The idea that a collective could be bearer of intentional states such as belief and intention is likely to raise some eyebrows, especially in certain Anglo-American and European philosophical circles. The dominant picture in these circles is that intentionality is a feature of individual minds/brains. On the face of it, groups don’t have minds or brains. How could they have intentional states?
Despite the initial skepticism, there is a growing number of philosophers turning their attention to the issue of collective intentionality. The focus of these recent discussions has been primarily on the notions of collective intention and belief. Philosophers of action theory have been interested in collective intentions because of their interest in understanding collective or group agency. Individual intentions shape and inform individual actions. My intention guides my daily activities, structures my desires in a variety of ways, and facilitates coordination with both my future self and others around me. But we do not always act alone and it is coordination with others that raises interesting issues regarding the possibility of collective intentions. Many philosophers believe that individual intentions alone will not explain collective action and that joint action requires joint (sometimes called shared or collective in the literature) intentions. An exception to this trend is Seamus Miller who has argued that collective or joint action can be understood in terms of collective ends that are not intentions. Because his positive account of joint action does not appeal to collective intentionality, his work will not be highlighted in this article.
Interest in the notion of collective belief has been motivated, in part, by concerns over how to understand our collective belief ascriptions and the role they play in social scientific theory and everyday contexts. We often attribute beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes to groups like corporations. What do these ascriptions mean? Are they to be taken literally?
Table of Contents
- Summative Accounts
- Non-Summative Accounts
- Internal Debates: Belief vs. Acceptance
- The Role of Collective Intentionality
- References and Further Reading
A common response to the questions that arise concerning our practice of ascribing intentional states to groups is to say that these ascriptions are mere fictions. When we say, “The Federal Reserve believes that interest rates ought to remain low,” this does not mean that the Federal Reserve literally has a belief. Rather, we are speaking metaphorically. According to this account, our ascriptions of intentional states to groups, though useful, are, strictly speaking, false.
Although this account has common-sense appeal, it has not been appealing to philosophers working in this area for a variety of reasons. First, our practice of attributing responsibility to organizations (consider, for instance, current tobacco lawsuits) seems to presuppose that organizations literally have intentional states. For we could not hold them legally and morally responsible for an action unless they intended to commit the act. Since we do not hold organizations metaphorically responsible (much to the dismay of tobacco companies), the attributions on which our ascriptions of responsibility rest should be, at least initially, considered non-metaphorical.
Further, our ascriptions of intentional states to groups have a surprising explanatory power. They allow us to predict and explain the actions of groups. Although false ascriptions could be explanatorily powerful (just as false theories are sometimes explanatorily powerful), explanatory power is prima facie evidence that our ascriptions are not simply false. We might also note that if the instrumentalist about collective intentionality is correct, then we, the media, social scientists, lawyers, political scientists, etc. are continually disseminating falsehoods. This seems to be an odd result and again, prima facie, evidence that our ascriptions are not mere metaphors.
It should be noted that rejection of the metaphorical approach to our collective intentional state ascriptions does not necessarily commit one to the view that when we are ascribing intentional states to groups those ascriptions are true in virtue of the fact that there is a collective or group mind that is the bearer of these states. In rejecting the metaphorical approach one need not also reject an individualistic approach. As we shall see there are alternative accounts that hold that these ascriptions are true, not in virtue of there being a group mind, but in virtue of the fact that the individuals within the group have certain intentional states. Summative accounts are of this kind.
Summative accounts of collective attitude ascription argue that these ascriptions are a short-hand way of referring to the fact that most members have the attitude (and the content) ascribed to the group. This is the view espoused by Anthony Quinton in ‘Social Objects’ (1975). These accounts have been labeled summative by Margaret Gilbert (1989) because they try to analyze group attitude ascriptions in terms of the sum of individual attitudes with the same content as that ascribed to the group.
There are a variety of summative accounts on offer. For the purposes of this article I will focus on two types, simple summative account (SSA) and the complex summative account (CSA), identified by Margaret Gilbert in her (1987) article “Modelling Collective Belief.” According to the simple summative account:
Group G believes that p if and only if all or most of the members believe that p.
A simple summative account of group intention would substitute ‘intends’ in the formulation above. Gilbert (1987, 1989, 1994) has argued persuasively that this analysis is insufficient. Consider a case in which every member of the philosophy department believes that eating meat is immoral, but the members do not express this opinion because they are afraid of the response they will receive from their colleagues and students. In this context, it is unlikely that we would attribute to the philosophy department the belief that eating meat is immoral. It is possible, of course, to construct a context in which it would be appropriate to attribute such a belief to the philosophy department–perhaps, if the philosophy department were engaged in a discussion of animal rights. But in such a context the beliefs of the individuals would no longer be secret. Presumably, at least some of the members would express their opinions.
This example suggests that group belief depends on certain epistemic features of individuals. The complex summative account acknowledges these epistemic features by introducing the notion of common knowledge. CSA requires that members of the group recognize or know that most of the members in the group believe that p. Thus, CSA is committed to the conceptual truth of the following:
A group G believes that p if and only if (1) most of the members of G believe that p, and (2) it is common knowledge in G that (1).
Gilbert (1989, 1994) has argued that the CSA is too weak. Consider the following example: A company has formed two committees and coincidently the committees have the same exact membership. One committee has been formed in order to develop an office dress code. Call this committee the Dress Code committee. The other committee has been formed to assess the recently installed phone system. Call this committee the Phone committee. Now imagine that (a) every member of the Dress Code committee personally believes that spandex pants are inappropriate apparel for the office and this is common knowledge within the Dress Code committee, and (b) the same goes mutatis mutandis for each member of the Phone committee. It seems compatible with (a) and (b) that (c) the Dress Code committee believes spandex is inappropriate, and (d) the Phone committee does not believe that spandex is appropriate office apparel. Yet the conditions of the CSA have been met for both. Gilbert provides a similar example in (1996, 199). The addition of common knowledge, according to Gilbert, does not provide sufficient conditions for group belief. Although Angelo Corlett (1996) has criticized examples of this sort and has provided a defense of a simple summative account, most theorists agree with Gilbert that the account is insufficient.
