Associationism in the Philosophy of Mind

Association dominated theorizing about the mind in the English-speaking world from the early eighteenth century through the mid-twentieth and remained an important concept into the twenty-first. This endurance across centuries and intellectual traditions means that it has manifested in many different ways in different views of mind. The basic idea, though, has been constant: Some psychological states come together more easily than others, and one factor in explaining this connection is prior pairing.

Authors sometimes trace the idea back to Aristotle’s brief discussion of memory and recollection. Association got its name—“the association of ideas”—in 1700, in John Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, which is a founding document. British empiricists following Locke picked up the concept and built it into a general explanation of thought. In the resulting associationist tradition, association was a relation between imagistic “ideas” in the trains of conscious thought. The rise of behaviorism in the early twentieth century brought with it a reformulation of the concept. Behaviorists treated association as a link between physical stimuli and motor responses, omitting any intervening “mentalistic” processes. However, they still treated association just as centrally as the empiricist associationists. In later twentieth-century and early twenty-first-century work, association is variously treated as a relation between functionally defined representational mental states such as concepts, “subrepresentational” states (in connectionism), and activity in parts of the brain such as neurons, neural circuits, or brain regions. As a relation between representational states, association is viewed as one process among many in the mind; however, as a relation between subrepresentational or neural activities, it is again often viewed as a general explanation of thought.

Given this variety of theoretical contexts, associationism is better viewed as an orientation or research program rather than as a theory or collection of related theories. Nonetheless, there are several shared themes. First, there is a shared interest in sequences of psychological states. Second, though the laws of association vary considerably, association by contiguity has been a constant. The idea of association by contiguity is that each pairing of psychological states strengthens the association between them, increasing the ease with which the second state follows the first. In its simplest form, this can be thought of as akin to a footpath: Each use beats and strengthens the path. Third, this carries with it a more general emphasis on learning and a tendency to posit minimal innate cognitive structure.

The term “association” can refer to the sequences of thoughts themselves, to some underlying connection or disposition to sequence, or to the principle or learning process by which these connections are formed. This article uses the term to refer to underlying connections unless otherwise specified, as this is the most common use and the one that unites the others.

This article traces these themes as they developed over the years by presenting the views of central historical figures in each era, focusing specifically on their conception of the associative relation and how it operates in the mind.

Table of Contents

  1. The Empiricist Heyday (1700-1870s)
    1. John Locke (1632-1704)
    2. David Hume (1711-1776)
    3. David Hartley (1705-1757)
    4. The Scottish School: Reid, Stewart, and Hamilton
    5. Thomas Brown (1778-1820)
    6. James Mill (1773-1836) and John Stuart Mill (1806-1876)
    7. Alexander Bain (1818-1903)
    8. Themes and Lessons
  2. Fractures in Associationism (1870s-1910s)
    1. Herbert Spencer (1820-1903)
    2. Early Experimentalists: Galton, Ebbinghaus, and Wundt
    3. William James (1842-1910)
    4. Mary Whiton Calkins (1863-1930)
    5. Sigmund Freud (1856-1939)
    6. G. F. Stout (1860-1944)
    7. Themes and Lessons
  3. Behaviorism (1910s-1950s)
    1. Precursors: Pavlov, Thorndike, and Morgan
    2. John B. Watson (1878-1958)
    3. Edward S. Robinson (1893-1937)
    4. B. F. Skinner (1904-1990)
    5. Edwin Guthrie (1886-1959)
    6. Themes and Lessons
  4. After the Cognitive Revolution (1950s-2000s)
    1. Semantic Networks
    2. Associative Learning and the Resorla-Wagner Model
    3. Connectionism
  5. Ongoing Philosophical Discussion (2000s-2020s)
    1. Dual-Process Theories and Implicit Bias
    2. The Association/Cognition Distinction
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Empiricist Heyday (1700-1870s)

Associationism as a general philosophy of mind arguably reached its pinnacle in the work of the British Empiricists. These authors were explicit in their view of association as the key explanatory principle of the mind. Associationism also had a massive impact across the intellectual landscape of Britain in this era, influencing, for instance, ethics (through Reverend John Gay, Hume, and John Stuart Mill), literature, and poetry (see Richardson 2001).

Association in this tradition was called upon to solve two problems. The first was to explain the sequence of states in the conscious mind. The thought here is that there are some reliable patterns to the sequences which must be explained. These were explained by the “laws of association.” The basic procedure was, first, to identify sequences or patterns in sequence. Hobbes’s discussion of “mental discourse” demonstrates this interest, inspiring later associationist theories of mind and providing a famous example:

For in a discourse of our present civil war, what could seem more impertinent than to ask (as one did) what was the value of a Roman penny? Yet the coherence to me was manifest enough. For the thought of the war introduced the thought of the delivering up the king to his enemies; the thought of that brought in the thought of the delivering up of Christ; and that again the thought of the 30 pence which was the price of treason; and thence easily followed that malicious question; and all this in a moment of time, for thought is quick. (Leviathan, chapter 3)

Once the sequences have been identified, the next step is to classify them by the relations between their elements. For example, two ideas may be related by having been frequently paired, or may be similar in some way. This section and the next use “suggestion” to refer to particular incidents of sequence and “association” to refer to the underlying disposition. Secondly, some authors took the same relation to explain the generation of “complex” ideas out of “simple” ideas, often viewed as a kind of psychological atom. The empiricist project requires explaining how all knowledge could be generated from experience, and this was perhaps the most common way of doing so, though it was not universal.

Associationist authors then show how associations of the various sorts that they posit can or cannot explain various phenomena. For example, belief may be treated as simply a strong association. Abilities like memory, imagination, or even sometimes reason can be treated as simply different kinds of associative sequence. As empiricists, most eschew innate knowledge and tend to limit innate mental structure relative to competing traditions, though the claim that the mind is truly a blank slate would oversimplify. Their opponents in the Scottish school, for example, treat each of these as manifesting distinct, innate faculties, and posit innate beliefs in the form of “principles of common sense.”

a. John Locke (1632-1704)

John Locke laid the groundwork for empiricist associationism and coined the term “association of ideas” in a chapter he added to the fourth edition of his Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1700). He sets up the Cartesian notion of innate ideas as a primary opponent and asserts that experience can be the only source of ideas, through two “fountains” (book 2, chapter 1): “sensation,” or experience of the outside world, and “reflection,” or experience of the internal operations of our mind. He distinguishes between “simple” ideas, such as the idea of a particular color, or of solidity, and “complex” ideas, such as the idea of beauty or of an army. Simple ideas are “received” in experience through sensation or reflection. Complex ideas, on the other hand, are created in the mind by combining two or more simple ideas into a compound.

In his chapter on association of ideas (book 2, chapter 33), Locke emphasizes the ways that different ideas come together. As he puts it:

Some of our ideas have a natural correspondence and connexion one with another: it is the office and excellency of our reason to trace these . . . Besides this, there is another connexion of ideas wholly owing to chance or custom. Ideas that in themselves are not all of kin, come to be so united in some men’s minds, that . . . the one no sooner at any time comes into the understanding, but its associate appears with it.

His discussion in this chapter focuses on the connections based on chance or custom and describes them as the root of madness. Associations as described here are formed by prior pairings and strengthened passively as habitual actions or lines of thought are repeated.

Thus, despite the significance of his work in setting the stage for later associationists, Locke does not treat association as explaining the mind in general. He treats it as a failure to reason properly, and his interest in it is not only explanatory but normative. For these reasons, some have questioned whether one ought to treat Locke as an associationist, on the thinking that associationists viewed association as the central explanatory posit in the mind (for example, see Tabb 2019). Where one lands on this question seems to depend on the use of the term. After all, Locke’s description of the formation of complex ideas by combining simple ideas was counted as a kind of association by many later associationists. The key, for Locke, is that association is a passive process, while the mind is more active in other processes. The passive nature of association will return as a criticism of associationism; see also Hoeldtke (1967) for a discussion of the history of this line of thought in British psychiatry.

b. David Hume (1711-1776)

David Hume presented arguably the first attempt to understand thought generally in associative terms. He first lays out these views in A Treatise of Human Nature (1738) and then reiterates them in An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748). According to Hume, the trains of thought are made up of ideas, which are basically images in the mind. Simple ideas, such as a specific color, taste, or smell, are copies of sensory impressions. Thoughts in general are built from these simple ideas by association.

