Along with Confucianism, “Daoism” (sometimes called “Taoism“) is one of the two great indigenous philosophical traditions of China. As an English term, Daoism corresponds to both Daojia (“Dao family” or “school of the Dao”), an early Han dynasty (c. 100s B.C.E.) term which describes so-called “philosophical” texts and thinkers such as Laozi and Zhuangzi, and Daojiao (“teaching of the Dao”), which describes various so-called “religious” movements dating from the late Han dynasty (c. 100s C.E.) onward. Thus, “Daoism” encompasses thought and practice that sometimes are viewed as “philosophical,” as “religious,” or as a combination of both. While modern scholars, especially those in the West, have been preoccupied with classifying Daoist material as either “philosophical” or “religious,” historically Daoists themselves have been uninterested in such categories and dichotomies. Instead, they have preferred to focus on understanding the nature of reality, increasing their longevity, ordering life morally, practicing rulership, and regulating consciousness and diet. Fundamental Daoist ideas and concerns include wuwei (“effortless action”), ziran (“naturalness”), how to become a shengren (“sage”) or zhenren (“perfected person”), and the ineffable, mysterious Dao (“Way”) itself.
Table of Contents
- What is Daoism?
- Classical Sources for Our Understanding of Daoism
- Is Daoism a Philosophy or a Religion?
- The Daodejing
- Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
- The Zhuangzi
- Basic Concepts in the Zhuangzi
- Daoism and Confucianism
- Daoism in the Han
- Celestial Masters Daoism
- Shangqing and Lingbao Daoist Movements
- Tang Daoism
- The Three Teachings
- The “Destruction” of Daoism
- References and Further Reading
Strictly speaking there was no Daoism before the literati of the Han dynasty (c. 200 B.C.E.) tried to organize the writings and ideas that represented the major intellectual alternatives available. The name daojia, “Dao family” or “school of the dao” was a creation of the historian Sima Tan (d. 110 B.C.E.) in his Shi ji (Records of the Historian) written in the 2nd century B.C.E. and later completed by his son, Sima Qian (145-86 B.C.E.). In Sima Qian’s classification, the Daoists are listed as one of the Six Schools: Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalist, School of Names, and Daoists. So, Daoism was a retroactive grouping of ideas and writings which were already at least one to two centuries old, and which may or may not have been ancestral to various post-classical religious movements, all self-identified as daojiao (“teaching of the dao“), beginning with the reception of revelations from the deified Laozi by the Celestial Masters (Tianshi) lineage founder, Zhang Daoling, in 142 C.E.This article privileges the formative influence of early texts, such as the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, but accepts contemporary Daoists’ assertion of continuity between classical and post-classical, “philosophical” and “religious” movements and texts.
Daoism does not name a tradition constituted by a founding thinker, even though the common belief is that a teacher named Laozi originated the school and wrote its major work, called the Daodejing, also sometimes known as the Laozi. The tradition is also called “Lao-Zhuang” philosophy, referring to what are commonly regarded as its two classical and most influential texts: the Daodejing or Laozi (3rd Cn. B.C.E.) and the Zhuangzi (4th-3rd Cn. B.C.E.). However, various streams of thought and practice were passed along by masters (daoshi) before these texts were finalized. There are two major source issues to be considered when forming a position on the origins of Daoism. 1) What evidence is there for beliefs and practices later associated with the kind of Daoism recognized by Sima Qian prior to the formation of the two classical texts? 2) What is the best reconstruction of the classical textual tradition upon which later Daoism was based?
With regard to the first question, Isabelle Robinet thinks that the classical texts are only the most lasting evidence of a movement she associates with a set of writings and practices associated with the Songs of Chu (Chuci), and that she identifies as the Chuci movement. This movement reflects a culture in which male and female masters variously called fangshi, daoshi, zhenren, or daoren practiced techniques of longevity and used diet and meditative stillness anto create a way of life that attracted disciples and resulted in wisdom teachings. While Robinet’s interpretation is controversial, there are undeniable connections between the Songs of Chu and later Daoist ideas. Some examples include a coincidence of names of immortals (sages), a commitment to the pursuit of physical immortality, a belief in the epistemic value of stillness and quietude, abstinence from grains, breathing and sexual practices used to regulate internal energy (qi), and the use of ritual dances that resemble those still done by Daoist masters (the step of Yu).
