David Lewis (1941–2001)

LewisDavid Lewis was an American philosopher and one of the last generalists, in the sense that he was one of the last philosophers who contributed to the great majority of sub-fields of the discipline. He made central contributions in metaphysics, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind. He also made important contributions in probabilistic and practical reasoning, epistemology, the philosophy of mathematics, logic, the philosophy of religion, and ethics, including metaethics and applied ethics. He published four monographs and over one hundred articles.

Lewis’s contributions in metaphysics include foundational work in the metaphysics of modality, in particular his peculiar view of concrete modal realism. He also developed influential views about properties, dispositions, time, persistence, and causation. In the philosophy of language, he made important contributions to our understanding of conditionals—counterfactuals in particular. He also developed an influential account of what it is for a group of individuals to use a language, based on his similarly influential account of what it is for a group of individuals to adopt a convention. In the philosophy of mind, Lewis gave an important defense of mind-brain identity theory, and also developed an account of mental content that was based on his metaphysics of properties and modality.

This article discusses in detail only Lewis’s most popularized and influential views and arguments in metaphysics, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind. His views on metaphysics are discussed first, but his views on language and mind are no less influential. The focus is on representative examples of his most important views and arguments concerning particular issues. The article begins with a few short remarks about his biography, and it ends with a discussion of some of his other philosophical contributions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Modality
  3. Properties
  4. Time and Persistence
  5. Humean Supervenience
  6. Causation
  7. Counterfactuals
  8. Convention
  9. Mind
  10. Other Work and Legacy
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Further Reading

1. Life

David Kellogg Lewis was born in 1941 in Oberlin, Ohio. He did his undergraduate studies at Swarthmore College in Pennsylvania. He studied abroad for a year in Oxford, where he was tutored by Iris Murdoch, and where he had the opportunity to attend lectures by J. L. Austin. These experiences inspired him to major in philosophy when he returned to Swarthmore. He did his Ph.D. at Harvard, studying under W. V. O. Quine, who supervised his dissertation, which was the basis of his first book, Convention (1969). There he met his wife Stephanie, with whom he ultimately co-authored three papers. He worked at UCLA from 1966 to 1970, moving from there to Princeton, where he remained until his death in 2001. He spent a lot of time visiting and working in Australia from 1971 onward. As a result, his work was deeply influenced by a number of Australian philosophers, and, in turn, his work has made an indelible mark on analytic philosophy in Australia.

2. Modality

If you are looking for what Lewis had to say about modality, you most likely want to learn about his well-known but rather idiosyncratic view, concrete modal realism. The study of modality is the study of the meanings of expressions like ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’. One can assert that Socrates was a blacksmith, which is, of course, false. But one can also assert something weaker, that, possibly, Socrates was a blacksmith (that is, Socrates could have been a blacksmith). Or one can assert something stronger, that, necessarily, he was a blacksmith (that is, he could not have failed to be a blacksmith). There are different senses of the words ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’. One is related to what someone knows. Perhaps you are unsure whether Socrates was a philosopher. You might say that Socrates could have been a philosopher, meaning that, for all you know, Socrates was a philosopher (that is, nothing you know contradicts it). Or perhaps you are certain that he was a philosopher, in which case you might simply say that Socrates was a philosopher. Or you might say something stronger—that Socrates must have been a philosopher (that is, what you know contradicts his not having been a philosopher). This sort of modality is epistemic modality. The sort of modality Lewis was most concerned with in his development of concrete modal realism is alethic modality, and concerns how things might have been, or how things must be, regardless of what anyone thinks or knows about it.

One of the central questions in the study of (alethic) modality is what ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’ mean. Most discussions of modality are framed in terms of modal logic, which is a formal language that is an extension of propositional or first-order logic, generated by adding the modal operators ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’, abbreviated by ‘\Box’ (the box) and ‘\Diamond’ (the diamond). One approach to the question of what the modal operators mean is simply not to answer to it, and to take them as primitive, that is, to take their meanings to be unanalyzable. But, the reader might think, this is not all that satisfying an approach to take. And Lewis would agree. One of the first things he does in his seminal work on concrete modal realism, On the Plurality of Worlds (1986b)—hereafter ‘Plurality’, is to argue that the modal operators should not be taken to be primitive, but instead should be given some sort of analysis in non-modal terms. In the mid-20th century, logicians developed semantics for a variety of systems of modal logic. These semantics provide truth conditions for the box and diamond in terms of mathematical objects which came to be called ‘possible worlds’, since they were naturally interpretable as ways that the world could have been. Trump won the 2016 U.S. presidential election. But it could have been otherwise. He could have lost. Imagine that Trump lost the 2016 election, and that as few other facts as possible are different in order for that to have happened. What you are imagining is a possible world. The basic idea behind any possible-worlds-based analysis of the modal operators is rather simple. One can state the conditions in which sentences involving the modal operators are true in terms of possible worlds, by quantifying over them with quantifiers that behave exactly like those of the universal and existential quantifiers from standard first-order logic, as follows:

\Box p =_{df} for every possible world w, p is true at w.

\Diamond p =_{df} for some possible world w, p is true at w.

So a statement is necessarily true if it is true at every possible world and false otherwise. And it is possibly true if it is true at at least one possible world and false otherwise. It is actually true if it is true at the actual world (that is, the possible world which we inhabit).

Lewis was not the first to interpret the objects quantified over in these analyses, and at which propositions are true (and false), as possible worlds. Thus he was not the first to admit possible worlds into his ontology. What sets him apart from many of those who came before was how he conceived of possible worlds. Typically, worlds were thought of as abstract objects, for example, as maximal consistent sets of sentences of some interpreted language (1986b: 142 ff.). A maximal set of sentences is one that contains, for every sentence p, either p or its negation. A consistent set of sentences is one which does not imply a contradiction. So, {grass is green, grass is not green} is not consistent. Nor is {grass is green, if grass is green then snow is white, snow is not white}. However, {grass is green, snow is white}, is consistent, though not maximal. For Lewis, a possible world is not some abstract object like a set of sentences. Instead, it is something akin to our own world—a continuum of spacetime filled with objects of various sorts, like the ones we ourselves are surrounded by—galaxies, stars, mountains, people, chairs, atoms, and so forth. Possible worlds, for Lewis, are concrete, just like this world in which we find ourselves. Strictly speaking, modal realism is just the view that possible worlds exist (whether one thinks they are abstract or concrete). Concrete modal realism is the view that they exist and are concrete objects. It is this latter, more controversial thesis that Lewis is famous for defending.

Lewis’s argument for concrete modal realism has two main parts. The first part consists in arguing for the ‘realist’ part of concrete modal realism, thereby providing reasons against the alternative of taking the modal operators as primitive. His argument for this consists in showing what possible worlds are good for. He highlights some things that can be done, or can more easily be done, if possible worlds are available. He highlights four such things. The first concerns certain modal locutions of natural language (English) that do not appear to be translatable into sentences with just the box and diamond. One sort of such locution involves modal comparisons. The example Lewis gives is: “a red thing could resemble an orange thing more closely than a red thing could resemble a blue thing” (1986b: 13). Lewis’s analysis involves quantification over possible individuals:

For some x and y (x is red and y is orange and for all u and v (if u is red and v is blue, then x resembles y more than u resembles v)). (1986b: 13)

But, he points out, one would not be able to translate the original sentence with just boxes and diamonds, since “formulas [of modal logic] get evaluated relative to a world, which leaves no room for cross-world comparisons” (1986b: 13). A realist about modality like Lewis, according to whom possible worlds, including the things in them, are as real as our own world and the things in it, is able to make these cross-world comparisons, and thus do justice to modal locutions of natural language that the modal primitivist cannot. He points out that this problem extends past natural language and into philosophical quasi-technical language. The basic idea behind supervenience, the philosophical workhorse of Lewis’s day, used to formulate various theses about dependence, is that the Fs supervene on the Gs if and only if there could be no difference in the Fs without a difference in the Gs. But, he notes (1986b: 14 ff.), attempts to capture this basic notion strictly in terms of the modal operators have failed, either resulting in something too weak or too strong.

The other jobs that Lewis thinks possible worlds can do are briefly outlined as follows. The second job is that talk of possible worlds allows us to make sense of the idea that some possibilities are closer to actuality than others (for example, Hillary Clinton’s having won the 2016 election is a closer possibility to actuality than her being in command of a colonial expedition to the Andromeda galaxy). Such comparisons are useful in making sense of counterfactual claims, that is, claims of the form ‘if it were the case that p then it would be the case that q’. Discussion of Lewis’s account of counterfactuals, and the role possible worlds play in it, occurs in section 7. The third job Lewis thinks that possible worlds can do is that they provide us with the resources to formulate what he takes to be the best theory of mental content, that is, the best theory about what our thoughts are about. He thinks such a theory will construe such contents as sets of possibilities, that is, as sets of possible worlds or possible individuals. The fourth job is that Lewis thinks that sets of possible individuals can play the role of properties, a discussion of which occurs in detail in the next section (section 3). One who takes the modal operators as primitive will not be able to accomplish these things—at least not as easily. This is already clear in the case of jobs three and four; a primitivist about modality will simply not have the worlds and individuals hanging around which they can collect up into sets to act as properties or the contents of our thoughts. While some may balk at some of the consequences of modal realism (such as that there exist infinitely many talking donkeys in other possible worlds, in virtue of it being possible that infinitely many talking donkeys exist), Lewis thinks that these theoretical benefits nonetheless provide reason to prefer modal realism to the primitivist alternative.

