Epictetus (55–135 C.E.)

epictetusEpictetus (pronounced Epic-TEE-tus) was an exponent of Stoicism who flourished in the early second century C.E. about four hundred years after the Stoic school of Zeno of Citium was established in Athens. He lived and worked, first as a student in Rome, and then as a teacher with his own school in Nicopolis in Greece. Our knowledge of his philosophy and his method as a teacher comes to us via two works composed by his student Arrian, the Discourses and the Handbook. Although Epictetus based his teaching on the works of the early Stoics (none of which survives) which dealt with the three branches of Stoic thought, logic, physics and ethics, the Discourses and the Handbook concentrate almost exclusively on ethics. The role of the Stoic teacher was to encourage his students to live the philosophic life, whose end was eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or ‘flourishing’), to be secured by living the life of reason, which – for Stoics – meant living virtuously and living ‘according to nature’. The eudaimonia (‘happiness’) of those who attain this ideal consists of ataraxia (imperturbability), apatheia (freedom from passion), eupatheiai (‘good feelings’), and an awareness of, and capacity to attain, what counts as living as a rational being should. The key to transforming oneself into the Stoic sophos (wise person) is to learn what is ‘in one’s power’, and this is ‘the correct use of impressions’ (phantasiai), which in outline involves not judging as good or bad anything that appears to one. For the only thing that is good is acting virtuously (that is, motivated by virtue), and the only thing that is bad is the opposite, acting viciously (that is, motivated by vice). Someone who seeks to make progress as a Stoic (a prokoptôn) understands that their power of rationality is a fragment of God whose material body – a sort of rarefied fiery air – blends with the whole of creation, intelligently forming and directing undifferentiated matter to make the world as we experience it. The task of the prokoptôn, therefore, is to ‘live according to nature’, which means (a) pursuing a course through life intelligently responding to one’s own needs and duties as a sociable human being, but also (b) wholly accepting one’s fate and the fate of the world as coming directly from the divine intelligence which makes the world the best that is possible.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Discourses
    2. The Handbook
  3. Epictetus’ Stoicism
  4. Key Concepts
    1. The Promise of Philosophy
    2. What is Really Good
    3. What is in our Power
    4. Making Proper Use of Impressions
    5. The Three Topoi
      1. The Discipline of Desire
      2. The Discipline of Action
      3. The Discipline of Assent
    6. God
    7. On Living in Accord with Nature
    8. Metaphors for Life
    9. Making Progress
  5. Glossary of Terms
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Translations of Epictetus
    2. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics
    3. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically
    4. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally
    5. Other Items on Hellenistic Philosophy Generally

1. Life

It is possible to draw only a basic sketch of Epictetus’ life. Resources at our disposal include just a handful of references in the ancient texts, to which we can add the few allusions that Epictetus makes to his own life in the Discourses.

Epictetus was born in about 55 C.E. in Hierapolis in Phrygia (modern-day Pamukkale, in south-western Turkey). As a boy he somehow came to Rome as a slave of Epaphroditus who was a rich and powerful freedman, having himself been a slave of the Emperor Nero (he had been an administrative secretary). Whilst still a slave, Epictetus studied with the Stoic teacher Musonius Rufus.

There is a story told by the author Celsus (probably a younger contemporary of Epictetus) – quoted by the early Christian Origen (c.185–254) at Contra Celsum 7.53 – that when still a slave, Epictetus was tortured by his master who twisted his leg. Enduring the pain with complete composure, Epictetus warned Epaphroditus that his leg would break, and when it did break, he said, ‘There, did I not tell you that it would break?’ And from that time Epictetus was lame. The Suda (tenth century), however, although confirming that Epictetus was lame, attributes his affliction to rheumatism.

At some point Epictetus was manumitted, and in about 89, along with other philosophers then in Rome, was banished by the Emperor Domitian. He went to Nicopolis in Epirus (in north-western Greece) where he opened his own school which acquired a good reputation, attracting many upper-class Romans. One such student was Flavius Arrian (c.86–160) who would compose the Discourses and the Handbook, and who later served in public office under the Emperor Hadrian and made his mark as a respected historian (much of his writings survive). Origen (Contra Celsum 6.2) reports that Epictetus had been more popular in his day than had Plato in his. Aulus Gellius (c.125–c.165) reports that one of Marcus Aurelius’ teachers, Herodes Atticus (c.101–177), considered Epictetus to be ‘the greatest of Stoics’ (Attic Nights 1.2.6).

Our sources report that Epictetus did not marry, had no children, and lived to an old age. With respect to marriage and children we may note the story from Lucian (Demonax 55) about the Cynic philosopher Demonax who had been a pupil of Epictetus. On hearing Epictetus exhort his students to marry and have children (for it was a philosopher’s duty to provide a substitute ready for the time when they would die), he sarcastically asked Epictetus whether he could marry one of his daughters.

2. Writings

It appears that Epictetus wrote nothing himself. The works we have that present his philosophy were written by his student, Flavius Arrian. We may conjecture that the Discourses and the Handbook were written some time around the years 104–107, at the time when Arrian (born c.86) was most likely to have been a student.

Dobbin (1998), though, holds the view that the Discourses and the Handbook were actually written by Epictetus himself; the Suda does say, after all, that Epictetus ‘wrote a great deal’. Dobbin is not entirely convinced by Arrian’s claim in his dedicatory preface that he wrote down Epictetus’ words verbatim; firstly, stenographic techniques at this time were primitive, and anyway were the preserve of civil servants; secondly, most of the discourses are too polished, and look too much like carefully crafted prose to be the product of impromptu discussions; and thirdly, some of the discourses (notably 1.29, 3.22 and 4.1) are too long for extempore conversations.

There is no way to resolve this question with certainty. Whether the texts we have do indeed represent a serious attempt to record Epictetus at work verbatim, whether draft texts were later edited and rewritten (as seems wholly likely), possibly by Epictetus, or whether Epictetus did in fact write the texts himself, drawing on his recollections as a lecturer with only occasional attempts at strictly verbatim accuracy, we shall never know. But what we can be certain of, regardless of who actually wrote the words onto the papyrus to make the first draft of the text as we have it today, is that those words were intended to present Stoic moral philosophy in the terms and the style that Epictetus employed as a teacher intent on bringing his students to philosophic enlightenment as the Stoics had understood this enterprise.

a. Discourses

Written in Koine Greek, the everyday contemporary form of the language, Epictetus’ Discourses appear to record the exchanges between Epictetus and his students after formal teaching had concluded for the day. Internal textual evidence confirms that the works of the early Stoic philosophers (Zeno, Cleanthes and Chrysippus) were read and discussed in Epictetus’ classes, but this aspect of Epictetus’ teaching is not recorded by Arrian. What we have, then, are intimate, though earnest, discussions in which Epictetus aims to make his students consider carefully what the philosophic life – for a Stoic – consists in, and how to live it oneself. He discusses a wide range of topics, from friendship to illness, from fear to poverty, on how to acquire and maintain tranquillity, and why we should not be angry with other people.