In addition to the controversial connection to the Songs of Chu, the Guanzi (350-250 B.C.E.) is a text older than both the Daodejing and probably all of the Zhuangzi, except the “inner chapters” (see below). The Guanzi is a very important work of 76 “chapters.” Three of the chapters of the Guanzi are called the Neiye, a title which can mean “inner cultivation.” The self-cultivation practices and teachings put forward in this material may be fruitfully linked to several other important works: the Daodejing; the Zhuangzi; a Han dynasty Daoist work called the Huainanzi; and an early commentary on the Daodejing called the Xiang’er. Indeed, there is a strong meditative trend in the Daoism of late imperial China known as the “inner alchemy” tradition and the views of the Neiye seem to be in the background of this movement. Two other chapters of the Guanzi are called Xin shu (Heart-mind book). The Xin shu connects the ideas of quietude and stillness found in both the Daodejing and Zhuangzi to longevity practices. The idea of dao in these chapters is very much like that of the classical works. Its image of the sage resembles that of the Zhuangzi. It uses the same term (zheng) that Zhuangzi uses for the corrections a sage must make in his body, the pacification of the heart-mind, and the concentration and control of internal energy (qi). These practices are called “holding onto the One,” “keeping the One,” “obtaining the One,” all of which are phrases also associated with the Daodejing (chs. 10, 22, 39).
The Songs of Chu and Guanzi still represent texts which are themselves creations of actual practitioners of Daoist teachings and sentiments, just as do the Daodejing and Zhuangzi. Who these persons were we do not know with certainty. It is possible that we do have the names, remarks, and practices of some of these individuals (daoshi) embodied in the passages of the Zhuangzi. For example, in Chs. 1-7 alone, Xu You, Ch.1; Lianshu, Ch.1; Ziqi Ch. 2; Wang Ni, Ch. 2; Changwuzi, Ch. 2; Qu Boyu, Ch. 4; Carpenter Shi, Ch. 4; Bohun Wuren, Ch. 5; Nu Y, Ch. 6; Sizi, Yuzi, Lizi, Laizi, Ch. 6; Zi Sanghu, Meng Zifan, Zi Qinzan, Ch. 6; Yuzi and Sangzi, Ch. 6; Wang Ni and Putizi, Ch. 7; Jie Yu, Ch. 7; Lao Dan, Ch. 7; Huzi, Ch. 7).
As for a reasonable reconstruction of the textual tradition upon which Daoism is based, we should not try to think of this task so simply as determining the relationship between the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, such as which text was first and which came later. These texts are composite. The Zhuangzi, for example, repeats in very similar form sayings and ideas found in the Daodejing, especially in the essay composing Zhuangzi Chs. 8-10. However, we are not certain whether this means that whomever was the source of this material in the Zhuangzi knew the Daodejing and quoted it, or if they both drew from a common source, or even if the Daodejing in some way depended on the Zhuangzi. In fact, one theory about the legendary figure Laozi is that he was created first in the Zhuangzi and later became associated with the Daodejing. There are seventeen passages in which Laozi (a.k.a. Lao Dan) plays a role in the Zhuangzi and he is not mentioned by name in the Daodejing.
Based on what we know now, we could offer the following summary of the sources of early Daoism. Stage One: Zhuang Zhou’s “inner chapters” (chs. 1-7) of the Zhuangzi (c. 350 B.C.E.) and some components of the Guanzi, including perhaps both the Neiye and the Xin shu. Stage Two: The essay in Chs. 8-10 of the Zhuangzi and some collections of material which represent versions of our final redaction of the Daodejing, as well as Chs. 17-28 of the Zhuangzi representing materials likely gathered by Zhuang Zhou’s disciples. Stage Three: the “Yellow Emperor” (Huang-Lao) manuscripts from Mawangdui and of the Zhuangzi (Chs. 11-19, and 22), and the text known as the Huainanzi (c. 139 B.C.E.).
In the late 1970s Western and comparative philosophers began to point out that an important dimension of the historical context of Daoism was being overlooked because the previous generation of scholars had ignored or even disparaged connections between the classical texts and Daoist religious belief and practice not previously thought to have developed until the 2nd century C.E. We have to lay some of the responsibility for a prejudice against Daoism as a religion and the privileging of its earliest forms as a pure philosophy at the feet of the eminent translators and philosophers Wing-Tsit Chan and James Legge, who both spoke of Daoist religion as a degeneration of a pristine Daoist philosophy arising from the time of the Celestial Masters (see below) in the late Han period. Chan and Legge were instrumental architects in the West of the view that Daoist philosophy (daojia) and Daoist religion (daojiao) are entirely different traditions.
Actually, our interest in trying to separate philosophy and religion in Daoism is more revealing of the Western frame of reference we use than of Daoism itself. Daoist ideas fermented among master teachers who had a holistic view of life. These daoshi (Daoist masters) did not compartmentalize practices by which they sought to influence the forces of reality, increase their longevity, have interaction with realities not apparent to our normal way of seeing things, and order life morally and by rulership. They offered insights we might call philosophical aphorisms. But they also practid meditative stillness and emptiness to gain knowledge, engaged in physical exercises to increase the flow of inner energy (qi), studied nature for diet and remedy to foster longevity, practiced rituals related to their view that reality had many layers and forms with whom/which humans could interact, wrote talismans and practiced divination, engaged in spellbinding of “ghosts,” led small communities, and advised rulers on all these subjects. The masters transmitted their teachings, some of them only to disciples and adepts, but gradually these teachings became more widely available as is evidenced in the very creation of the Daodejing and Zhuangzi themselves.