He begins his discussion of association in the Enquiry:

It is evident that there is a principle of connexion between the different thoughts or ideas of the mind, and that, in their appearance to the memory or imagination, they introduce each other with a certain degree of method and regularity. (Enquiry, section III)

His use of the term is not limited to irrationality and madness, as Locke’s was, but it is applied to the trains of thought generally. He questions what relations might explain the observed regularities and claims that there are three: resemblance, contiguity in time or place, and cause or effect. He mentions contrast or contrariety as another candidate in a footnote (footnote 4, section III), but rejects it, arguing it is a mixture of causation and resemblance. Association also explains the combination of simple ideas into complex ideas.

Hume’s inclusion of “cause or effect” as one of the primary categories of association might be thought incongruous with his general view on causality. While the best understanding of association by cause or effect has been controversial, Hume treats it as an independent principle of association, and it can be understood as such, and not, for example, as just a strong association by contiguity. He argues that we gain the impression of a causal power by coming to expect, in the imagination, the effect with the presentation of the cause. As a general matter, he suggests that we cannot feel the relations between sequential ideas, but we can uncover them with imagination and reasoning, though these relations may be different from the factors responsible for association.

Just how generally Hume applied his conception of association may also be subject to interpretation. On the one hand, his discussions of induction, probability, and miracles in the Enquiries suggest that he views association, or habit, as the sole basis of our reasoning about the world, and as such, a normatively adequate means for doing so. On the other hand, he arguably posits several other principles of mind throughout his work. For example, he often treats the imagination as a separate capacity, and he discusses several moral sentiments that would seem to require separate principles. He also expresses uncertainty in the completeness of his list of laws of association. Moreover, he characteristically avoids claims about the ultimate foundation of human nature. In the Treatise, he says: “as to its [association’s] causes, they are mostly unknown, and must be resolv’d into original qualities of human nature which I pretend not to explain” (pg. 13). It may be that, despite its centrality in his philosophy, Hume did not view association as a bedrock principle or cause of thought, though that view later became common, due in large part to the work of David Hartley.

c. David Hartley (1705-1757)

Hartley’s Observations on Man (1749) was published just after Hume’s Enquiry, though he claimed to have been thinking about the power of association for about 18 years. Hartley’s discussion of association is more focused and sustained than Hume’s because of his explicitly programmatic goals. Following Newton’s axiomatization of physics, Hartley sought to axiomatize psychology on the twin principles of association and vibration. Vibrations, in Hartley’s system, are the physiological counterpart of associations. As association carries the mind from idea to idea, vibrations in the nerves carry sensations to the brain and through it. He references physical vibrations as causing mental associations (pg. 6), but then expresses dissatisfaction with this framing and uncertainty on the exact association-vibration relation (pp. 33-34).

The idea is that external stimuli act on nerves, inciting infinitesimally small vibrations in invisible particles of the nerve. These vibrations travel up the nerves, and upon reaching the brain, cause our experience of sensations. If a particular frequency or pattern of vibration is repeated, the brain gains the ability to incite new vibrations like them. This is, effectively, storing a copy of the idea for later thought. These ‘ideas of sensation’ are the elements from which all others are built. Ideas become associated when they are presented at the same time or in immediate succession, meaning that the first idea will bring the second to mind, and, correspondingly, their vibrations in the brain will follow in sequence.

Hartley, like Hume, viewed association as both the principle by which ideas came to follow one another and by which simple ideas were combined into complex ideas: A complex idea is the end point of the process of strengthening associations between simple ideas. Unlike Hume, though, Hartley only posited association by contiguity and did not allow for any other laws of association.

He was also, as noted, explicit in his goal of capturing psychology with the principle. He argues that supposed faculties like memory, imagination, and dreaming, as well as emotional capacities like sympathy, are merely applications of the associative principle. He also emphasized associations between sensations, ideas, and motor responses. For instance, the tuning of motor responses by association explains how we get better at skilled activities with practice. He recognizes that the resulting picture is a mechanical picture, but he does not see this as incompatible with free will, appropriately conceived.

Hartley’s most important contribution is the very project of describing an entire psychology in associative terms. This animated the associationist tradition for the next hundred years or so. In setting up his picture, he was also the first to connect association to physiological mechanisms. This became important in the work of the later empiricist associationists, and in reformulations of associative views after the cognitive revolution discussed in section 4.

d. The Scottish School: Reid, Stewart, and Hamilton

The Scottish Common Sense School, led by Thomas Reid (1710-1796) and subsequently Dugald Stewart (1753-1828) and William Hamilton (1788-1856), was the main competition to associationism in Britain. Their views are instructive in articulating the role and limits of the concept, as well as in setting up Brown’s associationism, discussed below. The Scottish School differed from the associationists in two main ways. Firstly, they took humans to be born with innate knowledge, which Reid called “principles of common sense.” Secondly, they argued for a faculty psychology: They took the mind to be endowed with a collection of distinct “powers” or capacities such as memory, imagination, conception, and judgment. The associationists, in contrast, usually treated these as different manifestations of the single principle of association. Nevertheless, the Scottish School did provide a role for associations.

Reid takes the train of conscious thoughts to be an aggregate effect of the perhaps numerous faculties active at any given time (Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, Essay IV, chapter IV). He does allow that frequently repeated trains might become habitual. He treats habit, then, as another faculty that makes these sequences easier to repeat. Associations, or dispositions for certain trains to repeat, are an effect of the causally prior faculty of habit.

Stewart reverses the causal order between association and habit (see Mortera 2005). For Stewart, association is a distinct operation of the mind, which produces mental habits. Association plays a more important role in his system than in Reid’s. He does retain other mental faculties, though, which are responsible for at least the first appearance of any particular sequence in thought. The mistake the associationists make, on his view, is in thinking that they have traced all mental phenomena to a single principle (1855, pp. 11-12). He admits it is possible that philosophers may someday discover the ultimate principle of psychology but doubts that the associationists have done so. Stewart is responding specifically to Joseph Priestly, who edited a famous abridged edition of Hartley’s work.

William Hamilton’s contributions to the concept of association are less direct. He provides the first history of the concept of association of ideas in his notes on The Works of Thomas Reid (1872, Supplemental Dissertation D). Hamilton’s own views also inspired later work by John Stuart Mill in his Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1878).

e. Thomas Brown (1778-1820)

Thomas Brown occupies a unique position in the history of associationism. His main work, Lectures on the Philosophy of the Human Mind (1820), was published after his death at the age of 43. On the one hand, he is a student of the Scottish School, having studied under Dugald Stewart. On the other hand, he was an ardent associationist, reducing all of the supposed faculties to association. Brown explicitly casts his project as one of identifying and classifying the sequences of “feelings” in the mind, which was his general term for mental states, including ideas, emotions, and sensations.

Arguably, his philosophy of mind is more Humean than Hume’s, in that he extends Hume’s arguments against necessary connections between cause and effect in the world to the mind. He argues that an association is not a “link” between ideas that explains their sequence; it is the sequence itself. The idea of an associative link is vacuous and explanatorily circular. Brown actually argues for the term “suggestion” over “association,” though he uses the terms interchangeably when he fears no misinterpretation (Lecture 40). He differentiates two kinds of suggestion: simple suggestion, in which feelings simply follow in sequence, and relative suggestion, in which the relationship between sequential ideas is felt as well. Simple suggestion is responsible for capacities like memory and imagination, while relative suggestion allows capacities like reason and judgment.

Brown also differs from the standard associationist picture in that he, like Reid, embraces innate knowledge, which he calls “intuitive beliefs.” His prime example is belief in personal identity over time. Another is that “like follows like,” which can serve as the basis for the associating principle. He expresses an expectation that all associations will eventually be shown to be instances of association by contiguity, but does not think this has been shown yet. He thus finds it best to “avail ourselves of the most obvious categories” of contiguity, similarity, and contrast (Lecture 35).

Brown introduces several “secondary” laws of association, which can help predict which of any particular associations are likely to be followed in any given case (Lecture 37). He lists nine, including liveliness of feelings associated, frequency with which they had paired, recency, and differences arising from emotional context. While members of subsequent lists changed, the introduction of secondary laws of association may have been Brown’s most enduring legacy.

In common with those associationists above, Brown emphasizes a role for association in the formation of complex ideas out of simple ideas. However, he views ideas as states of the mind itself, not objects in the mind—a mistake he attributes primarily to Locke. As a result, he argues that it is metaphysically impossible that complex ideas are literally built of simple ideas, since the mind can only occupy one state at a time. He does argue that it is useful to think of simple ideas as continuing in a “virtual coexistence” in complex ideas, but the focus here is an historical/etiological story of how complex ideas came to be, rather than a literal decomposition.

