knowing ourselves as caused, the practical meaning of which is that we deny our own ‘sociality’, as one mode amongst others, and the significance of the relations that we enter into, which actually determine our power to act, and our ability to experience active joy.

The second is the critique of morality. Spinoza’s Ethics, for Deleuze, constitutes a rejection of the transcendent Good/Evil distinction in favour of a merely functional opposition between good and bad. Good and Evil, for Spinoza as for Lucretius and Nietzsche, are the illusions of a moralistic world-view that does nothing but reduce our power to act and encourages the experience of the sad passions (SPP 25; LS 275-8). The Ethics is for Deleuze rather an incitement to consider encounters between bodies on the basis of their relative ‘goodness’ for those modes that are relating. The shark enters into a good relation with salt water, which increases its power to act, but for fresh water fish, or for a rose bush, salt water only degrades the characteristic relations between the parts of the bush and threatens to destroy its existence.

So actions have no transcendental scale to be measured upon (the theological illusion), but only relative and perspectival good and bad assessments, based on specific bodies. Thus the Ethics is, for Deleuze, an ‘ethology’, that is, a guide to obtaining the best relations possible for bodies.

Finally, Deleuze sees in Spinoza the rejection of the sad passions. This point is linked to the last, and again closely related to Nietzsche’s critique of ressentiment and slave morality. Sad passions are for Spinoza all those forces which disparage life. For Deleuze, Spinoza,

denounces all the falsifications of life, all the values in the name of which we disparage life. We do not live, we only lead a semblance of life; we can only think of how to keep from dying, and our whole life is a death worship. (SPP 26)

The hinge that this practical reading of Spinoza turns on is Deleuze’s angle of approach to the Ethics. Rather than emphasising the great theoretical structures found in the first few sections, Deleuze emphasises the later part of the book (particularly part V), which consists in arguments from the point of view of individual modes. This approach puts the importance on the reality of individuals rather than form, and on the practical rather than the theoretical. In the preface to the English translation of Expressionism in Philosophy, he writes:

What interested me most in Spinoza wasn’t his Substance, but the composition of finite modes . . . That is: the hope of making substance turn on finite modes, or at least of seeing in substance a plane of immanence in which finite modes operate . . .” (EPS 11)

Deleuze’s reading of Spinoza has clear and profound relations with all that he wrote after 1968, especially the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia.

c. Nietzsche

Aside from Spinoza, Nietzsche is the most important philosopher for Deleuze. His name, and central concepts that he created appear almost without exception in all of Deleuze’s books. It would also be accurate to say that he reads both Spinoza and Nietzsche together, one through the other, and thus highlights the profound continuity of their thought.

The most significant work that Deleuze did with Nietzsche was his highly influential study Nietzsche and Philosophy, the first book in France to systematically defend and explicate Nietzsche’s work, still suspected of fascism, after the second World War. This text was and is extremely well regarded by other philosophers, including Jacques Derrida (Derrida 2001), and Pierre Klossowski, who wrote the other key French study on Nietzsche in the second half of last century (Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, which is dedicated to Deleuze).

While Nietzsche and Philosophy does deal with Nietzsche’s polemical targets, its originality and strength lies in its systematic exposition of the diagnostic elements of his thought. Indeed, one critique of this text is that it oversystematises a thinker and writer whose style of writing overtly resists such a summary approach. For Deleuze, however, it has been one of the hallmarks of bad readings of Nietzsche that they have relied upon a non-philosophical reading, either seeing him as a writer who attempts to assert other models of thought over philosopher, or, more commonly, as an obscurantist or (proto-) madman whose books have no coherence or value.

Nietzsche, for Deleuze, develops a symptomatology based on an analysis of forces that is elaborate, rigorous and systematic. He argues that Nietzsche’s ontology is monist, a monism of force: “There is no quantity of reality, all reality is already a quantity of force.” (NP 40) This force, in turn, is solely a force of affirmation, since it expresses only itself and itself to its fullest; that is, force says ‘yes’ to itself (NP 186). Deleuze’s reading of Nietzsche starts from this point, and accounts for the whole of Nietzsche’s critical typology of negation, sadness, reactive forces and ressentiment on this basis. The polemical basis of Nietzsche’s work, for Deleuze, is directed at all that would separate force from acting on its own basis, that is, from affirming itself.

There is not one force, but many, the play and interaction of which forms the basis of existence. Deleuze argues that the many antagonistic metaphors in Nietzsche’s writing should be interpreted in light of his pluralist ontology, and not as indications of some sort of psychological agressivity.

Nietzsche’s ontology, then, retains the suppleness and reliance on difference while remaining monist. Thus he, for Deleuze, is characterised as an anti-transcendental thinker.

Deleuze’s reading of Nietzsche demonstrates the extent to which he rejected the traditional, or dogmatic image of thought (see (4)(d) below), which relies upon a natural harmony between thinker, truth and the activity of thought. Thought does not naturally relate to truth at all, but is rather a creative act (NP xiv), an act of affect, of force on other forces: “As Nietzsche succeeded in making us understand, thought is creation, not will to truth.” (WP 54) There is no room for seeing truth as abstract generality (NP 103) in Deleuze’s account of Nietzsche, but rather to see truth itself as a part of regimes of force, as a matter of value, to be assessed and judged, rather than as an innate disposition (NP 108).

Once again, in Nietzsche, we are confronted with the problem of considering a philosopher who is generally considered to be quite foreign to the tradition of empiricist thought, as an empiricist. As with Spinoza, however, Deleuze’s reading of Nietzsche, as he himself indicates, relies upon his characterisation of empiricist thought: as the rejection of the transcendental, both in ontology and thought, and the consequent affirmation of thought as creativity.

d. Deleuze’s Central Empiricist Concepts

While Deleuze often refers to the central concepts of empiricism as classically formulated by Hume in the Treatise (association, habituation, convention etc.) (ES; LS 305-7; DR 70-3; WP 201-2), he also develops, throughout his work, a number of other key concepts which should be considered as empiricist. The most prominent of these are immanence, constructivism, and excess.

The key word throughout Deleuze’s writings, as we have seen, to be found in almost all of his main texts without fail, is immanence. This term refers to a philosophy based around the empirical real, the flux of existence which has no transcendental level or inherent seperation. His last text, published a few months before his death, bore the title, “Immanence: a life . . .” (PI 25-33). Deleuze repeatedly insists that philosophy can only be done well if it approaches the immanent conditions of that which it is trying to think; this is to say that all thought, in order to have any real force, must not work by setting up trancendentals, but by creating movement and consequences:

If you’re talking about establishing new forms of transcendence, new universals, restoring a reflective subject as the bearer of rights, or setting up a communicative intersubjectivity, then it’s not much of a philosophical advance. People want to produce ‘consensus’, but consensus is an ideal that guides opinion, and has nothing to do with philosophy. (N 152; cf. 145; WP chapter 2)

Deleuze’s insistence on the concept of the immanent also has an ontological sense, as we have seen in his studies of Spinoza and Nietzsche, and which returns later in works such as Difference and Repetition and Capitalism and Schizophrenia: there is only one substance, and therefore everything which exists must be considered on the same plane, the same level, and analysed by way of their relations, rather than by their essence.

Constructivism is the title that Deleuze uses to characterise the movement of thought in philosophy. This has two senses. Firstly, empiricism, immanent thought, must create movement, create concepts if it is to be philosophy and not just opinion or consensus. Deleuze and Guattari cite Nietzsche on this point: “[Philosophers] must no longer accept concepts as a gift, nor merely purify or polish them, but first make and create them, present them and make them convincing.” (WP 5)

Secondly, in relation to other philosophy, Deleuze maintains that we do not just repeat what they have already said (see (2) above): “Empiricism . . . [analyses] the states of things, in such a way that non-pre-existent concepts can be extracted from them.” (D vii) This constructivism, for Deleuze, holds weight in all areas of research, as he demonstrates in his studies of literature, cinema and art (see (6) below).

Constructivism, moreover, does not proceed along any predetermined lines. There is nothing that is necessary to create, for Deleuze: thought does not have a pre-given orientation (see (4)(b) below). Empiricist thought is thus always in some sense strategic (LS 17).

The concept of excess takes the place in Deleuze’s thought of the transcendent. Instead of an object, a table for example, being determined and given its essence by a transcendental concept or Idea (Plato) which is directly applicable to it, or the application of a transcendental category or schema (Kant), everything that exists is exceeded by the forces which constitute it. The table does not have a for-itself, but has existence within a field or territory, which are beyond its meaning or control. Thus a table exists in a kitchen, which is part of a three-bedroom family home, which is part of a capitalist society. In addition, the table is used to eat on, linking itself with the human body, and another produced, consumable item, a hamburger. For Deleuze, one can always analyse interminably in any direction these relations of force, which always move beyond the horizon of the object in question.

For Deleuze, however, nothing is exceeded more than subjectivity. This is not a statement of ontological priority, but bears on the extreme privilege the conscious-to-self subject has had in the history of Western thought, it is certainly here that Deleuze makes his most significant use of the concept of excess. Consider, for example: “Subjectivity is determined as an effect.” (ES 26). “There are no fewer things in the mind that exceed our consciousness than there are things in the body that exceed our knowledge.” (SPP 18)

The point is that human forces aren’t on their own enough to establish a dominant form in which man can install himself. Human forces (having an understanding, a will, an imagination and so on) have to combine with other forces: an overall form arises from this combination, but everything depends on the nature of other forces with which the human forces become linked. (N 117; cf. especially DR 254; 257-61)

While Deleuze protests that he never made a big deal out of rejecting traditional postulates like the subject (N 88), he frequently writes about the notion of the exceeded subject, from his first book on Hume and throughout his work. This in some sense locates him in the landscape of what is known as postmodern thought, along with other figures such as Jacques Derrida, Jean-Francois Lyotard and Michel Foucault.

4. Difference And Repetition

Difference and Repetition (1968) is without doubt Deleuze’s most significant book in a traditional academic style, and proposes the most central of his disruptions to the canonical traditions of philosophy. However, precisely for this reason, it is also one of his most difficult books, dealing as it does with two age-old, overdetermined philosophical topics, identity and time, and with the nature of thought itself.

a. Difference-in-itself

Deleuze’s main aim in Difference and Repetition is a creative elaboration of these two concepts, but it essentially precedes by way of a critique of Western philosophy. His central thesis is,

That identity not be first, that it exist as a principle but as a second principle, as a principle become; that it revolve around the Different: such would be the nature of a Copernican revolution which opens up the possibility of difference having its own concept, rather than being maintained under the domination of a concept in general already understood as identical. (DR 41)

From Plato (DR 59-63) to Heidegger (DR 64-6), Deleuze argues, difference has not been accepted on its own, but only after being understood with reference to self-identical objects, which makes difference a difference between. He attempts in this book to reverse this situation, and to understand difference-in-itself.

We can understand Deleuze’s argument by way of reference to his analysis of Plato’s three-tiered system of idea, copy and simulacrum (cf. LS 253-65). In order to define something such as courage, we can have reference in the end only to the Idea of Courage, an identical-to-itself, this idea containing nothing else (DR 127). Courageous acts and people can be thus judged by analogy with this Idea. There are also, however, those who only imitate courageous acts, people who use courage as a front for personal gain, for example. These acts are not copies of the courageous ideal, but rather fakes, distortions of the idea. They are not related to the Idea by way of analogy, but by changing the idea itself, making it slip. Plato frequently makes arguments based on this system, Deleuze tells us, from the Statesman (God-shepherd, King-shepherd, charlatan) to the Sophist (wisdom, philosopher, sophist) (DR 60-1; 126-8).

The philosophical tradition, beginning with Plato (although Deleuze detects some ambiguity here (eg. DR 59; TP 361)) and Aristotle, has sided with the model and the copy, and resolutely fought to exclude the simulacra from consideration, either by rejecting it as an external error (Descartes (DR 148)), or by assimilating it into a higher form, via the operation of a dialectic (Hegel (DR 263)).

While difference is subordinated to the model/copy scheme, it can only be a consideration between elements, which gives to difference a wholly negative determination, as a not-this. However, Deleuze suggests, if we turn our attention to the simulacra, the reign of the identical and of analogy is destabilised. The simulacra exists in and of itself, without grounding in or reference to a model: its existence is “unmediated” (DR 29), it is itself unmediated difference. It is for this reason that Deleuze makes his well-known claim that a true philosophy of difference must be “inverted-” or “anti-Platonism” (DR 127-8): the being of simulacra is the being of difference itself; each simulacra is its own model.

We might well ask here: what provides the unity of the different? How can we talk about the being of something that is difference itself? Deleuze’s answer is that precisely there is no intrinsic ontological unity. He takes up here Nietzsche’s idea that being is becoming: there is an internal self-differing within the different itself, the different differs from itself in each case. Everything that exists only becomes and never is.

Unity, Deleuze tells us, must be understood as a secondary operation (DR 41) under which difference is pressed into forms. The prominent philosophical notion he offers for such unity is time (see (4)(c) below), but later, in Anti-Oedipus, Deleuze and Guattari offer a political ontology that shows how this process of becoming is fixed into unitary formulations.

b. Contra-Hegel

Deleuze’s arch-enemy in Difference and Repetition is Hegel. While this critical stance is already clearly evident in Nietzsche and Philosophy and from there throughout his work, Deleuze’s revaluation of difference itself takes as its most essential form the rejection of the Hegelian dialectic, which represents the most extreme development of the logic of the identical.

The dialectic, Deleuze tells us, seems to operate with extreme differences alone, even so far as acknowledging them as the motor of history. Formed of two opposite terms, such as being and non-being, the dialectic operates by synthesising them into a new third term that preserves and overcomes the earlier opposition. Deleuze argues that this is a dead end which makes,

identity the sufficient condition for difference to exist and be thought. It is only in relation to the identical, as a function of the identical, that contradiction is the greatest difference. The intoxication and giddiness are feigned, the obscure is already clarified from the outset. Nothing shows this more than the insipid monocentrality of the circles in the Hegelian dialectic. (DR 263)

While offering a philosophical tool that sees difference at the heart of being, the process of the dialectic removes this affirmation as its most essential step.

The further consequence of this for Deleuze relates to the place of negation in Hegel’s system. The dialectic, in its general movement, takes specific differences, differences-in-themselves, and negates their individual being, on the way to a “superior” unity. Deleuze argues in Difference and Repetition that this step of Hegel’s mistakes ontology, history and ethics.

“Beneath the platitude of the negative lies the world of ‘disparateness'” (DR 267). There is no resolution of the differences-in-themselves into a higher unity that does not fundamentally misunderstand difference. Here Deleuze is clearly recalling his Spinozist and Nietzschean ontology of a single substance that is expressed in a multiplicity of ways (cf. DR 35-42; 269): In a famous sentence, he writes: “A single voice raises the clamour of being.” (DR 35)

Hegel is famous for asserting that the negating dialectic is the motor of history, proceeding towards the often-caricatured end of history and the realisation of absolute spirit. For Deleuze, history does not have a teleological element, a direction of realisation; this is only an illusion of consciousness (cf. SPP 17-22):

History progresses not by negation and the negation of negation, but by deciding problems and affirming differences. It is no less bloody and cruel as a result. Only the shadows of history live by negation . . . (DR 268)

Finally, regarding ethics, Deleuze argues that an ontology based on the negative makes of ethical affirmation a secondary, derived possibility: “The false genesis of affirmation . . .: if the truth be told, none of this would amount to much if it was not for the moral presuppositions and practical implications of such a distortion.” (DR 268)

c. Repetition and Time

For Deleuze, the central stake in the consideration of repetition is time. As with difference, repetition has been subjected to the law of the identical, but also to a prior model of time: to repeat a sentence means, traditionally, to say the same thing twice, at different moments. These different moments must be themselves equal and unbiased, as if time were a flat, featureless expanse. So repetition has essentially been considered as the traditional idea of difference over time understood in a common-sense way, as a succession of moments. Deleuze asks if, given a renovated understanding of difference as in-itself, we are able to reconsider repetition also. But there is also an imperative here, since, if we are to consider difference-in-itself over time, based in the traditional logic of repetition, we once again reach the point of identity. As such, Deleuze’s critique of identity must revaluate the question of time.

Deleuze’s argument proceeds through three models of time, and relates the concept of repetition to each of them.

The first is time as a circle. Circular time is mythical and seasonal time, the repetition of the same after time has passed through its cardinal points. These points may be simple natural repetitions, like the sun rising daily, the movement of summer to spring, or the elements of tragedy, which Deleuze suggests operate cyclically. There is a sense of both destiny and theology in the concept of time as a circle, as a succession of instants which are governed by an external law.

When time is considered in this fashion, Deleuze argues (DR 70-9), repetition is solely concerned with habit. The subject experiences the passing of moments cyclically (the sun will come up every morning), and contracts habits which make sense of time as a continually living present. Habit is thus the passive synthesis of moments that creates a subject.

The second model of time is linked by Deleuze to Kant (KCP vii-viii), and it constitutes one of the central ruptures that the Kantian philosophy creates in thought, for Deleuze: this is time as a straight line. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant liberates time from the circular model by proposing it as a form that is imposed upon sensory experience. For Deleuze, this reverses the earlier situation by placing events into time (as a line), rather than seeing the chain of events constituting time by the passing of present moments.

Habit can thus no longer have any power, since in this model of time, nothing returns. In order for sense to be made of what has occurred, there must be an active process of synthesis, which makes of the past instances a meaning (DR 81). Deleuze calls this second synthesis memory. Unlike habit, memory does not relate to a present, but to a past which has never been present, since it synthesises from passing moments a form in-itself of things which never existed before the operation. The novels of Marcel Proust are for Deleuze the most profound development of memory as the pure past, or in Proust’s terminology, as time regained. (DR 122; PS passim)

In this second model of time, repetition thus has an active sense in line with the synthesis, since it repeats something, in the memory, that did not exist before – this does not save it, however, from being an operation of identity, nonetheless. These two moments, the active constitution of a pure past, and the disparate experience of a present yet to be synthesised produces a further consequence for Deleuze: as in Kant, a radical splitting of the subject into two elements, the I of memory, which is only a process of synthesis, and a self of experience, an ego which undergoes experience. (DR 85-7; KCP viii-ix)

Deleuze insists that both of these models of time press repetition into the service of the identical, and make it a secondary process with regards to time. The final model of time that Deleuze proposes attempts to make repetition itself the form of time.

In order to do this, Deleuze relates the concepts of difference and repetition to each other. If difference is the essence of that which exists, constituting beings as disparates, then neither of the first two models of time does justice to them, insisting as they do on the possibility and even necessity of synthesising differences into identities. It is only when beings are repeated as something other that their disparateness is revealed. Consequently, repetition cannot be understood as a repetition of the same, and becomes liberated from subjugation under the demands of traditional philosophy.

To give body to the conception of repetition as the pure form of time, Deleuze turns to the Nietzschean concept of the eternal return. This difficult concept is always given a forceful and careful qualification by Deleuze whenever he writes about it (eg. DR 6;41; 242; PI 88-9; NP 94-100): that it must not be considered as the movement of a cycle, as the return of the identical. As a form of time, the eternal return is not the circle of habit, even on the cosmic level. This would only allow the return of something that already existed, of the same, and would result again in the suppression of difference through an inadequate concept of repetition.

While habit returned the same in each instance, and memory dealt with the creation of identity in order to allow experience to be remembered, the eternal return is, for Deleuze, only the repetition of that which differs-from-itself, or, in Nietzsche’s terminology, only the repetition of those beings whose being is becoming: “The subject of the eternal return is not the same but the different, not the similar but the dissimilar, not the one but the many . . .” (DR 126)

As such, Deleuze tells us, repetition as the third meaning of time takes the form of the eternal return. Everything that exists as a unity will not return, only that which differs-from-itself. “Difference inhabits repetition.” (DR 76). So, while habit was the time of the present, and memory the being of the past, repetition as the eternal return is the time of the future.

The superiority of this third understanding of repetition as time has two main impetuses in Deleuze’s argument. The first is obviously that it keeps difference intact in its movement of differing-from-itself. The second is as significant, if for different reasons. If only what differs returns, then the eternal return operates selectively (DR 126; PI 88-9), and this selection is an affirmation of difference, rather than an activity of representation and unification based on the negative, as in Hegel.

d. The Image of Thought

Chapter three of Difference and Repetition provides a novel approach to an important question in philosophy, the problem of presuppositions. Deleuze pursues this topic again later in A Thousand Plateaus (374-80), and when he writes about conceptual personae in What is Philosophy? (ch. 3); he had already written on images of thought in Nietzsche and Philosophy (103-10) and Proust and Signs (94-102).

An example is Descartes’ celebrated phrase at the beginning of the Discourse on the Method:

Good sense is the most evenly shared thing in the world . . the capacity to judge correctly and to distinguish the true from the false, which is properly what one calls common sense or reason, is naturally equal in all men . .

For Descartes, thought has a natural orientation towards truth, just as for Plato, the intellect is naturally drawn towards reason and recollects the true nature of that which exists. This, for Deleuze, is an image of thought.

Although images of thought take the common form of an ‘Everybody knows . . .’ (DR 130), they are not essentially conscious. Rather, they operate on the level of the social and the unconscious, and function, “all the more effectively in silence.” (DR 167)

Deleuze undertakes a thorough analysis of the traditional philosophical image of thought, and lists eight features which, in all aspects of philosophical pursuit, imply a subordination of thought to externally imposed directives. He includes the good nature of thought, the priority of the model or recognition as the means of thought, the sovereignty of representation over supposed elements in nature and thought, and the subordination of culture to method (or learning to knowledge). These all imply an a priori nature of thought, a telos, a meaning and a logic of practice. These features,

crush thought under an image which is that of the Same and the Similar in representation, but profoundly betrays what it means to think and alienates the two powers of difference and repetition, of philosophical commencement and recommencement. (DR167)

It is this element, in Difference and Repetition, that founds Deleuze’s most serious criticism of the traditional image of thought: that it fails to come to terms with the true nature of difference and repetition. As a result, it is fair to say that this moment of the book is essential for understanding the way in which Deleuze both wants to base his assessment of traditional philosophies of identity and time, and how he wishes to exceed them: his reformulation of difference and repetition is made possible by this critique (cf. N 149).

The other critical angle Deleuze supplies here is related to the first, and derives from Nietzsche’s critique of Western thought:

When Nietzsche questions the most general presuppositions of philosophy, he says that these are essentially moral, since Morality alone is capable of convincing us that thought has a good nature and the thinker a good will, and that only the good can ground the supposed affinity between thought and the True. (DR132; cf. LS 3)

As we saw above regarding Hegel, the real point of concern is that this image of thought is in the service of practical, political and moral forces, it is not simply a matter of philosophy, in segregation from the rest of the world.

To the question ‘why do we have this image of thought?’ Deleuze, along with Nietzsche, that it is a moral image, and is in the service of power, but there is also a more intrinsic problem with thinking itself, that is only fully developed in the Conclusion to What is Philosophy?, and this is that thought itself is dangerous.

In contradistinction to the natural goodness of thought in the traditional image, Deleuze argues for thought as an encounter: “Something in the world forces us to think.” (DR 139) These encounters confront us with the impotence of thought itself (DR 147), and evoke the need of thought to create in order to cope with the violence and force of these encounters. The traditional image of thought has developed, just as Nietzsche argues about the development of morality in The Genealogy of Morals, as a reaction to the threat that these encounters offer. We can consider the traditional image of thought, then, precisely as a symptom of the repression of this violence.

As a result, the relationship of philosophy to thought must have two correlative aspects, Deleuze argues:

an attack on the traditional moral image of thought, but also a movement towards understanding thought as self-engendering, an act of creation, not just of what is thought, but of thought itself, within thought (DR 147).

This is true, dangerous thought, but the sole thought capable of approaching difference-in-itself and complex repetition: thought without an image. .

The thought which is born in thought, the act of thinking which is neither given by innateness nor presupposed by reminiscence but engendered in its genitality, is a thought without image. But what is such a thought, and how does it operate in the world? (DR 167; cf. 132)

This final question directs us towards the central aim of the two texts of Capitalism and Schizophrenia.

5. Capitalism And Schizophrenia – Deleuze And Guattari

The collaborative texts of Deleuze and Felix Guattari, particularly the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia, are outside of the scope of the current article (see the Deleuze and Guattari entry in this encyclopaedia, forthcoming). However, two brief points are important to note.

First, that despite the wide notoriety of these works as obscurantist and non-philosophical, they bear a profound relation to Deleuze’s philosophical enterprise in general, and develop in new ways many of his concerns: a commitment to an immanent ontology, the importance of the social and the political to the very heart of being, and the affirmation of difference over the transcendental hierarchy in every aspect of this work.

Secondly, the manner in which these texts are written by the two writers, between the two and not seperately, means that many new elements emerge that cannot be drawn from their work individually. As such, regarding Deleuze, many of the central ideas cited above do undergo an interesting and novel transformation into a new direction: the very type of relationship characterised in Capitalism and Schizophrenia as a becoming.

6. Literature, Cinema, Painting

Deleuze’s work on the arts, he never ceases to remind the reader, are not to be understood as literary criticism, film or art theory. Talking of the 1980’s, during which he wrote almost exclusively on the arts, he states the following:

let’s suppose that there’s a third period when I worked on painting and cinema: images on the face of it. But I was writing philosophy. (N 137)

This accords with the aims of Deleuze’s empiricism (see (3) above), to understand philosophy as an encounter (with a work, philosophical or artistic, an object, a person) out of which “non-pre-existent concepts,” (DR vii) can be created. Regarding his books on cinema, he is even more explicit:

Film criticism faces twin dangers: it shouldn’t just describe films but nor should it apply to them concepts taken from outside film. The job of criticism is to form concepts that aren’t of course ‘given’ in films but nonetheless relate specifically to cinema, and to some specific genre of film, to some specific film or other. Concepts specific to cinema, but which can only be formed philosophically. (N 58; C2 280)

All of Deleuze’s work on artists can be assembled under the rubric of the creation of new philosophical concepts that relate specifically to the work at hand, yet which also link these works with others more generally. Not a philosophy of the arts per se, but a philosophical encounter with specific artistic works and forms.

One feature that the artistic works also contain, distinct from many of Deleuze’s other books, is a concern with a taxonomy of signs. In Proust and Signs, Francis Bacon, and the Cinema books, Deleuze attempts to develop a systematic approach of classifying different signs. These signs are not linguistic (C1 ix), since they are not themselves elements of a system, but rather are types of emissions from a work. Proust, for example, on Deleuze’s account, understands experience itself as a reception of signs by a proto-subject which must be understood properly, just as the large variety of images discussed in Cinema 1 and 2 are categorised by Deleuze on the basis of C.S. Peirce’s semiotics.

Deleuze often comes to consider the questions ‘what is the nature of the artist, and of art?’ Aside from his specific elaborations of these questions in What is Philosophy?, he is concerned to emphasise the radically active creative nature of art and artists in his work in general. This characterisation goes far beyond the general consideration of artists as ‘creative people’, and highlights the manner in which art is itself a creation of movement, not of representations: that is, something radically new, an affect, a movement of force or desire (cf. PS xi.,187 n1).

While the dominant Western tradition, from Plato to Heidegger, places art in a relationship to truth, Deleuze insists in every case on a Nietzschean argument (NP 102-3), that the work of art only has relations with forces, and that truth is a derivative, secondary formation: art is active.

In another register, Deleuze suggests that artists are themselves created, within thought, and must be cultured and afflicted by forces which exceed them to develop to the point of creativity (NP 103-9; cf. (4)(d) above). These forces, in turn, account for the frequent frailty of artists and thinkers. While the work of art sets to work forces of life, the artist themselves has experienced “too much”, and this wearies and sickens them (D 18; C2 189).

Deleuze’s insistences that the artist is above all someone who creates new ways of being and perceiving increases in frequency and strength throughout the course of his texts on art and artists.

a. Literature

Deleuze wrote extensively on literature throughout his career. Aside from dedicating whole works to Proust (Proust and Signs 1964), Leopold von Sacher-Masoch (“Coldness and Cruelty”1969), and Kafka (Kafka: Towards a Minor Literature 1975), and a large portion of The Logic of Sense to Lewis Carroll, he also dealt in some detail with a wide range of figures such as F. Scott Fizgerald, Herman Melville, Samuel Beckett, Antonin Artaud, Heinrich von Kleist, and Fyodor Dostoyevsky.

i. Marcel Proust

It is quite easy, if one wishes to attach a philosophical point of view to Marcel Proust’s work, to see it as a phenomenology of memory and perception, in which his famous text In Search of Lost Time would be oriented towards an understanding of what underlies and gives substance to experience and memory.

In essence, Deleuze proposes the opposite of the phenomenological method. He reads Proust’s work as an anti-logos, that supposes, rather than a transcendental ego which is the necessary feature of all experience, a passive, receptive subject at the mercy of the signs and symptoms of the world.

For what does in fact take place in In Search of Lost Time, one and the same story with infinite variations? It is clear that the narrator sees nothing, hears nothing . . like a spider poised in its web, observing nothing, but responding to the slightest sign . . . (AO 68)

Rather than memory, the central question of the Search, being based within the subject, and as the product of certain transcendental operations, it is a creation of something which did not exist before by way of an original, each-time unique, style of interpretation for experiences (PS 101). Deleuze uses the term ‘anti-logos’ on the grounds that Proust, as he argues, refuses the representational model of experience central to Western philosophy:

Everywhere Proust contrasts the world of signs and symptoms with the world of attributes, the world of hieroglyphs and ideograms with the world of analytic expression, phonetic writing, and rational thought. What is constantly impugned are the great themes inherited from the Greeks: philos, sophia, dialogue, logos, phone. (PS 108)

In contrast, Deleuze characterises the Search as a recasting of thought: thought is creative and not reminiscent (Platonic and phenomenological).

ii. Leopold von Sacher-masoch

Masoch features in a few of Deleuze’s books (K 66-7; D 119-23), but most significantly in his long study “Coldness and Cruelty”. This early text is a critique of the unity of the clinical and aesthetic notion “sado-masochism”.

Deleuze argues here that this clinical concept fails to account for the actual writings of the Maquis de Sade and Sacher-masoch, along with making an unjustified unity from a two quite distinct groups of symptoms.

Masoch is considered by Deleuze to be an important writer of unusual power, and a master of suspense, the key literary element of masochism. However, while de Sade has become well-known, and his writings analysed, Deleuze suggests that our poor understanding of Masoch’s texts is one of the main culprits in making the confused unity that is sadomasochism. In fact, according to Deleuze, he offers us a new way of understanding existence by displacing sexuality into the world of power (M 12). Thus, Deleuze tells us, Masoch was in fact, “a great anthropologist.” (M 16)

Point by point, Deleuze develops a reading of the two writers, Masoch in particular, that shows their profound disparity. Alongside this is an analysis of the psychiatric categories of sadism and masochism that reveals the same lack of common ground.

Sadomasochism is one of these misbegotten names, a semiological howler. We found in every case that what appeared to be a common ‘sign’ linking the two perversions together turned out on investigation to be in the nature of a mere syndrome which could be further broken down into irreducibly specific symptoms of the one or the other perversion. (M 134)

In “Coldness and Cruelty”, Deleuze also elaborates a critique of Freud that points in the direction of Anti-Oedipus, although clearly more limited in scope.

iii. Franz Kafka

Kafka: towards a minor literature can be distinguished from Deleuze’s other texts on literature in that it was written with Guattari, and it strongly bears the stamp of Anti-Oedipus, published just three years earlier, and the concepts utilised there. In many ways, it can be read as a development of the same themes in regard to Kafka’s work.

This text is a marked departure from all of the dominant interpretations of Kafka’s writing, which is generally considered either psychoanalytically (as a projection of interior guilt onto the world through writing) or mythically, that is, as a reserve of symbols and closely related to negative theology and Jewish mysticism. Deleuze and Guattari consider Kafka as a proponent of a joyful science, of writing as a way of creating a line of flight or freedom from the forms of domination. They write:

The three worst themes in many interpretations of Kafka are the transcendence of the law, the interiority of guilt, the subjectivity of enunciation. (K 45)

In contrast, Deleuze and Guattari read Kafka as a proponent of the immanence of desire. The law is no more than a secondary configuration that traps desire into certain formations: bureaucracy, of course, is the main example in Kafka’s work, where offices, secretaries, lawyers and bankers present figures of entrapment.

They also see Kafka as directly targeting the Oedipus complex, the triangle of “daddy-mommy-me”:

the too-well formed family triangle is really only a conduit for investments of an entirely different sort that the child endlessly discovers underneath his father, inside his mother, in himself. The judges, commissioners, bureaucrats, and so on, are not substitutes for the father; rather, it is the father who is a condensation of all these forces that he submits to and that he tries to get his son to submit to. (K 11-2)

Thus, for Kafka, according to Deleuze and Guattari, the family are a socially derived unit that works by trapping the flow of desire. The interiority of guilt is replaced by the exteriority of subjugation. This is best demonstrated in the analysis of Kafka’s famous short story, The Metamorphosis (K 14-5).

They also wish to read Kafka, not as a writer of genius, who expresses the superior insight of his inner sight, but as a writer of minor literature. This is the key concept of Deleuze and Guattari’s reading of Kafka. Minor literature is a writing that takes a dominant language (German, in Kafka’s case, French in Beckett’s, and so forth), and pushes it until it becomes a language of force, and not of signification (K 19). In turn, this connects immediately with the situation of minorities, minority groups in the first instance, but also the attempts that everyone makes to create a line of flight outside of majoritarian or molar social formations.

As such, minor literature is an immediately political writing (K 17), which connects the text immediately to (micro-) political struggle. Thus the third substitution is the collective, that is, political, nature of enunciation, for the traditional model of the subjective intent behind the author’s words. Kafka, for Deleuze and Guattari, writes as a node in a field of forces, rather than a Cartesian cogito, sovereign in the castle of consciousness. “The superiority of Anglo-american literature”

One clear feature of Deleuze’s relationship to literature is his outspoken appreciation for what he calls Anglo-American literature, and its superiority over the literature of Europe.

What we find in great English and American novelists is a gift, rare among the French, for intensities, flows, machine-books, tool-books, schizo-books. (N 23)

The great European tradition in literature is analogous for Deleuze to traditional philosophy: it always revolves around a relationship to truth, the preservation of some kind of social status quo, the sovereignty of the author over the text; as Deleuze states, “everybody says “cogito” in the French novel.”

The strength of Anglo-american literature for Deleuze is rather that it rejects the idea of the book as a representation of reality, and all of the adjacent problems with the dogmatic image of literature, and presents the book as a machine, as something which does things, rather than signifying.

b. Cinema

Part of the reason for the impact of Deleuze’s writings on cinema is simply that he is the first important philosopher to have devoted such detailed attention to it. Of course, many philosophers have written about movies, but Deleuze offers an analysis of the cinema itself as an artistic form, and develops a number of connections between it and other philosophical work.