The second part of Lewis’s argument for concrete modal realism consists in arguing for the ‘concrete’ component of the view, and comprises a number of arguments against various forms of modal realism which regard possible worlds as abstract entities of one sort or another—what he calls ‘ersatz realism’. Often times, Lewis’s strategy is to argue that concrete modal realism does a better job solving certain problems as compared to these ersatzist alternatives. These arguments can be found in chapter three of Plurality. Just one example, conveniently connected to issues already discussed, is Lewis’s first argument against what he calls ‘linguistic ersatzism’, the view, already introduced, that possible worlds are maximal consistent sets of sentences. Lewis’s complaint is that linguistic ersatzism is committed to a primitive conception of modality—something which Lewis has already argued against, and something to which his own view is not similarly committed. Lewis provides two reasons to think linguistic ersatzism is committed to primitive modality, of which only the first is discussed here. The notion of consistency, in part in terms of which the linguistic ersatzist characterizes possible worlds, appears to be a modal notion: “a set of sentences is consistent iff those sentences, as interpreted, could all be true together” (1986b: 151 ital. orig.). Since Lewis’s own view is not committed to primitive modality, he is able to give a complete analysis of modality in terms of his particular brand of possible worlds, while the linguistic ersatzist is not.

Lewis’s view about modality is distinctive not only in that he takes possible worlds to be concrete. It is also distinctive in the way it analyzes possibility and necessity claims about individuals. Consider possibility claims. One might think that, for something to possibly be some way, there is a possible world at which that very thing is that way. So, for example, one might think that, for it to be true that Hubert Humphrey could have won the 1968 United States presidential election, there is a possible world at which Humphrey—the very same person who lost the 1968 election in the actual world—won the 1968 election. This is a very natural way to think about the analysis of possibility claims. The thesis that objects exist in more than one possible world is known as ‘transworld identity’. When worlds are taken to be concrete, transworld identity amounts to the claim that worlds share constituents, and, for this reason, Lewis calls it ‘(concrete) modal realism with overlap’. It is typically understood as the idea that a thing in this world which could have been qualitatively different than it actually is itself inhabits another possible world as well, in which it is qualitatively different. Instead of taking this approach, Lewis elects to reject any overlap among possible worlds, and to analyze possibility and necessity claims about individuals in terms of counterparts. In particular:

\Box Fa =_{df} for every possible world w at which a counterpart of a exists, Fa is true at w.

\Diamond Fa =_{df} for some possible world w at which a counterpart of a exists, Fa is true at w.

Lewis’s analysis of modality in terms of counterparts is known as ‘counterpart theory’. His complete view about modality, then, is what could be called ‘concrete modal realism with counterpart theory’.

Lewis discusses counterpart theory in Plurality, Ch. 4, ‘Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic’ (1968), and ‘Counterparts of Persons and Their Bodies’ (1971). When do x and y stand in the counterpart relation? Lewis thinks an object’s counterparts will track intrinsic similarity to some extent. But the notions come apart. This is mainly because the counterpart relation is context-sensitive. This is connected to a factor that Lewis thinks constitutes an advantage of counterpart theory to concrete modal realism with overlap, namely, it can help us make sense of variability in our judgments about what properties are essential to an object (1986b: 252–53). Consider a statue of a human being made of clay standing in a grotto. Many are inclined to say that it is essential to the statue that it has the shape it has. Were it another shape (for example, the shape of a horse), it would be a different statue. The lump of clay, however, would have been the same object even if it were shaped differently than it is. One solution to this problem is to say that there are actually two objects in the grotto: the statue, with a certain set of essential properties, and the lump of clay, with a different set. But Lewis took it to be a cost to be saddled with the possibility of multiple objects that occupy exactly the same spatial region. Lewis’s solution was to note that there can be a single object in the grotto but, when we are describing it as a statue (context 1), we are particularly interested in a certain set of the object’s properties, while, when we are thinking of it as a lump of clay (context 2), we are interested in a different set. In context 1, a lump of clay that was sourced from exactly the same place as the lump of clay in our world was sourced will not count as a counterpart of the object in the grotto if it has a different shape. But it will count as a counterpart of the object in the grotto in context 2. This allows Lewis to explain why, in context 1 but not context 2, we are inclined to say that the object has its shape essentially. In every possible world in which the object has a counterpart (described as a statue), that counterpart will have the same shape that it does.

Lewis’s key arguments against concrete modal realism with overlap appear in chapter four of Plurality. Another important argument is based on what Lewis calls ‘the problem of accidental intrinsics’. If possible worlds share parts (like Humphrey), it is not clear, given modal realism with overlap, how Humphrey could have different intrinsic properties at each world. He presumably does so, since, for at least some of the intrinsic properties he actually has, he could have lacked them, and for at least some of those he actually lacks, he could have had them. Lewis’s example concerns Humphrey’s shape. He actually has five fingers on his left-hand. But he could have had six. It will not do, Lewis thinks, for the proponent of overlap to relativize Humphrey’s property instantiation to worlds, saying, for example, that he has five fingers on his left-hand relative to the actual world, but that the world relative to which he has six fingers on his left-hand is a distinct world. This might work for a tower having different cross-sectional shapes on different levels, Lewis says, for example, being square on the third floor but circular on the fourth. But, he points out, it is only a part of the tower that has the shape at each level. According to modal realism with overlap, the whole of Humphrey exists at each world at which Humphrey exists. Similarly, the relativization strategy might work when Humphrey is honest according to one media source and dishonest according to other. The sources represent Humphrey in different ways. This might work for the ersatzist, whose ersatz individuals merely represent actual objects (as would, for example, a collection of predicates which are sufficient to represent Humphrey and no one else). According to the concrete modal realist, however, possible individuals are individuals, not representations of individuals. Finally, the relativization strategy might work with extrinsic relations like being a father of. A man might be father of Ed and son of Fred, that is, he might be father relative to Ed but not to Fred. But Humphrey’s five-fingeredness concerns his shape, and, as Lewis points out, “If we know what shape is, we know that it is a property, not a relation” (1986b: 204).

Counterpart theory is not without its detractors. Saul Kripke (1980: 45, fn. 13), for example, complains that, on Lewis’s view, possibility claims about an individual are not actually about that individual him-, her-, or itself, but, rather, about one of his, her, or its counterparts. When one says, for example, ‘Humphrey could have won the 1968 election’, the complaint goes, one is not saying something about the Humphrey we are acquainted with—that is, one is not strictly saying something about that very individual who, in our actual world, lost the 1968 election. Instead, one is saying something about an individual that exists in some other possible world, who is similar to our actual Humphrey in certain relevant respects and to sufficient degrees, who won the 1968 election in that world. Lewis is unimpressed with this objection (see, for example, Plurality: 196). He thinks that ‘Humphrey could have won the 1968 election’ is about our Humphrey—the Humphrey in the actual world. Granted, the analysis of this claim involves invoking a distinct entity—one of Humphrey’s counterparts. But it is the actual Humphrey who has the modal property of possibly winning. His counterpart, in contrast, has the property of winning (simpliciter) as well.

3. Properties

Lewis was a realist about properties. That is, he thought that properties exist. Properties can be intuitively understood as ways that things can be. Beyond that very general conception, disagreement arises. One major point of disagreement is about whether properties are repeatable—that distinct things which can be truly ascribed to be similar, in some respect, literally share something in common. This sort of property is usually termed a ‘universal’. Those who endorse this view are realists about universals. According to realists, greenness, for example, is a sui generis entity, distinct from any particular green thing, that is had, or instantiated by each green thing. Realists typically seek to explain the similarity among similar things (such as green things), by appealing to the fact that each instantiates the same universal (so each green thing instantiates greenness). Those who deny the claim that properties are repeatable are nominalists about universals. (This form of nominalism is stricter than that most commonly at issue in the philosophy of mathematics, which denies the existence of all abstract entities, including sets.) Nominalists about universals come is many flavors. David Armstrong (1978a) provides a relatively comprehensive taxonomy of them. Of particular relevance to Lewis’s views on the matter are class nominalists, who identify properties with the sets of the individuals that can be truly described as having them. On such a view, the property of greenness, for example, is identified with the set of green things SG, that is, as that set which contains frogs, grass, the Statue of Liberty, and so forth. To instantiate the property of greenness is just, according to the class nominalist, to belong to the set SG.

Lewis is officially a nominalist. He elected to identify properties with sets, and thus his view was a form a class nominalism. (Lewis had perfectly analogous views about relations.) As such, Lewis’s view faces challenges similar to those class nominalists face. Chief among them is the problem of coextensive properties, which is the concern that class nominalism must identify any properties which have the same extension (that is, apply to the same individuals), whether those properties are intuitively the same or not. The set of those organisms which have hearts, for example, is, as it happens, the same as that which have kidneys. As such, the class nominalist is forced to identify the property of being a cordate with that of being a renate. This seems wrong, however. The former property seems to concern one sort of organ, the latter a completely different sort of organ. These properties seem to be distinct.

Lewis’s solution to this problem is made possible by his views on modality. Lewis identifies each property not with the set of individuals in the actual world to which it can be truly ascribed. Rather, he identifies it with the set of individuals in all possible worlds to which it can be truly ascribed. Due to his views about modality, such individuals exist, and are thus available to be members of sets. The result is a class nominalism that is immune to the aforementioned problem. While it is actually true that every cordate is a renate and vice versa, this is an accident—the result of a long and complex series of events in the evolutionary history of life on Earth. But this history could have unfolded differently. Thus there are possible worlds, according to Lewis, which contain organisms which have hearts but which filter toxins in a different way. And there are worlds which contain organisms which have kidneys but deliver oxygen to cells in a different way. The existence of organisms of either sort ensures that the set of cordates is distinct from the set of renates, and so ensures that these properties are distinct. Of course, one might raise the concern that Lewis’s view has a perfectly analogous problem with properties whose extensions are identical in every possible world, as that of being a triangular polygon and being a trilateral (three-sided) polygon presumably are. For more on this issue, see section 2 of Sophie Allen’s article ‘Properties.’

