The Indeterminacy of Translation and Radical Interpretation

The indeterminacy of translation is the thesis that translation, meaning, and reference are all indeterminate: there are always alternative translations of a sentence and a term, and nothing objective in the world can decide which translation is the right one. This is a skeptical conclusion because what it really implies is that there is no fact of the matter about the correct translation of a sentence and a term. It would be an illusion to think that there is a unique meaning which each sentence possesses and a determinate object to which each term refers.

Arguments in favor of the indeterminacy thesis first appear in the influential works of W. V. O. Quine, especially in his discussion of radical translation. Radical translation focuses on a translator who has been assigned to translate the utterances of a speaker speaking a radically unknown language. She is required to accomplish this task solely by observing the behavior of the speaker and the happenings in the environment. Quine claims that a careful study of such a process reveals that there can be no determinate and uniquely correct translation, meaning, and reference for any linguistic expression. As a result, our traditional understanding of meaning and reference is to be thrown away. Quine’s most famous student, Donald Davidson, develops this scenario under the title of “radical interpretation.” Among other differences, radical interpretation is distinguished from Quine’s radical translation with regard to its concentration on an interpreter constructing a theory of meaning for the speaker’s language. Such a theory is supposed to systematically entail the meaning of the speaker’s sentences. Nonetheless, radical interpretation too cannot resist the emergence of indeterminacy. According to the thesis of the indeterminacy of interpretation, there always will be rival interpretations of the speaker’s language, and no objective criterion can decide which interpretation is to be chosen as the right one.

These views of Quine and Davidson have been well received by analytic philosophers particularly because of their anti-Cartesian approach to knowledge. This approach says knowledge of what we mean by our sentences and what we believe about the external world, other minds, and even ourselves cannot be grounded in any infallible a priori knowledge; instead, we are rather bound to study this knowledge from a third-person point of view, that is, from the standpoint of others who are attempting to understand what we mean and believe. What the indeterminacy of translation/interpretation adds to this picture is that there can never be one unique, correct way of determining what these meanings and beliefs are.

The article begins with Quine’s arguments for the indeterminacy of translation, then introduces Davidson’s treatment of indeterminacy by focusing on his semantic project and the scenario of radical interpretation. Then the discussion turns to David Lewis’s version of radical interpretation, Daniel Dennett’s intentional stance, and the way Lewis and Dennett treat the indeterminacy of interpretation.

Table of Contents

  1. Quine’s Naturalized Epistemology and Physicalism
    1. Quine’s Naturalism
    2. Quine’s Physicalism
  2. Quine’s Arguments for the Indeterminacy of Translation
    1. Quine’s Radical Translation Scenario
    2. The Argument from Below: The Inscrutability of Reference
    3. The Argument from Above: The Indeterminacy of Translation
      1. Confirmational Holism and Underdetermination
      2. Underdetermination and Indeterminacy
  3. Davidson’s Semantic Project
    1. Davidson’s Use of Tarski’s Truth-Theory
    2. Davidson’s Radical Interpretation Scenario
  4. Davidson on the Indeterminacy of Interpretation
  5. Lewis on Radical Interpretation
    1. Lewis’s Constraints on Radical Interpretation
    2. Lewis on the Indeterminacy of Interpretation
      1. Putnam’s Model-Theoretic Argument and Lewis’s Reference Magnetism
  6. Dennett’s Intentional Stance
    1. Indeterminacy and the Intentional Stance
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Quine’s Naturalized Epistemology and Physicalism

Quine has famously argued that the reference of any language’s term and the meaning of any language’s sentence is indeterminate. When a speaker uses terms like “rabbit”, “tree”, and “rock”, it can never be settled to what specific object she is referring.When she utters “that’s a rabbit”, “that’s a tree”, “tigers are fast”, and the like, it will always remain indeterminate what she really means by them. These claims can be called the “skeptical conclusions” of Quine’s arguments for the indeterminacy of translation.

The first preliminary point to note is that this sort of skepticism is not epistemological but constitutive. Quine’s claim will not be that it is difficult to know what someone means by her words, or that we may lack the sort of epistemic powers, skills, or tools required to ascertain such meanings. His claim is that there is no determinate meaning and reference to know at all: there is no fact as to what a sentence means and what a term refers to. This is what Quine means by the claim that meaning and reference are indeterminate.

Quine has two famous arguments for these conclusions: (1) the argument from below, which is also called the argument for the “inscrutability of reference”, “indeterminacy of reference” and “ontological relativity” (Quine 1970), and (2) the “argument from above”, which is also called the argument for the “indeterminacy of translation” (Quine 1970) or “holophrastic indeterminacy” (Quine 1990a).  The two arguments are discussed below after first considering the grounds on which Quine builds his arguments since the arguments rely on a variety of important positions, among which Quine’s version of naturalism is significant.

a. Quine’s Naturalism

According to Quinean naturalism, there is no such thing as first philosophy which, independently of natural science, can offer unquestionable knowledge of the world; rather, philosophy is to be viewed as continuous with science, especially physics (Quine,1981). On this view, we are bound to investigate the world, human beings included, from the standpoint of our best scientific theory. In our study of the world, we should take a “third-person” point of view rather than a Foundationalist Cartesian one. The Cartesian position advocates a priori and infallible knowledge, on the basis of which our knowledge of the external world and other minds can be established. Something is knowable a priori if it can be known independently of any specific experience of the external world, and such knowledge is infallible if it is immune to doubt or uncertainty. For Descartes, such knowledge cannot be dependent on, or inferred from, science because science relies on what we can perceive via our senses, and we can never trust our senses: they can deceive us. The Cartesian view, therefore, looks for a source of knowledge that is free from such doubts. Quine, especially in his famous article “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (Quine 1951), argues that any hope of finding such an a priori basis for knowledge is illusory because, among other reasons, the analytic/synthetic distinction cannot be preserved.

Analytic statements are traditionally held to be true in virtue of the meaning of their constituent parts. Anyone who knows English and thus knows what “bachelor” and “unmarried” mean would know that the sentence “bachelors are unmarried” is true. Synthetic statements (such as “it’s raining”) are those which are true not solely on the basis of the meaning of their terms, but also on the basis of what goes on in the world. Many philosophers believed that if a statement is analytic, it is also necessarily true, and what it expresses is knowable a priori. In “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, Quine argues that there is no non-circular way of defining the notion of analyticity. If so, what then does form the bedrock of our knowledge of the world? Quine’s answer is natural science.

This is part of what provides Quine with enough reason to call his philosophy “naturalistic”. If epistemology is defined as the study of knowledge, then Quine insists that epistemology must be naturalized: it must follow the methods of science (Quine 1969b). However, what does a scientist do? A scientist investigates the connection between her theory and the (sensory) evidence or data she collects from the world. She makes observations, forms hypotheses about the future behavior of certain objects or the occurrence of future events, and checks whether they are supported by further evidence. Investigating the link between evidence and theory, and the support the latter can receive from the former, is the best we can do in our study of a subject matter. We can never stand outside of our theory and survey the world; we are bound to work from within (Quine 1981). Philosophers interested in the study of reality, knowledge, morality, mind, meaning, translation, and so forth, have no choice but to proceed in the same way, that is, to explore the link between the relevant flow of evidence and their best (scientific) theory about them. This explains why Quine is also called a “physicalist”.

b. Quine’s Physicalism

Quine’s view of physicalism has changed during his philosophical career. The clearest characterization of it has been offered by Quine himself: “Nothing happens in the world … without some redistribution of microphysical states” (Quine 1981, 98). According to this view, in the absence of some relevant physical change, there can be no real change in any subject matter. Let’s use the notion of “facts of the matter”. Our scientific theory of the world works if the world can be viewed as consisting in specific things, that is, if there are certain facts of the matter about them. For instance, the theory works if there are molecules, electrons, trees, neutrinos, and so forth; it tells us that molecules have certain features, move in such and such a way, and are made of such and such elements. Quine’s physicalism implies that facts about any subject matter are to be fixed by the totality of such facts about the world, and the totality of facts about world is fixed by our choice of a total theory of the world. For example, if one claims that temperature is real, and thus there are facts about temperature, such facts are to be determined once the relevant physical facts are fixed, which are, in this case, facts about molecules’ average kinetic energy at a certain time. According to Quine’s physicalism, we can legitimately talk about facts about temperature because once we know the amount of molecules’ average kinetic energy, we know all there is to know about temperature. In this sense, the physical facts have fixed the facts about temperature. Therefore, we can characterize Quine’s physicalism as the view implying that either the totality of physical facts determines the facts about a subject matter, or there is simply no fact about that subject matter at all. This view will play a vital role in Quine’s arguments for the indeterminacy of translation.

One of our most central questions in the philosophy of language concerns what determines the meaning of a linguistic expression. We can already guess that, for Quine, any answer to this question must be offered from a naturalistic point of view. We should see what science can tell us about our linguistic practices, especially that of meaning something by an expression. The indeterminacy of translation arises from such a Quinean way of treating the questions about meaning and reference.

2. Quine’s Arguments for the Indeterminacy of Translation

For the moment, assume that Quine can successfully establish the skeptical conclusion that there is no fact of the matter about the correct translation of any expression. When we talk about translating terms, we talk about pairing two terms which have the same reference. For instance, if you look at a standard German to English dictionary, you can find “snow” is the translation of the German word “Schnee”. Both of these terms refer to a certain sort of thing: snow. Moreover, when we talk about translation in the case of sentences, we talk about the process of pairing two sentences, such as “snow is white” and “Der Schnee ist weiss”, in terms of having the same meaning. But, if neither “snow is white” nor “Der Schnee ist weiss” can be said to have any determinate meaning, it follows that we cannot say that one is the correct translation of the other simply because there is no such thing as one unique meaning that they share, and vice versa, that is, if none can be said to be the correct translation of the other, there is then no unique meaning which can be claimed to be shared by them. This shows that meaning can be studied in terms of translation. If Quine can lead us to skepticism about the existence of correct translations, he has thereby led us to skepticism about the existence of determinate meanings.