Deleuze’s first book is entitled Cinema 1: The Movement-Image. It deals with cinema from its development through to the second World War. For Deleuze, the cinema as an art form is quite unique, and deals with its subject matter in ways that no other form of art is capable of, particularly as a way of relating to the experience of space and time.

Deleuze’s analysis begins by coming to new understandings of the concepts of the image and movement. The image, above all, is not a representation of something, that is, a linguistic sign. This definition relies upon the age-old Platonic distinction between form and matter, in its modern Saussurean form of signifier-signified. Rather, Deleuze wants to collapse these two orders into one, and the image thus becomes expressive and affective: not an image of a body, but the body as image (C1 58).

This collapse comes about with reference to two philosophers, Henri Bergson and Charles Sanders Peirce. Deleuze dedicated a book-length study to the former entitled Bergsonism (1968), and his use of his notions of movement and time in the Cinema texts is already presaged by this text. Movement for Bergson, Deleuze argues, is not separable from the object which moves: they are literally the same thing. Thus, no representative relationship can be established without artificially halting the flow of movement and thus misconstruing the frozen ‘element’ as self-sufficient. There is only the flow of movement which expresses itself in different ways. Among other things, this is one of Deleuze’s critiques of phenomenology (C1 56, 60). Thus the early cinema is characterised for Deleuze by the reign of what he calls the sensory-motor schema. This schema is the unity of the viewed and the eye that views in dynamic movement.

This model of the movement-image is precisely the nature of cinema, for Deleuze. It does not falsify movement by extracting segments and stringing them together in a representative fashion, but creates a wide range of expressive images. It is in order to come to terms with the varieties of movement-images that Deleuze turns to Peirce, who developed, “the most extraordinary classifications of images and signs . . .” (C2 30). The main part of Cinema 1 is thus devoted to using, with some alterations, Peirce’s semiotic classifications to describe the use of movement-images in cinema, and their centrality before the second World War.

The movement from the first text to Cinema 2: The Time-Image has a significance closely related to Kant’s so-called Copernican revolution in philosophy. Up until Kant, time was subject to the events that took place within it, time was a time of seasons and habitual repetition (see (3)(c) above); it was not able to be considered on its own, but as a measure of movement (C2 34-5; KCP iv.). One element of Kant’s achievement for Deleuze, as we have seen, is his reversal of the time-movement relationship: he establishes time itself as an element to which movement must be subordinated, a pure time.

In the cinema, Deleuze argues, a similar reversal takes place. The historico-cultural reason behind this reversal is the event of World War two itself. With the great truths of Western culture put so deeply in question by the before unimaginable methods employed and their forthcoming results, the sensory-motor apparatus of the movement-image are made to tremble before the unbearable, the too-much of life’s possibilities, the potential of the present (C2 35). No longer could the dogmatic truths that had guided society, and cinema to an extent, allow the apparently ‘natural’ movement from one thing to the next in an habitual fashion: ‘natural’ links precisely lost their efficacy. And with the use of unnatural or false links, which do not follow the sequence or narrative affect of the movement-image, time itself, the time-image, is manifested in cinema (Deleuze considers Orson Welles to be the first auteur to make use of the time-image (C2 137)). Rather than finding time as an, “indirect representation,” (C2 35-6), the viewer experiences the movement of time itself, which images, scenes, plots and characters presuppose or manifest in order to gain any sort of movement whatsoever.

Along with this ‘external’ reason, there is also for Deleuze a motivation within cinema itself to go from the movement-image to the time-image. The movement image has the tendency, thanks to the habitual experience of movement as normal and centered, to justify itself in relation to truth: as Deleuze argues with regard to the dogmatic image of thought (see (3)(d) above), there is the presupposition that thought naturally moves towards truth. Of course, Deleuze suggests, cinema, when truly creative, never relied upon this presupposition, and yet, “the movement-image, in its very essence, is answerable to the effect of truth which it invokes while movement preserves its centres.” (C2 142). In questioning its own presuppositions, Deleuze argues, cinema moved towards a new, different, way of understanding movement itself, as subordinate to time.

This in turn leads Deleuze to abandon Peirce’s semiotics to a large degree, since it has no room for the time-image (C2 33-4ff.), and replaces him with Nietzsche. As we have seen in our consideration of time in Difference and Repetition (see (3)(c) above), Nietzsche is the philosopher who Deleuze considers to have made the crucial move with regard to time, surpassing even Kant.

One of the central consequences for cinema that this move from movement-image to time-image makes again highlights one of Deleuze’s central concerns, to establish an ontology and a semiology of force: “What remains? There remain bodies, which are forces, nothing but forces.” (C2 139) Since the cinema of the time-image is concerned to liberate images from carrying or implying time in order to form narrative (no less than liberating time itself from narrative), images are themselves free now to express forces, “shocks of force,” (C2 139). Scenes, movements and language become expressive rather than representative.

c. Painting

Deleuze’s central work in the visual arts is his monograph Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation (the logic of sensation), but he also engages with a large number of other figures in various texts (eg. TP 492-500; WP ch.7), such as Turner (AO 132), Van Gogh, Klee, Kandinsky and Cezanne.

Deleuze’s book on Francis Bacon, as the title suggests, is an attempt to construct a logic of sensations from the artist’s work (FB 7). This task is largely a taxonomic one. Deleuze develops, throughout the book, a number of key categorial notions and new concepts that allow him to move away from the standard representational view of painting, towards a painting of force, that presents force and creates affects (sensations) rather than representing or describing a scene. Three central ideas are at work.

The first is an elaboration of the concept of Figure. For Deleuze, while the idea of figuration in painting has largely been representational, he sees Bacon, and to some extent Cezanne before him (FB 40, 76), collapsing the Figure into the world of forces, placing it in a new relation to force. Thus Bacon’s cries, for which he is famous, place the figure in the presence of force: “. . . painting will place the visible cry, the mouth which cries, into a relation with force.” (FB 41). For Deleuze the cry expresses an extreme moment of life, rather than suffering or horror. As with Kafka, Deleuze takes Bacon’s artistic work, is commonly considered very dark and nihilistic, and considers it as a true sign of life, and of struggle with death.

The second, a refrain familiar from all of his work, relates to a notion of force that makes it ontologically and artistically fundamental rather than politically oppressive, much as desire is reconfigured in Capitalism and Schizophrenia. It is in fact this move that allows Deleuze’s general ‘positivism’ towards Bacon, as we have just seen: “Everything . . . is in relation with forces, everything is force.” (FB 40) In Francis Bacon, Deleuze thus creates the notion of ‘color-force’, in order to understand how color can be expressive of force rather than representative (FB 94-7).

Finally, Deleuze draws on the difference between Western, representational models of vision, and the haptic style of Egyptian art, in which he sees a development of a mode of writing/drawing which resists being hypostased into the content/form duality common to philosophical understandings of art.

7. What Is Philosophy?

We have already seen the significance of empiricism for Deleuze’s philosophy ((3) above). Throughout his work, however, Deleuze gives a number of further formulations concerning the aim and nature of philosophy. These can be understood in two phases, an early critical naturalism and a later vitalist constructivism.

a. Early reflections – Naturalism

In his early works in the history of philosophy, culminating with The Logic of Sense, Deleuze expresses an essentially critical model of philosophy. In his book on Nietzsche, he writes:

When someone asks ‘what’s the use of philosophy?’ the reply must be aggressive, since the question tries to be ironic and caustic. Philosophy does not serve the State or the Church, who have other concerns. It serves no established power. The use of philosophy is to sadden. A philosophy which saddens no one, that annoys no one, is not a philosophy. It is useful for harming stupidity, for turning stupidity into something shameful. Its only use is the exposure of all forms of baseness of thought. . . . Philosophy is at its most positive as a critique, as an enterprise of demystification. (NP 106)

It seems that this is the sole moment in Deleuze’s published work where he uses the term ‘sadden’ in a positive manner, as something desirable, and this is an indication of the strength by which he considers philosophy, in this early sense, as an exercise in naturalism in the sense that Lucretius uses this term, that is, as an attack on all forms of mystification. Commenting on Lucretius, Deleuze makes the following, extremely similar, remark:

The speculative object and the practical object of philosophy as Naturalism, science and pleasure, coincide on this point: it is always a matter of denouncing the illusion, the false infinite, the infinity of religion and all of the theologico-erotic-oneiric myths in which it is expressed. To the question ‘what is the use of philosophy?’ the answer must be: what other object would have an interest in holding forth the image of a free man, and in denouncing all of the forces which need myth and troubled spirit in order to establish their power? (LS 278)

Deleuze’s philosophical naturalism is thus critical, Spinozist and Nietzschean: it sets as the aim of philosophy the attack of all that belittles life: the sad passions of Spinoza, the passive and reactive forces of Nietzsche, and mythology, in Lucretian terms. Naturalism must not here be understood as opposed to a cosmopolitanism, or constructivism, Deleuze tells us. Rather, “Naturalism . . . directs its attack against the prestige of the negative; it deprives the negative of all of its power; it refuses the spirit of the negative the right to speak in the name of philosophy.” (LS 279)

Mythology, in the sense of these texts, is the eternal danger for the operation of thought. Deleuze summarises this immanent threat within thought (cf. (4)(d) above) as the threat of stupidity:

Philosophy could have taken up the problem with its own means and with the necessary modesty, by considering the fact that stupidity is never that of others but the object of a properly transcendental question: how is stupidity […] possible? (DR 151)

b. “What is Philosophy?” – constructivism

From Difference and Repetition onwards, Deleuze, while maintaining this critical aspect for philosophy, develops a thorough-going constructivist view which manifests itself in the final collaboration between Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy? This text involves arguments about three central notions: the creation of concepts, the presuppositions of philosophy, and the relations between philosophy, science and art.

As we have seen, a certain doctrine of empiricist constructivism runs through Deleuze’s work from the beginning, and on a number of levels. In What is Philosophy? this becomes the central and explicit theme: “philosophy is the art of forming, inventing, and fabricating concepts”. (WP 2)

The philosopher’s only business is concepts, Deleuze and Guattari tell us, and the concept belongs only to philosophy (WP 34). This is already clear when we consider Deleuze’s writings on the arts, which he considers to be philosophical (see (6) above).

The fortunes of the concept, due to lack of attention by philosophers, have fallen, to the point at which even marketing has taken hold of it, in, “the general movement that replaced Critique with sales promotion.” (WP 10) However, Deleuze and Guattari insist, philosophy still only has meaning vis a vis the concept.

A concept is distinctly featured. It is a multiplicity, not in itself a single thing, but an assemblage of components which must retain coherence with the others for the concept to remain itself (in this sense, it closely resembles the Spinozist body). These components are singularities: “‘a’ possible world, ‘a’ face, ‘some’ words . . .” (WP 20), and yet become indiscernible when a part of a concept. Each concept also has a relationship to other concepts by way of the similar problems that they address, and by having similar component elements, and Deleuze and Guattari describe their relations by the use of the term vibration (WP 23).

Above all, however, the concept must not be confused with the proposition, as in logic (WP 135 ff.), which is to say that it is agrammatical. There is no necessary relation between concepts, nor is there any given way of relating. The logical functions of either/or, both/and and so forth, do not do justice to the each-time created nature of conceptual relations. Neither does the concept have a reference, in the way that a proposition does. Rather, it is intensive and expresses the virtual existence of an event in thought: consider Descartes’ famous cogito, which expresses the virtual individual in relation to themselves and the world.

Finally, a concept has no relationship to truth, which is an external determination, or presupposition, that places thought at the service of the dogmatic image of thought: “The concept is a form or a force” (WP 144). As such, concepts act, they are affective, rather than significatory, or expressive of the contents of ideas.

The question of presuppositions, already dealt with via the concept of the image of thought (see (4)(d) above), is examined in much greater depth by Deleuze and Guattari in What is Philosophy? Indeed, their answer involves two new concepts, the conceptual personae, and the plane of immanence.

Conceptual personae (WP ch. 3) are the figures of thought that give concepts their specific force, their raison d’être. They are to be confused with neither psycho-social types (WP 67), nor with the philosophers themselves (WP 64), but are like concepts created. Deleuze and Guattari argue that conceptual personae, while often only implicit in philosophy, are decisive for understanding the significance of concepts. To take again Descartes’ cogito, the implicit conceptual persona is the idiot, the regular person, uneducated, untrained in philosophy, potentially betrayed by their senses at every turn, and yet, able to have perfectly clear and distinct knowledge of themselves, through the certainty of the ‘I think, therefore I am’. Also mentioned are Nietzsche’s famous personae, both sympathetic and anti-pathetic: Zarathustra, the last man, Dionysus, the Crucified, Socrates, and so forth. (WP 64)

Conceptual personae are, for Deleuze and Guattari, internal, non-philosophical preconditions for the practice of creating concepts. These personae, in turn, are related to the plane of immanence. This concept has clear and significant resonances with other important elements of Deleuze’s thought, above all with his monist ontology of forces, and with his practical emphasis on Nietzsche and Spinoza’s ethics as non-transcendental.

The plane of immanence (WP ch. 2) in thought is opposed to the transcendent in traditional philosophy. Each time that a transcendent is raised (Descartes’ cogito, Plato’s ideas, Kant’s categories), thought is arrested, and philosophy is placed at the service of dominant ideas. For Deleuze and Guattari, all of these instances of the transcendental stem from the same problem: insisting that immanence be immanent to “something”. (WP 44-5)

For thought to exist, for concepts to be formed and then given body through conceptual personae, they must operate immanently, without the rule of a “Something” that organises or stratifies the plane of immanence. Concepts exist on the plane of immanence, and each philosopher, Deleuze and Guattari tell us, must create such a plane.

The other main concern of What is Philosophy? is to come to an understanding of the relations between philosophy, art and science respectively. Deleuze and Guattari argue that each discipline involves the activity of thought, and that in each case it is a matter of creation. What differs is the sphere of creation and the manner in which it is populated.

Art is concerned with the creation of percepts and affects (WP 164), which are together sensation. Percepts are not perceptions, in that they do not refer to a perceiver, and neither are affects the feelings or affections of someone. Just as we saw with concepts, affects and percepts are independent beings which exist outside of the experience of a thinker, and have no reference to a state of affairs. Deleuze and Guattari write: “The work of art is a being of sensation and nothing else: it exists in itself.” (WP 164) The correlate of the conceptual persona in art is the figure (which is investigated in great depth in Deleuze’s text on Bacon, see (6)(c) above), and for the plane of immanence, art is created on the plane of composition, which is likewise immanent only to itself, and populated with the pure forces of percepts and affects (WP 196).

The situation with science is similar. Science is the activity of thought that creates functions. These functions, in contrast to concepts, are propositional (WP 117), and form the fragments from which science is able to piece together a kind of makeshift language, one which however, does not have any prior relation to truth, any more than philosophy does. Functions have meaning in creating a referential point of view, for Deleuze and Guattari, that is, in creating a basis from which things can be measured. As such, the first great functions are those such as absolute zero Kelvin, the speed of light etc., in relation to which a plane of reference is assumed. The plane of reference, again immanent to the functions that populate it, gains consistency through the strength and effectiveness of its functions. Also presupposed by science, in What is Philosophy?, are partial observers, the scientific counterpart of conceptual personae and artistic figures.

The figure of the partial observer in science, as in philosophy, is frequently implicit, and exists to give direction to functions: we could consider Gallileo as an example, whose functions regarding cosmology relate to a plane of reference that gives a greater consistency to the functions that the previous planes, which often relied upon a religious transcendental structure that damaged and made scientific thinking difficult by imposing a moral image of thought. The partial observer in this case would be a figure that makes certain functions in particular take shape and gain force regarding a certain phenomena, such as the relation of the sun to the moon: the heliocentrist.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Main texts

Below is a list of Deleuze’s main works, in order of their original publication in French. Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation is currently the only major work without a complete English translation, although one is currently being completed, and should be expected shortly. Indicated in parentheses after the original publication date are the initials by which each text is referred to above. In addition to the following, another resources seem particularly useful to those not familiar with Deleuze: a long three-part interview conducted with Claire Parnet, L’Abécédaire de Gilles Deleuze. Parnet suggests a topic for each letter of the alphabet, and Deleuze’s answers, in most cases, are both substantial and revealing. The video set is available to purchase in French.

  • Empiricism and Subjectivity (1953 ES) trans. Constanine Boundas (1991: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Nietzsche and Philosophy (1962 NP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson (1983: Althone Press, London)
  • Kant’s Critical Philosophy (1963 KCP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam (1983: Althone Press, London)
  • Proust and Signs (1964 PS) trans. Richard Howard (2000: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • “Coldness and Cruelty” in Masochism (1967 M) trans. Charles Stivale (1989: Zone Books, New York)
  • Bergsonism (1968 B) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1988: Zone Books, New York)
  • Difference and Repetition (1968 DR) trans. Paul Patton (1994: Colombia University Press, New York)
  • Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza (1968 EPS) trans. Martin Joughin (1990: Zone Books, New York)
  • The Logic of Sense (1969 LS) trans. Mark Lester and Charles Stivale (1990: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Spinoza: Practical Philosophy (1970 SPP) trans. Robert Hurley (1988: City Light Books, San Francisco)
  • (with Guattari) Anti-Oedipus – Capitalism and Schizophrenia (1972 AO) trans. Robert Hurley, Mark Seem, and Helen Lane (1977: Viking Press, New York)
  • (with Guattari) Kafka: Towards a Minor Literature (1975 K) trans. Dana Polan (1986: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • (with Claire Parnet) Dialogues (1977 D) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1987: Althone Press, London)
  • (with Guattari) A Thousand Plateaus – Capitalism and Schizophrenia (1980 TP) trans. Brian Massumi (1987: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Francis Bacon: logique de la sensation (1981 FB: Éditions de la différence, Paris)
  • Cinema: The Movement Image (1983 C1) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbera Habberjam (1989: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • The Time Image (1985 C2) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Robert Galeta (1989: University of Minnesota Press, Minnesota)
  • Foucault (1986 F) trans. Sean Hand (1988: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque (1988 FLB) trans. Tom Conley (1993: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Negotiations (1990 N) trans. Martin Joughin (1995: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • (with Guattari) What is Philosophy? (1991 WP) trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell (1994: Columbia University Press, New York)
  • Essays Critical and Clinical (1993) trans. Smith and Greco (1997: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Pure Immanence: Essays on a life ed. John Rajchman trans. Anne Boymen (2001 PI: Zone Books, New York)

b. Secondary texts

A good text that deals systematically with the whole body of Deleuze’s work, that is also quite easy to read, is the Rajchman volume. Regarding Capitalism and Schizophrenia, there are a number of commentaries available; the Massumi text is perhaps the best known and most consistent, although the general level of all secondary texts in this area is very difficult. The Clamour of Being, by Alain Baidou is a controversial interpretation of Deleuze’s work, particularly his ontology, from the perspective of another important French philosopher who knew Deleuze. Michel Foucault’s 1977 article, “Theatricum Philosophicum,” is also a significant and well-known interpretation of Difference and Repetition and The Logic of Sense.

i. Books and Collections of Essays

  • Ansell-Pearson ed., Deleuze and Philosophy: the difference engineer (1997: Routledge, New York) – chapters 2-5, 6, 7 and 13 especially
  • Badiou, Alain Deleuze: the Clamour of Being trans. Louise Burchill (2000: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Boundas and Olkowski eds., Gilles Deleuze and the Theatre of Philosophy (1994: Routledge, New York)
  • Buchanan and Colebrook eds., Deleuze and Feminist Theory (2000: Edinburgh University Press, Edinburgh)
  • Hardt, Michael Gilles Deleuze: an apprenticeship in philosophy (1993: University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis)
  • Lecercle, J. Philosophy through the Looking-Glass: Language, Nonsense, Desire (1985: Hutchinson Press, London)
  • Marks, John Gilles Deleuze: Vitalism and Multiplicity (1998: Pluto Press, London)
  • Massumi, Brian A User’s Guide to Capitalism and Schizophrenia – deviations from Deleuze and Guattari (1992: MIT Press, Cambridge)
  • Patton, Paul Deleuze and the Political (2000: Routledge, New York)
  • Rajchman, John The Deleuze Connections (2000: MIT Press, Cambridge)

ii. Additional Uncollected Articles

  • Braidotti, Rosi “Embodiment, Sexual Difference, and the Nomadic Subject” in Hypatia vol 8, no. 1, pp. 1-13 (Winter 1993)
  • Derrida, Jacques “I’m going to have to wander all alone” in Brault and Nass eds., The Work of Mourning pp. 192-5 (2001: University of Chicago Press, Chicago)
  • Eribon, Didier “Sickness unto life – the life and works of Gilles Deleuze” Artforum, v34. no. 7 (March 1996)
  • Foucault, Michel “Theatrum Philosophicum” in Language, Counter-memory, Practice trans. Donald Bouchard and Sherry Simon pp 165-198 (1977: Cornell University Press, Ithaca)
  • Goulimari, Pelagia “A minoritarian feminism? Things to do with Deleuze and Guattari” Hypatia v14 i2 pp. 97-9 (Spring 1999)
  • Neil, David “The Uses of Anachronism: Deleuze’s History of the Subject” Philosophy Today 4: 42 Winter pp. 418-31 (1998)

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Ethics and Phenomenology

Phenomenology is, generally speaking, a discipline that examines questions of metaphysics and epistemology. Insofar as ethics is usually seen as a topic apart from metaphysics and epistemology, it is thus not typically addressed by philosophers in the phenomenological tradition. However, there are important areas of overlap between ethics, metaphysics and epistemology, which may be fruitful points of departure for exploring a phenomenologically-oriented notion of ethics. In particular, metaphysics and epistemology seek to consider the validity of, among other ideas, analysis and wonder. An exploration of analysis and wonder can reveal the importance of ethics in this context. Once we have seen what follows from this standpoint, further consideration of ethics in terms of engineering will show how this standpoint can inform upon the world of praxis.

Table of Contents

  1. Theoretical Concerns
    1. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis
    2. War
    3. Hospitals
    4. Ethics of Integration
    5. People
  2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World
    1. Overview
    2. Human Factors Engineering
    3. Phenomenology: Brentano
    4. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl
    5. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels
    6. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics
    7. Ethics as Homological
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Theory
    2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

1. Theoretical Concerns

a. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis

Ethics can be seen as the foundation of wonder and analytic thought. First, existentialists accept wonder and deemphasize analysis, though phenomenologists tend to be more open to wonder and analytic thinking. Logical positivists and linguistic analysts see wonder as reducible to logic. Existentialists and phenomenologists are comfortable with ethics associated with wonder and analysis. Positivists and analysts deny ethics as an irreducible field of study. Ethicists would look at wonder to see if people need drugs in order to achieve states of euphoria or peace. Additionally, ethicists would take the same view about computers and analytic method.

In both instances, the question of ethics enters concerning more than the validity of wonder and analysis in the traditional philosophical sense (Kazanjian, 80; Buber, p. 11). Traditionally, existentialists and phenomenologists see wonder as revealing what “is.” Analysis has almost no place in much of existentialism, and varying degrees of validity in phenomenology. Traditionally, linguistic analysts and logical positivists see nothing to be gained with wonder. Reality is language, and is to be analyzed, never something about which to wonder.

Ethics brings in a deeper issue in both instances. Even if wonder alone is valid, ought people use drugs to feel a sense of awe? Even if analysis alone can give access to reality, ought people simply resot to computers, the higher the speed the better, to understand what is?

Existential and phenomenological thinkers tell us that awe or wonder is the basis of analysis, or as pure wonder, may stand alone without cognition. Ethicists may argue that awe or wonder is a human trait and ought not require or involve drugs and surgical stimulation of the brain to induce a sense of wonder (Campbell, p. 163). Awe is basically the social, intersubjective reality of living in the world. Phenomenology calls the world the lived world instead of just the material, quantifiable world. This wonder is consciousness in the unaltered state. In this unaltered state, wonder is part of normal, lived, reality or existence.

Ethicists would say that linguistic analysis or logical positivism changes or distorts reality. Drugs and brain stimulation are not lived reality. They develop a state of artificial awe or wonder. If the unaltered mind uses logic alone to access reality, it may mean altering reality from what ought be to what artificially exists. If the person uses mind altering drugs to achieve awe or wonder, then the awe or wonder itself is altered, artificial, and unlived. We then see not the lived world, but the artificial world.

Phenomenology says we should not excarnate or take analysis out of the lived world. Phenomenological ethicists would say we should not excarnate wonder itself from the lived world. Thus, phenomenologists and existentialists would be medically, pharmaceutically, or biologically excarnating wonder or awe from the lived world, even if they refute positivism and analytics’ portrayal of awe or wonder as wrong and insist on wonder or awe as revealing reality. The ethical position becomes a sociological view (Bryant, p. 1).

Paul Ricoeur (p. 217) looks at Cartesian dualism and says that we must overcome its excarnating of objectivity from the body. Non-biochemically, Ricoeur is criticizing Cartesian dualism for ignoring the embodiment of the objective. He is insisting that objectification must be done within the context of the lived world. We analyze the lived world or reduce it to quantities within the general framework of awe or wonder. Ricoeur’s approach suggests that even logical positivism and linguistic analysis needs to look at the problem of excarnation. These movements are in the same category as Cartesian dualism when they consider analysis or reduction as without wonder, or devoid of the lived world.

The difference between logical positivism and analytic philosophy on the one hand, and Cartesian dualism on the other, rests with their views of reality. Dualism sees mind and body, or objectivity and subjectivity, as both real and valid. The problem is how to relate them. Positivism and analytic thinking argue that the lived world, subjectivity, wonder, awe, and so on do not exist as irreducible reality. They are totally reducible to the simples of fact.

Ricoeurian thinking contrasts with Cartesian dualism and with positivism and analytic philosophy by saying all three movements should see themselves as having wrongly excarnated object from the lived world. An ethics approach to wonder, however, goes deeper than Ricoeur. The ethicist would insist that we cannot justify wonder for the sake of wonder. We need to look at how we approach wonder or awe. Saying that the lived world and wonder are important is not sufficient. Arguing against positivist and analytic reductionism of wonder to facts is only partly correct. How we define the biochemical context of wonder is critical.

In ethics, we may wonder by being conscious and not taking drugs to alter the brain. People look around them, or they inquire, or meditate, and feel it crucial to feel a sense of wonder that beings “are.” We wonder by ourselves, without bio-physiological intervention. Indeed, we do not need to take an aspirin or other legal medication to feel as sense of relaxation, calm, or rest. Beyond this, ethics says we ought not feel it important or in any way justified to take any illegal drugs that might induce a “high.” The biochemical high or awe is indeed a biochemical reduction or analytic approach to wonder. This approach would assume that the state of wonder is primarily, perhaps exclusively, a chemical reaction within the brain, and has little to do with normal, non-biochemical experiences of the lived world. In other words, the biochemical approach to wonder suggests that we wonder not through existing, but primarily through changing the chemistry of the brain.

Ethics might call the biochemical approach to wonder as biochemical, pharmaceutical, or otherwise physiological positivism or analysis. Ironically and unfortunately, this becomes serious to the point where no real inquiry, not even traditional logical positivism and analytic thinking is possible. An ethicist might ask us to look at a piece of analytic literature or philosophy. We see symbols, diagrams, and virtually mathematical methods for attempting to determine resolutions to questions and problems. The analytic thinker, the positivist, would argue that they are coming near to solving issues, and that these solutions or clarifications reveal a reality devoid of wonder.

The ethics approach notes that these analytic and positivist thinkers are consciously engaging in intellectually work. They converse with each other, perhaps argumentatively with existentialists and phenomenologists, but always are participating in some kind of control over what they are doing. Their brains are functioning without medication or alteration. Now, the ethicists will point out, consider the biochemically activated phenomenologist or existentialist. In other words, we no longer just speaking of the positivist and analytic thinker inquiring without drugs. We are no longer speaking of positivists and analytic thinkers trying to totally reduce wonder to facts in terms of normal, not medicated activity. What the ethicist criticizes is the phenomenologist or existentialist who is defending wonder through druges. This person is criticizing positivism and analysis for trying to totally non-biochemically reduce wonder or awe to atomism. Yet, the phenomenologist and existentialist is defending irreducibility by feeling wonder, perhaps even attempting writing if that is possible, by consuming biochemicals which will induce the sense of oneness or awe (Eliade, p. 31).

In effect, the phenomenologist or existentialist has become a de facto positivist or analytic thinker. The phenomenologist or existentialist becomes a biochemical phenomenologist or existentialist, totally reducing the chemistry of the brain, body, and lived world to atoms and chemical reactions. If it is possible, the ethicist calls this positivistic or analytic phenomenology or existentialism. On the other hand, for clarification, the ethicist might use another term: biochemical phenomenology or existentialism.

b. War

What of the analytic thinker or positivist using computers for their approaches? Ethics would point to the efforts by analytic thinkers during World War II to crack Hitler’s Enigma Machine code. The machine worked strictly through symbols. Codes are symbols. During WWII the codes were relatively complex, but speed was crucial in breaking them. Today, and in the future, with cryptology becoming increasingly sophisticated, codes become more complex, and the speed required to break them more crucial.

Positivists and analysts would insist that their philosophy requires respect, and faster computers. Ethicists would argue that we need a better world where criminals and dictators are minimized, and their powers decapitated. Having the computer capabilities of speedier problem-solving does not “solve” the problem in its widest sense. The problem in its widest sense is that people, usually the leaders, go bad and make evil things happen in the world. When governments ignore the rise of evil, they usually invite international catastrophes such as the Second World War. As the war occurs, and as the innocent attempt to now fight and defeat the enemy, many on the side of the innocent take pride in their technical efforts.

Technical abilities helped our side win against Hitler in his efforts to communicate through codes. None of this would have had to occur if we had kept him from rising to power in the first place. His rise to power, and the unethical ways we ignored his ascension were key to the disaster of the Second World War. We ignored his actions against Jews and non-Jews. This ignorance was unethical. We sat back and did nothing.

Toward the end, we began panicking and wondered how to solve problems to end the war. One major answer was to break his coding abilities. Fortunately, we broke his code, and this helped us win the war.

Today, intelligence agencies are increasingly positivistic in their coding/decoding efforts. Computers are the foundations of coding/decoding. Speed is paramount. We spend money, lots of it, in developing ways of surreptitiously monitoring telecommunications to determine what potential terrorists are saying. Technology is advancing rapidly in our endeavors to translate foreign and English conversations to determine whether speakers are planning attacks.

Forgotten in all this rush to technologize existence, society ignores the ethical grounds of analysis and computers (Stine, 141). We forget that analysis is embodied in wonder, and that thinking and wonder involve the ethical orientation. Are we ignoring the poor, the economically and socially deprived, the underprivileged? We no doubt are ignoring the impoverished. Then, in the event that the impoverished seek ways of retaliating, we suddenly seeks technical ways of speedier discovery of the terrorists’ plots.

Even when terrorists are wealthy, we seek to look the other way instead of considering their moral deviancy and their ongoing hatred of humanity, especially of the West. We let this hatred grow, assuming that we do not initially deny it. As their hatred grows, it can mushroom into attacks against the West or even people in other cultures. Only then, in post 9/11 fashion, do we react and seek the speediest computers to analyze terrorist activities and conversations.

Ethics is derived from ethos or people. Any human activity must be seen within the social context. Thinking and wonder are among the fundamental human activities. Relegating cognition to the sum total of data becomes anti-human; similarly, relegating wonder to the realm of intravenous or other methods of drug intake is no longer a human activity. The ethos orientation of cognition means that thought, contrary to what Descartes said, is embodied and of social perspective. Cognition is never disembodied. To disembody cognition is to commit two wrongs.

One wrong is to seek cognition as devoid of awe. This makes thought sterile and dehumanizing. The second wrong is to see disembodied cognition as part of a technology where speed is the only way to resolve problems and answer questions.

Awe or wonder is the pre-cognitive requisite of the cognitive. Yet, ethics notes that we cannot stop there. Wonder cannot be an end in itself. If wonder is derived from a natural, non-drug induced sequence whereby we simply wonder that things “are,” then we are practicing true awe. Once we take drugs or otherwise stimulate the brain to induce wonder, than the wonder is unethical. It is mechanical rather than emerging from ethos.

c. Hospitals

Take the example of a hospital’s intensive care unit. Patients are put on a respirator to help them breathe. They may also be put on intravenous feeding so that the body can be “fed” nutrients mechanically instead of taking in food through the mouth. In time, however, society believes that such patients may be retained on such mechanical devices only if their physical conditions warrant such technologization. The purpose of life is for the patient to be helped toward normalcy. In this case, the patient must be helped to leave the hospital and eat and breathe, and so on, on their own.

The objective of life, of the hospital, is never to merely have the patients remain in intensive care, or even in the hospital. People need to be active in daily life, eating, breathing, and so on on their own. To eat and breathe on their own means dining and respiring as part of society, with one’s own bodily abilities. Food is irreducible to nutrients. Breathing is irreducible to oxygen intake. Food and respiration emerge from the ethos, from the ethical. As biological as eating and breathing, they are not merely physical processes.

For example, the nervous person, the seriously emotionally troubled individual, will have difficulty eating and breathing. Human activity such as eating and breathing are as much part of the ethos or ethical, as they are physical, neurochemical, and so on. Indeed, eating disorders such as those resulting in being overweight, imply reducing food to merely physical entities being “put into the mouth.” Eating does not mean simply stuffing the mouth, eating quickly, or any other physical process. Dining is a cultural, ethical process.

Similarly, we do not just respire by hyperventilating. We breathe by inhaling and exhaling normally, often unconsciously. Perons inhaling too fast may be suffering from an emotional problem, or perhaps physical difficulty. Persons inhaling and exhaling too fast are behaving unethically, anti-ethos or different from normal human activity.

We can say the same about wonder and analysis. Wonder is something we sense under normal human conditions without mechanical assistance. Drugs ought not play part of wonder.

Analysis is an activity in which we participate without the aid of computers, and hopefully within the context of wonder. To think analytically is to take apart. But to spend our time only taking apart means that we are simply assuming that words, pictures, behavior, and so on are only to be taken apart and never appreciated as products of the ethos or community. Taking apart ought mean that something was initially a whole. That wholeness cannot be violated. If we emphasize the taking apart aspect of existence, and reject or ignore the synthetic and the wonderful, we have relegated existence to a form of hospitalization, to a form of the intensive care unit.

Existence is not meant to be only analyzed, and it is not meant to be only wondered. Ethos means that analysis and wonder go hand in hand. Analysis and wonder are not mutually exclusive. We never merely analyze without some wonder, and never wonder by merely mechanical means. Both analysis and wonder reflect an ethical, social, cultural dimension.

