Faith: Contemporary Perspectives
Faith is a trusting commitment to someone or something. Faith helps us meet our goals, keeps our relationships secure, and enables us to retain our commitments over time. Faith is thus a central part of a flourishing life.
This article is about the philosophy of faith. There are many philosophical questions about faith, such as: What is faith? What are its main components or features? What are the different kinds of faith? What is the relationship between faith and other similar states, such as belief, trust, knowledge, desire, doubt, and hope? Can faith be epistemically rational? Practically rational? Morally permissible?
This article addresses these questions. It is divided into three main parts. The first is about the nature of faith. This includes different kinds of faith and various features of faith. The second discusses the way that faith relates to other states. For example, what is the difference between faith and hope? Can someone have faith that something is true even if they do not believe it is true? The third discusses three ways we might evaluate faith: epistemically, practically, and morally. While faith is not always rational or permissible, this section covers when and how it can be. The idea of faith as a virtue is also discussed.
This article focuses on contemporary work on faith, largely since the twentieth century. Historical accounts of faith are also significant and influential; for an overview of those, see the article “Faith: Historical Perspectives.”
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Faith
- Faith and Other States
- Evaluating Faith
- References and Further Reading
1. The Nature of Faith
As we saw above, faith is a trusting commitment to someone or something. While this definition is a good start, it leaves many questions unanswered. This section is on the nature of faith and is divided into two subsections. The first covers distinctions among different kinds of faith and the second explores features of faith.
a. Types of Faith
This subsection outlines distinctions among different kinds of faith. It focuses on four distinctions: attitude-focused faith vs. act-focused faith, faith-that vs. faith-in, religious vs. non-religious faith, and important vs. mundane faith.
i. Attitude-Focused vs. Act-Focused
One of the most important distinctions is faith as an attitude compared to faith as an action. Faith, understood as an attitude, is similar to attitudes like beliefs or desires. In the same way that you might believe that God exists, you might have faith that God exists. Both are attitudes (things in your head), rather than actions (things you do). Call this attitude-focused faith.
Attitude-focused faith is thought to involve at least two components (Audi 2011: 79). The first is a belief-like, or cognitive, component. This could simply be a belief. While some contend that faith always involves belief, others argue that faith can involve something weaker, but still belief-like: some confidence that the object of faith is true, thinking it is likely to be true, supported by the evidence, or the most likely of the options under consideration. Either way, attitude-focused faith involves something belief-like. For example, if you have faith that your friend will win their upcoming basketball game, you will think there is at least a decent chance they win. It does not make sense to have faith that your friend’s team will win if you are convinced that they are going to get crushed. Later, this article returns to questions about the exact connection between faith and belief, but it is relatively uncontroversial that attitude-focused faith involves a belief-like component.
The second component of attitude-focused faith is a desire-like, or conative, component. Attitude-focused faith involves a desire for, or a positive evaluation of, its object. Returning to our example, if you have faith that your friend will win their upcoming game, then you want them to win the game. You do not have faith that they will win if you are cheering for the other team or if you want them to lose. This example illustrates why plausibly, attitude-focused faith involves desire; this article returns to this later as well.
A second kind of faith is not in your head, but an action. This kind of faith is similar to taking a “leap of faith”—an act of trust in someone or something. For example, if your friend promises to pick you up at the airport, waiting for them rather than calling a taxi demonstrates faith that they will pick you up. Walking across a rickety bridge demonstrates faith that the bridge will hold you. Doing a trust fall demonstrates faith that someone will catch you. Call this type of faith an act of faith, or action-focused faith.
On some views, such as Kvanvig’s (2013), faith is a disposition. In the same way that glass is disposed to shatter (even if it never actually shatters), on dispositional views of faith, having faith is a matter of being disposed to do certain things (even if the faithful never actually do them). The view that faith is a disposition could be either attitude-focused or action-focused. Faith might be a disposition to act in certain ways, maybe ways that demonstrate trust or involve risk. This type of faith would be action-focused (see Kvanvig 2013). Faith might instead be a disposition to have certain attitudes: like to believe, be confident in, and/or desire certain propositions to be true. This type of faith would be attitude-focused (see Byerly 2012).
What is the relationship between attitude-focused faith and action-focused faith? They are distinct states, but does one always lead to the other? One might think that, in the same way that beliefs and desires cause actions (for example, your belief that there is food in the fridge and your desire for food leads you to open the fridge), attitude-focused faith will cause (or dispose you toward) action-focused faith, as attitude-focused faith is made up of belief- and desire-like states (see Jackson 2021). On the other hand, we may not always act on our beliefs and our desires. So one question is: could you have attitude-focused faith without action-focused faith?
A related question is whether you could have action-focused faith without attitude-focused faith. Could you take a leap of faith without having the belief- and desire-like components of attitude-focused faith? Speak (2007: 232) provides an example that suggests that you could take a leap of faith without a corresponding belief. Suppose Thomas was raised in circumstances that instilled a deep distrust of the police. Thomas finds himself in an unsafe situation and a police officer is attempting to save him; Thomas needs to jump from a dangerous spot so the officer can catch him. While the officer has provided Thomas with evidence that he is reliable, Thomas cannot shake the belief instilled from his upbringing that the police are not trustworthy. Nonetheless, Thomas jumps. Intuitively, Thomas put his faith in the officer, even without believing that the officer is trustworthy.
Generally, you can act on something, even rationally, if you have a lot to gain if it is true, even if you do not believe that it is true. Whether this counts as action-focused faith without attitude-focused faith, however, will depend on the relationship between faith and belief, a question addressed in a later section.
ii. Faith-That vs. Faith-In
A second distinction is between faith-that and faith-in. Faith-that is faith that a certain proposition is true. Propositions are true or false statements, expressed by declarative sentences. So 1+1=2, all apples are red, and God exists are all propositions. In the case of faith, you might have faith that a bridge will hold you, faith that your friend will pick you up from the airport, or faith that God exists. Faith-that is similar to other propositional attitudes, like belief and knowledge. This suggests that attitude-focused faith is a species of faith-that, since the attitudes closely associated with faith, like belief and hope, are propositional attitudes.
There’s also faith-in. Faith-in is not faith toward propositions, but faith toward persons or ideals. For example, you might have faith in yourself, faith in democracy, faith in your spouse, faith in a political party, or faith in recycling.
Some instances of faith can be expressed as both faith-that and faith-in. For example, theistic faith might be described as faith-that God exists or faith-in God. You might also have faith-that your spouse is a good person or faith-in your spouse. There are questions about the relationship between faith-that and faith-in. For example, is one more fundamental? Do all instances of faith-that reduce to faith-in, or vice versa? Or are they somewhat independent? Is there a significant difference between faith-in X, and faith-that a proposition about X is true?
iii. Religious vs. Non-Religious
A third distinction is between religious faith and secular faith. The paradigm example of religious faith is faith in God or gods, but religious faith can also include: faith that certain religious doctrines are true, faith in the testimony of a religious leader, faith in a Scripture or holy book, or faith in the church or in a religious group. In fact, according to one view that may be popular in certain religious circles, “faith” is simply belief in religious propositions (see Swindal 2021).
