Thomas Hobbes: Moral and Political Philosophy
The English philosopher Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679) is best known for his political thought, and deservedly so. His vision of the world is strikingly original and still relevant to contemporary politics. His main concern is the problem of social and political order: how human beings can live together in peace and avoid the danger and fear of civil conflict. He poses stark alternatives: we should give our obedience to an unaccountable sovereign (a person or group empowered to decide every social and political issue). Otherwise what awaits us is a state of nature that closely resembles civil war – a situation of universal insecurity, where all have reason to fear violent death and where rewarding human cooperation is all but impossible.
One controversy has dominated interpretations of Hobbes. Does he see human beings as purely self-interested or egoistic? Several passages support such a reading, leading some to think that his political conclusions can be avoided if we adopt a more realistic picture of human nature. However, most scholars now accept that Hobbes himself had a much more complex view of human motivation. A major theme below will be why the problems he poses cannot be avoided simply by taking a less selfish view of human nature.
Table of Contents
- Life and Times
- Two Intellectual Influences
- Ethics and Human Nature
- The Natural Condition of Mankind
- References and Further Reading
Hobbes is the founding father of modern political philosophy. Directly or indirectly, he has set the terms of debate about the fundamentals of political life right into our own times. Few have liked his thesis, that the problems of political life mean that a society should accept an unaccountable sovereign as its sole political authority. Nonetheless, we still live in the world that Hobbes addressed head on: a world where human authority is something that requires justification, and is automatically accepted by few; a world where social and political inequality also appears questionable; and a world where religious authority faces significant dispute. We can put the matter in terms of the concern with equality and rights that Hobbes’s thought heralded: we live in a world where all human beings are supposed to have rights, that is, moral claims that protect their basic interests. But what or who determines what those rights are? And who will enforce them? In other words, who will exercise the most important political powers, when the basic assumption is that we all share the same entitlements?
We can see Hobbes’s importance if we briefly compare him with the most famous political thinkers before and after him. A century before, Nicolo Machiavelli had emphasized the harsh realities of power, as well as recalling ancient Roman experiences of political freedom. Machiavelli appears as the first modern political thinker, because like Hobbes he was no longer prepared to talk about politics in terms set by religious faith (indeed, he was still more offensive than Hobbes to many orthodox believers), instead, he looked upon politics as a secular discipline divorced from theology. But unlike Hobbes, Machiavelli offers us no comprehensive philosophy: we have to reconstruct his views on the importance and nature of freedom; it remains uncertain which, if any, principles Machiavelli draws on in his apparent praise of amoral power politics.
Writing a few years after Hobbes, John Locke had definitely accepted the terms of debate Hobbes had laid down: how can human beings live together, when religious or traditional justifications of authority are no longer effective or persuasive? How is political authority justified and how far does it extend? In particular, are our political rulers properly as unlimited in their powers as Hobbes had suggested? And if they are not, what system of politics will ensure that they do not overstep the mark, do not trespass on the rights of their subjects?
So, in assessing Hobbes’s political philosophy, our guiding questions can be: What did Hobbes write that was so important? How was he able to set out a way of thinking about politics and power that remains decisive nearly four centuries afterwards? We can get some clues to this second question if we look at Hobbes’s life and times.
Hobbes’s biography is dominated by the political events in England and Scotland during his long life. Born in 1588, the year the Spanish Armada made its ill-fated attempt to invade England, he lived to the exceptional age of 91, dying in 1679. He was not born to power or wealth or influence: the son of a disgraced village vicar, he was lucky that his uncle was wealthy enough to provide for his education and that his intellectual talents were soon recognized and developed (through thorough training in the classics of Latin and Greek). Those intellectual abilities, and his uncle’s support, brought him to university at Oxford. And these in turn—together with a good deal of common sense and personal maturity—won him a place tutoring the son of an important noble family, the Cavendishes. This meant that Hobbes entered circles where the activities of the King, of Members of Parliament, and of other wealthy landowners were known and discussed, and indeed influenced. Thus intellectual and practical ability brought Hobbes to a place close to power—later he would even be math tutor to the future King Charles II. Although this never made Hobbes powerful, it meant he was acquainted with and indeed vulnerable to those who were. As the scene was being set for the Civil Wars of 1642-46 and 1648-51—wars that would lead to the King being executed and a republic being declared—Hobbes felt forced to leave the country for his personal safety, and lived in France from 1640 to 1651. Even after the monarchy had been restored in 1660, Hobbes’s security was not always certain: powerful religious figures, critical of his writings, made moves in Parliament that apparently led Hobbes to burn some of his papers for fear of prosecution.
Thus Hobbes lived in a time of upheaval, sharper than any England has since known. This turmoil had many aspects and causes, political and religious, military and economic. England stood divided against itself in several ways. The rich and powerful were divided in their support for the King, especially concerning the monarch’s powers of taxation. Parliament was similarly divided concerning its own powers vis-à-vis the King. Society was divided religiously, economically, and by region. Inequalities in wealth were huge, and the upheavals of the Civil Wars saw the emergence of astonishingly radical religious and political sects. (For instance, the Levellers called for much greater equality in terms of wealth and political rights; the Diggers, more radical still, fought for the abolition of wage labor.) Civil war meant that the country became militarily divided. And all these divisions cut across one another: for example, the army of the republican challenger, Cromwell, was the main home of the Levellers, yet Cromwell in turn would act to destroy their power within the army’s ranks. In addition, England’s recent union with Scotland was fragile at best, and was almost destroyed by King Charles I’s attempts to impose consistency in religious practices. We shall see that Hobbes’s greatest fear was social and political chaos—and he had ample opportunity both to observe it and to suffer its effects.