Feminism can be helpful here. Feminists argue that nothing written is ever totally objective, and devoid of the cultural. Look at books. Their authors are not just “authorities,” but traditionally have been white males. Their subject matter, too, have typically ignored injustices toward women. Sexism means that we have looked at women simply as reducible to anatomy, and never as human beings. Ethics means that women are human beings, irreducible to physical characteristics.

Racial theory can also help. Racism has meant that authorities writing books have been white males. But the ethical thrust of the women’s’ movement and racial justice has attempted to bring about a better, ethos oriented vision. We now have books and articles written by women, and by nonwhite males. Authors are not just authors. They are a racial-gender-human continuum. No author is the sum total of racial, religious, biological, and other parts. Every author is first of all a human being.

Wonder and analysis, then, are irreducible to mechanical identification. Persons need to be able to wonder with only their mind and body, in awe of the universe or of any particular event. They need only to analyze within the context of this natural wonder, and with computers only on a limited scale.

Ethics does not demand the exclusion of computers from society. The ethos orientation requires only that computing, speed, technology, and other quantification occur within the context of a healthy environment. The idea of proactivity or prevention is important here.

Proactivity means we need to prevent rather than react to bad events. Before illness strikes, we need to monitor physical and other conditions resulting in disease. Ethics means we ought not ignore health dangers, and then react medically, physically, surgically, to “solve” unhealthy situations. Drugs, whether over the counter or prescription, do not need to take the place of a healthy lifestyle and diet. People might need to depend on drugs as they age and their body deteriorates. Even then, they must take drugs only by doctor’s orders, and never simply because the drugs are there.

The preventative, proactive approach to health includes habits of proper diet, exercise, monitoring stress, wearing clothes appropriate to the season, air conditioning during the summer and heat during the winter. These measures and lifestyles help insure that people will not get ill to the extent that they can have some reasonable control over life. Illness can and will come under many circumstances. Viruses, bacteria, many forms of sickness will emerge regardless of what we do to prevent illness.

When illness does come, we need to take a look at the best ways of curing what we have, and returning to a relative healthy state. Physicians may often examine patients and tell them than rest, proper diet, the drinking of fluids, and so on, will probably help bring the patients back to health. Not all diseases require medication. Additionally not all diseases require surgery. Even broken bones may not require cutting the patient. In time, many bones will heal correctly if their break is not in a physical position to cause deformity when healed.

Medicine, then, often seeks to prevent illness through a healthy lifestyle. When medical treatment is needed, pills are often preferable to surgery. Similar approaches are sought by ethicists for awe and analysis.

Wonder and analytic thinking are never mutually exclusive. Existence does not consist of wonder devoid of analysis, or analysis and rational-sensory approaches lacking awe. Most importantly, phenomenological ethics means that wonder and analysis are not to be merely the ends in themselves. We cannot say that because we are analyzing within the context of wonder, we are therefore being ethical, appropriately intellectual and properly in awe.

The states of awe and analysis are human states. They are irreducible to mechanical, physical, neurophysiological methods. Before we consider being in awe as a context for being analytical, we need to realize the need for being ethical, social, humane. Ethics is more than doing right and avoiding wrong in daily activity, business ventures, and the professions. Ethical behavior is basic to cognitive efforts to understand reality. The drug culture of the 1960s assumed that achieving a “high” was very important, but could not be reached until persons smoked pot or did hard drugs to alter the mind.

Similarly, people who believe in the rational approach to existence frequently misinterpret rationalism, logic, calculation, and speed. They too often assume that the logical or rational sequences are only sequences depending on speed. Their view is that speed is fundamental, and therefore the faster a sequence the better. From that view, the quicker we gather and understand greater numbers of variables or parts of the problem, the better our solution.

An unethical view of problem solving involves quick technical solutions to a given problem. A problem can be small or large. Instead of asking ourselves whether the problem is real or not, we frequently tell ourselves that speedy solutions are the answer. For example, take urban crime. We see robbers, burglars, car thieves. We hear of homicides and arsonists. Our typical approach is to assume that crime is crime, and its solution is a nonsocial, purely professional response from the police. The more police the better. The faster our calls are answered, and the quicker the police arrive at the scene, the better we feel that the problem of criminality is being solved.

This unethical view says that more crime we have, the more and faster police response we need. That view also suggests that the faster we get fingerprints and identify the wrongdoer, the more our society is progressing. Our emphasis is on speed, imprisonment or worse, technology, and other mechanical forms of reaction.

The ethical approach is fundamentally different. We would give opportunities to young people in order to attract them to productive lives outside crime. Families need strengthening, discipline must be practiced and taught, neighborhoods aware of wrongdoing, parental responsibility required. Our social institutions must be upheld. Churches, social groups, schools, governmental organizations, hospitals, and all businesses will need to work together. The police are there, but cannot be the only people combating crime. Technology ought be there, but only within the context of the social structures.

Society ought not ignore the social conditions and then go after the criminals arising as a result of deteriorating cultural situations. Culture is the not only contributor to crime. Some people simply may be born trouble makers. A weak social structure lets them do as they please until it is too late. Simply waiting for people to become criminals, then going after them, arresting, taking them to trail, and locking them up are the mechanical ways of recidivism.

The ethical approach attempt to return the criminal to society through rehabilitation when initial parenting or habilitation has failed. We cannot just let young people grow up doing as they please, and then throw the book at them when they go wrong. Society seems to like the mechanical approach to most things. In medicine and health, we increase emergency rooms. In law enforcement, we want more and faster police. Education becomes a mechanical method of learning from computers. Transportation develops into a way of speedier, aircraft, and automobiles even if we need to build bigger airports, and destroy ecology with more highways. Information becomes merely a commodity where we transmit data and receive it with greater efficiency. In more and areas, technology and rapidity of getting something or someone from here to there becomes paramount. Ethically, medicine must involve better health habits, law enforcement better homes, love, and discipline, learning a matter of student teacher interaction, travel a matter of bicycles and trains, and information an issue of understanding and social empathy.

d. Ethics of Integration

Wonder and analysis are good when they are integrated. We cannot have just wonder, or only analysis. Yet, integrated or not, wonder must come from within and never as a result of drugs and electrical stimulation of the brain. Analysis must be within the social context and never merely a computerized battle toward solutions. Phenomenological ethics shows awe to be the view that things are fundamentally one, and culturally uplifting. Basic to all is our wonder that reality is a beautiful, awesome, non-problematic existence.

Existence is more than just a problem to be solved, a difficulty to be overcome. Existing ought mean appreciating life, people, God, culture, and all plants and animals. We cannot just look at the world as an ongoing defect to be repaired. Life may have evil in it, but is not essentially evil. It is a wondrous reality. This view is available to us not just through drugs, but our very natural feeling of awe. Again, good parenting and better social structure can contribute to or take away from this feeling.

Albert Einstein displayed ethics when he told his fellow scholars at Princeton to stop by an say hello from time to time. Most scholars were shocked. They felt that Princeton was a place for intellectual discourse instead of chit chat and normal conversation. They felt even more strongly that Einstein’s work was so critical that they did not wish to interfere in his studies with what they consider small talk or any conversation irrelevant to scientific work.

We think of Einstein as a scientist. He was clearly displaying what phenomenology calls intersubjectivity and wonder as the basis of any scientific work. Einstein believed that normal human beings, even those in intensive scholarly research, needed and should engage in the wonder of interpersonal, face to face community that this the social foundations of any verbal communications. Community is the basis of communications. We cannot communicate or convey information from person to person unless we first establish of acknowledge what phenomenology calls the “given” community or lived world.

e. People

In phenomenological ethics, we are first, last, and always in the community of people, in intersubjectivity, wonder, awe, or the non-cognitive. We are one with vegetation, with nature, with spiritual powers or religious dimensions. The term “people like us” is not to be taken as meaning individuals of our race, creed, color, or gender. It is to be interpreted as meaning that all human beings in the world are like each other. People are the same, regardless of race, creed, and so on.

Wonder means that all things are essentially related with each other. We do not first sense races, creeds, religions, and genders, and then arrive, step by step, to our humanity. The first thing we sense is that all individuals are alike. Races, religions, and so on are differentiations that we tend to make in distinguishing each other. Wonder makes it clear that whatever else we have as differences, human beings are, at bottom, the same.

Only within the context of fundamental awe of the unity of all things, do we then take apart or analyze people from each other, animals, nature, and so on. Analysis, done within awe, is benign. Analysis done outside the framework of wonder becomes mere taking apart of the essentially unified. In this sense, analysis becomes mere destruction.

Wonder and analysis in the ethical perspective comprise our intersubjective, sensory, rational unity. This occurs only when awe and analytic thinking occur within the context of the ethic or ethos: culture. Human beings are meant to awe that they are in the unified world of people, animals, vegetation and nature. Nothing is or ought be totally objectified. We are meant also to differentiate or analyze carefully in order to understand and intellectually cope with the existing world. Within awe, we objectify in order to develop an intellectual stance about why things are as they are.

Intersubjectivity and objectivity go hand in hand. Intersubjectivity or wonder devoid of objectivity becomes dangerously anti-technology. Objectivity alone becomes anti-human. Ethics tells us that this integration is complete when we appreciate intersubjectivity through normal human activity and not through drugs. We need also appreciate objectivity through normal intellectual activity and never through seeing speed, technology, or quantification as an end in itself.

The awe of our being together as a basis for any technique in analyzing that intersubjectivity can be seen MIT’s OpenCourseWare. Classroom learning with face to face interaction is fundamental to any distance learning. Wonder occurs not through mechanical activity but the social interaction found in the classroom; analysis is then found not through sophisticated telecourses, but computers existing and operating in the service and context of face-to-face interaction.

Alfred North Whitehead (p. 232) says that philosophy begins in wonder, and that wonder continues after philosophers have analyzed reality. Judith Boss says ethics begins in wonder. Philosophy can say that wonder and analysis begin with ethics, and that ethics continues as the context or orientation for analysis and wonder, and all activity.

2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

a. Overview

A key model that represents the way to tie phenomenological ethics to the world is by examining ethics, philosophy, and engineering. Scholars in the field of ethics would say that their field provides basic ideas unifying engineering and philosophy. Those thinkers who are ethicists would indicate that engineering and philosophy share a common ground in ethics. Engineering and philosophy are specific manifestation of ethics. The ethicist’s position sees engineering and philosophy as fields where human beings and values orient technology, objectivity, reason, and logic.

Ethicists (Kazanjian, 1998, Chapter 2) would view ethics as unifying engineering and philosophy. Scholars in ethics would view their field as underlying the humanistic thinking in philosophy, and the scientific views of engineering. Those who study ethics would see ethical ideas as necessary in courses in virtually all disciplines and professions. These scholars see ethics as an interdisciplinary foundation to the arts and sciences. For ethicists, business ethics, legal ethics, medical and biomedical ethics, engineering ethics, are all integral parts of business, law, medicine, and the other disciplines. Those who are ethics scholars would say business ought engage in ethical instead of unethical practices. These ethicists would also see lawyers, physicians, biomedical researchers, engineers, and others as competent when their curriculum teaches them values and morals as well as technical expertise. Ethicists would say that values and morals orient technique. The ethical perspective sees the mechanics of a given field as ethically oriented. Ethics scholars would view any disciplinarian as a professional concerned with human beings instead of merely a cognitive or technical, non-ethical expert. Scholars from the field of ethics see their work as interdisciplinarity, among their tasks being the disclosure of the ethical basis of engineering and philosophy. As such, ethicists see their discipline as basic to liberal arts and sciences, and interdisciplinarity at any level.

b. Human Factors Engineering

Human factors engineering, also known as ergonomics or ergonomic engineering, is that kind of engineering which designs physical environments including machines and processes to match human limits and abilities, and train people to use those environments (Chapanis, p.534; Kantowicz and Sorkin, p. 20). These engineers work with mathematics, physics, chemistry, and often computers. Beyond these scientific and technical fields, ergonomics engineers deal with human beings. These engineers are concerned not only with how to design an environment, but how to design it to be safe for the user.

The ergonomics position sees safety as meaning that engineers ought design the environments to be user friendly and ought avoid both user unfriendly and user too friendly designs (Adams, p. 256). A design that is user unfriendly ignores the user. To be user unfriendly means is a design whereby the machine or process is dangerous or offensive for the user. The other design is user too friendly, whereby the machine or process is so safe as to be rendered unfunctional. Designing something as user friendly means that users are able to work with an environment which takes into account the users’ limits and abilities. Such limits and abilities mean people have arms, legs, eyes, ears, and torsos with certain anatomic and sensory measurements. Arms bend in certain ways and are of certain lengths. The same with legs. Ears hear best at certain sound levels. We see best at certain distances.

Ergonomics is saying that human beings see, hear, and move within certain physical parameters. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on. Any machine or process ought be designed such that it allows the user to use it comfortably, without undue stress or tension. Designing user friendly machines or processes is right. Designing an environment that forces people to merely sense or move is wrong. At the other extreme, designing an environment so safe that users need not make any effort to learn or use it is also wrong. The system could become nonfunctional.

The typical human factors engineering text looks like a combination engineering, psychology, and biology book. Ergonomics engineers say that any physical environment is as much social and psychological as it is mathematical, physical, or chemical. No user friendly design is totally reducible to the sum of nuts and bolts. Human factors argues that objects and people comprise an interface: both are interrelated to each other. Machines/processes and human beings ought not be seen as mutually exclusive, but inherently human-oriented. Al Gini (p. 3) argues that work is vital to our identity, but it must be a humanizing career and never just meaningless, dehumanizing sum of tasks.

Human factors also rejects overemphasizing the user. If machines/processes are to take into account the user’s abilities and limits, they are not to simply make things so safe and user-friendly that the machine/procedure becomes unfunctional or unable to perform its technical task.

c. Phenomenology: Brentano

Phenomenology is the philosophical movement somewhere between existentialism and logical positivism. Existentialists would see human beings or any aspect of reality almost totally irreducible to numbers or rational explanation, while the logical positivist position would view people and any reality as totally reducible to number and reason. The existential position views our social and cultural embodiment or existence is almost completely irreducible to number and reason, whereas logical positivism and linguistic analysis see our existence as basically, perhaps totally, rational and numeric. Brentano is considered the founder of phenomenology. He (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8) initiated the idea of intentionality. Intentionality means that consciousness or embodiment inherently relates to objects. Consciousness is consciousness of objects. Brentano attempted to overcome the logical positivist notion that objects and sensation are real, and consciousness is totally reducible to objectivity.

Brentano would see the thinking mind and the body mutually interrelated . He believed Cartesian dualism is wrong in stating that thinking and the body are two different entities. In speaking about the mind-body unity, Brentano set the stage for Husserl to develop phenomenology. Brentano spoke of the mind-body continuum and rejected total objectivity. Thinking is continuous or interrelated with the body. But Husserl more fully developed the continuum and rejecting two extremes: thinking alone or objectivism, and mere embodiment or subjectivism.

d. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl

Edmund Husserl moved beyond Brentano (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8). Husserl sees a development of the mind-body continuum. Objectivity or mind is never value-free or disembodied, according to Husserl. All objectivity is value-laden or occurs as worldly, social, cultural. This view contrasts with the logical positivist notion that objectivity is the sole reality, and value-free.

Husserl’s position would say objectivity ought be seen as reflecting or matching subjectivity or values. From the perspective of phenomenology, we must consider all phenomena as real that appear to consciousness or our thoughts. Where logical positivists and linguistic analysts, and all emotional terms such as God as poetry and not cognitively meaningful, phenomenologists believe all objectivity reflects subjectivity, culture, values, and ethics.

The phenomenological position sees the mind-body issue in the manner that people ought look at physical environments as continuous with subjectivity, and emotions and noncognitive ideas as the social milieu generating the meaning of physical environments. Phenomenologically, objects, cognition, and cultural artifacts are real: products of human or subjective intentions. Mathematics, physics, chemistry, computers, and all the arts and sciences must be seen as part of life. But these cognitive realities emerge from a social, subjective realm and are not to be divorced from human experience. Cognition is never reducible to numbers, symbols, sense perception, and other non-emotive reality. Words reflect human experiences as a whole.

The position of phenomenology is that objectivity to be value-laden and ought avoid two extremes. One extreme is value-free cognition. This is cognition whereby cognition or any object is seen as free of any emotive or cultural values or spirituality. The other extreme means extreme existentialism that rejects any reducibility. Here, science, technology and any cognitive effort is considered almost anti-human. Phenomenology sees cognition and physical environments as things that take into account our values and any other noncognitive being. People have cognitive and analytical abilities and ought use them in certain ways. Knowing is not a simple matter of sense perception and analysis. The blanket denial of the reality of noncognitive ideas such as God and values suggests too simplistic a means of getting at reality.

Husserl also rejects subjectivism or solipsism. In saying that everything appearing to consciousness is real, critics argues that he was dangerous near, if not in fact, advocating solipsism. However, Husserl reject both logical positivism’s cold objectivism, which says people are objects and values unreal, and extreme existentialism and subjectivism’s solipsism, which maintains that the self is the only reality.

Phenomenology: Alfred Schutz (p. 140) comes from the perspective of applied phenomenology. Specifically, his viewpoint is sociology. He considers sociology as the study of “lived history,” or human institutions within which we find chronological or day to day history. He points out that human beings see, hear, and move within value parameters. Social structures comprise “lived history,” and are the context within which “chronological history” makes sense. Schutz ideas are similar to those of Kenneth Boulding. Boulding, while not technically a phenomenologist, notes that perception and action occur within our images of wholes, and never as the sensing of raw data or merely mechanical anatomic movement. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on.

In phenomenology, consciousness intends or is consciousness of objects, thus revealing a subject-object continuum. Objectivity, perception and movement, in turn, are colored by our values and lived world. Objectivity is continuous with subjectivity. Subjectivity is never the reality of just one person, but intersubjective or social. Thus, phenomenology rejects the existential notion of extreme individuality or the virtually solipsistic ego.

Reality, in phenomenology, is the subject-object continuum or duality. Phenomenologists say we ought avoid Cartesian dualism of the mutually exclusive mind and body. Consciousness is always of the object, and the object is always embodied. Ricoeur (p. 217) argues that phenomenology overcomes Cartesian dualism by reintroducing the excarnate mind into the carnate or body. His efforts enable phenomenology to resolve dualism, as well as the objectivism of positivism, and subjectivism of existentialism.

The mind-body continuum means that subjectivity and objectivity are both real, but comprise a systematic reality instead of parts being real in themselves. Human beings exist in a world of physical reality. We sense this as we consider the lived world of culture giving meaning to material objects and generating ideas. Subjectivity does not exist alone; it requires a object. Likewise, objectivity is not merely “out there;” it is always perceived within cultural, lived orientations.

The phenomenological view is that subjectivity is never devoid of objectivity, while the solipsistic position entails subjectivity as devoid of objectivity. We need the world, for people are part of physical reality. Interpreting objectivity as devoid of subjectivity is similarly wrong. It becomes a dehumanized objectivity disregarding human beings and consciousness. Along these lines and seemingly less serious a problem, dualism is just as wrong, according to phenomenology. Objects and subjects are irreducible to mutual distinct, inherently unrelated entities. We do not just take discreet objectivity and subjectivity and externally juxtapose them. We would be unable to bridge the subject-object gap if it were intrinsically discontinuous or unbridged.

e. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels

Human factors engineering and phenomenology appear to be mutually distinct fields. One is engineering and quantitative, the other a philosophical movement rejecting total quantification. As such, engineering and phenomenology would seem to be irreconcilable disciplines: engineering being strictly hard culture, phenomenology fundamentally soft culture. But our brief statements above show something else.

A glance at human factors engineering and phenomenology reveals parallels. Human factors believes that all physical environment interface with people. Objects ought be designed as continuous with human operators. The entire system is a machine-person interface or continuum, instead of the machine being something totally objective and non-personal. Phenomenology says that mind or objectification is continuous with the social dimension. Phenomenologists speak of the mind-body continuum. Human factors could speak of the machine-user continuum, phenomenology of the mind-body interface. Human factors would be saying machines are continuous with the user, phenomenology would be indicating that the mind interrelates with the body. In ergonomics, seeing designs or actual machines means seeing the operator or subjectivity. In phenomenology, seeing words on paper must mean seeing human values and other intangibles. For human factors engineers, machines/processes ought be acknowledged as intrinsically continuous or interfacing with people’s physical, social, and psychological limits. In phenomenology, the written word ought be recognized as inherently continuous with values and other cultural themes underlying the empirical.

Human factors says machines/processes ought be user-friendly, and ought not be user-unfriendly. Phenomenology maintains that objectivity ought be seen as value-laden, and never value-free. By user friendly, human factors means buttons, numbers, levers, lights, and other physical apparatus the operations and reasons of which the user can learn relatively easily, and the use of which will not harm the person. The human being need not be the proverbial rocket scientist to understand these operations; training would not require the typical user to earn a Ph.D., or even take one course from MIT. The user also need not be made of steel or physically qualify for Navy SEAL commando work to use the environment. The user friendly environment is designed for the typical person’s intellectual and physical abilities. By value-laden, phenomenology means any word ultimately reflects human values. No word is or can be value-free, as the philosophical movements logical positivism and .linguistic analysis tend to maintain. Positivists and analytic thinkers argue that words such as God, love, and religion do not belong in intellectual discourse because they reflect values and emotion. Words such as chair, table, atom and other words are value-free and non-emotive. However, chair reflects the English language, can imply the electric chair, can mean a department head at a college or university, and appears to be nonsexist relative to the apparently sexist term chairman. Phenomenologists would maintain that no word is value-free, that every term is a sociology of that term. Every word emerges from and reflects the social and cultural framework that produces it.

A user unfriendly environment is totally objective, ignoring human limits and abilities and forcing people to mere push, pull, and perceive. Al Gini (p. 120) notes that work offering no hope and becoming unethical is wrong, and means roughly what ergonomics means by user unfriendly work. Value-free language would mean a totally objective set of words over which there is no debate. However, every math, computer, physics and other science book or piece of literature reflects a human author and the author’s perspective, slant, or view. Feminism and civil rights thinkers have shown that such books (any book) are value-laden whether we like it or not. Each is written by a white male, black male, Latino woman, or person of a particular religious, ethnic, or sexual orientation. An author lacking ethnic, gender, and similar human qualities is impossible.

Human factors could say machines ought be user-laden, while phenomenologists might indicate that objectivity ought be seen as subject-friendly. The human factors term “user” is synonymous with phenomenology’s term “subject.” User and subject mean the human being and the cultural context from which the human being emerges.

Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at human-made environments as reflecting culture and not as just cognitive, scientific, or merely objective fields of study and work. Moreover, both ergonomics and phenomenology consider the human as part of the object. Thus, ergonomics notes that we ought avoid simply catering to the person’s every desire and want, and phenomenology rejects solipsism’s view that the individual is the sole reality.

f. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics

The previous section notes the technical parallels between ergonomics and phenomenology. Readers will see the term “ought” throughout the paragraphs.

Phenomenology and human factors have fundamental parallels, as indicated in the previous section. These are intellectual or technical similarities. They indicate that both see a unity of objects and people.

In doing so, they are ethical in the general sense. Both machines and rational thought emerge from the social context. Ergonomics argues that machines reflect the social and cultural milieu, and are not totally reducible to nuts and bolts. Phenomenologists (Stewart and Mikunas, p. 10) note that God, love, anger, desire, and other intangibles are real because they appear to consciousness. Secular phenomenologists consider nonreligious themes as real. Religious phenomenologists believe that theological and spiritual notions such as God are real.

Both human factors experts and phenomenologists deny that sensation is our only way of knowing and experiencing. Ergonomics engineers would say it is wrong or unethical to design a machine or process that has operators simply “look,” “hear,” or otherwise sense a control panel or other part of a machine. Phenomenologists argue that we would be outside the ethos or culture if we considers human behavior or reality as strictly sensory phenomena.

Engineers abide by and study professional ethics, and the Occupational Safety and Health Administration monitors dangerous in the workplace according to federal law. Phenomenology, however, does not become part of a professional ethics issue except in the case of the ethics of teaching. It may seem that in phenomenology, the subject-object discontinuity or dichotomy is only an academic rather than a technically ethical matter as in engineering. To say that objects are disconnected from and do not reflect subjectivity is not an ethical matter.

Phenomenology is concerned with ethics in the broad sense of ethos or culture. Totally reducing knowledge or reality to the empirical means excarnating or taking sensation out of the social realm comprising ethos. In applied phenomenology, reducing people to computerized forms, numbers, and related paper work may be seen an unethical or socially undesirable.

In acknowledging the social and psychological as well as physical side of people, both human factors engineering and phenomenology are rooted in the sociology of human-made products. A sociology of work suggests that people do not just “do.” They do and know within social, ethos, and thereby ethical constraints.

Both human factors engineering and phenomenology share the view that the person or subject is not alone. In ergonomics, machines ought take the user into account, but this does not mean that the design reflect everything about the user. Physical environments should not be so designed as to satisfy every want, desire, and whim of the operator. Operators need to be trained, and put forth effort to realize that the environment requires change on the users’ part. Additionally, operators are continuous with their surroundings. They are not Luddites, working or existing alone, without the use of physical environments. Phenomenology says that subjectivity is not the same as subjectivism. In subjectivism, the self is considered to be alone, devoid of objectivity.

Phenomenology seems not to fall into the same ethics category of including punishments for unethical behavior as does human factors engineering. However, the culture that supports a totally dehumanized attitude toward people, such as allowing computerization to go wild and reduce everyone to numbers in every instance, is manifesting an anti phenomenological view. The positivism attitude is that we merely know and are excarnated from feelings and emotions. No ethical ruling can be made against positivism as an intellectual movement Yet positivism reflects the culture view that we can and ought ignore feeling and other intangibles.

The lived world is phenomenology’s notion that people live, work, and play in a social context where not everything is totally reducible to numbers or is effable. Paul Ricouer tells us that Cartesian dualism is the effort to see the world and the mind as two different substances. The Cartesian world-view means that cognition is excarnate, discontinuous with the body. Positivism argues that the cognitive is all there exists. Ricoeur would want us to reintroduce the cognitive into the lived world, and to see cognition as incarnate or embodied.

Broadly speaking, the embodied viewpoint is the ethos-oriented viewpoint whereby cognitive activity emerges from the parameters of culture. People ought not just think. Basically, they never just think. Thus, no individual ought take the stand that we are simply thinking substances, whether this substance is somehow related to the body in dualistic terms, or stands by itself in positivistic notions. On the other hand, the cognitive is part of life. We ought not consider the reductive or cognitive as unwarranted, as in much existentialism. We certainly ought not take the view that the cognitive does not have a reality, that the self is alone, that each of us is isolated.

The ethical view posits a holistic perspective. Objectification ought be seen as interfacing or being continuous with the subject or intersubjectivity. Neither objectification devoid of subjectivity, nor subjectivity without objectivity, is the ought.

Human factors speaks of groups of users, not just a user, as reference for designing machines. Phenomenology speaks of intersubjectivity, not just of one subject, a reference for seeing the cognitive. Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at individuals as social, and their limits and abilities are pertaining to groups rather than to one or two people.

Phenomenological thinkers take the position that could be interpreted as the philosophical version of ergonomics. In ergonomics, we do not hear of linguistic analysis, logical positivism , or existentialism. Yet, Ergonomics reveals or deals with language in the broadest sense. When ergonomics speaks of people seeing, hearing, touching, pulling, they are using language. In saying that a person is something that simply sees, hears, etc., we are being positivistic and reducing the individual to an object. If we agree that users are human beings who see, hear, and otherwise sense and move within emotive, cultural, and physical contexts, we are then thinking or using language from a phenomenological viewpoint.

Traditional linguistic analysis tends to imply that philosophers in that vein are only thinkers and not fundamentally akin the engineering. An interdisciplinary attitude with a broad vision of language sees things differently. Language analysts in philosophy work with symbolic logic and not technical mathematics. Human factors engineers work with mathematics, but are suggesting that people are indeed at least partly physical, sensory, and material. Ergonomics may be called human factors, but it can also be called subjectivity factors: we need to take the subjective and cultural into account for engineering processes.

As a corollary, the phenomenological position would be that human factors considers users as not mere objects, but that any characteristic of the person that appears to consciousness is a valid reality. Thus, engineers who are only nuts and bolts people traditionally say we are only skin, neurons, senses, and bones. This is very positivistic language. Phenomenologically, users are also values, emotions, spirituality, and ethos as a whole. Human factors and phenomenology are looking at operators as fundamentally human beings with dignity and essentially irreducible qualities.

Logical positivists might argue that their members helped win World War II by cracking Hitler’s Enigma Machine code. This is true. On the more fundamental side, Hitler would not have risen to the powerful level that we allowed to him to do so had we been phenomenological and cultural. As he was rising and accumulating power, a cultural view would have told us to stop him in his tracks. Had we done so, war would have been unnecessary, the Normandy invasion would not have had to occur, and Hitlers codes would not have had time to develop to be used against us.

Ethics tells us that human factors and phenomenology speak the same language, though ergonomics is the trained engineer designing machines, and phenomenologists are philosophers trained in inquiry and argument instead of the design of physical environments. Physical environments are but a form of language. Ergonomics and phenomenology speak the same language in terms of acknowledging that objectivity is subject- or value-oriented. Al Gini speaks of work in terms of business ethics: work must be ethical and never unethical.

They speak the same language in saying that human beings are essential social instead of standing alone. The physical, written, and motor environments are never totally reducible to objects “out there.” But as reflections of human beings, these environments mirror “our” and not “my” world. Any human value represents the share world-view of numerous individuals comprising a group. Language ought never be either completely symbolic as in the totally logical methods of linguistic analysis, nor ought it be simply one person’s language which no other person can understand.

Two people, one a human factors engineer, the other a phenomenologist, can look at a machine or consider a procedure. These two individuals can communicate with each other if they understand their shared viewpoint. Both are coming from the ethical perspective. The engineer is saying that the numbers, words, and motions, which is to say, the language, of a system, ought reflect human beings in light of culture. A phenomenologist is saying that the writings in a human factors text ought reflect the social, psychological and related value-oriented words and meanings we see in culture.

Both the ergonomics and phenomenological philosopher would agree that the human values comprise a share enterprised that reflects the objective world continuous with the cultural milieu. No person is an island, no person is reducible to flesh and bones. Somewhere between extreme individualism and mere objectivism, the subject-object continuum or machine-person interface comprises a reality including the validity of external and internal worlds.

Ethics means objects are the externalizing of human ideas and the validity of the outside world. As ethos, we are neither extra-ethos nor merely ethos. The extra-ethos or extra-ethical suggests that people are sensations and motions; the merely ethos or ethical can mean we are only a commune, only a community doing little or nothing. Pushed to the extreme, the commune leads to the individual member as possibly believing that he or she stands alone.

In both human factors and phenomenology, language as our fundamental nature is seen as an object-subjective reality. Positivism sees language as symbols and sensory activity; traditional engineering involving merely nuts and bolts sees machines, and therefore language, as the sum total of physical parts. Human factors and phenomenology, rooted in ethos, consider language as a holistic reality whereby being serves to objectify itself through beings.

g. Ethics as Homological

We typically think of ethics as a course of study, as in professional or philosophical ethics. In that way, ethics is no more fundamental than any other discipline. The above pages show that ethics is isomorphic or homological. Isomorphic is derived from iso meaning the same, and morphic meaning shape. Ethics is the same shape or principle that underlies ergonomics and phenomenology. Homological is derived from homo means same, and logic meaning word or structure. Ethics is the same structure from which ergonomics and phenomenology are derived. Learning ethics is basic to human factors engineering and phenomenology. As we consider ethics, we find it necessary to objectify within the parameters of culture, values, and perhaps spirituality. From the engineering perspective, ethics becomes a method of developing physical structures for human use. From the philosophical view, ethics can be interpreted as the intellectual inquiry into knowledge and reality.

As an isomorphic or homological root to human factors and phenomenology, ethics becomes the foundations for a liberal arts. Whatever we know and do, we are inherently facing the opportunity to know and do what is humane, and what is not. This opportunity means intellectual and engineering approaches are basically ethical. They emerge from culture or ethos. To deny values would be to reject our cultural foundations; to seek only values would be unrealistic.

Interdisciplinary research has gone in two directions. One is interdisciplinarity in the sense of team teaching and putting together courses and topics in some sort of seamless or minimally seamed fabric. Ethics plays an equity role here. It is one of the disciplines or ideas relevant to knowledge. The other direction (Kazanjian, 2002, p. 30) is more fundamental. This is the isomorphic direction. Isomorphic or homological ethics means that we must study ethics as a cultural, ethos framework within which we find the roots for all other professions.

Ethics as the homological root of numerous disciplines can thereby show us how to understand human factors engineering and phenomenology. Take ethics away from ergonomics and we essentially eliminate human factors engineering. The very term “human factor” implies that ethos is basic to engineering. Take ethics away from phenomenology and we basically have logical positivism. The subjective orientations of objectivity refer to the ethos from which emerges the objective.

Contemporary interest in professional ethics implies that ethical and non-ethical thinking and doing is something new. Indeed, our admission is new. The existence of the ethical perspective is as old as humanity. Mircea Eliade (p. 31) has taken pains to elucidate the validity of ethics in primitive cultures. In every society we have dos and don’ts. Without that view, any person in any culture will simply do or know, and the result could hurt that person or others.

Eliade’s point concerns comparative religion. Ancient societies did everything by repeating the anatomic gestures as performed in Primordial Time by the gods. Primordial Time is the time before the gods created the world and our idea of calendar time. No member of any society simply “did” something. Today, we imply that we merely do or know. Even Eliade suggests that contemporary society is totally secularized. Yet, Clifton Bryant’s research in the sociology of work (p. 1) catalogues the social and thus ethical directions of knowledge and technique.

Ethics, then, is not just another topic (Kazanjian, p. 3). It is the ongoing insight that ethos or culture provides us with the framework for survival and etiquette. Human factors and phenomenology are two specific manifestation of that insight.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Theory

  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Social Dimensions of Work Englewood Cliffs, NJ.: Prentice-Hall; 1972
  • Martin Buber I and Thou New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons; 1970.
  • Jeremy Campbell The Improbable Machine New York: Simon and Schuster; 1989,
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion Cleveland: The World Publishing Company; 1958.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary Evanston, IL: NorthwesternUniversity Press; 1968.
  • David Stewart and Algis Mackunas Exploring Phenomenology Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • G. Harry Stine The Hopeful Future New York: Macmillan;1983.
  • Alfred North Whitehead Modes of Thought New York: The Macmillan Company; 1958.

b. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

  • Jack A. Adams Human Factors Engineering. New York: Macmillan; 1989.
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing; 1963.
  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Sociology of Work. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice Hall; 1972.
  • Alphonse Chapanis, “Human Engineering,” in Operations Research and Systems Engineering ed. Charles D. Flagle, William H. Huggins, and Robert R. Roy, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press; 1960.
  • Al Gini My Job, My Self. New York: Routledge; 2001.
  • Edmund Husserl Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to PhenomenologicalPhilosophy The Netherlands: Kluwer; 1967..
  • Barry H. Kantowicz and Robert D. Sorkin. Human Factors. New York: John Wiley; 1983.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Phenomenology and Education The Netherlands: Rodopi: 1998.
    • Especially chapters one and two comparing ethics, human factors, and phenomenology.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Algis Mikunas and David Stewart Exploring Phenomenology. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary. Evanston: Northwestern University Press; 1966.
  • Alfred Schutz The Phenomenology of the Social World. Evanston: Northwestern University Press;1967.