However, faith is not merely religious—there are ample examples of non-religious faith. This includes the faith that humans have in each other, faith in secular goals or ideals, and faith in ourselves. It is a mistake to think that faith is entirely a religious thing or reserved only for the religious. Faith is a trusting commitment—and this can involve many kinds of commitments. This includes religious commitment, but also includes interpersonal commitments like friendship or marriage, intrapersonal commitments we have to ourselves or our goals, and non-personal commitments we have to ideals or values.
One reason this distinction is important is that some projects have good reason to focus on one or the other. For example, on some religious traditions, like the Christian tradition, faith is a condition for salvation. But presumably, not any kind of faith will do—religious faith is required. One project in Christian philosophical theology provides an analysis of the religious faith that is closely connected to salvation (see Bates 2017). Projects like these have good reason to set secular faith aside. Others may have a special interest in secular faith and thus set religious faith aside.
This article considers both religious and non-religious faith. While they are different in key ways, they both involve trusting commitments, and many contemporary accounts of faith apply to both.
iv. Important vs. Mundane
A final distinction is between important faith and mundane faith. Important faith involves people, ideals, or values that are central to your life goals, projects, and commitments. Examples of important faith include religious faith, faith in your spouse, or faith in your political or ethical values. In most cases, important faith is essential to your life commitments and often marks values or people that you build your life around.
But not all faith is so important. You might have faith that your office chair will hold you, faith that your picnic will not be rained out, or faith that your spouse’s favorite football team will win their game this weekend. These are examples of mundane faith. While mundane faith still plausibly involves some kind of trusting commitment, this commitment is less important and more easily given up. You may have a weak commitment to your office chair. But—given it is not a family heirloom—if the chair started falling apart, you would quickly get rid of it and buy a new one. So important faith is associated with your central, life-shaping commitments, and mundane faith is associated with casual commitments that are more easily given up.
One might distinguish between objectively important faith—faith held to objectively valuable objects—and subjectively important faith—faith held to objects that are important to a particular individual but may or may not be objectively valuable. For example, some critics of religion might argue that while religious faith might be subjectively important to some, it is nonetheless not objectively important.
While this article focuses mostly on important faith, some of what is discussed also applies to mundane faith, but it may apply to a lesser degree. For example, if faith involves a desire, then the desires associated with mundane faith may be weaker. Now, consider features of faith.
b. Features of Faith
This subsection discusses four key features of faith: trust, risk, resilience, and going beyond the evidence. These four features are often associated with faith. They are not necessarily synonymous with faith, and not all accounts of faith give all four a starring role. Nonetheless, they play a role in understanding faith and its effects. Along the way, this article considers specific accounts that closely associate faith with each feature.
The first feature of faith is trust. As we have noted, faith is a trusting commitment. Trust involves reliance on another person. This can include, for example, believing what they say, depending on them, or being willing to take risks that hinge on them coming through for you. Faith and trust are closely connected, and some even use faith and trust as synonymous (Bishop 2016).
The close association with faith and trust lends itself nicely to a certain view of faith: faith is believing another’s testimony. Testimony is another’s reporting that something is true. Accounts that connect faith and testimony are historically significant, tracing back to Augustine, Locke, and Aquinas. Recent accounts of faith as believing another’s testimony include Anscombe (2008) and Zagzebski (2012). Anscombe, for example, says to have faith that p is to believe someone that p. Religious faith might be believing God’s testimony or the testimony of religious leaders. Interpersonal faith might be believing the testimony of your friends or family.
Plausibly, trust is a key feature—likely the key feature—of interpersonal faith. Faith in others involves trusting another person: this includes faith in God or gods, but also faith in other people and faith in ourselves. It is plausible that even propositional faith can be understood in terms of trust. For example, propositional faith that your friend will pick you up from the airport involves trusting your friend. Even in mundane cases propositional faith could be understood as trust: if you have faith it will be sunny tomorrow, you trust it will be sunny tomorrow.
Faith is also closely related to risk. William James (1896/2011) discusses a hiker who gets lost. She finally finds her way back to civilization, but as she is walking, she encounters a deep and wide crevice on the only path home. Suppose that, to survive, she must jump this crevice, and it is not obvious that she can make the jump. She estimates that she has about a 50/50 chance. She has two choices: she can give up and likely die in the wilderness. Or she can take a (literal) leap of faith and do her best to make it across the crevice. This decision to jump involves a risk: she might fail to make it to the other side and fall to her death.
Risk involves making a decision in a situation where some bad outcome is possible but uncertain. Jumping a wide crevice involves the possible bad outcome of falling in. Gambling involves the possible bad outcome of losing money. Buying a stock involves the bad outcome of its value tanking.
If faith is connected to risk, this suggests two things about faith. First, faith is associated with a degree of uncertainty. For example, if one has faith that something is true, then one is uncertain regarding its truth or falsity. Second, faith is exercised in cases where there is a potentially bad outcome. The outcome might involve the object of faith’s being false, unreliable, or negative in some other way. For example, if you have faith that someone will pick you up at the airport, there is the possibility that they do not show up. If you have faith in a potential business partner, there is the possibility that they end up being dishonest or difficult to work with.
These examples illustrate the connection between risk and action-focused faith. When we act in faith, there is usually some degree of uncertainty involved and a potentially bad outcome. If you have action-focused faith your spouse will pick you up you wait for them and do not call a taxi, you risk waiting at the airport for a long time and maybe even missing an important appointment if your spouse does not show. If you have action-focused faith someone is a good business partner you dedicate time, money, and energy into your shared business, and you risk wasting all those resources if they are dishonest or impossible to work with. Or you might have action-focused faith that God exists and dedicate your life to God, which risks wasting your life if God does not exist.
Attitude-focused faith may also involve risk: some kind of mental risk. William James (1896/2011) discusses our two epistemic goals: believe truth and avoid error. We want to have true beliefs, but if that is all we cared about, we should believe everything. We want to avoid false beliefs, but if that is all we cared about, we should believe nothing. Much of the ethics of belief is about balancing these two goals, and this balance can involve a degree of mental risk. For example, suppose you have some evidence that God exists, but your evidence is not decisive, and you also recognize that there are some good arguments that God does not exist. While it is safer to withhold judgment on whether God exists, you also could miss out on a true belief. Instead, you might take a “mental” risk, and go ahead and believe that God exists. While you are not certain that God exists, and believing risks getting it wrong, you also face a bad outcome if you withhold judgment: missing out on a true belief. By believing that God exists in the face of indecisive evidence, you take a “mental” or “attitude” risk. James argues that this kind of mental risk can be rational (“lawful”) when “reason does not decide”—our evidence does not make it obvious that the statement believed is true or false—and we face a “forced choice”—we have to commit either way.
The view that faith involves an attitude-risk closely resembles John Bishop’s account of faith, which is inspired by insights from James. Bishop (2007) argues that faith is a “doxastic venture” (doxastic meaning belief-like). Bishop’s view is that faith involves believing beyond the evidence. Bishop argues that certain propositions (including what he calls “framework principles”) are evidentially undecidable, meaning our evidence cannot determine whether the claim is true or false. In these cases, you can form beliefs for non-evidential reasons—for example, beliefs can be caused by desires, emotions, affections, and so forth. This non-evidential believing enables you to believe beyond the evidence (see also Ali 2013).
