Edmund Husserl: Phenomenology of Embodiment

HusserlFor Husserl, the body is not an extended physical substance in contrast to a non-extended mind, but a lived “here” from which all “there’s” are “there”; a locus of distinctive sorts of sensations that can only be felt firsthand by the embodied experiencer concerned; and a coherent system of movement possibilities allowing us to experience every moment of our situated, practical-perceptual life as pointing to “more” than our current perspective affords. To identify such experiential structures of embodiment, however, Husserl must clarify and set aside not only the ways in which the natural sciences approach the body, but also the ways in which we have tacitly taken over natural-scientific assumptions into our everyday understanding of embodiment. Husserl’s phenomenological investigations eventually lead to the notion of kinaesthetic consciousness, which is not a consciousness “of” movement, but a consciousness or subjectivity that is itself characterized in terms of motility, that is, the very ability to move freely and responsively. In Husserl’s phenomenology of embodiment, then, the lived body is a lived center of experience, and both its movement capabilities and its distinctive register of sensations play a key role in his account of how we encounter other embodied agents in the shared space of a coherent and ever-explorable world. Many of Husserl’s findings were taken up by such later figures in the phenomenological tradition as Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, who gave these findings an ontological interpretation. However, Husserl’s main focus is epistemological, and for him, lived embodiment is not only a means of practical action, but an essential part of the deep structure of all knowing.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Sources and Themes
    2. Terms and Concepts
  2. Naturalistic Presuppositions about the Body
  3. Embodied Personhood
  4. The Structure of Embodied Experience
    1. The Body as a Center of Orientation
    2. Distinctive Bodily Sensations
    3. Movement and the “I Can”
  5. Kinaesthetic Consciousness
    1. Systems of Kinaesthetic Capabilities
    2. Kinaesthetic Capabilities and Perceptual Appearances
    3. Kinaesthetic Experience and the Experience of Others
    4. Further Philosophical Issues
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Sources and Themes

Edmund Husserl (1859–1938), the founder of phenomenology, addressed the body throughout his philosophical life, with much of the relevant material to be found in lecture courses, research manuscripts, and book-length texts not published during his lifetime. One of the most important texts—the second volume of his Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, subtitled Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution and usually referred to as Ideas 2—was particularly influential. Heidegger, for example, had access to it in manuscript before writing his own major work, Being and Time (1927), and Merleau-Ponty consulted it while working on his Phenomenology of Perception (1945); indeed, Ideas 2 first became generally known on the basis of Merleau-Ponty’s references to it in Phenomenology of Perception. It has long been known that the text posthumously published in 1952 as Ideas 2 had been shaped by not one, but two editors, Edith Stein and Ludwig Landgrebe (each of whom worked on the text while serving as Husserl’s assistant). But more recent scholarship by Sawicki (1997) suggests that Edith Stein (1891–1942) should be seen as the guiding architect of the work, which she attempted to recast in terms of her own philosophical commitments so as to “correct” what she saw as problems and shortcomings in Husserl’s original 1912 draft. This may be why the text as we currently have it is marked by certain gaps and tensions. In fact, no faithful account of this seminal work will be possible until a new edition is published, fully disentangling Husserl’s own train of thought from Stein’s argument. The present article is therefore based on texts from all periods, and the copious amount of relevant material has been organized in terms of four main tasks of a Husserlian phenomenology of embodiment: bringing naturalistic presuppositions about the body to light; setting aside the naturalized body in favor of embodied personhood; offering phenomenological descriptions of the structure of embodied experience; and demonstrating that transcendental (inter)subjectivity itself must be thought as kinaesthetic consciousness. Before turning to these themes, however, let us pause for a brief overview of some of the key Husserlian terms and concepts used in this article.

b. Terms and Concepts

Husserlian phenomenology stands in opposition to naturalism, for which material nature is simply a given and conscious life itself is part of nature, to be approached with natural-scientific methods oriented toward empirical facts and causal explanations. In contrast, phenomenology turns directly to the evidence of lived experience—of first-person subjective life—in order to provide descriptions of experiencing and of objects as experienced, rather than causal explanations. For Husserl, these descriptions are to be eidetic (or “essential”) insofar as what is being described is not a specific set of empirical facts considered for their own sake, but invariants governing a certain range of facts—for instance, structural patterns that must obtain for something to be an object of a certain type at all, or eidetically necessary laws such as “any conceivable color has some extension.” Husserl’s investigations of essential structures of conscious life and experience further focus on consciousness as transcendental rather than mundane, which means that consciousness is taken not as a part of the world, but as the constitutive presupposition for experiencing any world whatsoever.

Husserl’s technical term constitution takes on many nuances as his work develops. But all constitutive phenomenology is concerned with the correlation between “experiencing” and “that which is experienced”—for example, between perceiving and the perceived, remembering and the remembered, and so on. This “universal a priori of correlation” (Husserliana 6, §46) encompasses not only conscious performances actively carried out by the I (for instance, a judging whose correlate is the corresponding judgment), but also deeper strata of subjective experience that often remain unnoticed in everyday life. They can, however, be brought to light by reflecting on the structure of the type of experience concerned. For example, that only one side of the perceptual object actually appears to me at any given moment has its subjective correlate in the situatedness of embodied experience, so that any spatial thing is always seen from a particular standpoint; at the same time, that I am currently seeing “this side” of the object has its subjective correlate in my capability for movement, since I am able in principle to move in such a way as to bring “other sides” into view. In short, Husserl does not presuppose a subject-object split, but operates with a subject-object correlation—a correlation he works out in detail for almost every sphere and stratum of experience.