Author Information

Michael M. Kazanjian
U. S. A.

Epsilon Calculi

Epsilon Calculi are extended forms of the predicate calculus that incorporate epsilon terms. Epsilon terms are individual terms of the form ‘εxFx’, being defined for all predicates in the language. The epsilon term ‘εxFx’ denotes a chosen F, if there are any F’s, and has an arbitrary reference otherwise. Epsilon calculi were originally developed to study certain forms of arithmetic, and set theory; also to prove some important meta-theorems about the predicate calculus. Later formal developments have included a variety of intensional epsilon calculi, of use in the study of necessity, and more general intensional notions, like belief. An epsilon term such as ‘εxFx’ was originally read as ‘the first F’, and in arithmetical contexts as ‘the least F’. More generally it can be read as the demonstrative description ‘that F’, when arising either deictically, that is, in a pragmatic context where some F is being pointed at, or in linguistic cross-reference situations, as with, for example, ‘There is a red-haired man in the room. That red-haired man is Caucasian’. The application of epsilon terms to natural language shares some features with the use of iota terms within the theory of descriptions given by Bertrand Russell, but differs in formalising aspects of a slightly different theory of reference, first given by Keith Donnellan. More recently, epsilon terms have been used by a number of writers to formalise cross-sentential anaphora, which would arise if ‘that red-haired man’ in the linguistic case above was replaced with a pronoun such as ‘he’. There is then also the similar application in intensional cases, like ‘There is a red-haired man in the room. Celia believed he was a woman.’

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Descriptions and Identity
  3. Rigid Epsilon Terms
  4. The Epsilon Calculus’ Problematic
  5. The Formal Semantics of Epsilon Terms
  6. Some Metatheory
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Epsilon terms were introduced by the german mathematician David Hilbert, in Hilbert 1923, 1925, to provide explicit definitions of the existential and universal quantifiers, and resolve some problems in infinitistic mathematics. But it is not just the related formal results, and structures which are of interest. In Hilbert’s major book Grundlagen der Mathematik, which he wrote with his collaborator Paul Bernays, epsilon terms were presented as formalising certain natural language constructions, like definite descriptions. And they in fact have a considerably larger range of such applications, for instance in the symbolisation of certain cross-sentential anaphora. Hilbert and Bernays also used their epsilon calculus to prove two important meta-theorems about the predicate calculus. One theorem subsequently led, for instance, to the development of semantic tableaux: it is called the First Epsilon Theorem, and its content and proof will be given later, in section 6 below. A second theorem that Hilbert and Bernays proved, which we shall also look at then, establishes that epsilon calculi are conservative extensions of the predicate calculus, that is, that no more theorems expressible just in the quantificational language of the predicate calculus can be proved in epsilon calculi than can be proved in the predicate calculus itself. But while epsilon calculi do have these further important formal functions, we will not only be concerned to explore them, for we shall also first discuss the natural language structures upon which epsilon calculi have a considerable bearing.

The growing awareness of the larger meaning and significance of epsilon calculi has only come in stages. Hilbert and Bernays introduced epsilon terms for several meta-mathematical purposes, as above, but the extended presentation of an epsilon calculus, as a formal logic of interest in its own right, in fact only first appeared in Bourbaki’s Éléments de Mathématique (although see also Ackermann 1937-8). Bourbaki’s epsilon calculus with identity (Bourbaki, 1954, Book 1) is axiomatic, with Modus Ponens as the only primitive inference or derivation rule. Thus, in effect, we get:

(X ∨ X) → X,
X → (X ∨ Y),
(X ∨ Y) → (Y ∨ X),
(X ∨ Y) → ((Z ∨ X) → (Z ∨ Y)),
Fy → FεxFx,
x = y → (Fx ↔ Fy),
(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) → εxFx = εxGx.

This adds to a basis for the propositional calculus an epsilon axiom schema, then Leibniz’ Law, and a second epsilon axiom schema, which is a further law of identity. Bourbaki, though, used the Greek letter tau rather than epsilon to form what are now called ‘epsilon terms’; nevertheless, he defined the quantifiers in terms of his tau symbol in the manner of Hilbert and Bernays, namely:

(∃x)Fx ↔ FεxFx,
(x)Fx ↔ Fεx¬Fx;

and note that, in his system the other usual law of identity, ‘x = x’, is derivable.

The principle purpose Bourbaki found for his system of logic was in his theory of sets, although through that, in the modern manner, it thereby came to be the foundation for the rest of mathematics. Bourbaki’s theory of sets discriminates amongst predicates those which determine sets: thus some, but only some, predicates determine sets, i.e. are ‘collectivisantes’. All the main axioms of classical Set Theory are incorporated in his theory, but he does not have an Axiom of Choice as a separate axiom, since its functions are taken over by his tau symbol. The same point holds in Bernays’ epsilon version of his set theory (Bernays 1958, Ch VIII).

Epsilon calculi, during this period, were developed without any semantics, but a semantic interpretation was produced by Gunter Asser in 1957, and subsequently published in a book by A.C. Leisenring, in 1969. Even then, readings of epsilon terms in ordinary language were still uncommon. A natural language reading of epsilon terms, however, was present in Hilbert and Bernays’ work. In fact the last chapter of book 1 of the Grundlagen is a presentation of a theory of definite descriptions, and epsilon terms relate closely to this. In the more well known theory of definite descriptions by Bertrand Russell (Russell 1905) there are three clauses: with

The king of France is bald

we get, on Russell’s theory, first

there is a king of France,


there is only one king of France,

and third

anyone who is king of France is bald.

Russell uses the Greek letter iota to formalise the definite description, writing the whole


but he recognises the iota term is not a proper individual symbol. He calls it an ‘incomplete symbol’, since, because of the three parts, the whole proposition is taken to have the quantificational analysis,

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x) & (y)(Ky → By)),

which is equivalent to

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky→ y = x) & Bx).

And that means that it does not have the form ‘Bx’. Russell believed that, in addition to his iota terms, there was another class of individual terms, which he called ‘logically proper names’. These would simply fit into the ‘x’ place in ‘Bx’. He believed that ‘this’ and ‘that’ were in this class, but gave no symbolic characterisation of them.

Hilbert and Bernays, by contrast, produced what is called a ‘pre-suppositional theory’ of definite descriptions. The first two clauses of Russell’s definition were not taken to be part of the meaning of ‘The King of France is bald’: they were merely conditions under which they took it to be permitted to introduce a complete individual term for ‘the King of France’, which then satisfies

Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x).

Hilbert and Bernays continued to use the Greek letter iota in their individual term, although it has a quite different grammar from Russell’s iota term, since, when Hilbert and Bernays’ term can be introduced, it is provably equivalent to the corresponding epsilon term (Kneebone 1963, p102). In fact it was later suggested by many that epsilon terms are not only complete symbols, but can be seen as playing the same role as the ‘logically proper names’ Russell discussed.

It is at the start of book 2 of the Grundlagen that we find the definition of epsilon terms. There, Hilbert and Bernays first construct a theory of indefinite descriptions in a similar manner to their theory of definite descriptions. They allow, now, an eta term to be introduced as long as just the first of Russell’s conditions is met. That is to say, given


one can introduce the term ‘ηxFx’, and say


But the condition for the introduction of the eta term can be established logically, for certain predicates, since

(∃x)((∃y)Fy → Fx),

is a predicate calculus theorem (Copi 1973, p110). It is the eta term this theorem allows us to introduce which is otherwise called an epsilon term, and its logical basis enables entirely formal theories to be constructed, since such individual terms are invariably defined. Thus we may invariably introduce ‘ηx((∃y)Fy → Fx)’, and this is commonly written ‘εxFx’, about which we can therefore say

(∃y)Fy → FεxFx.

Since it is that F which exists if anything is F, Hilbert read the epsilon term in this case ‘the first F’. For instance, in arithmetic, ‘the first’ may be taken to be the least number operator. However, while if there are F’s then the first F is clearly some chosen one of them, if there are no F’s then ‘the first F’ must be a misnomer. And that form of speech only came to be fully understood in the theories of reference which appeared much later, when reference and denotation came to be more clearly separated from description and attribution. Donnellan (Donnellan 1966) used the example ‘the man with martini in his glass’, and pointed out that, in certain uses, this can refer to someone without martini in his glass. In the terminology Donnellan made popular, ‘the first F’, in the second case above works similarly: it cannot be attributive, and so, while it refers to something, it must refer arbitrarily, from a semantic point of view.

With reference in this way separated from attribution it becomes possible to symbolise the anaphoric cross-reference between, for instance, ‘There is one and only one king of France’ and ‘He is bald’. For, independently of whether the former is true, the ‘he’ in the latter is a pronoun for the epsilon term in the former — by a simple extension of the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier. Thus the pair of remarks may be symbolised

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x)) & Bεx(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x)).

Furthermore such cross-reference may occur in connection with intensional constructions of a kind Russell also considered, such as

George IV wondered whether the author of Waverley was Scott.

Thus we can say ‘There is an author of Waverley, and George IV wondered whether he was Scott’. But the epsilon analysis of these cases puts intensional epsilon calculi at odds with Russellian views of such constructions, as we shall see later. The Russellian approach, by not having complete symbols for individuals, tends to confuse cases in which assertions are made about individuals and cases in which assertions are made about identifying properties. As we shall see, epsilon terms enable us to make the discrimination between, for instance,

s = εx(y)(Ay ↔ y = x),

(i.e. ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’), and

(y)(Ay ↔ y = s),

(that is, ‘there is one and only one author of Waverley and he is Scott’), and so it enables us to locate more exactly the object of George IV’s thought.

2. Descriptions and Identity

When one starts to ask about the natural language meaning of epsilon terms, it is interesting that Leisenring just mentions the ‘formal superiority’ of the epsilon calculus (Leisenring 1969, p63, see also Routley 1969, Hazen 1987). Leisenring took the epsilon calculus to be a better logic than the predicate calculus, but merely because of the Second Epsilon Theorem. Its main virtue, to Leisenring, was that it could prove all that seemingly needed to be proved, but in a more elegant way. Epsilon terms were just neater at calculating which were the valid theorems of the predicate calculus.

Remembering Hilbert and Bernays’ discussion of definite and indefinite descriptions, clearly there is more to the epsilon calculus than this. And there are, in fact, two specific theorems provable within the epsilon calculus, though not the predicate calculus, which will start to indicate the epsilon calculus’ more general range of application. They concern individuals, since the epsilon calculus is distinctive in providing an appropriate, and systematic means of reference to them.

The need to have complete symbols for individuals became evident some years after Russell’s promotion of incomplete symbols for them. The first major book to allow for this was Rosser’s Logic for Mathematicians, in 1953, although there were precursors. For the classical difficulty with providing complete terms for individuals concerns what to do with ‘non-denoting’ terms, and Quine, for instance, following Frege, often gave them an arbitrary, though specific referent (Marciszewski 1981, p113). This idea is also present in Kalish and Montague (Kalish and Montague 1964, pp242-243), who gave the two rules:

(∃x)(y)(Fy ↔ y = x) ├ FιxFx,
¬(∃x)(y)(Fy ↔ y = x) ├ιxFx = ιx¬(x = x),

where ‘ιxFx’ is what otherwise might be written ‘εx(y)(Fy ↔ y = x)’. Kalish and Montague believed, however, that the second rule ‘has no intuitive counterpart, simply because ordinary language shuns improper definite descriptions’ (Kalish and Montague 1964, p244). And, at that time, what Donnellan was to publish in Donnellan 1966, about improper definite descriptions, was certainly not well known. In fact ordinary speech does not shun improper definite descriptions, although their referents are not as fixed as the above second rule requires. Indeed the very fact that the descriptions are improper means that their referents are not determined semantically: instead they are just a practical, pragmatic choice.

Stalnaker and Thomason recognised the need to be more liberal when they defined their referential terms, which also had to refer, in the contexts they were concerned with, in more than one possible world (Thomason and Stalnaker 1968, p363):

In contrast with the Russellian analysis, definite descriptions are treated as genuine singular terms; but in general they will not be substance terms [rigid designators]. An expression like ιxPx is assigned a referent which may vary from world to world. If in a given world there is a unique existing individual which has the property corresponding to P, this individual is the referent of ιxPx; otherwise, ιxPx refers to an arbitrarily chosen individual which does not exist in that world.

Stalnaker and Thomason appreciated that ‘A substance term is much like what Russell called a logically proper name’, but they said that an individual constant might or might not be a substance term, depending on whether it was more like ‘Socrates’ or ‘Miss America’ (Thomason and Stalnaker 1968, p362). A more complete investigation of identity and descriptions, in modal and general intensional contexts, was provided in Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, and Routley 1977, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, Ch 11. And with these writers we get the explicit rendering of definite descriptions in epsilon terms, as in Goddard and Routley 1973, p558, Routley 1980, p277, c.f. Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p203.

Certain specific theorems in the epsilon calculus, as was said before, support these kinds of identification. One theorem demonstrates directly the relation between Russell’s attributive, and some of Donnellan’s referential ideas. For

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x) & Gx)

is logically equivalent to

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)) & Ga,

where a = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)). This arises because the latter is equivalent to

Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a) & Ga,

which entails the former. But the former is

Fb & (y)(Fy → y = b) & Gb,

with b = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x) & Gx), and so entails

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),


Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a).

But that means that, from the uniqueness clause,

a = b,

and so


meaning the former entails the latter, and therefore the former is equivalent to the latter.

The former, of course, gives Russell’s Theory of Descriptions, in the case of ‘The F is G’; it explicitly asserts the first two clauses, to do with the existence and uniqueness of an F. A presuppositional theory, such as we saw in Hilbert and Bernays, would not explicitly assert these two clauses: on such an account they are a precondition before the term ‘the F’ can be introduced. But neither of these theories accommodate improper definite descriptions. Since Donnellan it is more common to allow that we can always use ‘the F’: if the description is improper then the referent of this term is simply found in the term’s practical use.

One detail of Donnellan’s historical account, however, must be treated with some care, at this point. Donnellan was himself concerned with definite descriptions which were improper in the sense that they did not uniquely describe what the speaker took to be their referent. So the description might still be ‘proper’ in the above sense — if there still was something to which it uniquely applied, on account of its semantic content. Thus Donnellan allowed ‘the man with martini in his glass’ to identify someone without martini in his glass irrespective of whether there was some sole man with martini in his glass. But if one talks about ‘the man with martini in his glass’ one can be correctly taken to be talking about who this describes, if it does in fact correctly describe someone — as Devitt and Bertolet pointed out in criticism of Donnellan (Devitt 1974, Bertolet 1980). It is this aspect of our language which the epsilon account matches, for an epsilon account allows definite descriptions to refer without attribution of their semantic character, but only if nothing uniquely has that semantic character. Thus it is not the whole of the first statement above , but only the third part of the second statement which makes the remark ‘The F is G’.

The difficulty with Russell’s account becomes more plain if we read the two equivalent statements using relative and personal pronouns. They then become

There is one and only one F, which is G,
There is one and only one F; it is G.

But using just the logic derived from Frege, Russell could formalise the ‘which’, but could not separate out the last clause, ‘it is G’. In that clause ‘it’ is an anaphor for ‘the (one and only) F’, and it still has this linguistic meaning if there is no such thing, since that is just a matter of grammar. But the uniqueness clause is needed for the two statements to be equivalent — without uniqueness there is no equivalence, as we shall see – so ‘which’ is not itself equivalent to ‘it’. Russell, however, because he could not separate out the ‘it’, had to take the whole of the first expression as the analysis of ‘The F is G’ — he could not formulate the needed ‘logically proper name’.

But how can something be the one and only F ‘if there is no such thing’? That is where another important theorem provable in the epsilon calculus is illuminating, namely:

(Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a)) → a = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)).

The important thing is that there is a difference between the left hand side and the right hand side, i.e. between something being alone F, and that thing being the one and only F. For the left-right implication cannot be reversed. We get from the left to the right when we see that the left as a whole entails

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),

and so also its epsilon equivalent

Fεx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)) & (z)(Fz → z = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x))).

Given Fa, then from the second clause here we get the right hand side of our original implication. But if we substitute ‘εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x))’ for ‘a’ in that implication then on the right we have something which is necessarily true. But the left hand side is then the same as

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),

and that is in general contingent. Hence the implication cannot generally be reversed. Having the property of being alone F is here contingent, but possessing the identity of the one and only F is necessary.

The distinction is not made in Russell’s logic, since possession of the relevant property is the only thing which can be formally expressed there. In Russell’s theory of descriptions, a’s possession of the property of being alone a king of France is expressed as a quasi identity

a = ιxKx,

and that has the consequence that such identities are contingent. Indeed, in counterpart theories of objects in other possible worlds the idea is pervasive that an entity may be defined in terms of its contingent properties in a given world. Hughes and Cresswell, however, differentiated between contingent identities and necessary identities in the following way (Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p191):

Now it is contingent that the man who is in fact the man who lives next door is the man who lives next door, for he might have lived somewhere else; that is living next door is a property which belongs contingently, not necessarily, to the man to whom it does belong. And similarly, it is contingent that the man who is in fact the mayor is the mayor; for someone else might have been elected instead. But if we understand [The man who lives next door is the mayor] to mean that the object which (as a matter of contingent fact) possesses the property of being the man who lives next door is identical with the object which (as a matter of contingent fact) possesses the property of being the mayor, then we are understanding it to assert that a certain object (variously described) is identical with itself, and this we need have no qualms about regarding as a necessary truth. This would give us a way of construing identity statements which makes [(x = y) → L(x = y)] perfectly acceptable: for whenever x = y is true we can take it as expressing the necessary truth that a certain object is identical with itself.

There are more consequences of this matter, however, than Hughes and Cresswell drew out. For now that we have proper referring terms for individuals to go into such expressions as ‘x = y’, we first see better where the contingency of the properties of such individuals comes from — simply the linguistic facility of using improper definite descriptions. But we also see, because identities between such terms are necessary, that proper referring terms must be rigid, i.e. have the same reference in all possible worlds.

This is not how Stalnaker and Thomason saw the matter. Stalnaker and Thomason, it will be remembered, said that there were two kinds of individual constants: ones like ‘Socrates’ which can take the place of individual variables, and others like ‘Miss America’ which cannot. The latter, as a result, they took to be non-rigid. But it is strictly ‘Miss America in year t’ which is meant in the second case, and that is not a constant expression, even though such functions can take the place of individual variables. It was Routley, Meyer and Goddard who most seriously considered the resultant possibility that all properly individual terms are rigid. At least, they worked out many of the implications of this position, even though Routley was not entirely content with it.

Routley described several rigid intensional semantics (Routley 1977, pp185-186). One of these, for instance, just took the first epsilon axiom to hold in any interpretation, and made the value of an epsilon term itself. On such a basis Routley, Meyer and Goddard derived what may be called ‘Routley’s Formula’, i.e.

L(∃x)Fx → (∃x)LFx.

In fact, on their understanding, this formula holds for any operator and any predicate, but they had in mind principally the case of necessity illustrated here, with ‘Fx’ taken as ‘x numbers the planets’, making ‘εxFx’ ‘the number of the planets’. The formula is derived quite simply, in the following way: from


we can get


by the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier, and so


by existential generalisation over the rigid term (Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, p308, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, pp197, 204). Routley, however, was still inclined to think that a rigid semantics was philosophically objectionable (Routley 1977, p186):

Rigid semantics tend to clutter up the semantics for enriched systems with ad hoc modelling conditions. More important, rigid semantics, whether substitutional or objectual, are philosophically objectionable. For one thing, they make Vulcan and Hephaestus everywhere indistinguishable though there are intensional claims that hold of one but not of the other. The standard escape from this sort of problem, that of taking proper names like ‘Vulcan’ as disguised descriptions we have already found wanting… Flexible semantics, which satisfactorily avoid these objections, impose a more objectual interpretation, since, even if [the domain] is construed as the domain of terms, [the value of a term in a world] has to be permitted, in some cases at least, to vary from world to world.

As a result, while Routley, Meyer and Goddard were still prepared to defend the formula, and say, for instance, that there was a number which necessarily numbers the planets, namely the number of the planets (np), they thought that this was only in fact the same as 9, so that one still could not argue correctly that as L(np numbers the planets), so L(9 numbers the planets). ‘For extensional identity does not warrant intersubstitutivity in intensional frames’ (Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, p309). They held, in other words that the number of the planets was only contingently 9.

This means that they denied ‘(x = y) → L(x = y)’, but, as we shall see in more detail later, there are ways to hold onto this principle, i.e. maintain the invariable necessity of identity.

3. Rigid Epsilon Terms

There is some further work which has helped us to understand how reference in modal and general intensional contexts must be rigid. But it involves some different ideas in semantics, and starts, even, outside our main area of interest, namely predicate logic, in the semantics of propositional logic.

When one thinks of ‘semantics’ one maybe thinks of the valuation of formulas. Since the 1920s a meta-study of this kind was certainly added to the previous logical interest in proof theory. Traditional proof theory is commonly associated with axiomatic procedures, but, from a modern perspective, its distinction is that it is to do with ‘object languages’. Tarski’s theory of truth relies crucially on the distinction between object languages and meta-languages, and so semantics generally seems to be necessarily a meta-discipline. In fact Tarski believed that such an elevation of our interest was forced upon us by the threat of semantic paradoxes like The Liar. If there was, by contrast, ‘semantic closure’, i.e. if truth and other semantic notions were definable at the object level, then there would be contradictions galore (c.f. Priest 1984). In this way truth may seem to be necessarily a predicate of (object-level) sentences.

But there is another way of looking at the matter which is explicitly non-Tarskian, and which others have followed (see Prior 1971, Ch 7, Sayward 1987). This involves seeing ‘it is true that’ as not a predicate, but an object-level operator, with the truth tabulations in Truth Tables, for instance, being just another form of proof procedure. Operators indeed include ‘it is provable that’, and this is distinct from Gödel’s provability predicate, as Gödel himself pointed out (Gödel 1969). Operators are intensional expressions, as in the often discussed ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is believed that’, and trying to see such forms of indirect discourse as metalinguistic predicates was very common in the middle of the last century. It was pervasive, for instance, in Quine’s many discussions of modality and intensionality. Wouldn’t someone be believing that the Morning Star is in the sky, but the Evening Star is not, if, respectively, they assented to the sentence ‘the Morning Star is in the sky’, and dissented from ‘the Evening Star is in the sky’? Anyone saying ‘yes’ is still following the Quinean tradition, but after Montague’s and Thomason’s work on operators (e.g. Montague 1963, Thomason 1977, 1980) many logicians are more persuaded that indirect discourse is not quotational. It is open to doubt, that is to say, whether we should see the mind in terms of the direct words which the subject would use.

The alternative involves seeing the words ‘the Morning Star is in the sky’ in such an indirect speech locution as ‘Quine believes that the Morning Star is in the sky’ as words merely used by the reporter, which need not directly reflect what the subject actually says. That is indeed central to reported speech — putting something into the reporter’s own words rather than just parroting them from another source. Thus a reporter may say

Celia believed that the man in the room was a woman,

but clearly that does not mean that Celia would use ‘the man in the room’ for who she was thinking about. So referential terms in the subordinate proposition are only certainly in the mouth of the reporter, and as a result only certainly refer to what the reporter means by them. It is a short step from this thought to seeing

There was a man in the room, but Celia believed that he was a woman,

as involving a transparent intensional locution, with the same object, as one might say, ‘inside’ the belief as ‘outside’ in the room. So it is here where rigid constant epsilon terms are needed, to symbolise the cross-sentential anaphor ‘he’, as in:

(∃x)(Mx & Rx) & BcWεx(Mx & Rx).

To understand the matter fully, however, we must make the shift from meta- to object language we saw at the propositional level above with truth. Routley, Meyer and Goddard realised that a rigid semantics required treating such expressions as ‘BcWx’ as simple predicates, and we must now see what this implies. They derived, as we saw before, ‘Routley’s Formula’

L(∃x)Fx → (∃x)LFx,

but we can now start to spell out how this is to be understood, if we hold to the necessity of identities, i.e. if we use ‘=’ so that

x = y → L(x = y).

Again a clear illustration of the validity of Routley’s Formula is provided by the number of the planets, but now we may respect the fact that some things may lack a number, and also the fact that referential, and attributive senses of terms may be distinguished. Thus if we write ‘(nx)Px’ for ‘there are n P’s’, then εn(ny)Py will be the number of P’s, and it is what numbers them (i.e. ([εn(ny)Py]x)Px) if they have a number (i.e. if (∃n)(nx)Px) — by the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier. Then, with ‘Fx’ as the proper (necessary) identity ‘x = εn(ny)Py’ Routley’s Formula holds because the number in question exists eternally, making both sides of the formula true. But if ‘Fn’ is simply the attributive ‘(ny)Py’ then this is not necessary, since it is contingent even, in the first place, that there is a number of P’s, instead of just some P, making both sides of the formula false.

Hughes and Cresswell argue against the principle saying (Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p144):

…let [Fx] be ‘x is the number of the planets’. Then the antecedent is true, for there must be some number which is the number of the planets (even if there were no planets at all there would still be such a number, namely 0): but the consequent is false, for since it is a contingent matter how many planets there are, there is no number which must be the number of the planets.

But this forgets continuous quantities, where there are no discrete items before the nomination of a unit. The number associated with some planetary material, for instance, numbers only arbitrary units of that material, and not the material itself. So the antecedent of Routley’s Formula is not necessarily true.

Quine also used the number of the planets in his central argument against quantification into modal contexts. He said (Quine 1960, pp195-197):

If for the sake of argument we accept the term ‘analytic’ as predicable of sentences (hence as attachable predicatively to quotations or other singular terms designating sentences), then ‘necessarily’ amounts to ‘is analytic’ plus an antecedent pair of quotation marks. For example, the sentence:

(1) Necessarily 9 > 4

is explained thus:

(2) ‘9 > 4’ is analytic…

So suppose (1) explained as in (2). Why, one may ask, should we preserve the operatorial form as of (1), and therewith modal logic, instead of just leaving matters as in (2)? An apparent advantage is the possibility of quantifying into modal positions; for we know we cannot quantify into quotation, and (2) uses quotation…

But is it more legitimate to quantify into modal positions than into quotation? For consider (1) even without regard to (2); surely, on any plausible interpretation, (1) is true and this is false:

(3) Necessarily the number of major planets > 4.

Since 9 = the number of major planets, we can conclude that the position of ‘9’ in (1) is not purely referential and hence that the necessity operator is opaque.

But here Quine does not separate out the referential ‘the number of the major planets is greater than 4’, i.e. ‘εn(ny)Py > 4’, from the attributive ‘There are more than 4 major planets’, i.e. ‘(∃n)((ny)Py & n > 4)’. If 9 = εn(ny)Py, then it follows that εn(ny)Py > 4, but it does not follow that (∃n)((ny)Py & n > 4). Substitution of identicals in (1), therefore, does yield (3), even though it is not necessary that there are more than 4 major planets.

We can now go into some details of how one gets the ‘x’ in such a form as ‘LFx’ to be open for quantification. For, what one finds in traditional modal semantics (see Hughes and Cresswell 1968, passim) are formulas in the meta-linguistic style, like

V(Fx, i) = 1,

which say that the valuation put on ‘Fx’ is 1, in world i. There should be quotation marks around the ‘Fx’ in such a formula, to make it meta-linguistic, but by convention they are generally omitted. To effect the change to the non-meta-linguistic point of view, we must simply read this formula as it literally is, so that the ‘Fx’ is in indirect speech rather than direct speech, and the whole becomes the operator form ‘it would be true in world i that Fx’. In this way, the term ‘x’ gets into the language of the reporter, and the meta/object distinction is not relevant. Any variable inside the subordinate proposition can now be quantified over, just like a variable outside it, which means there is ‘quantifying in’, and indeed all the normal predicate logic operations apply, since all individual terms are rigid.

A example illustrating this rigidity involves the actual top card in a pack, and the cards which might have been top card in other circumstances (see Slater 1988a). If the actual top card is the Ace of Spades, and it is supposed that the top card is the Queen of Hearts, then clearly what would have to be true for those circumstances to obtain would be for the Ace of Spades to be the Queen of Hearts. The Ace of Spades is not in fact the Queen of Hearts, but that does not mean they cannot be identical in other worlds (c.f. Hughes and Cresswell, 1968, p190). Certainly if there were several cards people variously thought were on top, those cards in the various supposed circumstances would not provide a constant c such that Fc is true in all worlds. But that is because those cards are functions of the imagined worlds — the card a believes is top (εxBaFx) need not be the card b believes is top (εxBbFx), etc. It still remains that there is a constant, c, such that Fc is true in all worlds. Moreover, that c is not an ‘intensional object’, for the given Ace of Spades is a plain and solid extensional object, the actual top card (εxFx).

Routley, Meyer and Goddard did not accept the latter point, wanting a rigid semantics in terms of ‘intensional objects’ (Goddard and Routley, 1973, p561, Routley, Meyer and Goddard, 1974, p309, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p197). Stalnaker and Thomason accepted that certain referential terms could be functional, when discriminating ‘Socrates’ from ‘Miss America’ — although the functionality of ‘Miss America in year t’ is significantly different from that of ‘the top card in y’s belief’. For if this year’s Miss America is last year’s Miss America, still it is only one thing which is identical with itself, unlike with the two cards. Also, there is nothing which can force this year’s Miss America to be last year’s different Miss America, in the way that the counterfactuality of the situation with the playing cards forces two non-identical things in the actual world to be the same thing in the other possible world. Other possible worlds are thus significantly different from other times, and so, arguably, other possible worlds should not be seen from the Realist perspective appropriate for other times — or other spaces.

4. The Epsilon Calculus’ Problematic

It might be said that Realism has delayed a proper logical understanding of many of these things. If you look ‘realistically’ at picturesque remarks like that made before, namely ‘the same object is ‘inside’ the belief as ‘outside’ in the room’, then it is easy for inappropriate views about the mind to start to interfere, and make it seem that the same object cannot be in these two places at once. But if the mind were something like another space or time, then counterfactuality could get no proper purchase — no one could be ‘wrong’, since they would only be talking about elements in their ‘world’, not any objective, common world. But really, all that is going on when one says, for instance,

There was a man in the room, but Celia believed he was a woman,

is that the same term — or one term and a pronominal surrogate for it — appears at two linguistic places in some discourse, with the same reference. Hence there is no grammatical difference between the cross reference in such an intensional case and the cross reference in a non-intensional case, such as

There was a man in the room. He was hungry.


(∃x)Mx & HεxMx.

What has been difficult has merely been getting a symbolisation of the cross-reference in this more elementary kind of case. But it just involves extending the epsilon definition of existential statements, using a reiteration of the substituted epsilon term, as we can see.

It is now widely recognised how the epsilon calculus allows us to do this (Purdy 1994, Egli and von Heusinger 1995, Meyer Viol 1995, Ch 6), the theoretical starting point being the theorem about the Russellian theory of definite descriptions proved before, which breaks up what otherwise would be a single sentence into a sequential piece of discourse, enabling the existence and uniqueness clauses to be put in one sentence while the characterising remark is in another. The relationship starts to matter when, in fact, there is no obvious way to formulate a combination of anaphoric remarks in the predicate calculus, as in, for instance,

There is a king of France. He is bald,

where there is no uniqueness clause. This difficulty became a major problem when logicians started to consider anaphoric reference in the 1960s.

Geach, for instance, in Geach 1962, even believed there could not be a syllogism of the following kind (Geach 1962, p126):

A man has just drunk a pint of sulphuric acid.
Nobody who drinks a pint of sulphuric acid lives through the day.
So, he won’t live through the day.

He said, one could only draw the conclusion:

Some man who has just drunk a pint of sulphuric acid won’t live through the day.

Certainly one can only derive

(∃x)(Mx & Dx & ¬Lx)


(∃x)(Mx & Dx),


(x)(Dx → ¬Lx),

within predicate logic. But one can still derive

¬Lεx(Mx & Dx),

within the epsilon calculus.

Geach likewise was foxed later when he produced his famous case (numbered 3 in Geach 1967):

Hob thinks a witch has blighted Bob’s mare, and Nob wonders whether she (the same witch) killed Cob’s sow,

which is, in epsilon terms

Th(∃x)(Wx & Bxb) & OnKεx(Wx & Bxb)c.

For Geach saw that this could not be (4)

(∃x)(Wx & ThBxb & OnKxc),

or (5)

(∃x)(Th(Wx & Bxb)& OnKxc).

But also a reading of the second clause as (c.f. 18)

Nob wonders whether the witch who blighted Bob’s mare killed Cob’s sow,

in which ‘the witch who blighted Bob’s mare killed Cob’s sow’ is analysed in the Russellian manner, i.e. as (20)

just one witch blighted Bob’s mare and she killed Cob’s sow,

Geach realised does not catch the specific cross-reference — amongst other things because of the uniqueness condition which is then introduced.

This difficulty with the uniqueness clause in Russellian analyses has been widely commented on, although a recent theorist, Neale, has said that Russell’s theory only needs to be modestly modified: Neale’s main idea is that, in general, definite descriptions should just be localised to the context. His resolution of Geach’s troubling cases thus involves suggesting that ‘she’, in the above, might simply be ‘the witch we have been hearing about’ (Neale 1990, p221). Neale might here have said ‘that witch who blighted Bob’s mare’, showing that an Hilbertian account of demonstrative descriptions would have a parallel effect.

A good deal of the ground breaking work on these matters, however, was done by someone again much influenced by Russell: Evans. But Evans significantly broke with Russell over uniqueness (Evans 1977, pp516-517):

One does not want to be committed, by this way of telling the story, to the existence of a day on which just one man and boy walked along a road. It was with this possibility in mind that I stated the requirement for the appropriate use of an E-type pronoun in terms of having answered, or being prepared to answer upon demand, the question ‘He? Who?’ or ‘It? Which?’ In order to effect this liberalisation we should allow the reference of the E-type pronoun to be fixed not only by predicative material explicitly in the antecedent clause, but also by material which the speaker supplies upon demand. This ruling has the effect of making the truth conditions of such remarks somewhat indeterminate; a determinate proposition will have been put forward only when the demand has been made and the material supplied.

It was Evans who gave us the title ‘E-type pronoun’ for the ‘he’ in such expressions as

A Cambridge philosopher smoked a pipe, and he drank a lot of whisky,

i.e., in epsilon terms,

(∃x)(Cx & Px) & Dεx(Cx & Px).