A third feature of faith is resilience. Faith’s resilience stems from the connection between faith and commitment. Consider some examples. If you have faith that my team will win their upcoming game, you have some kind of commitment to my team. If you have faith that God exists, this involves a religious commitment. You might commit to finishing a degree, picking up a new instrument, a marriage, or a religion. These commitments can be difficult to keep—you get discouraged, doubt yourself or others, your desires and passions fade, and/or you get counterevidence that makes you wonder if you should have committed in the first place. Faith’s resilience helps you overcome these obstacles and keep your commitments.
Lara Buchak’s (2012) risky commitment view of faith brings risk and commitment together. On Buchak’s view, faith involves stopping one’s search for evidence and making a commitment. Once this commitment is made, you will maintain that commitment, even in the face of new counterevidence. For example, suppose you are considering making a religious commitment. For Buchak, religious faith involves stopping your search for evidence regarding whether God exists and taking action: making the commitment. Of course, this does not mean that you can no longer consider the evidence or have to stop reading philosophy of religion, but you are not looking for new evidence to decide whether to make (or keep) the commitment. Once you’ve made this religious commitment, you will continue in that commitment even if you receive evidence against the existence of God—at least, to a degree.
The literature on grit is also relevant to faith’s resilience. Grit, a phenomenon discussed by both philosophers and psychologists, is the ability to persevere to achieve long-term, difficult goals (Morton and Paul 2019). It takes grit to train for a marathon, survive a serious illness, or remain married for decades. Matheson (2018) argues that faith is gritty, and this helps explain how faith can be both rational and voluntary. Malcolm and Scott (2021) argue that faith’s grit helps the faithful be resilient to a variety of challenges. Along similar lines, Jackson (2021) argues that the belief- and desire-like components of faith explain how faith can help us keep our long-term commitments, in light of both epistemic and affective obstacles.
iv. Going Beyond the Evidence
A final feature of faith is that it goes beyond the evidence. This component is related to faith’s resilience. Faith helps you maintain your commitments because it goes beyond the evidence. You might receive counterevidence that makes you question whether you should have committed in the first place. For example, you might commit to a certain major, but a few months in, realize the required classes are quite difficult and demanding. You might wonder whether you are cut out for that field of study. Or you might have a religious commitment, but then encounter evidence that an all-good, all-loving God does not exist—such as the world’s serious and terrible evils. In either case, faith helps you continue in your commitment in light of this counterevidence. And if the evidence is misleading—so you are cut out for the major, or God does exist—then this is a very good thing.
The idea that faith goes beyond the evidence raises questions about rationality. How can faith go beyond the evidence but still be rational? Is it not irrational to disrespect or ignore evidence? This article returns to this question later, but for now, note that there is a difference between going beyond the evidence and going against the evidence. Going beyond the evidence might look like believing or acting when the evidence is decent but imperfect. Bishop’s account, for example, is a way that faith might “venture” beyond the evidence (2007). However, this does not mean faith goes against the evidence, requiring you to believe something that you have overwhelming evidence is false.
Some do argue that faith goes against the evidence. They fall into two main camps. The first camp thinks that faith goes against the evidence, and this is a bad thing; faith is harmful, and we should avoid having faith at all costs. The New Atheists, such as Richard Dawkins and Sam Harris, have a view like this (but see Jackson 2020). The second camp thinks that faith goes against the evidence but that is actually a good thing. This view is known as fideism. Kierkegaard argued for fideism, and he thought that faith is valuable because it is absurd: “The Absurd, or to act by virtue of the absurd, is to act upon faith” (Journals, 1849). Nonetheless, Kierkegaard thought having faith is one of the highest ideals to which one can aspire. This article returns to the idea that faith “goes beyond the evidence” in Section 3.
2. Faith and Other States
This section is about the relationship between faith and related attitudes, states, or actions: belief, doubt, desire, hope, and acceptance. Unlike the features just discussed, these states are normally not part of the definition or essence of faith. Nonetheless, these states are closely associated with faith. Appreciating the ways that faith is similar to, but also different than, these states provides a deeper understanding of the nature of faith.
a. Faith and Belief
When it comes to attitudes associated with faith, many first think of belief. Believing something is taking it to be the case or regarding it as true. Beliefs are a propositional attitude: an attitude taken toward a statement that is either true or false.
What is the relationship between faith and belief? Since belief is propositional, it is also natural to focus on propositional faith; so what is the relationship between belief that p and faith that p? More specifically: does belief that p entail faith that p? And: does faith that p entail belief that p? The answer to the first question is no; belief does not entail propositional faith. This is because propositional faith involves a desire-like or affective component; belief does not. You might believe that there is a global pandemic or believe that your picnic was rained out. However, you do not have faith that those things are true, because you do not desire them to be true.
The second question—whether propositional faith entails belief—is significantly more controversial. Does faith that p entail belief that p? Answers to this question divide into three main views. Those who say yes normally argue that faith is a kind of belief. The no camp divides into two groups. The first group argues that faith does not have to involve belief, but it involves something belief-like. A final group argues that faith is something totally different from belief. This article considers each view in turn. (See Buchak 2017 for a very helpful, more detailed taxonomy of various views of faith and belief.)
i. Faith as a Belief
On some views, faith is a belief. Call these “doxastic” views of faith. We have discussed two doxastic views already. The first is the view that faith is simply belief in a religious proposition; it was noted that, if intended as a general theory of faith, this seems narrow, as one can have non-religious faith. (But it may be more promising as an account of religious faith.) The second view is Anscombe’s (2008) and Zagzebski’s (2012) view that faith is a belief based on testimony, discussed in the previous section on trust. A third view traces back to Augustine and Calvin, and is more recently defended by Plantinga (2000). On this view, faith is a belief that is formed through a special mental faculty known as the sensus divintatus, or the “sense of the divine.” For example, you might watch a beautiful sunset and form the belief that there is a Creator; you might be in danger and instinctively cry out to God for help. (Although Plantinga also is sympathetic to views that connect faith and testimony; see Plantinga 2000: ch. 9.)
Note two things about doxastic views. First, most doxastic views add other conditions in addition to belief. For instance, as we have discussed, it is widely accepted that faith has an affective, desire-like component. So on one doxastic view, faith involves a belief that p and a desire for p. You could also add other conditions: for example, faith is associated with dispositions to act in certain ways, take certain risks, or trust certain people. What unites doxastic views is that faith is a kind of belief; faith is belief-plus.
Second, the view that faith entails belief does not require you to accept that faith is a belief. You could have a view on which faith is not a belief, but every time you have faith that a statement is true, you also believe it—faith and belief “march in step” (analogy: just because every animal with a heart also has a kidney does not mean hearts are kidneys). So, another view in the family of doxastic views, is that faith is not a belief, but always goes along with belief.
ii. Faith as Belief-like
Some resist the idea that faith entails belief. Daniel Howard-Snyder (2013) provides several arguments against doxastic views of faith. Howard-Snyder argues that if one can have faith without belief, this makes sense of the idea that faith is compatible with doubt. Doubting might cause you to give up a belief, but Howard-Snyder argues that you can maintain your faith even in the face of serious doubts. Second, other belief-like attitudes can play belief’s role: for example, you could think p is likely, be confident in p, think p is more likely than not, and so forth. If you do not flat-out believe that God exists, but are confident enough that God exists, Howard-Snyder argues that you can still have faith that God exists. A final argument that you can have faith without belief involves real-life examples of faith without belief. Consider the case of Mother Theresa. Mother Theresa went through a “dark night of the soul” in her later life. During this dark time, in her journals, she confessed that her doubts were so serious that at times, she did not believe that God existed. Nonetheless, she maintained her commitment and dedication to God. Many would not merely say she had faith; Mother Theresa was a paradigm example of a person of faith. This again supports the idea that you can have faith without belief. In general, proponents of non-doxastic views do not want to exclude those who experience severe, belief-prohibiting doubts from having religious faith. In fact, one of the functions of faith is to help you keep your commitments in the face of such doubts.