Despite his idiosyncratic views, Brown identified his position as associationist, and it was accepted as such by the tradition. Though his work has been largely forgotten, it was very influential in the United Kingdom and United States in the years following its publication. Brown’s place in the associationist tradition strains standard interpretations of the tradition and what, if anything, unites it. After all, he denies the central associationist posit, the associative link, and allows innate knowledge.

f. James Mill (1773-1836) and John Stuart Mill (1806-1876)

James Mill’s view rivals Hartley’s as a candidate prototypical associationist picture of mind. Mill presents his views in his Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind (originally published 1829, cited here from 1869; this edition includes comments from John Stuart Mill and Alexander Bain).

Like Hartley, James Mill argues that contiguity is the only law of association. Specifically, James Mill argues that similarity is just a kind of contiguity. The claim is that we are used to seeing similar objects together, as sheep tend to be found in a flock, and trees in a forest. In his editorial comments in the 1869 edition, John Stuart Mill calls this “perhaps the least successful attempt at a generalisation and simplification of the laws of mental phenomena, to be found in the work” (pg. 111). For his part, James Mill does not attribute much significance to the question, saying: “Whether the reader supposes that resemblance is, or is not, an original principle of association, will not affect our future investigations” (pg. 114).

In discussing the associative relation itself, James Mill distinguishes synchronous and successive association. Some stimuli are experienced simultaneously, as in those emanating from a single object, and others successively, as in a sequence of events. The resulting ideas are associated correspondingly. Synchronous ideas arise together and themselves constitute complex ideas. Thus, a complex idea, in James Mill’s system, is a literal composite of simpler ideas. Successively associated ideas will arise successively. Of successive association, James Mill remarks that it is not a causal relation, though he does not elaborate on what he means by this (pg. 81). He describes three different ways that the strength of an association can manifest: “First, when it is more permanent than another: Secondly, when it is performed with more certainty: Thirdly when it is performed with more facility” (pg. 82). Adapting some of Brown’s secondary laws, he argues that strength is caused by the vividness of the associated feelings and frequency of the association.

James Mill reduces the various “active” and “intellectual” powers of the mind to association. He limits his discussion of association to mental phenomena, though he recognizes the significance of physiology for motor movements and reflexes. For instance, conception, consciousness, and reflection simply refer to the train of conscious ideas itself. Memory and imagination are particular segments of the trains. Motives are associations between actions and positive or negative sensations which they produce. The will is also reduced to an association between various ideas and muscular movements. Thus, even the active powers are mechanistic. Belief is just a strong association. Ratiocination, as in syllogistic reasoning, simply chains associations. Consider the syllogism: “All men are animals: kings are men : therefore kings are animals” (pg. 424). This produces the compound association “kings – men – animals.” For James Mill, this compound association includes an intermediate that remains in place, but is simply passed over so quickly it can be imperceptible and appear to simply be “kings – animals”; much in the same way that complex ideas still include all of the simpler ideas. This sets up a noteworthy disagreement between James and his son, John Stuart Mill.

John Stuart Mill argues, against his father, that complex ideas are new entities, not mere aggregates of simple ideas, and that intermediate ideas can drop out of sequences like that above. In general, John Stuart Mill analogizes the association of ideas to a kind of chemistry, where a new compound has new properties separate from its constituent elements (A System of Logic, chapter IV). In James Mill’s view of association, ideas retain their identity in combination, like bricks in a wall.

John Stuart Mill’s views on association are spread through several texts (see Warren 1928 pp.95-103 for a summary of his views), and his psychological aspirations are not as imperial or systematic as his father’s. This is evident partly in his lack of a sustained treatment, but also in the phenomena he does not attribute to association. For instance, he does not treat induction as an associative phenomenon, breaking with Hume (see A System of Logic). Similarly, breaking with his father, he does not view belief as simply a strong association, arguing that it must include some other irreducible element (notes in James Mill’s Analysis, pg. 404). When John Stuart Mill does allude to a systematic development of association, he usually defers to our next subject, Alexander Bain.

g. Alexander Bain (1818-1903)

Alexander Bain presents a sophisticated version of empiricist associationism. His main work on the topic comes in The Senses and the Intellect (originally published 1855, cited here from 3rd ed., 1868). Bain’s early work was developed and published with significant help from his close friend and mentor, J. S. Mill, but became a standard.

Bain differs most from previous associationists in the role he grants to instincts. By “instincts,” he means reflex actions, basic coordinated movement patterns such as walking and simple vocalization, and the seeds of volition (the potential for spontaneous action). This discussion is unique, first, in that he separates these out from the domain explained by association. He takes instincts to be “primordial,” inborn, and unlearned. Second, he opens his text with a discussion of basic neuroanatomy and function and explains instincts largely by appeal to the structure of the nervous system and the flow of nervous energy. This discussion was aided in part by recent progress in physiology, but also by an avowed interest in bringing physiology and psychology in contact.

Bain, nonetheless, takes association to be the central explanatory principle for phenomena belonging to the intellect. By “intellect,” he has in mind phenomena one might call thought, such as learning, memory, reasoning, judgment, and imagination. When he switches to his discussion of the intellect, his physiological discussions drop out, and his method is entirely introspective. As Robert Young notes: “his work points two ways: forward to an experimental psychophysiology, and backward to the method of introspection” (1970, pg.133).

Bain never makes any distinction between simple and complex ideas, and he discusses association in successive terms. He also does not restrict association to ideas and argues that the same principles can combine, sequence, and modify patterns of movement, emotions, sensations, and the instincts generally.

He admits three fundamental principles of association: similarity, contiguity, and contrast. Contiguity is the basic principle of memory and learning, while similarity is the basic principle of reasoning, judgment, and imagination. Nonetheless, the three are interdependent in complex ways. For instance, similarity is required for contiguity to be possible: Similarity is required for us to recognize that this sequence is similar enough to a former sequence for them to both strengthen the same association by contiguity. The principle of contrast has a more complex role. On the one hand, it is fundamental to the stream of consciousness in the first place. We would not recognize changes in consciousness as changes without this principle. As such, we cannot be conscious of anything as something without recognizing that there is something else it is not: If red were the only color, we would simply not be conscious of color. The other principles would be impossible. Nonetheless, it can also drive sequences, but only when properly scaffolded by similarity or contiguity. Similarity is necessary for association by contrast because contrast is always within a kind, and similarity is necessary for recognition of that original kind; he notes, “we oppose a long road to a short road, we do not oppose a long road to a loud sound” (1868, pg. 567). In many particular cases, contrast can be driven by contiguity, as contrasting concepts are frequently paired: up and down, pain and pleasure, true and false, and so on. Experiences of contrast themselves, he notes, often arouse emotional responses, as in works of poetry and literature. In other work, however, Bain does not seem to find the question of whether contrast is a separate principle of association to be all that interesting, since transitions based on contrast are very rare, and many instances of contrast-based associations are in fact based in contiguity (1887).

He discusses two other kinds of association: compound association and constructive association (in his first edition, he lists these as additional principles of association, but drops that categorization by the third). Compound association includes the ways associations can interact. For instance, if there are several features present that all remind us of a friend, all of those associative strengths can combine to make it more likely that we think of the friend. He groups imagination and creativity under “constructive association,” an active process of combining ideas, as in imagination, creativity, and the formation of novel sentences.

h. Themes and Lessons

Surveying these views uncovers significant diversity, even among the “pure” associationists found in the empiricist tradition. Most abstractly, the authors differed in their metaphysics. Brown was an avowed dualist. Hartley expresses uncertainty on the mind/brain relation but posited a physiological counterpart to association. Hume and Reid refused to speculate on metaphysics. Precursors include George Berkeley, an idealist, and Thomas Hobbes, a materialist.

The topics of debate within associationism itself included, first, the proposed list of laws of association. While all of the authors mentioned took association by contiguity to be among them, Hume included resemblance and cause or effect, Brown and Bain included similarity and contrast, and Hartley and James Mill included no others. It is common to view associationism as defined by the reliance on association by contiguity. While contiguity was generally posited, this is an oversimplification. It misses not only the diversity in laws posited, but also by the attitude authors take towards those laws. Many central associationists, including Hume, Brown, James Mill, and Bain, either describe their classification to be provisional, or express some willingness to defer. Overall, Stewart’s discussion of the question of how far one traces the causal/explanatory thread captures the general situation. The starting point is observed sequences of conscious thought, and the question is how far one can go in finding the principles that explain those sequences.