Not all of the Discourses appear to have survived, as the ancient Byzantine scholar Photius (c.810–c.893) reports that the complete text originally comprised eight books, whereas all we have today are four books. Because the text, chapter by chapter, jumps to different topics and shows no orderly development, it is not readily apparent that anything is missing, and indeed, the reference to eight books may be mistaken (though another author, Aulus Gellius, at Attic Nights 19.1.14, refers to the fifth book of the Discourses). The range of topics is sufficiently broad for us to be reasonably confident that, even if some of the text has been lost, what we lack by and large repeats and revisits the material that we have in the book as it has come down to us.

b. The Handbook

This little book appears to be an abstract of the Discourses, focusing on key themes in Epictetus’ teaching of Stoic ethics. Some of the text is taken from the Discourses, and the fact that not all of it can be correlated with passages in the larger work supports the view that some of the Discourses has indeed been lost.

3. Epictetus’ Stoicism

The writings of the early Stoics, of Zeno (335–263 B.C.E.) the founder of the school, of Chrysippus (c.290–207 B.C.E.) the extremely influential third head of the Stoa, and of others, survive only as quoted fragments found in later works. The question arises as to what extent Epictetus preserved the original doctrines of the Stoic school, and to what extent, if any, he branched out with new emphases and innovations of his own. The nineteenth-century Epictetan scholar Adolf Bonhöffer (1998, 3) remarks: ‘[Epictetus] is completely free of the eclecticism of Seneca and Marcus Aurelius; and, compared with his teacher Musonius Rufus … his work reveals a considerably closer connection to Stoic doctrine and terminology as developed mainly by Chrysippus.’ Evidence internal to the Discourses indicates that Epictetus was indeed faithful to the early Stoics. At 1.4.28–31, Epictetus praises Chrysippus in the highest terms, saying of him, ‘How great the benefactor who shows the way! … who has discovered, and brought to light, and communicated, the truth to all, not merely of living, but of living well’ (trans. Hard). It would be inconsistent, if not wholly ridiculous, to laud Chrysippus in such terms and then proceed to depart oneself from the great man’s teaching. At 1.20.15, Epictetus quotes Zeno, and at 2.6.9–10 he quotes Chrysippus, to support his arguments. Aulus Gellius (Attic Nights 19.1.14) says that Epictetus’ Discourses ‘undoubtedly agree with the writings of Zeno and Chrysippus’.

Scholars are agreed that the ‘doctrine of the three topics (topoi)’ (fields of study) which we find in the Discourses originates with Epictetus (see Bonhöffer 1996, 32; Dobbin 1998, xvii; Hadot 1998, 83; More 1923, 107). Oldfather (1925, xxi, n. 1), in the introduction to his translation of the Discourses, remarks that ‘this triple division … is the only notable original element … found in Epictetus, and it is rather a pedagogical device for lucid presentation than an innovation in thought’. Our enthusiasm for this division being wholly original to Epictetus should be tempered with a reading of extracts from Seneca’s Moral Letters (75.8–18 and 89.14–15) where we also find a threefold division of ethics which, although not exactly similar to Epictetus’ scheme, suggests the possibility that both Seneca and Epictetus drew on work by their predecessors that, alas, has not survived. Suffice it so say, what Epictetus teaches by means of his threefold division is wholly in accord with the principles of the early Stoics, but how he does this is uniquely his own method. The programme of study and exercises that Epictetus’ students adhered to was in consequence different from the programme that was taught by his predecessors, but the end result, consisting in the special Stoic outlook on oneself and the world at large and the ability to ‘live the philosophic life’, was the same.

4. Key Concepts

a. The Promise of Philosophy

Epictetus, along with all other philosophers of the Hellenistic period, saw moral philosophy as having the practical purpose of guiding people towards leading better lives. The aim was to live well, to secure for oneself eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or ‘a flourishing life’), and the different schools and philosophers of the period offered differing solutions as to how the eudaimôn life was to be won.

No less true of us today than it was for the ancients, few people are content with life (let alone wholly content), and what contributes to any contentment that may be enjoyed is almost certainly short-lived and transient.

The task for the Stoic teacher commences with the understanding that (probably) everyone is not eudaimôn for much, or even all, of the time; that there is a reason for this being the case and, most importantly, that there are solutions that can remedy this sorry state of affairs.

Indeed, Epictetus metaphorically speaks of his school as being a hospital to which students would come seeking treatments for their ills (Discourses 3.23.30). Each of us, in consequence merely of being human and living in society, is well aware of what comprise these ills. In the course of daily life we are beset by frustrations and setbacks of every conceivable type. Our cherished enterprises are hindered and thwarted, we have to deal with hostile and offensive people, and we have to cope with the difficulties and anxieties occasioned by the setbacks and illnesses visited upon our friends and relations. Sometimes we are ill ourselves, and even those who have the good fortune to enjoy sound health have to face the fact of their own mortality. In the midst of all this, only the rare few are blessed with lasting and rewarding relationships, and even these relationships, along with everything that constitutes a human life, are wholly transient.

But what is philosophy? Does it not mean making preparation to meet the things that come upon us? (Discourses 3.10.6, trans. Oldfather)

The ills we suffer, says Epictetus, result from mistaken beliefs about what is truly good. We have invested our hope in the wrong things, or at least invested it in the wrong way. Our capacity to flourish and be happy (to attain eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon our own characters, how we dispose ourselves to ourselves, to others, and to events generally. What qualities our characters come to have is completely up to us. Therefore, how well we flourish is also entirely up to us.

b. What is Really Good

The central claim of Stoic ethics is that only the virtues and virtuous activities are good, and that the only evil is vice and actions motivated by vice (see Discourses 2.9.15 and 2.19.13). When someone pursues pleasure or wealth, say, believing these things to be good, the Stoics hold that this person has made a mistake with respect to the nature of the things pursued and the nature of their own being, for the Stoics deny that advantages such as pleasure and health (wealth and status, and so forth) are good, because they do not benefit those who possess them in all circumstances. Virtue, on the other hand, conceived as the capacity to use such advantages wisely, being the only candidate for that which is always beneficial, is held to be the only good thing (see Plato, Euthydemus 278e–281e and Meno 87c–89a).

Thus, the Stoics identify the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life as one that is motivated by virtue. The term we translate as ‘virtue’ (from the Latin virtus) is aretê, and means ‘excellence’. To progress towards excellence as a human being, for Epictetus, means understanding the true nature of one’s being and keeping one’s prohairesis (moral character) in the right condition. Epictetus uses the term aretê only occasionally, and whereas the early Stoics spoke of striving for excellence as what was proper for a rational creature and required for eudaimonia (‘happiness’ or well-being), Epictetus speaks of striving to maintain one’s prohairesis in proper order (see Discourses 1.4.18 and 1.29.1).

Although things such as material comfort, for instance, will be pursued by the Stoic student who seeks eudaimonia, they will do this in a different way from those not living the ‘philosophic life’ – for Stoics claim that everything apart from virtue (what is good) and vice (what is bad) is indifferent, that is, ‘indifferent’ with regard to being good or bad. It is how one makes use of indifferent things that establishes how well one is making progress towards aretê (moral excellence) and a eudaimôn (‘happy’) life.