Moreover, as the examples indicate, a Husserlian approach to consciousness or subjectivity is not restricted to the realm of the mental as traditionally understood; instead, the phenomenological notion of embodied experience offers an alternative to mind-body dualism. And Husserl’s investigations ultimately embrace not only the achievements and correlates of constituting subjectivity, but also those of intersubjectivity, that is, of the “we” rather than solely the “I.”

Finally, a general feature of Husserl’s terminology must also be mentioned: he frequently takes over words used differently in other contexts and expects the reader to understand these words not in terms of linguistic definitions set forth in advance, but in light of their referents—the experiential features or nuances that he is describing. Thus the Husserlian tradition is not merely a tradition of texts to comment upon or argue against, but a permanent possibility of checking descriptive claims against the touchstone of the appropriate experiential evidence so as to confirm or correct such claims. Bearing this in mind, let us now return to the four main moves accomplished by a Husserlian phenomenology of embodiment: criticizing naturalistic presuppositions about the body; thematizing embodied personhood; describing the structure of embodied experience; and investigating kinaesthetic consciousness.

2. Naturalistic Presuppositions about the Body

Summary: Husserl criticizes the assumption that the body is a psychophysical entity, in order to make “the body as directly experienced by the embodied experiencer concerned” a theme for phenomenological investigation.

Let us begin by sketching Husserl’s response to the philosophical and scientific tradition in which he found himself—and in particular to the naturalism of the positivistic natural sciences, which he addresses through a critique of its presuppositions. He is specifically concerned to demonstrate how a natural-scientific tradition that has inherited a Cartesian dualism of substances (res extensa/res cogitans), and is committed to mathematization as the measure of truth, deals with the “mental” by approaching the “psyche” in terms of the “psychophysical”: it is only by taking intangible minds as localizable in tangible living bodies that natural science can bring the “mental” side of the inherited dualism into the realm of real-spatial causality, and thus into the domain of calculability, prediction, and control. Rather than automatically accepting these assumptions, Husserl brings them to light; traces their historical development; establishes the limits of their legitimacy; and offers an alternative account of “consciousness” or “subjectivity,” an account that relies on rigorous philosophical methods and on a radical turn to the evidence of lived experience, rather than on the assumptions and methods of natural-scientific cognition.

But in the course of carrying out these larger tasks, Husserl highlights a major presupposition concerning embodiment. The received tradition, with its tendency to think in terms of the “psychophysical” (even when one is not actively carrying out psychophysical investigations or making specifically psychophysical claims), not only attempts to tie the “mind” to a material “body,” but is already operating under a more basic assumption—namely, that this body can itself be taken as a physical body (Körper) like any other spatial thing, albeit a thing with certain distinctive sorts of characteristics. For even if “organisms” are the province of special natural sciences (for example, anatomy and physiology) having to do with living rather than non-living things, it is still taken for granted that like “inanimate” objects, the “animate” ones too belong to the realm of real, spatially extended entities to be explained in terms of causal laws. Yet such a presupposition completely ignores what is essential to the body as a lived body (Leib)—as my body, someone’s body, experienced in a unique way by the embodied experiencer concerned. In other words, what is missing in naturalism is the body of embodiment, which must not be taken physically, but as directly experienced from within.

Here Husserl is not challenging the right of scientific practice to approach living bodies in causal terms; in Ideas 3 (originally written in 1912, but not published until 1952), he even proposes a new science—somatology—that would incorporate both physiological investigation of the material properties of the body as a living organism and experiential investigation of firsthand, first-person somatic perception (for example, of sensing tactile contact). But he does indeed insist on clarifying the presuppositions governing natural-scientific cognition, recognizing them for what they are and acknowledging their limits, so that, as he puts it in 1936 in §9h of The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, we do not “take for true being what is actually a method.” Thus the historical fact that living bodies can be, and have been, approached with natural-scientific methods does not automatically allow us to relegate the body of embodiment to the res extensa side of Cartesian dualism. Instead, appropriate modes of inquiry must be developed to do justice to the body of direct experience.

Accordingly, Husserl not only provides a critique of the presupposition of the “psychophysical” (and of the lived body as a physical body), but opens up several further ways in which a phenomenology of embodiment can be pursued. In Ideas 1 (first published in 1913), he sets the body aside in order to reach the realm of “pure consciousness.” Commentators sometimes mistake this strategic move for Husserl’s “position,” and accuse him of postulating a disembodied, desituated consciousness. But the body that is set out of play here is merely the body that is assumed to be the “physical” half of the inherited dualism. Moreover, this is only the first step in the critique: Husserl is effectively suspending the tacit hegemony of the prevailing presupposition whereby it is automatically accepted, as a matter of course, that the body is a physical reality that is a part of nature—and setting this assumption out of play frees us to address the body and embodiment phenomenologically rather than naturalistically. After suspending the unquestioned validity of naturalistic presuppositions concerning the body, then, the next step is to retrieve the body of experience, and Husserl employs various pivotal distinctions in order to open up the experience of embodiment for phenomenological investigation.

3. Embodied Personhood

Summary: Husserl shows that embodied experience is geared into the world as a communal nexus of meaningful situations, expressive gestures, and practical activities.