The anti-supernaturalist and anti-dualist agendas that provoked Westerners to separate philosophy and religion, dating at least to the classical Greek period of philosophy was not part of the preoccupation of Daoists. Accordingly, the question whether Daoism is a philosophy or a religion is not one we can ask without imposing a set of understandings, presuppositions, and qualifications that do not apply to Daoism. But the hybrid nature of Daoism is not a reason to discount the importance of Daoist thought. Quite to the contrary, it may be one of the most significant ideas classical Daoism can contribute to the study of philosophy in the present age.
The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) is divided into 81 “chapters” consisting of slightly over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. In its received form from Wang Bi (see below), the two major divisions of the text are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on little else than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). The text is a collection of short aphorisms that were not arranged to develop any systematic argument. The long standing tradition about the authorship of the text is that the “founder” of Daoism, known as Laozi gave it to Yin Xi, the guardian of the pass through the mountains that he used to go from China to the West (i.e., India) in some unknown date in the distant past. But the text is actually a composite of collected materials, most of which probably originally circulated orally perhaps even in single aphorisms or small collections. These were then redacted as someone might string pearls into a necklace. Although D.C. Lau and Michael LaFargue had made preliminary literary and redaction critical studies of the texts, these are still insufficient to generate any consensus about whether the text was composed using smaller written collections or who were the probable editors.
For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text as early as c. 300 B.C.E.
Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called “A” and “B.” These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching (1989). Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao).
The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 B.C.E. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the “inner chapters” (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than do the Mawangdui versions. A complete translation and study of the Guodian cache has been published by Scott Cook (2013).
The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as “the Way.” This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, “the dao”) and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not “the World” or “the cosmos” in a Western sense.
The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can express in language (ch.1). Those who experience oneness with dao, known as “obtaining dao,” will be enabled to wu-wei . Wu-wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as “nonaction” or “no action” is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of “doing nothing.” Wu-wei means something like “act naturally,” “effortless action,” or “nonwillful action.” The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu-wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be inhabited by numinal power (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family’s house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life’s occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven’s (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)
A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge and vice versa. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, “Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full.” While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, “straightforward words seem paradoxical,” implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).
What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), or the perfected person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu-wei, (chs. 2, 63). They act effortlessly and spontaneously as one with dao and in so doing, they “virtue” (de) without deliberation or volitional challenge. In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by culture and society (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of the discriminations used in conventional language and culture. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest naturalness and plainness, becoming like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires rooted in the discriminations that human society makes (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive to dao and its power (de) and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek to control their own lives (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to “solve” or “figure out” life’s apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin both themselves and the world (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage’s spirit becomes invincible (ch. 67).
Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in advising civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers in the DDJ seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence, never standing out (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler’s work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This picture of rulership in the DDJ is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 B.C.E.). However, it is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ’s admonitions to “fill the bellies and empty the minds” of the people to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture. When the DDJ says that rulers keep the people without knowledge, it probably means that they do not encourage human knowledge as the highest form of knowing but rather they encourage the people to “obtain oneness with the dao.”
The second of the two most important classical texts of Daoism is the Zhuangzi. This text is a collection of stories and remembered as well as imaginary conversations. The text is well known for its creativity and skillful use of language. Within the text we find longer and shorter treatises, stories, poetry, and aphorisms. The Zhuangzi may date as early as the 4th century B.C.E. and according to imperial bibliographies of a later date, the Zhuangzi originally had 52 “chapters.” These were reduced to 33 by Guo Xiang in the 3rd century C.E., although he seems to have had the 52 chapter text available to him. Ronnie Littlejohn has argued that the later work Liezi may contain some passages from the so-called “Lost Zhuangzi” 52 chapter version. Unlike the Daodejing which is ascribed to the mythological Laozi, the Zhuangzi may actually contain materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 B.C.E. Chapters 1-7 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi himself (which is a title meaning “Master Zhuang”) and these are known as the “inner chapters.” The remaining 26 chapters had other origins and they sometimes take different points of view from the Inner Chapters. Although there are several versions of how the remainder of the Zhuangzi may be divided, one that is gaining currency is Chs. 1-7 (Inner Chapters), Chs. 8-10 (the “Daode” essay), Chs. 11-16 and parts of 18, 19, and 22 (Yellow Emperor Chapters), and Chs. 17-28 (Zhuang Zhou’s Disciples’ material), with the remains of the text attributable to the final redactor.