So far, Lewis looks to be nothing more than a class nominalist, if a relatively sophisticated one, owing to the tricks he can draw from his concrete modal realist bag. But he recognizes that universals do important philosophical work. He enumerates the jobs that universals can do in ‘New Work for a Theory of Universals’ (1983a). To take just one example, Lewis admits that universals can serve to distinguish laws of nature from mere accidental regularities. Armstrong (1978b and 1983) employs universals in this way in his theory of lawhood. According to Armstrong, what ensures, for example, that:

 (G1)     All uranium spheres are less than one mile in diameter

is a law of nature, while:

(G2)     All gold spheres are less than one mile in diameter

is not, is that (G1) is made true not just by the contingent fact that there are no uranium spheres that are one mile in diameter or larger. It is made true by a certain fact that holds at certain worlds about the universals being a uranium sphere and being less than one mile in diameter. These universals jointly instantiate a second-order universal (second-order because it relates universals rather than particulars), which relates these two universals in such a way that it guarantees, at any world at which these universals stand in this relationship, that there will never be a uranium sphere with a diameter of one mile or more (since the relationship between the universals will ensure that any such sphere will explode). There is no such fact concerning the universals being a gold sphere and being less than one mile in diameter. What makes (G2) true is a fact that has nothing to do with these universals. Instead, it has to do only with certain historical contingencies about our world that suffice to explain why, in fact, no gold spheres one mile in diameter or larger ever naturally developed or were artificially constructed. With just his properties, Lewis does not have the resources to explain this difference. Lewis’s properties are abundant. Any old collection of things count as a property. Thus Lewis would have no basis on which to say that the property of being a uranium sphere is related to the property of being less than one mile in diameter in any way that is more (or less) significant than the relation between being a gold sphere and being less than one mile in diameter. He can say that the set-theoretic intersection of each pair is empty, that is, the properties do not share any members (remember, for Lewis, properties are sets). But the similarity of being a uranium sphere and being a gold sphere in this respect would provide him with no basis on which to say that the first figures into a law of nature while the second does not.

Lewis rejects Armstrong’s approach to lawhood (along with his commitment to the existence of universals), and instead characterizes a law as a statement of a regularity that belongs to a suitable deductive system, which (i) is true, (ii) is closed under strict implication (that is, whatever is necessarily implied by any set of statements in the system is also in the system), and (iii) is balanced with respect to simplicity and empirical informativeness. In particular, the system must be as simple as it can be without being informationally too impoverished to do justice to the empirical facts about the world, but, to the extent that it does not sacrifice a sufficient degree of simplicity, it must be as informative as it can be. Nonetheless, Lewis recognizes a problem with his view, and, while he does not need to endorse universals to solve it, he requires something more than his ontology of properties. The problem is that there is a way for a deductive system to meet Lewis’s criteria (i)–(iii) that is clearly undesirable. Suppose we have discovered the best system S for describing the actual world. The way scientists have currently formulated it is rather complicated. But some wiseacre comes up with the idea to introduce a new predicate F into our language and stipulate that F is satisfied by all and only those things at the worlds at which S is true. But suppose further that this wiseacre refuses to provide an analysis of F. S can then be axiomatized with the single axiom ‘\forall x Fx’. This theory is very simple, and it is, in a sense, as informationally enriched as it can be, since it perfectly selects the worlds at which S is true. Nonetheless, the theory is useless to the curious inhabitant. It tells them nothing about what their world is like.

The first step of Lewis’s solution to this problem is to adopt some primitive distinctions among properties. There are those that are perfectly natural, those which are natural to some degree (though not perfectly natural), and those which are unnatural. Lewis (1983a: 346 ff.) imagines that the perfectly natural properties will be those properties that would correspond to universals in Armstrong’s metaphysics, which is sparse enough to enable him to distinguish between laws (for example, being made of uranium). Less natural (but still comparatively natural) properties would correspond to families of suitably related universals (for example, being metallic). The spectrum would continue until wholly unnatural, gerrymandered properties are reached (for example, being either the Eiffel Tower or a part of the moon). Lewis notes that admitting universals into one’s ontology can provide the basis for a distinction between more and less natural properties, in the way just gestured at in the comparison with Armstrong’s metaphysics. But he notes that the distinction can be taken to be a primitive one between properties (classes) instead. This is Lewis’s preference; it allows him to avoid realism about universals and thus remain a nominalist. Lewis then solves the problem of the true but useless theory ‘\forall x Fx’ by imposing a further criterion that the most suitable deductive system which sets the laws apart from the non-laws is one whose axioms are stated in a way that refers only to perfectly natural properties.

4. Time and Persistence

Lewis’s most well-known writings about time have to do with the persistence of objects. Lewis was a four-dimensionalist. That is, he believed that there exist four-dimensional objects, extended not just in space, but in time as well. Four-dimensionalism is to be contrasted with three-dimensionalism, according to which the only objects which exist are extended in space only (if they are extended at all that is, so as not to rule out the existence of non-extended points of space). Lewis’s commitment to four-dimensionalism was a result of his endorsement of two theses: (1) unrestricted composition, and (2) eternalism. Unrestricted composition is the thesis that any objects compose some object. So not only do my head, torso, arms, and legs compose an object (me), my head and the near side of the moon compose an object as well. Eternalism is a view about the ontology of time, according to which past, present, and future times, objects, and events are equally real. Eternalism is to be contrasted with presentism, the view that only the present time and present objects and events are real, and with the growing block theory, the view that past and present times, objects, and events are real, but future ones are not. Committing oneself to unrestricted composition and eternalism requires one to countenance four-dimensional objects. Not only do any presently existing objects compose an object, past ones do too. And, crucially, objects which exist at different times compose objects as well, such as the object that is composed of George Washington’s first wig and the sandwich someone just made for lunch.

As strange a view as four-dimensionalism might seem, Lewis has good reasons for adopting it. These reasons concern issues connected to the persistence of objects through time. Lewis is a perdurantist, and as such believes that for an object to persist through an interval of time is for it to perdure, that is, to have proper parts, one of which is wholly present at each moment of that interval. Perdurantism is to be contrasted with endurantism, according to which an object’s persistence through an interval of time amounts to the whole object being wholly present at each moment of that interval. Perdurantism, obviously, requires the truth of four-dimensionalism, at least assuming that some objects do in fact persist through time. This is because any such object must have parts which exist at different times. According to perdurantism (at least Lewis’s version—Theodore Sider develops another version of it in 1996 and 2001), the objects that we refer to with our names and definite descriptions are actually four-dimensional worm-like objects. We are acquainted with them by being acquainted with some of their parts at various times. So, for example, the Taj Mahal is a spacetime worm that extends back to about 1653. I am acquainted with it only insofar as I am acquainted with one of its parts, which extends through time for about two hours, which I toured on November 28, 2015. Even human beings, according to Lewis, are actually spacetime worms. They are not themselves shaped like those objects depicted in anatomy textbooks. Instead, those diagrams depict certain parts of human beings that exist at instants of time.

Lewis’s perdurantism might seem like an odd view, but, he thinks, it solves an important problem. Its competitor endurantism faces an important problem which Lewis calls the ‘problem of temporary intrinsics’ (1986b: 202–04 and 2002), which is analogous to the problem of accidental intrinsics which faces concrete modal realism with overlap (see the discussion in section 2). Everyone agrees that objects change over time. A person may previously have been standing and currently be sitting. The endurantist must say that the very same object has both the property of standing and sitting. This looks, at least at first glance, to be a contradiction. Endurantists typically say that the contradiction is only apparent, and they explain it away in various ways. But Lewis does not think any of those strategies succeed. One strategy endurantists use is to say that what we thought were properties, instantiated by a single object, are actually relations, instantiated by an object and a time. There is no contradiction involved in one’s both standing and sitting, since one is standing in relation to one (past) time and sitting in relation to another (the present time). But Lewis thinks that if an intrinsic property like shape (that is, a property having only to do with an object, and nothing to do with how it is related to other objects) is anything, it is not a relation (see the Lewis quotation at the end of section 2). Another strategy endurantists use to explain away the apparent contradiction resulting from temporary intrinsics is to adopt presentism. Since only the present is real, the person has the property of sitting. They do not have the property of standing. (They did have the property of standing when that moment was present. But it is present no longer, and thus is not real.) But, Lewis thinks, presentism comes at a high cost. The presentist must reject the idea that a person has a past and (typically) a future as well, since, according to presentism, neither the past nor future exists. Lewis points out that perdurantism solves the problem nicely. There is something that has the property of sitting—a part of the person that is wholly present at a certain moment in the past. And there is something that has the property of standing—a part of the person that is wholly present at the present moment. But there is no contradiction since these are distinct parts of this person. Lewis’s perdurantist solution appeals to the same consideration which allows us to say that there is no contradiction in my left hand currently being fist-shaped and my right hand currently being open-palmed. They are different parts of me, and so are distinct objects. There is no contradiction in distinct objects having incompatible properties.

5. Humean Supervenience

Lewis believes that everything in the actual world is material. He also defends a thesis he calls ‘Humean supervenience’. Humean supervenience is the thesis that, in Lewis’s words, “all there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact, just one little thing and another” (1986c: ix). Hume was known for rejecting the idea that there were hidden connections behind conjoined phenomena which necessitate their conjunction. He was not against there being regularities in the world. His objection was to these regularities being explained by necessary connections (such as Armstrong’s second-order states of affairs relating universals—see section 3). Lewis is sympathetic to this view, and also likes the idea that macroscopic phenomena are reducible to certain basic microscopic phenomena. These microscopic phenomena Lewis takes to be just the geometrical arrangement of the world’s spacetime points, and the instantiation of certain perfectly natural properties at each of those points. Lewis takes this to mean that fundamental entities are point-sized, or, perhaps, that the fundamental entities are the spacetime points themselves.