One key distinction emphasized in Ideas 2 contrasts the “naturalistic” attitude, as the theoretical attitude within which natural science is practiced, with the “personalistic” attitude that characterizes personal and social experience in the world of everyday life—the “lifeworld” (Lebenswelt), the cultural world that is the province of the cultural or human sciences. Within the personalistic attitude, our intersubjective encounters are always experienced as embodied encounters, and our ongoing practical life is already an embodied one. Thus, for example, we greet one another with culturally specific gestures such as shaking hands; we communicate with others, responding to their facial expressions, gestures, and tones of voice; we use tools in practical, goal-directed actions; we rely on bodily capabilities and develop new skills that improve with practice or grow rusty with disuse; and so on. In other words, what we come upon are others embodying themselves in particular ways (serenely or impatiently, adroitly or clumsily, buoyantly or dragged down by pain or fatigue, and so forth): we immediately see embodied persons, not material objects animated by immaterial minds, and the immediacy of this carnal intersubjectivity is the foundation of community and sociality (with culturally specific “normal” embodiment playing a privileged role as the measure from which the “anomalous” and the “abnormal” diverge). Similarly, we make immediate use of the bodily possibilities at our disposal, which serve as the “means whereby” we carry out our everyday activities, without having to appeal to psychophysical explanations: I simply reach for my cup, pick it up, and drink from it, without ever giving a thought to the neurophysiological processes that allow me to keep my balance as I reach, move the cup without spilling the liquid, and swallow without choking. And even if my abilities are compromised by illness or injury, the lived experience of “I can no longer do it” is qualitatively different from the physician’s causal explanations for my condition.

For the most part, Husserl himself provides passing examples, rather than extended analyses, of embodied experience in the personalistic attitude. Yet if we recall that his aim is not to carry out concrete cultural-scientific investigations but to clarify the philosophical bases of the cultural or human sciences, we can see that his critique of naturalistic presuppositions about the body both secures a theoretical foundation for work in such areas as nonverbal communication (as well as other sorts of studies of embodiment carried out within phenomenological psychology, phenomenological sociology, and so on), and anticipates more recent concerns with socially shaped patterns of embodiment (including, for example, issues of gendered embodiment, as contrasted with the biological “sex” of an individual—although even the medical assignment of sex at birth may display, in certain problematic cases, social/cultural assumptions and priorities).

Husserl’s discussions of the “personalistic” attitude in Ideas 2 are echoed in his extensive discussions of the lifeworld in the Crisis, and several further points concerning embodiment can be made in this connection. First of all, for Husserl, the “prescientific” world of experience is more basic than the “objective” world constituted as a correlate to scientific practice in the naturalistic attitude; for example, natural-scientific investigation of the body as an object presupposes a functioning bodily subjectivity on the part of each of the scientists concerned, for whom their own lived bodies tacitly serve as organs of perception, communication, and action, even while they are engaged in carrying out detailed research into, say, the neurophysiology of motor behavior. At the same time, however, scientific assumptions and constructs “flow back into” everyday lifeworldly language and experience, so that, for instance, I may refer to my own body in anatomical terms as a matter of course, or offer causal explanations (rather than experiential descriptions) of my own bodily condition, even in a casual conversation with a friend. Thus although there is a functional priority of the personalistic over the naturalistic attitude, the former is ongoingly shaped and reshaped by the historical acquisitions of the latter—as well as by its unnoticed philosophical presuppositions and its habitual abstractions. Moreover, despite their important differences, both the naturalistic attitude and the personalistic attitude fall within a more general attitude that Husserl terms the “natural attitude.” In the natural attitude, not only are we typically straightforwardly directed toward objects rather than reflecting on the structures of our own subjective experience, but entities such as “bodies” (whether these are taken as “psychophysical realities” or “embodied persons”) are given as ready-made realities within a pregiven world; even the experiencer for whom such entities are given is him/herself taken as one entity among others in the world. And the natural attitude is both all-pervasive and anonymous—it is so taken for granted that we are not even cognizant of it as an “attitude” at all. But when we do become aware of it, still further insights into embodied experience become possible.

4. The Structure of Embodied Experience

Summary: Husserl’s phenomenological investigations emphasize that the lived body functions as the central “here” from which spatial directions and distances are gauged; that it is the locus of distinctive sorts of directly felt sensations such as the experience of tactile contact; and that it is capable of self-movement, opening a rich range of practical possibilities.

Husserl’s approach to disclosing the natural attitude for what it is and suspending its wholesale, automatic efficacy is termed the phenomenological reduction, which leads us from the natural attitude of everyday life to the phenomenological attitude. Within the phenomenological attitude, we set aside questions framed in terms of an ultimate “being” or “reality” existing utterly in itself; instead, we make experiencing—and correlatively, phenomena, which means whatever is experienced, exactly as experienced—the focus of our investigations. For a phenomenology of embodiment, this means turning to the body of direct experience in a way that is even more radical than acknowledging everyday encounters with embodied persons in the personalistic attitude. Why is it more radical? It is because in everyday practical life, we are typically occupied with things and tasks, and ignore the bodily “means whereby” we perceive things and carry out our activities. Although the “anonymity” of this tacitly functioning, everyday body becomes a key theme in existential phenomenology of the body, Husserl too was well aware of it, and it was his groundbreaking research that initially retrieved this lived body and bodily experience from its anonymity.