Authors also disagreed on whether the process, force, or principle combining simple ideas into complex ideas (simultaneous association) was the same as that producing the sequences of ideas through the mind (successive association). All of the theorists discussed here accept successive association, while simultaneous association is more controversial. Brown disavows simultaneous association, while Bain simply ignores it. Even proponents of simultaneous association disagree on how it operates, as evidenced in John Stuart Mill’s disagreement with his father on “mental chemistry.” Questions like this, about how more complex ideas are formed, remain at issue(for example, see Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988 and Fodor 1998). The formation of abstract ideas was a particularly difficult version of this problem through much of the tradition; it is much easier to see how ideas formed through sensory impressions can refer to concrete objects. Simultaneous association could provide an answer according to which abstract ideas include all of the particulars, while others take abstract ideas to simply include a particular feature, or simply a name for a feature, by, for instance, examining a feeling of similarity between two ideas of particulars.

Finally, there is disagreement in what psychological elements associations are supposed to hold between. Discussion of association often latches onto Locke’s term “association of ideas,” ignoring views that take stimuli and motor movements (most of the authors above, including arguably Locke himself as he describes a visual context improving a dance; Essay, book 2, chapter 33, section 16), reflexes, and instincts (Bain) to be associable in just the same way. Even when discussing association as a relation between ideas, there is disagreement on the nature of ideas and their relationship to mind. For instance, Brown criticizes Locke for treating ideas as independent objects in the mind, rather than states of the mental substance.

The diversity in associationist views suggests that associationism is better viewed as a research program with shared questions and methods, rather than a shared theory or set of theories (Dacey 2015). Such an approach makes better sense of similarities and differences in the views. Hume, Hartley, and James Mill make good prototypes for associationism, but one misses much if one takes any particular author to speak for the tradition as a whole.

2. Fractures in Associationism (1870s-1910s)

In the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, the associationist tradition began to fracture. Several factors combined to shape this overall trend. Important changes in the intellectual landscape included the arrival of evolutionary theory, the rise of experimental psychology—bringing with it psychology’s separation from philosophy as a field—and increasing understanding of neurophysiology. At the same time, several criticisms of the pure associationist philosophies became salient. Through this era, the basic conception of association was still largely preserved from the previous one: It is a relation between internal elements of consciousness. By this time, materialism had largely taken over, and most authors here view association as having some neural basis, even if association itself is a psychological relation.

Associationism fractured in this era because the trend was to disavow the general, purely associationist program described in the last section, even if authors still saw association as a central concept. Thus, while associationism lost a shared outlook and purpose, there was still much progress made in testing the possibilities and limits of the concept of association.

a. Herbert Spencer (1820-1903)

Herbert Spencer’s philosophy was framed by a systematic worldview that placed evolutionary progress, as he conceived it, at its core. His psychology was no different. His Principles of Psychology was first published in 1855, four years before On the Origin of Species, but was substantially rewritten by the third edition, which is the focus here (1880, cited here from 1899). By this point, the work had been folded into his System of Synthetic Philosophy, a ten-volume set treating everything from physics to psychology to social policy (Principles of Psychology became volumes 4 and 5). Spencer’s conception of evolution was quite different from later views. Firstly, Spencer believed in the inheritance of acquired traits. Secondly, and partly as a result of this, Spencer viewed evolution as a universal force for progress; species literally get better as they evolve.

The basic units of consciousness for Spencer are nervous shocks, or individual bursts of nervous activity. Thus, the atoms in his picture are much smaller than what we might usually call thoughts or ideas, and all of the psychological activities he describes are assumed to be localizable within the nervous system. Spencer distinguishes between “feelings” proper and relations between feelings. Feelings include what would previously have been called sensations and ideas, as well as emotions. They can exist in the mind independently. Relations are felt, in that they are present in consciousness, but they can only exist between two feelings. For instance, we might feel a relation of relative spatial position between objects in a room as we scan or imagine the scene. Both feelings and relations are associable.

The primary kind of association is that between a particular feeling and members of its same kind. Thus, similarity is the fundamental law of association, both with feelings and relations. A particular experience of red will revive a feeling corresponding to other red feelings. Spencer seems to think that the resulting “assemblages” do not constitute new feelings, effectively siding with James Mill over John Stuart. “Revivability” varies with the vividness of the reviving feeling, the frequency with which feelings have occurred together, and with the general “vigor” of the nervous tissues. This last variable includes the particular claim that a long time spent contemplating one subject will deplete resources in the corresponding bits of brain tissue, making related ideas temporarily less revivable. Relations are generally more revivable, and so more associable, than feelings. Relations can, themselves, aggregate into classes, and revive members of the class. As a result, many relations may arise in mind between two feelings, though some, perhaps most, of these will pass too quickly to be noticed.

Spencer takes the laws of association to simply be manifestations of certain relations between feelings, which are actually associated based on similarity. For instance, he takes association by contiguity to be a relation of “likeness of relation in Time or in Space or in both” (267), which is just a kind of similarity. He does not seem to see any problem in making this claim, while still asserting frequency of co-occurrence as an independent law of revivability above. Moreover, when two feelings arrive in sequence in the mind, they are always mediated by at least two relations: one of difference, as the feelings must not be identical, and one of coexistence or sequence.

Spencer claims to have squared empiricist and rationalist views of mind using evolution (pg. 465). He combines the law of frequency with his view on the heritability of acquired traits to argue that associations learned by members of one generation can be passed on to the next. The empiricists are right that knowledge comes from learning, but the rationalists are right that we are individually born with certain frameworks of understanding the world. In early animals, simple reflexes were so combined to create more flexible instincts. Some relations in the world, like those of space and time, are so reliably encountered that their inner mental correspondents are fixed through evolutionary history. Thus, human beings are born with certain basic ideas, like those of space and time. The resulting view is one in which thought is structured by association, but associations are accrued across generations (see Warren 1928, pg. 132).

b. Early Experimentalists: Galton, Ebbinghaus, and Wundt

Francis Galton (1822-1911), Darwin’s polymath cousin, published the first experiments on association under the title Psychometric Experiments in 1879. He ran his experiments on himself; the method was to work through a list of 75 words, one by one, and record the thoughts each suggested and the time it took to form each associated thought clearly. He did so four different times, in different contexts at least a month apart. He reports 505 associations over 600 seconds total, for a rate of about 50 associations per minute. Of the 505 ideas formed, 289 were unique, with the rest repetitions. He emphasizes that this demonstrates how habitual associations are. He notes that ideas connected to memories from early in his life were more likely to be repeated across the four presentations of the relevant word. This he takes to show that older associations have achieved greater fixity.

Among his pioneering studies on memory, Hermann Ebbinghaus (1850-1909) tested capacity for learning sequences of nonsense syllables, arguably the first test of the learning of associations (1885). He found, using himself as his subject, that the number of repetitions required to learn a sequence increased with the length of the sequence. He also found that rehearsing a sequence 24 hours before learning it brought savings in learning. The savings increased with increasing number of rehearsal repetitions.

Though the first experimental psychology labs were established in Germany, where the concept of association never reached the significance it had in Britain, association remained a target of early experiments, directly or indirectly (see Warren 1928, chapter 8 for a fuller survey; see also sections on Calkins and Thorndike below). These studies established association as a controllable, measurable target for experiment, even among those who did not subscribe to associationism as a general view. This role arguably sustained association as a central concept of psychology into the twenty-first century.

Wilhelm Wundt (1832-1920) provides perhaps the most complete theoretical treatment of association among the early experimentalists (1896, section 16; 1911, chapter 3). While association plays an important role in his system, he objects that associationists leave no place for the will among the passive processes of association. Thus, he distinguishes the passive process of combination he calls association and an active process of combination he calls “apperception” These ideas were developed into structuralism in America by Wundt’s student E. B. Titchener.

c. William James (1842-1910)

William James is not generally considered an associationist, and he attacks the associationists at several points in his Principles of Psychology (originally published 1890, cited here from 1950). However, at the close of his chapter on association (chapter XIV), he professes to have maintained the body of the associationist psychology under a different framing. His framing is captured as follows:

Association, so far as the word stands for an effect, is between THINGS THOUGHT OF—it is THINGS, not ideas, which are associated in the mind. We ought to talk of the association of objects, not of the association of ideas. And so far as association stands for a cause, it is between processes in the brain—it is these which, by being associated in certain ways, determine what successive objects shall be thought. (pg. 554)

James notes here an ambiguity in the term “association”; that between association as an observed sequence of states in the conscious mind (an effect) and association as the causal process driving those sequences. His handling of each side of the ambiguity highlights, in turn, his major criticisms of associationist psychologies before him.