In addition to being too weak, many including Gilbert believe that both the CSA and SSA are too strong. On summative accounts it is conceptually necessary for most of the members of G to believe that p in order for G to believe that p. This seems too strong. Indeed, there seem to be contexts in which no group member has the attitude ascribed to the group. Imagine a group of politicians who do not personally believe that partial birth abortion should be outlawed, but because of the pressure exerted by their constituents they vote to ban partial birth abortion. Ascriptions of belief to the group of politicians would probably be made on the basis of this vote and, thus, we would ascribe the belief that partial birth abortion should be banned to the group of politicians even though no individual politician personally believes this proposition.
Group intentions, too, are not easily understood in terms of the summation of individual intentions to perform some action. Consider this example given by John Searle (1990, 403). Imagine a group of people sitting on the grass enjoying a sunny afternoon. Suddenly it grows dark and starts to rain. They all get up and run for shelter. In this scenario each individual has the intention “I am running to shelter” and these intentions are had independently of one another. Now imagine a situation in which their running to the shelter is part of a performance. Suppose they are a group of actors and this is part of a scene in a play. Thus, at one point in the play they perform the same actions done by the individuals in the above scenario. According to Searle, the performance by the actors involves a collective intention in the form “we intend to do x.” This collective intention is different from the individual intentions had by the individual actors and it is not captured by summing up individual intentions in the form “I intend to x.”
The reason why collective intentions cannot be reduced to individual intentions, argues Searle, is that no set of I-intentions even supplemented with mutual beliefs will add up to a we-intend. Collective intentions involve a sense of acting and willing something together. Individual intentions involved in this enterprise are derived from collective intentions and the individual intentions that are derived from the collective intention will often have a different content from that of the collective intention. Michael Bratman (1999,111) also stresses the inadequacy of summative accounts of group intentions. Consider a case in which you have an intention to paint the house and I have an intention to paint the same house and this is common knowledge between us. The set of intentional states is not enough to guarantee that our actions are coordinated in any manner so that we are painting the house together. Indeed, the complex summative account does not rule out the possibility of our painting the same house at the same time but independent of one another (avoiding the other by chance). The set of individual intentional states identified by the complex summative accounts is not going to play any role in coordinating our behavior so that painting the house is something we do together. Intentions, either collective or individual, do, by their nature, play a role in planning and coordination. (Bratman, 1999, 1987) So, according to this line of reasoning, summative accounts, even of the complex kind, cannot be an adequate account of the nature of collective intention.
In “Collective Intentions and Actions” (1990) and in The Construction of Social Reality (1995) John Searle defends an account of collective intentionality that is non-summative, but remains individualistic. Searle specifies that anything we say about collective intention must meet the following conditions of adequacy:
- It must be consistent with the fact that society is nothing over and above the individuals that comprise it. All consciousness and intentionality is in the minds of individuals. Specifically, individual brains.
- It must be consistent with the fact that all intentionality could be had by a brain in a vat.
Searle’s first criterion of adequacy denies that groups themselves can be intentional agents and advocates a form of individualism. The second criterion is motivated by atomism. According to this condition, all intentionality, individual or collective, is independent of what the real world is like, since a radical mistake is possible. These two conditions entail that collective intentions exist in individual brains. Thus Searle’s position allows for the possibility of a single person having the collective intention “we intend to do x.”
…I could have all the intentionality I do have even if I am radically mistaken, even if the apparent presence and cooperation of other people is an illusion, even if I am suffering a total hallucination, even if I am a brain in a vat. (1990, 117)
How is it possible for an individual to have an intention of the form “We intend to J”? Searle contends that this capacity is biologically primitive. Indeed, he suggests that it is shared by a variety of other species. This capacity presupposes other Background capacities (the Background is a technical term for Searle referring to conditions necessary for certain cognitive activities and language). In particular, it presupposes a Background sense of the other as a candidate for cooperative agency (1990, 414).
Collective intentionality plays a large role in Searle’s overall account of social reality. In The Construction of Social Reality (1995) collective intentionality is that which confers a function on artifacts and changes them into social facts. Pieces of paper function as money because we intend them to do so. Just as individual intentionality has the ability to change the world via speech acts, collective intentionality has, according to Searle, the ability to create social facts.
Searle’s account of collective intention has been criticized for a variety of reasons. First, Tollefsen (2002d) notes that it rests on the controversial assumption that externalist theories of content individuation are false. According to standard externalist reasoning, if a brain in a vat is not in the proper water environment (either in causal contact with water or able to theorize about water) then it cannot have beliefs or intentions about water. The content of a belief is determined by external rather than merely internal aspects. If this is correct then a brain in a vat could not have we-intentions. Further, there are some who argue that one could not even have a concept of another agent if he or she is not part of a social practice of interpretation (Davidson, for instance, 1992). If these views are correct it would be difficult to say how a brain in a vat could have a we-concept at all. One cannot simply assume that these theories are false without a lengthy discussion and refutation. To the extent that Searle’s account rests on a controversial thesis in the philosophy of mind and language it is problematic.
