The Garden of Epicurus

A garden near the city of Athens, owned and used by the philosopher Epicurus and his followers. It became a symbol of Epicurean philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Location and Use
  2. References and Further Reading

1. Location and Use

In 307/306 BCE the Athenian philosopher Epicurus bought a house with a garden just outside Athens along the road from the Dipylon gate to the Academy (CiceroDe Finibus 5.1.3). Other great founders of philosophical schools had chosen public areas for their teaching: Plato established his school near the Academy, Isocrates and Aristotle taught in the Lyceum, Zeno often met his students in the Stoa Poecile. In contrast, Epicurus’ hedonistic and materialistic philosophy flourished and grew amidst the privately owned groves of his Garden. The Garden itself – apart from the city, a private space, and pleasurable – became a symbol for the detachment and hedonism of the Epicurean school. Nothing of the Garden’s layout is known, but its closeness to the canalized Eridanus River must have provided plentiful water for irrigation of its trees and plants. After Epicurus’ death the Garden was passed down to his followers (Diogenes Laertius, 10.10 and 10.17). We may imagine that Epicureans seeking relief from the disturbances of the city gathered in the Garden’s groves for many centuries.

2. References and Further Reading

  • Furley, David John. “Epicurus” in the Oxford Classical Dictionary. Third Edition. Oxford 1996.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 197

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University