Zhuangzi taught that a set of practices, including meditative stillness, helped one achieve unity with the dao and become a “perfected person” (zhenren). The way to this state is not the result of a withdrawal from life. However, it does require disengaging or emptying oneself of conventional values and the demarcations made by society. In Chapter 23 of the Zhuangzi, aNanrong Chu inquiring of the character Laozi about the solution to his life’s worries was answered promptly: “Why did you come with all this crowd of people?” The man looked around and confirmed he was standing alone, but Laozi meant that his problems were the result of all the baggage of ideas and conventional opinions he lugged about with him. This baggage must be discarded before anyone can be zhenren, move in wu-wei and express profound virtue (de).
Like the DDJ, Zhuangzi also valorizes wu-wei, especially in the Inner Chapters, the Yellow Emperor sections on rulership, and the Zhuangzi disciples’ materials in Ch. 19. For its examples of such living the Zhuangzi turns to analogies of craftsmen, athletes (swimmers), ferrymen, cicada-catching men, woodcarvers, and even butchers. One of the most famous stories in the text is that of Ding the Butcher, who learned what it means to wu wei through the perfection of his craft. When asked about his great skill, Ding says, “What I care about is dao, which goes beyond skill. When I first began cutting up oxen, all I could see was the ox itself. After three years I no longer saw the whole ox. And now—now I go at it by spirit and don’t look with my eyes. Perception and understanding have come to a stop and spirit moves where it wants. I go along with the natural makeup, strike in the big hollows, guide the knife through the big openings, and follow things as they are. So I never touch the smallest ligament or tendon, much less a main joint. A good cook changes his knife once a year—because he cuts. A mediocre cook changes his knife once a month—because he hacks. I’ve had this knife of mine for nineteen years and I’ve cut up thousands of oxen with it, and yet the blade is as good as though it had just come from the grindstone. There are spaces between the joints, and the blade of the knife has really no thickness….[I] move the knife with the greatest subtlety, until—flop! The whole thing comes apart like a clod of earth crumbling to the ground.” (Ch. 3, The Secret of Caring for Life) The recurring point of all of the stories in Zhuangzi about wu-wei is that such spontaneous and effortless conduct as displayed by these many examples has the same feel as acting in wu-wei. The point is not that wu-wei results from skill development. Wu-wei is not a cultivated skill. It is a gift of oneness with dao. The Zhuangzi’s teachings on wu-wei are closely related to the text’s consistent rejection of the use of reason and argument as means to dao (chs. 2; 12, 17, 19).
Persons who exemplify such understanding are called sages, zhenren, and immortals. Zhuangzi describes the Daoist sage in such a way as to suggest that such a person possesses extraordinary powers. Just as the DDJ said that creatures do not harm the sages, the Zhuangzi also has a passage teaching that the zhenren exhibits wondrous powers, frees people from illness and is able to make the harvest plentiful (ch.1). Zhenren are “spirit like” (shen yi), cannot be burned by fire, do not feel cold in the freezing forests, and life and death have no effect on them (ch. 2). Just how we should take such remarks is not without controversy. To be sure, many Daoist in history took them literally and an entire tradition of the transcendents or immortals (xian) was collected in text and lore.
Zhuangzi is drawing on a set of beliefs about master teachers that were probably regarded as literal by many, although some think he meant these to be taken metaphorically. For example, when Zhuangzi says that the sage cannot be harmed or made to suffer by anything that life presents, does he mean this to be taken as saying that the zhenren is physically invincible? Or, does he mean that the sage has so freed himself from all conventional understandings that he refuses to recognize poverty as any more or less desirable than affluence, to recognize blindness as worse than sight, to recognize death as any less desirable than life? As the Zhuangzi says in Chapter One, Free and Easy Wandering, “There is nothing that can harm this man.” This is also the theme of Chapter Two, On Making All Things Equal. In this chapter people are urged to “make all things one,” meaning that they should recognize that reality is one. It is a human judgment that what happens is beautiful or ugly, right or wrong, fortunate or not. The sage knows all things are one (equal) and does not judge. Our lives are snarled and jumbled so long as we make conventional discriminations, but when we set them aside, we appear to others as extraordinary and enchanted.
An important theme in the Zhuangzi is the use of immortals to illustrate various points. Did Zhuangzi believe some persons physically lived forever? Well, many Daoists did believe this. Did Zhuangzi believe that our substance was eternal and only our form changed? Almost certainly Zhuangzi thought that we were in a constant state of process, changing from one form into another (see the exchange between Master Lai and Master Li in Ch. 6, The Great and Venerable Teacher). In Daoism, immortality is the result of what may be described as a wu xing transformation. Wu xing means “five phases” and it refers to the Chinese understanding of reality according to which all things are in some state of combined correlation of qi as wood, fire, water, metal, and earth. This was not exclusively a “Daoist” physics. It underlay all Chinese “science” of the classical period, although Daoists certainly made use of it. Zhuangzi wants to teach us how to engage in transformation through stillness, breathing, and experience of numinal power (see ch. 6). And yet, perhaps Zhuangzi’s teachings on immortality mean that the person who is free of discrimination makes no difference between life and death. In the words of Lady Li in Ch. 2, “How do I know that the dead do not wonder why they ever longed for life?”