a. The Body as a Center of Orientation

One mode of inquiry that Husserl uses in his descriptive investigations of the body of lived experience is eidetic phenomenology. The eidetic reduction—which is the shift whereby we enter the eidetic attitude—takes whatever it is that we are experiencing as but one “example of” a particular structure or possibility. (Although Husserl speaks of “essences” in this connection, his use of the term must be distinguished both from Platonic essences and from more recent concerns with “essentialism.”) Thus, for example, as I write these words, the carrots growing in my garden are to my left; later in the day, when I have moved to a different spot in the sun, the carrots will be to my right. But in each case, what I experience is not an empty, homogeneous, mathematical space; instead, I experience lived space as an oriented space whose directional axes—left/right, above/below, in front/behind—are gauged from my own lived body as the central “here” from which all there’s are “there” and from which things are relatively “near” or “far” (right now, the lettuce is “closer to me” than the carrots). One way to refer to this invariant structural feature of embodied experiencing (of which my current relation to the plants in my garden is but one of innumerable possible variations—each of us could contribute a different example, but they would all be examples “of” the same experiential structure) is to speak of the lived body as the “nullpoint of orientation.” But Husserl’s account is more nuanced than this. Although visual experience does indeed seem to proceed from a “point” somewhere in the head, behind the eyes (so that, for example, what you can see of your nose is “in front,” what you can see of your lower lid is “below,” and so on), Husserl also refers to the bodily “here” as a whole with such expressions as “null-position” and “null-posture,” so that the structure of the experiential “center” need not be point-like. And in exploring, say, the underside of my own chin and jaw with my hand, I may find that I am living in the touching hand as the functional center of orientation and experiencing what I am touching as being “above” this hand. Like all descriptive phenomenological claims, the latter claim—namely, that the functional center of orientation can vary from the central “point” from which vision proceeds—is an invitation to consult the relevant experiential evidence for yourself; is the example I have mentioned a possibility that you can actualize? Can you “find” it, experientially, immediately … or does this structure of experience only emerge after a while, or in a different way? Spiegelberg (1966/1986/2004), for example, explores further experiential variations concerning the lived location of the embodied “center” of experiencing, and more descriptive work on this theme (especially work carried out by phenomenologists of diverse cultural backgrounds) would be welcome.

b. Distinctive Bodily Sensations

However, the lived body is more than a tacit “zero,” an abiding “here” from which spatial dimensions of perception and action unfold; it is not an abstract or empty center, but a filled one, with its own familiar feel, for to be embodied is to experience certain sorts of sensations as “mine” in a unique way. In some passages, Husserl replaces the usual German term for sensations—Empfindungen—with a new term, “Empfindnisse” (translated as “feelings” or “sensings”). Such distinctive sensitivities may be collectively referred to as the “somaesthetic” dimension of experience, including, for example, sensations felt in our bodily depths as well as on our bodily surfaces, and encompassing many nuances beyond “pleasure” and “pain.” But one of Husserl’s most important examples is tactile contact: when you touch my body, you are touching me, and I feel it. Sometimes one and the same episode of touching can be experienced in a double way: I might, for example, be exploring a small sculpture with my fingers, intent on its contours, textures, variations in temperature, and so on, or I can continue to palpate the object, but shift to an experiential attitude focused on sensing myself in contact with it precisely here, in exactly this way—retrieving the “bodily” side of my embodied commerce with the thing. Or I myself can furnish both sides of the example, touching one hand with the other (an example of Husserl’s to which Merleau-Ponty accords great importance). Here it becomes clear not only that my own body can be given to me both as the organ and as the object of touch—both as the means whereby the activity of touching is carried out, and as the phenomenon I experience through this activity (for example, the contours and textures I can feel on the surface of my touched hand)—but also that the same touched hand that is the object explored by the touching hand is itself alive to this contact, feeling it subjectively, so that I am living in this hand too as “mine.” In this connection the term “lived” body may connote a certain “undergoing,” emphasizing “affectivity” (being affected) rather than “activity” (although both are important for Husserl, who routinely mentions them together in his later research manuscripts).

c. Movement and the “I Can”

Nevertheless, actions too are “mine” (albeit in a qualitatively different way than the immediate bodily feelings of contact, pleasure, pain, warmth, cold, and so forth, are). And along with the body’s role as the center of orientation and its unique somaesthetic sensations, Husserl also emphasizes bodily motility—the capability for self-movement per se—as an essential feature of embodiment. “Being able to move” is the foundation for any specific bodily “I do” and for what he typically terms the bodily “I can” (which can be experienced as such even without actually performing the movement concerned—for instance, one can find the lived consciousness, “I can nod my head,” without actually doing it, experiencing it instead as a practical possibility given in the sheer “I could”). The range of the “I can” is enriched when I cultivate my capabilities or learn new skills, although as I have already indicated, it may also be temporarily eroded or permanently truncated in cases of illness or injury, so that the “I can” becomes an “I cannot.” For Husserl, however, the lived experience of embodied motility goes far beyond movement that is actively initiated by the I: there are also movements such as breathing, which normally goes on without my active intervention, yet can indeed be deliberately altered to some extent. Husserl therefore speaks of all such bodily movement as pertaining to the I in a broad sense that encompasses, but also includes more than, the active, awake I. For example, habitual movement patterns such as playing a familiar piece on the piano can indeed proceed without my explicit, moment by moment direction, yet are still lived as “mine,” and although they may often remain marginal, they can also be informed with awareness—or with a kind of “active allowing,” as when I lend them my “fiat” and am consciously letting the movement unfold. Thus here motility is a broader concept than agency in the strict sense whereby an “agent” would be actively, explicitly involved in initiating and directing the action throughout.

5. Kinaesthetic Consciousness


Summary: Husserl describes the articulation of kinaesthetic capabilities into coordinated systems of specific movement possibilities; outlines the “if-then” structure through which actualizing certain kinaesthetic possibilities brings coherent fields of appearances to givenness; suggests how a different “if-then” structure—one linking the deployment of my own kinaesthetic capability with the bodily feel of the movement concerned—is implicated in coming to experience other moving bodies as other sentient beings “like me”; and addresses the tension between “embodiment” as an ongoing dynamic, subjective process and the “body” as one object among others in the world.