Although social and political turmoil affected Hobbes’s life and shaped his thought, it never hampered his intellectual development. His early position as a tutor gave him the scope to read, write and publish (a brilliant translation of the Greek writer Thucydides appeared in 1629), and brought him into contact with notable English intellectuals such as Francis Bacon. His self-imposed exile in France, along with his emerging reputation as a scientist and thinker, brought him into contact with major European intellectual figures of his time, leading to exchange and controversy with figures such as Descartes, Mersenne and Gassendi. Intensely disputatious, Hobbes repeatedly embroiled himself in prolonged arguments with clerics, mathematicians, scientists and philosophers—sometimes to the cost of his intellectual reputation. (For instance, he argued repeatedly that it is possible to square the circle It is no accident that the phrase is now proverbial for a problem that cannot be solved!) His writing was as undaunted by age and ill health as it was by the events of his times. Though his health slowly failed—from about sixty, he began to suffer shaking palsy, probably Parkinson’s disease, which steadily worsened—even in his eighties he continued to dictate his thoughts to a secretary, and to defend his quarter in various controversies.
Hobbes gained a reputation in many fields. He was known as a scientist (especially in optics), as a mathematician (especially in geometry), as a translator of the classics, as a writer on law, as a disputant in metaphysics and epistemology; not least, he became notorious for his writings and disputes on religious questions. But it is for his writings on morality and politics that he has, rightly, been most remembered. Without these, scholars might remember Hobbes as an interesting intellectual of the seventeenth century; but few philosophers would even recognize his name.
What are the writings that earned Hobbes his philosophical fame? The first was entitled The Elements of Law (1640); this was Hobbes’s attempt to provide arguments supporting the King against his challengers. De Cive [On the Citizen] (1642) has much in common with Elements, and offers a clear, concise statement of Hobbes’s moral and political philosophy. His most famous work is Leviathan, a classic of English prose (1651; a slightly altered Latin edition appeared in 1668). Leviathan expands on the argument of De Cive, mostly in terms of its huge second half that deals with questions of religion. Other important works include: De Corpore [On the Body] (1655), which deals with questions of metaphysics; De Homine [On Man] (1657); and Behemoth (published 1682, though written rather earlier), in which Hobbes gives his account of England’s Civil Wars. But to understand the essentials of Hobbes’s ideas and system, one can rely on De Cive and Leviathan. It is also worth noting that, although Leviathan is more famous and more often read, De Cive actually gives a much more straightforward account of Hobbes’s ideas. Readers whose main interest is in those ideas may wish to skip the next section and go straight to ethics and human nature.
As well as the political background just stressed, two influences are extremely marked in Hobbes’s work. The first is a reaction against religious authority as it had been known, and especially against the scholastic philosophy that accepted and defended such authority. The second is a deep admiration for (and involvement in) the emerging scientific method, alongside an admiration for a much older discipline, geometry. Both influences affected how Hobbes expressed his moral and political ideas. In some areas it is also clear that they significantly affected the ideas themselves.
Hobbes’s contempt for scholastic philosophy is boundless. Leviathan and other works are littered with references to the “frequency of insignificant speech” in the speculations of the scholastics, with their combinations of Christian theology and Aristotelian metaphysics. Hobbes’s reaction, apart from much savage and sparkling sarcasm, is twofold. In the first place, he makes very strong claims about the proper relation between religion and politics. He was not (as many have charged) an atheist, but he was deadly serious in insisting that theological disputes should be kept out of politics. (He also adopts a strongly materialist metaphysics, that—as his critics were quick to charge—makes it difficult to account for God’s existence as a spiritual entity.) For Hobbes, the sovereign should determine the proper forms of religious worship, and citizens never have duties to God that override their duty to obey political authority. Second, this reaction against scholasticism shapes the presentation of Hobbes’s own ideas. He insists that terms be clearly defined and relate to actual concrete experiences—part of his empiricism. (Many early sections of Leviathan read rather like a dictionary.) Commentators debate how seriously to take Hobbes’s stress on the importance of definition, and whether it embodies a definite philosophical doctrine. What is certain, and more important from the point of view of his moral and political thought, is that he tries extremely hard to avoid any metaphysical categories that do not relate to physical realities (especially the mechanical realities of matter and motion). Commentators further disagree whether Hobbes’s often mechanical sounding definitions of human nature and human behavior are actually important in shaping his moral and political ideas—see Materialism versus self-knowledge below.
Hobbes’s determination to avoid the “insignificant” (that is, meaningless) speech of the scholastics also overlaps with his admiration for the emerging physical sciences and for geometry. His admiration is not so much for the emerging method of experimental science, but rather for deductive science—science that deduces the workings of things from basic first principles and from true definitions of the basic elements. Hobbes therefore approves a mechanistic view of science and knowledge, one that models itself very much on the clarity and deductive power exhibited in proofs in geometry. It is fair to say that this a priori account of science has found little favor after Hobbes’s time. It looks rather like a dead-end on the way to the modern idea of science based on patient observation, theory-building and experiment. Nonetheless, it certainly provided Hobbes with a method that he follows in setting out his ideas about human nature and politics. As presented in Leviathan, especially, Hobbes seems to build from first elements of human perception and reasoning, up to a picture of human motivation and action, to a deduction of the possible forms of political relations and their relative desirability. Once more, it can be disputed whether this method is significant in shaping those ideas, or merely provides Hobbes with a distinctive way of presenting them.
Hobbes’s moral thought is difficult to disentangle from his politics. On his view, what we ought to do depends greatly on the situation in which we find ourselves. Where political authority is lacking (as in his famous natural condition of mankind), our fundamental right seems to be to save our skins, by whatever means we think fit. Where political authority exists, our duty seems to be quite straightforward: to obey those in power.
But we can usefully separate the ethics from the politics if we follow Hobbes’s own division. For him ethics is concerned with human nature, while political philosophy deals with what happens when human beings interact. What, then, is Hobbes’s view of human nature?