Quine invites us to consider the way in which we learn our first language. Through such a process, we learn how to use our language’s terms correctly, especially “Mama”, “Milk”, “Fire” and so on, which can be treated as one-word sentences. We gradually become competent in detecting different parts of sentences and understanding how these parts can be put together to form more complex expressions. We finally gain mastery of the use of our language so that others in our speech-community can treat us as reliable users of it. Quine thinks that, instead of talking about such a complex process of learning a first language, we can “less abstractly and more realistically” talk about translation (Quine 1960, 27). Imagine that a translator finds herself in the middle of Amazon Jungle and faces a member of a tribe nearby whose language is entirely unknown to her. In order to start communicating with this native speaker, she should start translating his utterances. For each expression in the native’s language, she should find an expression in her own language which has the same meaning: she starts making a dictionary for that language. Since the language is radically unknown, our translator is called a “radical translator”.

a. Quine’s Radical Translation Scenario

Imagine that where our radical translator and the native meet, a rabbit scurries by, and the native utters “Gavagai”. The translator treats “Gavagai” as a one-word sentence. Considering the presence of the rabbit and the native’s response, the translator writes down “Lo, a rabbit” as the hypothetical translation of “Gavagai”. Her reason is this: in a similar situation, she would utter “Lo, a rabbit”. This translation is currently only hypothetical because one observation alone would not be enough for the translator to decide whether “Lo, a rabbit” is the correct translation of “Gavagai”. She continues checking this hypothetical translation with further evidence. For instance, suppose that she has been successful in detecting that the native’s word “Evet” corresponds to “Yes” and “York” corresponds to “No”. Suppose again that a different rabbit with a different color is observable and the translator points to it and asks: “Gavagai?” Assume that the native responds by “Evet”. In this situation, Quine says that the native assents to “Gavagai” in the presence of the rabbit. On a different occasion, an owl is present and the translator asks the same question “Gavagai?” The native responds by “York” this time. In this situation, the native dissents from “Gavagai”.

The native’s behavioral responses, that is, his assent to, or dissent from, a sentence on specific occasions, are pivotal for Quine’s project because they form the “evidential basis” for translation. For two reasons the translator cannot have access to anything more than this sort of evidence. First of all, the native’s language is radically unknown to the translator: she has no prior information whatsoever about what the native’s words mean and what the native believes. This by itself puts a considerable limitation on the sort of evidence available to her. Secondly, Quine was a physicalist. For Quine, physicalism, in the case of translation, manifests itself in a sort of behaviorism. The reason is that the relevant physical facts about translation are facts about the observable behavior of the speaker, that is, the native’s assents and dissents. To be more precise, the translator can appeal only to the native’s dispositions to verbal behavior. As Quine famously puts it, “there is nothing in linguistic meaning…beyond what is to be gleaned from overt behavior in observable circumstances” (Quine 1987, 5). Therefore, when Quine talks about “evidence”, he talks about behavioral evidence, and when he talks about “facts”, he talks about the native’s observable behavior.

Suppose that the translator, after making several observations, has become confident that “Lo, a rabbit” is to be considered as the correct translation of “Gavagai”. Another important notion is introduced by Quine at this point. We can now say that “Gavagai” and “Lo, a rabbit” are stimulus synonymous, or have the same stimulus meaning (Quine 1990a). The claim that “Gavagai” and “Lo, a rabbit” have the same stimulus meaning is equivalent to the claim that what prompts the native to assent to (or dissent from) “Gavagai” also prompts the translator to assent to (or dissent from) “Lo, a rabbit”.  What causes the native to assent to “Gavagai” and the translator to assent to “Lo, a rabbit” is the presence of a rabbit. Therefore, the stimulus meaning of “Gavagai” is the set of all the stimulations which prompt the native to assent to, or dissent from, “Gavagai”. Similarly, the stimulus meaning of “Lo, a rabbit” is the set of all the stimulations which cause the translator to assent to, or dissent from, “Lo, a rabbit”. Since the stimulations were the same in this case, that is, the presence of a rabbit, we can conclude that “Gavagai” and “Lo, a rabbit” have the same stimulus meaning. But why does Quine talk about stimulations, rather than objects? Instead of talking about rabbit stimulations, one may complain, he could simply say that rabbits prompt the native to assent to “Gavagai”.

Quine’s insistence on treating stimulations rather than objects as central has its roots in his adherence to naturalism. For him, what is scientifically worth considering about meaning and reference is the pattern of stimulations since, as Quine puts it, “it is a finding of natural science itself, however fallible, that our information about the world comes only through impacts on our sensory receptors” (Quine 1990a, 19). What science tells us, in this case, is that the native and the translator, via observing the rabbit in view, would have a visual stimulation, or some “pattern of chromatic irradiation of the eye” (Quine 1960, 31). For Quine, we can assume that the native would be prompted to assent to “Gavagai” by the same irradiations which prompt the translator to assent to “Lo, a rabbit”. Even if we linguists wanted to talk about the rabbit itself, we had no other way but to rely on what our sensory receptors receive from touching it, seeing it, and the like.

Having reviewed the scenario of radical translation, consider Quine’s first argument for indeterminacy, that is, his argument for the inscrutability of reference.

b. The Argument from Below: The Inscrutability of Reference

With the notion of stimulus meaning at hand, we can introduce Quine’s more technical notion of “observation sentences”, which also has an important role to play in his arguments. Our radical translator starts her translation by focusing on the native’s sentences which are about the immediate happenings in the world. Quine calls sentences like “Lo, a rabbit”, “it’s raining”, “that’s a tree”, and the like, “observation sentences.” Observation sentences themselves belong to the category of “occasion sentences”, the sentences that are true on some occasions and false on others. For instance, the sentence “it’s raining” as uttered by the speaker at time t is true if it is raining around her at t. The truth-value of occasion sentences, that is, their truth or falsity, depends on whether the speaker is prompted to assent to, or dissent from, them on specific occasions. Thus, the stimulus meaning of occasion sentences is highly sensitive to the occasion of speech and may change with regard to some additional information the speaker may receive. (On the contrary, “standing sentences” are much less sensitive to the occasion of speech, such as “rabbits are animals”.) Observation sentences are those occasion sentences which are more stable with regard to their stimulus meaning, in the sense that almost all members of a speech-community can be said to have more or less similar dispositions to assent to, or dissent from, them on specific occasions. Our translator is primarily concerned with translating the native’s observation sentences. Her aim is to match the native’s observation sentences, such as “Gavagai”, with the observation sentences of her own language, such as “Lo, a rabbit”, by way of discovering whether these sentences have the same stimulus meaning, that is, whether the native’s and the translator’s assents to, or dissents from, them are prompted by the same sort of stimulations. To simplify the example, assume that the native utters “Yo, gavagai”.

Quine’s principal question is this: Given that “Yo, gavagai” and “Lo, a rabbit” have the same stimulus meaning, would this fact justify claiming that the terms “gavagai” and “rabbit” are the correct translations of one another? Quine’s answer is negative. One term is the correct translation of another if both refer to the same thing, or if both have the same reference. But, as Quine argues, the fact that “Yo, gavagai” and “Lo, a rabbit” are stimulus synonymous cannot show that the native’s term “gavagai” and the translator’s term “rabbit” have the same referent. In order to see why, imagine that there is a second translator translating the observation sentences of another member of the native tribe. Suppose that when, for the first time, the native utters “Yo, gavagai” in the presence of a rabbit, our second translator, before writing down “Lo, a rabbit” as the translation of “Yo, gavagai”, hesitates for a moment. Having taken into account the cultural and other differences between him and the native, he decides to take “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part” as his hypothetical translation of “Yo, gavagai”, on the basis of the idea that, perhaps, the natives believe that there are only particulars in the world, not whole objects. The translator thinks that he would have assented to “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part” if he had had such a belief about the world. Our translator, however, does not need to be worried because if he is wrong, he will soon find some evidence to the contrary leading him to throw away such a hypothetical translation and replace it with “Lo, a rabbit”. He goes on, just like our first translator, and checks the native’s assents and dissents with regard to “Yo, gavagai” on different occasions.

The problem is that the same sort of evidence which led our first translator to translate “Yo, gavagai” into “Lo, a rabbit”, equally well supports the second translator’s translation, “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part”. The reason is simple: whenever a rabbit is present, an undetached rabbit-part (such as its ear) is also present. The problem becomes worse once we realize that there can be an infinite number of such alternative translations, such as “Lo, another manifestation of rabbithood”, “Lo, a rabbit time-slice”, and so forth. All such translations are mutually incompatible but are compatible with all evidence there is with regard to the native’s verbal behavior. Nothing in the native’s assents to “Yo, gavagai” in the presence of rabbits can discriminate between such rival translations. The two translators have come up with different dictionaries, that is, different sets of translations of the native’s terms, in each of which a different translation has been offered for the native’s term “gavagai”. In one, it has been suggested that “gavagai” refers to what “rabbit” refers to because, for the first translator, “Lo, a rabbit” and “Yo, gavagai” have the same stimulus meaning. In another, it has been suggested that “gavagai” stands for what “an undetached rabbit-part” refers to because “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part” and “Yo, gavagai” have the same stimulus meaning. Which of these translations is to be chosen as the correct one? To which object does “gavagai” refer after all?

Quine famously claims that there is no objective basis for deciding which translation is right and which is wrong. There are indefinitely many mutually different translations of a term, which are compatible with all possible facts about stimulus meaning. “Yo, gavagai”, “Lo, a rabbit”, “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part”, and so on, are all stimulus synonymous. And obviously such facts do not suffice to determine the reference of the term “gavagai”: all the stimulations which prompt the native to assent to “Yo, gavagai” prompt assent to “Lo, a rabbit”, “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part”, and so forth. This implies that for “gavagai” there can be indefinitely many referents, and there would be nothing objective on the basis of which we can determine which one is the real referent of “gavagai”. As a result, the reference of the native’s term “gavagai” becomes inscrutable. Also, since the same problem can potentially arise for any term in any language, reference is inscrutable in general.

To see why this conclusion is skeptical, recall Quine’s physicalism: either the physical facts fix the semantic facts by picking out one unique translation of the native’s term as the correct one, or they fail to fix such semantic facts, in which case it should be concluded that there are no such facts at all. The physical facts, in the case of translation, were the facts about the native’s assents and dissents, and they failed to determine the reference of the term “gavagai”. There is, therefore, no fact as to what a term refers to. Again, this sort of skepticism is not epistemological: the claim is not that there is a hidden fact within the physical facts which, if we had the epistemic power to discover it, would solve our problem. Quine’s claim has rather an ontological consequence: since it remains forever indeterminate to what things in the world people refer by their terms, it is entirely indeterminate how they slice the world. This is the reason why the inscrutability of reference leads to “ontological relativity”: it would never be determinate whether, for the native, the world consists in whole enduring rabbits or only rabbit-parts.