Others (Meijers 2001, Gilbert 1998) have argued that Searle’s account fails to capture the normative relations that are an integral part of collective intentions. When we form a collective intention, we create obligations and expectations among us. The football players in Searle’s example above are obligated to perform certain actions given that they have formed a collective intention to execute a pass play. As Gilbert notes (1989, 1994) if one of the players fails to do his or her part the other players have a right to rebuke their teammate. This rebuke is evidence of the normativity involved in joint action. When we form a collective intention we make commitments and incur obligations. Searle’s account, because it essentially allows for solipsistic we-intentions, fails to acknowledge the normativity involved in collective intentionality. For Gilbert and Meijers, the normativity of collective intentionality is essential to the phenomenon.
Searle himself acknowledges that it is because of the special nature of collective intentions that we are able to distinguish between the two cases of individuals running for cover in the example above. There is something about collective intentions that coordinates individual, independent actions into a joint action. But isolated, perhaps even solipsistic, we-intentions do not, in themselves, seem to be enough to direct and coordinate the individual intentional actions of which the joint action is comprised. Suppose, for instance, that none of the actors knew of the other actor’s we-intention. It would seem to be a complete accident that they acted together. Indeed, it would seem as fortuitous as a group of individuals that just happen to get up at the same time and run for cover.
The problems with Searle’s account point to the fact that whatever individual intentional states underlie collective intentions, they should be interrelated in a significant way. Michael Bratman provides an account of collective intention in terms of the intentions of the individual participants and their interrelations. His analysis provides a rational reconstruction of what it is for two people to intend to do something together. We should note that Bratman uses the term “shared intention” rather than collective intention.
We need to be careful with this phrase as there are several senses in which one can “share” an intention. You and I, for instance, can both intend to wash the dishes and thus we share, in some sense, the intention to wash the dishes. But these intentions are consistent with our washing the dishes independently of one another. Here is another way to distinguish between the weak and the strong sense of sharing. You and I each have a quarter in our pockets. In this case, one might say that we share “quarter possession.” This is the weak sense of sharing. This sense of sharing is to be distinguished from a case in which we share a quarter between us. The weak sense of sharing does not aid us in understanding how people can perform actions together. With this caution in mind, I will use collective intention and shared intention interchangeably to refer to the type of intention that is thought to be crucial for understanding collective actions. The weak sense of shared intention noted above is not a candidate.
Bratman begins his discussion of collective intention by identifying the role that collective or shared intentions play. First, shared intentions help to coordinate our intentional actions. For instance, our shared intention of washing the dishes will guide each of our intentional actions towards satisfying the goal of washing the dishes. Thus, someone will wash the dishes before rinsing them and someone will rinse them before drying them. Second, our shared intention will coordinate our actions by making sure that our own personal plans of action meld together. If I plan to do the washing, then I will check with your plan and see if there is any conflict. Third, shared intentions act as a backdrop against which bargaining and negotiation occur. Conflicts about who does the washing and who does the drying will be resolved by considering the fact that we share the intention to do the dishes. Thus, shared intention unifies and coordinates individual intentional actions by tracking the goals accepted by each individual.
Consider a case in which you and I intend to wash the dishes together. If this intention is a shared intention then it is not a matter of you having an intention to wash the dishes and me having an intention to wash the dishes. Nor is it a matter of each of us having an atomistically conceived we-intention to wash the dishes. Such coincident intentions do not insure that each of us knows of the other’s intention and that we are committed to the joint action of washing the dishes together. Further, an explicit promise made to each other does not seem to insure that we share an intention either. Because I might be lying to you and have no intention of washing the dishes with you. Thus, explicit promises are not sufficient for shared intention. Nor are they necessary for shared intention. Bratman provides an example from Hume to highlight this. “Consider Hume’s example of two people in a row boat who row together ‘tho they have never given promises to each other.’ Such rowers may well have a shared intention to row the boat together”(Bratman, 1993, 98-99).
What do shared intentions consist in according to Bratman? Bratman shares Searle’s commitment to individualism in that he does not think that shared intentions are the intentions of a plural agent, nor are they to be understood solely in terms of individual intentional states. Shared intentions, according to Bratman, are to be identified with the state of affairs consisting of a set of interrelated individual intentional states. What set of individual attitudes are interrelated in appropriate ways such that the complex consisting of such attitudes would, if functioning properly, do the jobs of shared intention?
Here is a somewhat simplified version of Bratman’s answer to this question. We intend to wash the dishes if and only if:
- a. I intend that we wash the dishes.
b. You intend that we wash the dishes.
- I intend that we wash the dishes in accordance with and because of 1a and 1b; you intend likewise.
- 1 and 2 are common knowledge between us.
It should be noted that the focus in this article is on Bratman’s account of the shared intention that underlies joint intentional action. In “Shared Cooperative activity” (1999) Bratman provides an account of the shared intention that underlies more cooperative ventures and it involves conditions 1-3 and some additional conditions that rule out coercion.
As a first approximation, this complex of intentional attitudes above seems plausible. But consider a case in which we each intend to wash the dishes together and we each do so in part because of the other’s intention. However, I intend to wash the dishes with Palmolive and you intend to wash them with Joy. All of this is common knowledge and we will not compromise. Is there a collective intention present? It seems not. In this case we do not have our subplans coordinated in the appropriate way. Recall that one of the jobs that shared intention has is to coordinate our individual plans and goals. In the example above our individual subplans are in conflict and this would prevent us from achieving our goal of getting the dishes washed.
Bratman avoids this counterexample by adding a clause about participants’ subplans. It is not necessary that our subplans match, but they must mesh. So, if my subplan is to wash the dishes with Palmolive, and your subplan is to wash them with hot water, and I have no preference about the water temperature, then our subplans mesh though they don’t match exactly. But if we have subplans to wash the dishes with completely different types of dish detergent then our subplans do not mesh. Bratman reformulates the account in the following way:
We intend to J if and only if:
- (a) I intend that we J and (b) you intend that we J
- I intend that we J in accordance with and because of 1a and 1b, and meshing subplans of 1a and 1b; you intend the same.