Reading the opening chapters of Leviathan is a confusing business, and the reason for this is already apparent in Hobbes’s very short Introduction. He begins by telling us that the human body is like a machine, and that political organization (the commonwealth) is like an artificial human being. He ends by saying that the truth of his ideas can be gauged only by self-examination, by looking into our selves to adjudge our characteristic thoughts and passions, which form the basis of all human action. But what is the relationship between these two very different claims? For obviously when we look into our selves we do not see mechanical pushes and pulls. This mystery is hardly answered by Hobbes’s method in the opening chapters, where he persists in talking about all manner of psychological phenomena—from emotions to thoughts to whole trains of reasoning – as products of mechanical interactions. (As to what he will say about successful political organization, the resemblance between the commonwealth and a functioning human being is slim indeed. Hobbes’s only real point seems to be that there should be a head that decides most of the important things that the body does.)
Most commentators now agree with an argument made in the 1960’s by the political philosopher Leo Strauss. Hobbes draws on his notion of a mechanistic science, that works deductively from first principles, in setting out his ideas about human nature. Science provides him with a distinctive method and some memorable metaphors and similes. What it does not provide—nor could it, given the rudimentary state of physiology and psychology in Hobbes’s day—are any decisive or substantive ideas about what human nature really is. Those ideas may have come, as Hobbes also claims, from self-examination. In all likelihood, they actually derived from his reflection on contemporary events and his reading of classics of political history such as Thucydides.
This is not to say that we should ignore Hobbes’s ideas on human nature—far from it. But it does mean we should not be misled by scientific imagery that stems from an in fact non-existent science (and also, to some extent, from an unproven and uncertain metaphysics). The point is important mainly when it comes to a central interpretative point in Hobbes’s work: whether or not he thinks of human beings as mechanical objects, programmed as it were to pursue their self-interest. Some have suggested that Hobbes’s mechanical world-view leaves no room for the influence of moral ideas, that he thinks the only effective influence on our behavior will be incentives of pleasure and pain. But while it is true that Hobbes sometimes says things like this, we should be clear that the ideas fit together only in a metaphorical way. For example, there is no reason why moral ideas should not “get into” the mechanisms that drive us round (like so many clock-work dolls perhaps?). Likewise, there is no reason why pursuing pleasure and pain should work in our self-interest. (What self-interest is depends on the time-scale we adopt, and how effectively we might achieve this goal also depends on our insight into what harms and benefits us). If we want to know what drives human beings, on Hobbes’s view, we must read carefully all he says about this, as well as what he needs to assume if the rest of his thought is to make sense. The mechanistic metaphor is something of a red herring and, in the end, probably less useful than his other starting point in Leviathan, the Delphic epithet: nosce teipsum (know thyself).
There are two major aspects to Hobbes’s picture of human nature. As we have seen, and will explore below, what motivates human beings to act is extremely important to Hobbes. The other aspect concerns human powers of judgment and reasoning, about which Hobbes tends to be extremely skeptical. Like many philosophers before him, Hobbes wants to present a more solid and certain account of human morality than is contained in everyday beliefs. Plato had contrasted knowledge with opinion. Hobbes contrasts science with a whole raft of less reliable forms of belief—from probable inference based on experience, right down to “absurdity, to which no living creature is subject but man” (Leviathan, v.7).
Hobbes has several reasons for thinking that human judgment is unreliable, and needs to be guided by science. Our judgments tend to be distorted by self-interest or by the pleasures and pains of the moment. We may share the same basic passions, but the various things of the world affect us all very differently; and we are inclined to use our feelings as measures for others. It becomes dogmatic through vanity and morality, as with “men vehemently in love with their own new opinions…and obstinately bent to maintain them, [who give] their opinions also that reverenced name of conscience” (Leviathan, vii.4). When we use words which lack any real objects of reference, or are unclear about the meaning of the words we use, the danger is not only that our thoughts will be meaningless, but also that we will fall into violent dispute. (Hobbes has scholastic philosophy in mind, but he also makes related points about the dangerous effects of faulty political ideas and ideologies.) We form beliefs about supernatural entities, fairies and spirits and so on, and fear follows where belief has gone, further distorting our judgment. Judgment can be swayed this way and that by rhetoric, that is, by the persuasive and “colored speech” of others, who can deliberately deceive us and may well have purposes that go against the common good or indeed our own good. Not least, much judgment is concerned with what we should do now, that is, with future events, “the future being but a fiction of the mind” (Leviathan, iii.7) and therefore not reliably known to us.
For Hobbes, it is only science, “the knowledge of consequences” (Leviathan, v.17), that offers reliable knowledge of the future and overcomes the frailties of human judgment. Unfortunately, his picture of science, based on crudely mechanistic premises and developed through deductive demonstrations, is not even plausible in the physical sciences. When it comes to the complexities of human behavior, Hobbes’s model of science is even less satisfactory. He is certainly an acute and wise commentator of political affairs; we can praise him for his hard-headedness about the realities of human conduct, and for his determination to create solid chains of logical reasoning. Nonetheless, this does not mean that Hobbes was able to reach a level of scientific certainty in his judgments that had been lacking in all previous reflection on morals and politics.
The most consequential aspect of Hobbes’s account of human nature centers on his ideas about human motivation, and this topic is therefore at the heart of many debates about how to understand Hobbes’s philosophy. Many interpreters have presented the Hobbesian agent as a self-interested, rationally calculating actor (those ideas have been important in modern political philosophy and economic thought, especially in terms of rational choice theories). It is true that some of the problems that face people like this—rational egoists, as philosophers call them—are similar to the problems Hobbes wants to solve in his political philosophy. And it is also very common for first-time readers of Hobbes to get the impression that he believes we are all basically selfish.