Lewis is willing to admit that other possible worlds sufficiently different from our own might be different in this last respect. In particular, he thinks that it might take more than just the point-wise distribution of instantiations of perfectly natural properties to determine all of the phenomena in the world. Now the scientifically informed reader might object that our current physical theories show that this is not true even at our world. Some of our most promising physical theories, for example, posit spatially extended fields as being among the fundamental constituents of reality, rather than point-like entities. As Daniel Nolan (2005: 29 ff.) and Brian Weatherson (2016: sec. 5) point out, Lewis is concerned more with illustrating the defensibility of this latter thesis than with its truth. It could be regarded as an idealization or simplification, suitable for philosophical purposes, in terms of which Lewis formulates his thesis of Humean supervenience. If it turns out that the fundamental furniture of the world actually consists of spatially extended entities, rather than point-like entities, Lewis will be content to backpedal a bit, and formulate Humean supervenience in a way that is consistent with that, such as, for example, claiming that what is true at a given world is determined by the geometrical arrangement of its spacetime points and where perfectly natural properties are instantiated at the spacetime regions occupied by the fundamental entities. But, as Lewis suggests in ‘Humean Supervenience Debugged’ (1994a: 474), he expects that, even once we have settled on the nature of the physical world, we will find that the profusion of phenomena at our world can be explained by a comparatively sparse base of simple entities instantiating comparatively basic properties and perhaps also standing in comparatively basic relations.

6. Causation

Lewis is known for his counterfactual analysis of causation. Lewis made significant contributions to the semantics of counterfactuals, which will be discussed in the next section. The following is perhaps the most straightforward way to provide an analysis of causation in terms of counterfactuals, though, as we will see, it is importantly different from Lewis’s account:

x causes y iff x and y occur, and if x had not occurred, then y would not have occurred.

Counterfactual analyses of causation are to be contrasted with productive accounts, according to which x causes y iff x produces some change in properties in y, where the notion of production is typically taken to be primitive. Both sorts of analysis face their own characteristic set of problems. This article discusses only what is the most well-known problem for the above counterfactual account, the problem of causal preemption (or causal redundancy) since it will help the reader understand why Lewis develops his own counterfactual analysis of causation in the way that he does. Suppose that Alice and Bob are throwing rocks at bottles and Alice throws her rock at one of the bottles and hits it, shattering it. Intuitively, Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter. But suppose also that Bob was ready to throw his rock at the same bottle just in case Alice did not throw, and, moreover, he has perfect aim. Thus Bob’s rock would have struck the bottle, causing it to shatter, had Alice not thrown. Due to this fact, the right side of the above counterfactual analysis of causation is not satisfied in this case. It is not the case that, had Alice not thrown, the bottle would not have shattered. This is because, given the way the case was set up, Bob’s throw would have ensured that the bottle would shatter. Yet, intuitively, Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter. Something seems to be wrong with the above counterfactual analysis of causation.

In order to avoid this problem, in ‘Causation’ (1973a), Lewis distinguishes between causation and causal dependence. The above analysis is actually the analysis Lewis provides of causal dependence. He defines causation in terms of chains of causal dependence (where a chain might, but typically will not, have only two nodes). So, for example, if y causally depends on x, and z causally depends on y, then x causes z, even if z might have occurred even if x had not. Lewis thinks there is independent motivation for this move, as he thinks there are often cases in which it is natural to say that x causes z even when z does not counterfactually depend on x. This is explained by Lewis by positing a chain of causal dependence. In general, counterfactual dependence is not transitive. The light would not have come on if I had not flicked the switch. I would not have flicked the switch if I had been out running errands. But the light may well have come on just then even if I had been out running errands. Another member of my family might have walked into the room and flicked the switch. Lewis deals with cases of causal preemption, like the one involving Alice and Bob, by pointing out that, in such cases, there will nonetheless be a chain of counterfactual (and thus causal) dependence which we can invoke to secure the truth of the causal claims we think are true. Lewis grants that it is not the case that, if Alice had not thrown her rock, then the bottle would not have shattered (since Bob would have fired). But, he thinks this establishes only that the bottle’s shattering doesn’t causally depend on Alice’s throw. Since causes need only be linked by chains of causal dependence to their effects, Lewis can still say that Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter. He would note first that:

(CF1) the bottle would not have shattered if Alice’s rock had not been speeding toward it.

This is true because, by the time the rock was speeding toward the bottle, Bob has seen that Alice had thrown her rock, and so has refrained from throwing his own rock. Lewis would note second that:

(CF2) Alice’s rock would not have been speeding toward the bottle if Alice had not thrown it.

This sets up a chain of causal dependence between Alice’s throw and the bottle’s shattering, which is enough, on Lewis’s account, to secure the desired conclusion that Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter.

Lewis’s counterfactual account of causation, as just explicated, still has a problem with preemption. This is the problem of late preemption, in which one causal process is preempted by the effect rather than by an event earlier in the process. So, for example, rather than Bob’s throw being preempted by Alice’s throwing her rock, suppose Bob threw his rock a split second after Alice threw hers, and that his rock did not hit the bottle only because the bottle had shattered a split second before Bob’s rock reached the bottle’s former position. In this case (adapted from Hall 2004), (CF1) would be false, and so Lewis would be unable to set up a chain of counterfactual dependence on which he could base a determination that Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter. This problem led Lewis to revise his view significantly in ‘Causation as Influence’ (2000a and 2004), wherein he analyzes causation in terms of the notion of influence. Lewis characterizes influence as follows:

C influences E iff there is a substantial range C1, C2,… of different not-too-distant alterations of C (including the actual alteration of C) and there is a range E1, E2,… of alterations of E, at least some of which differ, such that if C1 had occurred, E1 would have occurred, and if C2 had occurred, E2 would have occurred, and so on. Thus we have a pattern of counterfactual dependence of whether, when, and how on whether, when, and how. (2000a: 190 and 2004: 91)

The precise circumstances in which an event occurs, including the exact time at which it occurs, and the manner in which it occurs, are relevant to whether one event influences another. On this characterization, Alice’s throw influenced the bottle’s shattering, since it made a difference, for example, to the exact manner in which it occurred. Let’s say, for example, that her rock hit the right side of the bottle, and that it shattered to the left. But if she had thrown a bit to the left, the bottle would have shattered towards the right. The same is not true of Bob’s throw. If he had thrown a bit to the left, the bottle still would have shattered in the way that it did, since Alice’s rock would still have hit it in the way that it did. This allows Lewis to say that Alice’s throw caused the bottle to shatter, despite the fact that Bob’s rock was on its way to ensure that it shatters in case Alice’s aim happened to be off.

Another sort of problem that gives Lewis trouble involve absences. It is not clear how Lewis’s view can deal with cases like when an absence of light causes a plant to die. There is no event in terms of which we can formulate any counterfactuals of the form ‘if x had not occurred, then y would not have occurred’ in such cases. Lewis (for example, 2000a, sec. X) deals with absences by admitting that there are some instances of causation that do not have causes (understood as events). Instead, he thinks that it is true to say that the absence of light caused the plant to die as long the right sorts of counterfactuals are true, for example, ‘if there had been more light over the past few weeks, the plant would have survived’.

7. Counterfactuals

Lewis makes use of some of the tools of his theory of modality in his contributions to the literature on the semantics of counterfactuals. A counterfactual is a certain type of conditional. A conditional is a sentence synonymous to one of the form ‘if…, then…’. An indicative conditional is a conditional whose verbs are in the indicative mood, for example:

(1) If Tom is skiing, then he is not in his office.

Other conditionals are in the subjunctive mood, for example:

(2) If Tom were a skiing instructor, then he would be in great shape.

Many of the subjunctive conditionals that we use on a day-to-day basis, such as (2), are counterfactual conditionals, that is, conditionals whose antecedents express statements that are contrary to what is actually the case. (Suppose Tom is in fact an accountant.) The material conditional ‘’ from propositional logic can be used to adequately translate many natural language conditionals. Recall that, as an operator that is truth-functional, all there is to the meaning of ‘p \rightarrow q’ is its truth conditions as given by its truth table, according to which it is true if either p is false or q is true, and it is false otherwise (that is, when p is true and q is false).

\begin{tabular}{c c | c} $p$ & $q$ & $p \rightarrow q$ \\ \hline T & T & T \\ T & F & F \\ F & T & T \\ F & F & T \\ \end{tabular}

But there are many other natural language conditionals which cannot be adequately translated with the material conditional. Counterfactuals form an important class of such conditionals.

Before Lewis, the most well-worked-out accounts of counterfactuals construed them as strict conditionals meeting certain conditions (in particular, see Goodman 1947 and 1955). A strict conditional is just a material conditional that holds of necessity, that is, a statement of the form ‘\Box (p \rightarrow q)’. The simplest strict-conditional account of counterfactuals (which is admittedly simpler than Goodman’s, but will be sufficient to motivate Lewis’s account) analyzes each counterfactual in terms of the corresponding strict conditional, that is,

p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q’ is true iff \Box (p \rightarrow q).

(Following Lewis in Counterfactuals, (1973b, 1–2), ‘if it had been the case that p then it would have been the case that q’ is abbreviated with ‘p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q’.) This account is inadequate because a strict conditional is like a material conditional insofar as strengthening its antecedent cannot take the entire conditional from being true to being false, whereas this is not so for counterfactuals (see Lewis 1973b: ch. 1, Nolan 2005: 74 ff., and Weatherson 2016: sec. 3.1). Recall from propositional logic that the following inference pattern is valid.

\( \begin{array}{l} p \rightarrow q \\ \hline (p \land r) \rightarrow q \end{array} \)

The analogous inference pattern involving the strict conditional is also valid:

\( \begin{array}{l} \Box (p \rightarrow q) \\ \hline \Box [(p \land r) \rightarrow q] \end{array} \)

But the analogous inference for the counterfactual conditional is not valid:

\( \begin{array}{l} p \ensuremath{\mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{$\rightarrow$}}} q \\ \hline (p \land r) \ensuremath{\mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{$\rightarrow$}}} q \end{array} \)

Suppose that the counterfactual (2) above is true, and consider the following strengthening of it:

(3) If Tom were a skiing instructor and he always wore a robotic exoskeleton so that he did not ever expend any energy, then he would be in great shape.