He also insisted (Evans 1977, p516) that what was unique about such pronouns was that this conjunction of statements was not equivalent to

A Cambridge philosopher, who smoked a pipe, drank a lot of whisky,


(∃x)(Cx & Px & Dx).

Clearly the epsilon account is entirely in line with this, since it illustrates the point made before about cases without a uniqueness clause. Only the second expression, which contains a relative pronoun, is formalisable in the predicate calculus. To formalise the first expression, which contains a personal pronoun, one at least needs something with the expressive capabilities of the epsilon calculus.

5. The Formal Semantics of Epsilon Terms

The semantics of epsilon terms is nowadays more general, but the first interpretations of epsilon terms were restricted to arithmetical cases, and specifically took epsilon to be the least number operator. Hilbert and Bernays developed Arithmetic using the epsilon calculus, using the further epsilon axiom schema (Hilbert and Bernays 1970, Book 2, p85f, c.f. Leisenring 1969, p92) :

(εxAx = st) → ¬At,

where ‘s’ is intended to be the successor function, and ‘t’ is any numeral. This constrains the interpretation of the epsilon symbol, but the least number interpretation is not strictly forced, since the axiom only ensures that no number having the property A immediately precedes εxAx.

The new axiom, however, is sufficient to prove mathematical induction, in the form:

(A0 & (x)(Ax → Asx)) → (x)Ax.

For assume the reverse, namely

A0 & (x)(Ax → Asx) & ¬(x)Ax,

and consider what happens when the term ‘εx¬Ax’ is substituted in

t = 0 ∨ t = sn,

which is derivable from the other axioms of number theory which Hilbert and Bernays are using. If we had

εx¬Ax = 0,

then, since it is given that A0, then we would have Aεx¬Ax. But since, by the definition of the universal quantifier,

Aεx¬Ax ↔ (x)Ax,

we know, because ¬(x)Ax is also given, that ¬Aεx¬Ax, which means we cannot have εx¬Ax = 0. Hence we must have the other alternative, i.e.

εx¬Ax = sn,

for some n. But from the new axiom

(εx¬Ax = sn) → An,

hence we must have An, although we must also have

An → Asn,

because (x)(Ax → Asx). All together that requires Aεx¬Ax again, which is impossible. Hence the further epsilon axiom is sufficient to establish the given principle of induction.

The more general link between epsilon terms and choice functions was first set out by Asser, although Asser’s semantics for an elementary epsilon calculus without the second epsilon axiom makes epsilon terms denote rather complex choice functions. Wilfrid Meyer Viol, calling an epsilon calculus without the second axiom an ‘intensional’ epsilon calculus, makes the epsilon terms in such a calculus instead name Skolem functions. Skolem functions are also called Herbrand functions, although they arise in a different way, namely in Skolem’s Theorem. Skolem’s Theorem states that, if a formula in prenex normal form is provable in the predicate calculus, then a certain corresponding formula, with the existential quantifiers removed, is provable in a predicate calculus enriched with function symbols. The functions symbolised are called Skolem functions, although, in another context, they would be Herbrand functions.

Skolem’s Theorem is a meta-logical theorem, about the relation between two logical calculi, but a non-metalogical version is in fact provable in the epsilon calculus from which Skolem’s actual theorem follows, since, for example, we can get, by the epsilon definition, now of the existential quantifier

(x)(∃y)Fxy ↔ (x)FxεyFxy.

As a result, if the left hand side of such an equivalence is provable in an epsilon calculus the right hand side is provable there. But the left hand side is provable in an epsilon calculus if it is provable in the predicate calculus, by the Second Epsilon Theorem; and if the right hand side is provable in an epsilon calculus it is provable in a predicate calculus enriched with certain function symbols — epsilon terms, like ‘εyFxy’. So, by generalisation, we get Skolem’s original result.

When we add to an intensional epsilon calculus the second epsilon axiom

(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) →εxFx = εxGx,

the interpretation of epsilon terms is commonly extensional, i.e. in terms of sets, since two predicates ‘F’ and ‘G’ satisfying the antecedent of this second axiom will determine the same set — if they determine sets at all, that is. For that requires the predicates to be collectivisantes, in Bourbaki’s terms, as with explicit set membership statements, like ‘x ∈ y’. In such a case the epsilon term ‘εx(x ∈ y)’ designates a choice function, i.e. a function which selects one from a given set (c.f. Leisenring 1969, p19, Meyer Viol 1995, p42). In the case where there are no members of the set the selection is arbitrary, although for all empty sets it is invariably the same. Thus the second axiom validates, for example, Kalish and Montague’s rule for this case, which they put in the form

εxFx = εx¬(x = x).

Kalish and Montague in fact prove a version of the second epsilon axiom in their system (Kalish and Montague 1964, see T407, p256). The second axiom also holds in Hermes’ system (Hermes 1965), although there one in addition finds a third epsilon axiom,

εx¬(x = x) = εx(x = x),

for which there would seem to be no real justification.

But the second epsilon axiom itself is curious. One questionable thing about it is that both Leisenring and Meyer Viol do not state that the predicates in question must determine sets before their choice function semantics can apply. That the predicates are collectivisantes is merely presumed in their theories, since ‘εxBx’ is invariably modelled by means of a choice from the presumed set of things which in the model are B. Certainly there is a special clause dealing with the empty set; but there is no consideration of the case where some things are B although those things are not discrete, as with the things which are red, for instance. If the predicate in question is not a count noun then there is no set of things involved, since with mass terms, and continuous quantities there are no given elements to be counted (c.f. Bunt 1985, pp262-263 in particular). Of course numbers can still be associated with them, but only given an arbitrary unit. With the cows in a field, for instance, we can associate a determinate number, but with the beef there we cannot, unless we consider, say, the number of pounds of it.

The point, as we saw before, has a formalisation in epsilon terms. Thus if we write ‘(nx)Fx’, for ‘there are n F’s’, then εn(ny)Fy will be the number of F’s, and it is what numbers them if they have a number. But in the reverse case the previously mentioned arbitrariness of the epsilon term comes in. For if ¬(∃n)(nx)Fx, then ¬([εn(ny)Fy]x)Fx, and so, although an arbitrary number exists, it does not number the F’s. In that case, in other words, we do not have a number of F’s, merely some F.

In fact, even when there is a set of things, the second epsilon axiom, as stated above, does not apply in general, since there are intensional differences between properties to consider, as in, for instance ‘There is a red-haired man, and a Caucasian in the room, and they are different’. Here, if there were only red-haired Caucasians in the room, then with the above second axiom, we could not find epsilon substitutions to differentiate the two individuals involved. This may remind us that it is necessary co-extensionality, and not just contingent co-extensionality which is the normal criterion for the identity of properties (c.f. Hughes and Cresswell 1968, pp209-210). So it leads us to see the appropriateness of a modalised second axiom, which uses just an intensional version of the antecedent of the previous second epsilon axiom, in which ‘L’ means ‘it is necessary that’, namely:

L(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) →εxFx = εxGx.

For with this axiom only the co-extensionalities which are necessary will produce identities between the associated epsilon terms. We can only get, for instance,

εxPx = εx(Px ∨ Px),


εxFx = εyFy,

and all other identities derivable in a similar way.

However, the original second epsilon axiom is then provable, in the special case where the predicates express set membership. For if necessarily

(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) ↔ y = z,

while necessarily

y = z ↔ L(y = z),

(see Hughes and Cresswell, 1968, p190) then

L(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) ↔ (x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z),

and so, from the modalised second axiom we can get

(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) →εx(x ∈ y) = εx(x ∈ z).

Note, however, that if one only has contingently

(x)(Fx ↔ x ∈ z),

then one cannot get, on this basis,

εxFx = εx(x ∈ z).

But this is something which is desirable, as well. For we have seen that it is contingent that the number of the planets does number the planets — because it is not necessary that ([εn(ny)Py]x)Px. This makes ‘(9x)Px’ contingent, even though the identity ‘9 = εn(nx)Px’ remains necessary. But also it is contingent that there is the set of planets, p, which there is, since while, say,

(x)(x ∈ p ↔ Px),


εn(nx)(x ∈ p) = εn(nx)Px = 9,

it is still possible that, in some other possible world,

(x)(x ∈ p’ ↔ Px),

with p’ the set of planets there, and

¬(εn(nx)(x ∈ p’) = 9).

We could not have this further contingency, however, if the original second epsilon axiom held universally.

It is on this fuller basis that we can continue to hold ‘x = y → L(x = y)’, i.e. the invariable necessity of identity — one merely distinguishes ‘(9x)Px’ from ‘9 = εx(nx)Px’, and from ‘9 = εx(nx)(x ∈ p)’, as above.

Adding the original second epsilon axiom to an intensional epsilon calculus is therefore acceptable only if all the predicates are about set membership. This is not an uncommon assumption, indeed it is pervasive in the usually given semantics for predicate logic, for instance. But if, by contrast, we want to allow for the fact that not all predicates are collectivisantes then we should take just the first epsilon axiom with merely a modalised version of the second epsilon axiom. The interpretation of epsilon terms is then always in terms of Skolem functions, although if we are dealing with the membership of sets, those Skolem functions naturally are choice functions.

6. Some Metatheory

To finish we shall briefly look, as promised, at some meta-theory.

The epsilon calculi that were first described were not very convenient to use, and Hilbert and Bernays’ proofs of the First and Second Epsilon Theorems were very complex. This was because the presentation was axiomatic, however, and with the development of other means of presenting the same logics we get more readily available meta-logical results. I will indicate some of the early difficulties before showing how these theorems can be proved, nowadays, much more simply.

The problem with proving the Second Epsilon Theorem, on an axiomatic basis, is that complex, and non-constant epsilon terms may enter a proof in the epsilon calculus by means of substitutions into the axioms. What has to be proved is that an epsilon calculus proof of an epsilon-free theorem (i.e. one which can be expressed just in predicate calculus language) can be replaced by a predicate calculus proof. So some analysis of complex epsilon terms is required, to show that they can be eliminated in the relevant cases, leaving only constant epsilon terms, which are sufficiently similar to the individual symbols in standard predicate logic. Hilbert and Bernays (Hilbert and Bernays 1970, Book 2, p23f) say that one epsilon term ‘εxFx’ is subordinate to another ‘εyGy’ if and only if ‘G’ contains ‘εxFx’, and a free occurrence of the variable ‘y’ lies within ‘εxFx’. For instance ‘εxRxy’ is a complex, and non-constant epsilon term, which is subordinate to ‘εySyεxRyx’. Hilbert and Bernays then define the rank of an epsilon term to be 1 if there are no epsilon terms subordinate to it, and otherwise to be one greater than the maximal rank of the epsilon terms which are subordinate to it. Using the same general ideas, Leisenring proves two theorems (Leisenring 1969, p72f). First he proves a rank reduction theorem, which shows that epsilon proofs of epsilon-free formulas in which the second epsilon axiom is not used, but in which every term is of rank less than or equal to r, may be replaced by epsilon proofs in which every term is of rank less than or equal to r – 1. Then he proves the eliminability of the second epsilon axiom in proofs of epsilon-free formulas. Together, these two theorems show that if there is an epsilon proof of an epsilon-free formula, then there is such a proof not using the second epsilon axiom, and in which all epsilon terms have rank just 1. Even though such epsilon terms might still contain free variables, if one replaces those that do with a fixed symbol ‘a’ (starting with those of maximal length) that reduces the proof to one in what is called the ‘epsilon star’ system, in which there are only constant epsilon terms (Leisenring 1969, p66f). Leisenring shows that proofs in the epsilon star system can be turned into proofs in the predicate calculus, by replacing the epsilon terms by individual symbols.

But, as was said before, there is now available a much shorter proof of the Second Epsilon Theorem. In fact there are several, but I shall just indicate one, which arises simply by modifying the predicate calculus truth trees, as found in, for instance, Jeffrey (see Jeffrey 1967). Jeffrey uses the standard propositional truth tree rules, together with the rules of quantifier interchange, which remain unaffected, and which are not material to the present purpose. He also has, however, a rule of existential quantifier elimination,

(∃x)Fx ├ Fa,

in which ‘a’ must be new, and a rule of universal quantifier elimination

(x)Fx ├ Fb,

in which ‘b’ must be old — unless no other individual terms are available. By reducing closed formulas of the form ‘P & ¬C’ to absurdity Jeffrey can then prove ‘P → C’, and validate ‘P ├ C’ in his calculus. But clearly, upon adding epsilon terms to the language, the first of these rules must be changed to

(∃x)Fx ├ FεxFx,

while also the second rule can be replaced by the pair

(x)Fx ├ Fεx¬Fx,
Fεx¬Fx ├ Fa,

(where ‘a’ is old) to produce an appropriate proof procedure. Steen reads ‘εx¬Fx’ as ‘the most un-F-like thing’ (Steen 1972, p162), which explains why Fεx¬Fx entails Fa, since if the most un-F-like thing is in fact F, then the most plausible counter-example to the generalisation is in fact not so, making the generalisation exceptionless. But there is a more important reason why the rule of universal quantifier elimination is best broken up into two parts.

For Jeffrey’s rules only allow him ‘limited upward correctness’ (Jeffrey 1967, p167), since Jeffrey has to say, with respect to his universal quantifier elimination rule, that the range of the quantification there be limited merely to the universe of discourse of the path below. This is because, if an initial sentence is false in a valuation so also must be one of its conclusions. But the first epsilon rule which replaces Jeffrey’s rule ensures, instead, that there is ‘total upwards correctness’. For if it is false that everything is F then, without any special interpretation of the quantifier, one of the given consequences of the universal statement is false, namely the immediate one — since Fεx¬Fx is in fact equivalent to (x)Fx. A similar improvement also arises with the existential quantifier elimination rule. For Jeffrey can only get ‘limited downwards correctness’, with his existential quantifier elimination rule (Jeffrey 1967, p165), since it is not an entailment. In fact, in order to show that if an initial sentence is true in a valuation so is one of its conclusions, in this case, Jeffrey has to stretch his notion of ‘truth’ to being true either in the given valuation, or some nominal variant of it.

The epsilon rule which replaces Jeffrey’s overcomes this difficulty by not employing names, only demonstrative descriptions, and by being, as a result, totally downward correct. For if there is an F then that F is F, whatever name is used to refer to it. The epsilon calculus terminology thus precedes any naming: it gets hold of the more primitive, demonstrative way we have of referring to objects, using phrases like ‘that F’. Thus in explication of the predicate calculus rule we might well have said

suppose there is an F, well, call that F ‘a’, then Fa,

but that requires we understand ‘that F’ before we come to use ‘a’.

So how does the Second Epsilon Theorem follow? This theorem, as before, states that an epsilon calculus proof of an epsilon-free theorem may be replaced by a predicate calculus proof of the same formula. But the transformation required in the present setting is now evident: simply change to new names all epsilon terms introduced in the epsilon calculus quantifier elimination rules. This covers both the new names in Jeffrey’s first rule, but also the odd case where there are no old names in Jeffrey’s second rule. The epsilon calculus proofs invariably use constant epsilon terms, and are thus effectively in Leisenring’s epsilon star system.

Epsilon terms which are non-constant, however, crucially enter the proof of the First Epsilon Theorem. The First Epsilon Theorem states that if C is a provable predicate calculus formula, in prenex normal form, i.e. with all quantifiers at the front, then a finite disjunction of instances of C’s matrix is provable in the epsilon calculus. The crucial fact is that the epsilon calculus gives us access to Herbrand functions, which arise when universal quantifiers are eliminated from formulas using their epsilon definition. Thus


for instance, is equivalent to


and so


and the resulting epsilon term ‘εxFyx’ is a Herbrand function.

Using such reductions, all universal quantifiers can evidently be removed from formulas in prenex normal form, and the additional fact that, in a certain specific way, the remaining existential quantifiers are disjunctions makes all predicate calculus formulas equivalent to disjunctions. Remember that a formula is provable if its negation is reducible to absurdity, which means that its truth tree must close. But, by König’s Lemma, if there is no open path through a truth tree then there is some finite stage at which there is no open path, so, in the case above, for instance, if no valuation makes the last formula’s negation true, then the tree of the instances of that negative statement must close in a finite length. But the negative statement is the universal formula


by the rules of quantifier interchange, so a finite conjunction of instances of the matrix of this universal formula, namely Fyx, must reduce to absurdity. For the rules of universal quantifier elimination only produce consequences with the form of this matrix. By de Morgan’s Laws, that makes necessary a finite disjunction of instances of ¬Fyx. By generalisation we thus get the First Epsilon Theorem.

The epsilon calculus, however, can take us further than the First Epsilon Theorem. Indeed, one has to take care with the impression this theorem may give that existential statements are just equivalent to disjunctions. If that were the case, then existential statements would be unlike individual statements, saying not that one specified thing has a certain property, but merely that one of a certain group of things has a certain property. The group in question is normally called the ‘domain’ of the quantification, and this, it seems, has to be specified when setting out the semantics of quantifiers. But study of the epsilon calculus shows that there is no need for such ‘domains’, or indeed for such semantics. This is because the example above, for instance, is also equivalent to


where a = εy¬FεxFyx. So the previous disjunction of instances of ¬Fyx is in fact only true because this specific disjunct is true. The First Epsilon Theorem, it must be remembered, does not prove that an existential statement is equivalent to a certain disjunction; it shows merely that an existential statement is provable if and only if a certain disjunction is provable. And what is also provable, in such a case, is a statement merely about one object. Indeed the existential statement is provably equivalent to it. It is this fact which supports the epsilon definition of the quantifiers; and it is what permits anaphoric reference to the same object by means of the same epsilon term. An existential statement is thus just another statement about an individual — merely a nameless one.

The reverse point goes for the universal quantifier: a universal statement is not the conjunction of its instances, even though it implies them. A generalisation is simply equivalent to one of its instances — to the one involving the prime putative exception to it, as we have seen. Not being able to specify that prime putative exception leaves Jeffrey saying that if a generalisation is false then one of its instances is false without any way of ensuring that that instance has been drawn as a conclusion below it in the truth tree except by limiting the interpretation of the generalisation just to the universe of discourse of the path. It thus seems necessary, within the predicate calculus, that there be a ‘model’ for the quantifiers which restricts them to a certain ‘domain’, which means that they do not necessarily range over everything. But in the epsilon calculus the quantifiers do, invariably, range over everything, and so there is no need to specify their range.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ackermann, W. 1937-8, ‘Mengentheoretische Begründung der Logik’, Mathematische Annalen, 115, 1-22.
  • Asser, G. 1957, ‘Theorie der Logischen Auswahlfunktionen’, Zeitschrift für Mathematische Logik und Grundlagen der Mathematik, 3, 30-68.
  • Bernays, P. 1958, Axiomatic Set Theory, North Holland, Dordrecht.
  • Bertolet, R. 1980, ‘The Semantic Significance of Donnellan’s Distinction’, Philosophical Studies, 37, 281-288.
  • Bourbaki, N. 1954, Éléments de Mathématique, Hermann, Paris.
  • Bunt, H.C. 1985, Mass Terms and Model-Theoretic Semantics, C.U.P., Cambridge.
  • Church, A. 1940, ‘A Formulation of the Simple Theory of Types’, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 5, 56-68.
  • Copi, I. 1973, Symbolic Logic, 4th ed. Macmillan, New York.
  • Devitt, M. 1974, ‘Singular Terms’, The Journal of Philosophy, 71, 183-205.
  • Donnellan, K. 1966, ‘Reference and Definite Descriptions’, Philosophical Review, 75, 281-304.
  • Egli, U. and von Heusinger, K. 1995, ‘The Epsilon Operator and E-Type Pronouns’ in U. Egli et al. (eds.), Lexical Knowledge in the Organisation of Language, Benjamins, Amsterdam.
  • Evans, G. 1977, ‘Pronouns, Quantifiers and Relative Clauses’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 7, 467-536.
  • Geach, P.T. 1962, Reference and Generality, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
  • Geach, P.T. 1967, ‘Intentional Identity’, The Journal of Philosophy, 64, 627-632.
  • Goddard, L. and Routley, R. 1973, The Logic of Significance and Context, Scottish Academic Press, Aberdeen.
  • Gödel, K. 1969, ‘An Interpretation of the Intuitionistic Sentential Calculus’, in J. Hintikka (ed.), The Philosophy of Mathematics, O.U.P. Oxford.
  • Hazen, A. 1987, ‘Natural Deduction and Hilbert’s ε-operator’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 16, 411-421.
  • Hermes, H. 1965, Eine Termlogik mit Auswahloperator, Springer Verlag, Berlin.
  • Hilbert, D. 1923, ‘Die Logischen Grundlagen der Mathematik’, Mathematische Annalen, 88, 151-165.
  • Hilbert, D. 1925, ‘On the Infinite’ in J. van Heijenhoort (ed.), From Frege to Gödel, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
  • Hilbert, D. and Bernays, P. 1970, Grundlagen der Mathematik, 2nd ed., Springer, Berlin.
  • Hughes, G.E. and Cresswell, M.J. 1968, An Introduction to Modal Logic, Methuen, London.
  • Jeffrey, R. 1967, Formal Logic: Its Scope and Limits, 1st Ed. McGraw-Hill, New York.
  • Kalish, D. and Montague, R. 1964, Logic: Techniques of Formal Reasoning, Harcourt, Brace and World, Inc, New York.
  • Kneebone, G.T. 1963, Mathematical Logic and the Foundations of Mathematics, Van Nostrand, Dordrecht.
  • Leisenring, A.C. 1969, Mathematical Logic and Hilbert’s ε-symbol, Macdonald, London.
  • Marciszewski, W. 1981, Dictionary of Logic, Martinus Nijhoff, The Hague.
  • Meyer Viol, W.P.M. 1995, Instantial Logic, ILLC Dissertation Series 1995-11, Amsterdam.
  • Montague, R. 1963, ‘Syntactical Treatments of Modality, with Corollaries on Reflection Principles and Finite Axiomatisability’, Acta Philosophica Fennica, 16, 155-167.
  • Neale, S. 1990, Descriptions, MIT Press, Cambridge MA.
  • Priest, G.G. 1984, ‘Semantic Closure’, Studia Logica, XLIII 1/2, 117-129.
  • Prior, A.N., 1971, Objects of Thought, O.U.P. Oxford.
  • Purdy, W.C. 1994, ‘A Variable-Free Logic for Anaphora’ in P. Humphreys (ed.) Patrick Suppes: Scientific Philosopher, Vol 3, Kluwer, Dordrecht, 41-70.
  • Quine, W.V.O. 1960, Word and Object, Wiley, New York.
  • Rasiowa, H. 1956, ‘On the ε-theorems’, Fundamenta Mathematicae, 43, 156-165.
  • Rosser, J. B. 1953, Logic for Mathematicians, McGraw-Hill, New York.
  • Routley, R. 1969, ‘A Simple Natural Deduction System’, Logique et Analyse, 12, 129-152.
  • Routley, R. 1977, ‘Choice and Descriptions in Enriched Intensional Languages II, and III’, in E. Morscher, J. Czermak, and P. Weingartner (eds), Problems in Logic and Ontology, Akademische Druck und Velagsanstalt, Graz.
  • Routley, R. 1980, Exploring Meinong’s Jungle, Departmental Monograph #3, Philosophy Department, R.S.S.S., A.N.U. Canberra.
  • Routley, R., Meyer, R. and Goddard, L. 1974, ‘Choice and Descriptions in Enriched Intensional Languages I’, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 3, 291-316.
  • Russell, B. 1905, ‘On Denoting’ Mind, 14, 479-493.
  • Sayward, C. 1987, ‘Prior’s Theory of Truth’ Analysis, 47, 83-87.
  • Slater, B.H. 1986(a), ‘E-type Pronouns and ε-terms’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 16, 27-38.
  • Slater, B.H. 1986(b), ‘Prior’s Analytic’, Analysis, 46, 76-81.
  • Slater, B.H. 1988(a), ‘Intensional Identities’, Logique et Analyse, 121-2, 93-107.
  • Slater, B.H. 1988(b), ‘Hilbertian Reference’, Noûs, 22, 283-97.
  • Slater, B.H. 1989(a), ‘Modal Semantics’, Logique et Analyse, 127-8, 195-209.
  • Slater, B.H. 1990, ‘Using Hilbert’s Calculus’, Logique et Analyse, 129-130, 45-67.
  • Slater, B.H. 1992(a), ‘Routley’s Formulation of Transparency’, History and Philosophy of Logic, 13, 215-24.
  • Slater, B.H. 1994(a), ‘The Epsilon Calculus’ Problematic’, Philosophical Papers, XXIII, 217-42.
  • Steen, S.W.P. 1972, Mathematical Logic, C.U.P. Cambridge.
  • Thomason, R. 1977, ‘Indirect Discourse is not Quotational’, Monist, 60, 340-354.
  • Thomason, R. 1980, ‘A Note on Syntactical Treatments of Modality’, Synthese, 44, 391-395.
  • Thomason, R.H. and Stalnaker, R.C. 1968, ‘Modality and Reference’, Noûs, 2, 359-372.

Author Information

Barry Hartley Slater
University of Western Australia

Epicurus (341—271 B.C.E.)

epicurus2Epicurus is one of the major philosophers in the Hellenistic period, the three centuries following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 B.C.E. (and of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.). Epicurus developed an unsparingly materialistic metaphysics, empiricist epistemology, and hedonistic ethics. Epicurus taught that the basic constituents of the world are atoms, uncuttable bits of matter, flying through empty space, and he tried to explain all natural phenomena in atomic terms. Epicurus rejected the existence of Platonic forms and an immaterial soul, and he said that the gods have no influence on our lives. Epicurus also thought skepticism was untenable, and that we could gain knowledge of the world relying upon the senses. He taught that the point of all one’s actions was to attain pleasure (conceived of as tranquility) for oneself, and that this could be done by limiting one’s desires and by banishing the fear of the gods and of death. Epicurus’ gospel of freedom from fear proved to be quite popular, and communities of Epicureans flourished for centuries after his death.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Sources
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void
    2. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe
    3. Differences from Democritus
      1. Weight
      2. The Swerve
      3. Sensible Qualities
    4. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena
    5. The Gods
    6. Philosophy of Mind
    7. Perception
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Canon: Sensations, Preconceptions, and Feelings
    2. Anti-skeptical Arguments
      1. The “Lazy Argument”
      2. The Self-refutation Argument
      3. The Argument from Concept-formation
  5. Ethics
    1. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical
    2. Types of Pleasure
    3. Types of Desire
    4. The Virtues
    5. Justice
    6. Friendship
    7. Death
      1. The No Subject of Harm Argument
      2. The Symmetry Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collections of Primary Sources
    2. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus’ Philosophy

1. Life

Epicurus was born around 341 B.C.E., seven years after Plato’s death, and grew up in the Athenian colony of Samos, an island in the Mediterranean Sea. He was about 19 when Aristotle died, and he studied philosophy under followers of Democritus and Plato. Epicurus founded his first philosophical schools in Mytilene and Lampsacus, before moving to Athens around 306 B.C.E. There Epicurus founded the Garden, a combination of philosophical community and school. The residents of the Garden put Epicurus’ teachings into practice. Epicurus died from kidney stones around 271 or 270 B.C.E.

After Epicurus’ death, Epicureanism continued to flourish as a philosophical movement. Communities of Epicureans sprang up throughout the Hellenistic world; along with Stoicism, it was one of the major philosophical schools competing for people’s allegiances. Epicureanism went into decline with the rise of Christianity. Certain aspects of Epicurus’ thought were revived during the Renaissance and early modern periods, when reaction against scholastic neo-Aristotelianism led thinkers to turn to mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena.

2. Sources

Epicurus was a voluminous writer, but almost none of his own work survives. A likely reason for this is that Christian authorities found his ideas ungodly. Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century CE , wrote a 10-book Lives of the Philosophers, which includes three of Epicurus’ letters in its recounting of the life and teachings of Epicurus. These three letters are brief summaries of major areas of Epicurus’ philosophy: the Letter to Herodotus, which summarizes his metaphysics, the Letter to Pythocles, which gives atomic explanations for meteorological phenomena, and the Letter to Menoeceus, which summarizes his ethics. It also includes the Principal Doctrines, 40 sayings which deal mainly with ethical matters.

Because of the absence of Epicurus’ own writings, we have to rely on later writers to reconstruct Epicurus’ thought. Two of our most important sources are the Roman poet Lucretius (c. 94-55 B.C.E.) and the Roman politician Cicero (106-43 B.C.E.). Lucretius was an Epicurean who wrote De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things), a six-book poem expounding Epicurus’ metaphysics. Cicero was an adherent of the skeptical academy, who wrote a series of works setting forth the major philosophical systems of his day, including Epicureanism. Another major source is the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 CE), a Platonist. However, both Cicero and Plutarch were very hostile toward Epicureanism, so they must be used with care, since they often are less than charitable toward Epicurus, and may skew his views to serve their own purposes.

Although the major outlines of Epicurus’ thought are clear enough, the lack of sources means many of the details of his philosophy are still open to dispute.

3. Metaphysics

Epicurus believes that the basic constituents of the world are atoms (which are uncuttable, microscopic bits of matter) moving in the void (which is simply empty space). Ordinary objects are conglomerations of atoms. Furthermore, the properties of macroscopic bodies and all of the events we see occurring can be explained in terms of the collisions, reboundings, and entanglements of atoms.

a. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void

Epicurus’ metaphysics starts from two simple points: (1) we see that there are bodies in motion, and (2) nothing comes into existence from what does not exist. Epicurus takes the first point to be simply a datum of experience. The second point is a commonplace of ancient Greek philosophy, derived from the Principle of Sufficient Reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).

First, because bodies move, there must be empty space for them to move in, and Epicurus calls this empty space ‘void.’ Second, the ordinary bodies that we see are compound bodies–that is, bodies which are made up of further bodies, which is shown by the fact that they can be broken down into smaller pieces. However, Epicurus thinks that this process of division cannot go on indefinitely, because otherwise bodies would dissolve away into nothing. Also, there must be basic and unchangeable building blocks of matter in order to explain the regularities in nature. These non-compound bodies are atoms–literally, ‘uncuttables.’ Only bodies and void exist per se, that is, exist without depending for their existence on something else. Other things–such as colors, time, and justice–are ultimately explicable as attributes of bodies.

b. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe

Because Epicurus believes that nothing comes into existence from nothing, he thinks that the universe has no beginning, but has always existed, and will always exist. Atoms, too, as the basic building blocks of all else, cannot come into existence, but have always existed. Our particular cosmos, however, is only a temporary agglomeration of atoms, and it is only one of an infinite number of such cosmoi, which come into existence and then dissolve away. Against Aristotle, Epicurus argues that the universe is unlimited in size. If the universe were limited in size, says Epicurus, you could go to the end of it, stick your fist out, and where your fist was located would be the new ‘limit’ of the universe. Of course, this process could be reiterated an endless number of times. Since the universe is unlimited in size, there must also be an unlimited number of atoms and an infinite amount of void. If the number of atoms were limited, then the ‘density’ of atoms in any region would effectively be zero, and there would be no macroscopic bodies, as there evidently are. And there must be an unlimited amount of void, since without a limitless amount of void, the infinite number of atoms would be unable to move.

c. Differences from Democritus

Up to this point, Epicurus is largely following the thought of Democritus, a pre-Socratic philosopher and one of the inventors of atomism. However, he modifies Democritus’ atomism in at least three important ways.

i. Weight

The first is that Epicurus thinks that atoms have weight. Like Democritus, Epicurus believes that atoms have the properties of size, shape, and resistance. Democritus explains all atomic motion as the result of previous atomic collisions, plus the inertia of atoms. Aristotle, however, criticizes Democritus on this point, saying that Democritus has not explained why it is that atoms move at all, rather than simply standing still. Epicurus seems to be answering this criticism when he says that atoms do have a natural motion of direction–‘downward’–even though there is no bottom to the universe. This natural motion is supposed to give an explanation for why atoms move in the first place. Also, Epicurus thinks that it is evident that bodies do tend to travel down, all else being equal, and he thinks that positing weight as an atomic property accounts for this better than thinking all atomic motion is the result of past collisions and inertia.

ii. The Swerve

The second modification of Democritus’ views is the addition of the ‘swerve.’ In addition to the regular tendency of atoms to move downward, Epicurus thinks that occasionally, and at random times, the atoms swerve to the side. One reason for this swerve is that it is needed to explain why there are atomic collisions. The natural tendency of atoms is to fall straight downward, at uniform velocity. If this were the only natural atomic motion, the atoms never would have collided with one another, forming macroscopic bodies. As Lucretius puts it, they would ‘fall downward, like drops of rain, through the deep void.’ The second reason for thinking that atoms swerve is that a random atomic motion is needed to preserve human freedom and ‘break the bonds of fate,’ as Lucretius says. If the laws of atomic motion are deterministic, then the past positions of the atoms in the universe, plus these laws, determine everything that will occur, including human action. Cicero reports that Epicurus worries that, if it has been true from eternity that, e.g., “Milo will wrestle tomorrow,” then presently deliberating about whether to make it true or false would be idle.

iii. Sensible Qualities

The third difference between Epicurus and Democritus has to do with their attitudes toward the reality of sensible properties. Democritus thinks that, in reality, only atoms and the void exist, and that sensible qualities such as sweetness, whiteness, and the like exist only ‘by convention.’ It is controversial exactly how to understand Democritus’ position, but most likely he is asserting that atoms themselves have no sensible qualities–they are simply extended bits of stuff. The sensible qualities that we think bodies have, like sweetness, are not really in the object at all, but are simply subjective states of the percipient’s awareness produced by the interaction of bodies with our sense-organs. This is shown, thinks Democritus, by the fact that the same body appears differently to different percipients depending on their bodily constitution, e.g., that a ‘white’ body appears yellow to somebody with jaundice, or that honey tastes bitter to an ill person. From this, Democritus derives skeptical conclusions. He is pessimistic about our ability to gain any knowledge about the world on the basis of our senses, since they systematically deceive us about the way the world is.