Huangdi (the Yellow Emperor) is the most prominent immortal mentioned in the text of the Zhuangzi and he is a main character in the sections of the book called “the Yellow Emperor Chapters” noted above. He has long been venerated in Chinese history as a cultural exemplar and the inventor of civilized human life. Daoism is filled with other accounts designed to show that those who learn to live according to the according to the dao have long lives. Pengzu, one of the characters in the Zhuangzi, is said to have lived eight hundred years. The most prominent female immortal is Xiwangmu (Queen Mother of the West), who was believed to reign over the sacred and mysterious Mount Kunlun.
The passages containing stories of the Yellow Emperor in Zhuangzi provide a window into the views of rulership in the text. On the one hand, the Inner Chapters (chs. 1-7) reject the role of ruler as a viable vocation for a zhenren and consistently criticize the futility of government and politics (ch. 7). On the other hand, the Yellow Emperor materials in Chs. 11-13 present rulership as valuable, so long as the ruler is acts by wu-wei. This second position is also that taken in the work entitled the Huainanzi (see below).
The Daoists did not think of immortality as a gift from a god, or an achievement in the religious sense commonly thought of in the West. It was a result of finding harmony with the dao, expressed through wisdom, meditation, and wu-wei. Persons who had such knowledge were reputed to live in the mountains, thus the character for xian (immortal) is made up of two components, the one being shan “mountain” and the other being ren “person.” Undoubtedly, some removal to the mountains was a part of the journey to becoming a zhenren “true person.” Because Daoists believed that nature and our own bodies were correlations of each other, they even imagined their bodies as mountains inhabited by immortals. The struggle to wu-wei was an effort to become immortal, to be born anew, to grow the embryo of immortality inside. A part of the disciplines of Daoism included imitation of the animals of nature, because they were thought to act without the intention and willfulness that characterized human decision making. Physical exercises included animal dances (wu qin xi) and movements designed to enable the unrestricted flow of the cosmic life force from which all things are made (qi). These movements designed to channel the flow of qi became associated with what came to be called tai qi or qi gong. Daoists practiced breathing exercises, used herbs and other pharmacological substances, and they employed an instruction booklet for sexual positions and intercourse, all designed to enhance the flow of qi energy. They even practiced external alchemy, using burners to modify the composition of cinnabar into mercury and made potions to drink and pills to ingest for the purpose of adding longevity. Many Daoist practitioners died as a result of these alchemical substances, and even a few Emperors who followed their instructions lost their lives as well, Qinshihuang being the most famous.
The attitude and practices necessary to the pursuit of immortality made this life all the more significant. Butcher Ding is a master butcher because his qi is in harmony with the dao. Daoist practices were meant for everyone, regardless of their origin, gender, social position, or wealth. However, Daoism was a complete philosophy of life and not an easy way to learn.
When superior persons learn the Dao, they practice it with zest.
When average persons learn of the Dao, they are indifferent.
When petty persons learn of the Dao, they laugh loudly.
If they did not laugh, it would not be worthy of being the Dao.DDJ, 41
Arguably, Daoism shared some emphases with classical Confucianism such as a this-worldly concern for the concrete details of life rather than speculation about abstractions and ideals. Nevertheless, it largely represented an alternative and critical tradition divergent from that of Confucius and his followers. While many of these criticisms are subtle, some seem very clear.
One of the most fundamental teachings of the DDJ is that human discriminations, such as those made in law, morality (good, bad) and aesthetics (beauty, ugly) actually create the troubles and problems humans experience, they do not solve them (ch. 3a). The clear implication is that the person following the dao must cease ordering his life according to human-made distinctions (ch. 19). Indeed, it is only when the dao recedes in its influence that these demarcations emerge (chs. 18; 38), because they are a form of disease (ch. 74). In contrast, Daoists believe that the dao is untangling the knots of life, blunting the sharp edges of relationships and problems, and turning down the light on painful occurrences (ch. 4). So, it is best to practice wu-wei in all endeavors, to act naturally and not willfully try to oppose or tamper with how reality is moving or try to control it by human discriminations.
Confucius and his followers wanted to change the world and be proactive in setting things straight. They wanted to tamper, orchestrate, plan, educate, develop, and propose solutions. Daoists, on the other hand, take their hands off of life when Confucians want their fingerprints on everything. Imagine this comparison. If the Daoist goal is to become like a piece of unhewn and natural wood, the goal of the Confucians is to become a carved sculpture. The Daoists put the piece before us just as it is found in its naturalness, and the Confucians polish it, shape it, and decorate it. This line of criticism is made very explicitly in the essay which makes up Zhuangzi Chs. 8-10.