(3) appears to be false. If he never expended any energy, he would not be in great shape. But (3) follows from (2) on the strict conditional account because of the validity of the above inference pattern involving the strict conditional. It does not, however, follow on Lewis’s account.

Lewis analyzes counterfactuals in terms of possible worlds, and the basic idea behind his analysis is similar to that of Robert Stalnaker (1968). Stalnaker proposed the following analysis of counterfactuals in terms of the similarity of worlds:

p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q’ is true iff the most similar p-world to the actual world is also a q-world, where a p-world is just a world at which p is true.

(Technically this only specifies the truth conditions for counterfactuals that are non-vacuously true, that is, when there is at least one p-world most similar to the actual world. But we can ignore vacuously true counterfactuals.) Lewis has a helpful metaphor which he employs when thinking about the similarity between worlds. He thinks about possible worlds as if they were arranged in a space, with the actual world at the center, with larger and smaller degrees of similarity to the actual world being represented by larger and smaller distances from (closeness to) the actual world. Counterfactual (2) above, for example, is true, on Stalnaker’s account, because the most similar (closest) world to the actual world at which Tom is a skiing instructor is one at which he is in great shape. A world in which Tom wears a robotic exoskeleton while teaching people to ski (thus keeping him in poor shape) is plausibly less similar to (farther away from) the actual world than one in which he teaches people to ski using his own muscles. (3), however, requires one to look at the closest world at which both Tom is a skiing instructor and Tom wears a robotic exoskeleton. And in that world, plausibly, Tom is not in great shape. It would require even more changes in the actual facts to ensure that Tom would be in great shape in such a world (for example, Tom has taken a pill—the result of a medical breakthrough that has not occurred at the actual world—that keeps his body in great shape even if he does not exercise).

There are important differences between the analysis Lewis ultimately settles on and Stalnaker’s. For one, Lewis rejects Stalnaker’s assumption that there will always be a unique p-world that is most similar to the actual world. As a result, the analysis that Lewis adopts is closer to the following:

p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q’ is true iff all p-worlds that are most similar to the actual world are also q-worlds.

Lewis also challenges the tempting assumption that there is a closest “sphere” of p-worlds to the actual world (this is the Limit Assumption—see 1973b: 19 ff.). Without it, counterfactuals are best analyzed as follows:

p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q’ is true iff there is a (p \land q)-world that is more similar to the actual world than any (p \land \neg q)-world.

Finally, Lewis questions the tempting assumption that each world is more similar to itself than any other world (1973b: 28 ff.). Making this assumption results in p \land q entailing p \mathrel{\Box\kern-1.5pt\raise1pt\hbox{\rightarrow}} q. So, for instance, ‘Tom is a skiing instructor and Tom is in great shape’ would entail (2). But it would seem odd for this counterfactual to be true if its antecedent were not in fact false. In the end, Lewis sticks with this assumption for technical reasons (cf. Weatherson 2016: sec. 3.2).

Lewis’s analysis of counterfactuals is not without problems. Kit Fine (1975), for instance, argues that Lewis’s account, as it stands, makes the following counterfactual false, though it is presumably true:

(4) If Nixon had pressed the button, there would have been nuclear war.

It seems that any of the worlds in which Nixon pressed the button that are most similar to the actual world are ones in which there was no nuclear war, but in which instead some relatively minor miracle occurred—some violation of the natural laws of our world, perhaps specific to the exact location of the button and the specific time at which Nixon pressed it—which renders the button momentarily useless. To surmount this problem, Lewis says more about similarity in ‘Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow’ (1979b). He had already noted that similarity would be context-sensitive in his book Counterfactuals. That is, he had already noted that the “distance” that possible worlds are from the actual world might be different for the same counterfactual when it is uttered in different contexts. If, for example, (2) were uttered in a context in which it had already been established that Tom owned a robotic exoskeleton and was considering using it, the closest worlds to the actual world would include those in which he wore it and thus maintained a poor physique, thus rendering the counterfactual false instead of true. But Lewis says little else about similarity there.

To deal with Fine’s challenge, Lewis outlines a number of rules which one should abide by while measuring similarity given a context:

(1) It is of the first importance to avoid big, widespread diverse violations of law.

(2) It is of the second importance to maximize the spatiotemporal region throughout which a perfect match of particular fact prevails.

(3) It is of the third importance to avoid even small, localized, simple violations of law.

(4)  It is of little or no importance to secure approximate similarity of particular fact, even in matters that concern us greatly. (1979b: 472)

Lewis assumes determinism throughout his discussion. That is, he assumes that everything that occurs is necessitated by the events which occurred earlier together with the laws of nature. Lewis thinks that determinism better explains, in comparison to indeterminism, the fact that counterfactuals which concern events which occur at different times exhibit an asymmetry which encodes the fixedness of the past and the openness of the future (1979b: 460). Given the assumption of determinism, and the assumption that Nixon did not press the button in the actual world, any world in which Nixon did press the button must either (i) be a world in which a small miracle occurred to enable Nixon to press the button despite having the same history as the actual world or (ii) be a world that has a completely different history than our own world, to enable Nixon’s pressing of the button to be necessitated by that history. By Lewis’s rules above, type (i) worlds are more similar to the actual world than type (ii) worlds, since the latter violate the more important rule (2). Type (i) worlds are identical to the actual world up to the point at which Nixon is considering pressing the button. Type (ii) worlds have completely different histories. Type (i) worlds violate only the less important rule (3), since they feature a small miracle. Lewis grants that there will be worlds with the same history as the actual world in which Nixon presses the button but no nuclear war ensues because another miracle causes a malfunction in the button, preventing the warheads from launching. But these worlds will have to involve miracles in addition to the one which enables Nixon to press the button. This is a further violation of rule (3). In contrast, a world in which Nixon presses the button and nuclear war ensues will violate the less important rule (4). As a result, Lewis concludes, the most similar worlds to the actual world are worlds in which Nixon presses the button and nuclear war ensues. Lewis’s account, therefore, makes the above counterfactual (4) true, as it should be.

8. Convention

Lewis’s earliest work is devoted to developing an account of what it is for a group of individuals to use a language. The lion’s share of his work on this issue can be found in his first book, Convention (1969) (see also ‘Languages and Language’ (1975)). Lewis makes use of the notion of a convention in his analysis of language use, and a significant part of the importance of this book is due to the account of conventions that he offers. Conventions about language use are by no means the only ones around. It is, for example, a convention in the United States to drive on the right-hand side of the road. An initial picture of convention that one might have is one of convention as the result of agreement. That is, one might think that a convention among some individuals is the result of an agreement they make with one another. However, individuals appear able to make an agreement only in a language. Thus one cannot give an analysis of what it is for a group of individuals to speak a language in terms of convention, understood in terms of agreement, since it would be circular; it would presuppose that these individuals speak a language (cf. Weatherson 2016: sec. 2). Lewis’s analysis of conventions avoids this problem.

What motivates the implementation of conventions are coordination problems. Roughly, a coordination problem is a problem facing two or more people where the best outcome for each person can result only by the coordination of their actions. Suppose, for example, that each member of a group of people is trying to decide which side of the road to drive on. Consider one such individual, Carol. Carol might have her own basic unconditioned preference on which side to drive. She might, for instance, prefer to drive on the right-hand side of the road because the steering wheel of her car is situated on the right-hand side, and she would like to place herself as far from oncoming traffic as possible. Still, she has a conditional preference concerning driving on the left-hand side of the road. She would prefer to drive on the left-hand side of the road on the condition that everyone else drives on the left-hand side of the road. This is rooted in Carol’s desire to minimize the chances she is hit by oncoming traffic. We can suppose that everyone (or at least almost everyone) in the group has the conditional preferences that she prefers to drive on the left (right) side of the road on the condition that everyone else drives on the left (right) side of the road. Notice that there are two ways to solve these individuals’ coordination problem: (1) they might adopt the convention that everyone drive on the left side of the road, and (2) they might adopt the convention that everyone drive on the right side of the road. When everyone in the group settles on one of these options, what results is a coordination equilibrium.

It is important to note that there is more than one equilibrium which the members of the group can adopt to create the best outcome for all of them. It is in such circumstances that a convention must be adopted. In other words, some coordination problems will have only a single solution, in which case there is no need for a convention. People will act in such a way just because it creates the best outcome for them (and for everyone else). Suppose, for example, that there is a group of farmers that sell a certain product, say, coffee, to a population. We can suppose that there is a certain price p below which each farmer will fail to make an adequate profit on each item, which would ultimately drive them out of business. And we can suppose that there is certain price p′ above which consumers will forgo the product, substituting it with another less expensive product, like chicory or tea, available from others, or changing their habits altogether to eliminate a bitter morning drink from their diet. Assuming that p′ > p, we can expect these farmers (each of whom, we are supposing, is acting in her own self-interest) to offer their product somewhere within the price range bounded by p and p′. This outcome is not the result of the adoption of a convention among these farmers. It is instead a result of each farmer acting in her own self-interest, of there being only one way for each farmer to achieve the best outcome for herself, and of her accurately observing the character of her market. Solving other coordination problems, however, such as the question of which side of the road everyone should drive on, requires a convention, since there are two possible ways to achieve the best outcome for everyone involved.

Of course, everyone in Carol’s group could get together and have a vote to decide which side of the road everyone in their group should drive on, in effect making an explicit agreement with one another. Perhaps the majority of car owners have an unconditioned preference like Carol’s, and prefer, for whatever reason, to drive on the right-hand side of the road. In this case, the result will be that everyone agrees to drive on the right-hand side of the road. But, importantly, agreement is not the only way to establish a convention (1969: 33–34). It might be that, as a matter pure chance, the first handful of people on the road with their cars happened to share Carol’s unconditional preference to drive on the right, and this effectively forced the latecomers to drive on the right in order to avoid the preexisting oncoming traffic.