Howard-Snyder’s positive view is that faith is “weakly doxastic.” Faith does not require belief but requires a belief-like attitude, such as confidence, thinking likely, and so forth. He adds other conditions as well; in addition to a belief-like attitude, he thinks that faith that p requires a positive view of p, a positive desire-like attitude toward p, and resilience to new counterevidence against the truth of p.
In response to Howard-Snyder, Malcolm and Scott (2017) defend that faith entails belief. While they agree with Howard-Snyder that faith is compatible with doubt, they point out that belief is also compatible with doubt. It is not uncommon or odd to say things like “I believe my meeting is at 3 pm, but I’m not sure,” or “I believe that God exists, but I have some doubts about it.” Malcolm and Scott go on to argue that faith without belief, especially religious faith without belief, is a form of religious fictionalism. Fictionalists speak about and act on something for pragmatic reasons, but they do not believe the claims that they are acting on and speaking about. For example, you might go to church, pray, or recite a creed, but you do not believe that God exists or what the creed says—you merely do those things for practical reasons. Malcolm and Scott argue that there is something suspicious about this, and there is reason to think that fictionalists do not have genuine faith. They conclude that faith entails belief, and more specifically, religious faith requires the belief that God exists.
This debate is not be settled here, but note that there are various responses that the defender of the weakly-doxastic view of faith could provide. Concerning the point about doubt, a proponent of weak doxasticism might argue that faith is compatible with more doubt than belief. Even if belief is compatible with some doubt—as it seems fine to say, “I believe p but there’s a chance I’m wrong”—it seems like faith is compatible with even more doubt—more counterevidence or lower probabilities. On fictionalism, Howard-Snyder (2018) responds that religious fictionalism is a problem only if the fictionalist actively believes that the claims they are acting on are false. However, if they are in doubt but moderately confident, or think the claims are likely, even if they do not believe the claims, it is more plausible that fictionalists can have faith. You might also respond by appealing to some of the distinctions discussed above: for example, perhaps religious faith entails belief, but non-religious faith does not.
iii. Faith as Totally Different from Belief
A third view pulls faith even further away from belief. On this view, faith does not entail belief, nor does faith entail something belief-like, but instead, faith is totally different from belief. This view is often known as the pragmatist view of faith.
This article returns to these views later, but here is a summary. Some authors argue that faith only involves accepting, or acting as if, something is true (Swinburne 1981; Alston 1996). Others argue that faith is a disposition to act in service of an ideal (Dewey 1934; Kvanvig 2013), or that faith involves pursuing a relationship with God (Buckareff 2005). Some even argue that faith is incompatible with belief; for example, Pojman (1986) argues that faith is profound hope, and Schellenberg (2005) argues that faith is imaginative assent. Both argue that one cannot have faith that p if they believe that p.
Pragmatist views depart drastically from both doxastic and weakly doxastic accounts of faith. Faith does not even resemble belief, but is something totally unlike belief, and more closely related to action, commitment, or a disposition to act.
There are two ways to view the debate between doxastic, weakly doxastic, and pragmatic views of faith. One possibility is that there is a single thing, “faith,” and there are various views about what exactly faith amounts to: is faith a belief, similar to a belief, or not at all like belief? Another possibility, however, is that there are actually different kinds of faith. Plausibly, both doxastic and weakly doxastic views are describing attitude-focused faith, and pragmatic views of faith are describing action-focused faith. This second possibility does not mean there are not any interesting debates regarding faith. It still leaves open whether attitude-focused faith requires belief, or merely something belief-like, and if the latter, what those belief-like attitudes can be, and how weak they can be. It also leaves open which view of action-focused faith is correct. However, you may not have to choose between pragmatist views on the one hand, and doxastic or weakly doxastic views on the other; each view may simply be describing a different strand of faith.
b. Faith and Doubt
One might initially think that faith and doubt are opposed to each other. That is, those with faith will never doubt, or if they do doubt, their faith is weak. However, if you agree with the points made in the previous section—Howard-Snyder’s argument that faith is compatible with doubt; and Malcolm and Scott’s point that belief is also compatible with doubt—there is reason to reject the view that faith and doubt are completely opposed to each other.
Howard-Snyder (2013: 359) distinguishes between two ways of doubting. First, you might simply doubt p. Howard-Snyder says that this involves an inclination to disbelieve p. If you doubt that it will rain tomorrow, you will tend to disbelieve that it will rain tomorrow. This type of doubt—doubting p—might be in tension with, or even inconsistent with faith. Even those who deny that faith entails belief nonetheless think that faith is not consistent with disbelief; you cannot have faith that p if you think p is false (but see Whitaker 2019 and Lebens 2021).
However, not all doubt is closely associated with disbelief. You might instead be in doubt about p, or have some doubts about p. Moon (2018) argues that this type of doubt involves (roughly) thinking you might be wrong. In these cases, you are pulled in two directions—maybe you believe something, but then receive some counterevidence. Moon argues that this second kind of doubt is compatible with belief (2018: 1831), and Howard-Snyder argues that it is compatible with faith. Howard-Snyder says, “Being in doubt is no impediment to faith. Doubt is not faith’s enemy; rather, the enemies of faith are misevaluation, indifference or hostility, and faintheartedness” (2013: 370).
Thus, there is good reason to think that having doubts is consistent with faith. Those that deny that faith entails belief might argue that faith is compatible with more doubts than belief. What is more, faith may be a tool that helps us maintain our commitments in light of doubts. For example, Jackson (2019) argues that evidence can move our confidence levels around, but it does not always change our beliefs. For example, suppose John is happily engaged and will be married soon, and based on the sincerity and commitment of him and his spouse, he has faith that they will not get divorced. Then, he learns that half of all marriages end in divorce. Learning this should lower his confidence that they will remain committed, causing him to have doubts that his marriage will last. However, this counterevidence does not mean he should give up his faith or the commitment. His faith in himself and his spouse can help him maintain the commitment, even in light of the counterevidence and resulting doubts.
c. Faith and Desire
Recall that attitude-focused faith involves a desire for, or a positive evaluation of, the object of faith. If you have faith that your friend will win her upcoming race, then you want her to win; it does not make sense to claim to have faith she will win if you hope she will lose. Similarly, you would not have faith that your best friend has cancer, or that your father will continue smoking. A large majority of the authors writing on the philosophy of faith maintain that faith involves a positive evaluation of its object (Audi 2011: 67; Howard-Snyder 2013: 362–3). Even action-focused faith may involve desire. While it is more closely identified with actions, rather than attitudes, it could still involve or be associated with desires or pro-attitudes.