This argument has been subject to various criticisms. Most of them target the “gavagai” example, but Quine does not think that such criticisms succeed. For instance, many may think that the solution to the above indeterminacy problem is simple: Why not simply ask the native? Assume that we have found out how to translate the native’s words for “is the same as”. The problem will be solved if the linguist points to the rabbit’s ear and simultaneously to the rabbit’s foot and asks the native, “Is this gavagai the same as that gavagai?” If the native responds positively by “Evet”, then “gavagai” refers to the whole rabbit because the rabbit’s ear and the rabbit’s foot are two different rabbit-parts. Quine’s response is that you simply begged the question by presupposing that the translation of the native’s expression for “is the same as” (whatever it is in the native’s language) is determinate. But, what if its translation be “is part of the same rabbit”? In this case, when we asked, “Is this gavagai the same as that gavagai?”, what we were asking was: “Is this gavagai part of the same rabbit as that gavagai?” The native’s previous positive response is now compatible with the assumption that by “gavagai” the native refers to an undetached rabbit-part because the ear and the foot are indeed parts of the same rabbit.

For Quine, the problem is deeper than this: the “gavagai” example has been just a convenient way of putting it. Nonetheless, many philosophers of language have found this response unconvincing. There is an interesting debate about it between the proponents and the opponents of Quine’s argument from below. To mention some of the most famous ones, Gareth Evans (Evans 1975) and Jerry Fodor (Fodor 1993, 58-79) have attempted to modify and push the general sort of objection introduced above. Mark Richard (Richard 1997) and especially Christopher Hookway (Hookway 1988, 151-155) have argued that Quine is right in his claim that this strategy would inevitably fail because we can always offer alternative translations of the native’s terms which remain compatible with any such modifications. Although these alternative translations may seem too complex, odd, or unnatural, what would prevent us from taking the native to believe in them?

c. The Argument from Above: The Indeterminacy of Translation

Having been disappointed with such debates about his “gavagai” example, Quine claimed that, for those who have not been satisfied with the argument from below, he has a very different, broader, and deeper argument: the “argument from above”. It is this second argument that Quine prefers to call his argument for “the indeterminacy of translation” (Quine 1970). One reason is that his previous argument for the inscrutability of reference at most results in the conclusion that there are always alternative translations of the native’s sentences because facts about stimulus meaning cannot fix the reference of sub-sentential parts of the sentences. The truth-value of the sentences, however, remains the same since if “Lo, a rabbit” is true because of the dispositions to assent to, or dissent from, it in the presence of a rabbit, then “Lo, an undetached rabbit-part” would also be true on the same basis. Quine argues that there can be rival translations of the native’s whole sentences such that the same sentence can be true in one and false in another.

The argument from above rests on the thesis of the “underdetermination of theory by evidence” and its relation to the indeterminacy thesis. Quine’s argument can have a very simple characterization: insofar as a theory is underdetermined by evidence, the translation of the theory is also indeterminate. In an even simpler way, Quine’s claim is that underdetermination together with physicalism results in the indeterminacy of translation. Contrary to its simple characterization, however, the argument is more complex than the argument from below because it is not based on any interesting example by which the argument can be established step by step; it is rather based on much theoretical discussion. To begin with, what does Quine mean by “underdetermination of theory by evidence”?

i. Confirmational Holism and Underdetermination

Quine’s thesis of underdetermination of theory by evidence claims that different theories of the world can be empirically equivalent (Quine 1990b). This thesis stems from Quine’s famous “confirmational holism” (or, as it is sometimes called, “epistemological holism”). Confirmational holism appears more vividly in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, where Quine famously states that “our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually, but only as a corporate body” (Quine 1951, 38). Let’s see what this claim implies.

A scientific theory consists of a variety of sentences, from observation sentences to theoretical ones. Observations sentences were particularly important because their stimulus meaning was directly linked to immediate observables. There are, however, theoretical sentences whose stimulus meaning is less directly linked to observables, such as “neutrinos have mass” or “space-time is curved”. Another part of such a theory consists in what are sometimes called “auxiliary hypotheses or assumptions” (Quine and Ullian 1978, 79). These are statements about, for instance, the conditions of the experiments, the experimenters, the lab, when the observations have been made, and so forth. We can take total science, or our total theory of the world, as “a man-made fabric which impinges on experience only along the edges. … [T]otal science is like a field of force whose boundary conditions are experience” (Quine 1951, 39). Such a theory is like a web with observation sentences at its outer layers and logic and mathematics at its core.

Quine’s confirmational holism implies that a single statement in isolation cannot be confirmed by any observation, evidence, or data because there would always be other factors involved in making such a decision. Suppose that some newly found evidence contradicts your theory. According to confirmational holism, the emergence of such a conflict between the theory and the evidence does not necessarily force you to abandon your theory and start constructing a new one. Rather you always have a choice: you can hold onto any part of your theory, provided that you can make some complementary changes, or proper compensations, elsewhere in your theory so that the theory can preserve its consistency. In this way, the conflicting evidence can be handled by manipulating some of the auxiliary hypotheses. Compensations can potentially be made in many different ways and thus different parts of the theory can be saved. Each alteration, however, can result in a different theory. The important point to note is that although these theories are different, they are empirically equivalent because they are all compatible with the same body of evidence. In this case, your theory is underdetermined by that set of evidence. More generally, for any set of data, no matter how big it is, there can always be different theories which are compatible with that set.

There are different characterizations of underdetermination. Strong underdetermination, which Quine initially works with in his argument from above, states that our total theory is underdetermined even by the totality of all possible evidence. Quine also believed that there can be empirically equivalent theories which are logically incompatible (Quine 1970). Two theories are logically incompatible if the same sentence is true in one and false in another. But, in his later works, he almost gives up on this claim and takes all such theories to be empirically equivalent and logically compatible, though they are now counted as rival ones if they cannot be reduced to one another term by term and sentence by sentence (Quine 1990b). Moreover, your theory can be viewed as underdetermined by all data so far collected; it may be taken to be underdetermined by all data collectable from the past to the future, though some factors may remain unnoticed to you. In all such cases, underdetermination survives. For suppose that your theory A is compatible with all data collected from the past to the present. Other theories can be made out of A by changing different parts of it (and making proper compensations.) The result of (at least some of) such changes would be different theories. The theory A is thus underdetermined by such a set of data (Quine 1990c).

It is also important to note that the underdetermination thesis is an epistemological thesis, not a skeptical one with ontological consequences. Suppose that we have come up with a total theory of the world, within which the totality of truths about the world is now fixed. This theory too is naturally underdetermined by all possible data so that there will be rival theories which are compatible with all such possible data. This fact, however, does not result in the skeptical conclusion that there is thereby no fact of the matter about the world. It only implies that there are always different ways of describing it. The reason has its roots in Quine’s naturalism again, according to which there is no such a thing as a free-from-theory stance from which you can compare such theories. You are always working from within a theory. Although there are always rival ones, once you choose one underdetermined theory, all facts of the matter about the world are considered fixed within it. From within your favored theory, you expect no additional underdetermination to emerge with regard to what your theory says there are in the world. Now, what is the relation between underdetermination and indeterminacy?

ii. Underdetermination and Indeterminacy

Quine’s claim was that insofar as a theory is underdetermined by evidence its translation is indeterminate. The question is how we reach skepticism about translation from underdetermination of theory. This is an important question because underdetermination resulted in an epistemological problem only: even if all possible evidence is at hand, there always are rival theories which are compatible with such a set of evidence. For Quine, linguistics is part of natural science. Thus, it seems that, in the case of translation too, we should face nothing more serious than a similar epistemological problem, that is, the underdetermination of translation by evidence: even if we have the set of all behavioral evidence, there will always remain rival translations of the native’s sentences. This conclusion does not result in the skeptical conclusion that there is no fact of the matter about correct translation. Thus, one may complain that Quine would not be justified in claiming that, in the case of translation, we have to deal with the skeptical problem of indeterminacy. This is the objection which Chomsky (Chomsky 1968) makes to Quine’s indeterminacy thesis.

For Chomsky, we all agree that, for any set of data, there can always be different theories implying it. But the underdetermination of our scientific theory does not lead to any skepticism about the world: we do not claim that there is no fact of the matter about, for instance, tables and trees. Why should there be any difference when the case of our study becomes that of translation? Quine famously replies that the distinction between underdetermination and indeterminacy is what “Chomsky did not dismiss … He missed it” (Quine 1968, 276). For Quine, indeterminacy and underdetermination are parallel, but only up to a certain point. It is true that, in the case of translation too, we have the problem of underdetermination since the translation of the native’s sentences is underdetermined by all possible observations of the native’s verbal behavior so that there will always remain rival translations which are compatible with such a set of evidence. To this extent, Quine agrees with Chomsky. Nonetheless, he believes that indeterminacy is parallel but additional to underdetermination. When do these two theses differ in the case of translation?

Quine’s answer has its roots in his naturalistic claim that our best scientific theory is all there is to work with: it is the ultimate parameter. Even our total theory of the world would be underdetermined by the totality of all evidence. Quine’s point is that once you favor an underdetermined theory, the totality of truths about the world is thereby fixed. Take such a theory to be A. According to Quine, even within A, translation still varies and thereby remains underdetermined. Translation is thus doubly underdetermined: an additional underdetermination reoccurs in the case of translation. But, as previously indicated, this recurrence of underdetermination cannot be accepted by Quine since within our theory, we expect no further underdetermination to emerge. Recall Quine’s physicalism: if no fact about correct translation can be found in the set of all the physical facts about the world, we should conclude that there is simply no such fact. Having chosen the theory A, all facts of the matter about the world are fixed, and if despite that, translation still varies, we should conclude that the totality of facts about the world has failed to fix the facts about correct translation. As Quine famously says, translation “withstands even … the whole truth about nature” (Quine 1968, 275). Therefore, there is no fact of the matter about correct translation, which establishes the skeptical conclusion that Quine was after. This is the reason why the argument from above was characterized as claiming that underdetermination plus physicalism results in indeterminacy. “Where indeterminacy of translation applies, there is no real question of right choice; there is no fact of the matter even to within the acknowledged under-determination of a theory of nature” (Quine 1968, 275).