There are good reasons why earlier interpreters and new readers tend to think the Hobbesian agent is ultimately self-interested. Hobbes likes to make bold and even shocking claims to get his point across. “I obtained two absolutely certain postulates of human nature,” he says, “one, the postulate of human greed by which each man insists upon his own private use of common property; the other, the postulate of natural reason, by which each man strives to avoid violent death” (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory). What could be clearer?—We want all we can get, and we certainly want to avoid death. There are two problems with thinking that this is Hobbes’s considered view, however. First, quite simply, it represents a false view of human nature. People do all sorts of altruistic things that go against their interests. They also do all sorts of needlessly cruel things that go against self-interest (think of the self-defeating lengths that revenge can run to). So it would be uncharitable to interpret Hobbes this way, if we can find a more plausible account in his work. Second, in any case Hobbes often relies on a more sophisticated view of human nature. He describes or even relies on motives that go beyond or against self-interest, such as pity, a sense of honor or courage, and so on. And he frequently emphasizes that we find it difficult to judge or appreciate just what our interests are anyhow. (Some also suggest that Hobbes’s views on the matter shifted away from egoism after De Cive, but the point is not crucial here.)
The upshot is that Hobbes does not think that we are basically or reliably selfish; and he does not think we are fundamentally or reliably rational in our ideas about what is in our interests. He is rarely surprised to find human beings doing things that go against self-interest: we will cut off our noses to spite our faces, we will torture others for their eternal salvation, we will charge to our deaths for love of country. In fact, a lot of the problems that befall human beings, according to Hobbes, result from their being too little concerned with self-interest. Too often, he thinks, we are too much concerned with what others think of us, or inflamed by religious doctrine, or carried away by others’ inflammatory words. This weakness as regards our self-interest has even led some to think that Hobbes is advocating a theory known as ethical egoism. This is to claim that Hobbes bases morality upon self-interest, claiming that we ought to do what it is most in our interest to do. But we shall see that this would over-simplify the conclusions that Hobbes draws from his account of human nature.
This is Hobbes’s picture of human nature. We are needy and vulnerable. We are easily led astray in our attempts to know the world around us. Our capacity to reason is as fragile as our capacity to know; it relies upon language and is prone to error and undue influence. When we act, we may do so selfishly or impulsively or in ignorance, on the basis of faulty reasoning or bad theology or others’ emotive speech.
What is the political fate of this rather pathetic sounding creature—that is, of us? Unsurprisingly, Hobbes thinks little happiness can be expected of our lives together. The best we can hope for is peaceful life under an authoritarian-sounding sovereign. The worst, on Hobbes’s account, is what he calls the natural condition of mankind, a state of violence, insecurity and constant threat. In outline, Hobbes’s argument is that the alternative to government is a situation no one could reasonably wish for, and that any attempt to make government accountable to the people must undermine it, so threatening the situation of non-government that we must all wish to avoid. Our only reasonable option, therefore, is a “sovereign” authority that is totally unaccountable to its subjects. Let us deal with the “natural condition” of non-government, also called the “state of nature,” first of all.
The state of nature is “natural” in one specific sense only. For Hobbes political authority is artificial: in the “natural” condition human beings lack government, which is an authority created by men. What is Hobbes’s reasoning here? He claims that the only authority that naturally exists among human beings is that of a mother over her child, because the child is so very much weaker than the mother (and indebted to her for its survival). Among adult human beings this is invariably not the case. Hobbes concedes an obvious objection, admitting that some of us are much stronger than others. And although he is very sarcastic about the idea that some are wiser than others, he does not have much difficulty with the idea that some are fools and others are dangerously cunning. Nonetheless, it is almost invariably true that every human being is capable of killing any other. “Even the strongest must sleep; even the weakest might persuade others to help him kill another”. (Leviathan, xiii.1-2) Because adults are equal in this capacity to threaten one another’s lives, Hobbes claims there is no natural source of authority to order their lives together. (He is strongly opposing arguments that established monarchs have a natural or God-given right to rule over us.)
Thus, as long as human beings have not successfully arranged some form of government, they live in Hobbes’s state of nature. Such a condition might occur at the “beginning of time” (see Hobbes’s comments on Cain and Abel, Leviathan, xiii.11, Latin version only), or in “primitive” societies (Hobbes thought the American Indians lived in such a condition). But the real point for Hobbes is that a state of nature could just as well occur in seventeenth century England, should the King’s authority be successfully undermined. It could occur tomorrow in every modern society, for example, if the police and army suddenly refused to do their jobs on behalf of government. Unless some effective authority stepped into the King’s place (or the place of army and police and government), Hobbes argues the result is doomed to be deeply awful, nothing less than a state of war.
Why should peaceful cooperation be impossible without an overarching authority? Hobbes provides a series of powerful arguments that suggest it is extremely unlikely that human beings will live in security and peaceful cooperation without government. (Anarchism, the thesis that we should live without government, of course disputes these arguments.) His most basic argument is threefold. (Leviathan, xiii.3-9) (i) He thinks we will compete, violently compete, to secure the basic necessities of life and perhaps to make other material gains. (ii) He argues that we will challenge others and fight out of fear (“diffidence”), so as to ensure our personal safety. (iii) And he believes that we will seek reputation (“glory”), both for its own sake and for its protective effects (for example, so that others will be afraid to challenge us).
This is a more difficult argument than it might seem. Hobbes does not suppose that we are all selfish, that we are all cowards, or that we are all desperately concerned with how others see us. Two points, though. First, he does think that some of us are selfish, some of us cowardly, and some of us “vainglorious” (perhaps some people are of all of these!). Moreover, many of these people will be prepared to use violence to attain their ends—especially if there is no government or police to stop them. In this Hobbes is surely correct. Second, in some situations it makes good sense, at least in the short term, to use violence and to behave selfishly, fearfully or vaingloriously. If our lives seem to be at stake, after all, we are unlikely to have many scruples about stealing a loaf of bread; if we perceive someone as a deadly threat, we may well want to attack first, while his guard is down; if we think that there are lots of potential attackers out there, it is going to make perfect sense to get a reputation as someone who should not be messed with. In Hobbes’s words, “the wickedness of bad men also compels good men to have recourse, for their own protection, to the virtues of war, which are violence and fraud”. (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory) As well as being more complex than first appears, Hobbes’s argument becomes very difficult to refute.