Confucians think they can engineer reality, understand it, name it, control it. But the Daoists think that such endeavors are the source of our frustration and fragmentation (DDJ, chs. 57, 72). They believe the Confucians create a gulf between humans and nature that weakens and destroys us. Indeed, as far as the Daoists are concerned, the Confucian project is like a cancer that saps our very life. This is a fundamental difference in how these two great philosophical traditions think persons should approach life, and as shown above it is a consistent difference found also between the Zhuangzi and Confucianism.
The Yellow Emperor sections of the Zhuangzi in Chs. 12, 13 and 14 contain five text blocks in which Laozi is portrayed in dialogue with Confucius and according to which he is pictured as Confucius’ master and teacher. These materials provide a direct access into the Daoist criticism of the Confucian project.
The teachings that were later called Daoism were closely associated with a stream of thought called Huanglao Dao (Yellow Emperor-Laozi Dao) in the 3rd and 2nd cn. B.C.E. The thought world transmitted in this stream is what Sima Tan meant by Daojia. The Huanglao school is best understood as a lineage of Daoist practitioners mostly residing in the state of Qi (modern Shandong area). Huangdi was the name for the Yellow Emperor, from whom the rulers of Qi said they were descended. When Emperor Wu, the sixth sovereign of the Han dynasty (r. 140-87 B.C.E.) elevated Confucianism to the status of the official state ideology and training in it became mandatory for all bureaucratic officials, the tension with Daoism became more evident. And yet, at court, people still sought longevity and looked to Daoist masters for the secrets necessary for achieving it. Wu continued to engage in many Daoist practices, including the use of alchemy, climbing sacred Taishan (Mt. Tai), and presenting talismanic petitions to heaven. Liu An, the Prince of Huainan and a nephew of Wu, is associated with the production of the work called the Masters of Huainan (Huainanzi, 180-122 B.C.E.). This is a highly synthetic work formed at what is known as the Huainan academy and greatly influenced by Yellow Emperor Daoism. John Major and a team of translators published the first complete English version of this text (2010). The text was an attempt to merge cosmology, Confucian ideals, and a political theory using “quotes” attributed to the Yellow Emperor, although the statements actually parallel closely the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. All this is of added significance because in the later Han work, Laozi binahua jing (Book of the Transformations of Laozi) the Chinese physics that persons and objects change forms was employed in order to identify Laozi with the Yellow Emperor.
Even though Emperor Wu forced Daoist practitioners from court, Daoist teachings found a fertile ground in which to grow in the environment of discontent with the policies of the Han rulers and bureaucrats. Popular uprisings sprouted. The Yellow Turban movement tried to overthrow Han imperial authority in the name of the Yellow Emperor and promised to establish the Way of Great Peace (Tai ping). Indeed, the basic moral and philosophical text that provided the intellectual justification of this movement was the Classic of Great Peace (Taiping jing), provided in an English version by Barbara Hendrischke. The present version of this work in the Daoist canon is a later and altered iteration of the original text dating about 166 CE and attributed to transnormal revelations experienced by Zhang Jiao.
Easily the most important of the Daoist trends at the end of the Han period was the wudou mi dao (Way of Five Bushels of Rice) movement, best known as the Way of the Celestial Masters (tianshi dao). This movement is traceable to a Daoist hermit named Zhang ling, also known as Zhang Daoling, who resided on a mountain near modern Chengdu in Sichuan. According to an account in Ge Hong’s Biographies of Spirit Immortals, Laozi appeared to Zhang (c. 142 CE) and gave him a commission to announce the soon end of the world and the coming age of Great Peace (taiping). The revelation said that those who followed Zhang would become part of the Orthodox One Covenant with the Powers of the Universe (Zhengyi meng wei). Zhang began the movement that culminated in a Celestial Master state. The administrators of this state were called libationers (ji jiu), because they performed religious rites, as well as political duties. They taught that personal illness and civil mishap were owing to the mismanagement of the forces of the body and nature. The libationers taught a strict form of morality and displayed registers of numinal powers they could access and control. Libationers were moral investigators, standing in for a greater celestial bureaucracy. The Celestial Master state developed against the background of the decline of the later Han dynasty. Indeed, when the empire finally decayed, the Celestial Master government was the only order in much of southern China.
When the Wei dynastic rulers became uncomfortable with the Celestial Masters’ power, they broke up the power centers of the movement. But this backfired because it actually served to disperse Celestial Masters followers throughout China. Many of the refugees settled near X’ian in and around the site of Louguan tai. The movement remained strong because its leaders had assembled a canon of texts [Statutory Texts of the One and Orthodox (Zhengyi fawen)]. This group of writings included philosophical, political, and ritual texts. It became a fundamental part of the later authorized Daoist canon.