- 1 and 2 are common knowledge
This account of collective intentions rejects the atomism of Searle’s account. Because a shared intention is the complex of attitudes of individuals and their interrelations, an individual cannot have a shared intention. As we have seen, on Searle’s account one can have a shared intention, even if one is a brain in a vat. On Bratman’s view the intentions of individuals are interrelated and reflexive in a way that makes solipsistic we-intentions impossible.
Bratman’s account of collective or shared intentions has been criticized in a variety of ways. Both Searle and Bratman attempt to avoid the specter of the collective mind. Searle places we-intentions in the mind of individuals. Bratman avoids positing a plural agent by trying to explain collective intentions in terms of individual attitudes with common contents that are distinctively social in the sense that solitary individuals could not have them. But how is it possible for me to have an intention with the form “we-intend” or with the form “I intend that we do J”? There seem to be certain features of intention itself that would rule out both Searle’s and Bratman’s ways of understanding the notion of joint intention. This line of argument has been developed, in slightly different ways, in recent papers by Annette Baier (1997), Frederick Stoutland (1997), and J. David Velleman (1997). Normally, when I intend to do something, the action I intend to do is under my control. And in normal cases of shared intention (cases where there is no coercion or where I am not in control of your actions), the other agent is seen as being in control of his or her own actions. Further, when I intend to do something, this intention settles, in some sense, what I will do. In Bratman’s terms, I have set a plan or course of action for myself. But how, then, can I intend that we do something? There is something in this scenario that is out of my control. My intention that we J cannot settle what we will do, because you have an equally important role in settling what will be done. Thus, I cannot intend that we J.
Stoutland (1997) puts the problem a bit differently by emphasizing that Bratman’s attempt to identify a set of individual intentions with common contents is impossible. Because intention makes an implicit reference to the subject that fulfills the intention, there are no intentions with common content. “Art can intend to go to a film and Mary can intend to do the same; but their intentions do not have common content, since Art’s intention is his going to the film and Mary’s is her going to the film.” (1997, 56). Likewise, it would seem impossible for me to have a Searlian we-intention. Because intention makes an implicit reference to the subject that is responsible for fulfilling the intention and I am not a we, I cannot have a we-intention. In cases of joint action I am not the subject that is responsible for fulfilling the intention. In order to be responsible I would have to have the actions of others under my direct control. But I do not. Therefore, I cannot have a we-intention.
In “I intend that we J” (1999) Bratman alters his account of shared intention in an attempt to meet this challenge. Basically, Bratman introduces the technical notion of intending that. This is supposed to be like ordinary intention except that it does not require that the individual with the intention also be the individual who fulfills the intention. I can intend that my children go to college, for instance. On this understanding of intention it seems possible for an individual to have the intention that we X. This way of avoiding the objection has seemed to some to be problematic. First, to intend that my children go to college is simply to intend to do something that brings it about that my children go to college. And these actions (whatever they might be) are under my direct control. This is not so in the case of my intending that we X. Further, Bratman seems to have changed the subject. Intentions are normally intentions to do something. It is intentions to act that explain behavior at the individual level. If collective actions presuppose intention in the way that individual agency does, then it would seem to be the same sort of intention to that is presupposed. But according to Stoutland and others, Bratman doesn’t give us an account of these intentions.
Like Searle, Bratman has been accused of ignoring the normativity of collective intentions. For Gilbert and Meijers, there is a normativity involved in collective intentionality that suggests that collective intentions and other intentional states are essentially commitments of a sort. Consider Gilbert’s (1989) example of walking together. We form an intention to walk together and begin our journey. Halfway through the walk you veer off to the left and start walking away from me. If we intended to walk together, this behavior is not only odd but justifiably subject to rebuke. The behavior will be considered to be a violation of some sort of commitment that we made. There seems to be a sense in which you ought not to have done this and I have the right to rebuke you. “Hey” I can say, “we are walking together. Where are you going?” I can take offense at your behavior and, according to Gilbert, my offense is justified and its justification derives from the normative commitments that are inherent in the collective intention.
Bratman’s account of collective or shared intentionality does not involve a normative element. For him, cognitive attitudes and their interrelations are enough to explain collective intentionality. Although he admits that certain shared activities will involve obligations, he stresses that it is possible to have a shared intention that does not involve promises or obligations. That is, there is nothing essentially normative about collective intentionality. He does, however, make a further distinction between weak and strong shared intentions, in which the latter involves binding agreement. This normativity inherent in a binding agreement, however, is explained in terms of additional moral principles like Scanlon’s (1998) “principle of fidelity.”
Margaret Gilbert’s account of collective intentions and other intentional states like belief aims, in part, to explain the nature of this normative phenomenon without having to postulate additional normative principles. Her account of collective intentionality is also part of a larger project to provide a conceptual analysis of certain group concepts. In On Social Facts (1989), in addition to providing an analysis of the concept of a group belief and intention, she also provides an account of the concept of a social group and the concept of social convention. In doing so, she claims to be uncovering the “core” of such concepts and legitimizing the use of these “everyday” concepts within the social sciences.
Gilbert’s account of collective intentionality is closely linked to her account of the concept of a social group. Briefly, our everyday concept of a social group is, according to Gilbert, the concept of a plural subject of belief or action. A plural subject is an entity, or as Gilbert puts it, “a special kind of thing, a ‘synthesis sui generis‘”(1996, 268) formed when individuals bond or unite in a particular way. This “special kind of thing” can be the subject to which intentional action and psychological attributes are attributed. We can formulate the conceptually necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of plural subjects in the following way:
Individuals A1…..An….form a plural subject of X-ing (for some action X or psychological attribute X) if and only if A1An form a joint commitment to X-ing as a body.