Indifferent things are either ‘preferred’ or ‘dispreferred’. Preferred are health and wealth, friends and family, and pretty much all those things that most people pursue as desirable for leading a flourishing life. Dispreferred are their opposites: sickness and poverty, social exclusion, and pretty much all those things that people seek to avoid as being detrimental for a flourishing life. Thus, the preferred indifferents have value for a Stoic, but not in terms of their being good: they have an instrumental value with respect to their capacities to contribute to a flourishing life as the objects upon which our virtuous actions are directed (see Discourses 1.29.2). The Stoic does not lament their absence, for their presence is not constitutive of eudaimonia. What is good is the virtuous use one makes of such preferred things should they be to hand, but no less good are one’s virtuous dispositions in living as well as one may, even when they are lacking.

c. What is in our Power

To maintain our prohairesis (moral character) in the proper condition – the successful accomplishment of this being necessary and sufficient for eudaimonia (‘happiness’) – we must understand what is eph’ hêmin (‘in our power’ or ‘up to us’; see Discourses 1.22.9–16). If we do not do this, our prohairesis will remain in a faulty condition, for we will remain convinced that things such as wealth and status are good when they are really indifferent, troubled by frustrations and anxieties, subject to disturbing emotions we do not want and cannot control, all of which make life unpleasant and unrewarding, sometimes overwhelmingly so. This is why Epictetus remarks: ‘This is the proper goal, to practise how to remove from one’s life sorrows and laments, and cries of “Alas” and “Poor me”, and misfortune and disappointment’ (Discourses 1.4.23, trans. Dobbin).

No one is master of another’s prohairesis [moral character], and in this alone lies good and evil. No one, therefore, can secure the good for me, or involve me in evil, but I alone have authority over myself in these matters. (Discourses 4.12.7–8, trans. Dobbin)

What is in our power, then, is the ‘authority over ourselves’ that we have regarding our capacity to judge what is good and what is evil. Outside our power are ‘external things’, which are ‘indifferent’ with respect to being good or evil. These indifferents, as we saw in the previous section, number those things that are conventionally deemed to be good and those that are conventionally deemed to be bad. Roughly, they are things that ‘just happen’, and they are not in our power in the sense that we do not have absolute control to make them occur just as we wish, or to make them have exactly the outcomes that we desire. Thus, for example, sickness is not in our power because it is not wholly up to us whether we get sick, and how often, nor whether we will recover quickly or indeed at all. Now, it makes sense to visit a doctor when we feel ill, but the competence of the doctor is not in our power, and neither is the effectiveness of any treatment that we might be offered. So generally, it makes sense to manage our affairs carefully and responsibly, but the ultimate outcome of any affair is, actually, not in our power.

What is in our power is the capacity to adapt ourselves to all that comes about, to judge anything that is ‘dispreferred’ not as bad, but as indifferent and not strong enough to overwhelm our strength of character.

The Handbook of Epictetus begins with these words:

Some things are up to us [eph’ hêmin] and some things are not up to us. Our opinions are up to us, and our impulses, desires, aversions–in short, whatever is our own doing. Our bodies are not up to us, nor are our possessions, our reputations, or our public offices, or, that is, whatever is not our own doing. (Handbook 1.1, trans. White)

That is, we have power over our own minds. The opinions we hold of things, the intentions we form, what we value and what we are averse to are all wholly up to us. Although we may take precautions, whether our possessions are carried off by a thief is not up us (but the intention to steal, that of course is in the power of the thief), and our reputations, in whatever quarter, must be decided by what other people think of us, and what they do think is up to them. Remaining calm in the face of adversity and controlling our emotions no matter what the provocation (qualities of character that to this day are referred to as ‘being stoical’), are accomplished in the full Stoic sense, for Epictetus, by making proper use of impressions.

d. Making Proper Use of Impressions

To have an impression is to be aware of something in the world. For example, I may look out of my window and have the impression of an airship floating over the houses in the distance. Whether there is really an airship there, half a mile off, or whether there is just a little helium-filled model tied to my garden gate by a bit of string, is a separate question. ‘Making proper use of impressions’ concerns how we move from the first thing, being aware of something or other, to the second thing, making a judgement that something or other is the case. The Stoic stands in sharp contrast to the non-Stoic, for when the latter faces some disaster, say (let us imagine that their briefcase has burst open and their papers are scattered by the wind all along the station platform and onto the track), they will judge this a terrible misfortune and have the appropriate emotional response to match. Epictetus would declare that this person has made the wrong use of their impression.

In the first place, do not allow yourself to be carried away by [the] intensity [of your impression]: but say, ‘Impression, wait for me a little. Let me see what you are, and what you represent. Let me test you.’ Then, afterwards, do not allow it to draw you on by picturing what may come next, for if you do, it will lead you wherever it pleases. But rather, you should introduce some fair and noble impression to replace it, and banish this base and sordid one. (Discourses 2.18.24–5, trans. Hard)

Few non-Stoics, ignorant of Epictetus’ teaching, would do other than rush around after their papers, descending deeper and deeper into a panic, imagining their boss at work giving them a dressing down for losing the papers, making them work extra hours to make good the loss, and perhaps even dismissing them from their job. The Stoic, by contrast, tests their impression to see what the best interpretation should be: losing the papers is a dispreferred indifferent, to be sure, but having an accident of this sort is bound to happen once in a while, and is nothing to be troubled about. They will quietly gather up the papers they can, and instead of panicking with respect to facing their boss, they will rehearse a little speech about having had an accident and what it means to have lost the papers. If their boss erupts in a temper, well, that is a concern for the boss.

Our attaining the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life requires that we judge things in the right way, for ‘what disturbs men’s minds is not events but their judgements on events’ (Handbook 5, trans. Matheson).

Remember that foul words or blows in themselves are no outrage, but your judgement that they are so. So when any one makes you angry, know that it is your own thought that has angered you. Wherefore make it your endeavour not to let your impressions carry you away. For if once you gain time and delay, you will find it easier to control yourself. (Handbook 20, trans. Matheson)

e. The Three Topoi

The three topoi (fields of study) establish activities in which the prokoptôn (Stoic student) applies their Stoic principles; they are practical exercises or disciplines that when successfully followed are constitutive of the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life which all rational beings are capable of attaining.

There are three areas of study, in which a person who is going to be good and noble must be trained. That concerning desires and aversions, so that he may never fail to get what he desires nor fall into what he would avoid. That concerning the impulse to act and not to act, and, in general, appropriate behaviour; so that he may act in an orderly manner and after due consideration, and not carelessly. The third is concerned with freedom from deception and hasty judgement, and, in general, whatever is connected with assent. (Discourses 3.2.1–2, trans. Hard)

Our capacity to employ these disciplines in the course of daily life is eph’ hêmin (‘in our power’ or ‘up to us’) because they depend on our opinions, judgements, intentions and desires which concern the way we regard things over which our prohairesis (moral character) has complete control.

i. The Discipline of Desire

The first discipline concerns what someone striving for excellence as a rational being should truly believe is worthy of desire, which for the Stoics is that which is truly good, virtue and action motivated by virtue.