His claim that we ought to talk of association of objects rather than association of ideas stems from his criticism of the associationist belief that the stream of consciousness is made up of discrete “ideas.” James shares with the associationists an emphasis on the stream of consciousness: He takes it to be the first introspective phenomenon of analysis for psychology (chapter IX). However, his introspective analysis of the stream of consciousness reveals it to be too complicated to be broken up into ideas. There are two main reasons for this: First, he notes, ideas are standardly treated as particular entities that are repeatedly revived across time: My idea of “blue” is the same entity now as it was 5 years ago. In contrast, James notes that the totality of our conscious state is always varied. Some of these differences come from external conditions, such as the current illumination of a blue object, or different sounds present, temperatures, and so on. Other differences come internally, including particular moods, varying emotional significance to a particular object, and previous thoughts fading away. He even suggests that organic differences in the brain, like blood flow, might influence our experience of some thought at different times.

His second concern is that consciousness does not present breaks, as one would expect when transitioning between discrete ideas. Rather, consciousness is continuous. Thoughts arise and fade, but they overlap, sometimes attitudes persist in the background, and he insists there is always a feeling present, even if some are transient and difficult to name. Thus, he prefers the term “streams of consciousness” to “trains of thought.”

The association of ideas presents a false view because conscious states are not discrete, and they are never revived in exactly the same way. Both mistakes share one major cause: the fact that we name and identify representational states by the objects that they represent. It is the common referent in the world that makes us think that the idea itself is the same each time, ignoring the nuance of particular experiences. Similarly, we focus on these ideas, ignoring the feelings that bridge them and persist through them. Thus, these problems are solved by shifting to association of objects. This, however, is just a description of the stream of consciousness, and cannot explain it.

James believes that looking at association as a brain process can explain the streams of thought while still respecting the nuances of consciousness just discussed. This claim depends on his view of habit, which he treats as a physiological, even generally physical, fact (chapter IV). Actions often repeated become easier. He explains that channels for nerve discharge become worn with use, just as a path is worn with use, or a paper creased in folding.

Thus, brain processes become associated in the sense that processes frequently repeated in sequence will tend to come in sequence. At any given moment, there are many processes operating behind a particular conscious state: Some processes will have to do with a thought we are considering, some with moods, some with emotional states, and some with ongoing perception as we think. Each of these will, in some way, contribute to the set of thoughts and feelings that come next. This, James held, could explain the various, multifaceted sequences of thought. The various feelings present are not literal “parts” of any conscious state, as in the common associationist picture of complex ideas. Even so, different feelings can potentially influence the direction of the stream of consciousness at any given point because each is attended by brain processes which are separable, and which actually direct the stream. This also allows active processes, like attention and interest, to contribute to guiding the stream of consciousness, even if they are, in effect, operating through habit.

A natural question would be how we know which of any candidate set of thoughts will come next. James discusses some factors much like Brown’s “secondary laws” above, including interest, recency, vividness, and emotional congruity. This is the question taken up by Mary Whiton Calkins.

d. Mary Whiton Calkins (1863-1930)

Mary Whiton Calkins was both the first woman president of the American Psychological Association and the first woman president of the American Philosophical Association. She was a student of James, and despite his enthusiastic support, she was refused her PhD from Harvard because of her gender. This did not prevent her from an influential career and many years as a faculty member at Wellesley College. Her description of association in her textbook (1901) largely follows James’s. However, Calkins was much more interested in experimental methods than him.

She was particularly interested in the question, “What one of the numberless images which might conceivably follow upon the present percept or image will actually be associated with it?” (1896, pg. 32), taking this to be the key to making concrete predictions about the stream of consciousness, and even perhaps to control problematic sequences. In so doing, she targets what had elsewhere been called the secondary laws: frequency, vividness, recency, and primacy. In a paired-associate memory task, she finds frequency to be by far the most significant factor. She finds this surprising, as she takes introspection to indicate that recency and vividness are just as important. She sees this result as significant for training and correcting associative sequences.

e. Sigmund Freud (1856-1939)

Sigmund Freud’s relationship to associationism is most evident in two aspects of his work. First, Freud outlined a thoroughly associationist picture of the mind and brain in his early and unpublished Project for a Scientific Psychology (written 1895, published posthumously in 1950). Second is his invention of the method of free association.

In the Project, Freud conceives of the nervous system as a network of discrete, but contacting, neurons, through which flows a nervous energy he calls “Q.” As neurons become “cathected” (filled) with Q, they eventually discharge to the next downstream neurons. The ultimate discharge of Q results in motor movements, which is how we actually release Q energy. In the central neurons, responsible for memory and thought, there is a resistance at the contact barrier. There is no such resistance at the barriers of sensory neurons. Learning occurs because frequent movements of Q through a barrier will lower its resistance. He identifies this as association by contiguity (pg. 319). Thus, the neurophysiological picture is also a psychological picture, and these basic processes are associative.

In addition, Freud adds two other systems. First is a class of neurons that respond to the period of activity in other neurons. These are able to track which perceptions are real and which are fantasy or hallucination, because stimuli coming in through the senses have characteristic periods. Second is the ego. In this work, the ego is simply a pattern of Q levels distributed across the entire network. By maintaining this distribution, the ego prevents any one neuron or area from becoming too heavily cathected with Q, which would result in erratic thought and action because of the resulting violent discharge. The role of the ego is thus inhibitory. Together, these additional systems control the underlying associative processes in ways that allow rational thought.

Freud never published this work and abandoned most of the details. Nonetheless, it arguably previews the basic underlying theories of much of his later work (as noted by the editor of the standard edition of Freud [Vol 1. pp. 290-292] and Kitcher 1992; see Sulloway 1979 for discussion of continental associationist influences on Freud). The thinking would go that breakdowns in rationality, as in dreaming or pathology, come when basic processes like association operate uncontrolled.

Regardless of exactly how it fits in his overall theoretical framework, his invention of the method of free association deserves note as well. Freud began using free association in the 1890s as an alternative to hypnosis. The patient would lie in a relaxed but waking state and simply discuss thoughts as they came freely to mind. The therapist would then analyze the sequence of thoughts and attempt to determine what unconscious thoughts or desires might be directing them. In later versions, patients are asked to keep in mind a starting point of interest or are presented a particular word or image to respond to. Free association was massively influential, and it remains the core psychoanalytic method (and has also been used in mapping semantic networks; see section 4). It also takes associative processes to operate in the unconscious, another view that would be revived later (see section 5).

f. G. F. Stout (1860-1944)

F. Stout continues the trend of criticizing associationism while allowing a significant role for association in his Manual of Psychology (1899). A prominent British philosopher and psychologist at the turn of the century, Stout taught, at different times, at Cambridge (including students G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell), Aberdeen, Oxford, and St. Andrews. He accepts association as a valuable story for the reproduction of particular elements of consciousness, but he argues that there is an independent capacity for generating new elements. He specifically attacks John Stuart Mill and his analogy of mental chemistry (1899, book I, chapter III). According to Stout, Mill was right that complex ideas are not mere aggregates of simple ideas, but failed to recognize that this means that a new idea must be generated: The new idea had aggregates of associated simple ideas as precursors, not as parts—previewing the work of the Gestalt psychologists. He claims that Mill’s attempt to include the simple ideas in complex ideas as in chemical combination is a desperate attempt to save the theory from a fatal flaw.

Stout does grant association a significant part in the reproduction of ideas in the train of thought. There, as well, he provides a novel interpretation (book IV, chapter II). Specifically, he argues that association by contiguity should be rephrased as “contiguity of interest.” This means that only those elements that are interesting—at the time, based on goals, intentions, and other states—will be associated, and uninteresting elements will be dropped. He takes this to be the sole law of association. Apparent associations by similarity are in fact associations by contiguity of interest, because similar objects will have some aspects that are identical, and these aspects drive the suggestion. He also addresses the question of which of several competing associations will actually lead thought. He mentions Brown’s secondary laws as factors, but he takes the most important to be the “total mental state,” or the “general trend of psychical activity,” such that factors like intentions or background desires are usually decisive.