Husserl devotes considerable attention to the theme of motility, and sketching out some of this work in more detail will allow us to see how his descriptive phenomenological work on embodiment fits into the larger philosophical context of his constitutive phenomenology (recalling that here “constitution” ultimately refers to the correlations between that which is experienced and the relevant performances and achievements of “consciousness” or “subjectivity”). Here a distinction given terminological form by one of Husserl’s assistants, Ludwig Landgrebe (1902–1991), is particularly helpful: that between the body-as-constituted and the body-as-constituting. The body-as-constituted is the body as experienced, that is, it is “that which” is experienced in the experience; the body-as-constituting is the experiencing body “by means of which” something is experienced. And for Husserl, this embodied, experiencing subjectivity (the body-as-constituting) is above all a kinaesthetic consciousness (Claesges 1964)—not as a consciousness “of” movement, but as a consciousness or subjectivity capable of movement.

a. Systems of Kinaesthetic Capabilities

Thus Husserl’s recourse to “kinaestheses” does not refer to “sense data” (for example, sensations pertaining to muscles or joints) postulated as “ingredients” of perceptual experience (for instance, of my own limbs given to me as material objects moving in space), but to the sheer experience of the subjective capability for movement per se (including the “I could” already mentioned) and to its organization into kinaesthetic systems, each with its own (multidimensional) leeway of movement possibilities. For example, in visual perception, the movement of the eyes alone forms one system; head movement affords a second system; the possibilities of rotating one’s entire body on the spot counts as a third system; and locomotor movement (for instance, walking) adds yet another system. When I turn to the left to look for the bird in the birdbath, my eye, head, and torso movements are typically vectorially combined into one integrated gesture. Turning my head allows me to see farther to my left than if eye movements alone were involved, and turning my torso expands my view beyond what eye and head movements can offer together—but whatever combination of eye, head, and torso movements is swung into play when I hear the splash in the birdbath, “turning to the left” will eventually allow me to bring what initially appeared only at (or beyond) the left-hand periphery of the visual field into the center of the field. Kinaesthetic systems can also stand in for one another—if my arms are full, I may hold the door open with my hip or acknowledge a friend’s wave with a gesture of my head rather than my hand. In this way the interarticulated kinaesthetic systems work together as one total kinaesthetic system whose multifarious possibilities of coordination typically take on the more circumscribed form of a habitual repertoire of familiar movement possibilities and customary ways to move.

Even within this more limited leeway, however, motility is characterized by a certain essential freedom that can be contrasted with the physical motion of spatial objects. This by no means implies complete freedom in every case—once I jump off the diving board, it is too late to change my mind, and I am headed for the water, since—unlike a bird—I have no way to fly back up into the sky. But the lived motility in which kinaesthetic consciousness holds sway is more typically experienced as reversible: having turned my head to the left, I can turn it back to the right; having extended my hand, I can withdraw it; having gone in one direction, I can retrace my steps. Moreover, the lived movement can be not only reversed, but repeated, interrupted, and inhibited; for Husserl, even “holding still” is a dynamic event, since it involves ongoingly maintaining a certain kinaesthetic “constellation” or “situation.”

b. Kinaesthetic Capabilities and Perceptual Appearances

Such descriptions retrieve kinaesthetic functioning from its anonymity, but remain abstract as long as its constitutive role is not specified more precisely. For example, enacting certain kinaesthetic possibilities brings certain correlative perceptual appearances to givenness in a concordant, regulated, non-arbitrary manner. “From here” I can see “this side” of the house, but this side already promises more, a situation for which Husserl uses the technical terms “inner horizon” and “outer horizon.” The current appearance of this side points to an inner horizon of possible future perceptions in which this very same side would itself be more fully given—for instance, if I were to move closer, then it could be touched as well as seen, or what is currently seen indistinctly could be seen in more detail, and so on. But “this” side of the building also points to an outer horizon of possible future perceptions of other “sides,” as well as further features of the surroundings, including currently unseen sides of other objects in the background, and so on.

Here what is important is not merely that Husserl’s account of perception emphasizes a correlation between, on the one hand, an embodied perceiver functioning as a center of orientation and, on the other hand, the perspectivity that is the invariable mode of givenness of perceived things in space; rather, what is at stake is a coherent, explorable, transcendent, open world. In other words, it is not merely that I see things from my own standpoint: it is that my own motility is the subjective correlate both of the world’s open explorability—its transcendence “beyond” the aspect of it given at any moment—and of its concordant coherence, since if I enact the appropriate kinaesthetic sequences, then what is currently “emptily” predelineated can be “fulfilled” in itself-givenness of the anticipated side or feature concerned (or can be “disappointed” and corrected instead). For example, I see a “corner” of the house; inseparable from the experience of this as a “corner” is that there is “more” to the house to be seen “around the corner” (even if this “more” is as yet indeterminate), and “if” I move there, “then” I will see precisely this “more,” determine its features in more detail, and so forth (or perhaps discover that all that is left of the building is a facade). However, the “if-then” relation that is at stake here is not a causal one, since the correlations in question pertain to the ordered structure of experience purely as experienced, not to real relations between physical entities considered in the naturalistic attitude (an attitude that we are, of course, free to take up if we wish).

Within the phenomenological attitude, in other words, the point is not to establish causal relations between “turning my head to the left” and “seeing a birdbath”; instead, the horizon of freedom pertaining to kinaesthetic consciousness opens ordered fields of display that can be seamlessly expanded as I move, so that turning my head to the left allows the corresponding further stretch of the visible world to come into view, whatever there may in fact be for me to see in any given situation or on any given occasion. And the same fundamental correlation between kinaesthetic capabilities and coherent fields of spatial display holds good for movement in any direction, as well as for the intersensorial world. Thus the description identifies an essential structure of experience per se, rather than offering a causal explanation of a particular empirical/factual event. Moreover, it turns out that Husserl’s analyses are not confined to the kinaesthetic circumstances swung into play in experiencing individual transcendent things “in” space, but demonstrate that kinaesthetic consciousness is itself space-constituting. (Early extensive analyses are found in the 1907 lectures published in Thing and Space, but Husserl refined his account throughout his life.) This, then, is another example of a Husserlian critique of presuppositions: he does not naively assume “space” as a pregiven framework for embodied perception and action (for example, as some kind of ready-made “container”), but devotes many pages to the experiential evidence that is at stake in the givenness of various types or levels of “space,” including not only the most immediate, “preobjective” space, but the infinite and homogeneous space of the natural sciences.