In the spirit of the above considerations, Lewis ultimately settles on the following analysis of a convention:

A regularity R in the behavior of members of a population P when they are agents in a recurrent situation S is a convention if and only if it is true that, and it is common knowledge in P that, in almost any instance of S among members of P,

        1. almost everyone conforms to R;
        2. almost everyone expects almost everyone else to conform to R;
        3. almost everyone has approximately the same preferences regarding all possible combinations of actions;
        4. almost everyone prefers that any one conform to R, on condition that almost everyone conform to R;
        5. almost everyone would prefer that any one conform to R′, on condition that almost everyone conform to R′,

where R′ is some possible regularity in the behavior of members of P in S, such that no one in almost any instance of S among members of P could conform both to R and to R′. (1969: 78)

One aspect of this analysis worth noting immediately is its tolerance for a certain number of exceptions (embodied by the consistent appearance of occurrences of ‘almost’). This is to prevent the analysis from failing to count as a convention what we would think should be counted as one. Of course, from time to time, there are, unfortunately, those who drive on the wrong side of the road. But these isolated incidents should not preclude the existence of a convention in the population to which these individuals belong, even if it did not come about as a result of an agreement. Suppose that the convention to drive on the right side of the road in Carol’s group arose by chance as described above, with all later drivers conforming to the preference of the first few drivers to drive on the right-hand side of the road. After weeks of this, we would not expect a single individual driving a single time on the left side of the road, for whatever the reason (whether the result of negligence or an intentional act of rebellion), to prevent the regularity that had emerged in the behavior of drivers in the group from being a convention. The convention is still there. It is just that this individual has failed, on this occasion, to act in accordance with it.

Another thing worth noting about Lewis’s analysis of convention is that, by ‘common knowledge that p’, Lewis does not require that p be true (1969: 52 ff.). Instead, it is enough that everyone has reason to believe that p, everyone has reason to believe that everyone has reason to believe that p, and so on. Whether or not anyone in fact believes that p, or in fact believes that everyone has reason to believe that p, and so on, is inconsequential to the analysis. This is why Lewis must specify separately that it is true that conditions (1)–(5) hold. Lewis adopts this characterization of common knowledge because he does not want to require, effectively, that, for a convention to hold, everyone believes that it holds. While he expects many people to be adept enough reasoners that they will come to believe the things they have reason to believe, he wants to allow for exceptions—individuals who never explicitly represent to themselves all of the various conditions which must hold for a convention to be present. But the presence of such individuals, of course, should not prevent a convention from being present (1969: 60 ff.).

Conditions (1) and (2) of Lewis’s analysis of convention are relatively straightforward, and they have been discussed above. Condition (4) is relatively straightforward as well. It requires, for example, that the vast majority of Carol’s group prefers that everyone in the group drives on the right-hand side of the road on the condition that almost everyone drives on the right-hand side of the road. If a substantial portion of the population did not desire that a convention be observed, the convention could easily collapse at any time, even if almost everyone had been observing it up to that time.  This sort of situation is often exactly what is present just before a convention is abandoned. Consider public order—the tendency for people in many societies to act in an orderly and organized way while out in public. It is not implausible to say that public order is a convention which exists in these societies. And when it does, it is often, at least in part, the result of people wanting to live in a peaceful and orderly environment. But a sufficient number of grievances can develop within a population to the point where their preference for those grievances to be addressed trumps their preference for a peaceful and orderly environment. In such circumstances, the convention of public order can disappear. Condition (5) is what distinguishes conventions from cases where only one coordination equilibrium is possible, as in the example with the farmers selling their coffee. In that case, there existed no other regularity in the behavior of the farmers other than selling their coffee in the price range between p and p′ that would have resulted in the best outcome for each of them.

Condition (3) is a bit trickier to understand. It is connected to formal issues of game theory—particularly with the question of whether a coordination equilibrium is possible. The basic idea behind it can be illustrated with an example. For simplicity, suppose that Carol and Diane are the only people in the group. There are four possible combinations of actions to the coordination problem of which side of the road on which to drive:

(a)  Carol drives on the left and Diane drives on the left.

(b)  Carol drives on the left and Diane drives on the right.

(c)  Carol drives on the right and Diane drives on the left.

(d)  Carol drives on the right and Diane drives on the right.

And there are, in principle, twenty-four possible ways for each of Carol and Diane to order these actions according to her preference. By adopting condition (3), Lewis aims to ensure that there is enough agreement between the preferences of Carol and Diane to make a coordination equilibrium possible. If, for example, Carol prefers (d) to (a), and (a) to either (b) or (c), then an equilibrium will be unreachable if, for example, Diane prefers either of (b) and (c) to either of (a) or (d). (This is in part because Diane represents a significant portion of the group.)

Now that Lewis’s analysis of convention has been introduced, one can appreciate how he employs it in his account of what it is for a group of individuals to speak a language. Lewis provides an in-depth discussion of what he takes a language to be (1969: 160 ff.). But it should be noted that, for Lewis, a language is not just a collection of basic vocabulary items (a lexicon) and a set of rules for arranging them into more complex elements of the language, including sentences of arbitrary complexity (a grammar). It also includes an interpretation, that is, a function which assigns to each sentence of the language a set of conditions under which that sentence is true (and false). (Technically, the function assigns truth conditions to each possible utterance of each sentence, since Lewis wants to accommodate the possibility of ambiguous sentences, which are standard features of natural languages. Lewis also makes allowance for imperative sentences as well, which are “true” just in case they are obeyed.) So, a language that is just like English except that ‘p or q’ is true iff p is true and q is true and ‘p and q’ is true iff p is true or q is true would not be English, but some other language. Though it consists of the same basic vocabulary items and grammar as English, and thus the same sentences, it supplies interpretations of some of those sentences that are different from those that English supplies. In particular, it switches the truth conditions of ‘and’ and ‘or’ in English. As a result of this conception of languages, a sentence can only be true or false in a language. Another language could also have that same sentence as one of its elements, but it could supply different truth conditions for it.

For Lewis, what it is for a population P to use a language L is for there to be a convention in P to be truthful in L, that is, it is true for almost all individuals to almost always utter sentences only if they believe them to be true (1969: 177, cf. 1975: 7). That is, it is true that, and common knowledge in P that, in almost any instance of verbal communication among members of P:

    1. almost everyone is truthful in L;
    2. almost everyone expects almost everyone else to be truthful in L;
    3. almost everyone has approximately the same preferences regarding all possible combinations of utterances of L;
    4. almost everyone prefers that any one person is truthful in L, given that everyone else is truthful in L; and
    5. there is some other possible language L′ which almost everyone would prefer that any one be truthful in, on condition that almost everyone is truthful in L′.

But Lewis is careful to note that a person must occasionally use or respond appropriately to utterances of sentences of L in order to be a member of a population that uses L. If, at some point, she stops using and responding appropriately to such utterances, she will eventually not belong to any population that uses L (1969: 178).

9. Mind

There are two major respects in which Lewis contributes to the philosophy of mind. The first concerns his theory of mind, which is a version of the identity theory. The second is his theory of mental content, that is, an account of the contents of certain mental states like what is believed when one has a belief, and what is desired when one has a desire. This article discusses only the former (aside from the brief discussion of the latter included in section 2). As indicated in section 4, Lewis is a materialist insofar as he believes that everything in the actual world is material. As a result, he rejects idealism, that is, the view that everything is mental, and dualism, the view that there are fundamentally two different types of entity, mental and physical. Thus, he is a physicalist, and, as mentioned above, an identity theorist. He is a type-type identity theorist, and as such, identifies each type of mental state (each type of experience we can have) with a type of neurophysiological state. So, for example, for Lewis, pain is identical to, say, c-fiber firing. (C-fibers are nerve fibers in the human central nervous system, activation of which is responsible for certain types of pain.) Such views are typically contrasted with token-token identity theories, which say only that each token mental state is identical to some token physical state. A token-token identity theorist will reject the rather general identity between pain and c-fiber firing, though they will recognize an identity between, say, the specific token of pain that Ronald Reagan felt when he was struck by John Hinkley Jr.’s bullet on March 30, 1981 and the appropriate token neurophysiological event which occurred in Reagan’s brain and which was caused by his nerves firing as a result of the bullet strike.

Lewis’s commitment to his theory of mind can be found in his earliest published work, in ‘An Argument for the Identity Theory’ (1966). Given the title, the reader will not be surprised that his main argument for it can be found there too. He argues that because mental states are defined in terms of their causal roles, being caused by certain stimuli and causing certain behaviors, and because every physical phenomenon’s occurrence can be explained by appeal only to physical phenomenon, the phenomena to which we appeal to explain our behaviors, which are usually rendered in the vocabulary of folk psychology (for example, Alice felt/believed x, so she did y), must themselves be physical phenomena. Folk psychology is the largely unscientific theory that each of us uses in order to explain and predict the behavior of others, by appealing to such things as pleasure, pain, beliefs, and desires. We are using folk psychology, for example, when we say that Alice screamed because she was in pain.

Concerning his first premise, Lewis thinks that, for instance, pain is defined by a set of pairs of causal inputs and behavioral outputs that is characteristic only to it. That set might include, for example, the causal input of a live electrode being put into contact with a human being, and the causal output of that human being vocalizing loudly. If this sounds behaviorist, that is because the view has its roots in behaviorism. But, unlike the behaviorist, Lewis does not think that that is all there is to say about mentality. He thinks that each mental state must still be a physical entity. While each is definable in terms of causal roles, each is a neurophysiological state. Furthermore, Lewis thinks that the mental concepts afforded to us by folk psychology pick out real mental states—at least for the most part. Thus Lewis expects that, by and large at least, each mental state that is part of our folk psychological theory will be definable in terms of a unique set of causal inputs and outputs. This sets Lewis (and other reductionists about the mind) apart from eliminativists, who expect no such accuracy in our folk psychological theory, and, indeed, often argue against its adequacy (as in, for example, Churchland 1981).