Finally, he argues that the process of ideational construction is active at all times and does not merely generate new ideas. It also modifies ideas as they are revived. Ideas take on new relations to other ideas. They may be seen in a different light, with different aspects emphasized based on differences in context, as well as in mental state and interests. Ideas are, in a real sense, remade as they are revived.

g. Themes and Lessons

The proliferation of interpretations of association through this era demonstrates the decline of the pure empiricist versions of the view. Nonetheless, the empiricist conception remains prominent. Authors who disavow that position still hold views substantially similar to it. Those working to refine the concept are still working from an empiricist starting point: Associations hold between conscious states, and contiguity and similarity remain the most common laws of association. Compared with the associationists described in the previous section, the diversity of views in this section is greater by a quantitative, rather than qualitative, degree.

Nonetheless, these authors do not proclaim their adherence to associationism, and many expressly disavow it. Worries about the theory itself center on its atomism—treating simple ideas as discrete indivisible units that are reified in thought—and its passive, mechanical depiction of mind. More general trends include increasing knowledge in related fields such as evolutionary theory, neurophysiology, and experimental psychology. Evolutionary theory poses a challenge to associationist empiricism, as it allows a mechanism for innate ideas. Neurophysiology and experimental psychology both contributed to the fracturing of associationism, partly because progress on each came at the time from the continent, where there was less interest in a general associationist picture than in the United Kingdom. Nonetheless, each development supported a role for association. At least superficially, the network of neural connections looks a lot like the network of associated ideas. And associations make good experimental targets because they are easy to induce and test.

It does not seem that associationism must stand or fall with any of these challenges or developments singly, as there are views broadly consistent with each in the previous section. Rather, these problems persisted and compiled at the same time as new ideas from other fields allowed researchers to step out of the old paradigm and cast about for new formulations of the old idea. The general picture, then, is of a concept losing its role as the single core-concept of psychology and philosophy of mind, but nonetheless retaining several important roles. The development that finally brought this particular associationist tradition to an end, the rise of behaviorism, returned association to its central position.

3. Behaviorism (1910s-1950s)

Behaviorism arose in America as a reaction to the introspective methods that had dominated psychology to that point. Most of the authors listed above built their systems entirely from introspection. Even the experimentalists mostly recorded introspective reports, often using themselves as the only subject. The behaviorists did not see this as a reliable basis for a scientific psychology. Science, as they saw it, only succeeded when it studied public, observable phenomena that could be recorded, measured, and independently verified. Introspection is a private process, which is not independently verifiable or objectively measurable.

The result of adopting this viewpoint was a complete change in the conceptual basis of psychology, as well as in its methodology and theory. Behaviorists abandoned concepts like “ideas” and “feelings,” and the notion that the stream of consciousness was the primary phenomenon of psychology. Some even denied the phenomenon of consciousness itself. What they did not abandon, however, was the concept of association. In fact, association regained its role as the central concept of psychology, now reimagined as a relation between external stimuli and responses rather than internal conscious states. Even the law of association by contiguity was co-opted.

a. Precursors: Pavlov, Thorndike, and Morgan

Ivan Pavlov’s (1849-1936) famous work provided what would be a core phenomenon and some of the basic language of the behaviorists. Pavlov (1902) was interested in the physiology of the digestive system of dogs and the particular stimuli which elicit salivation. In the course of his studies, he observed that salivation would occur as the attendant who usually fed the animal approached. He noted a difference between “unconditional reflex,” as when salivation occurs due to a taste stimulus, and a “conditional reflex,” as when salivation occurs due to the approaching attendant (1902, pg. 84). Pavlov was able to show that a stimulus as arbitrary as a musical note or a bright color could cause salivation if paired frequently with food. He notes that the effect is only caused when the animal is hungry, and that it seems important that the unconditional reflex is tied to a basic life process. His account of the phenomenon is characteristically physiological:

It would appear as if the salivary centre, when thrown into action by the simple reflex, because a point of attraction for influences from all organs and regions of the body specifically excited by other qualities of the object. (pg. 86)

This phenomenon came to be known as “classical conditioning.” As Pavlov presciently remarks: “An immeasurably wide field for new investigation is opened up before us” (pg. 85). In subsequent work, Pavlov (1927) further explores these processes, including inhibitory processes such as extinction, conditioned inhibition, and delay.

Edward Thorndike (1874-1949) explicitly targeted the processes of association in animals (1898). He laments that existing work tells us that a cat will associate hearing the phrase “kitty kitty” with milk, but does not tell us the actual sequence of associated thoughts, or “what real mental content is present” (pp. 1-2). To test this objectively, he placed animals in a series of puzzle boxes with food visible outside. Most were cats, but he also experimented with dogs and chicks. Escape, and thus food, required unlocking the door using one or more actions such as pulling a string, pressing a lever, or depressing a paddle. If they did not escape within a certain time limit, they would be removed without food.

As Thorndike describes it, animals placed in the box first perform “instinctive” actions like clawing at the bars and attempting to squeeze through the gaps. Eventually, the animal will happen upon the actual mechanism and accidentally manipulate it. Once some action is successful, the animal will associate it with the stimulus of the inside of the box. This association gradually strengthens with repeated presentation, as shown by learning curves of animals more rapidly escaping with sequential trials, which came to be known as operant, or instrumental, conditioning. He argues that this must be explained with associations between an idea or sense impression and an impulse to a particular action, rather than the “association of ideas,” as ideas themselves are inert (pg.71). He expresses the belief that animals have conscious ideas but remains officially agnostic, and he emphasizes that humans are not merely animals plus reason; human associations are different from animal associations as well. Thus, he arrives at the basic idea that he later restated under the name “the law of effect”:

Of several responses made to the same situation, those which are accompanied or closely followed by satisfaction to the animal will, other things being equal, be more firmly connected with the situation, so that, when it recurs, they will be more likely to recur; those which are accompanied or closely followed by discomfort to the animal will, other things being equal, have their connections with that situation weakened, so that, when it recurs, they will be less likely to occur. The greater the satisfaction or discomfort, the greater the strengthening or weakening of the bond. (1911, pg. 244)

While the name “law of effect” has stuck, it is worth noting that in his dissertation (1898) and his textbook (1905 pp. 199-203), Thorndike simply calls it the “law of association.”

Lloyd Morgan (1852-1936) also discusses “the association of ideas” in nonhuman animals. However, his most significant contribution to the use of the concept is indirect, through a methodological principle that came to be known as his “Canon”:

In no case may we interpret an action as the outcome of the exercise of a higher psychical faculty, if it can be interpreted as the outcome of the exercise of one which stands lower in the psychological scale. (Morgan 1894, pg. 53)

The behaviorists took Morgan’s Canon to encourage positing minimal mental processes. More generally, associative processes are usually thought to be among the “lowest,” or “simplest,” processes available. This means that an associative explanation will be preferred until it can be ruled out; a practice that remains (see sections 5 and 6).

b. John B. Watson (1878-1958)

Watson rung in the behaviorist era with his paper Psychology as the Behaviorist Views It (1913). In that work, he attacks the introspective method and claims about conscious feelings or thoughts. As he develops the view (1924/1930), he says that all of psychology can be reframed in terms of stimulus and response. The connection between them is a “reflex arc” of neural connections running from the sense organ to the muscles and glands necessary for a response. Watson thus identifies each stimulus with specific physical features, and each response with specific physiological changes or movements. This came to be known, following Tolman (1932), as the “molecular” definition of behavior, distinct from the “molar” definition, which characterizes behaviors more abstractly; purposively (intentionally), or as a pattern of specific excitations and movements.

Watson applies the same system to humans and to nonhuman animals. He takes infants to be born with only a small stock of simple reflexes, or “unconditioned” stimulus-response pairs—nothing that could properly be called instinct. These basic reflex patterns are modified by conditioning. In conditioning, the new conditioned stimulus either “replaces” the original unconditioned stimulus as a cause of the response, like the musical notes in Pavlov’s experiments, or a new response is conditioned to an existing stimulus, as when one becomes afraid of a dog that had been previously seen as friendly. As these conditioned changes compound, stimulus-response sets can be coordinated in the ways that allow sophisticated behaviors in humans. He backs this up using experiments with infants, such as his ethically fraught Little Albert experiment: Watson conditioned a fear response to a white rat in 11-month-old Albert by making a loud noise every time the rat was produced (1924/1930, pp. 158-164).