Epicurus wants to resist these pessimistic conclusions. He argues that properties like sweetness, whiteness, and such do not exist at the atomic level–individual atoms are not sweet or white–but that these properties are nonetheless real. These are properties of macroscopic bodies, but the possession of these properties by macroscopic bodies are explicable in terms of the properties of and relations amongst the individual atoms that make up bodies. Epicurus thinks that bodies have the capability to cause us to have certain types of experiences because of their atomic structure, and that such capabilities are real properties of the bodies. Similar considerations apply for properties like “being healthy,” “being deadly,” and “being enslaved.” They are real, but can only apply to groups of atoms (like people), not individual atoms. And these sorts of properties are also relational properties, not intrinsic ones. For example, cyanide is deadly–not deadly per se, but deadly for human beings (and perhaps for other types of organisms). Nonetheless, its deadliness for us is still a real property of the cyanide, albeit a relational one.

d. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena

One important aspect of Epicurus’ philosophy is his desire to replace teleological (goal-based) explanations of natural phenomena with mechanistic ones. His main target is mythological explanations of meteorological occurrences and the like in terms of the will of the gods. Because Epicurus wishes to banish the fear of the gods, he insists that occurrences like earthquakes and lightning can be explained entirely in atomic terms and are not due to the will of the gods. Epicurus is also against the intrinsic teleology of philosophers like Aristotle. Teeth appear to be well-designed for the purpose of chewing. Aristotle thinks that this apparent purposiveness in nature cannot be eliminated, and that the functioning of the parts of organisms must be explained by appealing to how they contribute to the functioning of the organism as a whole. Other philosophers, such as the Stoics, took this apparent design as evidence for the intelligence and benevolence of God. Epicurus, however, following Empedocles, tries to explain away this apparent purposiveness in nature in a proto-Darwinian way, as the result of a process of natural selection.

e. The Gods

Because of its denial of divine providence, Epicureanism was often charged in antiquity with being a godless philosophy, although Epicurus and his followers denied the charge. The main upshot of Epicurean theology is certainly negative, however. Epicurus’ mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena are supposed to displace explanations that appeal to the will of the gods. In addition, Epicurus is one of the earliest philosophers we know of to have raised the Problem of Evil, arguing against the notion that the world is under the providential care of a loving deity by pointing out the manifold suffering in the world.

Despite this, Epicurus says that there are gods, but these gods are quite different from the popular conception of gods. We have a conception of the gods, says Epicurus, as supremely blessed and happy beings. Troubling oneself about the miseries of the world, or trying to administer the world, would be inconsistent with a life of tranquility, says Epicurus, so the gods have no concern for us. In fact, they are unaware of our existence, and live eternally in the intermundia, the space between the cosmoi. For Epicurus, the gods function mainly as ethical ideals, whose lives we can strive to emulate, but whose wrath we need not fear.

Ancient critics thought the Epicurean gods were a thin smoke-screen to hide Epicurus’ atheism, and difficulties with a literal interpretation of Epicurus’ sayings on the nature of the gods (for instance, it appears inconsistent with Epicurus’ atomic theory to hold that any compound body, even a god, could be immortal) have led some scholars to conjecture that Epicurus’ ‘gods’ are thought-constructs, and exist only in human minds as idealizations, i.e., the gods exist, but only as projections of what the most blessed life would be.

f. Philosophy of Mind

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to put forward an Identity Theory of Mind. In modern versions of the identity theory, the mind is identified with the brain, and mental processes are identified with neural processes. Epicurus’ physiology is quite different; the mind is identified as an organ that resides in the chest, since the common Greek view was that the chest, not the head, is the seat of the emotions. However, the underlying idea is quite similar. (Note: not all commentators accept that Epicurus’ theory is actually an Identity Theory.)

The main point that Epicurus wants to establish is that the mind is something bodily. The mind must be a body, thinks Epicurus, because of its ability to interact with the body. The mind is affected by the body, as vision, drunkenness, and disease show. Likewise, the mind affects the body, as our ability to move our limbs when we want to and the physiological effects of emotional states show. Only bodies can interact with other bodies, so the mind must be a body. Epicurus says that the mind cannot be something incorporeal, as Plato thinks, since the only thing that is not a body is void, which is simply empty space and cannot act or be acted upon.

The mind, then, is an organ in the body, and mental processes are identified with atomic processes. The mind is composed of four different types of particles–fire, air, wind, and the “nameless element,” which surpasses the other particles in its fineness. Although Epicurus is reticent about the details, some features of the mind are accounted for in terms of the features of these atoms–for instance, the mind is able to be moved a great deal by the impact of an image (which is something quite flimsy), because of the smallness of the particles that make up the mind. The mind proper, which is primarily responsible for sensation and thought, is located in the chest, but Epicurus thinks that there is also a ‘spirit,’ spread throughout the rest of the body, which allows the mind to communicate with it. The mind and spirit play roles very similar to those of the central and peripheral nervous systems in modern theory.

One important result of Epicurus’ philosophy of mind is that death is annihilation. The mind is able to engage in the motions of sensation and thought only when it is housed in the body and the atoms that make it up are properly arranged. Upon death, says Epicurus, the container of the body shatters, and the atoms disperse in the air. The atoms are eternal, but the mind made up of these atoms is not, just as other compound bodies cease to exist when the atoms that make them up disperse.

g. Perception

Epicurus explains perception in terms of the interaction of atoms with the sense-organs. Objects continually throw off one-atom-thick layers, like the skin peeling off of an onion. These images, or “eidola,” fly through the air and bang into one’s eyes, from which one learns about the properties of the objects that threw off these eidola. This explains vision. Other senses are analyzed in similar terms; e.g., the soothing action of smooth atoms on the tongue causes the sensation of sweetness. As noted above, Epicurus maintains that such sensible qualities are real qualities of bodies.

4. Epistemology

a. The Canon: Sensations, Preconceptions, and Feelings

Epicurus’ epistemology is resolutely empiricist and anti-skeptical. All of our knowledge ultimately comes from the senses, thinks Epicurus, and we can trust the senses, when properly used. Epicurus’ epistemology was contained in his work the ‘Canon,’ or ‘measuring stick,’ which is lost, so many of the details of his views are unavailable to us.

Epicurus says that there are three criteria of truth: sensations, ‘preconceptions,’ and feelings. Sensations give us information about the external world, and we can test the judgments based upon sensations against further sensations; e.g., a provisional judgment that a tower is round, based upon sensation, can be tested against later sensations to be corroborated or disproved. Epicurus says that all sensations give us information about the world, but that sensation itself is never in error, since sensation is a purely passive, mechanical reception of images and the like by sense-organs, and the senses themselves do not make judgments ‘that’ the world is this way or that. Instead, error enters in when we make judgments about the world based upon the information received through the senses.

Epicurus thinks that, in order to make judgments about the world, or even to start any inquiry whatsoever, we must already be in possession of certain basic concepts, which stand in need of no further proof or definition, on pain of entering into an infinite regress. This concern is similar to the Paradox of Inquiry explored by Plato in the Meno, that one must already know about something in order to be able to inquire about it. However, instead of postulating that our immaterial souls had acquaintance with transcendent Forms in a pre-natal existence, as Plato does, Epicurus thinks that we have certain ‘preconceptions’–concepts such as ‘body,’ ‘person,’ ‘usefulness,’ and ‘truth’–which are formed in our (material) minds as the result of repeated sense-experiences of similar objects. Further ideas are formed by processes of analogy or similarity or by compounding these basic concepts. Thus, all ideas are ultimately formed on the basis of sense-experience.

Feelings of pleasure and pain form the basic criteria for what is to be sought and avoided.

b. Anti-skeptical Arguments

Epicurus is concerned to refute the skeptical tendencies of Democritus, whose metaphysics and theory of perception were similar to Epicurus’. At least three separate anti-skeptical arguments are given by Epicureans:

i. The “Lazy Argument”

Epicurus says that it is impossible to live as a skeptic. If a person really were to believe that he knows nothing, then he would have no reason to engage in one course of action instead of another. Thus, the consistent skeptic would engage in no action whatsoever, and would die.

ii. The Self-refutation Argument

If a skeptic claims that nothing can be known, then one should ask whether he knows that nothing can be known. If he says ‘yes,’ then he is contradicting himself. If he doesn’t say yes, then he isn’t making a claim, and we don’t need to listen to him.

iii. The Argument from Concept-formation

If the skeptic says that nothing can be known, or that we cannot know the truth, we can ask him where he gets his knowledge of concepts such as ‘knowledge’ and ‘truth.’ If the senses cannot be relied on, as the skeptic claims, then he is not entitled to use concepts such as ‘knowledge’ and ‘truth’ in formulating his thesis, since such concepts derive from the senses.

5. Ethics

Epicurus’ ethics is a form of egoistic hedonism; i.e., he says that the only thing that is intrinsically valuable is one’s own pleasure; anything else that has value is valuable merely as a means to securing pleasure for oneself. However, Epicurus has a sophisticated and idiosyncratic view of the nature of pleasure, which leads him to recommend a virtuous, moderately ascetic life as the best means to securing pleasure. This contrasts Epicurus strongly with the Cyrenaics, a group of ancient hedonists who better fit the stereotype of hedonists as recommending a policy of “eat, drink, and be merry.”

a. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical

Epicurus’ ethics starts from the Aristotelian commonplace that the highest good is what is valued for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else, and Epicurus agrees with Aristotle that happiness is the highest good. However, he disagrees with Aristotle by identifying happiness with pleasure. Epicurus gives two reasons for this. The main reason is that pleasure is the only thing that people do, as a matter of fact, value for its own sake; that is, Epicurus’ ethical hedonism is based upon his psychological hedonism. Everything we do, claims Epicurus, we do for the sake ultimately of gaining pleasure for ourselves. This is supposedly confirmed by observing the behavior of infants, who, it is claimed, instinctively pursue pleasure and shun pain. This is also true of adults, thinks Epicurus, but in adults it is more difficult to see that this is true, since adults have much more complicated beliefs about what will bring them pleasure. But the Epicureans did spend a great deal of energy trying to make plausible the contention that all activity, even apparently self-sacrificing activity or activity done solely for the sake of virtue or what is noble, is in fact directed toward obtaining pleasure for oneself.

The second proof, which fits in well with Epicurus’ empiricism, supposedly lies in one’s introspective experience. One immediately perceives that pleasure is good and that pain is bad, in the same way that one immediately perceives that fire is hot; no further argument is needed to show the goodness of pleasure or the badness of pain. (Of course, this does not establish Epicurus’ further contention that only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and only pain is intrinsically bad.)

Although all pleasures are good and all pains evil, Epicurus says that not all pleasures are choiceworthy or all pains to be avoided. Instead, one should calculate what is in one’s long-term self-interest, and forgo what will bring pleasure in the short-term if doing so will ultimately lead to greater pleasure in the long-term.

b. Types of Pleasure

For Epicurus, pleasure is tied closely to satisfying one’s desires. He distinguishes between two different types of pleasure: ‘moving’ pleasures and ‘static’ pleasures. ‘Moving’ pleasures occur when one is in the process of satisfying a desire, e.g., eating a hamburger when one is hungry. These pleasures involve an active titillation of the senses, and these feelings are what most people call ‘pleasure.’ However, Epicurus says that after one’s desires have been satisfied, (e.g., when one is full after eating), the state of satiety, of no longer being in need or want, is itself pleasurable. Epicurus calls this a ‘static’ pleasure, and says that these static pleasures are the best pleasures.

Because of this, Epicurus denies that there is any intermediate state between pleasure and pain. When one has unfulfilled desires, this is painful, and when one no longer has unfulfilled desires, this steady state is the most pleasurable of all, not merely some intermediate state between pleasure and pain.

Epicurus also distinguishes between physical and mental pleasures and pains. Physical pleasures and pains concern only the present, whereas mental pleasures and pains also encompass the past (fond memories of past pleasure or regret over past pain or mistakes) and the future (confidence or fear about what will occur). The greatest destroyer of happiness, thinks Epicurus, is anxiety about the future, especially fear of the gods and fear of death. If one can banish fear about the future, and face the future with confidence that one’s desires will be satisfied, then one will attain tranquility (ataraxia), the most exalted state. In fact, given Epicurus’ conception of pleasure, it might be less misleading to call him a ‘tranquillist’ instead of a ‘hedonist.’

c. Types of Desire

Because of the close connection of pleasure with desire-satisfaction, Epicurus devotes a considerable part of his ethics to analyzing different kinds of desires. If pleasure results from getting what you want (desire-satisfaction) and pain from not getting what you want (desire-frustration), then there are two strategies you can pursue with respect to any given desire: you can either strive to fulfill the desire, or you can try to eliminate the desire. For the most part Epicurus advocates the second strategy, that of paring your desires down to a minimum core, which are then easily satisfied.

Epicurus distinguishes between three types of desires: natural and necessary desires, natural but non-necessary desires, and “vain and empty” desires. Examples of natural and necessary desires include the desires for food, shelter, and the like. Epicurus thinks that these desires are easy to satisfy, difficult to eliminate (they are ‘hard-wired’ into human beings naturally), and bring great pleasure when satisfied. Furthermore, they are necessary for life, and they are naturally limited: that is, if one is hungry, it only takes a limited amount of food to fill the stomach, after which the desire is satisfied. Epicurus says that one should try to fulfill these desires.

Vain desires include desires for power, wealth, fame, and the like. They are difficult to satisfy, in part because they have no natural limit. If one desires wealth or power, no matter how much one gets, it is always possible to get more, and the more one gets, the more one wants. These desires are not natural to human beings, but inculcated by society and by false beliefs about what we need; e.g., believing that having power will bring us security from others. Epicurus thinks that these desires should be eliminated.

An example of a natural but non-necessary desire is the desire for luxury food. Although food is needed for survival, one does not need a particular type of food to survive. Thus, despite his hedonism, Epicurus advocates a surprisingly ascetic way of life. Although one shouldn’t spurn extravagant foods if they happen to be available, becoming dependent on such goods ultimately leads to unhappiness. As Epicurus puts it, “If you wish to make Pythocles wealthy, don’t give him more money; rather, reduce his desires.” By eliminating the pain caused by unfulfilled desires, and the anxiety that occurs because of the fear that one’s desires will not be fulfilled in the future, the wise Epicurean attains tranquility, and thus happiness.

d. The Virtues

Epicurus’ hedonism was widely denounced in the ancient world as undermining traditional morality. Epicurus, however, insists that courage, moderation, and the other virtues are needed in order to attain happiness. However, the virtues for Epicurus are all purely instrumental goods–that is, they are valuable solely for the sake of the happiness that they can bring oneself, not for their own sake. Epicurus says that all of the virtues are ultimately forms of prudence, of calculating what is in one’s own best interest. In this, Epicurus goes against the majority of Greek ethical theorists, such as the Stoics, who identify happiness with virtue, and Aristotle, who identifies happiness with a life of virtuous activity. Epicurus thinks that natural science and philosophy itself also are instrumental goods. Natural science is needed in order to give mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena and thus dispel the fear of the gods, while philosophy helps to show us the natural limits of our desires and to dispel the fear of death.

e. Justice

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to give a well-developed contractarian theory of justice. Epicurus says that justice is an agreement “neither to harm nor be harmed,” and that we have a preconception of justice as “what is useful in mutual associations.” People enter into communities in order to gain protection from the dangers of the wild, and agreements concerning the behavior of the members of the community are needed in order for these communities to function, e.g., prohibitions of murder, regulations concerning the killing and eating of animals, and so on. Justice exists only where there are such agreements.

Like the virtues, justice is valued entirely on instrumental grounds, because of its utility for each of the members of society. Epicurus says that the main reason not to be unjust is that one will be punished if one gets caught, and that even if one does not get caught, the fear of being caught will still cause pain. However, he adds that the fear of punishment is needed mainly to keep fools in line, who otherwise would kill, steal, etc. The Epicurean wise man recognizes the usefulness of the laws, and since he does not desire great wealth, luxury goods, political power, or the like, he sees that he has no reason to engage in the conduct prohibited by the laws in any case.

Although justice only exists where there is an agreement about how to behave, that does not make justice entirely ‘conventional,’ if by ‘conventional’ we mean that any behavior dictated by the laws of a particular society is thereby just, and that the laws of a particular society are just for that society. Since the ‘justice contract’ is entered into for the purpose of securing what is useful for the members of the society, only laws that are actually useful are just. Thus, a prohibition of murder would be just, but antimiscegenation laws would not. Since what is useful can vary from place to place and time to time, what laws are just can likewise vary.

f. Friendship

Epicurus values friendship highly and praises it in quite extravagant terms. He says that friendship “dances around the world” telling us that we must “wake to blessedness.” He also says that the wise man is sometimes willing to die for a friend. Because of this, some scholars have thought that in this area, at least, Epicurus abandons his egoistic hedonism and advocates altruism toward friends. This is not clear, however. Epicurus consistently maintains that friendship is valuable because it is one of the greatest means of attaining pleasure. Friends, he says, are able to provide one another the greatest security, whereas a life without friends is solitary and beset with perils. In order for there to be friendship, Epicurus says, there must be trust between friends, and friends have to treat each other as well as they treat themselves. The communities of Epicureans can be seen as embodying these ideals, and these are ideals that ultimately promote ataraxia.

g. Death

One of the greatest fears that Epicurus tries to combat is the fear of death. Epicurus thinks that this fear is often based upon anxiety about having an unpleasant afterlife; this anxiety, he thinks, should be dispelled once one realizes that death is annihilation, because the mind is a group of atoms that disperses upon death.

i. The No Subject of Harm Argument

If death is annihilation, says Epicurus, then it is ‘nothing to us.’ Epicurus’ main argument for why death is not bad is contained in the Letter to Menoeceus and can be dubbed the ‘no subject of harm’ argument. If death is bad, for whom is it bad? Not for the living, since they’re not dead, and not for the dead, since they don’t exist. His argument can be set out as follows:

  1. Death is annihilation.
  2. The living have not yet been annihilated (otherwise they wouldn’t be alive).
  3. Death does not affect the living. (from 1 and 2)
  4. So, death is not bad for the living. (from 3)
  5. For something to be bad for somebody, that person has to exist, at least.
  6. The dead do not exist. (from 1)
  7. Therefore, death is not bad for the dead. (from 5 and 6)
  8. Therefore death is bad for neither the living nor the dead. (from 4 and 7)

Epicurus adds that if death causes you no pain when you’re dead, it’s foolish to allow the fear of it to cause you pain now.

ii. The Symmetry Argument

A second Epicurean argument against the fear of death, the so-called ‘symmetry argument,’ is recorded by the Epicurean poet Lucretius. He says that anyone who fears death should consider the time before he was born. The past infinity of pre-natal non-existence is like the future infinity of post-mortem non-existence; it is as though nature has put up a mirror to let us see what our future non-existence will be like. But we do not consider not having existed for an eternity before our births to be a terrible thing; therefore, neither should we think not existing for an eternity after our deaths to be evil.

6. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it’s a selection of further texts to read for those who want to learn more about Epicurus and Epicureanism. Most of the books listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

a. Collections of Primary Source

  • The Epicurus Reader, translated and edited by Brad Inwood and L.P. Gerson, Hackett Publishing.
    • This inexpensive collection has most of the major extant writings of Epicurus, in addition to other ancient sources such as Cicero and Plutarch who wrote about Epicureanism. (Lucretius is not included much.) However, there is little commentary or explication of the material, and some of the primary sources are fairly opaque.
  • The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: translations of the principal sources, with philosophical commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge University Press.
    • This excellent book organizes the texts into sections topically, (e.g., “Atoms,” “Soul,” “Language,” “Death,”) and follows each selection of texts with commentary and explication. Vol. 2, which contains the original Greek and Latin texts, has a fine, if somewhat dated (1987) bibliography at the end.Lucretius, De Rerum Natura

There are many different editions of Lucretius’ masterpiece, an extended exposition of Epicurus’ metaphysics, philosophy of mind, and natural science. I personally like the translation by Rolfe Humphries: Lucretius: The Way Things Are. The De Rerum Natura of Titus Lucretius Carus, Indiana University Press. Humphries translates Lucretius’ poem as a poem, not as prose, yet the translation is still very clear and readable.

b. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus’ Philosophy

The books below are all well-written and influential. They deal in-depth with problems of interpreting particular areas of Epicurus’ philosophy, while still remaining, for the most part, accessible to well-educated general readers. They also have extensive bibliographies. However, do not assume that the interpretations of Epicurus in these books are always widely accepted.

  • Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind, by Julia Annas, University of California Press.
    • This book deals with Epicurean and Stoic theories of what the mind is.
  • Epicurus’ Ethical Theory : The Pleasures of Invulnerability, by Phillip Mitsis, Cornell University Press.
    • This book is concerned with all of the major areas of Epicurean ethics, from pleasure, to friendship, justice, and human freedom. Mitsis is especially good at showing how Epicurus’ conception of pleasure differs from that of the utilitarians.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press.
    • This book focuses deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but is still a good source of information on Epicurean ethics, especially if one wants to put Epicurean ethics in the context of other ancient ethical theories.
  • Epicurus’ Scientific Method, by Elizabeth Asmis, Cornell University Press.
    • The best book-length treatment of Epicurus’ epistemology available. A little more technical than the books above, but still fairly accessible.

Author Information

Tim O’Keefe
Email: see web page
Georgia State University
U. S. A.

Epictetus (55–135 C.E.)

epictetusEpictetus (pronounced Epic-TEE-tus) was an exponent of Stoicism who flourished in the early second century C.E. about four hundred years after the Stoic school of Zeno of Citium was established in Athens. He lived and worked, first as a student in Rome, and then as a teacher with his own school in Nicopolis in Greece. Our knowledge of his philosophy and his method as a teacher comes to us via two works composed by his student Arrian, the Discourses and the Handbook. Although Epictetus based his teaching on the works of the early Stoics (none of which survives) which dealt with the three branches of Stoic thought, logic, physics and ethics, the Discourses and the Handbook concentrate almost exclusively on ethics. The role of the Stoic teacher was to encourage his students to live the philosophic life, whose end was eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or ‘flourishing’), to be secured by living the life of reason, which – for Stoics – meant living virtuously and living ‘according to nature’. The eudaimonia (‘happiness’) of those who attain this ideal consists of ataraxia (imperturbability), apatheia (freedom from passion), eupatheiai (‘good feelings’), and an awareness of, and capacity to attain, what counts as living as a rational being should. The key to transforming oneself into the Stoic sophos (wise person) is to learn what is ‘in one’s power’, and this is ‘the correct use of impressions’ (phantasiai), which in outline involves not judging as good or bad anything that appears to one. For the only thing that is good is acting virtuously (that is, motivated by virtue), and the only thing that is bad is the opposite, acting viciously (that is, motivated by vice). Someone who seeks to make progress as a Stoic (a prokoptôn) understands that their power of rationality is a fragment of God whose material body – a sort of rarefied fiery air – blends with the whole of creation, intelligently forming and directing undifferentiated matter to make the world as we experience it. The task of the prokoptôn, therefore, is to ‘live according to nature’, which means (a) pursuing a course through life intelligently responding to one’s own needs and duties as a sociable human being, but also (b) wholly accepting one’s fate and the fate of the world as coming directly from the divine intelligence which makes the world the best that is possible.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Discourses
    2. The Handbook
  3. Epictetus’ Stoicism
  4. Key Concepts
    1. The Promise of Philosophy
    2. What is Really Good
    3. What is in our Power
    4. Making Proper Use of Impressions
    5. The Three Topoi
      1. The Discipline of Desire
      2. The Discipline of Action
      3. The Discipline of Assent
    6. God
    7. On Living in Accord with Nature
    8. Metaphors for Life
    9. Making Progress
  5. Glossary of Terms
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Translations of Epictetus
    2. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics
    3. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically
    4. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally
    5. Other Items on Hellenistic Philosophy Generally

1. Life

It is possible to draw only a basic sketch of Epictetus’ life. Resources at our disposal include just a handful of references in the ancient texts, to which we can add the few allusions that Epictetus makes to his own life in the Discourses.

Epictetus was born in about 55 C.E. in Hierapolis in Phrygia (modern-day Pamukkale, in south-western Turkey). As a boy he somehow came to Rome as a slave of Epaphroditus who was a rich and powerful freedman, having himself been a slave of the Emperor Nero (he had been an administrative secretary). Whilst still a slave, Epictetus studied with the Stoic teacher Musonius Rufus.

There is a story told by the author Celsus (probably a younger contemporary of Epictetus) – quoted by the early Christian Origen (c.185–254) at Contra Celsum 7.53 – that when still a slave, Epictetus was tortured by his master who twisted his leg. Enduring the pain with complete composure, Epictetus warned Epaphroditus that his leg would break, and when it did break, he said, ‘There, did I not tell you that it would break?’ And from that time Epictetus was lame. The Suda (tenth century), however, although confirming that Epictetus was lame, attributes his affliction to rheumatism.

At some point Epictetus was manumitted, and in about 89, along with other philosophers then in Rome, was banished by the Emperor Domitian. He went to Nicopolis in Epirus (in north-western Greece) where he opened his own school which acquired a good reputation, attracting many upper-class Romans. One such student was Flavius Arrian (c.86–160) who would compose the Discourses and the Handbook, and who later served in public office under the Emperor Hadrian and made his mark as a respected historian (much of his writings survive). Origen (Contra Celsum 6.2) reports that Epictetus had been more popular in his day than had Plato in his. Aulus Gellius (c.125–c.165) reports that one of Marcus Aurelius’ teachers, Herodes Atticus (c.101–177), considered Epictetus to be ‘the greatest of Stoics’ (Attic Nights 1.2.6).

Our sources report that Epictetus did not marry, had no children, and lived to an old age. With respect to marriage and children we may note the story from Lucian (Demonax 55) about the Cynic philosopher Demonax who had been a pupil of Epictetus. On hearing Epictetus exhort his students to marry and have children (for it was a philosopher’s duty to provide a substitute ready for the time when they would die), he sarcastically asked Epictetus whether he could marry one of his daughters.

2. Writings

It appears that Epictetus wrote nothing himself. The works we have that present his philosophy were written by his student, Flavius Arrian. We may conjecture that the Discourses and the Handbook were written some time around the years 104–107, at the time when Arrian (born c.86) was most likely to have been a student.

Dobbin (1998), though, holds the view that the Discourses and the Handbook were actually written by Epictetus himself; the Suda does say, after all, that Epictetus ‘wrote a great deal’. Dobbin is not entirely convinced by Arrian’s claim in his dedicatory preface that he wrote down Epictetus’ words verbatim; firstly, stenographic techniques at this time were primitive, and anyway were the preserve of civil servants; secondly, most of the discourses are too polished, and look too much like carefully crafted prose to be the product of impromptu discussions; and thirdly, some of the discourses (notably 1.29, 3.22 and 4.1) are too long for extempore conversations.

There is no way to resolve this question with certainty. Whether the texts we have do indeed represent a serious attempt to record Epictetus at work verbatim, whether draft texts were later edited and rewritten (as seems wholly likely), possibly by Epictetus, or whether Epictetus did in fact write the texts himself, drawing on his recollections as a lecturer with only occasional attempts at strictly verbatim accuracy, we shall never know. But what we can be certain of, regardless of who actually wrote the words onto the papyrus to make the first draft of the text as we have it today, is that those words were intended to present Stoic moral philosophy in the terms and the style that Epictetus employed as a teacher intent on bringing his students to philosophic enlightenment as the Stoics had understood this enterprise.

a. Discourses

Written in Koine Greek, the everyday contemporary form of the language, Epictetus’ Discourses appear to record the exchanges between Epictetus and his students after formal teaching had concluded for the day. Internal textual evidence confirms that the works of the early Stoic philosophers (Zeno, Cleanthes and Chrysippus) were read and discussed in Epictetus’ classes, but this aspect of Epictetus’ teaching is not recorded by Arrian. What we have, then, are intimate, though earnest, discussions in which Epictetus aims to make his students consider carefully what the philosophic life – for a Stoic – consists in, and how to live it oneself. He discusses a wide range of topics, from friendship to illness, from fear to poverty, on how to acquire and maintain tranquillity, and why we should not be angry with other people.

Not all of the Discourses appear to have survived, as the ancient Byzantine scholar Photius (c.810–c.893) reports that the complete text originally comprised eight books, whereas all we have today are four books. Because the text, chapter by chapter, jumps to different topics and shows no orderly development, it is not readily apparent that anything is missing, and indeed, the reference to eight books may be mistaken (though another author, Aulus Gellius, at Attic Nights 19.1.14, refers to the fifth book of the Discourses). The range of topics is sufficiently broad for us to be reasonably confident that, even if some of the text has been lost, what we lack by and large repeats and revisits the material that we have in the book as it has come down to us.

b. The Handbook

This little book appears to be an abstract of the Discourses, focusing on key themes in Epictetus’ teaching of Stoic ethics. Some of the text is taken from the Discourses, and the fact that not all of it can be correlated with passages in the larger work supports the view that some of the Discourses has indeed been lost.

3. Epictetus’ Stoicism

The writings of the early Stoics, of Zeno (335–263 B.C.E.) the founder of the school, of Chrysippus (c.290–207 B.C.E.) the extremely influential third head of the Stoa, and of others, survive only as quoted fragments found in later works. The question arises as to what extent Epictetus preserved the original doctrines of the Stoic school, and to what extent, if any, he branched out with new emphases and innovations of his own. The nineteenth-century Epictetan scholar Adolf Bonhöffer (1998, 3) remarks: ‘[Epictetus] is completely free of the eclecticism of Seneca and Marcus Aurelius; and, compared with his teacher Musonius Rufus … his work reveals a considerably closer connection to Stoic doctrine and terminology as developed mainly by Chrysippus.’ Evidence internal to the Discourses indicates that Epictetus was indeed faithful to the early Stoics. At 1.4.28–31, Epictetus praises Chrysippus in the highest terms, saying of him, ‘How great the benefactor who shows the way! … who has discovered, and brought to light, and communicated, the truth to all, not merely of living, but of living well’ (trans. Hard). It would be inconsistent, if not wholly ridiculous, to laud Chrysippus in such terms and then proceed to depart oneself from the great man’s teaching. At 1.20.15, Epictetus quotes Zeno, and at 2.6.9–10 he quotes Chrysippus, to support his arguments. Aulus Gellius (Attic Nights 19.1.14) says that Epictetus’ Discourses ‘undoubtedly agree with the writings of Zeno and Chrysippus’.

Scholars are agreed that the ‘doctrine of the three topics (topoi)’ (fields of study) which we find in the Discourses originates with Epictetus (see Bonhöffer 1996, 32; Dobbin 1998, xvii; Hadot 1998, 83; More 1923, 107). Oldfather (1925, xxi, n. 1), in the introduction to his translation of the Discourses, remarks that ‘this triple division … is the only notable original element … found in Epictetus, and it is rather a pedagogical device for lucid presentation than an innovation in thought’. Our enthusiasm for this division being wholly original to Epictetus should be tempered with a reading of extracts from Seneca’s Moral Letters (75.8–18 and 89.14–15) where we also find a threefold division of ethics which, although not exactly similar to Epictetus’ scheme, suggests the possibility that both Seneca and Epictetus drew on work by their predecessors that, alas, has not survived. Suffice it so say, what Epictetus teaches by means of his threefold division is wholly in accord with the principles of the early Stoics, but how he does this is uniquely his own method. The programme of study and exercises that Epictetus’ students adhered to was in consequence different from the programme that was taught by his predecessors, but the end result, consisting in the special Stoic outlook on oneself and the world at large and the ability to ‘live the philosophic life’, was the same.

4. Key Concepts

a. The Promise of Philosophy

Epictetus, along with all other philosophers of the Hellenistic period, saw moral philosophy as having the practical purpose of guiding people towards leading better lives. The aim was to live well, to secure for oneself eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or ‘a flourishing life’), and the different schools and philosophers of the period offered differing solutions as to how the eudaimôn life was to be won.

No less true of us today than it was for the ancients, few people are content with life (let alone wholly content), and what contributes to any contentment that may be enjoyed is almost certainly short-lived and transient.

The task for the Stoic teacher commences with the understanding that (probably) everyone is not eudaimôn for much, or even all, of the time; that there is a reason for this being the case and, most importantly, that there are solutions that can remedy this sorry state of affairs.

Indeed, Epictetus metaphorically speaks of his school as being a hospital to which students would come seeking treatments for their ills (Discourses 3.23.30). Each of us, in consequence merely of being human and living in society, is well aware of what comprise these ills. In the course of daily life we are beset by frustrations and setbacks of every conceivable type. Our cherished enterprises are hindered and thwarted, we have to deal with hostile and offensive people, and we have to cope with the difficulties and anxieties occasioned by the setbacks and illnesses visited upon our friends and relations. Sometimes we are ill ourselves, and even those who have the good fortune to enjoy sound health have to face the fact of their own mortality. In the midst of all this, only the rare few are blessed with lasting and rewarding relationships, and even these relationships, along with everything that constitutes a human life, are wholly transient.

But what is philosophy? Does it not mean making preparation to meet the things that come upon us? (Discourses 3.10.6, trans. Oldfather)

The ills we suffer, says Epictetus, result from mistaken beliefs about what is truly good. We have invested our hope in the wrong things, or at least invested it in the wrong way. Our capacity to flourish and be happy (to attain eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon our own characters, how we dispose ourselves to ourselves, to others, and to events generally. What qualities our characters come to have is completely up to us. Therefore, how well we flourish is also entirely up to us.

b. What is Really Good

The central claim of Stoic ethics is that only the virtues and virtuous activities are good, and that the only evil is vice and actions motivated by vice (see Discourses 2.9.15 and 2.19.13). When someone pursues pleasure or wealth, say, believing these things to be good, the Stoics hold that this person has made a mistake with respect to the nature of the things pursued and the nature of their own being, for the Stoics deny that advantages such as pleasure and health (wealth and status, and so forth) are good, because they do not benefit those who possess them in all circumstances. Virtue, on the other hand, conceived as the capacity to use such advantages wisely, being the only candidate for that which is always beneficial, is held to be the only good thing (see Plato, Euthydemus 278e–281e and Meno 87c–89a).

Thus, the Stoics identify the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life as one that is motivated by virtue. The term we translate as ‘virtue’ (from the Latin virtus) is aretê, and means ‘excellence’. To progress towards excellence as a human being, for Epictetus, means understanding the true nature of one’s being and keeping one’s prohairesis (moral character) in the right condition. Epictetus uses the term aretê only occasionally, and whereas the early Stoics spoke of striving for excellence as what was proper for a rational creature and required for eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or well-being), Epictetus speaks of striving to maintain one’s prohairesis in proper order (see Discourses 1.4.18 and 1.29.1).

Although things such as material comfort, for instance, will be pursued by the Stoic student who seeks eudaimonia, they will do this in a different way from those not living the ‘philosophic life’ – for Stoics claim that everything apart from virtue (what is good) and vice (what is bad) is indifferent, that is, ‘indifferent’ with regard to being good or bad. It is how one makes use of indifferent things that establishes how well one is making progress towards aretê (moral excellence) and a eudaimôn (‘happy’) life.