Underlying this most basic argument is an important consideration about insecurity. As we shall see Hobbes places great weight on contracts (thus some interpreters see Hobbes as heralding a market society dominated by contractual exchanges). In particular, he often speaks of “covenants,” by which he means a contract where one party performs his part of the bargain later than the other. In the state of nature such agreements are not going to work. Only the weakest will have good reason to perform the second part of a covenant, and then only if the stronger party is standing over them. Yet a huge amount of human cooperation relies on trust, that others will return their part of the bargain over time. A similar point can be made about property, most of which we cannot carry about with us and watch over. This means we must rely on others respecting our possessions over extended periods of time. If we cannot do this, then many of the achievements of human society that involve putting hard work into land (farming, building) or material objects (the crafts, or modern industrial production, still unknown in Hobbes’s time) will be near impossible.
One can reasonably object to such points: Surely there are basic duties to reciprocate fairly and to behave in a trustworthy manner? Even if there is no government providing a framework of law, judgment and punishment, do not most people have a reasonable sense of what is right and wrong, which will prevent the sort of contract-breaking and generalized insecurity that Hobbes is concerned with? Indeed, should not our basic sense of morality prevent much of the greed, pre-emptive attack and reputation-seeking that Hobbes stressed in the first place? This is the crunch point of Hobbes’s argument, and it is here (if anywhere) that one can accuse Hobbes of pessimism. He makes two claims. The first concerns our duties in the state of nature (that is, the so-called “right of nature”). The second follows from this, and is less often noticed: it concerns the danger posed by our different and variable judgments of what is right and wrong.
On Hobbes’s view the right of nature is quite simple to define. Naturally speaking—that is, outside of civil society – we have a right to do whatever we think will ensure our self-preservation. The worst that can happen to us is violent death at the hands of others. If we have any rights at all, if (as we might put it) nature has given us any rights whatsoever, then the first is surely this: the right to prevent violent death befalling us. But Hobbes says more than this, and it is this point that makes his argument so powerful. We do not just have a right to ensure our self-preservation: we each have a right to judge what will ensure our self-preservation. And this is where Hobbes’s picture of humankind becomes important. Hobbes has given us good reasons to think that human beings rarely judge wisely. Yet in the state of nature no one is in a position to successfully define what is good judgment. If I judge that killing you is a sensible or even necessary move to safeguard my life, then—in Hobbes’s state of nature – I have a right to kill you. Others might judge the matter differently, of course. Almost certainly you will have quite a different view of things (perhaps you were just stretching your arms, not raising a musket to shoot me). Because we are all insecure, because trust is more-or-less absent, there is little chance of our sorting out misunderstandings peacefully, nor can we rely on some (trusted) third party to decide whose judgment is right. We all have to be judges in our own causes, and the stakes are very high indeed: life or death.
For this reason Hobbes makes very bold claims that sound totally amoral. “To this war of every man against every man,” he says, “this also is consequent [i.e., it follows]: that nothing can be unjust. The notions of right and wrong, justice and injustice have no place [in the state of nature]”. (Leviathan, xiii.13) He further argues that in the state of nature we each have a right to all things, “even to one another’s body’ (Leviathan, xiv.4). Hobbes is dramatizing his point, but the core is defensible. If I judge that I need such and such—an object, another person’s labor, another person’s death—to ensure my continued existence, then in the state of nature, there is no agreed authority to decide whether I’m right or wrong. New readers of Hobbes often suppose that the state of nature would be a much nicer place, if only he were to picture human beings with some basic moral ideas. But this is naïve: unless people share the same moral ideas, not just at the level of general principles but also at the level of individual judgment, then the challenge he poses remains unsolved: human beings who lack some shared authority are almost certain to fall into dangerous and deadly conflict.
There are different ways of interpreting Hobbes’s view of the absence of moral constraints in the state of nature. Some think that Hobbes is imagining human beings who have no idea of social interaction and therefore no ideas about right and wrong. In this case, the natural condition would be a purely theoretical construction, and would demonstrate what both government and society do for human beings. (A famous statement about the state of nature in De Cive (viii.1) might support this interpretation: “looking at men as if they had just emerged from the earth like mushrooms and grown up without any obligation to each other…”) Another, complementary view reads Hobbes as a psychological egoist, so that—in the state of nature as elsewhere – he is merely describing the interaction of ultimately selfish and amoral human beings.
Others suppose that Hobbes has a much more complex picture of human motivation, so that there is no reason to think moral ideas are absent in the state of nature. In particular, it is historically reasonable to think that Hobbes invariably has civil war in mind, when he describes our “natural condition.” If we think of civil war, we need to imagine people who have lived together and indeed still do live together—huddled together in fear in their houses, banded together as armies or guerrillas or groups of looters. The problem here is not a lack of moral ideas—far from it – rather that moral ideas and judgments differ enormously. This means (for example) that two people who are fighting tooth and nail over a cow or a gun can both think they are perfectly entitled to the object and both think they are perfectly right to kill the other—a point Hobbes makes explicitly and often. It also enables us to see that many Hobbesian conflicts are about religious ideas or political ideals (as well as self-preservation and so on)—as in the British Civil War raging while Hobbes wrote Leviathan, and in the many violent sectarian conflicts throughout the world today.
In the end, though, whatever account of the state of nature and its (a) morality we attribute to Hobbes, we must remember that it is meant to function as a powerful and decisive threat: if we do not heed Hobbes’s teachings and fail to respect existing political authority, then the natural condition and its horrors of war await us.
Hobbes thinks the state of nature is something we ought to avoid, at any cost except our own self-preservation (this being our “right of nature,” as we saw above). But what sort of ought is this? There are two basic ways of interpreting Hobbes here. It might be a counsel of prudence: avoid the state of nature, if you’re concerned to avoid violent death. In this case Hobbes’s advice only applies to us (i) if we agree that violent death is what we should fear most and should therefore avoid; and (ii) if we agree with Hobbes that only an unaccountable sovereign stands between human beings and the state of nature. This line of thought fits well with an egoistic reading of Hobbes, but it faces serious problems, as will be seen.