Of these [three areas of study], the principle, and most urgent, is that which has to do with the passions; for these are produced in no other way than by the disappointment of our desires, and the incurring of our aversions. It is this that introduces disturbances, tumults, misfortunes, and calamities; and causes sorrow, lamentation and envy; and renders us envious and jealous, and thus incapable of listening to reason. (Discourses 3.2.3, trans. Hard)

Epictetus remarks: ‘When I see a man anxious, I say, What does this man want? If he did not want some thing which is not in his power, how could he be anxious?’ (Discourses 2.13.1, trans. Long). Those things that most of us, most of the time, seek after as being desirable, what we consider will make our lives go well, are things that are not in our power, and thus the hope we have for securing these things is placed in the hands of others or in the hands of fate. And when we are thwarted in our efforts to gain what we desire we become frustrated (or depressed or envious or angry, or all of these things). To be afflicted with such ‘passions’, says Epictetus, is the only real source of misery for human beings. Instead of trying to relieve ourselves of these unpleasant emotions by pressing all the harder to secure what we desire, we should rather place our hope not in ‘external’ things that are not in our power, but in our own dispositions and moral character. In short, we should limit our desire to virtue and to becoming (to the best of our capacities) examples of ‘excellence’. If we do not do this, the inevitable result is that we will continue to desire what we may fail to obtain or lose once we have it, and in consequence suffer the unhappiness of emotional disquiet (or worse). And as is the common experience of all people at some time or other, when we are in the grip of such emotions we run the risk of becoming blind to the best course of action, even when construed in terms of pursuing ‘external’ things.

The Stoic prokoptôn, in contrast, sets their hopes on excellence, recognising that this is where their power over things lies. They will still pursue those ‘preferred indifferent external’ things that are needed for fulfilling those functions and projects that they deem appropriate for them as individuals, and those they have obligations to meet. But they will not be distressed at setbacks or failure, nor at obstructive people, nor at other difficulties (illness, for instance), for none of these things is entirely up to them, and they engage in their affairs in full consciousness of this fact. It is in maintaining this consciousness of what is truly good (virtue), and awareness that the indifferent things are beyond their power, that makes this a discipline for the Stoic prokoptôn.

ii. The Discipline of Action

The second discipline concerns our ‘impulses to act and not to act’, that is, our motivations, and answers the question as to what we each should do as an individual in our own unique set of circumstances to successfully fulfil the role of a rational, sociable being who is striving for excellence.

The outcome of our actions is not wholly in our power, but our inclination to act one way rather than another, to pursue one set of objectives rather than others, this is in our power. The Stoics use the analogy of the archer shooting at a target to explain this notion. The ideal, of course, is to hit the centre of the target, though accomplishing this is not entirely in the archer’s power, for she cannot be certain how the wind will deflect the arrow from its path, nor whether her fingers will slip, nor whether (for it is within the bounds of possibility) the bow will break. The excellent archer does all within her power to shoot well, and she recognises that doing her best is the best she can do. The Stoic archer strives to shoot excellently, and will not be disappointed if she shoots well but fails to hit the centre of the target. And so it is in life generally. The non-Stoic views their success in terms of hitting the target, whereas the Stoic views their success in terms of having shot well (see Cicero, On Ends 3.22).

The [second area of study] has to do with appropriate action. For I should not be unfeeling like a statue, but should preserve my natural and acquired relations as a man who honours the gods, as a son, as a brother, as a father, as a citizen. (Discourses 3.2.4, trans. Hard)

Appropriate acts are in general measured by the relations they are concerned with. ‘He is your father.’ This means that you are called upon to take care of him, give way to him in all things, bear with him if he reviles or strikes you.
‘But he is a bad father.’
Well, have you any natural claim to a good father? No, only to a father.
‘My brother wrongs me.’
Be careful then to maintain the relation you hold to him, and do not consider what he does, but what you must do if your purpose is to keep in accord with nature. (Handbook 30, trans. Matheson)

The actions we undertake, Epictetus says, should be motivated by the specific obligations that we have in virtue of who we are, our natural relations to others, and what roles we have adopted in our dealings with the wider community (see Discourses 2.10.7–13). Put simply, our interest to live well as rational beings obliges us to act virtuously, to be patient, considerate, gentle, just, self-disciplined, even-tempered, dispassionate, unperturbed, and when necessary, courageous. This returns us to the central Stoic notion that the eudaimôn (‘happy’) life is realised by those who are motivated by virtue. The Discipline of Action points out to the prokoptôn how this should be applied in our practical affairs.

Epictetus sums up the first two disciplines:

We must have these principles ready to hand. Without them we must do nothing. We must set our mind on this object: pursue nothing that is outside us, nothing that is not our own, even as He that is mighty has ordained: pursuing what lies within our will [prohairetika], and all else [i.e., indifferent things] only so far as it is given to us. Further, we must remember who we are, and by what name we are called, and must try to direct our acts [kathêkonta] to fit each situation and its possibilities.
We must consider what is the time for singing, what the time for play, and in whose presence: what will be unsuited to the occasion; whether our companions are to despise us, or we to despise ourselves: when to jest, and whom to mock at: in a word, how one ought to maintain one’s character in society. Wherever you swerve from any of these principles, you suffer loss at once; not loss from without, but issuing from the very act itself. (Discourses 4.12.15–18, trans. Matheson)

The loss here is of course loss of eudaimonia.

Failing to ‘remember who we are’ will result in our failing to pursue those actions appropriate to our individual circumstances and commitments. Epictetus says that this happens because we forget what ‘name’ we have (son, brother, councillor, etc.), ‘for each of these names, if rightly considered, always points to the acts appropriate to it’ (Discourses 2.10.11, trans. Hard). To progress in the Discipline of Action, then, the prokoptôn must be conscious, moment by moment, of (a) which particular social role they are playing, and (b) which actions are required or appropriate for fulfilling that role to the highest standard.

iii. The Discipline of Assent

This exercise focuses on ‘assenting to impressions’, and continues the discussion already introduced in the section above on making proper use of impressions. ‘Assent’ translates the Greek sunkatathesis, which means ‘approve’, ‘agree’, or ‘go along with’. Thus, when we assent to an impression (phantasia) we are committing ourselves to it as a correct representation of how things are, and are saying, ‘Yes, this is how it is.’ The Discipline of Assent, then, is an exercise applied to our impressions in which we interpret and judge them in order to move from having the impression of something or other, to a declaration that such-and-such is the case.

The third area of study has to do with assent, and what is plausible and attractive. For, just as Socrates used to say that we are not to lead an unexamined life [see Plato, Apology 38a], so neither are we to accept an unexamined impression, but to say, ‘Stop, let me see what you are, and where you come from’, just as the night-watch say, ‘Show me your token.’ (Discourses 3.12.14–15, trans. Hard)

Make it your study then to confront every harsh impression with the words, ‘You are but an impression, and not at all what you seem to be’. Then test it by those rules that you possess; and first by this–the chief test of all–’Is it concerned with what is in our power or with what is not in our power?’ And if it is concerned with what is not in our power, be ready with the answer that it is nothing to you. (Handbook 1.5, trans. Matheson)

And we should do this with a view to avoiding falling prey to subjective (and false) evaluations so that we can be free from deception and from making rash judgements about how to proceed in the first two disciplines. For if we make faulty evaluations we will end up (with respect to the first discipline) having desires for the wrong things (namely, ‘indifferents’), and (with respect to the second discipline) acting inappropriately with regard to our duties and obligations. This is why Epictetus remarks that the third topic ‘concerns the security of the other two’ (Discourses 3.2.5, trans. Long).