Though Watson does not cast his own view in associative terms, his stimulus-response psychology effectively places association back at the center of psychology, and offhand references to association suggest he recognizes some connection. Even setting aside the specific points that S-R connections operate like associations, and classical conditioning like association by contiguity, Watson’s behaviorism shares with associationism an empiricist, anti-nativist orientation and an ideal of basing psychology on a single principle.

c. Edward S. Robinson (1893-1937)

Edward S. Robinson’s work Association Theory To-Day (1932) argues that associations themselves are the same in both behaviorism and the older associationist tradition. The difference is what answer one gives to the question, “What is associated?” Associationism had been rejected in large part because it was taken to be a relation between mentalistic ideas. Robinson takes this to be unfair, pointing to the diversity of views in earlier associationists. Robinson was far from the first to note the role of association in behaviorism (the earliest paper he cites as arguing along these lines is Hunter 1917; see also Guthrie 1930, discussed below), but he presents a systematic attempt to import previously existing associationist machinery to behaviorism.

An association is still an association, according to Robinson, whether it holds between ideas, stimuli and responses, or neural pathways. He adopts the generic term “psychological activities” to capture all of these, saying that association is a disposition of some activities to instigate particular others. He tentatively adopts a “molar” view of psychological activities over Watson’s molecular view because he doesn’t think existing research has actually shown associations between particular physiological activities. Thus, he argues that the relevant activities must be described at a more abstract level. Robinson does rely on behavioral evidence but does not proclaim the behaviorist rejection of all mentalistic postulates. He takes it to be an open empirical question which activities will be associated in the most effective version of the theory.

Robinson goes on to discuss several laws of association, describing how each should be viewed and summarizing relevant experimental findings. Contiguity, the first, is apparent in conditioning. He attributes the second, assimilation, to Thorndike’s observation that a person will give the same response when presented with sufficiently similar situations (pp. 81-82). Robinson denies this is the same as association by similarity proper, but it is the same basic role Bain gives similarity. Others include frequency, duration, context, acquaintance, composition, and individual differences. He takes the actual associative strength to be a sum of all of these features, lamenting the overemphasis on contiguity itself.

d. B. F. Skinner (1904-1990)

Skinner, like Watson, does not frame his understanding of behaviorism in terms of association. Nonetheless, his work is noteworthy for placing reinforcement at the center of learning. The focus here is on his early career. Skinner studied operant conditioning using an apparatus in which a rat would press a lever to receive food. The food, in this case, reinforces the action of pressing the lever. In Skinner’s view, reinforcement is necessary for operant learning. While this basic idea was known as part of Thorndike’s law of effect, it was not widely believed that effects could reinforce behavioral causes until Skinner. He went on to study reinforcement itself, especially the effects of various schedules of reinforcement (1938).

Skinner differentiated operant conditioning from Pavlovian, or classical, conditioning based on the sequences of stimulus/response (1935). Operant conditioning requires a four-step chain involving two reflexes: from a stimulus (sight of the lever) to an action (pressing the lever), which then causes another stimulus (food, the reinforcer) to a final action (eating/salivating). In Pavlovian-style experiments, a stimulus (for example, a light) switches from triggering an arbitrary reflex (such as orienting towards the light) to triggering a reflex relevant to the reinforcer (such as salivation if food is the reinforcer). Reinforcement is necessary for both; it simply plays a different role. Thinking in associative terms, different types of conditioning are differentiable by structure of associations. But this again modifies the conception of the process of association. Simple contiguity is not enough, one of the stimuli involved must also play the role of reinforcer.

Later, Skinner abandoned the stimulus-response framing of operant conditioning, arguing that the action (lever press) need not be viewed as a direct response to a stimulus (seeing the lever). To explain behavior in such a case, one must look back to the history of reinforcement, rather than any particular eliciting stimulus (1978). Skinner generally opposed private mentalistic posits, but his views on this were not always clear or consistent. He did, like Watson, treat behavior as the only legitimate target of study, retain a generally empiricist picture of mind, and take the view to apply generally. He was able to show that “shaping” techniques based on operant conditioning could train animals to complete sophisticated tasks, and he took this to apply to humans as well (1953), including with regard to language (1957) and even society (1976).

e. Edwin Guthrie (1886-1959)

Edwin Guthrie argues that the core phenomenon of conditioning is just association by contiguity, which he views as the single principle of learning. He states the principle as such: “Stimuli acting at a given instant tend to acquire some effectiveness toward the eliciting of concurrent responses, and this effectiveness tends to last indefinitely” (1930, pg. 416). He goes on to argue that various empirical phenomena of learning, including even forgetting and insight, “may all be understood as instances of a very simple and very familiar principle, the ancient principle of association by contiguity in time” (1930, pg. 428). He later builds on this conception by arguing that stimuli to which animals pay attention will become associated. He takes this to be the actual action by which reinforcers work, dissatisfied by Skinner’s seemingly circular definition of the term “reinforcer.” He presents the new version in simplified form as follows: “What is being noticed becomes a signal for what is being done” (1959, pg. 186).

Guthrie takes the focus on behavior to be an abstraction intended to make psychology empirically tractable, in the same way that physics models frictionless planes. As such, his behaviorism could be seen as less extreme than Watson or Skinner, but perhaps more so than Robinson.

f. Themes and Lessons

Across behaviorist views, association remains the core concept. As in the previous section, though, some authors explicitly take on the associationist mantle while others ignore it. Also as above, there is a diversity in views on the actual structure of associations, how they develop, and what is taken to be associated. Skinner (1945) captured perhaps the largest division: that between the radical behaviorists and the methodological behaviorists. This division is easily cast in terms of their views on association. The radical behaviorists, exemplified by Watson and Skinner, aim to eliminate mentalistic concepts; association can allow this, via the minimal connection between stimulus and response. The methodological behaviorists, exemplified here by Guthrie and Robinson, take the emphasis on behavior to be a methodological abstraction or simplification necessary for scientific progress. By implication, association itself is an abstract relation, which in principle can subsume various possible mechanisms, rather than excluding them.

4. After the Cognitive Revolution (1950s-2000s)

As cognitivism came to dominate in the mid-twentieth century, association took up various roles in different literatures. The rise of cognitivism brought two key changes in psychology generally. First, internal mental states returned. However, these states were generally viewed as functionally defined representational states rather than as imagistic ideas, as in the empiricist associationists. Second, cognitivism views the mind in broadly computational terms. Cognitivists take many psychological processes, called “cognitive processes,” to be algorithms that operate by applying formal rules to symbolic representational states, perhaps in a manner similar to language. Cognitive processes are often contrasted with associative processes, setting up a general view in which association is one kind of psychological process among many. Association is thought to be limited, in particular, because it is too simple to account for complex, rational thought (see Dacey 2019a). Learning by contiguity cannot differentiate which experienced sequences reflect real-world relations and which are mere accidents. Associative sequences in thought do not allow flexible application; they must be rigidly followed. Thus, associative processes are usually posited in simpler systems, like nonhuman animals, or the human unconscious. However, as connectionist computational strategies began to bear fruit, some treated these as a new, revitalized form of general associationism.

This section discusses three research programs that each treat associations in different ways and collectively capture the main threads of late twentieth- and early twenty-first-century thought on association.

a. Semantic Networks

The first program represents semantic memory—memory for facts—as a network of linked concepts. Retrieval or recall of information in such a model is described by activation spreading through this network. When activation reaches some critical level, the information is retrieved and available for use or report. This program got its formal start in the late 1960s with work by Ross Quillian and Allen Collins (Collins and Quillian 1969), and subsequently John R. Anderson (1974) and Elizabeth Loftus (Collins and Loftus 1975). The general idea is that different patterns of association explain facts about information retrieval, such as when it succeeds or fails, and how long it takes. John Anderson generalized the basic idea as part of his Human Associative Memory (HAM) model (Anderson and Bower 1973) and Adaptive Control of Thought (ACT) model and its descendants (Anderson 1996). In more specific circumstances, this basic strategy has been applied in a number of phenomena where information is accessed automatically, including: cued recall, priming (McNamara 2005), word association task responses, false memory (Gallo 2013), reading comprehension (Ericsson and Kintsch 1995), creativity (Runco 2014), and implicit social bias (Fazio 2007, Gawronski and Bodenhausen 2006; see also section 5).