The other way of interpreting Hobbes is not without problems either. This takes Hobbes to be saying that we ought, morally speaking, to avoid the state of nature. We have a duty to do what we can to avoid this situation arising, and a duty to end it, if at all possible. Hobbes often makes his view clear, that we have such moral obligations. But then two difficult questions arise: Why these obligations? And why are they obligatory?
Hobbes frames the issues in terms of an older vocabulary, using the idea of natural law that many ancient and medieval philosophers had relied on. Like them, he thinks that human reason can discern some eternal principles to govern our conduct. These principles are independent of (though also complementary to) whatever moral instruction we might get from God or religion. In other words, they are laws given by nature rather than revealed by God. But Hobbes makes radical changes to the content of these so-called laws of nature. In particular, he does not think that natural law provides any scope whatsoever to criticize or disobey the actual laws made by a government. He thus disagrees with those Protestants who thought that religious conscience might sanction disobedience of immoral laws, and with Catholics who thought that the commandments of the Pope have primacy over those of national political authorities.
Although he sets out nineteen laws of nature, it is the first two that are politically crucial. A third, that stresses the important of keeping to contracts we have entered into, is important in Hobbes’s moral justifications of obedience to the sovereign. (The remaining sixteen can be quite simply encapsulated in the formula, do as you would be done by. While the details are important for scholars of Hobbes, they do not affect the overall theory and will be ignored here.)
The first law reads as follows:
Every man ought to endeavor peace, as far as he has hope of obtaining it, and when he cannot obtain it, that he may seek and use all helps and advantages of war. (Leviathan, xiv.4)
This repeats the points we have already seen about our right of nature, so long as peace does not appear to be a realistic prospect. The second law of nature is more complicated:
That a man be willing, when others are so too, as far-forth as for peace and defense of himself he shall think it necessary, to lay down this right to all things, and be contented with so much liberty against other men, as he would allow other men against himself. (Leviathan, xiv.5)
What Hobbes tries to tackle here is the transition from the state of nature to civil society. But how he does this is misleading and has generated much confusion and disagreement. The way that Hobbes describes this second law of nature makes it look as if we should all put down our weapons, give up (much of) our “right of nature,” and jointly authorize a sovereign who will tell us what is permitted and punish us if we do not obey. But the problem is obvious. If the state of nature is anything like as bad as Hobbes has argued, then there is just no way people could ever make an agreement like this or put it into practice.
At the end of Leviathan, Hobbes seems to concede this point, saying “there is scarce a commonwealth in the world whose beginnings can in conscience be justified” (Review and Conclusion, 8). That is: governments have invariably been foisted upon people by force and fraud, not by collective agreement. But Hobbes means to defend every existing government that is powerful enough to secure peace among its subjects—not just a mythical government that’s been created by a peaceful contract out of a state of nature. His basic claim is that we should behave as if we had voluntarily entered into such a contract with everyone else in our society—everyone else, that is, except the sovereign authority.
In Hobbes’s myth of the social contract, everyone except the person or group who will wield sovereign power lays down their “right to all things.” They agree to limit drastically their right of nature, retaining only a right to defend their lives in case of immediate threat. (How limited this right of nature becomes in civil society has caused much dispute, because deciding what is an immediate threat is a question of judgment. It certainly permits us to fight back if the sovereign tries to kill us. But what if the sovereign conscripts us as soldiers? What if the sovereign looks weak and we doubt whether he can continue to secure peace…?) The sovereign, however, retains his (or her, or their) right of nature, which we have seen is effectively a right to all things—to decide what everyone else should do, to decide the rules of property, to judge disputes and so on. Hobbes concedes that there are moral limits on what sovereigns should do (God might call a sovereign to account). However, since in any case of dispute the sovereign is the only rightful judge—on this earth, that is – those moral limits make no practical difference. In every moral and political matter, the decisive question for Hobbes is always: who is to judge? As we have seen, in the state of nature, each of us is judge in our own cause, part of the reason why Hobbes thinks it is inevitably a state of war. Once civil society exists, the only rightful judge is the sovereign.
If we had all made a voluntary contract, a mutual promise, then it might seem half-way plausible to think we have an obligation to obey the sovereign (although even this requires the claim that promising is a moral value that overrides all others). If we have been conquered or, more fortunately, have simply been born into a society with an established political authority, this seems quite improbable. Hobbes has to make three steps here, all of which have seemed weak to many of his readers. First of all, he insists that promises made under threat of violence are nonetheless freely made, and just as binding as any others. Second, he has to put great weight on the moral value of promise keeping, which hardly fits with the absence of duties in the state of nature. Third, he has to give a story of how those of us born and raised in a political society have made some sort of implied promise to each other to obey, or at least, he has to show that we are bound (either morally or out of self-interest) to behave as if we had made such a promise.
In the first place, Hobbes draws on his mechanistic picture of the world, to suggest that threats of force do not deprive us of liberty. Liberty, he says, is freedom of motion, and I am free to move whichever way I wish, unless I am literally enchained. If I yield to threats of violence, that is my choice, for physically I could have done otherwise. If I obey the sovereign for fear of punishment or in fear of the state of nature, then that is equally my choice. Such obedience then comes, for Hobbes, to constitute a promise that I will continue to obey.
Second, promises carry a huge moral weight for Hobbes, as they do in all social contract theories. The question, however, is why we should think they are so important. Why should my (coerced) promise oblige me, given the wrong you committed in threatening me and demanding my valuables? Hobbes has no good answer to this question (but see below, on egoistic interpretations of Hobbes’s thinking here). His theory suggests that (in the state of nature) you could do me no wrong, as the right of nature dictates that we all have a right to all things. Likewise, promises do not oblige in the state of nature, inasmuch as they go against our right of nature. In civil society, the sovereign’s laws dictate what is right and wrong; if your threat was wrongful, then my promise will not bind me. But as the sovereign is outside of the original contract, he sets the terms for everyone else: so his threats create obligations.