c. Kinaesthetic Experience and the Experience of Others

At this point, a second set of analyses come into play, for it is a feature of lived embodiment that I cannot jump out of my own skin and walk around myself in order to survey myself from all sides: the seeing consciousness is always at the center of orientation, and although I may be able to see parts of myself from various angles, I cannot see myself as a whole, as a figure on a ground or as an object “over there” from which I could definitively move away. Instead, I function as the uncancellably abiding “here” from which space-perception invariably proceeds. This means, however, that my “solo” experience of situated motility leaves me with a “hole” in space wherever I go—a mobile but non-surveyable center around which the rest of the panorama unfolds. The constitution of a genuinely homogeneous, objective, three-dimensional space requires the contribution of others, for whom I myself am indeed “over there,” inhabiting one among many possible “there’s.”  Thus space-constitution is tied up with the Husserlian theme of intersubjectivity, which is also a key motif in his phenomenology of embodiment. Although Husserl gives various accounts of intersubjectivity, the present article pulls together some pieces of the puzzle that depend directly on his work with kinaesthetic consciousness. Note, however, that this account is not a linear account of discrete “steps” to be carried out, as though we began our existence utterly alone and only gradually discovered fellow living beings; rather, the explication furnishes a kind of “exploded diagram” of certain structural moments involved in the lived experience of recognizing embodied others—here construed broadly enough to encompass non-human as well as human cases. (Thus in the technical language of phenomenology, the “exploded diagram” account is “static,” rather than providing a “genetic” description of the origin and development of a certain type of experience as an abiding acquisition.)

For Husserl, a double dimension of “localization” of kinaestheses comes into play in this regard (always recalling that here the term “kinaesthetic” refers to motility per se, to the sheer “I can”/“I could” rather than to specific sorts of “sense data”). First of all, it is possible for at least some enactments of my own directly experienced motility to be co-given to me in the form of something perceivable in the same way as things of the world are. Thus, for example, not only can I move my own limbs, but—within limits—I can see them as moving objects in the same field of vision where other spatial things are given: subjective motility is “localized” in objectively appearing movements displaying certain distinctive styles of movement and modes of relating to the surrounding world (think, for example, of my own active/responsive hands being visible to me as I reach for an object and grasp it). Similarly, the kinaesthetic experience of speaking, singing, or crying out is paired with sounds appearing in the same audial field in which other sounds are given. (Although what I am providing here is, as I have indicated, a structural explication of intersubjectivity rather than a genetic-developmental account, it should be pointed out that in one brief passage on the mother-child relationship, Husserl emphasizes the child linking his/her own kinaesthetic capability for vocalization with certain heard sounds in the audial sphere in general—and then hearing sounds resembling these in certain respects, but without simultaneously experiencing the relevant kinaestheses, so that this contrast mediates the emerging own/other distinction.) But at the same time, enacting this or that kinaesthetic possibility (or constellation of possibilities) from the total kinaesthetic horizon yields yet another “if-then” order, above and beyond the coherent correlations discussed above whereby kinaesthetic circumstances motivate corresponding perceptual appearances. For “if” I move in a certain way, “then” even without touching myself, I can experience correlative somaesthetic sensations or sensings (Empfindnisse): kinaesthetic enactments are “localized” in corresponding patterns of felt embodiment (for instance, experiences of straining or releasing) through which my own lived body is concretely, sensuously present for me (whether marginally, as when I am immersed in something I am reading, or thematically—think, for example, of how it feels to stretch luxuriously).

To put it another way, the “mineness” of my own act of moving is linked with the “mineness” of the accompanying somaesthetic sensations, as well as with recognizable styles of externally perceivable movement. When I perceive movement in such a style, then, but without the correlative kinaesthetic consciousness (the tacit or explicit “I move”) and its accompanying patterns of felt somaesthetic localization, I experience (via what Husserl terms “passive syntheses of association”—which, however, must not be confused with “associationistic” psychological theories) another subjectivity who, like me, is a subject of both action and affection, both agency and ownership, both doing and undergoing. Thus it is not necessary to see another body that looks the same as mine in the sense of being roughly the same size, shape, and color in order to motivate the experience of recognizing the other’s subjectivity—in fact, the view of myself “from the outside” that this would require is precisely something that I can never fully have: it is a possibility that is itself motivated from the experience of the other as having his/her own point of view on me, and thus cannot serve to motivate my recognition of the other as another subjectivity in the first place. Instead, what I experience when I see the other stands at a higher degree of universality: I see a style of movement associated with certain eidetic features proper to sentient/sensitive motility per se, namely, kinaesthetic capability and somaesthetic sensibility. But exactly because these invariants are open to exemplification in so many ways, they provide the foundation for the lived experience of difference-from-the-other as well as that of similarity-with-the-other, since they are the very identity that permits the experience of “difference” here at all.