Malcolm and Scott (2021) challenge the orthodox view that faith entails desire or positivity. They argue that, while faith might often involve desire, the connection is not seamless. For example, you might have faith that the devil exists or faith that hell is populated—not because you want these to be true, but because these doctrines are a part of your religious commitment. You might find these doctrines confusing and difficult to swallow, and even hope that they are false, but you trust that God has a plan or reason to allow these to be true. Malcolm and Scott argue that faith in such cases does not involve positivity toward its object—and in fact, it may involve negativity.
Furthermore, crises of faith can involve the loss of desire for the object of faith. There has been much talk about how faith that p can be resilient in light of counterevidence: evidence that p is false. But what about evidence that p would be a bad thing? One might question their religious commitment, say, not because they doubt God’s existence, but because they doubt that God’s existence would be a good thing, or that God is worth committing to (see Jackson 2021). Malcolm and Scott argue that if one can maintain faith through a crisis of faith, this provides another reason to think that faith may not always involve positivity.
Note that more attention has been paid to the specifics of faith’s belief-like component than faith’s desire-like component. Many authors mention the positivity of faith, motivate it with a few examples, and then move on to other topics. But many similar questions that arise regarding faith and belief could also be raised regarding faith and desire. For example: does faith that p entail a desire for p? What if someone has something weaker than a desire, such as a second-order desire (a desire to desire p)? Or some desire for p, but also some desire for not-p? Could these people have faith? Can other attitudes play the role of desire in faith, such as a belief that p is good?
If you are willing to weaken the relationship between faith and desire, you could agree with Malcolm and Scott that the idea that faith entails desire is too strong, but nonetheless accept that a version of the positivity view is correct. Similar to a weakly doxastic account of faith, you could have a weakly positive account of faith and desire: faith’s desire-like condition could include things like second-order desires, conflicting desires, pro-attitudes, or beliefs about the good. In a crisis of faith, the faithful may have second-order desires or some weaker desire-like attitude. The prospect of weakly positive accounts of faith should be further explored. And in general, more attention should be paid to the relationship between faith and desire. In the religious case, this connection is related to the axiology of theism, the question of whether we should want God to exist (see The Axiology of Theism).
d. Faith and Hope
Faith and hope are often considered alongside each other, and for good reason. Like faith, hope also has a desire-like component and a belief-like component. The desire-like component in both attitudes is similar—whether you have faith that your friend will win their game or hope that they will win their game, you want them to win the game.
However, hope’s belief-like component is arguably weaker than faith’s. Hope that a statement is true merely requires thinking that statement is possibly true; it can be extremely unlikely. Even if there is a 95% chance of rain tomorrow, you can still hope your picnic will not be rained out. Hope’s belief-like component could be one of two things: a belief that p is possible, or a non-zero credence in p. (Credence is a measure of subjective probability—the confidence you have in the truth of some proposition. Credences are measured on a scale from 0 to 1, where 0 represents certainty that a proposition is false, and 1 represents certainty that it is true.) So if you hope that p, you cannot believe p is impossible or have a credence of 0 in p (certainty that p is false). At the same time, it seems odd to hope for things in which you are certain. You do not hope that 1+1=2 or hope that you exist, even if you desire those to be true. Then, as Martin (2013: 69) notes, hope that p may be consistent with any credence in p between, but excluding, 1 and 0.
Thus, on the standard view of hope, hope consists of two things: a desire for p to be true and a belief that p is possible (or non-zero credence). (See Milona 2019 for a recent defense of the standard view. Some argue that hope has additional components; for details of recent accounts of hope, see Rioux 2021.) Contrast this with faith. Unlike hope, faith that a statement is true is not compatible with thinking the statement is extremely unlikely or almost definitely false. If there is a 95% chance of rain tomorrow, you should not—and most would not—have faith that it will be sunny tomorrow. The chance of rain is just too high. But this does not preclude hoping that it will be sunny. Thus, you can hope that something is true when it is so unlikely that you cannot have faith.
This carves out a unique role for hope. Sometimes, after you make a commitment, you get lots of counterevidence challenging your basis for that commitment—counterevidence so strong that you must give up your faith. However, simply because you have to give up your faith does not mean you have to give up hope. You might hope your missing sibling is alive, even in light of evidence that they are dead, or hope that you will survive a concentration camp, or hope that you can endure a risky treatment for a serious illness. And resorting to hope does not always mean you should give up your commitment. Hope can, in general, underlie our commitments when we do not have enough evidence to have faith (see Jackson 2021).
While faith and hope are distinct in certain ways, Pojman (1986) argues that faith is a certain type of hope: profound hope. Pojman is not interested in casual hope—like hope your distant cousin will get the job he applied for—but is focused on the hope that is deep and central to our life projects. In addition to the two components of hope discussed above, profound hope also involves a disposition to act on p, an especially strong desire for p to be true, and a willingness to take great risks to bring p about. Pojman’s view draws on a connection between attitude-focused faith and action-focused faith, as Pojman’s account gives a central role to risky action. Those convinced by the idea that faith requires a bit more evidence than hope may also want to add a condition to Pojman’s view: the belief-like component of faith-as-hope must be sufficiently strong, as faith might require more than merely taking something to be possible.
e. Faith and Acceptance
Accepting that p is acting as if p. When you accept a proposition, you treat it as true in your practical reasoning, and when you make decisions, act as if p were true. According to Jonathan Cohen (1992: 4), when one accepts a proposition, one “includes that proposition… among one’s premises for deciding what to do or think in a particular context.” Often, we accept what we believe and believe what we accept. You believe coffee will wake you up, so you drink it when you are tired in the morning. You believe your car is parked north of campus, so you walk that way when you leave the office.
Sometimes, however, you act as if something is true even though you do not believe it. Say you are a judge in a court case, and the evidence is enough to legally establish that a particular suspect did it “beyond a reasonable doubt.” Suppose, though, you have other evidence that they are innocent, but it is personal, such that it cannot legally be used in a court of law. You may not be justified in believing they are guilty, but for legal reasons, you must accept that they are guilty and issue the “guilty” verdict. In other cases, you believe something, but do not act as it if is true. Suppose you are visiting a frozen lake with your young children, and they want to go play on the ice. You may rationally believe the ice is thick and safe, but refuse to let your children play, accepting that the ice will break, because of how bad it would be if they fell in.
Several authors have argued that faith and acceptance are closely connected. Alston (1996) argues that acceptance, rather than belief, is one of the primary components of faith. That is, those with faith may or may not believe the propositions of faith, but they act as if they are true. A similar view is Swinburne’s pragmatist faith. On Swinburne’s (1981) view, faith is acting on the assumption that p. Like Alston, Swinburne also maintains that faith does not require belief. Schellenberg’s (2005) view also gives acceptance a prominent place in faith. On Schellenberg’s view, faith is imaginative assent. If you have faith that p, you deliberately imagine p to be true, and, guided by this imaginative picture, you act on the truth of p. So Schellenberg’s picture of faith is imaginative assent plus acceptance. While these authors argue that acceptance is necessary for faith, most do not think it is sufficient; the faithful fulfill other conditions, including a pro-attitude towards the object of faith.