Lewis’s second premise is that the physical world is explanatorily closed. For any (explicable) physical phenomenon, there are some phenomena in terms of which it can be explained that are themselves physical. (Lewis leaves room for physical phenomena that have no explanations because they depend on chance, such as why a particular atom of uranium-235 decayed at a particular time t.) What is important for Lewis’s project is that this means we will never have to appeal to any non-physical (read: mental) entity in order to explain any physical phenomenon. And, because the causes and effects in the characteristic set that defines any given mental state are always physical (things like the placement of live electrodes and vocalizations), we will never need to invoke mental phenomena in order to explain any of these phenomena. We will be able to find some physical phenomena in terms of which to do so.

Very often, token-token identity theorists are role functionalists, who identify each type of mental state with a type of functional role. This role can, in principle, be realized by more than one type of physical state. And hence each type of mental state can, in principle, be realized by more than one type of physical state. But, according to role functionalists, a mental state itself is not identical to any physical state. So, for example, a role functionalist might identify pain with the functional state of bodily damage detection. That functional state is (we are supposing) realized in humans by c-fiber firings. As a result, pain is realized in humans by c-fiber firings. But it is something more abstract than just c-fiber firings; it is just whatever plays the role of bodily damage detection. It just so happens that what plays that role in humans is (we are supposing) c-fiber firings. Lewis was not a role functionalist. As stated, he identified each type of mental state with some type of physical state. So he identified pain with c-fiber firings, rather than saying that the former is realized by the latter.

This opens Lewis’s view up to the problem of the multiple realizability of the mental. This is the idea that human beings (or, more generally, organisms in which the role of bodily damage detection is played by c-fibers) are presumably not the only sorts of creatures that can be in pain. There may be animals on earth which lack c-fibers but which, when subjected to an electric shock, behave in the sort of way human beings behave, vocalizing loudly, moving away from the source of the shock, and so on. And even if there are not, we can imagine beings, perhaps Martians, that meet these conditions. What of them? Presumably, they can be in pain. But if they do not have c-fibers, then Lewis is forced to say that they, in fact, cannot be in pain.

In ‘Mad Pain and Martian Pain’ (1980a), Lewis deals with this problem by essentially biting the bullet. He recognizes that there will be distinct mental states associated with similar causal roles like human pain, jellyfish pain, Martian pain, and so forth. But he does not think this was too big a bullet to bite. The debate is, ultimately, just one about which state—realizer or role—we refer to when we use our folk psychological terminology to refer to mental states (such as ‘pleasure’, ’pain’, ‘belief’, ‘desire’, and so on). But Lewis also thinks there is good reason to prefer his view. Remember that he identifies mental states by their causal roles. Pain is whatever both is caused by certain sorts of stimuli (electric shocks, pricks with a needle, and so forth) and causes certain sorts of behavior (vocalizing loudly, moving away from the stimulus, and so forth). But an abstract functional role is not apt to play this causal role. There must be something physical that does so—that is actually involved in the push-and-pull of each causal chain of physical events. On Lewis’s account, according to which each type of mental state is a type of physical state, and in which each token mental state is a token physical state, there is always a physical state to play the needed causal role, and, moreover, to play that role while keeping the world at large completely material. One cannot help but appreciate how neatly this reply is connected to the argument he originally gives for his identity theory in his 1966 paper.

Another problem Lewis addresses in ‘Mad Pain and Martian Pain’ is, in a certain sense, the reverse of the problem of the multiple realizability of the mental. His terminology calls this ‘the problem of mad pain.’ The basic idea is that it is possible for there to be individual human beings (and as such, individuals we want to count as being capable of being in human pain), who lack the behavioral outputs that are typically associated with certain environmental inputs among humans, or have atypical behavioral outputs associated with certain environmental inputs. So, for example, when subjected to an electric shock, rather than screaming or moving away from its source, such an individual might sigh, relax her posture, and smile pleasantly. And when eating a piece of cake, she might scream and move away from it. Call such an individual a madman.

Even as early as his 1966 paper, Lewis is careful to characterize the characteristic causal role of a mental state as a set of typical associated environmental stimuli and behaviors (1966: 19–20). So the existence of a madman here or there does not cause problems for Lewis’s view. But, of course, one immediately wonders relative to what group these stimuli and behaviors are typically associated. He says, of the group relative to which we should characterize ‘pain’:

Perhaps (1) it should be us; after all, it’s our concept and our word. On the other hand, if it’s X we’re talking about, perhaps (2) it should be a population that X himself belongs to, and (3) it should preferably be one in which X is not exceptional. Either way, (4) an appropriate population should be a natural kind—a species, perhaps. (1980a: 219–20)

In the case of representative individuals of a population, all four criteria pull together. In the case of the Martian, criterion (1) is outweighed by the other three (whether the characteristic set for pain in Martians is exactly the same as it is in humans or if there are some differences between them). And in the case of the madman, it is criterion (3) that is outweighed by the other three. There will be certain cases with which Lewis’s account will have difficulties, to be sure. If a lightning strike hits a swamp and produces a one-off creature that is a member of no population apart from that consisting of just itself, Lewis’s account would provide no direction about how to regard a set of associated stimuli and behaviors which are correlated in the creature. That is, it would not tell us which mental state the set is associated with. But Lewis is prepared to live with such difficult cases, as he think our intuitions would not be reliable in such a situation anyway. As a result, he thinks that the fact that his theory provides no definitive answers in such cases is not a drawback of it, but, in fact, is in line with our pre-theoretic estimation of such cases.

A final issue worth mentioning is qualia—the subjective nature of an experience, for example, what it feels like to be in the sort of pain caused by a live electrode being put into contact with one’s left thumb. Identity theorists, and physicalists in general, often face the problem of qualia, that is, the allegation that their theory cannot make sense of the idea that there is something that it feels like to be in a particular mental state. One of the most famous statements of this problem is by Frank Jackson, in his paper, ‘Epiphenomenal Qualia’ (1982). He asks us to consider an individual, Mary, who has spent her entire life in a black and white room, never seeing any color other than black and white. Nonetheless, she has devoted herself to learning everything she can about color from (black and white) textbooks, television programs, and so forth, and is, at this point, perfectly knowledgeable about the subject. We can suppose she knows every piece of physical information there is to know about electromagnetism, optics, physiology, neuroscience, and so forth, that is related to color and its perception. Jackson then asks us to imagine that one day, Mary steps outside for the first time, and sees a red rose. He maintains that she learns something upon doing so that she did not know before, namely, what it is like to see red. Thus, Jackson concludes, not all information is physical information. This poses a problem for the physicalist because, according to physicalist, this should not be possible. There is nothing to know about color and its perception outside of the complete collection of physical information associated with color and its perception.

Lewis’s response to the qualia problem can be found in his Postscript to ‘Mad Pain and Martian Pain’ (1983b: 130–32), ‘What Experience Teaches’ (1988c), ‘Reduction of Mind’ (1994b), and ‘Should a Materialist Believe in Qualia?’ (1995). He credits it to Laurence Nemirow (1979, 1980, and 1990), and, in short, it is the idea that when Mary exits the room and sees a rose, she does not learn a new piece of information, instead, she gains a new ability. In particular, she gains the ability to make certain comparisons and to imagine certain sorts of objects that she was not able to do before. Now that she has seen the rose, she can go further out into the world and distinguish between things that are the same color as the rose and those which are not. And she can imagine what a red car would look like, even if she has not seen one. These are things she was not able to do before. But they are not propositional knowledge, in the sense that they are not things that can be expressed by a sentence of a language.

10. Other Work and Legacy

There are numerous aspects of Lewis’s work which this article has not discussed. He has influential views about the nature of dispositions, a discussion of which can be found in ‘Finkish Dispositions’ (1997b). He writes on free will in ‘Are We Free to Break the Laws?’ (1981a). And his discussions of his theory of mental content can be found in, for example, ‘Attitudes De Dicto and De Se’ (1979a) and ‘Reduction of Mind’ (1994b: 421 ff.). In addition to metaphysics, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind, Lewis contributed to other subfields, including epistemology and philosophy of mathematics. The reader can find what Lewis has to say about knowledge in ‘Elusive Knowledge’ (1996b). His main focus in the philosophy of mathematics is on squaring his materialistic commitments with his liberal use of set theory (in, for example, his theory of properties). After all, sets are, prima facie, abstract objects. Lewis’s strategy is to provide an analysis of set theory in mereological terms. The parthood relation does much of the work that the membership relation does in set theory. A set of some objects is, for him, just their mereological sum. With this idea in place, Lewis is able to make sense of set-theoretic talk in terms of concrete objects which stand in parthood relationships to one another. The interested reader can find discussions of this issue in his book Parts of Classes (1991) and his articles ‘Nominalistic Set Theory’ (1970c) and ‘Mathematics is Megethology’ (1993b).

Lewis discusses central issues in the philosophy of religion, including the ontological argument in ‘Anselm and Actuality’ (1970a), and the problem of evil in ‘Evil for Freedom’s Sake’ (1993a) and the posthumous ‘Divine Evil’ (2007). In the philosophy of science, he discusses inter-theoretic reduction in ‘How to Define Theoretical Terms’ (1970b) and verificationism in ‘Statements Partly About Observation’ (1988b). Lewis also writes extensively on chance and probabilistic reasoning in, for example, ‘Prisoners’ Dilemma Is a Newcomb Problem’ (1979c), ’A Subjectivist’s Guide to Objective Chance’ (1980b), ‘Causal Decision Theory’ (1981b), ‘Why Ain’cha Rich?’ (1981c), ‘Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities’ (1976a), ‘Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities II’ (1986d), ‘Human Supervenience Debugged’ (1994a), and ‘Why Conditionalize?’ (1999b). And he discusses certain issues that fall at the intersection of probabilistic and practical reasoning in ‘Desire as Belief’ (1988a) and ‘Desire as Belief II’ (1996a).