Indifferent things are either ‘preferred’ or ‘dispreferred’. Preferred are health and wealth, friends and family, and pretty much all those things that most people pursue as desirable for leading a flourishing life. Dispreferred are their opposites: sickness and poverty, social exclusion, and pretty much all those things that people seek to avoid as being detrimental for a flourishing life. Thus, the preferred indifferents have value for a Stoic, but not in terms of their being good: they have an instrumental value with respect to their capacities to contribute to a flourishing life as the objects upon which our virtuous actions are directed (see Discourses 1.29.2). The Stoic does not lament their absence, for their presence is not constitutive of eudaimonia. What is good is the virtuous use one makes of such preferred things should they be to hand, but no less good are one’s virtuous dispositions in living as well as one may, even when they are lacking.

c. What is in our Power

To maintain our prohairesis (moral character) in the proper condition – the successful accomplishment of this being necessary and sufficient for eudaimonia (‘happiness’) – we must understand what is eph’ hêmin (‘in our power’ or ‘up to us’; see Discourses 1.22.9–16). If we do not do this, our prohairesis will remain in a faulty condition, for we will remain convinced that things such as wealth and status are good when they are really indifferent, troubled by frustrations and anxieties, subject to disturbing emotions we do not want and cannot control, all of which make life unpleasant and unrewarding, sometimes overwhelmingly so. This is why Epictetus remarks: ‘This is the proper goal, to practise how to remove from one’s life sorrows and laments, and cries of “Alas” and “Poor me”, and misfortune and disappointment’ (Discourses 1.4.23, trans. Dobbin).

No one is master of another’s prohairesis [moral character], and in this alone lies good and evil. No one, therefore, can secure the good for me, or involve me in evil, but I alone have authority over myself in these matters. (Discourses 4.12.7–8, trans. Dobbin)

What is in our power, then, is the ‘authority over ourselves’ that we have regarding our capacity to judge what is good and what is evil. Outside our power are ‘external things’, which are ‘indifferent’ with respect to being good or evil. These indifferents, as we saw in the previous section, number those things that are conventionally deemed to be good and those that are conventionally deemed to be bad. Roughly, they are things that ‘just happen’, and they are not in our power in the sense that we do not have absolute control to make them occur just as we wish, or to make them have exactly the outcomes that we desire. Thus, for example, sickness is not in our power because it is not wholly up to us whether we get sick, and how often, nor whether we will recover quickly or indeed at all. Now, it makes sense to visit a doctor when we feel ill, but the competence of the doctor is not in our power, and neither is the effectiveness of any treatment that we might be offered. So generally, it makes sense to manage our affairs carefully and responsibly, but the ultimate outcome of any affair is, actually, not in our power.

What is in our power is the capacity to adapt ourselves to all that comes about, to judge anything that is ‘dispreferred’ not as bad, but as indifferent and not strong enough to overwhelm our strength of character.

The Handbook of Epictetus begins with these words:

Some things are up to us [eph’ hêmin] and some things are not up to us. Our opinions are up to us, and our impulses, desires, aversions–in short, whatever is our own doing. Our bodies are not up to us, nor are our possessions, our reputations, or our public offices, or, that is, whatever is not our own doing. (Handbook 1.1, trans. White)

That is, we have power over our own minds. The opinions we hold of things, the intentions we form, what we value and what we are averse to are all wholly up to us. Although we may take precautions, whether our possessions are carried off by a thief is not up us (but the intention to steal, that of course is in the power of the thief), and our reputations, in whatever quarter, must be decided by what other people think of us, and what they do think is up to them. Remaining calm in the face of adversity and controlling our emotions no matter what the provocation (qualities of character that to this day are referred to as ‘being stoical’), are accomplished in the full Stoic sense, for Epictetus, by making proper use of impressions.

d. Making Proper Use of Impressions

To have an impression is to be aware of something in the world. For example, I may look out of my window and have the impression of an airship floating over the houses in the distance. Whether there is really an airship there, half a mile off, or whether there is just a little helium-filled model tied to my garden gate by a bit of string, is a separate question. ‘Making proper use of impressions’ concerns how we move from the first thing, being aware of something or other, to the second thing, making a judgement that something or other is the case. The Stoic stands in sharp contrast to the non-Stoic, for when the latter faces some disaster, say (let us imagine that their briefcase has burst open and their papers are scattered by the wind all along the station platform and onto the track), they will judge this a terrible misfortune and have the appropriate emotional response to match. Epictetus would declare that this person has made the wrong use of their impression.

In the first place, do not allow yourself to be carried away by [the] intensity [of your impression]: but say, ‘Impression, wait for me a little. Let me see what you are, and what you represent. Let me test you.’ Then, afterwards, do not allow it to draw you on by picturing what may come next, for if you do, it will lead you wherever it pleases. But rather, you should introduce some fair and noble impression to replace it, and banish this base and sordid one. (Discourses 2.18.24–5, trans. Hard)

Few non-Stoics, ignorant of Epictetus’ teaching, would do other than rush around after their papers, descending deeper and deeper into a panic, imagining their boss at work giving them a dressing down for losing the papers, making them work extra hours to make good the loss, and perhaps even dismissing them from their job. The Stoic, by contrast, tests their impression to see what the best interpretation should be: losing the papers is a dispreferred indifferent, to be sure, but having an accident of this sort is bound to happen once in a while, and is nothing to be troubled about. They will quietly gather up the papers they can, and instead of panicking with respect to facing their boss, they will rehearse a little speech about having had an accident and what it means to have lost the papers. If their boss erupts in a temper, well, that is a concern for the boss.

Our attaining the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life requires that we judge things in the right way, for ‘what disturbs men’s minds is not events but their judgements on events’ (Handbook 5, trans. Matheson).

Remember that foul words or blows in themselves are no outrage, but your judgement that they are so. So when any one makes you angry, know that it is your own thought that has angered you. Wherefore make it your endeavour not to let your impressions carry you away. For if once you gain time and delay, you will find it easier to control yourself. (Handbook 20, trans. Matheson)

e. The Three Topoi

The three topoi (fields of study) establish activities in which the prokoptôn (Stoic student) applies their Stoic principles; they are practical exercises or disciplines that when successfully followed are constitutive of the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life which all rational beings are capable of attaining.

There are three areas of study, in which a person who is going to be good and noble must be trained. That concerning desires and aversions, so that he may never fail to get what he desires nor fall into what he would avoid. That concerning the impulse to act and not to act, and, in general, appropriate behaviour; so that he may act in an orderly manner and after due consideration, and not carelessly. The third is concerned with freedom from deception and hasty judgement, and, in general, whatever is connected with assent. (Discourses 3.2.1–2, trans. Hard)

Our capacity to employ these disciplines in the course of daily life is eph’ hêmin (‘in our power’ or ‘up to us’) because they depend on our opinions, judgements, intentions and desires which concern the way we regard things over which our prohairesis (moral character) has complete control.

i. The Discipline of Desire

The first discipline concerns what someone striving for excellence as a rational being should truly believe is worthy of desire, which for the Stoics is that which is truly good, virtue and action motivated by virtue.

Of these [three areas of study], the principle, and most urgent, is that which has to do with the passions; for these are produced in no other way than by the disappointment of our desires, and the incurring of our aversions. It is this that introduces disturbances, tumults, misfortunes, and calamities; and causes sorrow, lamentation and envy; and renders us envious and jealous, and thus incapable of listening to reason. (Discourses 3.2.3, trans. Hard)

Epictetus remarks: ‘When I see a man anxious, I say, What does this man want? If he did not want some thing which is not in his power, how could he be anxious?’ (Discourses 2.13.1, trans. Long). Those things that most of us, most of the time, seek after as being desirable, what we consider will make our lives go well, are things that are not in our power, and thus the hope we have for securing these things is placed in the hands of others or in the hands of fate. And when we are thwarted in our efforts to gain what we desire we become frustrated (or depressed or envious or angry, or all of these things). To be afflicted with such ‘passions’, says Epictetus, is the only real source of misery for human beings. Instead of trying to relieve ourselves of these unpleasant emotions by pressing all the harder to secure what we desire, we should rather place our hope not in ‘external’ things that are not in our power, but in our own dispositions and moral character. In short, we should limit our desire to virtue and to becoming (to the best of our capacities) examples of ‘excellence’. If we do not do this, the inevitable result is that we will continue to desire what we may fail to obtain or lose once we have it, and in consequence suffer the unhappiness of emotional disquiet (or worse). And as is the common experience of all people at some time or other, when we are in the grip of such emotions we run the risk of becoming blind to the best course of action, even when construed in terms of pursuing ‘external’ things.

The Stoic prokoptôn, in contrast, sets their hopes on excellence, recognising that this is where their power over things lies. They will still pursue those ‘preferred indifferent external’ things that are needed for fulfilling those functions and projects that they deem appropriate for them as individuals, and those they have obligations to meet. But they will not be distressed at setbacks or failure, nor at obstructive people, nor at other difficulties (illness, for instance), for none of these things is entirely up to them, and they engage in their affairs in full consciousness of this fact. It is in maintaining this consciousness of what is truly good (virtue), and awareness that the indifferent things are beyond their power, that makes this a discipline for the Stoic prokoptôn.

ii. The Discipline of Action

The second discipline concerns our ‘impulses to act and not to act’, that is, our motivations, and answers the question as to what we each should do as an individual in our own unique set of circumstances to successfully fulfil the role of a rational, sociable being who is striving for excellence.

The outcome of our actions is not wholly in our power, but our inclination to act one way rather than another, to pursue one set of objectives rather than others, this is in our power. The Stoics use the analogy of the archer shooting at a target to explain this notion. The ideal, of course, is to hit the centre of the target, though accomplishing this is not entirely in the archer’s power, for she cannot be certain how the wind will deflect the arrow from its path, nor whether her fingers will slip, nor whether (for it is within the bounds of possibility) the bow will break. The excellent archer does all within her power to shoot well, and she recognises that doing her best is the best she can do. The Stoic archer strives to shoot excellently, and will not be disappointed if she shoots well but fails to hit the centre of the target. And so it is in life generally. The non-Stoic views their success in terms of hitting the target, whereas the Stoic views their success in terms of having shot well (see Cicero, On Ends 3.22).

The [second area of study] has to do with appropriate action. For I should not be unfeeling like a statue, but should preserve my natural and acquired relations as a man who honours the gods, as a son, as a brother, as a father, as a citizen. (Discourses 3.2.4, trans. Hard)

Appropriate acts are in general measured by the relations they are concerned with. ‘He is your father.’ This means that you are called upon to take care of him, give way to him in all things, bear with him if he reviles or strikes you.
‘But he is a bad father.’
Well, have you any natural claim to a good father? No, only to a father.
‘My brother wrongs me.’
Be careful then to maintain the relation you hold to him, and do not consider what he does, but what you must do if your purpose is to keep in accord with nature. (Handbook 30, trans. Matheson)

The actions we undertake, Epictetus says, should be motivated by the specific obligations that we have in virtue of who we are, our natural relations to others, and what roles we have adopted in our dealings with the wider community (see Discourses 2.10.7–13). Put simply, our interest to live well as rational beings obliges us to act virtuously, to be patient, considerate, gentle, just, self-disciplined, even-tempered, dispassionate, unperturbed, and when necessary, courageous. This returns us to the central Stoic notion that the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life is realised by those who are motivated by virtue. The Discipline of Action points out to the prokoptôn how this should be applied in our practical affairs.

Epictetus sums up the first two disciplines:

We must have these principles ready to hand. Without them we must do nothing. We must set our mind on this object: pursue nothing that is outside us, nothing that is not our own, even as He that is mighty has ordained: pursuing what lies within our will [prohairetika], and all else [i.e., indifferent things] only so far as it is given to us. Further, we must remember who we are, and by what name we are called, and must try to direct our acts [kathêkonta] to fit each situation and its possibilities.
We must consider what is the time for singing, what the time for play, and in whose presence: what will be unsuited to the occasion; whether our companions are to despise us, or we to despise ourselves: when to jest, and whom to mock at: in a word, how one ought to maintain one’s character in society. Wherever you swerve from any of these principles, you suffer loss at once; not loss from without, but issuing from the very act itself. (Discourses 4.12.15–18, trans. Matheson)

The loss here is of course loss of eudaimonia.

Failing to ‘remember who we are’ will result in our failing to pursue those actions appropriate to our individual circumstances and commitments. Epictetus says that this happens because we forget what ‘name’ we have (son, brother, councillor, etc.), ‘for each of these names, if rightly considered, always points to the acts appropriate to it’ (Discourses 2.10.11, trans. Hard). To progress in the Discipline of Action, then, the prokoptôn must be conscious, moment by moment, of (a) which particular social role they are playing, and (b) which actions are required or appropriate for fulfilling that role to the highest standard.

iii. The Discipline of Assent

This exercise focuses on ‘assenting to impressions’, and continues the discussion already introduced in the section above on making proper use of impressions. ‘Assent’ translates the Greek sunkatathesis, which means ‘approve’, ‘agree’, or ‘go along with’. Thus, when we assent to an impression (phantasia) we are committing ourselves to it as a correct representation of how things are, and are saying, ‘Yes, this is how it is.’ The Discipline of Assent, then, is an exercise applied to our impressions in which we interpret and judge them in order to move from having the impression of something or other, to a declaration that such-and-such is the case.

The third area of study has to do with assent, and what is plausible and attractive. For, just as Socrates used to say that we are not to lead an unexamined life [see Plato, Apology 38a], so neither are we to accept an unexamined impression, but to say, ‘Stop, let me see what you are, and where you come from’, just as the night-watch say, ‘Show me your token.’ (Discourses 3.12.14–15, trans. Hard)

Make it your study then to confront every harsh impression with the words, ‘You are but an impression, and not at all what you seem to be’. Then test it by those rules that you possess; and first by this–the chief test of all–’Is it concerned with what is in our power or with what is not in our power?’ And if it is concerned with what is not in our power, be ready with the answer that it is nothing to you. (Handbook 1.5, trans. Matheson)

And we should do this with a view to avoiding falling prey to subjective (and false) evaluations so that we can be free from deception and from making rash judgements about how to proceed in the first two disciplines. For if we make faulty evaluations we will end up (with respect to the first discipline) having desires for the wrong things (namely, ‘indifferents’), and (with respect to the second discipline) acting inappropriately with regard to our duties and obligations. This is why Epictetus remarks that the third topic ‘concerns the security of the other two’ (Discourses 3.2.5, trans. Long).

Epictetus runs through a number of imaginary situations to show how we should be alert to the dangers of assenting to poorly evaluated impressions:

… We ought … to exercise ourselves daily to meet the impressions of our senses …. So-and-so’s son is dead. Answer, ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ His father has disinherited So-and-so; what do you think of it? ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ Caesar has condemned him. ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ He was grieved at all this. ‘That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is an evil.’ He has borne up under it manfully. ‘That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is a good.’ Now, if we acquire this habit, we shall make progress; for we shall never give our assent to anything but that of which we get a convincing sense-impression. His son is dead. What happened? His son is dead. Nothing else? Not a thing. His ship is lost. What happened? His ship is lost. He was carried off to prison. What happened? He was carried off to prison. But the observation: ‘He has fared ill,’ is an addition that each man makes on his own responsibility. (Discourses 3.8.1–5, trans. Oldfather)

What we must avoid, then, is adding to our impressions immediately and without proper evaluation any notion that something good or bad is at hand. For the only thing that is good is moral virtue, and the only harm that anyone can come to is to engage in affairs motivated by vice. Thus, to see the loss of a ship as a catastrophe would count as assenting to the wrong impression, for the impression that we have is that of just a ship being lost. To take the extra step of declaring that this is a misfortune and harmful would be to assent to an impression that is not in fact present, and would be a mistake. The loss of a ship, for a Stoic, is nothing more than a dispreferred indifferent, and does not constitute a harm.

f. God

For Epictetus, the terms ‘God’, ‘the gods’, and ‘Zeus’ are used interchangeably, and they appear frequently in the Discourses. In the Handbook, God is discussed as the ‘captain’ who calls us back on board ship, the subsequent voyage being a metaphor for our departure from life (see Handbook 7). God is also portrayed as ‘the Giver’ to whom we should return all those things we have enjoyed on loan when we lose close relatives or friends who die, and when we lose our possessions through misfortune (see Discourses 4.10.16 and Handbook 11).

If the Stoic making progress (the prokoptôn) understands God, the universe, and themselves in the right way, they ‘will never blame the gods, nor find fault with them’ (Handbook 31.1, trans. Oldfather):

Will you be angry and discontented with the ordinances of Zeus, which he, with the Fates who spun in his presence the thread of your destiny at the time of your birth, ordained and appointed? (Discourses 1.12.25, trans. Hard)

Indeed, they will pray to God to lead them to the fate that He has assigned them:

Lead me, Zeus, and you too, Destiny,
Wherever I am assigned by you;
I’ll follow and not hesitate,
But even if I do not wish to,
Because I’m bad, I’ll follow anyway.
(Handbook 53, trans. White = extract from Cleanthes’ Hymn to Zeus)

[For] God has stationed us to a certain place and way of life. (Discourses 1.9.24, trans. Dobbin)

Epictetus presents orthodox Stoic views on God. His justification for believing in God is expressed essentially along the lines of what we recognise as an argument from design. The order and harmony that we can perceive in the natural world (from astronomical events to the way plants grow and fruit in season) is attributed to a divine providence that orders and controls the entire cosmos intelligently and rationally (see Discourses 1.6.1–11, 1.14.1–6, 1.16.7–8 and 2.14.11/25–7). The Stoics were materialists, and God is conceived of as a type of fiery breath that blends perfectly with all other matter in the universe. In doing this, God transforms matter from undifferentiated ‘stuff’ into the varied forms that we see around us. This process is continuous, and God makes the world as it is, doing what it does, moment by moment. Just as the soul of a person is understood to bring alive and animate what would otherwise be dead and inert matter, so God is thought of as the ‘soul of the world’, and the universe is thought of as a sort of animal.

Stoics hold that the mind of each person is quite literally a fragment (apospasma) of God (see Discourses 2.8.11), and that the rationality that we each possess is in fact a fragment of God’s rationality; and this Epictetus primarily identifies as the capacity we have to make proper use of impressions (see Discourses 1.1.12). Epictetus expresses this in terms of what God has ‘given us’; He is conceived of as having constructed the universe in such a way that we have in our possession all that is within the compass of our own character or moral choice and nothing else, but this is no reason for complaint:

What has He given me for my own and subject to my authority, and what has He left for Himself? Everything within the sphere of the moral purpose He has given me, subjected them to my control, unhampered and unhindered. My body that is made of clay, how could He make that unhindered? Accordingly He has made it subject to the revolution of the universe–[along with] my property, my furniture, my house, my children, my wife. … But how should I keep them? In accordance with the terms upon which they have been given, and for as long as they can be given. But He who gave also takes away. …
And so, when you have received everything, and your very self, from Another [i.e., God], do you yet complain and blame the Giver, if He take something away from you? (Discourses 4.1.100–3, with omissions, trans. Oldfather)

The capacity that the prokoptôn has for understanding, accepting, and embracing this state of affairs, that this is indeed the nature of things, is another of the main foundation stones of Stoic ethics.

g. On Living in Accord with Nature

The outlook adopted and the activities performed by the Stoic student in pursuit of excellence, as detailed in the sections above, are frequently referred to collectively by Epictetus (following the Stoic tradition) as ‘following nature’ or ‘living in harmony with nature’. The Stoic prokoptôn maintains his ‘harmony with nature’ by being aware of why he acts as he does in terms of both (a) what his appropriate actions are, and (b) accepting what fate brings. If, for example, the prokoptôn is berated unfairly by his brother, he will not respond with angry indignation, for this would be ‘contrary to nature’, for nature has determined how brothers should rightly act towards each other (see Discourses 3.10.19–20). The task the Stoic student shoulders is to pursue actions appropriate to him as a brother, despite all and any provocation to act otherwise (see Handbook 30). This, for Epictetus, is a major component of what it means to keep one’s prohairesis (moral character) in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.6.15, 3.1.25 and 3.16.15).

Keeping ourselves in harmony with nature requires that we focus on two things. Firstly, we must pay attention to our own actions so that we respond appropriately, and secondly we must pay attention to the world in which our actions take effect and which prompts those actions in the first place.

When you are about to undertake some action, remind yourself what sort of action it is. If you are going out for a bath, put before your mind what commonly happens at the baths: some people splashing you, some people jostling, others being abusive, and others stealing. So you will undertake this action more securely if you say to yourself, ‘I want to have a bath and also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature.’ And do likewise in everything you undertake. So, if anything gets in your way when you are having your bath, you will be ready to say, ‘I wanted not only to have a bath but also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature; and I shall not keep it so if I get angry at what happens.’ (Handbook 4, trans. Hard)

In this extract about going to the baths, Epictetus focuses more on accepting what fate brings, saying that we should anticipate the sorts of things that can happen, so that when they do we will not be surprised and will not be angry. In other situations, anticipation of trouble or misfortune is impossible, but all the same, the Stoic will accept their fate as what God has ordained for them, and this for Epictetus is the very essence of keeping in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.4.18–21).

It is circumstances (difficulties) which show what men are. Therefore when a difficulty falls upon you, remember that God, like a trainer of wrestlers, has matched you with a rough young man. For what purpose? you may say. Why, that you may become an Olympic conqueror; but it is not accomplished without sweat. In my opinion no man has had a more profitable difficulty than you have had, if you choose to make use of it as an athlete would deal with a young antagonist. (Discourses 1.24.1–2, trans. Long)

Every problem we face in life should be understood as a new opportunity to strengthen our moral character, just as every new bout for the wrestler provides an opportunity for them to train their skill in wrestling.

To be instructed is this, to learn to wish that every thing may happen as it does. And how do things happen? As the disposer [i.e., God] has disposed them. And he has appointed summer and winter, and abundance and scarcity, and virtue and vice, and all such opposites for the harmony of the whole; and to each of us he has given a body, and parts of the body, and possessions, and companions.
Remembering then this disposition of things, we ought to go to be instructed, not that we may change the constitution of things, – for we have not the power to do it, nor is it better that we should have the power, – but in order that, as the things around us are what they are and by nature exist, we may maintain our minds in harmony with the things which happen. (Discourses 1.12.15–17, trans. Long)

The wise and good man … submits his own mind to him who administers the whole [i.e., God], as good citizens do to the law of the state. He who is receiving instruction ought to come to be instructed with this intention, How shall I follow the gods in all things, how shall I be contented with the divine administration, and how can I become free? For he is free to whom every thing happens according to his will [prohairesis], and whom no man can hinder. (Discourses 1.12.7–9, trans. Long)

In this last extract we see Epictetus refer to the ideal Stoic practice as that of ‘following the gods’. This means essentially the same as ‘following nature’, for God, who is immanent in the world (as the Stoics understand it) is identified with the way the world manifests, so if one follows nature, one must also be following God (see Discourses 1.20.15, 1.30.4, 4.7.20 and 4.10.14).

h. Metaphors for Life

Epictetus employs a number of metaphors to illustrate what the Stoic attitude to life should be.

Life as a festival

In this metaphor, Epictetus encourages us to think of life as a festival, arranged for our benefit by God, as something that we can live through joyously, able to put up with any hardships that befall us because we have our eye on the larger spectacle that is taking place. He asks his students:

Who are you, and for what purpose have you come? Was it not he [i.e., God] who brought you here? … And as what did he bring you here? Was it not as a mortal? Was it not as one who would live, with a little portion of flesh, upon this earth, and behold his governance and take part with him, for a short time, in his pageant and his festival? (Discourses 4.1.104, trans. Hard)

The whole thrust of Stoic ethics aims to persuade us that we should ourselves contribute to the festival by living as well as we may and fulfilling our duties as sociable citizens of God’s ‘great city of the universe’ (Discourses 3.22.4, trans. Hard). (See also Discourses 1.12.21, 2.14.23 and 4.4.24–7/46.)

Life as a game

At Discourses 2.5.2, in encouraging his students to appreciate that external things are indifferent (being neither good nor bad), Epictetus says that we should imitate those who play dice, for neither the dice nor the counters have any real value; what matters, and what is either good or bad, is the way we play the game. Similarly at 2.5.15–20, where Epictetus discusses the example of playing a ball game, no one considers for a moment whether the ball itself is good or bad, but only whether they can throw and catch it with the appropriate skill. What matters are the faculties of dexterity, speed and good judgement exhibited by the players, for it is in deploying these faculties effectively that any player is deemed to have played well. (See also Discourses 4.7.5/19/30–1.) Epictetus also uses the metaphor of playing games when discussing suicide, for just as someone stops playing a game when they are no longer amused by it, so it should be in life generally: if life should become unbearable, no one can force us to keep living it.

To summarize: remember that the door is open. Do not be more cowardly than children, but just as they say, when the game no longer pleases them, ‘I will play no more,’ you too, when things seem that way to you, should merely say, ‘I will play no more,’ and so depart; but if you stay, stop moaning. (Discourses 1.24.20, trans. Hard; see also 1.25.7–21 and 2.16.37)

Life as weaving

In this metaphor, the wool that the weaver uses to make cloth takes the place of the ball in the game; that is, whatever material comes our way, it is our duty to make proper use of it, and if possible make it into the best thing of its kind as we can (see Discourses 2.5.21–2).

Life as a play

We have already seen, when discussing the Discipline of Action, that Epictetus urges us to ‘remember who we are’ and what ‘name’ we have, because what role we play in life will determine which actions are appropriate for us. Obviously, the metaphor of life as a play expands on this idea, but also brings in the notion of our having to accept our fate, whatever that may be, since we do not ourselves chose the role we must play (for although we may aim for one role rather than another, we must recognise that our attaining it is not, in fact, ‘in our power’).

Remember that you are an actor in a play, which is as the author [i.e., God] wants it to be: short, if he wants it to be short; long, if he wants it to be long. If he wants you to act a poor man, a cripple, a public official, or a private person, see that you act it with skill. For it is your job to act well the part that is assigned to you; but to choose it is another’s. (Handbook 17, trans. Hard)

Life as an athletic contest

This metaphor invites us to see an analogy between one’s training in Stoic ethics as preparatory for living the philosophic life and someone’s training in athletics as preparatory for entering the contest in the arena. Epictetus addresses someone who has become distressed at not having enough leisure to study their philosophy books, saying:

For is not reading a kind of preparation for living, but living itself made up of things other than books? It is as if an athlete, when he enters the stadium, should break down and weep because he is not exercising outside. This is what you were exercising for; this is what the jumping-weights, and the sand and your young partners were all for. So are you now seeking for these, when it is the time for action? That is just as if, in the sphere of assent, when we are presented with impressions, some of which are evidently true and others not, instead of distinguishing between them, we should want to read a treatise On Direct Apprehension. (Discourses 4.4.11–13, trans. Hard)

Training to live a life that befits someone who strives for the Stoic ideal is directly compared to athletic training. Such training is difficult, demanding, and unpleasant; there is little point in showing eagerness for any endeavour if we have not properly assessed the demands that will be placed upon us, and in inevitably losing our original enthusiasm we will look foolish. This applies to philosophic training no less than to training as a wrestler in preparation for competing in the Olympic games (see Discourses 3.15.1–13 = Handbook 29). Elsewhere, Epictetus declares that delay is no longer possible, that we must meet the challenges that life throws at us:

Therefore take the decision right now that you must live as a full-grown man, as a man who is making progress; and all that appears to be best must be to you a law that cannot be transgressed. And if you are confronted with a hard task or with something pleasant, or with something held in high repute or no repute, remember that the contest is now, and that the Olympic games are now, and that it is no longer possible to delay the match, and that progress is lost and saved as a result of one defeat and even one moment of giving in. (Handbook 51.2, trans. Boter; see also Discourses 1.4.13–17, 1.18.21–3, 1.24.1–2 and 3.25.3)

Life as military service

This metaphor returns us to the Stoic idea that the universe is governed by God, and that, like it or not, we are all in service to God. The Stoic prokoptôn (student making progress) should understand that they should live life attempting to discharge this service to the highest standards. Epictetus addresses the person who is upset that they are obliged to travel abroad, causing their mother to be distressed at their absence.

Do you not know that life is a soldier’s service? One man must keep guard, another go out to reconnoitre, another take the field. It is not possible for all to stay where they are, nor is it better so. But you neglect to fulfil the orders of the general and complain, when some severe order is laid upon you; you do not understand to what a pitiful state you are bringing the army so far as in you lies; you do not see that if all follow your example there will be no one to dig a trench, or raise a palisade, no one to keep night watch or fight in the field, but every one will seem an unserviceable soldier.
… So too it is in the world; each man’s life is a campaign, and a long and varied one. It is for you to play the soldier’s part–do everything at the General’s bidding, divining his wishes, if it be possible. (Discourses 3.24.31–5, trans. Matheson; see also 1.9.24 and 1.16.20–1)

i. Making Progress

In making progress, the Stoic prokoptôn will pay a price. In standing to God, the world, society, herself and her undertakings in this new way (by accepting the Stoic notions of what is truly good, what is truly up to her, where her proper duties lie, and in considering her life to be one of service to God), the prokoptôn separates herself from the rest of society in fairly marked, if not profound, ways. For example, Epictetus wants his students to enjoy and participate in the ‘festival of life’, yet at the public games (for instance) they must not support any one individual, but must wish the winner to be he who actually wins; they must refrain entirely from shouting or laughing, and must not get carried away by the spectacle of the contest (Handbook 33.10). So whilst the prokoptôn’s friends immerse themselves fully in the games, cheering on their man and jeering at his opponent, the Stoic stands aloof and detached. Deliberately separating herself from the crowd is the price she pays for well-being (eudaimonia), dispassion (apatheia), tranquillity and imperturbability (ataraxia), along with the conviction that she is living as God intends.

But having declared her hand, the prokoptôn will pay in other ways also, for those around her will rebuke and ridicule her (Handbook 22), for in abandoning the values and practices common to the wider community, she will provoke hostility and suspicion. Yet there remains the hope that some at least will see the prokoptôn as someone whose wisdom has value for the community at large, as someone who serves as an example of how one may get along in the world without being overwhelmed by it, as someone with specific skills to offer, such as mediating family disputes and suchlike (see Discourses 1.15.5).

Epictetus characterises the differences between the non-philosopher and someone making progress in these terms:

This is the position and character of a layman: He never looks for either help or harm from himself, but only from externals. This is the position and character of the philosopher: He looks for all his help or harm from himself.
Signs of one who is making progress are: He censures no one, praises no one, blames no one, finds fault with no one, says nothing about himself as though he were somebody or knew something. When he is hampered or prevented, he blames himself. And if anyone compliments him, he smiles to himself at the person complimenting; while if anyone censures him, he makes no defence. He goes about like an invalid, being careful not to disturb, before it has grown firm, any part which is getting well. He has put away from himself every desire, and has transferred his aversion to those things only, of what is under our control [eph’ hêmin], which are contrary to nature. He exercises no pronounced choice in regard to anything. If he gives the appearance of being foolish or ignorant he does not care. In a word, he keeps guard against himself as though he were his own enemy lying in wait. (Handbook 48.1–3, trans. Oldfather)

Epictetus’ life as a Stoic teacher can perhaps be regarded as a personal quest to awaken to true philosophic enlightenment that person who will stand up proudly when his teacher pleads:

Pray, let somebody show me a person who is in such a good way that he can say, ‘I concern myself only with what is my own, with what is free from hindrance, and is by nature free. That is what is truly good, and this I have. But let all else be as god may grant; it makes no difference to me.’ (Discourses 4.13.24, trans. Hard)

For having attained such enlightenment himself (for surely this we must suppose), Epictetus devoted his life to raising up others from the crowd of humanity who could stand beside him and share in a perception of the universe and a way of life that any rational being is obliged to adopt in virtue of the nature of things.

5. Glossary of Terms


‘indifferent’; any of those things that are neither good or bad, everything, in fact, that does not fall under the headings ‘virtue’ or ‘vice’. The indifferents are what those lacking Stoic wisdom frequently take to have value (either positive or negative), and hence take to be desirable or undesirable. Pursuing them, or trying to avoid them, can lead to disturbing emotions that undermine one’s capacity to lead a eudaimôn life.


freedom from passion, a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


aversion; the opposite of hormê.


any ‘dispreferred’ indifferent, including such things as sickness, poverty, social exclusion, and so forth (conventionally ‘bad’ things). Suffering any of the dispreferred indifferents does not detract from the eudaimôn life enjoyed by the Stoic sophos. See proêgmena.

appropriate action

see kathêkon.


‘excellence’ or virtue; in the context of Stoic ethics the possession of ‘moral excellence’ will secure eudaimonia. For Epictetus, one acquires this by learning the correct use of impressions, following God, and following nature.


training or exercise undertaken by the Stoic prokoptôn striving to become a Stoic sophos.


see sunkatathesis and phantasiai (impressions).


imperturbability, literally ‘without trouble’, sometimes translated as ‘tranquillity’; a state of mind that is a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


see kathêkon.


avoidance; opposite of orexis.


‘external’; any of those things that fall outside the preserve of one’s prohairesis, including health, wealth, sickness, life, death, pain – what Epictetus calls aprohaireta, which are not in our power, the ‘indifferent‘ things.


see pathos.


see telos.

eph’ hêmin

what is in our power, or ‘up to us’ – namely, the correct use of impressions.


‘happiness’ or ‘flourishing’ or ‘living well’. One achieves this end by learning the correct use of impressions following God, and following nature.


‘good feelings’, possessed by the Stoic wise person (sophos) who experiences these special sorts of emotions, but does not experience irrational and disturbing passions.


see aretê.

external thing

see ektos.


see theos.


‘commanding faculty’ of the soul (psuchê); the centre of consciousness, the seat of all mental states, thought by the Stoics (and other ancients) to be located in the heart. It manifests four mental powers: the capacity to receive impressions, to assent to them, form intentions to act in response to them, and to do these things rationally. The Discourses talk of keeping the prohairesis in the right condition, and also of keeping the hêgemonikon in the right condition, and for Epictetus these notions are essentially interchangeable.


impulse to act; that which motivates an action.


see phantasiai.


see adiaphora.


any ‘appropriate action’, ‘proper function’, or ‘duty’ undertaken by someone aiming to do what befits them as a responsible, sociable person. The appropriate actions are the subject of the second of the three topoi.


a ‘right action’ or ‘perfect action’ undertaken by the Stoic sophos, constituted by an appropriate action performed virtuously.


‘desire’ properly directed only at virtue.


see pathos.


any of the disturbing emotions or ‘passions’ experienced by those who lack Stoic wisdom and believe that externals really are good or bad, when in fact they are ‘indifferent‘. A pathos according to the Stoics is a false judgement based on a misunderstanding of what is truly good and bad.


‘impressions’, what we are aware of in virtue of having experiences. Whereas non-rational animals respond to their impressions automatically (thus ‘using’ them), over and above using our impressions, human beings, being rational, can ‘attend to their use’ and, with practice, assent or not assent to them as we deem appropriate. The capacity to do this is what Epictetus strives to teach his students.


nature. To acquire eudaimonia one must ‘follow nature’, which means accepting our own fate and the fate of the world, as well as understanding what it means to be a rational being and strive for virtue. See aretê and God.


any ‘preferred’ indifferent, conventionally taken to be good, including such things as health and wealth, taking pleasure in the company of others, and so forth. Enjoying any of the preferred indifferents is not in itself constitutive of the eudaimôn life sought by the Stoic prokoptôn. See apoproêgmena.