A final view is that faith involves a kind of allegiance. Allegiance is an action-oriented submission to a person or ideal. Dewey (1934) and Kvanvig (2013) defend the allegiance view of faith, on which the faithful are more characterized by their actions than their attitudes. The faithful are marked by their loyalty and committed action to the object of faith; in many cases, this could look like accepting certain propositions of faith, even if one does not believe them. Bates (2017) also proposes a model of Christian faith as allegiance, but for Bates, faith requires both a kind of intellectual assent (something belief-like) and allegiance, or enacted loyalty and obedience to God.
Whether these views that give acceptance or action a central role in faith are weakly doxastic or pragmatic depends on one’s view of acceptance: is acceptance a belief-like state or an action-like state? Since acceptance is acting as if something is true, and you can accept a proposition even if you think it is quite unlikely, in my opinion, these views are better characterized as pragmatic. However, some acceptance views, like Bates’, that involve both acceptance and something belief-like, may be doxastic or weakly doxastic.
3. Evaluating Faith
Thus far, this article has focused on the nature of faith. Section 1 covered types of faith and features of faith. Section 2 covered the way faith compares and contrasts with other related attitudes and actions. This final section is about evaluating faith. This section discusses three modes of evaluation: epistemic, practical, and moral.
Note that, like other attitudes and actions, faith is sometimes rational and sometimes irrational, sometimes permissible and sometimes impermissible. In the same way that beliefs can be rational or irrational, faith can be rational or irrational. Not all faith should be evaluated in the same way. The rationality of faith depends on several factors, including the nature of faith and the object of faith. Drawing on some of the above accounts of the nature of faith, this article discusses various answers to the question of why and when faith could be rational, and why and when faith could be irrational.
a. Faith’s Epistemic Rationality
Our first question is whether faith can be epistemically rational, and if so, when and how. Epistemic rationality is rationality that is aimed at getting at the truth and avoiding error, and it is associated with justified belief and knowledge. An epistemically rational belief has characteristics like being based on evidence, being reliably formed, being a candidate for knowledge, and being the result of a dependable process of inquiry. Paradigm examples of beliefs that are not epistemically rational ones are based on wishful thinking, hasty generalizations, or emotional attachment.
Epistemic rationality is normally applied to attitudes, like beliefs, so faith’s epistemic rationality primarily concerns faith as a mental state. This article also focuses on propositional faith, and it divides the discussion of faith’s epistemic rationality into two parts: evidence and knowledge.
i. Faith and Evidence
Before discussing faith, it might help to discuss the relationship between evidence and epistemic rationality. It is widely thought that epistemically rational people follow the evidence. While the exact relationship between evidence and epistemic rationality is controversial, many endorse what is called evidentialism, the view that you are epistemically rational if and only if you proportion your beliefs to the evidence.
We have seen that faith is resilient: it helps us keep our commitments in the face of counterevidence. Given faith’s resilience, it is natural to think that faith goes beyond the evidence (or involves a disposition to go beyond the evidence). But would not having faith then violate evidentialism? Can faith both be perfectly proportioned to the evidence, but also go beyond the evidence? Answers to these questions fall into three main camps, taking different perspectives on faith, evidence, and evidentialism.
The first camp, mentioned previously, maintains that faith violates evidentialism because it goes beyond the evidence; but evidentialism is a requirement of rationality; thus, faith is irrational. Fideists and the New Atheists may represent such a view. However, you might think that the idea that all faith is always irrational is too strong, and that, instead, faith is more like belief: sometimes rational and sometimes irrational. Those that think faith can be rational fall into two camps.
The first camp holds that rational faith does not violate evidentialism and that there are ways to capture faith’s resilience that respect evidentialism. For example, consider Anscombe’s and Zagzebski’s view that faith is believing another’s testimony. On this view, faith is based on evidence, and rational faith is proportioned to the evidence: testimonial evidence. Of course, this assumes that testimony is evidence, but this is highly plausible: much of our geographical, scientific, and even everyday beliefs are based on testimony. Most of our scientific beliefs are not based on experiments we did ourselves—they are based on results reported by scientists. We trust their testimony. We believe geographical facts about the shape of the globe and things about other countries even though we have never traveled there ourselves—again, based on testimony. We ask people for directions on the street and believe our family and friends when they report things to us. Testimony is an extremely important source of evidence, and without it, we would be in the dark about a lot of things.
In what sense does faith go beyond the evidence, on this view? Well, sometimes, we have only testimony to go on. We may not have the time or ability to verify what someone tells us without outside sources, and we may be torn about whether to trust someone. In choosing to take someone’s word for something, we go beyond the evidence. At the very least, we go beyond certain kinds of evidence, in that we do not require outside verifying evidence. One worry for this view, however, is that faith is straightforwardly based on evidence, and thus it cannot sufficiently explain faith’s resilience, or how faith goes beyond the evidence.
A second view on which rational faith goes beyond the evidence without violating evidentialism draws on a view in epistemology known as epistemic permissivism: the view that sometimes, the evidence allows for multiple different rational attitudes toward a proposition. In permissive cases, where your evidence does not point you one way or another, there is an evidential tie between two attitudes. You can then choose to hold the faithful attitude, consistent with, but not required by, your evidence. This does not violate evidentialism, as the faithful attitude is permitted by, and in that sense fits, your evidence. At the same time, faith goes beyond the evidence in the sense that the faithful attitude is not strictly required by your evidence.
Consider two concrete examples. First, suppose your brother is accused of a serious crime. Suppose that there are several good, competing explanations of what happened. It might be rational for you to withhold belief, or even believe your brother is guilty, but you could instead choose the explanation of the evidence that supports your brother’s innocence. This demonstrates faith that your brother is innocent without violating the evidence, since believing that he is innocent is a rational response to the data.
Or suppose you are trying to decide whether God exists. The evidence for (a)theism is complicated and difficult to assess, and there are good arguments on both sides. Suppose, because the evidence is complicated in this way, you could be rational as a theist (who believes God exists), atheist (who believes God does not exist), or agnostic (who is undecided on whether God exists). Say you go out on a limb and decide to have faith that God exists. You are going beyond the evidence, but you are also not irrational, since your evidence rationally permits you to be a theist. Again, this is a case where rational faith respects evidentialism, but also goes beyond the evidence. (Note that, depending on how evidentialism is defined, this response may better fit under the third view, discussed next. Some strong versions of evidentialism are inconsistent with permissivism, and on some versions of the permissivist theory of faith, non-evidential factors can break evidential ties, so things besides evidence affect rational belief.) Attempts to reconcile faith’s resilience with evidentialism include, for example, Jackson (2019) and Dormandy (2021).
The third and final camp holds the view that faith, in going beyond the evidence, violates evidentialism, but this does not mean that faith is irrational. (James 1896/2011 and Bishop 2007 may well be characterized as proponents of this view, as they explicitly reject Clifford’s evidentialism). For example, you might maintain that evidentialism applies to belief, but not faith. After all, it is natural to think that faith goes beyond the evidence in a way that belief does not. To maintain evidentialism about belief, proponents of this view would need to say that rational faith is inconsistent with belief. Then, faith might be subject to different, non-evidentialist norms, but could still be rational and go beyond the evidence.