The last question to answer is how it is that, within our total theory A, the totality of facts fails to fix the facts about correct translation. In order to see how Quine reaches this skeptical conclusion, imagine that our translator is given the task of translating the native’s total theory. The translator starts by translating the observation sentences of the native’s theory. Suppose that the translator’s theory is A and her aim is to match the observation sentences of the native’s theory with the observation sentences of A. What is the translator’s justification for deciding whether the observation sentences of her theory are matched with the observation sentences of the native theory? It is, as before, the fact that the observation sentences have the same stimulus meaning. Assume that the translator has matched up all such observation sentences. This is just to say that facts about translation are thereby fixed: the observation sentences are paired in terms of having the same stimulus meaning. Thus, it seems that our translator can now justifiably take A to be the unique, correct translation of the native’s theory: from the fact that all the observation sentences are matched up, she concludes that the native believes in the same theory as she does. But can she really make such a claim? Quine’s answer is negative.

The reason for Quine’s negative answer can be put as follows. Suppose that there is a second translator who, like the first translator, holds A for himself and aims to translate the native’s theory. As with our first translator, he matches the observation sentences of A with the observation sentences of the native’s theory in terms of the sentences’ having the same stimulus meaning. Having done that, however, he decides to attribute theory B to the native. The difference between A and B is this: they are different but empirically equivalent theories. Both theories share the same observation sentences but differ with regard to, for instance, some of their auxiliary assumptions, theoretical sentences, and the like. Neither the first nor the second translator really believes in B; they both find B to be too odd, complex, or unnatural to believe. Nonetheless, while the first translator attributes A to the native, the second translator, for whatever reason, attributes B to him. Quine’s crucial claim is that although the translators’ theory is A, that is, although they are both working from within one theory, they are still free to attribute either A or B to the native as the translation of his theory. There is no objective criterion on the basis of which they can decide which of A or B is the theory which the native, as a matter fact, believes since both A and B are alike with regard to the totality of facts about stimulus meaning. Therefore, as Quine’s physicalism implied, we should conclude that there is no fact of the matter as to which of A or B is to be chosen as the correct translation of the native’s total theory. Despite the fact that the totality of facts is fixed within A, the translators still have freedom of choice between rival translations of the native’s theory. This underdetermination with regard to rival translations is additional to our old underdetermination of theory by evidence. The translation of the native’s theory is thereby indeterminate. This argument is called the “argument from above” since it does not start by investigating how the reference of sub-sentential parts of sentences is fixed; it rather deals with the whole theory and the translation of its whole sentences.

As with the argument from below, the argument from above too has been subject to a variety of objections. Chomsky’s objection (Chomsky 1968) has been reviewed, but it is worth briefly reviewing the general form of two further objections. Robert Kirk (Kirk 1986) objects that Quine’s argument from above is not successful because it has to rely on the conclusion of the argument from below. In other words, it faces a dilemma: either it presupposes the argument from below, in which case it would be a question-begging argument because the argument from above was supposed to be an independent argument, or it does not presuppose the argument from below, in which case it fails to establish Quine’s desired skeptical conclusion. The reason for the latter is that Quine’s claim that the translator’s only justification for matching the observation sentences is that they have the same stimulus meaning does not, in any combination with underdetermination, result in the indeterminacy of translation, unless we read this claim as implying that these matchings form the totality of facts about translation and that they fail to pin down one unique translation of the native’s theory. By doing so, however, we have already reached the indeterminacy of translation without even using the underdetermination thesis at all.

A different sort of objection has been made (Blackburn 1984), (Searle 1987) and (Glock 2003), according to which the skeptical conclusions of Quine’s argument (no fact of the matter about meaning and translation and indeterminacy at home too) leads to an entirely unacceptable conclusion: a denial of first-person authority. It can be intuitively conceded that speakers have first-person authority over the meaning of their own utterances and the content of their own mental states, such as their beliefs. They know what they mean and believe, and they know this differently from the way others, like the translators, know such meanings and beliefs. But, if radical translation starts at home, then indeterminacy arises at home, too. This means that, for the speaker too, it would be indeterminate what her own words mean. This implication is highly counterintuitive.

Let’s end our discussion of Quine by removing a potential confusion about the skeptical conclusions of Quine’s arguments. Although Quine claims that, as a matter of fact, translation is indeterminate, he does not claim that, in practice, translation is impossible. After all, we do translate other languages and understand what others mean by their words. This means that we should distinguish between two claims here. First, Quine has argued that the traditional conception of meaning and translation is to be abandoned: insofar as our concern is theoretical and philosophical, there is no such a thing as one correct translation of another sentence. But, from a practical and pragmatic point of view, translation is perfectly possible. The reason is that although there is no objective criterion on the basis of which we can pick out one correct translation of a sentence, we have good pragmatic reasons to choose between the rival ones. The translator translates the native’s utterances with “empathy”. She treats the native as a rational person who, like her, believes that there are rabbits, trees, and so forth, rather than only rabbit-parts or tree time-slices. This is a maxim, which can be called Quine’s version of  “the principle of charity” (Quine 1973). Our translator would choose “rabbit” as the translation of “gavagai” simply because this translation makes the communication between her and the native smoother. But, these norms cannot tell which translation is, as a matter of fact, correct. Although this maxim is also known as “the principle of charity”, it was not Quine who coined the term (though he started using a version of it in Word and Object (Quine 1960), and its role gradually became more important in his later works.) It was Neil L. Wilson (Wilson 1959, 532) who called a similarity to the aforementioned maxim “the principle of charity”, as Quine himself mentions. More or less similar to Wilson, Quine used it to emphasize that if the translator notices that her translation of the native’s sentences is resulting in a beyond-normal range of strange or “silly” translations, it is more likely that something is wrong with her translation than the native himself. The translator needs to choose those methods that lead to the attribution of the largest number of true sentences to the native. We are to maximize the agreement between us and the native with regard to holding true statements. As we will see, however, Davidson’s use of this principle is more extensive and substantial than Quine’s.

3. Davidson’s Semantic Project

Although Donald Davidson was inspired by Quine’s project of radical translation, he preferred to focus on what he calls “radical interpretation” (Davidson 1973a), (Davidson 1974b). Radical interpretation manifests itself in Davidson’s endeavor to uncover, from a theoretical point of view, how speakers’ ability to speak, and to understand the speech of others, can best be modeled or described. While Quine was interested in studying how the process of translation can proceed and what can be extracted from it regarding meaning determination and linguistic understanding, Davidson’s interest is wider. He is concerned with how a theory of meaning can be constructed for a language, a theory which can systematically entail the truth-conditions of all sentences of that language. His view of meaning is thus truth-conditional, according to which we understand a sentence, or what it means, by knowing under what condition the sentence would be true (Davidson 1967). For instance, the sentence “it’s raining” is true if and only if it is raining and false if it is not. We say that the truth-condition of the sentence is that it is raining. Someone who understands this sentence knows under what condition it would be true. If we succeed in constructing such a theory of meaning, which correctly specifies the truth-conditions of all sentences of a language, we have interpreted it, and we can, theoretically speaking, treat the speakers of that language as if they know such a theory, as if they speak in accordance with it and understand each other on that basis.

There are important differences between translation and interpretation. One difference is that, in the process of translating, our aim is to pair sentences of our language with sentences of the native’s on the basis of having the same meaning. In interpretation, our aim is to give the truth-conditions of the native’s sentences by using sentences of our own language. Obviously, the concept of truth has an important role to play in such a view. It is supposed to help us to clarify the concept of meaning. Davidson takes Alfred Tarski’s Truth-Theory, or Tarski’s definition of truth, to be the best tool for building his truth-based theory of meaning (Davidson 1967), (Davidson 1973b).

a. Davidson’s Use of Tarski’s Truth-Theory

For Davidson, any adequate theory of truth, if it is supposed to work as a theory of meaning entailing the right sort of truth-conditions for all sentences of a language, must meet certain constraints. One of the most important ones is to satisfy Tarski’s Convention-T, according to which our theory must entail all and only true instances of what is called Tarski’s “T-schema”:

(T) “s” is true in L if and only if p.

Our theory must entail true sentences in the form of (T) for all sentences of the native’s language L. Here, the native’s language is called the “object-language”: the language for the sentences of which our theory entails truth-conditions. Our own language is called the “meta-language,” the language whose sentences are used to specify such truth-conditions. In (T), the sentence in the quotation marks, “s”, mentions a sentence in the native’s language, and “p” is a sentence from our language that is used to give the truth-condition of the mentioned sentence.

Suppose that the object-language is German and the mentioned sentence is “Der Schnee ist weiss”. Which sentence in our language should be chosen to replace “p” in order to give the truth-condition of the German sentence? An important point to note here is that Tarski’s intent was to define truth (or, the truth-predicate, “is true”) for the object-language. In order to do so, he used the notion of translation, or sameness in meaning, and claims that what should be replaced by “p” must be either “s” itself (if the object-language is part of the meta-language) or the translation of “s” (if the object-language and the meta-language are different). Thus, the sentence which is put in place of “p” should be “snow is white”. Having done that, we come up with the following instance of the T-schema, or the following “T-sentence”:

(T1) “Der Schnee ist weiss” is true in German if and only if snow is white.

Tarski believed that each of such T-sentences yields a particular definition of truth since it defines truth for a particular sentence. A conjunction of all such instances will provide us with a definition of the concept of truth for the object-language. As a historical point, we should note that Tarski’s own goal was to define truth for a formal (that is, wholly translated into the first-order predicate logic) language, “L”, in a meta-language which contained L together with a few additional terms. He was very doubtful whether such a project could be consistently applied to the case of natural languages at all, mostly because natural languages can lead to a variety of paradoxes, such as the liar paradox. Although admitting that Tarski was suspicious of extending such a project to the case of natural languages, Davidson nevertheless attempts to carry out this project. He suggests that truth can potentially be defined for one natural language (as an object language) in another (as the meta-language). This is the reason why the examples used in this section are from natural languages, such as English, rather than from purely formal ones.

Tarski’s theory works recursively: it entails T-sentences like (T1) systematically from a finite set of axioms, as well as a finite set of rules for how different sub-sentential parts, or simple expressions, can be put together to form more complex expressions. The axioms’ job is to assign certain semantic properties to different parts of sentences: they assign reference to terms and satisfaction conditions to predicates. For instance, for (T1), we would have the following two axioms:

(A1) “Der Schnee” refers to snow.