It will be helpful to begin by considering what is involved in a joint commitment to act as a body or as a single individual. We will then consider the plural subject framework as it applies to psychological states like belief.
A joint commitment to act as a body is a commitment made by a collection of individuals to perform some present or future action as would a single individual. Joint commitments are formed when each of a number of people expresses his or her willingness to participate in the relevant joint commitment with the others. Each person understands that only when all of the relevant people have agreed to participate in the joint commitment will the joint commitment be formed. Once every one has agreed, a pool of wills is formed and individuals are then jointly committed. Once the joint commitment is established, each individual is individually obligated to do his or her part to make it the case that he or she acts as a body.
Consider a case in which Joe’s construction company agrees to build a house for Mrs. Wilbur. The members of the company do not each individually agree to build Mrs. Wilbur a house. This would lead to the proliferation of Wilbur abodes. They each individually agree, however, to make it the case that the house is built by the construction company and express their willingness to do so on the condition that every other member do the same. This expression of willingness need not be simultaneous. The members may express their willingness over time. Nor do they need to express their willingness verbally. In many cases, silence is an adequate expression of intention. They must, however, in order for the joint commitment to come into existence, communicate in some way and at some point in time their intention to do their part in building the house as a body with others.
Because joint commitments are joint, they cannot simply be reduced to an aggregate of individual commitments. A joint commitment gives rise to certain obligations and entitlements. Members of the group have a right to expect that other members will follow through on their commitments. Sam and Tammy are entitled to expect that Joe will do his part to make it the case that the construction company builds a house for Mrs. Wilbur. If Joe is doing something to frustrate the building process, Sam and Tammy are justified in rebuking him.
A joint commitment can only be rescinded if every member party to the joint commitment agrees to rescind it. The existence of the joint commitments in the face of an individual rescinding his or her individual commitment explains why the members of the construction company have a right to rebuke Joe when he is not doing his part. If Joe says, “I’ve had enough of this mindless labor,” and walks off the site, the joint commitment remains in full force because there has been no agreement among the members to rescind the joint commitment. This does not mean, of course, that the individual commitment Joe makes cannot be broken. It does mean, however, that if he breaks his individual commitment, even for a good reason, this does not nullify the joint commitment and its associated obligations.
According to Gilbert, the obligations which arise from a joint commitment are of a special kind and they differ from other forms of obligations in the following ways: First, although each individual in the group must be “willing” to be jointly committed, this notion of willingness does not, according to Gilbert, rule out coercion. A person can be coerced into being part of a joint commitment and yet it still remains a commitment to which a person is obligated. Gilbert wants to show that joint commitments arise in various environments and under various circumstances. Often joint commitments are coerced because the person who is doing the coercion needs the commitment of others in order to carry through with their actions.
A second aspect that distinguishes the obligations of a joint commitment from other types of obligation is the interdependence of the commitments makes it the case that no one member can rescind a joint commitment. For example, Al’s commitment to travel with Doris cannot be dissolved by Al changing his mind. This feature was already noted above.
Third, in becoming party to a joint commitment a person has a reason to act. It is a reason that remains whether or not his or her beliefs or external circumstances change. Joe is obligated to every other member of Joe’s construction company to act in accordance with the joint commitment to building a house. This commitment acts as a reason and, if reasons are causes, joint commitments can often explain why individuals act in particular circumstances. It is a reason that remains and will bind him to acting appropriately until the group as a whole decides to release one another from this obligation.
Finally, the people party to a joint commitment are aware of the obligations they have to one another. They could not be held responsible for violation of such obligations unless they were aware of these obligations. The fact that every other member has committed herself to the joint commitment is common knowledge, and there is also common knowledge of the obligations, expectations, and entitlements that arise from such commitments.
Having discussed the notion of forming a joint commitment to act as a body, we are now in a position to apply the plural subject schema to belief:
Individuals A1…An… form a plural subject of believing that p if and only if A1…An form a joint commitment to believe that p as a body.
Recall that joint commitments are commitments of groups, not individuals. They arise, in the case of joint action, when each individual expresses his willingness to do his part provided that every other individual commits to doing her part to bring it about that they perform some action as a body. Gilbert simply extends this analysis of joint action to group belief. Individuals express their willingness to do their part to make the case that they believe as a body. These commitments and expectations are common knowledge. This set of reciprocal intentions and commitments sets up the pool of wills and certain obligations and entitlements then come into play. But what is required in doing one’s part to make it the case that they believe that p as a body?
Gilbert makes it clear that members do not have to themselves believe that p. This allows her to avoid the pitfalls of the summative accounts. They also do not have to act as if they personally believe that p. Doing one’s part in the context of a joint belief, then, seems to involve at least not saying anything contrary to the group belief while speaking as a member of the group or acting contrary to the group belief while acting in one’s capacity as a group member. One who participates in a joint commitment to believe that p thereby accepts an obligation to do what he can to bring it about that any joint endeavors among the members of the group be conducted on the assumption that p is true. He is entitled to expect others’ support in bringing this about. Further, if one does believe something that is inconsistent with p, one is required at least not to express that belief baldly. The committee members would have a right to rebuke one of their own if, in acting as a member of the committee, he or she expressed views that were contrary to the group view without prefacing his or her remarks with “I personally believe that…”
According to Gilbert, then, when individuals form a plural subject of belief, (i.e., when they become party to a joint commitment to believe that p as a body), there is group belief that p. Note that she provides necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of a plural subject of belief. But Gilbert recognizes in later work (1994) that there may be cases in which we want to say that a group has a belief, yet they do not meet the existence conditions for a plural subject of belief. This recognition leads her to say that what she is giving is an analysis of the core notion of group belief and that other cases of group belief will be extensions of this core notion. Thus, we end up with the following statement of the conceptually sufficient conditions for group belief:
There is a group belief that p if some persons constitute the plural subject of a belief that p. Such persons collectively believe that p.