Spreading activation in a network manifests one side of the standard associative story. The difference from previous traditions is that associations relate concepts or propositions, and these networks usually include a possibility of subcritical activation of a concept that can facilitate later retrieval. These models rarely say anything explicitly about learning, but they sometimes carry implications for learning. Often, links are not taken to represent any particular relation, signifying only the disposition to spread activation. This is taken to indicate that the links are learned through a process like association by contiguity, which cannot encode meaningful real-world information. However, sometimes links are labeled with a meaningful relationship between concepts, which would imply a learning process capable of tracking that relation. In addition, some models that emerged out of related research, such as Latent Semantic Analysis (LSA) (Landauer and Dumais 1997) and Bound Encoding of the Aggregate Language Environment (BEAGLE) (Jones and Mewhort 2007), extract semantic information (for example, semantic similarity) about words in a linguistic corpus based on clustering patterns with other words.

b. Associative Learning and the Resorla-Wagner Model

Work on learning proceeded largely separately from the work on semantic networks just described. After the cognitive revolution, conditioning effects remained a representative phenomenon of basic learning processes. They were, again, re-described. Since the associations were taken to be formed between internal mental representations, conditioning was subsumed under the heading of “contingency learning” or “associative learning”: the learning of relations between events that tend to co-occur. “Associative learning” is sometimes used in this literature to refer to this phenomenon, regardless of what mechanism is taken to produce it. In this literature, human and nonhuman animal research have long informed one another. However, the orientation can depend on the subjects. It has long been accepted that humans have complex cognitive processes running in parallel with any simple associative processes (Shanks 2007). The question in the human literature is often whether purely associative models can explain any human learning. Research on animal minds is still heavily influenced by Morgan’s Canon (section 4.1). As a result, associative explanations have been heavily favored. Thus, the question is often whether nonhuman animals have any processes that cannot be described in associative terms.

The Rescorla–Wagner model (1972) has dominated much of this research, either by itself or through its various modifications and descendants. This model includes a “prediction” that is made when the antecedent cue is produced. Associative strength is either increased or decreased based on whether that prediction is borne out. For instance, if an animal has a strong association between a cue and a target, the animal will expect the target once the cue is presented. If the target does not follow, the associative strength is reduced. This presents a different conception of association from those encountered so far, as a prediction-error process, contrasted with the footpath notion of contiguity and with reinforcement (Rescorla 1988; see also Danks 2014, pg. 20, arguing that the prediction itself is not usually taken realistically). It also makes the Rescorla-Wagner model more successful at predicting various phenomena in contingency learning than previous conceptions of association. For instance, it predicts the fact that existing associations can block new associations from forming (Miller, Barnet, and Graham 1995). The computational precision and simplicity of associative models like the Rescorla-Wagner model are a major draw, and they have been further supported by neural evidence of prediction-error tracking in the brain (Schultz, Dayan, and Montague 1997).

However, one can also complicate models like this in various ways. Some models allow interactions between existing associations during learning (Dickinson 2001). Others allow interactions between association and other processes, like attention or background knowledge (Pearce and Macintosh 2010, Dickinson 2012, Thorwart and Livesey 2016). Finally, one can also model interference between associations at retrieval, as in the SOCR (Sometimes-Competing Retrieval) model (Stout and Miller 2007).

Even with these complicated types of models, critics have argued that simple associative stories cannot capture the complexity of associative learning. For instance, some argue that the processes responsible for human associative learning must be propositional (Mitchell, DeHouwer, and Lovibond 2009). Gallistel has been perhaps the most prominent opponent of associative theories of learning in animals generally, arguing that the processes responsible must be symbolic (Gallistel 1990, Gallistel and Gibbon 2002).

c. Connectionism

The arrival of connectionism as a major theory of mind in the 1980s was hailed as a revolution by many of its proponents (Rumelhart, McClelland, and PDP research group 1986). Connectionist models perform especially well in various kinds of categorization tasks. They are a kind of spreading activation model in which activation spreads through sequential layers of nodes. Though there were important precursors, especially Hebb (1949) and Rosenblatt (1962), connectionism came into its own when new techniques allowed much more computationally powerful three-layer networks. These networks include a “hidden” layer between “input” and “output” layers. The revolutionary claims of connectionism are usually based on the idea that the hidden layer represents information in a distributed manner, as a pattern of activation across multiple nodes. Thus, nodes are treated as “subrepresentational” units of information that also presumably correspond to something in the brain, such as neurons, sets or assemblies of neurons, or brain regions (Smolensky 1988). This is also thought to be a realistic view of representation in the brain, which is likely distributed. Unlike the other research programs discussed in this section, which take association to describe one kind of processing among many, connectionism, at least initially, purported to provide a general model of mind.

Connectionism has been treated as a version of associationism by both proponents (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 1991, Clark 1993) and opponents (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988). This is because it implements a kind of spreading activation, as well as the fact that connectionist networks are able to learn—something symbolic systems struggle with. While the emphasis on learning aligns with a generally empiricist approach, the specific mechanism matters for what, exactly, to make of this. Perhaps the most common process, backpropagation, is not usually thought to be realistic. Another common process, Hebbian learning, implements a version of association by contiguity (Hebb 1949). This is treated as more biologically plausible, but models implementing it are less powerful.

These networks modify the treatment of association by providing another set of answers to the question of what is associated. In this case, it is subrepresentational units or parts of the brain. While neural level stories have attended association throughout its history (see above sections on Hartley, Freud, and Watson; see also Sutton 1998 for discussion of similarities between connectionism and these historical views), they are usually secondary to a psychological-level story. Connectionists, in contrast, actually attempt to model neural-level phenomena.

In many networks, the number of hidden-layer nodes is chosen somewhat arbitrarily, and the network is tuned in whatever way gets the input-output mappings right. The question of what each node might represent in the brain is secondary, complicating their interpretation as actual models of the mind/brain. Arguably, later work during this period split between two approaches. Many researchers simply explore the framework as a computational tool, up to and including deep learning. These researchers are not primarily concerned with accurate modeling of brain processes, though they may view their models as “how-possibly” models (see Buckner 2018 for such a discussion of deep learning models and abstraction). Computational neuroscientists, on the other hand, generally start with neural information like single unit recordings, and model specific neural circuits, networks, or regions.

5. Ongoing Philosophical Discussion (2000s-2020s)

This section briefly surveys two debates that brought the concept of association back under philosophical scrutiny. These debates take place largely in the frameworks outlined in the last section.

a. Dual-Process Theories and Implicit Bias

One of the most philosophically important implications of early twenty-first-century work in psychology, especially social psychology, was the finding that much of our behavior is driven, or heavily influenced, by unconscious processes. Theorists generally captured these findings with Dual-Process theories, which separate the mind into two systems or processing types. Type 1 processing is fast, effortless, uncontrolled, and unconscious, while Type 2 processing is slow, effortful, controlled, and conscious. It is often the case that association is considered to be among the processes in Type 1, but Type 1 is also sometimes treated as associative in general (Kahneman 2011, Uhlmann, Poehlman, and Nosek 2012). This stronger claim is controversial (Mandelbaum 2016), but it is often implicit in discussions of unconscious processing.

The conception of association involved largely stems from the semantic network program described above. These authors, however, tend to emphasize the simplicity of associative processing, and so take onboard an associative account of learning as well. Thus, at stake is not just how one thinks about the mechanisms of unconscious processing, but how they relate to one’s agency and responsibility. It is often thought that unconscious processes cannot produce responsible action because they are associative and as such are too inflexible to produce responsible action (Levy 2014). How one understands and attributes associative models and associative processes is, as a result, significant for the conclusions one draws from this work (Dacey 2019b).

b. The Association/Cognition Distinction

The second discussion has occurred in relation to work in comparative animal psychology. In that literature, many debates are centered on whether the process responsible is associative or cognitive, with association gaining a default status due to Morgan’s Canon. As a result, associative processes are usually thought to be ubiquitous and sometimes can even potentially explain seemingly complex behavior (see Heyes 2012). Some authors have attacked the associative or cognitive framing as unproductive (Buckner 2011, Smith, Couchman, and Beran 2014, Dacey 2016). It remains an empirical question whether psychological processes cluster in ways that support a distinction between associative and cognitive processes. Nonetheless, there are reasons to reframe associative models as operating at either a lower, neural level (Buckner 2017) or a higher, more abstract level (Dacey 2016). Either move would, in principle, allow associative models and cognitive models to be applied to the same process, dissolving the problematic dichotomy.

6. Conclusion

Association is one of the most enduring concepts in the history of theorizing about the mind because it is one of the most flexible and one of the most powerful. The basic phenomena seem clear and indisputable: Some thoughts follow easily in sequence, and frequency of repetition is one reason for this. The models that formalize and articulate this insight seem capable of capturing many psychological phenomena. What this means is disputed and much less clear. There are questions pertaining to the specific mechanisms behind these phenomena, how many phenomena can be explained in these terms, what the associations are, and what is associated. The various views discussed above present very different answers to these questions.

7. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Mike Dacey
Bates College
U. S. A.