(A2) “ist weiss” is satisfied by white things.

Nonetheless, Davidson, who wants to specify meaning in terms of truth, cannot simply follow Tarski in claiming that the two sentences appearing in the T-sentences must have the same meaning; doing so presupposes the concept of meaning. Therefore, Davidson makes a weaker claim: our theory must produce all and only true T-sentences. That is to say, “p” should be replaced by a sentence that is true if and only if the object-language’s sentence is true. But it is easy to see why this constraint would not be strong enough to succeed in having the truth-theory entail the right sort of truth-conditions for the sentences of the object-language. Suppose that the object-language is English and so is the meta-language. In this case, the following T-sentences are both true:

(T2) “Snow is white” is true if and only if snow is white.

(T3) “Snow is white” is true if and only if grass is green.

The above T-sentences are true simply because both “snow is white” and “grass is green” are true. (The same would be true if we had “Der Schnee ist weiss”, rather than “snow is white”, on the left-hand side of (T2) and (T3) because our assumption is that “Der Schnee ist weiss” is a true sentence in German.) However, our theory must entail correct truth-conditions. Assume that the theory entailing (T2) is F and the theory entailing (T3) is Ψ. Both F and Ψ meet Davidson’s requirement of entailing only true T-sentences and must be considered as correct theories. But we know that Ψ is false and certainly does not give the correct truth-condition of “snow is white”. On the other hand, we cannot take this fact for granted. Thus, we still need more constraints on our theory.

Insofar as the discussion of radical interpretation is concerned, the most important constraint which Davidson imposes on his theory is that the totality of the theory’s T-sentences must optimally fit the evidence with regard to the speaker’s responses (Davidson 1973a). This is an empirical constraint: the theory should be treated as an empirical theory which is employed by an interpreter to specify the meaning of the speaker’s utterances. It should be constructed, checked, and verified as an interpretive theory which produces interpretive T-sentences and axioms. By an “interpretive theory” Davidson means the theory that entails correct truth-conditions for the speaker’s sentences, considering the evidence the interpreter has access to in the process of radical interpretation.

b. Davidson’s Radical Interpretation Scenario

Imagine that someone is sent again to the jungle to meet our native speaker but, this time, he is given the task of interpreting Davidson-style the native’s utterances, that is, finding appropriate sentences in his own language that can be used to correctly specify the truth-conditions of the native’s sentences. In order to do so, he is required to construct a theory which entails the truth-conditions of the native’s sentences. Call him the “interpreter”. The Davidsonian interpreter, like the Quinean translator, starts his interpretation from scratch: he has no prior knowledge of the native’s language or her mental states.

Like radical translation, radical interpretation primarily focuses on the native’s observation sentences. A difference between Quine and Davidson emerges at this point. Although Quine took stimulations, or “proximal stimulation”, to be basic, Davidson takes the ordinary objects and events in the world, or “distal stimuli”, to be basic (Davidson 1999a). Another important difference between these two projects concerns the sort of evidence the interpreter is allowed to work with. Quine limited it to purely behavioral evidence, that is, the speaker’s assent or dissent. Davidson agrees that what the interpreter can ultimately rely on is nothing but observing the native’s verbal behavior, but since he rejects behaviorism, he claims that we can allow the interpreter to have access to what he calls the “holding-true attitudes” of the speaker (Davidson 1980). These are attitudes which the speaker possesses towards her own sentences; when the speaker utters, or assents to, a sentence on a specific occasion, she holds the sentence to be true on that occasion. For Davidson, the interpreter knows this much already, though he emphasizes that from this assumption it does not follow that the interpreter thereby has access to any detailed information about what the speaker means and believes.

Suppose that our native speaker, S, utters the sentence “Es regnet” at time t. The evidence the interpreter can work with would have the following form:

(E) S holds true “Es regnet” at time t if and only if it is raining at time t near S.

For Davidson, belief and meaning are interdependent. When a speaker utters a sentence, she expresses her thoughts, especially her beliefs. This interdependence between meaning and belief manifests itself in his emphasis on the role of the speaker’s holding-true attitudes in his project since, according to Davidson, a speaker holds a sentence to be true partly because of what those words mean in her language and partly because of the beliefs she has about the world. This means that if we know that the speaker holds a sentence to be true on an occasion and we know what she means by it, we would know what she believes, and if we know what she believes, we can infer what she means by her utterance.

Our radical interpreter, therefore, has a difficult job to do. He should determine the meaning of the native’s utterances and, at the same time, attribute suitable beliefs to her. This leads to what is called the “problem of interpretation”, according to which the interpreter, on the basis of the same sort of evidence, like (E), has to determine both meaning and belief. Obviously, one of these two variables must be fixed; otherwise, interpretation cannot take off. Davidson attempts to solve this problem by appealing to his version of the principle of charity (Davidson 1991). According to this principle, as employed by Davidson, the interpreter must do her best to make the native’s behavior as intelligible as possible: she ought to aim at maximizing the intelligibility (and not necessarily the truth) of the native’s responses in the process of interpreting them The interpreter takes the native to be a rational agent whose behavior is intelligible and whose  patterns of beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes, are more or less similar to ours. Obeying such a rational norm does not necessarily result in attributing true beliefs to the subject all the time; sometimes attributing a false belief to the subject may make his behavior more intelligible and comprehensive. This reveals another difference between Davidson and Quine with regard to their use of such a maxim or principle. More is said about this in the next section.

For Davidson, when it is raining around the native and she utters “Es regnet”, the interpreter takes her to be expressing the belief that it is raining. Charity helps to fix one of the above two variables, that is, the belief part. On the basis of the evidence (E), and with the help of the principle of charity, the interpreter can come up with the following hypothetical T-sentence:

(T4) “Es regnet” is true in S’s language if and only if it is raining.

As with the case of radical translation, here too (T4) is to be treated as hypothetical for now because one observation would not be enough for the interpreter to confirm that (T4) gives the correct truth-condition of the native’s sentence. The process of interpretation is a holistic process: terms like “regnet” and “Schnee” appear in many different sentences of the native’s language. The interpreter must go on and check if (T4) remains true when the native utters “Es regnet” on different occasions. As the interpretation proceeds, the interpreter gradually comes to identify different sub-sentential parts of the native’s sentences and thereby constructs specific axioms which assign reference to the terms and satisfaction conditions to the predicates of the native’s language (such as (A1) and (A2) above). In this case, the interpreter would be able to verify whether “Schnee” in the native’s language refers to snow or grass. The interpreter would then be able to throw away the true-but-not-interpretive T-sentences like the following:

(T5) “Der Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if grass is green.

The reason is that the interpreter has checked, in several cases, that the native uses “Schnee” where there is snow, not grass, and that “… ist weiss” is used by the native where there are white things, not green things. The correct truth-condition of the native’s sentence seems to be snow is white, not grass is green.

At the end of this long process, the interpreter eventually comes up with a theory of interpretation, which correctly interprets the native’s verbal behavior. It systematically entails correct truth-conditions for all sentences of the native’s language. But, does this mean that indeterminacy has no chance to emerge in this process?

4. Davidson on the Indeterminacy of Interpretation

Davidson believes that some degree of indeterminacy survives in the process of radical interpretation. First of all, the inscrutability of reference cannot be avoided. Our words and things in the world can be connected in different ways, and we may never be able to tell which way of connecting words with things is right (Davidson 1997). If one way works, an infinite number of other ways will work as well, though some of them may seem strange or too complex to us. Davidson gives an example.

Predicates are said to have satisfaction conditions: they are satisfied, or are true of, certain things only. For instance, the predicate “… is red” is satisfied by red things, not blue things. Nonetheless, it seems that, for any predicate, we can find other predicates which have the same sort of satisfaction condition. In this case, the truth-value of the sentences in which such predicates appear would remain unchanged: if they are true (or false), they remain true (or false). But, since the totality of evidence is the same for all such cases, no evidence can help to decide which satisfaction condition is right. For example, suppose we have the following axioms:

(A3) “Rome” refers to Rome.

(A4) “… is a city in Italy” is satisfied by cities in Italy.

From these axioms, we can reach the following T-sentence:

(T6) “Rome is a city in Italy” is true if and only if Rome is a city in Italy.

This is a true T-sentence. Now consider an alternative set of axioms:

(A5) “Rome” refers to an area 100 miles to the south of Rome.

(A6) “… is a city in Italy” is satisfied by areas 100 miles south of cities in Italy.

From these, we can reach (T7):

(T7) “Rome is a city in Italy” is true if and only if the area 100 miles south of Rome is an area 100 miles south of a city in Italy.

The point is that if (T6) is true, (T7) is also true, and vice versa. Not only this, but there can be indefinitely many such mapping relations. The reference of “Rome” is thereby inscrutable: there is no way to determine which reference for “Rome”, and which satisfaction condition for “… is a city in Italy”, is to be chosen as the correct one. As before, such terms appear in a potentially indefinite number of sentences and thus, the inscrutability of reference affects the whole language. One interpreter may come up with a theory which takes “Rome” to be referring to Rome, while another may come up with a theory which takes it to be referring to an area 100 miles to the south of Rome. Both theories work just well, provided that each interpreter sticks to her own theory. Obviously, we cannot freely switch between different methods of interpretation. Rather, once it is fixed within one theory that “Rome” refers to Rome, the term has this reference in any sentence in which it occurs.

Davidson takes this sort of indeterminacy to be harmless and leading to no skepticism about meaning since it is similar to the innocuous familiar fact that we can have different ways of measuring the temperature, height, or weight of an object (Davidson 1997). When we want to tell what the temperature of an object is, we face different scales for measuring it. What we should do is to decide whether we want to use the Fahrenheit scale or the centigrade one. For Davidson, the inscrutability of reference should be understood in a similar way: there are always different methods of interpreting a speaker’s verbal behavior; what we must do is to choose between such rival methods and hold onto it. These different theories of interpretation are all compatible with the native’s behavioral evidence. But as there is no contradiction regarding the existence of different scales of measuring temperature, there would be no contradiction regarding the existence of different methods of interpreting the speaker’s behavior.