Unique to Gilbert’s account is the assertion that under certain circumstances individuals form a plural subject and this subject is the legitimate subject of intentional state ascriptions. Recall that Bratman and Searle deny that there is a collective entity that is the appropriate subject of intentional state ascription. Her account, then, is less individualistic than Searle’s and Bratman’s.
Gilbert’s account of collective intentionality has been criticized on the following grounds. First, Tollefsen (2002) has argued that Gilbert’s analysis is circular. This can be seen if we consider what it means to commit to doing one’s part to make it the case that the group believe as a body or act as a body. Gilbert claims that the notion of a group of individuals acting together to constitute a body is primitive and it guides the actions and thoughts of individuals in the group. It is this notion that tells them what their part is and what they are committed to doing. It is from this concept, for instance, that one knows that she must not say p, without prefacing her remarks appropriately, when she is acting as member of a group that believes not p. To do so would be to disrupt the unity within the group and break their semblance of being “one body.”
But this notion seems to be just the notion of a plural subject. For a collection of individuals to believe as a body or act as a body is for them to act or believe as a subject, a subject constituted by a plurality of individuals. Indeed Gilbert says as much in the following passage:
I do, of course, posit a mechanism for the construction of social groups (plural subjects of belief or action). And this mechanism can only work if everyone involved has a grasp of a subtle conceptual scheme, the conceptual scheme of plural subjects. Given that all have this concept, then the basic means for bringing plural subject-hood into being is at their disposal. All that anyone has to do is to openly manifest his willingness to be part of a plural subject of some particular attribute (1989, 416)
Plural subjects are formed when each of a set of individual agents expresses willingness to constitute, with the others, the plural subject of a goal, belief, principle of action, or other such thing, in conditions of common knowledge. The conceptually necessary conditions for plural subjecthood, then, contain the notion of plural subjecthood. As a conceptual analysis of our core notion of group belief -the belief of a plural subject-Gilbert’s analysis seems circular.
Gilbert (in correspondence) has responded to this charge by arguing that for her the concept of a plural subject is a technical notion. It is not, as Tollefsen suggests, simply the notion of a subject comprised of individuals but of a subject formed on the basis of joint commitments. So her analysis of plural subjecthood does not contain the technical notion of a plural subject and her analysis is not circular. The passage above, however, suggests that, at the very least, the formation of plural subjects presupposes that the participants have an understanding of the technical concept of plural subjecthood and an understanding of joint commitments. Since both notions are very technical, it seems psychologically implausible that everyday folk have even an implicit understanding of these concepts.
Tuomela (1992) charges Gilbert with circularity, as well. Gilbert argues that joint commitments are to be analyzed in terms of individuals expressing their willingness to be jointly committed with others. But this analysis leave the concept of joint commitment unanalyzed. Gilbert does, however, say a great deal more about the notion of joint commitment than this suggests. In particular, her most recent work (2003) provides a more detailed explanation of joint commitment. Expressions of willingness come in as conditions for the formation of a joint commitment, not part of an analysis of the notion of joint commitment. If Gilbert’s analysis of joint commitment does not appeal to the notion of a joint commitment then it seems she has avoided Tuomela’s objection.
Tuomela (1998) has also argued that Gilbert’s account is somewhat limited. Her account of group intentionality is an account of what we mean when we say “We believe that p,” where “we” is a small, unstructured group like a reading club, poetry discussion group, and committees with no formal decision method. She claims that she is giving an analysis of our core meaning of group belief. But the paradigm case of attribution of intentional states to groups seems to be those in which the subject is an organization like a corporation. This is particularly true when one reflects on our practice of praising and blaming the actions of corporations, states, governments, etc. Yet it is unclear how Gilbert’s account extends to organizations. It seems obvious that not every member of the organization (take, for instance, IBM) would have to openly express their willingness to do his or her part in bringing it about that IBM believes that profits are lower this year than last as a body in order for it to be true that IBM believe that. Does the person on the assembly line have to express his willingness to be jointly committed in the way described? It seems that not even an implicit expression of willingness (a failure to speak up) would make sense of this. To the extent that Gilbert’s account does not seem to extend to a range of other types of groups to which the intentional idiom extends, Tuomela argues that it remains inadequate.
There may be ways, however, of extending Gilbert’s analysis to account for the beliefs of large organizations. Gilbert suggests that one might explain corporate beliefs, for instance, by claiming that the core notion of group belief applies to the board of directors and there is a convention in place that makes the board’s beliefs the beliefs of the corporation. Gilbert has used the plural subject framework to provide an account of convention (1989).
Raimo Tuomela (1992, 1995) develops an account of collective belief, he calls the positional account of group beliefs. This account relies on the notions of rule-based social positions and tasks that are defined by the rules in force in a collective and emphasizes the role of positional beliefs. “Positional beliefs are views that a position-holder has qua a position-holder or has internalized and accepted as a basis of his performances of aforementioned kinds of social tasks” (1995, 312). Strictly speaking, positional beliefs are not beliefs at all but acceptances. His account of collective belief attempts to encompass not only the beliefs of small, organized, groups but organizations as well. Tuomela also provides an analysis of shared we-beliefs (called non-normative or merely factual group beliefs). Shared we-beliefs are not, according to Tuomela, proper group (collective) beliefs. Collective belief does not require that any particular member actually believe that p. Whereas in the case of a we-belief each member believes that p and it is common knowledge that each member believes that p. In this respect shared we-beliefs are, according to Tuomela, those characterized by the summative accounts. They are able to capture certain social phenomena but cannot explain collective belief in cases like corporations or groups where individuals do not themselves believe the proposition in question. For our purposes we will be focusing on Tuomela’s account of group (collective) belief proper.