‘moral character’, the capacity that rational beings have for making choices and intending the outcomes of their actions, sometimes translated as will, volition, intention, choice, moral choice, moral purpose. This faculty is understood by Stoics to be essentially rational. It is the faculty we use to ‘attend to impressions‘ and to give (or withhold) assent to impressions.


one who is making progress (prokopê) in living as a Stoic, which for Epictetus means above all learning the correct use of impressions.

proper function

see kathêkon.

right action

see katorthôma.


the Stoic wise person who values only aretê and enjoys a eudaimôn life. The sophos enjoys a way of engaging in life that the prokoptôn strives to emulate and attain.


assent; a capacity of the prohairesis to judge the significance of impressions.


disturbance, trouble; what one avoids when one enjoys ataraxia.


end; that which we should pursue for its own sake and not for the sake of any other thing. For the Stoic, this is virtue. Epictetus formulates the end in several different but closely related ways. He says that the end is to maintain one’s prohairesis in proper order, to follow God, and to follow nature, all of which count as maintaining a eudaimôn life. The means by which this is to be accomplished is to apply oneself to the ‘three disciplines‘ assiduously.


God, who is material, is a sort of fiery breath that blends with undifferentiated matter to create the forms that we find in the world around us. He is supremely rational, and despite our feelings to the contrary, makes the best world that it is possible to make. Epictetus says that we should ‘follow God’, that is, accept the fate that He bestows on us and on the world. Stoics understand that the rationality enjoyed by every human being (and any other rational beings, should there be any) is literally a fragment of God.


‘topics’. The ‘three topics’ or ‘fields of study’ which we find elucidated in the Discourses is an original feature of Epictetus’ educational programme. The three fields of study are: (1) The Discipline of Desire, concerned with desire and avoidance (orexis and ekklisis), and what is really good and desirable (virtue, using impressions properly, following God, and following nature); (2) The Discipline of Action, concerned with impulse and aversion (hormê and aphormê), and our ‘appropriate actions‘ or ‘duties’ with respect to living in our communities in ways that befit a rational being; and (3) The Discipline of Assent, concerned with how we should judge our impressions so as not to be carried away by them into anxiety or disturbing emotions with the likelihood of failing in the first two Disciplines.


from the Latin virtus which translates the Greek aretê, ‘excellence’.


the name for God; Epictetus uses the terms ‘Zeus’, ‘God’, and ‘the gods’ interchangeably.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Translations of Epictetus

(Note: ‘Enchiridion‘, ‘Encheiridion‘, ‘Handbook‘, and ‘Manual‘ all refer to the same work. Items in print and currently available are indicated with an asterisk*.)

  • *Boter, Gerard. 1999. The Encheiridion of Epictetus & its Three Christian Adaptations: Transmission & Critical Editions. Leiden: Brill.
  • *Dobbin, Robert. 1998. Epictetus: Discourses Book 1. Oxford: Clarendon.
    • Includes commentary.
  • *Hard, Robin. 1995. The Discourses of Epictetus. ed. with introduction and notes by Christopher Gill. London: Everyman/Dent.
    • Includes the complete Discourses, The Handbook, and Fragments.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1890. The Works of Epictetus Consisting of His Discourses, in Four Books, The Enchiridion, and Fragments. Boston: Little, Brown, & Company.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1944. Epictetus: Discourses and Enchiridion. Roslyn, NY: Walter J. Black.
    • Reprint of the nineteenth-century translation with minor editorial alterations.
  • *Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1948. The Enchiridion. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • *Lobell, Sharon. 1995. Epictetus: The Art of Living. The Classic Manual on Virtue, Happiness, and Effectiveness: A New Interpretation. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco.
    • A free paraphrase of the Handbook.
  • Long, George. 1890. The Discourses of Epictetus with the Encheiridion and Fragments. London: George Bell.
    • First published 1848.
  • *Long, George. 1991. Enchiridion. Amherst, NY: Prometheus.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • Matheson, P. E. 1916. Epictetus: The Discourses and Manual. 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • *Matson, Wallace I. 1998. Epictetus: Encheiridion. in Louis P. Pojman. ed. Classics of Philosophy: Volume 1, Ancient and Medieval. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • *Oldfather, W. A. 1925, 1928. Epictetus: The Discourses as Reported by Arrian, The Manual, and Fragments. 2 vols. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press.
    • With original Greek text facing English translation.
  • *Saunders, Jason L. ed. 1996. Greek and Roman Philosophy after Aristotle. New York: Free Press.
    • Readings from Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, Philo, Plotinus, and early Christian thought. Includes P. E. Matheson’s translation of the Manual of Epictetus.
  • *White, Nicholas. 1983. Handbook of Epictetus. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • A very competent and readable translation, with notes and a helpful, clear introduction.

b. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics

  • Inwood, Brad and L. P. Gerson. 1997. Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings. 2nd edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism and Scepticism.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin.

c. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically

  • Bonhöffer, Adolf Friedrich. 1996. The Ethics of the Stoic Epictetus. trans. William O. Stephens. New York: Peter Lang.
    • A very nicely done translation of this significant nineteenth-century work first published in 1894.
  • Hijmans, B. L. 1959. Askesis: Notes on Epictetus’ Educational System. Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Long, A. A. 2002. Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stephens, William O. 1996. Epictetus on How the Stoic Sage Loves. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 14: 193–210.
    • A very clear, scholarly survey of Epictetus’ ethics.
  • Stockdale, James Bond. 1993. Courage Under Fire: Testing Epictetus’s Doctrines in a Laboratory of Human Behavior. Stanford: Hoover Institution/Stanford University.
    • An account of how the author used the principles of Stoic ethics to survive the rigors of a Vietnamese prisoner of war camp.
  • Xenakis, Jason. 1969. Epictetus: Philosopher–Therapist. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

d. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally

  • Annas, Julia. 1995. The Morality of Happiness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gould, Josiah B. 1970. The Philosophy of Chrysippus. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1995. Philosophy as a Way of Life. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Engaging essays on the notion of philosophy as a way of life, with focus on Stoic practice.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1998. The Inner Citadel: The Mediations of Marcus Aurelius. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains a very helpful chapter on Epictetus.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1985. Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1989. Virtue and the Goods of Fortune in Stoic Moral Theory. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 95–127.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1993. Austere Friends: The Stoics and Friendship. Apeiron 26: 57–75.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • More, Paul Elmer. 1923. Hellenistic Philosophies. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. 1994. The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains very helpful chapters on Stoic ethics from the view point of philosophy as therapy, as the ancients conceived it.
  • Reale, Giovanni. 1990. A History of Ancient Philosophy: 4. The Schools of the Imperial Age. ed. & trans. John R. Catan. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Sandbach, F. H. 1989. The Stoics. London: Duckworth and Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Sharples, R. W. 1996. Stoics, Epicureans, and Sceptics: An Introduction to Hellenistic Philosophy. London: Routledge.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1990. Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquillity. The Monist 73–1: 97–110. also in Striker 1996
  • Striker, Gisela. 1991. Following Nature: A Study in Stoic Ethics. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 9: 1–73. also in Striker 1996.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1996. Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

e. Other items on Hellenistic philosophy generally

  • Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. 1999. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Annas, Julia. 1992. Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.

Author Information

Keith H. Seddon
Warnborough College

Empedocles (c. 492—432 B.C.E.)

empedoclesEmpedocles (of Acagras in Sicily) was a philosopher and poet: one of the most important of the philosophers working before Socrates (the Presocratics), and a poet of outstanding ability and of great influence upon later poets such as Lucretius. His works On Nature and Purifications (whether they are two poems or only one – see below) exist in more than 150 fragments. He has been regarded variously as a materialist physicist, a shamanic magician, a mystical theologian, a healer, a democratic politician, a living god, and a fraud. To him is attributed the invention of the four-element theory of matter (earth, air, fire, and water), one of the earliest theories of particle physics, put forward seemingly to rescue the phenomenal world from the static monism of Parmenides. Empedocles’ world-view is of a cosmic cycle of eternal change, growth and decay, in which two personified cosmic forces, Love and Strife, engage in an eternal battle for supremacy. In psychology and ethics Empedocles was a follower of Pythagoras, hence a believer in the transmigration of souls, and hence also a vegetarian. He claims to be a daimôn, a divine or potentially divine being, who, having been banished from the immortals gods for ‘three times countless years’ for committing the sin of meat-eating and forced to suffer successive reincarnations in an purificatory journey through the different orders of nature and elements of the cosmos, has now achieved the most perfect of human states and will be reborn as an immortal. He also claims seemingly magical powers including the ability to revive the dead and to control the winds and rains.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Physics and Cosmology
    1. Physics
    2. Cosmology
  4. Biology
    1. Origin of Species
    2. Embryology
    3. Perception and Thought
  5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul
    1. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls
    2. Meat-Eating and Sin
    3. Theology
    4. Physics and Theology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Commentaries
    2. Studies

1. Life

The most detailed source for Empedocles’ life is Diogenes Laertius’ Lives of the Eminent Philosophers 8.51-75. Perhaps because of his claims to divine status and magical powers a remarkable number of apocryphal stories gathered around the life of Empedocles in antiquity. His death in particular attracted attention and is reported to have occurred in several, clearly bathetic, ways: that he fell overboard from a ship and drowned; that he fell from his carriage, broke his leg and died; that he hanged himself; or the most famous account that, when he felt he was shortly to die and because he wished to appear to have been apotheosized, he leapt into the crater of Etna. In this story the ruse was unfortunately discovered when one of his trademark bronze sandals was thrown up by the volcano.

From more reliable sources it seems that he was born at Acragas in Sicily around 492 B.C.E. and died at the age of sixty. He was the son of a certain Meton, and was from an important and wealthy local aristocratic family: his grandfather, also called Empedocles, is reported to have been victorious in horse-racing at the Olympic Games in 496 B.C.E. It is not known where or with whom he studied philosophy, but various teachers are assigned to him by ancient sources, among them Parmenides, Pythagoras, Xenophanes, Anaxagoras and Anaximander (from whom he is said to have inherited his extravagant mode of dress). Whether or not he was his pupil, Empedocles was certainly very familiar with the work of Parmenides from whom he took the inspiration to write in hexameter verse, and whose physical system he adopts in part, and partly seeks to rectify.

He is reported to have been wealthy and to have kept a train of boy attendants and also to have provided dowries for many girls of Acragas. In dress he affected a purple robe with a golden girdle, bronze sandals, and a Delphic laurel-wreath, and in his manner he was grave and cultivated a regal public persona. These attributes contrast with his political outlook which is uniformly reported to have been actively pro-democratic. He began his political career with the prosecution of two state officials for their arrogant behaviour towards foreign guests which was seen as a sign of incipient tyrannical tendencies. He is also credited with activities against other anti-democratic citizens, and even with putting down an oligarchy and instituting a democracy at Acragas by use of his powers of rhetorical persuasion. Two speeches of his in favour of equality are also mentioned. His surviving poetry certainly shows considerable rhetorical skills, and indeed he is credited by Aristotle with the invention of rhetoric itself. Another report is of his breaking up a shadowy aristocratic political organisation called the ‘Thousand’. As a whole the tradition presents a picture of Empedocles as a popular politician, rhetorician, and champion of democracy and equality. This appears to fit in with the known history of Acragas where after the death of the popular and enlightened tyrant Theron in 473 B.C.E. his son Thrasydaeus proved to be a violent despot. After his forcible removal a democracy was established despite continuing political tensions.

As well as a being a philosopher, poet and politician, Empedocles was famous for his medical skills and healing powers. In his works he presents himself as a wandering healer offering to thousands of eager followers ‘prophecies’ and ‘words of healing for all kinds of illnesses’ (fr. 112 (Fragment numbers are those of Diels-Kranz)). He also promises his addressee Pausanias ‘you will learn remedies (pharmaka) for ills and help against old age’ and even ‘you will lead from Hades the life-force of a dead man’. To what degree this represents the real Empedocles is not known, but a tradition grew up of him as both a renowned physician and a practitioner of more magical cures, or as a charlatan. These stories however, may well derive from Empedocles’ own words in his poetry. On the other hand his work does show considerable interest in biology and especially in embryology and he was eminent enough as a writer on medicine to be attack ed by the writer of the Hippocratic treatise On Ancient Medicine who attempts to separate medicine from philosophy and rejects Empedocles’ work along with all philosophical medical works as irrelevant. The stories of his wonder-working such as curing entire plagues, reviving the dead and controlling the elements are clearly exaggerated at least, but it is becoming clearer, especially since the discovery of the Strasbourg fragments (see below), that, contrary to many former interpretations, Empedocles did not make a clear separation between his philosophy of nature and the more mystical, theological aspects of his philosophy, and so may well have seen no great difference in kind between healing ills through empirical understanding of human physiognomy and healing by means of sacred incantations and ritual purifications. His public as well may have made no great distinction between ‘scientific’ and sacred medicine as is suggested by the account of Empedocles curing a plague by restoring a fresh water-supply, after which he was venerated as a god.

2. Works

Empedocles work survives only in fragments, but luckily in a far greater number than any of the other Presocratics. These fragments are mostly quotations found in other authors such as Aristotle and Plutarch. Although many works, including tragedies and a medical treatise, are attributed to Empedocles by ancient sources no fragments of these have survived, and the extant fragments all come from a work of hexameter poetry traditionally entitled On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Phusika) and some from a possibly separate work called Purifications (Katharmoi). Of these two titles On Nature is by far the better attested and nearly all the fragments which are cited by ancient authors along with the title of the work they came from are attributed to On Nature, while only two are attributed to the Purifications. Because the fragments contain both material that clearly refers to physics and cosmology – the four elements, the cosmic cycle etc. – and also material concerning the fate of the soul, sin and purification, traditionally the former were placed in reconstructions of On Nature, and the latter in the Purifications. Indeed Empedocles’ writings contain ideas and themes that may seem quite incompatible with one another. On Natureas usually reconstructed seemed the work of a mechanist physicist which seeks to replace the traditional gods with four lifeless impersonal elements and two cosmic forces of attraction and repulsion, Love and Strife. The Purifications on the other hand seemed the work of a deeply religious Pythagorean mystic: it was often thought that Empedocles either wrote the Purifications as a move away from the mechanistic materialist position in On Nature, or that the Purifications were an addendum to On Nature, looking at the world from quite a different perspective.

However there have long been doubts about whether there were really two poems or only one poem (perhaps called On Nature and Purifications or with On Nature and Purifications as alternative titles for the same work) which contained both physical and religious material. First, although we may think of a poem called Physics as restricting itself to physical concerns alone, this may well be an anachronistic retrojection of modern rationalistic ideas of a gulf between physics and religion. Further, ancient book titles tend to be generic and there is a long tradition of works called either On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Physika) by various authors, with the earliest attested title for such works being On the Nature of the Universe (Peri Phuseôs tôn Ontôn ‘On the Nature of Things that Exist’), and so neither title may be Empedocles’ own and the two may perhaps be interchangeable different titles for the same work. Although there is still argument on this subject the Strasbourg fragments now suggest strongly that both physical and religious material was originally together in On Nature.

In 1990 the first ancient papyrus fragments of Empedocles were rediscovered at the University of Strasbourg and were published in 1999. Since these were also the first papyrus fragments of any of the Presocratics their discovery caused considerable excitement. Among other important new information they give about Empedocles’ philosophy, with great good fortune fr. a, the longest of the new fragments, was found to be a continuation of the longest of the previously known fragments (fr. 17) and thus now the two together form a continuous text of 69 lines. Fr. 17 is cited by Simplicius as being from book one of On Nature, and again very fortunately Strasbourg fr. a(ii) contains a marginal note by the manuscript copyist identifying line 30 of fr. a(ii) as line 300 of book one of On Nature. Since the Strasbourg fragments seem to have come from a single piece of papyrus, and they also overlap with a formerly known religious fragment usually placed in the Purifications (fr. 1 39) it now seems very likely that Empedocles introduced the themes of sin and purification early on in the physical poem. In fact it can now be argued that all of the fragments of the Purifications can be accommodated in the early part of book one of On Nature.

3. Physics and Cosmology

a. Physics

The foundations of Empedocles’ physics lie in the assumption that there are four ‘elements’ of matter, or ‘roots’ as he calls them, using a botanical metaphor that stresses their creative potential: earth, air, fire and water. These are able to create all things, including all living creatures, by being ‘mixed’ in different combinations and proportions. Each of the elements however, retains its own characteristics in the mixture, and each is eternal and unchanging. The positing of these four roots of matter forms part of a tradition of opposite material creative principles in Presocratic philosophy, but it also has its origins in an attempt to counter the theories of Parmenides who had argued that the world is single and unchanging since nothing can come from nothing and nothing can be destroyed into nothing: the theory known as Eleatic monism. Empedocles’ response was to appropriate Parmenides’ ideas and to use them against themselves. Nothing can come from nothing nor be destroyed into nothing (fr. 12), and therefore, in order to rescue the reality of the phenomenal world, there must be assumed to exist something eternal and unchanging beneath the constant change, growth and decay of the visible world. Empedocles then, transfers the changelessness that Parmenides attributes to the entire world to his four elements, and replaces the static singularity Parmenides’ world with a dynamic plurality. The four elements correspond closely to their expression at the macroscopic level of nature, with the traditional quadripartite division of the cosmos into earth, sea, air, and the fiery aether of the heavenly bodies: these four naturally occurring ‘elements’ of the cosmos clearly represent a fundamental natural division of matter at the largest scale. This division at the macroscopic level of reality is applied reductively at the microscopic level to produce a parallelism between the constituents of matter and the fundamental constituents of the cosmos, but the reduction of the world into four types of material particles does not deny the reality of the world we see, but instead validates it. Empedocles stresses this parallel between the elements at the different levels of reality by using the terms ‘sun’ ‘sea’ and ‘Earth’ interchangeably with ‘fire’, ‘water’ and ‘earth’. Of the four elements, although Empedocles stresses their equality of powers, fire is also granted a special role both in its hardening effect on mixtures of the other elements and also as the fundamental principle of living things.

b. Cosmology

Empedocles also posits two cosmic forces which work upon the elements in both creative and destructive ways. These he personifies as Love (Philia) – a force of attraction and combination – and Strife (Neikos) – a force of repulsion and separation. Whether these cosmic forces are to be envisaged in simply mechanistic terms as descriptions of the way things happen, or as expressions of internal properties of the elements, or as external forces that act upon the elements, is not clear. It is also unclear whether the two forces are to be seen as impersonal mechanistic physical forces or as intelligent divinities that act in purposive ways in creation and destruction. Evidence can be found for all these interpretations. What is clear is that these two forces are engaged in an eternal battle for domination of the cosmos and that they each prevail in turn in an endless cosmic cycle. The details of this cosmic cycle are also difficult to establish, but the most widely accepted interpretation is represented in the following diagram:


Beginning from the top of the diagram and proceeding clockwise, when Love is completely dominant she draws all the elements fully together into a Sphere in which, although the elements are not fused together into a single mass, each is indistinguishable from the others. The Sphere then, is an a-cosmic state during which no matter can exist, and no life is possible. Then as Love’s power gradually weakens and Strife begins to grow in power, he gradually separates out the elements from the Sphere until there is enough separation for matter to come into existence, for the world to be created and for all life to be born. When Strife has achieved total domination we again get an a-cosmic state in which the elements are separated completely and the world and all life is destroyed in a Whirl. Then Love begins to increase in power and to draw the elements together again, and as she does so the world is again created and life is again born. When Love has achieved full dominan ce we return once more to the sphere. As Empedocles puts it in fr. 17.1-8:

A twofold tale I shall tell: at one time it grew to be one only from many, and at another again it divided to be many from one. There is a double birth of what is mortal, and a double passing away; for the uniting of all things brings one generation into being and destroys it, and the other is reared and scattered as they are again being divided. And these things never cease their continuous exchange of position, at one time all coming together into one through Love, at another again being borne away from each other by Strife’s repulsion.

The cosmos exists in a state of constant flux then, beneath which there is a certain sort of stability in the eternity of the elements. The world is in a constant state of organic evolution, and there appear to be two different creations and two different worlds which have no direct link between them. According the most widely accepted interpretation Empedocles considered that we ourselves inhabit the world under the increasing power of Strife.

4. Biology

Empedocles’ physics have a particularly biological focus as is indicated by his choice of the botanical metaphor of ‘roots’ for what were later called ‘elements’. The term ‘roots’ stresses the creative potential of the roots rather than illustrating the way they create things by being mixed in different combinations: ‘elements’ (stoicheia in Greek, elementa in Latin) is the word for the letters of the alphabet, and is a metaphor that stresses the ability of the elements of matter to form different types of matter by interchange of position just as a limited number of letters are able to form all sorts of different words on the page. To illustrate this aspect of the creative abilities of his roots Empedocles uses an analogy with the way painters can use a limited number of colours to create all sorts of different colours and represent all the different productions of nature.
Fr. 23:

As painters, men well taught by wisdom in the practice of their art, decorate temple offerings when they take in their hands pigments of various colours, and after fitting them in close combination – more of some and less of others – they produce from them shapes resembling all things, creating trees and men and women, animals and birds and water-nourished fish, and long-lived gods too, highest in honor; so let not error convince you in your mind that there is any other source for the countless perishables that are seen, but know this clearly, since the account you have heard is divinely revealed.

Among other aspects, this analogy exhibits Empedocles’ tendency to think about the creative abilities of the elements in terms of their biological products, here a characteristically Empedoclean list of creatures representing the different orders of nature: plants, humans, land animals, birds, and fish, as well as gods. If painters use a mixture of a small number of pigments to produce copies of the works of nature, then the same process is productive of those works of nature. In other ways as well in his presentation of the cosmic cycle and the endless combination and separation of the elements he tends to elide the distinction between the elements and the life-forms they produce. Just as in the parallel he draws between the elements of the cosmos on both microscopic and macroscopic levels, so a close parallel is drawn between living creatures and their constituent elements.

a. Origin of Species

Empedocles presents us with the earliest extant attempt at producing a detailed rational mechanism for the origin of species. Greek traditions include the aetiological myths of the origin of a particular species of animal by transformation from a human being (many of these ancient mythological aetiologies are collected by Ovid in the Metamorphoses). The origins of humans, or of particular heroes, founders of cities or of races is frequently explained by what I term a botanical analogy: they originally emerged autochthonously from the ground just as plants do today, and this is also standard in ancient scientific theories as well: the original spontaneous generation of life from the earth, with all creatures emerging in their present species. Empedocles attempts to provide a comprehensive mechanism for the origins not simply of humans or of a particular animal but of all animal life, including humans, and a rational mechanism that would seem to do away with the need for any design in creatures or any external agency to order them and separate them into their individual species.

In Strasbourg fr. a(ii) 23-30 we now find the following lines in which Empedocles seemingly introduces his account of zoogony:

I will show you to your eyes too, where they find a larger body: first the coming together and the unfolding of birth, and as many as are now remaining of this generation. This [is to be seen] among the wilder species of mountain-roaming beasts; this [is to be seen] in the twofold offspring of men, this [is to be seen] in the produce of the root-bearing fields and of the cluster of grapes mounting on the vine. From these convey to your mind unerring proofs of my account: for you will see the coming together and unfolding of birth.

Empedocles promises an exposition of zoogony and the origin of species which, from the examples he gives – wild animals, humans and plants – is clearly intended to encompass all animal and plant life, including humans. He appeals to present day species as proofs of his theories: we can see both the products of this process of zoogony around us in nature today and also, it seems, we can see the same processes still going on today. That the theory refers to present day species rather than creatures in some counter world is underlined by the stress Empedocles puts on ‘as many as are now remaining of this generation’. So the theory is intended to explain the origin and development of all life and refers specifically to the animals and plants around us today, both as examples of and as proofs of the theory he will propose. This process of generation he describes by the repeated ‘the coming together and the unfolding of birth’. This seems to posit two processes which work, either together or separately, to produce the life we see around us today: a process of coming together and also a process of unfolding or perhaps more strictly ‘unleafing’ since the metaphor originates from the leaves of plants. So the second part of this process of zoogony involves a botanical metaphor: just as in the traditional botanical analogy of the myths of autochthony, an appeal to the development and growth of plants is used to describe the process of the development of all life.

According to fragments B57, B59, B60, and B61, first of all individual limbs and organs were produced from the earth. These wandered separately at first and then under the combining power of Love they came together in all sorts of wild and seemingly random hybrid combinations, producing double fronted creatures, hermaphrodites, ox-faced man creatures and man-faced ox-creatures. This weird picture is explained by Aristotle in the Physics and later in more detail by Simplicius in his commentary on the Physics as a theory of the origin of species in which, as we would put it, a certain form of natural selection is operative. The creatures assembled wrongly from parts of disparate animals will die out, either immediately, or by being unable to breed, and only the creatures by chance put together from homogeneous limbs will survive and so go on to found the species that we see today. The production of species and their ordering then is explained by a mechanistic process long recognised as a forerunner of Darwin’s theory of natural selection. Unlike in Darwin’s theory however, there would seem to be no gradual evolution of one species into another, and all of the variety of nature is produced in a great burst of birth in the beginning and is then whittled down by extinctions into the creatures we see today. That this theory intends to account for the origins of both humans and animals is ensured by the component parts of the ox-headed man-creatures and man-headed ox-creatures. There will clearly also be created by this system man-headed man-creatures and ox-headed ox-creatures, that is to say normal oxen and normal humans, although they are not mentioned. Further evidence that this zoogony relates to present day creatures is given by Aristotle and Simplicius who tell us that this process is still going on today.

However, Empedocles also adds to this theory another explanation of the origins of humans very much along the lines of traditional myths of autochthony. In fr. B62 and Strasbourg fr. d he describes the ‘shoots’ of men and women arising from the earth, drawn up by fire as it separates out from the other elements during the creation under the power of increasing Strife. As his choice of the word ‘shoots’ indicates these are not yet fully articulated people with distinct limbs but ‘whole-nature forms’ that ‘did not as yet show the lovely shape of limbs, or voice or language native to man’. We may assume that as Strife increases in power these ‘shoots’ will, just as plant buds do, gradually become fully articulated with distinct limbs and features. So human origins are accounted for by a botanical analogy, with humans as biological productions of the earth itself. This theory is also intended to account for modern-day as humans, as Strasbourg fr. d tells us ‘even now daylight beholds their remains’. So both the creation under Love and the creation under Strife refer to the origins of modern plants, animals, and humans. This is problematic since according to the picture of the cosmic cycle given above the world created by Strife is quite separate from that created by Love, and two quite different explanations are given by Empedocles for each creation of life. Various attempts have been made to account for this, including a radical revision of the cosmic cycle in order to allow both creations of life to take place within the same world, and also seeing the two different worlds of the cosmic cycle as more useful devices for examining different aspects of creation separately than absolutely chronologically separate phases of a cycle: the work of Love in combining creatures and the work of Strife in articulating them would then actually take place at the same time, but are simply described as operative in chronologically separate phases.

b. Embryology

Empedocles is an exponent of the pangenetic theory of embryology. In this theory inheritance of characteristics from both mother and father is explained by each of the two parents’ limbs and organs creating tiny copies of themselves. These miniature limbs and organs then flow together in the generative seed and when the two seeds combine in the womb the father’s seed may provide the model for the nose, while the mother’s seed the model for the eyes and so on. This is an elegant way of accounting for inheritance of characteristics, but this is unlikely to be the whole story. As Aristotle points out there are strong conceptual similarities between Empedocles’ embryology and the creation under Love in which we see the coming together of pre-formed limbs creating life. So Empedocles thinks of the original formation of animals as a process analogous to the present day formation of the embryo in the womb. From his description in Strasbourg fr. a (ii) 23-30 ‘the coming together and unfolding of birth’ we seem to have two processes that are at work in the formation of both present day creatures and the original creation of life. The ‘coming together’ describes both the original coming together of the limbs of the first creatures and also the coming together of the tiny limbs in conception. The other side of the creative process, the ‘unfolding’ is illustrated by the creation under Strife of the ‘shoots of men and pitiable women’ whose limbs are at first not fully articulated or defined: they will undergo a process of ‘unfolding’ just like plant buds and become fully developed humans. This ‘unfolding’ is clearly paralleled in embryology by the gradual development and growth of the embryo in the womb. Therefore it may be best to think of the tiny limbs and organs contained in the generative seed not as fully developed limbs and organs, but as the genetic material that contains the potential for the development of limbs and organs. This is so mewhat speculative, but would provide Empedocles with a much more nearly truly evolutionary theory of the origin of species than had previously been ascribed to him. Certainly the differentiation into the two sexes is described in terms of potential: the warmth of the womb determines whether the embryo will be male or female, cf. fr B 65: ‘They were poured in pure places; some met with cold and became women’, fr. B 67: ‘For the male was warmer . . . this is the reason why men are dark, more powerfully built, and hairier’. It may be that other characteristics are also determined or informed by environmental factors as well.

c. Perception and Thought

Empedocles seems to have been the first philosopher to give a detailed explanation of the mechanism by which we perceive things. His theory, criticised by Aristotle and Theophrastus, is that all things give off effluences and that these enter pores in the sense organs. The pores and the effluences will be of varying shapes and sizes and so only certain effluences enter certain sense-organs if they meet pores of the correct size and shape to admit them. Further, perception is achieved by the attraction of similars: we perceive light colours with fire in the eye, dark colours with water, smell is achieved by the presence of breath in the nostrils etc.

As Theophrastus complains, perception is closely linked to thought by Empedocles, cf. fr. B109:

With earth, we perceive earth, with water water, with air divine fire, with fire destructive fire, with love love, and strife with baneful strife.

fr. B 107:

All things are fitted together and constructed out of these, and by means of them they think and feel pleasure and pain.

In B 109 Empedocles moves from perception of physical elements to ethical perceptions using the same theory of perception by similars, while in B 107 we can see the theory used to account more directly for thought itself. Hence for Empedocles there is a close link between what we perceive and what we think. Further our thoughts will also be affected by our own physical constitutions (B 108). This process of the attraction of like to like is operative from the most fundamental level with the parts of the roots of matter being attracted to their like, right up to the highest level of the purest mixture which is the highest form of thought. Hence it seems that everything in nature has a share in perception and intelligence, cf. fr. 110.10: ‘know that all things have intelligence and a share of thought’.

5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul

a. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls

Plutarch cites the following fragment as coming from ‘the beginning of Empedocles’ philosophy’, fr. B 115:

There is a decree of necessity, ratified long ago by gods, eternal and sealed by broad oaths, that whenever one in error, from fear, defiles his own limbs, having by his error made false the oath he swore – daimôns to whom life long-lasting is apportioned – he wanders from the blessed ones for three-times countless years, being born throughout the time as all kinds of mortal forms, exchanging one hard way of life for another. For the force of air pursues him into the sea, and sea spits him out onto earth’s surface, earth casts him in the rays of blazing sun, and sun into the eddies of air; one takes him from another, and all abhor him. I too am now one of these, an exile from the gods and a wanderer, having put my trust in raving Strife.

Traditionally Plutarch’s seeming attribution of this fragment to On Naturewas assumed to be incorrect and it was placed in the Purifications instead. However from the evidence of the Strasbourg fragments it seems that it may well be that Plutarch was correct, since they contain a description of the details of the sin Empedocles accuses himself of in fr. 115, cf. Strasbourg fr. d lines 5-6:

‘Alas that merciless day did not destroy me sooner, before I devised with my claws terrible deeds for the sake of food’

In fr. 115 Empedocles describes himself as a ‘daimôn’, a being to whom long life has been granted, but who has committed the sin of meat-eating and bloodshed and consequently is punished by banishment from the company of the immortal gods. The banishment lasts three myriads of years, either ‘three-times countless years’ or thirty thousand years. In either case he must atone for his sin by being repeatedly reincarnated into all the different living forms of the different orders of nature. Elsewhere he says: ‘For before now I have been at some time boy and girl, bush, bird, and a mute fish in the sea’ (fr. B 117). Empedocles then, has already suffered this nearly endless cycle of reincarnations having been seemingly hurled down to the lowest rung of the scale of nature but has worked his way up, has been purified at last and, as he tells us in fr. B. 112, is himself now an immortal god. There are others too numbered among the daimôns, those who ‘at the end … come among men on earth as prophets, minstrels, physicians and leaders, and from these they arise as gods, highest in honour.’ (fr. 146). It is not entirely clear whether we are meant to imagine the daimôns as an entirely separate class of blessed being with a different creation and a different fate from ourselves, the ordinary mortals, or as people who began as ordinary mortals but who, having purified themselves and having achieved perfection, are now approaching divine status. The latter reading would perhaps make more sense in terms of Empedocles’ didactic ethical mission: if we are all potentially perfectable, then his purificatory teaching becomes much more crucial. Empedocles himself, as his life shows, has achieved all four of the states that qualify the daimôns for immortality, he is a prophet, a minstrel, a physician and a leader, and can now pass on his wisdom to those on earth whom he is about to leave behind when he rejoins the company of the immortals. As can be seen from the description above, there are strong similarities between Empedocles and the teachings of Pythagoras on the transmigration of souls. Empedocles is clearly a follower of Pythagoras, in his ethics and psychology at least, and shares his vegetarianism and pacifism.

b. Meat-Eating and Sin

Slaughter and meat-eating are the most terrible of sins, indeed for him animal slaughter is murder and meat-eating is cannibalism, as shown by fr. 137:

The father will lift up his dear son in changed form, and blind fool, as he prays he will slay him, and those who take part in the sacrifice bring the victim as he pleads. But the father, deaf to his cries, slays him in his house and prepares an evil feast. In the same way son seizes father, and children their mother, and having bereaved them of life devour the flesh of those they love.

Here, in terms reminiscent of Hesiod’s description of the coming horrors of the Iron Age in Works and Days, we see the appalling consequences of meat-eating: murder, cannibalism, the destruction of whole families and, by extrapolation, of entire societies. This is a radical position in both political and religious terms. Plato’s Protagoras in the eponymous dialogue can simply assume that all men agree that warfare is ‘a fine and noble thing’. For Empedocles warfare, one fundamental plank of the Greek city state, is the most appalling of all evils and is punished by the immortals by hurling the perpetrators not only out of their society, but out of human society and even down to the level of the lowest forms of nature.

c. Theology

In religious terms as well traditional animal sacrifice, another fundamental basis of Greek society, becomes the grossest impiety of all. A probably apocryphal tale reports that Empedocles sacrificed an ox made of honey and meal at Olympia, the religious heart of Greece: a pointed act of criticism of traditional religion. Further evidence for his radical theology lies in his appropriation of the names of the Olympian gods for his roots of matter and his cosmic forces. Implicitly he argues that the Olympian gods came into being as misinterpretations of the natural world: the real ‘gods’ are the elements of nature and the cosmic forces that direct their endless evolutio