I do not, in other words, recognize others because I see them as reiterations of myself in my concrete embodiment; the I-other pairing does not consist of a model and a replica, but of two mutually contrasting variations of “embodiment per se,” only one of which I have genuinely original access to (when I pick up the heavy stone, I experience both my own effort and the stone’s resistance firsthand; seeing the other struggle with the stone, I may understand the degree of effort involved and realize that I am the stronger of the two of us, but I do not experience the other’s effort in the same direct way I experience my own, nor do I directly experience the other’s pain if the stone slips and lands on the other’s toe). Thus the other active, sentient, sensitive, relational body is not some sort of duplicate of my own body, but precisely “a” lived body lived from an experiential standpoint I myself can never inhabit, a “here” that is truly transcendent to my own precisely because I inevitably experience it as a “there” in paired contrast to my own “here.”

d. Further Philosophical Issues

So far, I have sketched out how embodiment understood as kinaesthetic consciousness functions in Husserl’s philosophical accounts of the transcendent spatial world and transcendent fellow subjectivities. Here it is not possible to flesh out these accounts in any more detail, although it can be said that for Husserl, our very openness to the world essentially involves a kinaesthetic engagement with what is most immediately, sensuously given in such a way that the genetic origins of transcendental logic itself can be traced back to these kinaesthetic capabilities and performances and their correlative sensuous “givens” (see Husserliana 11), matters he thematizes under the title of “transcendental aesthetics” (although he takes this term in a different sense than Kant’s). However, a further step must at least be touched on, one that draws upon yet another important distinction—that between the transcendental and the mundane. Husserl’s analyses of kinaesthetic consciousness assume a transcendental attitude, yet in the natural attitude, the body is—as we have seen—“obviously” a mundane reality, a part of the world. Although his earlier efforts were geared toward clarifying the philosophical foundations of the sciences that study such a reality, some of his later writings (see, for example, Husserliana 15, 282–328, 648–57) are framed as an inquiry into the experiential achievements whereby transcendental consciousness “mundanizes” itself in the first place (that is, takes itself as part of the world), even prior to “naturalizing” itself in psychophysical terms. Without going into detail about his approach to the problem (which is also known as the paradox of subjectivity—how can the very consciousness that constitutes the world simultaneously be a part of this world?), it should be emphasized that for Husserl, what is at stake is ultimately not at all how a “disembodied” consciousness could somehow acquire a “body.” Instead, after demonstrating that kinaesthetic capability is an essential structural moment of transcendental subjectivity itself, he asks how kinaesthetic consciousness as an ongoing flow of purely experiential potentialities (the possibilities of primal motility per se), and of ever-changing actualizations of these possibilities, can come to count as a mundane entity apprehended as one thing among others in the world (and here Husserl’s descriptions of the lived experience of “resistance” offer important clues). In any case, however, the Husserlian critique of presuppositions concerning the body leads to something like the possibility of transcendental corporeality—a notion that places many aspects of the Western philosophical tradition itself into question.

6. Conclusion

Recognizing the tension between the transcendental experience of embodiment as kinaesthetic consciousness (or indeed, of “consciousness” or “subjectivity” as kinaesthetic) on the one hand and the mundane experience of the body as a material, psychophysical reality on the other can now allow us to summarize two of Husserl’s most important contributions to a phenomenology of embodiment (above and beyond his pioneering descriptions of essential features of bodily subjectivity). First, taken transcendentally, embodiment is not something accomplished once and for all, but is—to borrow a telling phrase from Zaner’s The Problem of Embodiment (1964)—“a continuously on-going act”: at every moment (even during periods of relative quiescence), I am involved in a dynamic process of “embodying” that is carried out through the current actualization of my own kinaesthetic capabilities, with certain possibilities rather than others being actualized in this or that way. This is the case whether the particular kinaestheses swung into play at any given moment arise from instinctual strivings, involuntary adjustments, acquired habits, or volitionally directed free movement, and whether these patterns of kinaesthetic actualization are going completely unnoticed; are marginally present for me; are experientially prominent due to difficulty or discomfort; or are consciously appreciated in lucid awareness “from within” (note that these two sets of possibilities—one having to do with volition, the other with awareness—can intersect in a number of ways). Second, that I can apprehend myself as a “psychophysical unity” is not simply something to be naively accepted, but something to be clarified as a historical achievement whereby embodied experience is localized in a mundane object, “the body,” as one item among others in a world of material, natural realities. Thus within the natural attitude, “embodiment” winds up signifying the external expression of the inwardness always already essentially pertaining to “bodies” insofar as they are lived bodies (as opposed to mere physical things). And indeed, experiential evidence for the latter sense of “embodiment” is readily available in everyday life in our times—we immediately encounter one another as embodied persons, not as machines that we suspect or conclude must harbor minds. However, experiencing myself as an ongoing realization of my own kinaesthetic capabilities taken not “psychophysically,” but sheerly experientially (which deactivates, rather than presupposing, mind-body dualism) requires shifting from the mundane to the transcendental attitude (in Husserl’s sense of the term “transcendental”), although once this insight has been historically achieved, it too, like the achievements of naturalism, can “flow back into” everyday experience.