In Chapter Seven of The Importance of Us (1995) and Group Beliefs (1992) Synthese, 91: 285-318. Raimo Tuomela provides the following analysis of our concept of collective belief.
(BG) G believes that p in the social and normative circumstances C if and only if in C there are operative members A1……An in G with respective positions P1…….Pn such that
(1) The agents A1….Am when they are performing their social tasks in their positions P1….Pm and due to their exercising the relevant authority system in G, (intentionally) jointly accept p as the view of G, and because of this exercise of the authority system they ought to continue to accept or positionally believe that p.
(2) there is a mutual belief among the operative members to the effect that (1)
(3) because of (1) the full-fledged and adequately informed non-operative members of G tend to tacitly accept-or at least ought to accept–p as members of G.
(4) there is a mutual belief in G to the effect that (3)
This account relies heavily on a distinction between operative and non-operative members, acceptance and belief, and the notion of correct social and normative circumstances. I will consider each of these features in turn.
Operative members are those members who are responsible for the group belief having the content that it does. In the case of a corporation, the board of directors may be the operative members. Whereas those who work on the assembly line or in the credit department, for instance, are non-operative members. Which members are operative is determined by the rules and regulations of the corporation. Such rules and regulations are part of the social and normative circumstances referred to in Tuomela’s analysis.
The relevant social and normative circumstances involve tasks and social roles and rules, either formal (resembling laws or statutes) or informal (based on informal group agreements). So, for instance, corporations have certain rules that define the roles and tasks of its members. The rules are formal in some cases and are to be found in the corporate handbook or charter. These rules often specify which members are operative and define the relation between operative members and non-operative members. In addition, they make clear the chain of authority and decision-making procedures. “Indeed, in the case of typical formal collectives (like corporations), certain position-holders are required by the constitutive rules of the collective to set goals and accepts views for the collective” (1998, 308).
According to Tuomela’s analysis, then, one of the necessary conditions for our concept of group belief to apply is that operative members have certain intentional states. In this respect he shares something with Gilbert’s view and individualism in general. It is a further question whether Tuomela’s account can be viewed as intentionalistic and, if so, whether his analysis suffers from circularity. I consider this issue below. For now we can note that, for Tuomela, the intentional states of individuals must be embedded in the right social and normative circumstances. So group belief statements are not analyzed solely in terms of statements about individual intentional states on Tuomela’s view. Tuomela therefore breaks from strong analytical individualism.
Tuomela’s account also relies on the distinction between accepting a proposition and believing it. Tuomela stresses the difference between accepting and believing by noting that accepting is an action where certain beliefs are “non-actional” or experiential. Perceptual beliefs seem to be of this kind. The agent is in some way passive. He concludes based on this that at least experiential believing is different from accepting a proposition. As for non-perceptual beliefs, Tuomela goes on to argue that they are also different from accepting a proposition. Typically, when someone is said to believe that p, she does so if and only if she accepts p as true (given a certain disquotational account of truth). Tuomela points out, however, that this need not always be the case. Someone might accept a proposition but not believe it. “A person may, for instance, accept as true that he (or his body) is a probabilistically fluctuating bunch of hadrons and leptons without really believing it to be true in the experiential sense, let alone having that conviction. His acceptance would then be “cognitive” acceptance in the sense that he would be willing to operate on the assumption in question, to concretely act on it and to use it as a premise in his reasoning, and so on.” (1995, 309)
As we have seen, traditional summative accounts that require all or some of the members believe that p were too strong. Tuomela attempts to avoid this problem by requiring that operative members accept that p. No member actually has to believe that p. The operative members have, in Tuomela’s view, positional beliefs. Positional beliefs are views a position-holder has accepted as a basis for his performance of certain kinds of social tasks. These positional beliefs are different from personal beliefs. For instance, the board of directors might personally believe that it is wrong for the company to fire 10,000 employees yet a director accepts this proposition and acts on it given the fact that he holds a position of authority in the company. Positional views, then, need not be truth-related. We may accept false beliefs and therefore adopt positional views that we know to be false.
Tollefsen (2002) has argued that Tuomela’s account suffers from the same problem of circularity from which Gilbert’s account suffers. Consider condition (1) of Tuomela’s analysis.
(1) The agents A1….Am when they are performing their social tasks in their positions P1….Pm, and due to their exercising the relevant authority system in G, (intentionally) jointly accept p as the view of G, and because of this exercise of the authority system they ought to continue to accept or positionally believe that p.
The operative members must intentionally and jointly accept P as the view of the group, where joint acceptance simply means that each operative member accepts p as the view of the group and this is common knowledge. But what are we to make of the reference to “the view of the group”? On an ordinary understanding of what it is to have a view on some issue is to have an opinion or a belief. The “view” of the group, then, seems to be simply the belief of the group. If so, one of the necessary and sufficient conditions for group belief appears to make reference to the notion of a group belief. Tuomela’s analysis, then, is circular. There is a group belief that p if and only if operative members accept p as the group belief. But group belief (the view of the group rather than the view of its individual members) is the concept that the analysis is supposed to illuminate by providing necessary and sufficient conditions for its application. It is hard to see how to make sense of the view of the group without appealing to notions like the belief of the group, the goal of the group, what the group intends, and so on.
The circularity issues raised by Gilbert’s and Tuomela’s account might be avoided if we simply give up the methodology of conceptual analysis. Indeed, Tuomela insists that he is not engaged in conceptual analysis but is providing truth conditions for our ascriptions. Thus, although his account is circular, it is not viciously so. We can view these accounts, then, as offering us a sort of identity theory of collective intentionality. Indeed, this is how Bratman viewed his account of collective (shared) intention. Group belief and intention plays a certain role. What these theorists have done is identify a complex of interrelated intentional states of individuals that plays that role. One could, then, conclude that collective belief and/or intention is that complex of attitudes.