The resurgence of Daoism after the Han dynasty is often known as Neo-Daoism. As a result, Confucian scholars sought to annotate and reinterpret their own classical texts to move them toward greater compatibility with Daoism, and they even wrote commentaries on Daoist works. A new type of Confucianism known simply as the Way of Mysterious Learning (Xuanxue) emerged. It is represented by a set of scholars, including some of the most prominent thinkers of the period: Wang Bi (226-249), He Yan (d. 249), Xiang Xiu (223?-300), Guo Xiang (d. 312) and Pei Wei (267-300). In general, these scholars share in common an effort to reinterpret the social and moral understanding of Confucianism in ways to make it more compatible with Daoist philosophy. In fact, for many interpreters, the extent to which Daoist influence is evident in the texts of these writers has led some scholars to call this movement ‘Neo-Daoism.’ Wang Bi and Guo Xiang who wrote commentaries respectively on the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi, were the most important voices in this development. Traditionally, the famous “Seven Sages of the Bamboo Grove” (Zhulin qixian) have also been associated with the new Daoist way of life that expressed itself in culture and not merely in mountain retreats. These thinkers included landscape painters, calligraphers, poets, and musicians.
Among the philosophers of this period, the great representative of Daoism in southern China was Ge Hong (283-343 CE). He practiced not only philosophical reflection, but also external alchemy, manipulating mineral substances such as mercury and cinnabar in an effort to gain immortality. His work the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of this period. For him, longevity and immortality are not the same, the former is only the first step to the latter.
After the invasion of China by nomads from Central Asia, Daoists of the Celestial Master tradition who had been living in the north were forced to migrate into southern China, where Ge Hong’s version of Daoism was strong. The mixture of these two traditions is represented in the writings of the Xu family. The Xu family was an aristocratic group from what is today the city of Nanjing. Seeking Daoist philosophical wisdom and the long life it promised, many of them moved to Mao Shan Mountain, near the city. There they claimed to receive revelations from immortals, who dictated new wisdom and morality texts to them. Yang Xi was the most prominent medium recipient of the Maoshan revelations (360-370 CE). These revelations came from spirits who were local heroes named the Mao brothers, but they had been transformed into deities. Yang Xi’s writings formed the basis for Highest Purity (Shangqing) Daoism. The writings were extraordinarily well done and even the calligraphy in which they were written was beautiful.
The importance of these texts philosophically speaking is to be found in their idealization of the quest for immortality and transference of the material practices of the alchemical science of Ge Hong into a form of reflective meditation. In fact, the Shangqing school of Daoism is the beginning of the tradition known as “inner alchemy” (neidan), an individual mystical pursuit of wisdom.
Some thirty years after the Maoshan revelations, a descendent of Ge Hong, named Ge Chaofu went into a mediumistic trance and authored a set of texts called the Numinous Treasure (Lingbao) teachings. These works were ritual recitation texts similar to Buddhist sutras, and indeed they borrowed heavily from Buddhism. At first, the Shangqing and Lingbao texts belonged to the general stream of the Celestial Masters and were not considered separate sects or movements within Daoism, although later lineages of masters emphasized the uniqueness of their teachings.
As the Lingbao texts illustrate, Daoism acted as a receiving structure for Buddhism. Many early translators of Buddhist texts used Daoist terms to render Indian ideas. Some Buddhists saw Laozi as an avatar of Shakyamuni (the Buddha), and some Daoists understood Shakyamuni as a manifestation of the dao, which also means he was a manifestation of Laozi. An often made generalization is that Buddhism held north China in the 4th and 5th centuries, and Daoism the south. But gradually this intellectual currency actually reversed. Daoism grew in scope and impact throughout China.
By the time of the Tang dynasty (618-906 CE) Daoism was the intellectual philosophy that underwrote the national understanding. The imperial family claimed to descend from Li (by lore, the family of Laozi). Laozi was venerated by royal decree. Officials received Daoist initiation as Masters of its philosophy, rituals, and practices. A major center for Daoist studies was created at Dragon and Tiger Mountain (longhu shan), chosen both for its feng shui and because of its strategic location at the intersection of numerous southern China trade routes. The Celestial Masters who held leadership at Dragon and Tiger Mountain were later called “Daoist popes” by Christian missionaries because they had considerable political power.
In aesthetics, two great Daoist intellectuals worked during the Tang. Wu Daozi developed the rules for Daoist painting and Li Bai became its most famous poet. Interestingly, Daoist alchemists invented gunpowder during the Tang. The earliest block-print book on a scientific subject is a Daoist work entitled Xuanjie lu (850 CE). As Buddhism gradually grew stronger during the Tang, Daoist and Confucian intellectuals sought to initiate a conversation with it. The Buddhism that resulted was a reformed version known as Chan (Zen in Japan).