Epictetus runs through a number of imaginary situations to show how we should be alert to the dangers of assenting to poorly evaluated impressions:

… We ought … to exercise ourselves daily to meet the impressions of our senses …. So-and-so’s son is dead. Answer, ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ His father has disinherited So-and-so; what do you think of it? ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ Caesar has condemned him. ‘That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.’ He was grieved at all this. ‘That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is an evil.’ He has borne up under it manfully. ‘That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is a good.’ Now, if we acquire this habit, we shall make progress; for we shall never give our assent to anything but that of which we get a convincing sense-impression. His son is dead. What happened? His son is dead. Nothing else? Not a thing. His ship is lost. What happened? His ship is lost. He was carried off to prison. What happened? He was carried off to prison. But the observation: ‘He has fared ill,’ is an addition that each man makes on his own responsibility. (Discourses 3.8.1–5, trans. Oldfather)

What we must avoid, then, is adding to our impressions immediately and without proper evaluation any notion that something good or bad is at hand. For the only thing that is good is moral virtue, and the only harm that anyone can come to is to engage in affairs motivated by vice. Thus, to see the loss of a ship as a catastrophe would count as assenting to the wrong impression, for the impression that we have is that of just a ship being lost. To take the extra step of declaring that this is a misfortune and harmful would be to assent to an impression that is not in fact present, and would be a mistake. The loss of a ship, for a Stoic, is nothing more than a dispreferred indifferent, and does not constitute a harm.

f. God

For Epictetus, the terms ‘God’, ‘the gods’, and ‘Zeus’ are used interchangeably, and they appear frequently in the Discourses. In the Handbook, God is discussed as the ‘captain’ who calls us back on board ship, the subsequent voyage being a metaphor for our departure from life (see Handbook 7). God is also portrayed as ‘the Giver’ to whom we should return all those things we have enjoyed on loan when we lose close relatives or friends who die, and when we lose our possessions through misfortune (see Discourses 4.10.16 and Handbook 11).

If the Stoic making progress (the prokoptôn) understands God, the universe, and themselves in the right way, they ‘will never blame the gods, nor find fault with them’ (Handbook 31.1, trans. Oldfather):

Will you be angry and discontented with the ordinances of Zeus, which he, with the Fates who spun in his presence the thread of your destiny at the time of your birth, ordained and appointed? (Discourses 1.12.25, trans. Hard)

Indeed, they will pray to God to lead them to the fate that He has assigned them:

Lead me, Zeus, and you too, Destiny,
Wherever I am assigned by you;
I’ll follow and not hesitate,
But even if I do not wish to,
Because I’m bad, I’ll follow anyway.
(Handbook 53, trans. White = extract from Cleanthes’ Hymn to Zeus)

[For] God has stationed us to a certain place and way of life. (Discourses 1.9.24, trans. Dobbin)

Epictetus presents orthodox Stoic views on God. His justification for believing in God is expressed essentially along the lines of what we recognise as an argument from design. The order and harmony that we can perceive in the natural world (from astronomical events to the way plants grow and fruit in season) is attributed to a divine providence that orders and controls the entire cosmos intelligently and rationally (see Discourses 1.6.1–11, 1.14.1–6, 1.16.7–8 and 2.14.11/25–7). The Stoics were materialists, and God is conceived of as a type of fiery breath that blends perfectly with all other matter in the universe. In doing this, God transforms matter from undifferentiated ‘stuff’ into the varied forms that we see around us. This process is continuous, and God makes the world as it is, doing what it does, moment by moment. Just as the soul of a person is understood to bring alive and animate what would otherwise be dead and inert matter, so God is thought of as the ‘soul of the world’, and the universe is thought of as a sort of animal.

Stoics hold that the mind of each person is quite literally a fragment (apospasma) of God (see Discourses 2.8.11), and that the rationality that we each possess is in fact a fragment of God’s rationality; and this Epictetus primarily identifies as the capacity we have to make proper use of impressions (see Discourses 1.1.12). Epictetus expresses this in terms of what God has ‘given us’; He is conceived of as having constructed the universe in such a way that we have in our possession all that is within the compass of our own character or moral choice and nothing else, but this is no reason for complaint:

What has He given me for my own and subject to my authority, and what has He left for Himself? Everything within the sphere of the moral purpose He has given me, subjected them to my control, unhampered and unhindered. My body that is made of clay, how could He make that unhindered? Accordingly He has made it subject to the revolution of the universe–[along with] my property, my furniture, my house, my children, my wife. … But how should I keep them? In accordance with the terms upon which they have been given, and for as long as they can be given. But He who gave also takes away. …
And so, when you have received everything, and your very self, from Another [i.e., God], do you yet complain and blame the Giver, if He take something away from you? (Discourses 4.1.100–3, with omissions, trans. Oldfather)

The capacity that the prokoptôn has for understanding, accepting, and embracing this state of affairs, that this is indeed the nature of things, is another of the main foundation stones of Stoic ethics.

g. On Living in Accord with Nature

The outlook adopted and the activities performed by the Stoic student in pursuit of excellence, as detailed in the sections above, are frequently referred to collectively by Epictetus (following the Stoic tradition) as ‘following nature’ or ‘living in harmony with nature’. The Stoic prokoptôn maintains his ‘harmony with nature’ by being aware of why he acts as he does in terms of both (a) what his appropriate actions are, and (b) accepting what fate brings. If, for example, the prokoptôn is berated unfairly by his brother, he will not respond with angry indignation, for this would be ‘contrary to nature’, for nature has determined how brothers should rightly act towards each other (see Discourses 3.10.19–20). The task the Stoic student shoulders is to pursue actions appropriate to him as a brother, despite all and any provocation to act otherwise (see Handbook 30). This, for Epictetus, is a major component of what it means to keep one’s prohairesis (moral character) in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.6.15, 3.1.25 and 3.16.15).

Keeping ourselves in harmony with nature requires that we focus on two things. Firstly, we must pay attention to our own actions so that we respond appropriately, and secondly we must pay attention to the world in which our actions take effect and which prompts those actions in the first place.

When you are about to undertake some action, remind yourself what sort of action it is. If you are going out for a bath, put before your mind what commonly happens at the baths: some people splashing you, some people jostling, others being abusive, and others stealing. So you will undertake this action more securely if you say to yourself, ‘I want to have a bath and also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature.’ And do likewise in everything you undertake. So, if anything gets in your way when you are having your bath, you will be ready to say, ‘I wanted not only to have a bath but also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature; and I shall not keep it so if I get angry at what happens.’ (Handbook 4, trans. Hard)

In this extract about going to the baths, Epictetus focuses more on accepting what fate brings, saying that we should anticipate the sorts of things that can happen, so that when they do we will not be surprised and will not be angry. In other situations, anticipation of trouble or misfortune is impossible, but all the same, the Stoic will accept their fate as what God has ordained for them, and this for Epictetus is the very essence of keeping in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.4.18–21).

It is circumstances (difficulties) which show what men are. Therefore when a difficulty falls upon you, remember that God, like a trainer of wrestlers, has matched you with a rough young man. For what purpose? you may say. Why, that you may become an Olympic conqueror; but it is not accomplished without sweat. In my opinion no man has had a more profitable difficulty than you have had, if you choose to make use of it as an athlete would deal with a young antagonist. (Discourses 1.24.1–2, trans. Long)

Every problem we face in life should be understood as a new opportunity to strengthen our moral character, just as every new bout for the wrestler provides an opportunity for them to train their skill in wrestling.