The problem with this approach is that one might wonder whether there might not be other ways in which these roles could be realized. Might there not be other combinations of individual attitudes and public acts and conditions, combinations that even in our world would function together in the ways that realize the roles of shared intention? The problem is analogous to type identity theories in the philosophy of mind. If mental states are multiply realized by different sorts of physical states, then type identity is false. Analogously, if collective intentional states are multiply realizable then identifying them with the complex of individual states is also problematic. Collective intentional states could plausibly be realized by a variety of different configurations of individual intentional states. Indeed, Tuomela’s voluminous work on group intentionality supports this. He provides different accounts of group intentional states depending on the particular group in question (e.g. normative vs. normative group belief). And we have also seen that Gilbert acknowledges that the conditions she identifies for group intentional states are sufficient but not necessary. This leaves open the possibility that group beliefs and other attitudes could be realized by other sets of individual intentional states. At the most, then, these accounts provide us with accounts of ways in which group attitudes can be realized but they do not provide us with an account of what group attitudes are.
We are left with the same question that plagues token-token identity theories in the philosophy of mind. The token identity thesis states that for every token instance of a mental state, there will be some token neuro-physiological event with which that token instance is identical. But what is it about these token mental states that makes them all tokens of the same type? If Sue and Eric both believe that Columbus is the capital of Ohio, then what is it that they have in common that makes their different neurophysiological states the same belief?
We can formulate the same question with respect to group intentional states. If GM and the Federal Reserve are both ascribed the belief that interest rates should be cut, what do these two groups have in common that makes it appropriate to ascribe to them the same belief? Tuomela would point to the fact that they both meet the conditions he specifies for proper group belief. But what if the members of GM meet the conditions of normative group belief and the members of the Federal Reserve Board meet the conditions for non-normative group belief? Do they share the same belief? And we are left with the further question of what is it about these particular configurations of intentional states that makes it appropriate to call them beliefs or intentions at all? Why is collective intentionality a species of intentionality? The work of Pettit (2002), Tollefsen (2002c), and Velleman (1997) attempt to fill this lacuna by showing that certain groups count as intentional agents given standard accounts of intentionality. Rather than analyze the concept of collective intentions or beliefs, these theorists have attempted to show that our everyday concept of belief and intention extends naturally to certain groups. Gilbert (2002), also, has recently attempted to flesh out the strong analogy between individual beliefs and group beliefs.
Among those who acknowledge that collectives can be the subject of intentional state ascription, there is a debate raging over which type of intentional states are appropriately attributable to collectives. There are some, like Margaret Gilbert and Tollefsen who argue that it is appropriate to attribute to groups a wide range of intentional states including beliefs. Others, like K. Brad Wray (2002), Raimo Tuomela (2000), and Anthonie Meijers (1999), have argued that, although groups may accept a proposition, they cannot believe. The nature of belief, according to these philosophers, is such that groups cannot be believers. The latter camp has been labeled by Gilbert as the rejectionists because they reject the possibility of group belief. For ease, I refer to the former camp as the believers.
In “Collective Belief and Acceptance” (2002), Wray identifies four differences between acceptance and belief.
- You can accept things that you do not believe but you cannot believe what you do not accept. (Rejection of the entailment thesis)
- “Acceptance often results from a consideration of one’s goals, and thus results from adopting a policy to pursue a particular goal.” (2002, p. 7).
- Belief is a disposition to feel that something is true.
- Belief is involuntary, whereas acceptance is voluntary.
Wray then proceeds to show that the examples that Gilbert gives of group belief (1989), (1994), are actually instances of acceptance. Because group attitudes are formed against the background of goals, because they are formed voluntarily, and because their formation does not entail that members believe the content of the attitude, group views are more aptly described as instances of acceptance. Both Wray (2000) and Meijers (1999) develop an acceptance-based account of collective attitudes.
There have been various attempts to respond to this line of argument. Much rests on the merits of the original distinction between acceptance and belief and on exploring the analogy between groups and individuals. Tollefsen (2003b), for instance, argues that the issue of voluntarism concerning belief is not as clear cut as rejectionists make it out to be. The assertion that we cannot will to believe is an empirical assertion and not a conceptual assertion about the nature of belief. Perhaps, then, individuals cannot will to believe because of our epistemic limits, but this does not rule out the possibility that collective agents can will to believe. Gilbert (2002) has argued that rejectionists beg the question with respect to collective belief. They assume that collective belief must have all the features of individual belief in order for it to be genuine belief but this just privileges individual belief without argument. It may be that collective belief, although a species of belief, is unique in certain respects.
We have already seen that some theorists focus on the role of collective intentions in organizing and coordinating collective action. And in Searle’s account of social reality, collective intentions confer status functions on artifacts and turn them into social facts. Money is money because we accept it and intend it to be. Others have explored the role that collective intentionality, either collective intentions or beliefs, plays in jurisprudence, economics, and politics, and moral theory. Gilbert (2001), for instance, argues that her account of collective intentionality provides a better account of social rules than H.L.A. Harts. Social rules are to be understood as the joint commitments of a society. This explains why we are justified in rebuking those who violate social rules. Maria Cristina Redondo (2001) argues that Searle’s account of social facts, an account grounding in collective intentionality, supports a version of legal positivism. Ota Weinberger (2001) develops the relationship between discussions of collective intentionality and the notion of the “general will” or the “will of the people.” Weinberger argues that the “general will” should be understood in terms of institutional processes that are collectively accepted within the community.
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