A second family of views that rejects evidentialism but maintains faith’s rationality are externalist views. Externalists maintain that epistemic justification depends on factors that are external to the person—for example, your belief that there is a cup on the desk can be rational if it is formed by a reliable perceptual process, whether or not you have evidence that there is a cup. Plantinga in particular is an externalist who thinks epistemic justification (or “warrant”) is a matter of functioning properly. Plantinga (2000) argues that religious beliefs can be properly basic: rational even if not based on an argument. Plantinga’s view involves the sensus divinitatus: a sense of the divine, that, when functioning properly, causes people to form beliefs about God (for example, “There is a Creator”; “God exists”; “God can help me”) especially in particular circumstances (for example, in nature, when in need of help, and so forth). These beliefs can be rational, even if not based on argument, and may be rational without any evidence at all.
That said, the view that religious belief can be properly basic does not, by itself, conflict with evidentialism. If a religious belief is based on experiential evidence, but not arguments, it can still be rational according to an evidentialist. Externalist views that deny evidentialism make a stronger claim: that religious belief can be rational without argument or evidence (see Plantinga 2000: 178).
Externalist views—at least ones that reject evidentialism—may be able to explain how rational faith goes beyond the evidence; evidence is not required for faith (or belief) to be epistemically rational. Even so, most externalist views include a no-defeater condition: if you get evidence that a belief is false (a defeater), that can affect, or even preclude, your epistemic justification. For example, you might form a warranted belief in God based on the sensus divinitatus but then begin to question why a loving, powerful God would allow the world’s seriously and seemingly pointless evils; this counterevidence could remove the warrant for your belief in God. Generally, externalist views may need a story about how faith can be resilient in the face of counterevidence to fully capture the idea that faith goes beyond the evidence.
We have seen three views about the relationship between faith, evidence, and evidentialism. On the first view, evidentialism is true, and faith does not respect evidentialism, so faith is irrational. On the second, evidentialism is true, and rational faith goes beyond the evidence in a way that respects evidentialism. On the final view, evidentialism is false, so faith does not have to be based on evidence; this makes space for rational faith to go beyond the evidence. Now, we turn to a second topic concerning the epistemology of faith: faith and knowledge.
ii. Faith and Knowledge
Epistemology is the study of knowledge. Epistemologists mostly focus on propositional knowledge: knowledge that a proposition is true. For example, you might know that 1+1=2 or that it is cold today. Knowledge involves at least three components: justification, truth, and belief. If you know that it is cold today, you believe that it is cold today, it is indeed cold today, and your belief that it is cold today is epistemically justified. (While these three components are necessary for knowledge, many think they are not sufficient, due to Gettier’s (1963) famous counterexamples to the justified true belief account of knowledge.) Note that knowledge is a high epistemic ideal. When a belief amounts to knowledge, it is not merely justified, but it is also true. Many epistemologists also think that knowledge requires a high degree of justification, for example, quite good evidence.
There are three main views about the relationship between faith and knowledge. The first is that propositional faith is a kind of knowledge. Plantinga’s view lends itself to a view of faith along these lines, as Plantinga’s story about proper function is ultimately an account of knowledge. Plantinga’s view is inspired by Calvin’s, who defines faith as a “firm and certain” knowledge of God (Institutes III, ii, 7:551). If Plantinga is right that (undefeated) theistic beliefs, formed reliably by properly functioning faculties in the right conditions, amount to knowledge, then Plantinga’s view might be rightfully characterized as one on which faith is (closely tied to) knowledge. Relatedly, Aquinas discusses a kind of faith that resembles knowledge, but is ultimately “midway between knowledge and opinion” (Summa Theologica 2a2ae 1:2).
On a second view, propositional faith is not a kind of knowledge, but can amount to knowledge in certain circumstances. For example, one might hold that faith may be consistent with less evidence or justification than is required for knowledge, or that faith does not require belief. Thus, one could have faith that p—even rationally—even if one does not know that p. Keep in mind that knowledge is a high epistemic bar, so meeting this bar for knowledge may not be required for faith to be rational—faith that p might be rational even if, for example, p is false, so p is not known. However, faith that p may amount to knowledge when it meets the conditions for knowledge: p is justifiedly believed, true, and not Gettiered.
On a final view, faith that p is inconsistent with knowing p. For example, Howard-Snyder (2013: 370) suggests that for faith, one’s evidence is often “sub-optimal.” Along similar lines, Alston (1996: 12) notes that “[F]aith-that has at least a strong suggestion of a weak epistemic position vis-a-vis the proposition in question.” Since knowledge sets a high epistemic bar (the proposition in question must enjoy a high degree of justification, be true, and so forth), faith may play a role when your epistemic position is too poor to know. And if you know p, faith that p is not needed. This fits well with Kant’s famous remarks: “I have… found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (Preface to the Second Edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, 1787/1933: 29). On this third view, then, if you have faith that p, you do not know p, and if you know p, faith that p is unnecessary.
As noted, many epistemologists focus on knowledge-that: knowing that a proposition is true. However, there are other kinds of knowledge: knowledge-how, or knowing how to perform some action, such as riding a bike, and knowledge-who, or knowing someone personally. There has been some interesting work on non-propositional knowledge and faith: see Sliwa (2018) for knowledge-how, and Benton (2018) for knowledge-who. Note that non-propositional knowledge might better fit with non-propositional faith, such as faith-in. This raises several interesting questions, such as: does faith in God require interpersonal knowledge of God? And how does this relate to the belief that God exists? The relationship between non-propositional knowledge and faith merits further exploration.
b. Faith’s Practical Rationality
A second question is whether faith can be practically rational, and if so, when and how. Practical rationality, unlike epistemic rationality, is associated with what is good for you: what fulfills your desires and leads to your flourishing. Examples of practically rational actions include brushing your teeth, saving for retirement, pursuing your dream job, and other things conducive to meeting your goals and improving your life (although see Ballard 2017 for an argument that faith’s practical and epistemic rationality are importantly connected).
Practical rationality is normally applied to actions. Thus, it makes the most sense to evaluate action-focused faith for practical rationality. In particular, acceptance, or acting as if a proposition is true, is often associated with action-focused faith. Thus, this article focuses on what makes accepting a proposition of faith practically rational, and whether leaps of faith can be practically rational but go beyond the evidence.
Elizabeth Jackson’s (2021) view of faith focuses on how acceptance-based faith can be practically rational in light of counterevidence. Jackson notes that, on two major theories of rational action (the belief-desire view and the decision-theory view), rational action is caused by two things: beliefs and desires. If it is rational for you to go to the fridge, this is because you want food (a desire) and you believe there is food in the fridge (a belief). But you can believe and desire things to a stronger or lesser degree; you might rationally act on something because you have a strong desire for it, even though you consider it unlikely. Suppose your brother goes missing. He has been missing for a long time, and there is a lot of evidence he is dead, but you think there is some chance he might be alive. Because it would be so good if he was alive and you found him, you have action-focused faith that he is alive: you put up missing posters, spend lots of time searching for him, and so forth. The goodness of finding him again makes this rational, despite your counterevidence. Or consider another example: you might rationally accept that God exists, by practicing a religion, participating in prayer and liturgy, and joining a spiritual community, even if you have strong evidence against theism. This is because you have a lot of gain if you accept that God exists and God does exist, and not much to lose if God does not exist.