A second sort of indeterminacy also emerges in the process of radical interpretation which, contrary to the inscrutability of reference, can affect the sentences’ truth-values. Suppose that you are interpreting someone who often applies “blue” to the objects which most people apply “green” to, such as emeralds. Davidson’s claim is that you, as her interpreter, face two options. (1) You can attribute to her true beliefs about the world by taking her to be in agreement with you regarding the things there are in the world and the properties they possess: you can treat her as believing that there are emeralds and they are green. But, since she applies “blue” to these things, you have to take her to mean something different by the term “blue”. You do so with the purpose of making her behavior intelligible. Thus, you interpret her utterance of “blue” to mean green, not blue. On this option, the speaker’s utterance of “that emerald is blue” is true because you have treated her as believing that emeralds are green and as meaning green by “blue”. Thus, what she means by her utterance is that that emerald is green. (2) The second option is to interpret her to mean the same thing as you mean by “blue”, that is, to be in agreement with you on what the correct use of “blue” is. For both of you, “blue” applies to blue things and thus means blue. Again, since she applies “blue” to the things to which you apply “green”, you take her to have some different (false) beliefs about the world in order to make her behavior intelligible. Thus, while you interpret her utterance of “blue” to mean blue, you attribute to her the false belief that emeralds are blue. On this option, however, the speaker’s utterance of “that emerald is blue” is false because what she claims is that that emerald is blue. According to Davidson, you, as the interpreter of her speech, can choose any of the above two options and, as before, it is enough that you continue interpreting her in that way. There is nothing in the world that can help you to decide which method is right (Davidson 1997). Rather, all there is for the interpreter to appeal to is the rational norms dictated by the principle of charity, which, as we can see now more clearly, may even result in attributing some false beliefs to the subject in order to make her behavior more intelligible. Therefore, Davidson believes that the inscrutability of reference and the indeterminacy with regard to the attributions of meaning and belief to the speaker arise in the process of radical interpretation too.

There is, however, a final point which is worth noting with regard to Davidson’s treatment of indeterminacy. For him, indeterminacy does not entail that there are no facts of the matter about meaning (Davidson 1999b). Rather, he treats indeterminacy as resulting in an epistemological problem only, with no ontological consequences. His reason is that if the overall pattern of the speaker’s behavior is stable, there can be alternative ways of describing it, that is, there can always be different theories of interpretation. Again, just as there were different ways of measuring temperature, there can be different ways of interpreting the speaker’s behavior. As we did not question the reality of temperature, we should not question the reality of meaning. Davidson, thus, departs from Quine on this matter: while Quine thought that the indeterminacy of translation has destructive ontological consequences, Davidson thinks that the indeterminacy shows only that there can be different ways of capturing facts about meaning.

In what follows, the article considers two important analytic philosophers who have been inspired by Davidson’s and Quine’s projects, David Lewis and Daniel Dennett.

5. Lewis on Radical Interpretation

David Lewis, in his famous paper “Radical Interpretation” (Lewis 1974), agrees with Davidson on the general claim that the aim of the process of radical interpretation is to determine what a speaker, say, Karl, means by his utterances and what he believes and desires. Lewis also agrees with Davidson and Quine that radical interpretation starts from scratch: at the outset, the interpreter has no prior information about Karl’s beliefs, desires, and meanings. Not only this, but our knowledge of Karl is also taken by Lewis to be limited to the sort of knowledge we can have of him as a physical system. Thus, on this latter point, he leans to Quine, rather than Davidson, and he invites us to imagine that we interpreters have access to the totality of physical facts about Karl. Lewis’s question is, what do such facts tell about Karl’s meanings, beliefs, and desires?

Lewis characterizes the “problem of radical interpretation” as follows. Suppose P is the set of all such facts about Karl viewed as a physical system, for instance, facts about his movements, his causal interactions with the world, his behavioral responses to others, the impact of physical laws on him, and so forth. Suppose also that we have two sets of specifications of Karl’s propositional attitudes, Ao and Ak. Ao is the set of specifications of Karl’s beliefs and desires as expressed in our language (for example, when we specify what Karl believes by using the English sentence “snow is white”), and Ak is the set of specifications of Karl’s beliefs and desires as expressed in Karl’s language (for example, given that Karl’s language is German, Karl’s belief (that snow is white) is expressed by the German sentence “Der Schnee ist weiss”). Finally, suppose that M is the set of our interpretations of Karl, that is, the specifications of the meaning of Karl’s utterances (for example, statements like “Karl means snow is white by his utterance of ‘Der Schnee ist weiss’”). Lewis’s question is: How are P, Ak and Ao related?

Some points about these sets are to be noted. (1) As with Davidson, Lewis is wishes to determine the truth-conditions of Karl’s sentences. So, the interpreter looks for correct interpretations such as “‘Der Schnee ist weiss’ as uttered by Karl is true if and only if snow is white”. (2) Following Davidson, Lewis also demands that these truth-conditions be entailed in a systematic way from a finite set of axioms. (3) Contrary to Davidson, however, Lewis puts a heavy emphasis on beliefs and desires, and claims that our most important goal in radical interpretation is to determine them first. This shift in emphasis leads us to two further points about the relation between the views of Lewis and Davidson. (a) Lewis agrees with Davidson that beliefs and desires play a significant role both in our treatment of the speaker as a rational agent and in our explanation of his behavior as an intentional action. For Davidson, a speaker is rational if she possesses a rich set of interrelated propositional attitudes, such as beliefs, desires, hopes, fears, and the like (Davidson 1982). An agent’s action can be explained as intentional if it can be properly described as caused by a belief-desire pair (Davidson 1963). For instance, to use Davidson’s example, suppose that someone adds sage to the stew with the purpose of improving its taste. This action is intentional if we can explain it as caused by the subject’s desire to improve the taste of the stew and the belief that adding sage would do that. (b) Nonetheless, Davidson did not take beliefs and desires (or, in general, any propositional attitudes) to be superior to meaning. He thought that meanings and beliefs are so interdependent that interpreters have to determine both at the same time. Lewis treats beliefs and desires as basic and claims that meanings can be determined only when the speaker’s beliefs and desires are determined first. This view is related to his analysis of success in our linguistic practices in terms of conventions and the crucial role speakers’ beliefs play in turning a sort of regularity-in-use into a convention (Lewis 1975). (3) Putting aside his delicate view of the notion of convention, the last point to note is that Lewis agrees with Quine rather than Davidson regarding the idea that the problem interpreters seek to answer in the process of meaning-determination is more than just an epistemological problem. The concern is not how P, the set of all physical facts about Karl, determines facts about Karl’s meanings, beliefs, and desires. Rather, one wants to know what facts P is capable of determining at all, that is, whether the totality of physical facts can fix the facts about what Karl means, believes, and desires.

Let’s see how the views of Lewis and Davidson particularly differ with regard to the constraints on the process of radical interpretation and the degree of indeterminacy which may survive after so restricting the process.

a. Lewis’s Constraints on Radical Interpretation

Lewis believes that the process of interpretation the interpreters needs to place more constraints than those introduced by Davidson. These extra constraints concern how meanings and propositional attitudes are related to one another, to the behavior of the speaker, and to the sensory stimulations. It is meeting these constraints that makes radical interpretation possible. (Lewis 1974) promotes six constraints on radical interpretation, only some of which are shared by Davidson:

(1) The Principle of Charity. The way Lewis characterizes this principle is slightly different from Davidson. According to this principle, in order to make Karl’s behavior most intelligible, the interpreter should interpret Karl’s behavior (as specified in P) by treating him as believing what he ought to believe and desiring what he ought to desire. Again, this does not mean that in order to make Karl’s behavior most intelligible, only true beliefs are to be attributed to him; rather, sometimes, treating him as holding some false beliefs may do much better in describing his behavior as rational, intelligible, and comprehensive. What Karl ought to believe and desire, from the interpreter’s point of view, is generally what she believes and desires (given by Ao). But, again, considering the particular circumstances under which Karl’s behavior is interpreted, as well as the available evidence, the values Karl accepts, and so forth, the interpreter should make room for attributing some errors or false beliefs to him.

(2) The Rationalization Principle. Karl should be interpreted as a rational agent. The beliefs and desires the interpreter attributes to Karl (in Ao) should be capable of providing good reasons for why Karl responds in the way he does. Nonetheless, it does not mean that there are thereby some sort of intentional (non-physical) facts about Karl. The facts about Karl are still limited to the physical ones specified in P. This principle rather implies that the interpreter attributes those desires and beliefs to Karl that not only make Karl’s behavior intelligible to us, but also provide him with reasons for acting in that way. For this reason, the rationalization principle and the principle of charity are different.

(3) The Principle of Truthfulness. Karl is to be considered a truthful speaker, that is, a speaker who is willing to assert only what he takes to be very probably true. This principle constrains the sort of desires and believes the interpreter is allowed to attribute to Karl (in Ao) in order to interpret his utterances (and specify their meaning in M).

(4) The Principle of Generativity. The truth-conditions which the interpreter assigns to Karl’s utterances (in M) must be finitely specifiable, uniform, and simple. The interpreter must do her best to avoid assigning too complex, odd, or unnatural meanings to Karl’s sentences, as well as the meanings that are not finitely and systematically inferable from a finite set of axioms.

(5) The Manifestation Principle. Karl’s attributed beliefs and desires should be capable of manifesting themselves in his behavior. Karl’s beliefs and other attitudes should be recognizable particularly in his use of his language. This means that when there is no evidence to the effect that Karl is self-deceived or lacks proper conception of what meaning and belief are, we should be able to extract beliefs and other propositional attitudes from Karl’s behavioral dispositions to respond to the world.

(6) The Triangle Principle. Karl’s meanings, beliefs, and desires should not change when they are specified in the interpreter’s language, whatever the interpreter’s language is. This principle may appear a bit puzzling. Suppose that Karl utters “Der Schnee ist weiss” and our interpreter, who speaks English, interprets it as follows:

(M1) “Der Schnee ist weiss” as uttered by Karl is true in German if and only if snow is white.

The truth-condition of Karl’s utterance is thus that snow is white. Suppose that another interpreter, Francesco, who speaks Italian, interprets Karl’s utterance as follows:

(M2) “Der Schnee is weiss”, proferita da Karl, è vera in Tedesco se e solo se la neve è bianca.

The truth-condition of Karl’s utterance is now given by the Italian sentence la neve è bianca. Lewis’s point is that what Karl means by his utterance and what belief he expresses by it must remain the same, no matter in what language they are specified. We can see this point by considering the way our English interpreter would interpret Francesco’s sentence “la neve è bianca”, used in (M2) to give the truth-condition of Karl’s utterance:

(M3) “La neve è bianca” as uttered by Francesco is true in Italian if and only if snow is white.