As this suggests, Hobbesian promises are strangely fragile. Implausibly binding so long as a sovereign exists to adjudicate and enforce them, they lose all power should things revert to a state of nature. Relatedly, they seem to contain not one jot of loyalty. To be logically consistent, Hobbes needs to be politically implausible. Now there are passages where Hobbes sacrifices consistency for plausibility, arguing we have a duty to fight for our (former) sovereign even in the midst of civil war. Nonetheless the logic of his theory suggests that, as soon as government starts to weaken and disorder sets in, our duty of obedience lapses. That is, when the sovereign power needs our support, because it is no longer able to coerce us, there is no effective judge or enforcer of covenants, so that such promises no longer override our right of nature. This turns common sense on its head. Surely a powerful government can afford to be challenged, for instance by civil disobedience or conscientious objection? But when civil conflict and the state of nature threaten, in other words when government is failing, then we might reasonably think that political unity is as morally important as Hobbes always suggests. A similar question of loyalty also comes up when the sovereign power has been usurped—when Cromwell has supplanted the King, when a foreign invader has ousted our government. Right from the start, Hobbes’s critics saw that his theory makes turncoats into moral heroes: our allegiance belongs to whoever happens to be holding the gun(s). Perversely, the only crime the makers of a coup can commit is to fail.
Why does this problem come about? To overcome the fact that his contract is a fiction, Hobbes is driven to construct a “sort of” promise out of the fact of our subjugation to whatever political authority exists. He stays wedded to the idea that obedience can only find a moral basis in a “voluntary” promise, because only this seems to justify the almost unlimited obedience and renunciation of individual judgment he is determined to prove. It is no surprise that Hobbes’s arguments creak at every point: nothing could bear the weight of justifying such an overriding duty.
All the difficulties in finding a reliable moral obligation to obey might tempt us back to the idea that Hobbes is some sort of egoist. However, the difficulties with this tack are even greater. There are two sorts of egoism commentators have attributed to Hobbes: psychological and ethical. The first theory says that human beings always act egoistically, the second that they ought to act egoistically. Either view might support this simple idea: we should obey the sovereign, because his political authority is what keeps us from the evils of the natural condition. But the basic problem with such egoistic interpretations, from the point of view of Hobbes’s system of politics, is shown when we think about cases where selfishness seems to conflict with the commands of the sovereign—for example, where illegal conduct will benefit us or keep us from danger. For a psychologically egoist agent, such behavior will be irresistible; for an ethically egoist agent, it will be morally obligatory. Now, providing the sovereign is sufficiently powerful and well-informed, he can prevent many such cases arising by threatening and enforcing punishments of those who disobey. Effective threats of punishment mean that obedience is in our self-interest. But such threats will not be effective when we think our disobedience can go undetected. After Orwell’s 1984 we can imagine a state that is so powerful that no reasonable person would ever think disobedience could pay. But for Hobbes, such a powerful sovereign was not even conceivable: he would have had to assume that there would be many situations where people could reasonably hope to “get away with it.” (Likewise, under non-totalitarian, liberal politics, there are many situations where illegal behavior is very unlikely to be detected or punished.) So, still thinking of egoistic agents, the more people do get away with it, the more reason others have to think they can do the same. Thus the problem of disobedience threatens to “snowball,” undermining the sovereign and plunging selfish agents back into the chaos of the state of nature.
In other words, sovereignty as Hobbes imagined it, and liberal political authority as we know it, can only function where people feel some additional motivation apart from pure self-interest. Moreover, there is strong evidence that Hobbes was well aware of this. Part of Hobbes’s interest in religion (a topic that occupies half of Leviathan) lies in its power to shape human conduct. Sometimes this does seem to work through self-interest, as in crude threats of damnation and hell-fire. But Hobbes’s main interest lies in the educative power of religion, and indeed of political authority. Religious practices, the doctrines taught in the universities (!), the beliefs and habits inculcated by the institutions of government and society: how these can encourage and secure respect for law and authority seem to be even more important to Hobbes’s political solutions than his theoretical social contract or shaky appeals to simple self-interest.
What are we to conclude, then, given the difficulties in finding a reliable moral or selfish justification for obedience? In the end, for Hobbes, everything rides on the value of peace. Hobbes wants to say both that civil order is in our “enlightened” self-interest, and that it is of overwhelming moral value. Life is never going to be perfect for us, and life under the sovereign is the best we can do. Recognizing this aspect of everyone’s self-interest should lead us to recognize the moral value of supporting whatever authority we happen to live under. For Hobbes, this moral value is so great—and the alternatives so stark – that it should override every threat to our self-interest except the imminent danger of death. The million-dollar question is then: is a life of obedience to the sovereign really the best human beings can hope for?
Hobbes has definite ideas about the proper nature, scope and exercise of sovereignty. Much that he says is cogent, and much of it can reduce the worries we might have about living under this drastically authoritarian sounding regime. Many commentators have stressed, for example, the importance Hobbes places upon the rule of law. His claim that much of our freedom, in civil society, “depends on the silence of the laws” is often quoted (Leviathan, xxi.18). In addition, Hobbes makes many points that are obviously aimed at contemporary debates about the rights of King and Parliament—especially about the sovereign’s rights as regards taxation and the seizure of property, and about the proper relation between religion and politics. Some of these points continue to be relevant, others are obviously anachronistic: evidently Hobbes could not have imagined the modern state, with its vast bureaucracies, massive welfare provision and complicated interfaces with society. Nor could he have foreseen how incredibly powerful the state might become, meaning that sovereigns such as Hitler or Stalin might starve, brutalize and kill their subjects, to such an extent that the state of nature looks clearly preferable.
However, the problem with all of Hobbes’s notions about sovereignty is that—on his account – it is not Hobbes the philosopher, nor we the citizens, who decide what counts as the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty. He faces a systematic problem: justifying any limits or constraints on the sovereign involves making judgments about moral or practical requirements. But one of his greatest insights, still little recognized by many moral philosophers, is that any right or entitlement is only practically meaningful when combined with a concrete judgment as to what it dictates in some given case. Hobbes’s own failure, however understandable, to foresee the growth of government and its powers only supports this thought: that the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty is a matter of complex judgment. Alone among the people who comprise Hobbes’s commonwealth, it is the sovereign who judges what form he should appear in, how far he should reach into the lives of his subjects, and how he should exercise his powers.