To be instructed is this, to learn to wish that every thing may happen as it does. And how do things happen? As the disposer [i.e., God] has disposed them. And he has appointed summer and winter, and abundance and scarcity, and virtue and vice, and all such opposites for the harmony of the whole; and to each of us he has given a body, and parts of the body, and possessions, and companions.
Remembering then this disposition of things, we ought to go to be instructed, not that we may change the constitution of things, – for we have not the power to do it, nor is it better that we should have the power, – but in order that, as the things around us are what they are and by nature exist, we may maintain our minds in harmony with the things which happen. (Discourses 1.12.15–17, trans. Long)

The wise and good man … submits his own mind to him who administers the whole [i.e., God], as good citizens do to the law of the state. He who is receiving instruction ought to come to be instructed with this intention, How shall I follow the gods in all things, how shall I be contented with the divine administration, and how can I become free? For he is free to whom every thing happens according to his will [prohairesis], and whom no man can hinder. (Discourses 1.12.7–9, trans. Long)

In this last extract we see Epictetus refer to the ideal Stoic practice as that of ‘following the gods’. This means essentially the same as ‘following nature’, for God, who is immanent in the world (as the Stoics understand it) is identified with the way the world manifests, so if one follows nature, one must also be following God (see Discourses 1.20.15, 1.30.4, 4.7.20 and 4.10.14).

h. Metaphors for Life

Epictetus employs a number of metaphors to illustrate what the Stoic attitude to life should be.

Life as a festival

In this metaphor, Epictetus encourages us to think of life as a festival, arranged for our benefit by God, as something that we can live through joyously, able to put up with any hardships that befall us because we have our eye on the larger spectacle that is taking place. He asks his students:

Who are you, and for what purpose have you come? Was it not he [i.e., God] who brought you here? … And as what did he bring you here? Was it not as a mortal? Was it not as one who would live, with a little portion of flesh, upon this earth, and behold his governance and take part with him, for a short time, in his pageant and his festival? (Discourses 4.1.104, trans. Hard)

The whole thrust of Stoic ethics aims to persuade us that we should ourselves contribute to the festival by living as well as we may and fulfilling our duties as sociable citizens of God’s ‘great city of the universe’ (Discourses 3.22.4, trans. Hard). (See also Discourses 1.12.21, 2.14.23 and 4.4.24–7/46.)

Life as a game

At Discourses 2.5.2, in encouraging his students to appreciate that external things are indifferent (being neither good nor bad), Epictetus says that we should imitate those who play dice, for neither the dice nor the counters have any real value; what matters, and what is either good or bad, is the way we play the game. Similarly at 2.5.15–20, where Epictetus discusses the example of playing a ball game, no one considers for a moment whether the ball itself is good or bad, but only whether they can throw and catch it with the appropriate skill. What matters are the faculties of dexterity, speed and good judgement exhibited by the players, for it is in deploying these faculties effectively that any player is deemed to have played well. (See also Discourses 4.7.5/19/30–1.) Epictetus also uses the metaphor of playing games when discussing suicide, for just as someone stops playing a game when they are no longer amused by it, so it should be in life generally: if life should become unbearable, no one can force us to keep living it.

To summarize: remember that the door is open. Do not be more cowardly than children, but just as they say, when the game no longer pleases them, ‘I will play no more,’ you too, when things seem that way to you, should merely say, ‘I will play no more,’ and so depart; but if you stay, stop moaning. (Discourses 1.24.20, trans. Hard; see also 1.25.7–21 and 2.16.37)

Life as weaving

In this metaphor, the wool that the weaver uses to make cloth takes the place of the ball in the game; that is, whatever material comes our way, it is our duty to make proper use of it, and if possible make it into the best thing of its kind as we can (see Discourses 2.5.21–2).

Life as a play

We have already seen, when discussing the Discipline of Action, that Epictetus urges us to ‘remember who we are’ and what ‘name’ we have, because what role we play in life will determine which actions are appropriate for us. Obviously, the metaphor of life as a play expands on this idea, but also brings in the notion of our having to accept our fate, whatever that may be, since we do not ourselves chose the role we must play (for although we may aim for one role rather than another, we must recognise that our attaining it is not, in fact, ‘in our power’).

Remember that you are an actor in a play, which is as the author [i.e., God] wants it to be: short, if he wants it to be short; long, if he wants it to be long. If he wants you to act a poor man, a cripple, a public official, or a private person, see that you act it with skill. For it is your job to act well the part that is assigned to you; but to choose it is another’s. (Handbook 17, trans. Hard)

Life as an athletic contest

This metaphor invites us to see an analogy between one’s training in Stoic ethics as preparatory for living the philosophic life and someone’s training in athletics as preparatory for entering the contest in the arena. Epictetus addresses someone who has become distressed at not having enough leisure to study their philosophy books, saying:

For is not reading a kind of preparation for living, but living itself made up of things other than books? It is as if an athlete, when he enters the stadium, should break down and weep because he is not exercising outside. This is what you were exercising for; this is what the jumping-weights, and the sand and your young partners were all for. So are you now seeking for these, when it is the time for action? That is just as if, in the sphere of assent, when we are presented with impressions, some of which are evidently true and others not, instead of distinguishing between them, we should want to read a treatise On Direct Apprehension. (Discourses 4.4.11–13, trans. Hard)

Training to live a life that befits someone who strives for the Stoic ideal is directly compared to athletic training. Such training is difficult, demanding, and unpleasant; there is little point in showing eagerness for any endeavour if we have not properly assessed the demands that will be placed upon us, and in inevitably losing our original enthusiasm we will look foolish. This applies to philosophic training no less than to training as a wrestler in preparation for competing in the Olympic games (see Discourses 3.15.1–13 = Handbook 29). Elsewhere, Epictetus declares that delay is no longer possible, that we must meet the challenges that life throws at us:

Therefore take the decision right now that you must live as a full-grown man, as a man who is making progress; and all that appears to be best must be to you a law that cannot be transgressed. And if you are confronted with a hard task or with something pleasant, or with something held in high repute or no repute, remember that the contest is now, and that the Olympic games are now, and that it is no longer possible to delay the match, and that progress is lost and saved as a result of one defeat and even one moment of giving in. (Handbook 51.2, trans. Boter; see also Discourses 1.4.13–17, 1.18.21–3, 1.24.1–2 and 3.25.3)

Life as military service

This metaphor returns us to the Stoic idea that the universe is governed by God, and that, like it or not, we are all in service to God. The Stoic prokoptôn (student making progress) should understand that they should live life attempting to discharge this service to the highest standards. Epictetus addresses the person who is upset that they are obliged to travel abroad, causing their mother to be distressed at their absence.