The truth-condition of Francesco’s sentence is that snow is white. Considering (M1) – (M3), one can see that what Karl expresses by his German sentence, that is, that snow is white, remains the same no matter in what language it is specified.

On the basis of these six principles, Lewis evaluates Davison’s project of radical interpretation. Davidson’s aim was to solve the problem of determining Karl’s beliefs and meanings at the same time. For Lewis, Davidson attempts to solve this problem by appealing to the Triangle Principle, the Principle of Charity, and the Principle of Generativity only. That is to say, what Davidson is concerned with is that the truth-conditions of Karl’s sentences are correctly specified in the interpreter’s language (the Triangle Principle), that such assignments of meaning are done with the purpose of maximizing the intelligibility of Karl’s behavior via attributing proper beliefs to him (the Principle of Charity), and finally, that the truth-conditions are inferred in a systematic way from a finite set of axioms (the Principle of Generativity). We temporarily fix beliefs, extract meanings, ask the interpreter to re-check her interpretation with further behavioral evidence, revise the beliefs if necessary, and re-check the interpretation. Lewis is not satisfied with Davidson’s method because, for him, Davidson has missed the other three principles.  Davidson especially fails to take into account the Principle of Truthfulness and the Rationalization Principle, which constrain Karl’s beliefs and desires and which consequently lead the interpreter to view Karl’s behavior as an intentional action in advance. Davidson has put too much emphasis on the language part, rather than the mental part.

Lewis’s method is almost the opposite. It starts by considering Karl’s behavior as what forms the evidential basis for interpretation, but it considers such behavior in the light of the Rationalization Principle and the Principle of Charity. Karl’s behavior is taken to be already rationalized. Karl’s behavior can be treated in this way if his behavior allows for attributions of those beliefs and desires to him that we interpreters ourselves often hold. Evidence to the contrary forces us to reconsider his behavior as rational. Karl’s linguistic behavior, his utterances, are simply part of the history of his behavior. On this basis, we are then allowed to assign truth-conditions to Karl’s utterances by employing the Principle of Truthfulness. That is, we view Karl as a rational agent who asserts a sentence only when he believes it is true. The Principle of Generativity constrains our attributions of truth-conditions to Karl’s sentences by demanding systematicity, coherence, and consistency in such attributions. Finally, if other principles are met, the Triangle Principle assures us that Karl’s meanings, beliefs, and desires remain the same when they are specified in the interpreter’s language.

The question, however, is whether these extra constraints can avoid the emergence of the inscrutability of reference and the indeterminacy of interpretation.

b. Lewis on the Indeterminacy of Interpretation

Lewis believes that indeterminacy, at least in its strong and threatening form, can be avoided, though some degree of mild or moderate indeterminacy would inevitably survive. His position changed from that in his earlier works on the topic, especially in “Radical Interpretation” (Lewis 1974). There Lewis admits that it is reasonable to think that there would probably remain some rival systems of interpretation which are compatible with the set of all behavioral evidence and which can be considered as correct. He uses Quine’s gavagai example to clarify the sort of indeterminacy which he thinks may appear in the process of radical interpretation. As he puts it, “[w]e should regard with suspicion any method that purports to settle objectively whether, in some tribe, ‘gavagai’ is true of temporally continuant rabbits or time-slices thereof. You can give their language a good grammar of either kind—and that’s that” (Lewis 1975, 21).

Nonetheless, even in this earlier period, Lewis emphasized that no “radical indeterminacy” can come out in radical interpretation. If a theory of interpretation meets all of the six conditions introduced above and it does so perfectly, then we should expect no radical indeterminacy to appear, that is, no rival theories of interpretation which all perfectly meet the six constraints but attribute radically different beliefs and desires to Karl. For Lewis, even if it can be shown somehow that such indeterminacy may emerge even when the six constraints are met, the conclusion of the attempt would not be that the interpreter should thereby accept the existence of such indeterminacy. Rather, what would be proved would be that all the needed constraints have not yet been found. Lewis, however, thinks that no convincing example has yet been offered to persuade us that we should take such a sort of radical indeterminacy seriously. He also denies that the existence of radical indeterminacy can be shown by any proof (Lewis 1974).

Lewis subsequently returned to the problem of indeterminacy due to Putnam’s argument in favor of radical indeterminacy.

i. Putnam’s Model-Theoretic Argument and Lewis’s Reference Magnetism

Putnam, in (Putnam 1977), reformulates Quine’s thesis of the inscrutability of reference in a way in which it could not be treated as a mild indeterminacy anymore. His argument, the “model-theoretic argument”, is technical and is not unpacked here. But consider its general conclusion. This argument attempts to undermine metaphysical realism, according to which there are theory-independent, language-independent, or mind-independent objects in the world to which our terms are linked in a certain way, and such a linkage makes our sentences about the world true. Such mind-independent objects can have properties which may go beyond the epistemic and cognitive abilities of human beings. For such realists, there can be only one true complete description of the world because the world is as it is, and things in it are the way they are and have the properties they have independently of how we can describe it. Now suppose that we have an epistemically ideal theory of the world, that is, a theory that meets all the theoretical and similar constraints we can impose on our theory, such as consistency, full compatibility with all evidence, completeness, and so forth. According to metaphysical realism, even such an ideal theory can come out false because, after all, it is the theory that is ideal for us, that is, ideal as far as an idealization of our epistemic skills allows. It is possible that this theory still fails to be the one which correctly describes the world as it really is. Putnam’s argument, however, aims to show that we interpreters can have different interpretations of the link between our words and things in the world which make any such ideal theory come out true.

As indicated in the above discussion of Quine, our theories of the world are nothing but a collection of interconnected sentences containing a variety of expressions. For Putnam, however, even if we can fix the truth-values (and even the truth-conditions) of all sentences of our language, it can still be shown that the reference of its terms would remain unfixed: there can always be alternative reference systems that are incompatible with one another but preserve the truth-values of the sentences of our language or theory. For instance, if we change the reference of “rabbit” from rabbits to undetached rabbit-parts, the truth-values of the sentences in which “rabbit” occurs would not change. This much was familiar from Quine’s argument from below. What Putnam adds is that realists have to concede that if there is only one correct theory, or description, of the world, this theory should thereby be capable of making the reference of our terms fixed: it should uniquely determine to what objects each term refers. Putnam’s question is how realists can explain such a reference-determining process. According to Putnam, no reference of any term can be determined; there can be many theories that come out true dependent on how we intend to interpret the systematic connection between words and things. Anything you may like can potentially be taken to be the reference of any term, without causing any change in the truth-values of whole sentences. Not only this, but introducing any further constraints on your theory would inevitably fail to solve the problem because any new constraint introduces (at most) some new terms into your theory, and the reference of such terms would be susceptible to the same problem of indeterminacy. Putnam’s point is that we cannot think of the world as bestowing fixed reference on our terms: “We interpret our languages, or nothing does” (Putnam 1980, 482).

This argument is taken seriously by Lewis because, not only was he an advocate of realism, he also supported “global descriptivism”, a view which Putnam’s argument undermines. For Lewis, we should interpret terms as referring to those things which make our theory come out true. If we attribute to the speaker the belief that Aristotle was a great Greek philosopher and if we concede, as Lewis does, that the content of this belief is expressible in the sentence “Aristotle was a great Greek philosopher”, then we should interpret “Aristotle” to refer to those things which make our theory containing it turn out true. For this to happen, it seems that “Aristotle” is to be interpreted as referring to a specific person, Aristotle. The sort of “causal descriptivism” which Lewis worked with implies that, first of all, there is a causal relationship between terms and their referents and, second of all, terms (like “Aristotle”) are so connected with their referents (such as Aristotle) by means of a certain sort of description, or a cluster of them, which we associate with the terms and which specifies how the terms and their referents are so causally linked. In this sense, “Aristotle” refers to Aristotle because it is Aristotle that satisfies, for instance, the definite description “Plato’s pupil and the teacher of the Alexander the Great.” Global descriptivism states that the reference of (almost) all the terms of our language is determined in this way.

Putnam’s argument undermines this view because if the reference of our terms is indeterminate, the problem cannot be dealt with simply by introducing or associating further descriptions with those terms because no matter what such descriptions and constraints are, they would be nothing but a number of other words, whose reference is again indeterminate. Such words are to be interpreted; otherwise, they would be useless since they would be nothing but uninterpreted, meaningless symbols. But if they are to be interpreted, they can be interpreted in many different ways. Therefore, the problem, as Lewis puts it, is that there can be many different (non-standard) interpretations which can make our epistemically ideal theory turn out true: “any world can satisfy any theory…, and can do so in countless very different ways” (Lewis 1983, 370). New constraints on our theory just lead to “more theory”, and it would be susceptible to the same sort of problem. After all, as Putnam stated, we interpret our language, so, under different interpretations, or models, our terms, whatever they are, can refer to different things, even to anything we intend. It would not really matter how the world is or what the theory says.

In order to solve this problem, Lewis introduces “reference magnetism” or “inegalitarianism”. According to this solution, the reference of a term is, as before, what causes the speaker to use that term and, more importantly, among the rival interpretations of that term, the eligible interpretation is the one which picks out the most natural reference for the term. Lewis’s view of natural properties and naturalness is complex. According to Lewis, the world consists of nothing but a throng of spatiotemporal joints, at which the world is carved up and various properties are instantiated. Such properties are “perfectly natural” properties (Lewis 1984). For Lewis, however, it is “a primitive fact that some classes of things are perfectly natural properties” (Lewis 1983, 347). It is helpful to use an example originally given by Nelson Goodman. Suppose that the application of the terms “green” and “blue” are governed by the following rules:

Rule1: “Green” applies to green things always. In this case, “green” means green.

Rule2: “Blue” applies to blue things always. In this case, “blue” means blue.

Suppose that a skeptic claims that the rules governing the application of “green” and “blue” are not those mentioned above. They are rather the following:

Rule1*: “Green” applies to green things up to a specific time t and to blue things after t. In this case, “green” does not mean green, but means grue.

Rule2*: “Blue” applies to blue things up until time t and to green things after t. In this case, “blue” does not mean blue, but means bleen.