During the Five Dynasties (907-960 CE) and Song periods (960-1279 CE) Confucianism enjoyed a resurgence and Daoists found their place by teaching that principal thinkers of their tradition were Confucian scholars as well. Most notable among these was Lu Dongbin, a legendary Daoist immortal that many believed was originally a Confucian teacher.
Daoism became a complete philosophy of life, reaching into religion, social action, and individual health and physical well-being. A huge network of Daoist temples known by the name Dongyue Miao (also called tianqing guan) was created through the empire, with a miao in virtually every town of any size. The Daoist masters who served these temples were often appointed as government officials. They also gave medical, moral, and philosophical advice, and led religious rituals, dedicated especially to the Lord of the Sacred Mountain of the East named Taishan. Daoist masters had wide authority. All this was obvious in the temple iconography. Taishan was represented as the emperor, the City God (cheng huang) was a high official, and the Earth God was portrayed as a prosperous peasant. Daoism of this period integrated the Three Teachings (sanjiao) of China: Confucianism, Buddhism, and Daoism. This process of synthesis continued throughout the Song and into the period of the Ming Dynasty.
Such a wide dispersal of Daoist thought and practice, taken together with its interest in merging Confucianism and Buddhism, eventually created a fragmented ideology. Into this confusion came Wang Zhe (1113-1170 CE), the founder of Quanzhen (Complete Perfection) Daoism. It was Wang’s goal to bring the three teachings into a single great synthesis. For the first time, Daoist teachers adopted monastic forms of life, created monasteries, and organized themselves in ways they saw in Buddhism. This version of Daoist thought interpreted the classical texts of the DDJ and the Zhuangzi to call for a rejection of the body and material world. The Quanzhen order became powerful as the main partner of the Mongols (Yuan dynasty), who gave their patronage to its expansion. Less frequently, the Mongol emperors favored the Celestial Masters and their leader at Dragon and Tiger Mountain in an effort to undermine the power of the Quanzhen leaders. For example, the Zhengyi (Celestial Master) master of Beijing in the 1220s was Zhang Liusun. Under patronage he was allowed to build a Dongyue Miao in the city in 1223 and make it the unofficial town hall of the capital. But by the time of Khubilai Khan (r. 1260-1294) the Buddhists were used against all Daoists. The Khan ordered all Daoist books except the DDJ to be destroyed in 1281, and he closed the Quanzhen monastery in the city known as White Cloud Monastery (Baiyun Guan).
When the Ming (1368-1644) dynasty emerged, the Mongols were expulsed, and Chinese rule was restored. The emperors sponsored the creation of the first complete Daoist Canon (Daozang), which was edited between 1408 and 1445. This was an eclectic collection, including many Buddhist and Confucian related texts. Daoist influence reached its zenith.
The Manchurian tribes that became rulers of China in 1644 and founded the Qing dynasty were already under the influence of conservative Confucian exiles. They stripped the Celestial Master of Dragon Tiger Mountain of his power at court. Only Quanzhen was tolerated. White Cloud Monastery (Baiyun Guan)) was reopened, and a new lineage of thinkers was organized. They called themselves the Dragon Gate lineage (Longmen pai). In the 1780s, the Western traders arrived, and so did Christian missionaries. In 1849, the Hakka people of Guangxi province, among China’s poorest citizens, rose in revolt. They followed Hong Xiuquan, who claimed to be Jesus’ younger brother. This millennial movement built on a strange version of Chinese Christianity sought to establish the Heavenly Kingdom of Peace (taiping). As the Taiping swept throughout southern China, they destroyed Buddhist and Daoist temples and texts wherever they found them. The Taiping army completely raised the Daoist complexes on Dragon Tiger Mountain. During most of the 20th century the drive to eradicate Daoist influence has continued. In the 1920s, the “New Life” movement drafted students to go out on Sundays to destroy Daoist statues and texts. Accordingly, by the year 1926 only two copies of the Daoist Canon (Daozang) existed and Daoist philosophical heritage was in great jeopardy. But permission was granted to copy the canon kept at the White Cloud Monastery, and so the texts were preserved for the world. There are 1120 titles in this collection in 5,305 volumes. Much of this material has yet to receive scholarly attention and very little of it has been translated into any Western language.
The Cultural Revolution (1966-1976) attempted to complete the destruction of Daoism. Masters were killed or “re-educated.” Entire lineages were broken up and their texts were destroyed. The miaos were closed, burned, and turned into military barracks. At one time, there were 300 Daoist sites in Beijing alone, now there are only a handful. However, Daoism is not dead. It survives as a vibrant philosophical system and way of life as is evidenced by the revival of its practice and study in several new University institutes in the People’s Republic.
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