Do you not know that life is a soldier’s service? One man must keep guard, another go out to reconnoitre, another take the field. It is not possible for all to stay where they are, nor is it better so. But you neglect to fulfil the orders of the general and complain, when some severe order is laid upon you; you do not understand to what a pitiful state you are bringing the army so far as in you lies; you do not see that if all follow your example there will be no one to dig a trench, or raise a palisade, no one to keep night watch or fight in the field, but every one will seem an unserviceable soldier.
… So too it is in the world; each man’s life is a campaign, and a long and varied one. It is for you to play the soldier’s part–do everything at the General’s bidding, divining his wishes, if it be possible. (Discourses 3.24.31–5, trans. Matheson; see also 1.9.24 and 1.16.20–1)

i. Making Progress

In making progress, the Stoic prokoptôn will pay a price. In standing to God, the world, society, herself and her undertakings in this new way (by accepting the Stoic notions of what is truly good, what is truly up to her, where her proper duties lie, and in considering her life to be one of service to God), the prokoptôn separates herself from the rest of society in fairly marked, if not profound, ways. For example, Epictetus wants his students to enjoy and participate in the ‘festival of life’, yet at the public games (for instance) they must not support any one individual, but must wish the winner to be he who actually wins; they must refrain entirely from shouting or laughing, and must not get carried away by the spectacle of the contest (Handbook 33.10). So whilst the prokoptôn’s friends immerse themselves fully in the games, cheering on their man and jeering at his opponent, the Stoic stands aloof and detached. Deliberately separating herself from the crowd is the price she pays for well-being (eudaimonia), dispassion (apatheia), tranquillity and imperturbability (ataraxia), along with the conviction that she is living as God intends.

But having declared her hand, the prokoptôn will pay in other ways also, for those around her will rebuke and ridicule her (Handbook 22), for in abandoning the values and practices common to the wider community, she will provoke hostility and suspicion. Yet there remains the hope that some at least will see the prokoptôn as someone whose wisdom has value for the community at large, as someone who serves as an example of how one may get along in the world without being overwhelmed by it, as someone with specific skills to offer, such as mediating family disputes and suchlike (see Discourses 1.15.5).

Epictetus characterises the differences between the non-philosopher and someone making progress in these terms:

This is the position and character of a layman: He never looks for either help or harm from himself, but only from externals. This is the position and character of the philosopher: He looks for all his help or harm from himself.
Signs of one who is making progress are: He censures no one, praises no one, blames no one, finds fault with no one, says nothing about himself as though he were somebody or knew something. When he is hampered or prevented, he blames himself. And if anyone compliments him, he smiles to himself at the person complimenting; while if anyone censures him, he makes no defence. He goes about like an invalid, being careful not to disturb, before it has grown firm, any part which is getting well. He has put away from himself every desire, and has transferred his aversion to those things only, of what is under our control [eph’ hêmin], which are contrary to nature. He exercises no pronounced choice in regard to anything. If he gives the appearance of being foolish or ignorant he does not care. In a word, he keeps guard against himself as though he were his own enemy lying in wait. (Handbook 48.1–3, trans. Oldfather)

Epictetus’ life as a Stoic teacher can perhaps be regarded as a personal quest to awaken to true philosophic enlightenment that person who will stand up proudly when his teacher pleads:

Pray, let somebody show me a person who is in such a good way that he can say, ‘I concern myself only with what is my own, with what is free from hindrance, and is by nature free. That is what is truly good, and this I have. But let all else be as god may grant; it makes no difference to me.’ (Discourses 4.13.24, trans. Hard)

For having attained such enlightenment himself (for surely this we must suppose), Epictetus devoted his life to raising up others from the crowd of humanity who could stand beside him and share in a perception of the universe and a way of life that any rational being is obliged to adopt in virtue of the nature of things.

5. Glossary of Terms


‘indifferent’; any of those things that are neither good or bad, everything, in fact, that does not fall under the headings ‘virtue’ or ‘vice’. The indifferents are what those lacking Stoic wisdom frequently take to have value (either positive or negative), and hence take to be desirable or undesirable. Pursuing them, or trying to avoid them, can lead to disturbing emotions that undermine one’s capacity to lead a eudaimôn life.


freedom from passion, a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


aversion; the opposite of hormê.


any ‘dispreferred’ indifferent, including such things as sickness, poverty, social exclusion, and so forth (conventionally ‘bad’ things). Suffering any of the dispreferred indifferents does not detract from the eudaimôn life enjoyed by the Stoic sophos. See proêgmena.

appropriate action

see kathêkon.


‘excellence’ or virtue; in the context of Stoic ethics the possession of ‘moral excellence’ will secure eudaimonia. For Epictetus, one acquires this by learning the correct use of impressions, following God, and following nature.


training or exercise undertaken by the Stoic prokoptôn striving to become a Stoic sophos.


see sunkatathesis and phantasiai (impressions).


imperturbability, literally ‘without trouble’, sometimes translated as ‘tranquillity’; a state of mind that is a constituent of the eudaimôn life.


see kathêkon.


avoidance; opposite of orexis.


‘external’; any of those things that fall outside the preserve of one’s prohairesis, including health, wealth, sickness, life, death, pain – what Epictetus calls aprohaireta, which are not in our power, the ‘indifferent‘ things.


see pathos.


see telos.

eph’ hêmin

what is in our power, or ‘up to us’ – namely, the correct use of impressions.


‘happiness’ or ‘flourishing’ or ‘living well’. One achieves this end by learning the correct use of impressions following God, and following nature.


‘good feelings’, possessed by the Stoic wise person (sophos) who experiences these special sorts of emotions, but does not experience irrational and disturbing passions.


see aretê.

external thing

see ektos.


see theos.


‘commanding faculty’ of the soul (psuchê); the centre of consciousness, the seat of all mental states, thought by the Stoics (and other ancients) to be located in the heart. It manifests four mental powers: the capacity to receive impressions, to assent to them, form intentions to act in response to them, and to do these things rationally. The Discourses talk of keeping the prohairesis in the right condition, and also of keeping the hêgemonikon in the right condition, and for Epictetus these notions are essentially interchangeable.


impulse to act; that which motivates an action.


see phantasiai.


see adiaphora.


any ‘appropriate action’, ‘proper function’, or ‘duty’ undertaken by someone aiming to do what befits them as a responsible, sociable person. The appropriate actions are the subject of the second of the three topoi.


a ‘right action’ or ‘perfect action’ undertaken by the Stoic sophos, constituted by an appropriate action performed virtuously.


‘desire’ properly directed only at virtue.


see pathos.


any of the disturbing emotions or ‘passions’ experienced by those who lack Stoic wisdom and believe that externals really are good or bad, when in fact they are ‘indifferent‘. A pathos according to the Stoics is a false judgement based on a misunderstanding of what is truly good and bad.


‘impressions’, what we are aware of in virtue of having experiences. Whereas non-rational animals respond to their impressions automatically (thus ‘using’ them), over and above using our impressions, human beings, being rational, can ‘attend to their use’ and, with practice, assent or not assent to them as we deem appropriate. The capacity to do this is what Epictetus strives to teach his students.


nature. To acquire eudaimonia one must ‘follow nature’, which means accepting our own fate and the fate of the world, as well as understanding what it means to be a rational being and strive for virtue. See aretê and God.


any ‘preferred’ indifferent, conventionally taken to be good, including such things as health and wealth, taking pleasure in the company of others, and so forth. Enjoying any of the preferred indifferents is not in itself constitutive of the eudaimôn life sought by the Stoic prokoptôn. See apoproêgmena.