In the end, then, whether he is providing a phenomenological genealogy of the “psychophysical” or offering an alternative account of embodiment in terms of “kinaesthetic consciousness,” Husserl provides a powerful critique of Cartesian dualism. Nevertheless, his own interests are basically epistemological in character: the accent lies not on claims about what the body really “is,” but on the epistemic contribution of embodiment itself to our knowledge of the world in the first place (as well as on the legitimacy of the foundations of our knowledge of such matters). And as in all of his phenomenological work, Husserl does not merely “hold a position” and offer arguments to support it, but consistently and rigorously takes the ultimate court of appeal to be the experiential evidence pertaining to the phenomena themselves—evidence that continually outruns our inherited terms and concepts and requires us to place them in question.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Husserl, Edmund. Ding und Raum. Vorlesungen 1907. Ed. Ulrich Claesges. Husserliana 16. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973; Thing and Space: Lectures of 1907. Trans. Richard Rojcewicz. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997, Sections IV–VI (129–245).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Zweites Buch. Phänomenologische Untersuchungen zur Konstitution [1912]. Ed. Marly Biemel. Husserliana 4. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1952; Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. Second Book. Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution. Trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989, especially §§18a–b (60–70), §§36–42 (152–69), §§59–60a (266–77), et passim.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie. Drittes Buch. Die Phänomenologie und die Fundamente der Wissenschaften [1912]. Ed. Marly Biemel. Husserliana 5. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1952; Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. Third Book. Phenomenology and the Foundations of the Sciences. Trans. Ted E. Klein and William E. Pohl. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1980, §2 (4–9); Supplement I, §4 (103–12).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Analysen zur passiven Synthesis. Aus Vorlesungs- und Forschungsmanuskripten 1918–1926. Ed. Margot Fleischer. Husserliana 11. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966; Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Trans. Anthony J. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001, §3 (47–53); “Perception and its Process of Self-Giving,” §2 (581–88); Appendix 25 (534–36).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Phänomenologische Psychologie. Vorlesungen Sommersemester 1925. Ed. Walter Biemel. Husserliana 9. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1962, Beilage VIII (“Die somatologische Struktur der objektiven Welt,” 390–95, not translated);Phenomenological Psychology: Lectures, Summer Semester, 1925. Trans. John Scanlon. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1977, §15 (79–83), §21 (99–101), §39 (150–53).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Cartesianische Meditationen [1931] und Pariser Vorträge. Ed. Stephan Strasser. Husserliana 1. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1950; Cartesian Meditations: An Introduction to Phenomenology. Trans. Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1960, Fifth Meditation, especially §44 (92–99), §§51–56 (112–31).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzendentale Phänomenologie. Eine Einleitung in die phänomenologische Philosophie [1936]. Ed. Walter Biemel. Husserliana 6. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1954; The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1970, §28 (103–11), §47 (161–64), §62 (215–19).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Erster Teil: 1905–1920; Zweiter Teil: 1921–1928; Dritter Teil: 1929–1935. Ed. Iso Kern. Husserliana 13, 14, 15. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973, passim.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Transzendentaler Idealismus. Texte aus dem Nachlass (1908–1921). Ed. Robin D. Rollinger with Rochus Sowa. Husserliana 36. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2003, Text Nr. 7 (132–45), Text Nr. 9 (151–66).
  • Husserl, Edmund. Die Lebenswelt. Auslegungen der vorgegebenen Welt und ihrer Konstitution. Texte aus dem Nachlass (1916–1937). Ed. Rochus Sowa. Husserliana 39. Dordrecht: Springer, 2008, especially Part IX (603–672).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Behnke, Elizabeth A. “Edmund Husserl’s Contribution to Phenomenology of the Body in Ideas II” [1989]. Rpt. in Issues in Husserl’s “Ideas II.” Ed. Thomas Nenon and Lester Embree. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1996, 135–60; rev. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 235–64 [includes further references to work in this area].
  • Bernet, Rudolf, Iso Kern, and Eduard Marbach. Edmund Husserl. Darstellung seines Denkens [1989]. 2nd rev. ed. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1996; An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1993, Chapter 4, §3 (“The Kinaesthetic Motivation in the Constitution of Thing and Space,” 130–40, 259–60); Chapter 5, §2 (“Our Experience of the Other,” 154–65, 261–62).
  • Claesges, Ulrich. Edmund Husserls Theorie der Raumkonstitution. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1964, Parts II and III (55–144) [includes significant citations on lived body and kinaesthetic consciousness from Husserl’s D manuscripts].
  • Depraz, Natalie. Lucidité du corps. De l’empirisme transcendantal en phénoménologie. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Dodd, James. Idealism and Corporeity: An Essay on the Problem of the Body in Husserl’s Phenomenology. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997.
  • Mohanty, J. N. “Intentionality and the Mind/Body Problem.” In Organism, Medicine, and Metaphysics: Essays in Honor of Hans Jonas. Ed. Stuart F. Spicker. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1978, 283–300; rpt. in his The Possibility of Transcendental Philosophy. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1985, 121–38; rpt. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 316–32.
  • Sawicki, Marianne. Body, Text, and Science: The Literacy of Investigative Practices and the Phenomenology of Edith Stein. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997, Chapter 2, D (“Nature and Intellect in Ideen II,” 73–89); Chapter 4, B, 1 (“Stein’s work for Husserl,” 153–65).
  • Seebohm, Thomas M. Hermeneutics: Method and Methodology. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2004, §12 (“The givenness of the other living body and animal understanding,” 98–105).
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “On the Motility of the Ego.” In Conditio Humana: Erwin W. Straus on his 75th birthday. Ed. Walter von Baeyer and Richard M. Griffith. Berlin: Springer-Verlag, 1966, 289–306; rpt., with Postscript 1978, in Spiegelberg, Steppingstones toward an Ethics for Fellow Existers: Essays 1944–1983. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1986, 65–86; rpt. in Phenomenology: Critical Concepts in Philosophy. Ed. Dermot Moran and Lester E. Embree with Tanja Staehler and Elizabeth A. Behnke. Volume 2. Phenomenology: Themes and Issues. London: Routledge, 2004, 217–34.
  • Ströker, Elisabeth. Philosophische Untersuchungen zum Raum. Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1965; Investigations in Philosophy of Space. Trans. Algis Mickunas. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press, 1987, Part One (“Lived Space,” 13–172).
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Husserl’s Phenomenology of the Body.” Études Phénoménologiques No. 19 (1994), 63–84.
  • Zaner, Richard M. The Problem of Embodiment: Some Contributions to a Phenomenology of the Body. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1964, 249–61, 287–89.


Author Information

Elizabeth A. Behnke
Email: sppb@openaccess.org
U. S. A.