It should be added that the one part of his system that Hobbes concedes not to be proven with certainty is just this question: who or what should constitute the sovereign power. It was natural for Hobbes to think of a King, or indeed a Queen (he was born under Elizabeth I). But he was certainly very familiar with ancient forms of government, including aristocracy (government by an elite) and democracy (government by the citizens, who formed a relatively small group within the total population). Hobbes was also aware that an assembly such as Parliament could constitute a sovereign body. All have advantages and disadvantages, he argues. But the unity that comes about from having a single person at the apex, together with fixed rules of succession that pre-empt dispute about who this person should be, makes monarchy Hobbes’s preferred option.
In fact, if we want to crack open Hobbes’s sovereign, to be able to lay down concrete ideas about its nature and limits, we must begin with the question of judgment. For Hobbes, dividing capacities to judge between different bodies is tantamount to letting the state of nature straight back in. “For what is it to divide the power of a commonwealth, but to dissolve it; for powers divided mutually destroy each other”. (Leviathan, xxix.12; cf De Cive, xii.5) Beyond the example of England in the 1640s, Hobbes hardly bothers to argue the point, although it is crucial to his entire theory. Always in his mind is the Civil War that arose when Parliament claimed the right to judge rules of taxation, and thereby prevented the King from ruling and making war as he saw fit, and when churches and religious sects claimed prerogatives that went against the King’s decisions.
Especially given modern experiences of the division of powers, however, it is easy to see that these examples are extreme and atypical. We might recall the American constitution, where powers of legislation, execution and case-by-case judgment are separated (to Congress, President and the judiciary respectively) and counter-balance one another. Each of these bodies is responsible for judging different questions. There are often, of course, boundary disputes, as to whether legislative, executive or judicial powers should apply to a given issue, and no one body is empowered to settle this crucial question of judgment. Equally obviously, however, such disputes have not led to a state of nature (well, at least if we think of the US after the Civil War). For Hobbes it is simply axiomatic that disputation as to who should judge important social and political issues spells the end of the commonwealth. For us, it is equally obvious that only a few extreme forms of dispute have this very dangerous power. Dividing the powers that are important to government need not leave a society more open to those dangerous conflicts. Indeed, many would now argue that political compromises which provide different groups and bodies with independent space to judge certain social or political issues can be crucial for preventing disputes from escalating into violent conflict or civil war.
What happens, then, if we do not follow Hobbes in his arguments that judgment must, by necessity or by social contract or both, be the sole province of the sovereign? If we are optimists about the power of human judgment, and about the extent of moral consensus among human beings, we have a straightforward route to the concerns of modern liberalism. Our attention will not be on the question of social and political order, rather on how to maximize liberty, how to define social justice, how to draw the limits of government power, and how to realize democratic ideals. We will probably interpret Hobbes as a psychological egoist, and think that the problems of political order that obsessed him were the product of an unrealistic view of human nature, or unfortunate historical circumstances, or both. In this case, I suggest, we might as well not have read Hobbes at all.
If we are less optimistic about human judgment in morals and politics, however, we should not doubt that Hobbes’s problems remain our problems. But hindsight shows grave limitations to his solutions. Theoretically, Hobbes fails to prove that we have an almost unlimited obligation to obey the sovereign. His arguments that sovereignty—the power to judge moral and political matters, and enforce those judgments—cannot be divided are not only weak; they are simply refuted by the (relatively) successful distribution of powers in modern liberal societies. Not least, the horrific crimes of twentieth century dictatorships show beyond doubt that judgment about right and wrong cannot be a question only for our political leaders.
If Hobbes’s problems are real and his solutions only partly convincing, where will we go? It might reasonably be thought that this is the central question of modern political thought. We will have no doubt that peaceful coexistence is one of the greatest goods of human life, something worth many inconveniences, sacrifices and compromises. We will see that there is moral force behind the laws and requirements of the state, simply because human beings do indeed need authority and systems of enforcement if they are to cooperate peacefully. But we can hardly accept that, because human judgment is weak and faulty, that there can be only one judge of these matters—precisely because that judge might turn out to be very faulty indeed. Our concern will be how we can effectively divide power between government and people, while still ensuring that important questions of moral and political judgment are peacefully adjudicated. We will be concerned with the standards and institutions that provide for compromise between many different and conflicting judgments. And all the time, we will remember Hobbes’s reminder that human life is never without inconvenience and troubles, that we must live with a certain amount of bad, to prevent the worst: fear of violence, and violent death.
- Edwards, Alistair (2002) “Hobbes” in Interpreting Modern Political Philosophy: From Machiavelli to Marx, eds. A Edwards and J Townshend (Palgrave Macmillan, Houndmills)
- A very helpful overview of key interpretative debates about Hobbes in the twentieth century.
- Hill, Christopher (1961/1980) The Century of Revolution, 1603-1714, second ed (Routledge, London)
- The classic work on the history and repercussions of England’s civil war.
- Hobbes, Thomas (1998 ) On the Citizen, ed & trans Richard Tuck and Michael Silverthorne (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
- The best translation of Hobbes’s most straightforward book,De Cive.
- Hobbes, Thomas (1994 [1651/1668]) Leviathan, ed Edwin Curley (Hackett, Indianapolis)
- The best edition of Hobbes’s magnum opus, including extensive additional material and many important variations (ignored by all other editions) between the English text and later Latin edition.
- Sorrell, Tom (1986) Hobbes (Routledge & Kegan Paul, London)
- A concise and well-judged account of Hobbes’s life and works.
- Sorrell, Tom, ed (1996) The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
- An excellent set of essays on all aspects of Hobbes’s intellectual endeavors.