Arguably, then, it is even easier for practically rational faith to go beyond the evidence than it is for epistemically rational faith. Taking an act of faith might be practically rational even if one has little evidence for the proposition they are accepting. Practically rational action depends on both your evidence and also what is at stake, and it can be rational to act as if something is true even if your evidence points the other way. In this, practically rational faith can be resilient in light of counterevidence: what you lose in evidence can be made up for in desire.
Of course, this does not mean that faith is always practically rational. Both your beliefs/evidence and your desires/what is good for you can render faith practically irrational. For example, if you became certain your brother was dead (perhaps his body was found), then acting as if your brother is still alive would be practically irrational. Similarly, faith could be practically irrational if its object is not good for your flourishing: for example, faith that you will get back together with an abusive partner.
However, since it can be rational to accept that something is true even if you have overwhelming evidence that it is false, practically rational acts of faith go beyond (and even against) the evidence. For other related decision-theoretic accounts of how practically rational faith can go beyond the evidence, see Buchak (2012) and McKaughan (2013).
c. Faith and Morality/Virtue
The third and final way to evaluate faith is from a moral perspective. There is a family of questions regarding the ethics of faith: whether and when is faith morally permissible? Is faith ever morally obligatory? Is it appropriate to regard faith as a virtue? Can faith be immoral?
We normally ask what actions, rather than what mental states, are obligatory/permissible/wrong. While virtues are not themselves actions, they are (or lead to) dispositions to act. In either case, it makes sense to morally evaluate action-focused faith. (Although, some argue for doxastic wronging, that is, beliefs can morally wrong others. If they can, this suggests beliefs—and perhaps other mental states—can be morally evaluated. This may open up space to morally evaluate attitude-focused faith as well.)
As with the epistemic and practical case, it would be wrong to think that all cases of faith fit into one moral category. Faith is not always moral: faith in an evil cause or evil person can be immoral. But faith is not always immoral, and may sometimes be morally good: faith in one’s close friends or family members, or faith in causes like world peace or ending world hunger seem morally permissible, if not even morally obligatory.
One of the most widely discussed topics on the ethics of faith is faith as a virtue (see Aquinas, Summa Theologiae II-II, q. 1-16). Faith is often taken to be both a virtue in general, but also a theological virtue (in the Christian tradition, along with hope and charity). For reasons just discussed, the idea that faith is a virtue by definition seems incorrect. Faith is not always morally good—it is possible to have faith in morally bad people or cases, and to have faith with morally bad effects. (This is why the discussion of faith as a virtue belongs in this section, rather than in previous sections on the nature of faith.)
This raises the question: Can faith satisfy the conditions for virtue? According to Aristotle, a virtue is a positive character trait that is demonstrated consistently, across situations and across time. Virtues are acquired freely and deliberately and bring benefits to both the virtuous person and to their community. For example, if you have the virtue of honesty, you will be honest in various situations and also over time; you will have acquired honesty freely and deliberately (not by accident), and your honesty will bring benefits both to yourself and those in your community. Thus, assuming this orthodox Aristotelian definition of virtue, when faith is a virtue, it is a stable character trait, acquired freely and deliberately, that brings benefits to both the faithful person and their community.
There have been several discussions of the virtue of faith in the literature. Anne Jeffrey (2017-a) argues that there is a tension between common assumptions about faith and Aristotelian virtue ethics. Specifically, some have argued that part of faith’s function depends on a limitation or an imperfection in the faithful person (for example, keeping us steadfast and committed in light of doubts or misguided affections). However, according to the Aristotelian view, virtues are traits held by fully virtuous people who have perfect practical knowledge and always choose the virtuous action. Taken together, these two views create a challenge for the idea that faith is a virtue, as faith seems to require imperfections or limitations incompatible with virtue. While this tension could be resolved by challenging the idea that faith’s role necessarily involves a limitation, Jeffrey instead argues that we should re-conceive Aristotelian virtue ethics and embrace the idea that even people with limitations can possess and exercise virtues. In another paper, Jeffrey (2017-b) argues that we can secure the practical rationality and moral permissibility of religious faith—which seems necessary if faith is a virtue—by appealing to the idea that faith is accompanied by another virtue, hope.
There is a second reason to think that the theological virtues—faith, hope, and charity—may not perfectly fit into the Aristotelian mold. While Aristotelian virtues are freely acquired by habituation, some thinkers suggest that theological virtues are infused immediately by God, rather than acquired over time (Aquinas, Summa Theologiae II-II, q. 6). While some may conclude from this that faith, along with the other theological virtues, are not true virtues, this may further support Jeffrey’s suggestion that Aristotle’s criteria for virtue may need to be altered or reconceived. Or perhaps there are two kinds of virtues: Aristotelian acquired virtues and theological infused virtues, each with their own characteristics.
A final topic that has been explored is the question of how virtuous faith interacts with other virtues. The relationship between faith and humility is widely discussed. Several authors have noted that prima facie, faith seems to be in tension with humility: faith involves taking various risks (both epistemic and action-focused risks), but in some cases, those risks may be a sign of overconfidence, which can be in tension with exhibiting humility (intellectual or otherwise). In response to this, both Kvanvig (2018) and Malcolm (2021) argue that faith and humility are two virtues that balance each other out. Kvanvig argues that humility is a matter of where your attention is directed (say, not at yourself), and this appropriately directed attention can guide faithful action. Malcolm argues that religious faith can be understood as a kind of trust in God—specifically, a reliance on God’s testimony, which, when virtuous, exhibits a kind of intellectual humility.
Faith is a trusting commitment to someone or something. There are at least four distinctions among kinds of faith: attitude-focused faith vs. act-focused faith, faith-that vs. faith-in, religious vs. non-religious faith, and important vs. mundane faith (Section 1.a). Trust, risk, resilience, and going beyond the evidence are all closely associated with faith (Section 1.b). Considering faith’s relationship to attitudes, states, or actions—belief, doubt, desire, hope, and acceptance—sheds further light on the nature of faith (Section 2). There are three main ways we might evaluate faith: epistemically, practically, and morally. While faith is not always epistemically rational, practically rational, or morally permissible, we have seen reason to think that faith can be positively evaluated in many cases (Section 3).
5. References and Further Reading
- Ali, Zain. (2013). Faith, Philosophy, and the Reflective Muslim. London, UK: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Alston, William. (1996). “Belief, Acceptance, and Religious Faith.” In J. Jordan and D. Howard-Snyder (eds.), Faith, Freedom, and Rationality pp. 3–27. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
- Anscombe, G. E. M. (2008). “Faith.” In M. Geach and L. Gormally (eds.), Faith in a Hard Ground. Exeter: Imprint Academic, 11–19.
- Audi, Robert. (2011). Rationality and Religious Commitment. New York: Oxford University Press.
- Ballard, Brian. (2017). “The Rationality of Faith and the Benefits of Religion.” International Journal for the Philosophy of Religion 81: 213–227.
- Bates, Matthew. (2017). Salvation by Allegiance Alone. Grand Rapids: Baker Academic.
- Benton, Matthew. (2018). “God and Interpersonal Knowledge.” Res Philosophica 95(3): 421–447.
- Bishop, John. (2007). Believing by Faith: An Essay in the Epistemology and Ethics of Religious Belief. Oxford: OUP.
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