‘moral character’, the capacity that rational beings have for making choices and intending the outcomes of their actions, sometimes translated as will, volition, intention, choice, moral choice, moral purpose. This faculty is understood by Stoics to be essentially rational. It is the faculty we use to ‘attend to impressions‘ and to give (or withhold) assent to impressions.


one who is making progress (prokopê) in living as a Stoic, which for Epictetus means above all learning the correct use of impressions.

proper function

see kathêkon.

right action

see katorthôma.


the Stoic wise person who values only aretê and enjoys a eudaimôn life. The sophos enjoys a way of engaging in life that the prokoptôn strives to emulate and attain.


assent; a capacity of the prohairesis to judge the significance of impressions.


disturbance, trouble; what one avoids when one enjoys ataraxia.


end; that which we should pursue for its own sake and not for the sake of any other thing. For the Stoic, this is virtue. Epictetus formulates the end in several different but closely related ways. He says that the end is to maintain one’s prohairesis in proper order, to follow God, and to follow nature, all of which count as maintaining a eudaimôn life. The means by which this is to be accomplished is to apply oneself to the ‘three disciplines‘ assiduously.


God, who is material, is a sort of fiery breath that blends with undifferentiated matter to create the forms that we find in the world around us. He is supremely rational, and despite our feelings to the contrary, makes the best world that it is possible to make. Epictetus says that we should ‘follow God’, that is, accept the fate that He bestows on us and on the world. Stoics understand that the rationality enjoyed by every human being (and any other rational beings, should there be any) is literally a fragment of God.


‘topics’. The ‘three topics’ or ‘fields of study’ which we find elucidated in the Discourses is an original feature of Epictetus’ educational programme. The three fields of study are: (1) The Discipline of Desire, concerned with desire and avoidance (orexis and ekklisis), and what is really good and desirable (virtue, using impressions properly, following God, and following nature); (2) The Discipline of Action, concerned with impulse and aversion (hormê and aphormê), and our ‘appropriate actions‘ or ‘duties’ with respect to living in our communities in ways that befit a rational being; and (3) The Discipline of Assent, concerned with how we should judge our impressions so as not to be carried away by them into anxiety or disturbing emotions with the likelihood of failing in the first two Disciplines.


from the Latin virtus which translates the Greek aretê, ‘excellence’.


the name for God; Epictetus uses the terms ‘Zeus’, ‘God’, and ‘the gods’ interchangeably.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Translations of Epictetus

(Note: ‘Enchiridion‘, ‘Encheiridion‘, ‘Handbook‘, and ‘Manual‘ all refer to the same work. Items in print and currently available are indicated with an asterisk*.)

  • *Boter, Gerard. 1999. The Encheiridion of Epictetus & its Three Christian Adaptations: Transmission & Critical Editions. Leiden: Brill.
  • *Dobbin, Robert. 1998. Epictetus: Discourses Book 1. Oxford: Clarendon.
    • Includes commentary.
  • *Hard, Robin. 1995. The Discourses of Epictetus. ed. with introduction and notes by Christopher Gill. London: Everyman/Dent.
    • Includes the complete Discourses, The Handbook, and Fragments.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1890. The Works of Epictetus Consisting of His Discourses, in Four Books, The Enchiridion, and Fragments. Boston: Little, Brown, & Company.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1944. Epictetus: Discourses and Enchiridion. Roslyn, NY: Walter J. Black.
    • Reprint of the nineteenth-century translation with minor editorial alterations.
  • *Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1948. The Enchiridion. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • *Lobell, Sharon. 1995. Epictetus: The Art of Living. The Classic Manual on Virtue, Happiness, and Effectiveness: A New Interpretation. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco.
    • A free paraphrase of the Handbook.
  • Long, George. 1890. The Discourses of Epictetus with the Encheiridion and Fragments. London: George Bell.
    • First published 1848.
  • *Long, George. 1991. Enchiridion. Amherst, NY: Prometheus.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • Matheson, P. E. 1916. Epictetus: The Discourses and Manual. 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • *Matson, Wallace I. 1998. Epictetus: Encheiridion. in Louis P. Pojman. ed. Classics of Philosophy: Volume 1, Ancient and Medieval. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • *Oldfather, W. A. 1925, 1928. Epictetus: The Discourses as Reported by Arrian, The Manual, and Fragments. 2 vols. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press.
    • With original Greek text facing English translation.
  • *Saunders, Jason L. ed. 1996. Greek and Roman Philosophy after Aristotle. New York: Free Press.
    • Readings from Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, Philo, Plotinus, and early Christian thought. Includes P. E. Matheson’s translation of the Manual of Epictetus.
  • *White, Nicholas. 1983. Handbook of Epictetus. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • A very competent and readable translation, with notes and a helpful, clear introduction.

b. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics

  • Inwood, Brad and L. P. Gerson. 1997. Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings. 2nd edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism and Scepticism.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin.

c. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically

  • Bonhöffer, Adolf Friedrich. 1996. The Ethics of the Stoic Epictetus. trans. William O. Stephens. New York: Peter Lang.
    • A very nicely done translation of this significant nineteenth-century work first published in 1894.
  • Hijmans, B. L. 1959. Askesis: Notes on Epictetus’ Educational System. Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Long, A. A. 2002. Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stephens, William O. 1996. Epictetus on How the Stoic Sage Loves. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 14: 193–210.
    • A very clear, scholarly survey of Epictetus’ ethics.
  • Stockdale, James Bond. 1993. Courage Under Fire: Testing Epictetus’s Doctrines in a Laboratory of Human Behavior. Stanford: Hoover Institution/Stanford University.
    • An account of how the author used the principles of Stoic ethics to survive the rigors of a Vietnamese prisoner of war camp.
  • Xenakis, Jason. 1969. Epictetus: Philosopher–Therapist. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

d. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally

  • Annas, Julia. 1995. The Morality of Happiness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gould, Josiah B. 1970. The Philosophy of Chrysippus. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1995. Philosophy as a Way of Life. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Engaging essays on the notion of philosophy as a way of life, with focus on Stoic practice.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1998. The Inner Citadel: The Mediations of Marcus Aurelius. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains a very helpful chapter on Epictetus.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1985. Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1989. Virtue and the Goods of Fortune in Stoic Moral Theory. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 95–127.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1993. Austere Friends: The Stoics and Friendship. Apeiron 26: 57–75.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • More, Paul Elmer. 1923. Hellenistic Philosophies. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. 1994. The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains very helpful chapters on Stoic ethics from the view point of philosophy as therapy, as the ancients conceived it.
  • Reale, Giovanni. 1990. A History of Ancient Philosophy: 4. The Schools of the Imperial Age. ed. & trans. John R. Catan. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Sandbach, F. H. 1989. The Stoics. London: Duckworth and Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Sharples, R. W. 1996. Stoics, Epicureans, and Sceptics: An Introduction to Hellenistic Philosophy. London: Routledge.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1990. Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquillity. The Monist 73–1: 97–110. also in Striker 1996
  • Striker, Gisela. 1991. Following Nature: A Study in Stoic Ethics. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 9: 1–73. also in Striker 1996.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1996. Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

e. Other items on Hellenistic philosophy generally

  • Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. 1999. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Annas, Julia. 1992. Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.

Author Information

Keith H. Seddon
Email: k.h.s@btinternet.com
Warnborough College