If the speaker has been following Rule1*, rather than Rule1, the application of “green” to an emerald at t+ would be incorrect. Obviously, there can be an infinite number of such alternative rules, and as t can be any given time, no behavioral evidence can help to decide whether by “green” the speaker really meant green or grue.

Lewis’s reference magnetism implies that the correct interpretation of the speaker’s utterance of “green” chooses the most natural property as the eligible referent of the term, that is, the property of being green rather than being grue. As he puts it, “grue things (or worse) are not all of a kind in the same way that … bits of gold…are all of a kind” (Lewis 1984, 228-229). Similarly, the most eligible referent for “rabbit” is that of being a rabbit, rather than an undetached rabbit-part. In this way, the sort of radical indeterminacy which Putnam argued for would be blocked. Lewis, therefore, thinks that we can eventually avoid the threatening radical indeterminacy.

6. Dennett’s Intentional Stance

Dennett’s position, unlike Lewis’s, does not claim that indeterminacy can be so controlled. Dennett follows Quine and Davidson in viewing the third-person point of view as our best and only viable view for investigating the behavior of objects, systems, or organisms. His concern is to find an answer to the question whether we can attribute propositional attitudes to certain objects or systems, that is, whether we can interpret their behavior as intentional and hence treat them as “true believers”.

Dennett famously distinguishes among three sorts of such a third-person standpoint: the “physical stance”, the “design stance” and the “intentional stance” (Dennett 2009). Which stance works best depends on how functional it is for our purposes, that is, whether it offers a useful interpretation of the system’s behavior. Such an interpretation must enable us to explain and predict the system’s future behavior in the most practical way. The physical stance or “strategy” is the one which we usually work with in our study of the behavior of objects like planets or a pot on the burner. This stance is the method which is often employed in natural sciences. Scientists use their knowledge of the laws of nature and the physical constitutions of objects to make predictions about the objects’ behavior. This stance seems to be our only option to scrutinize the behavior of things which are neither alive nor artifacts.

Sometimes, however, the physical stance may not be the best strategy for interpreting the object’s behavior. Rather, adopting the design stance would be far more helpful. By choosing the design stance, we add the assumption that the object or the system is designed in a certain way to accomplish a specific goal. This is the stance which we use in our explanation and prediction of the behavior of, for example, a heat-seeking missile or an alarm clock. Although we may not have enough detailed information about the physical constituents of such objects and how they work, the design stance enables us to successfully predict their behavior. What about the case of the objects which manifest far more complex behavior, such as humans or an advanced chess-playing computer?

In such cases, the design stance would not be as effective as it was in the simpler cases mentioned above. At this point, the intentional stance is available. By adopting the intentional stance, we presume that the object or the system is a rational agent, that is, an agent assumed to possess propositional attitudes such as beliefs and desires. Having granted that, we decide what sort of attitudes we ought to attribute to the object, on the basis of which we can interpret its behavior as an intentional action. Considering the system’s complex interactions with the environment, we attribute specific beliefs and desires to it. Attributing the right sort of beliefs and desires to the system, in turn, enables us to predict how, on the basis of having those attitudes, it will act and, more importantly, how it ought to act: we offer an “intentional interpretation” of the system’s behavior.

If we wanted, we could potentially use the intentional stance in our study of the behavior of the missile or the alarm clock; but we do not need it: the design strategy worked just well in predicting their future behavior. In order to understand the behavior of such objects, adopting the intentional stance is simply unnecessary. Moreover, we do not usually want to count these things as believers, that is, as the possessors of a complex set of interrelated propositional attitudes. Therefore, we can define an “intentional system” as any system whose behavior can be usefully predicted by adopting the intentional stance. We treat such things as if they are rational agents which ought to possess a certain sort of beliefs, desires, intentions, goals, and purposes, in the light of their needs and complex capacities to perceive the world (Dennett 1987) and (Dennett 2009).

a. Indeterminacy and the Intentional Stance

The intentional interpretation of a system naturally allows for the emergence of the indeterminacy of interpretation. Recall that Dennett’s concern was to find out how practical and useful the offered interpretation is for the purpose of predicting the system’s behavior. In this case, we cannot expect to come up with one unique intentional interpretation of the system’s behavior, which works so perfectly that it leaves no room for the existence of any other useful intentional interpretations. There can always be alternative interpretations which work just as well in predicting the system’s behavior. Two equally predictive interpretations may attribute different sets of attitudes to an intentional system. For Dennett, whenever there are two competing intentional interpretations of a system, which work well in predicting the system’s behavior, none can be said to have any clear advantage to the other because in order to make such a choice we have no further, especially no objective, criterion to rely on. As he clarifies, “we shouldn’t make the mistake of insisting that there has to be a fact of the matter about which interpretation is ‘the truth about’ the topic. Sometimes, in the end, one interpretation is revealed to be substantially better, all things considered. But don’t count on it” (Dennett 2018, 59).

To be a believer is to have the sort of behavior which is predictable by adopting the intentional stance. There is nothing to make it impossible that, for the same pattern of behavior, we can have rival intentional-stance interpretations. It is important to note that, for Dennett, the fact that such rival interpretations exist does not imply that these patterns are unreal. They are real patterns of observable behavior. The point is that our interpretation of them and the beliefs and desires that we attribute to them would depend on the sort of stance we choose to employ (Dennett 1991). There is no deeper fact than the fact that we choose to look at a system from a specific point of view and that we do so with the aim of making the best workable prediction of its behavior. In order to decide between rival interpretations, which are all compatible with all the evidence there is with regard to the system’s behavior, we have no objective criterion to rely on because the interpretations are compatible with all the facts there are, that is, facts about the system’s behavior. As a result, the indeterminacy of interpretation emerges.

Dennett states that the intentional stance with its rationality constraints is there to “explain why in principle…there is indeterminacy of radical translation/interpretation: there can always be a tie for first between two competing assignments of meaning to the behavior … of an agent, and no other evidence counts” (Dennett 2018, 58). When you intend to organize the behavior of a system, you can organize it in different ways; and whether such a system can be viewed as an intentional system would depend on whether its behavior can be usefully predicted from the point of view of the particular interpretive intentional stance which you adopt.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Blackburn, Simon. 1984. Spreading the Word. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam. 1968. “Quine’s Empirical Assumptions.” Synthese 19 (1/2): 53-68.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1963. “Actions, Reasons, and Causes.” The Journal of Philosophy 60: 685–99.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1967. “Truth and Meaning.” Synthese 17: 304–23.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1970. “Semantics for Natural Languages”. In Linguaggi nella Societa e nella Tecnica. Milan: Comunita.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1973a. “Radical Interpretation.” Dialectica 27: 314–28.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1973b. “In Defence of Convention T.” In Truth, Syntax and Modality, edited by H. Leblanc, 76–86. Dordretch: North-Holland.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974a. “On the very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 47: 5–20.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974b. “Belief and the Basis of Meaning.” Synthese 27: 309–23.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1978. “Intending.” In Philosophy of History and Action, edited by Y. Yovel, 41–60. Dordretch: D. Reidel and The Magnes Press.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1979. “The Inscrutability of Reference.” The Southwestern Journal of Philosophy 10: 7–20.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1980. “Toward a Unified Theory of Meaning and Action.” Grazer Philosophische Studien 11: 1–12.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1982. “Rational Animals.” Dialectica 36: 317–28.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1991. “Three Varieties of Knowledge.” In A. J. Ayer: Memorial Essays, edited by A. P. Griffiths, 153–66. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1993. “Method and Metaphysics.” Deucalion 11: 239–48.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1997. “Indeterminism and Antirealism.” In Realism/Antirealism and Epistemology, edited by C. B. Kulp, 109–22. Lanham, Md.: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1999a. “The Emergence of Thought.” Erkenntnis 51 (1): 7-17.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1999b. “Reply to Richard Rorty.” In The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, edited by L. E. Hahn, 595-600. US, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 1971. “Intentional Systems.” The Journal of Philosophy 68 (4): 87-106.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 1987 . The Intentional Stance. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 1991. “Real Patterns.” The Journal of Philosophy 88 (1): 27-51.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 2009. “Intentional Systems Theory.” In The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mind, edited by Brian P. McLaughlin, and Sven Walter Ansgar Beckermann, 340-350. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 2018. “Reflections on Tadeusz Zawidzki.” In The Philosophy of Daniel Dennett, edited by Bryce Huebner, 57-61. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Evans, Gareth. 1975. “Identity and Predication.” Journal of Philosophy LXXII(13): 343–362.
  • Fordor, Jerry. 1993. The Elm and the Expert: Mentalese and its Semantics. Cambridge, MA: Bradford.
  • Glock, Hans-Johann. 2003. Quine and Davidson on Language, Thought, and Reality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Goodman, Nelson. 1955. Fact, Fiction, and Forecast. Cambridge, MA.: Harvard UP.
  • Hookway, Christopher. 1988. Quine. London: Polity Press.
  • Kirk, Robert. 1986. Translation Determined. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David. 1974. “Radical Interpretation.” Synthese 23: 331-344.
  • Lewis, David. 1975. “Languages and Language.” In Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume VII, edited by Keith Gunderson, 3–35. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Lewis, David. 1983. “New Work for a Theory of Universals,.” Australasian Journal o f Philosophy 61 (4): 343–77.
  • Lewis, David. 1984. “Putnam’s Paradox.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy LXII : 221-36.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1977. “Realism and Reason.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 50 (6): 483-498.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1980. “Models and Reality.” The Journal of Symbolic Logic 45 (3): 464-482.
  • Quine, W. V. 1951. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” The Philosophical Review 60 (1): 20-43.
  • Quine, W. V. 1960. Word and Object. US, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. 1968. “Reply to Chomsky.” Synthese 19 (1/2): 274-283.
  • Quine, W. V. 1969a. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. 1969b. “Epistemology Naturalized.” In Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, by W. V. Quine, 69–90. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. 1970. “On the Reasons for Indeterminacy of Translation.” The Journal of Philosophy 67 (6): 178-183.
  • Quine, W. V. 1973. The Roots of Reference . Open Court.
  • Quine, W. V. 1981. Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
  • Quine, W. V. 1987. “Indeterminacy of Translation Again.” The Journal of Philosophy 84 (1): 5-10.
  • Quine, W. V. 1990a. Pursuit of Truth. Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
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Author Information

Ali Hossein Khani
Institute for Research in Fundamental Sciences, and
Iranian Institute of Philosophy