Lewis makes contributions to deontic logic, which is a formal modal language used to express claims of obligation and permission, whose operators are interpreted to mean ‘it is obligatory that’ and ‘it is permissible that’, in, for example, ‘Semantic Analyses for Dyadic Deontic Logic’ (1974). Lewis also has well-developed views about ethics, metaethics, and applied ethics. In ‘Dispositional Theories of Value’ (1989b), Lewis develops a materialism-friendly theory of value in terms of things’ dispositions to affect us in appropriate ways (or to generate appropriate attitudes in us) in ideal conditions. These attitudes are certain (intrinsic, as opposed to instrumental) second-order desires. That is, one values something only if she desires that she desires it. As a result, Lewis is officially a subjectivist about value. But he thinks (or at least hopes) that there is enough commonality among moral agents that a more-or-less fixed set of values can be discerned. Lewis does not develop a systematic ethical system. But he delivers critiques of consequentialist ethical theories (according to which what makes an action right or wrong is determined by the nature of its consequences) like utilitarianism (according to which what makes an action right/wrong is that it maximizes/fails to maximize the benefit to the largest number of people). See, for example, ‘Reply to McMichael’ (1978), ‘Devil’s Bargains and the Real World’ (1984), and Plurality (1986b: 128). One general constraint Lewis does make explicit about his positive view is that an ethical theory should be compatible with there being multiple, potentially conflicting, moral values. Similarly, he thinks it might be impossible to provide a binary evaluation of someone’s character as good or bad, overall. It might be that we can only point to respects in which an individual has good or bad character. Nolan (2005: 189) takes it to be likely that Lewis’s positive ethical theory, to the extent it can be discerned in his writings, is a version of virtue ethics, and thus that he bases the rightness or wrongness of a particular act on whether a moral agent with appropriate virtues and in appropriate circumstances would perform it (see, for example, Lewis 1986b: 127). Lewis focuses on several issues in applied ethics, including punishment in ‘The Punishment that Leaves Something to Chance’ (1987) and ‘Do We Believe in Penal Substitution?’ (1997a), tolerance in ‘Academic Appointments: Why Ignore the Advantage of Being Right?’ (1989a) and ‘Mill and Milquetoast’ (1989c), and nuclear deterrence in ‘Devil’s Bargains and the Real World’ (1984), ‘Buy Like a MADman, Use Like a NUT’ (1986a), and ‘Finite Counterforce’ (1989b).

Truly, then, Lewis’s contributions to philosophy range much more widely than his most-known work. It is difficult to summarize Lewis’s legacy. He makes important contributions to understanding probability and probabilistic reasoning, and his work on conditionals—counterfactuals in particular—can only be described as foundational. His work on causation is very important as well. In particular, his move from a simpler counterfactual analysis of causation to one invoking the notion of influence is reflected in more recent interventionist accounts of causation, according to which the cause of an event E is something which, when manipulated in some way (for example, by slightly changing the time at which it occurs or the manner in which it occurs), one can modify E. And, as Woodward (2016, sec. 9) notes, interventionist accounts are ultimately counterfactual accounts, and so they are also in this way indebted to Lewis’s earlier work on causation as well as to his work on counterfactuals. While dualism about the mind is much more popular in the first two decades of the twenty-first century than in Lewis’s day, his argument for his identity theory, which appeals to the explanatory closure of the physical world, is an important foil for the dualists who emerged in the 1980s and 90s. And his and Nemirow’s response to the problem of qualia was also a must-address for those dualists.

Lewis’s discussion of time and perdurance in Plurality generated a large debate in that area, and to a great extent set its parameters. Recall (see section 4) that he sets out three ways of solving the problem of temporary intrinsics: regarding intrinsic properties like shape to be relations to times, presentism, and his own worm theory. A lot of work was done exploring the tenability of each of these options, and exploring other nearby options. In addition, Lewis’s paper ‘The Paradoxes of Time Travel’ (1976b) is arguably responsible for an entire sub-literature on that topic.

Lewis’s metaphysics is, by and large, nominalist. But realism about universals is much more popular today than it was in the mid-20th century. As nominalistic as his views are, Lewis makes important moves away from the ideas which formed the environment in which his philosophical development took place. Quine, of course, believed that there is “no entity without identity” (for example, 1969: 23). What he intended by this is that we must have clear identity conditions for any entity whose existence we posit. This is one of the reasons why Quine was happy to recognize the existence of sets, which are individuated extensionally, that is, according to which members they have, but was skeptical of such things as properties. Lewis makes properties extensional by identifying them with sets, but goes a step further by allowing their extensions to range across all possibilia, rather than just actual entities. Lewis then goes even further in conceding, in ‘New Work for a Theory of Universals’ (1983a), that universals can do things which properties, as conceived by Lewis, cannot do. His basic distinction between properties which are perfectly natural and those which are not is rather anti-nominalistic, and this position can be understood as a bridge connecting the Quinean extensional picture of the world with the new hyperintensional picture of it, which allows for distinctions amongst entities, such as properties or propositions, that are not only extensionally equivalent, in that they apply to the same things or are all true or false at the actual world, but are intensionally equivalent, that is, they do so or are so at every possible world. An example are the properties, mentioned in section 3, being a triangular polygon and being a trilateral (three-sided) polygon. Sider (2011) generalizes Lewis’s idea from properties, which are the worldly correlates of predicates, to other sorts of entities, including the worldly correlates of predicate modifiers, sentential connectives, and quantifiers. He ends up with a very general notion of joint-carvingness, which is a feature of certain of our linguistic expressions, and he uses the notion to characterize the notion of fundamentality, as Lewis does with naturalness (for Lewis, the perfectly natural properties are the fundamental properties, all other properties being definable in terms of them—see, for example, 1994a: 474). It is hard to say exactly what the philosophical world today would be like without Lewis. But we can be sure that it would be very different than it is.

11. References and Further Reading

Note: Many of the papers below have been reprinted, sometimes with postscripts, in one of the collections Lewis 1983b, 1986c, 1998, 1999a, and 2000b; below, only the first appearance is cited.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lewis, David K. 1966. An Argument for the Identity Theory. Journal of Philosophy 63, 17–25.
  • Lewis, David K. 1968. Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic. Journal of Philosophy 65, 113–26.
  • Lewis, David K. 1969. Convention: A Philosophical Study. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 1970a. Anselm and Actuality. Noûs 4, 175–88.
  • Lewis, David K.1970b. How to Define Theoretical Terms. Journal of Philosophy 67, 427–46.
  • Lewis, David K. 1970c. Nominalistic Set Theory. Noûs 4, 225–40. Reprinted in Lewis 1998, 186–202.
  • Lewis, David K. 1971. Counterparts of Persons and Their Bodies. Journal of Philosophy 68, 203–11.
  • Lewis, David K. 1973a. Causation. Journal of Philosophy 70, 556–67.
  • Lewis, David K. 1973b. Counterfactuals. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lewis, David K. 1974. Semantic Analyses for Dyadic Deontic Logic. In Sören Stenlund (ed.), Logical Theory and Semantic Analysis: Essays Dedicated to Stig Kanger on His Fiftieth Birthday. Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Lewis, David K. 1975. Languages and Language. In Keith Gunderson (ed.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science. University of Minnesota Press, 3–35.
  • Lewis, David K. 1976a. Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities. Philosophical Review 85, 297–315.
  • Lewis, David K. 1976b. The Paradoxes of Time Travel. American Philosophical Quarterly 13, 145–52.
  • Lewis, David K. 1978. Reply to McMichael. Analysis 38, 85–86.
  • Lewis, David K. 1979a. Attitudes De Dicto and De Se. The Philosophical Review 88, 513–43.
  • Lewis, David K. 1979b. Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow. Noûs 13, 455–76.
  • Lewis, David K. 1979c. Prisoners’ Dilemma Is a Newcomb Problem. Philosophy and Public Affairs 8, 235–40.
  • Lewis, David K. 1980a. Mad Pain and Martian Pain. In Ned Block (ed.), Readings in Philosophy of Psychology,  Vol. 1. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 216–22.
  • Lewis, David K. 1980b. A Subjectivist’s Guide to Objective Chance. In Richard C. Jeffrey (ed.), Studies in Inductive Logic and Probability, Vol. II. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 263–93.
  • Lewis, David K. 1981a. Are We Free to Break the Laws? Theoria 47, 113–21.
  • Lewis, David K. 1981b. Causal Decision Theory. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 59, 5–30.
  • Lewis, David K. 1981c. Why Ain’cha Rich? Noûs 15, 377–80.
  • Lewis, David K. 1983a. New Work for a Theory of Universals. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61, 343–77.
  • Lewis, David K. 1983b. Philosophical Papers, Vol. I. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 1984. Devil’s Bargains and the Real World. In Douglas MacLean (ed.), The Security Gamble:  Deterrence in the Nuclear Age. Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Allenheld, 141–154.
  • Lewis, David K. 1986a. Buy Like a MADman, Use Like a NUT. QQ 6: 5–8.
  • Lewis, David K. 1986b. On the Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lewis, David K. 1986c. Philosophical Papers, Vol. II. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 1986d. Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities II. Philosophical Review 95, 581–89.
  • Lewis, David K. 1987. The Punishment that Leaves Something to Chance. In Proceedings of the Russellian Society (University of Sydney) 12, 81–97. Also in Philosophy and Public Affairs 18, 53–67.
  • Lewis, David K. 1988a. Desire as Belief. Mind 97, 323–32.
  • Lewis, David K. 1988b. Statements Partly About Observation. Philosophical Papers 17, 1–31.
  • Lewis, David K. 1988c. What Experience Teaches. Proceedings of the Russellian Society (University of Sydney) 13, 29–57.
  • Lewis, David K. 1989a. Academic Appointments: Why Ignore the Advantage of Being Right? In Ormond Papers, Ormond College, University of Melbourne.
  • Lewis, David K. 1989b. Finite Counterforce. In Henry Shue (ed.), Nuclear Deterrence and Moral Restraint. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 51–114.
  • Lewis, David K. 1989c. Mill and Milquetoast. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 67, 152–71.
  • Lewis, David K. 1991. Parts of Classes. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lewis, David K. 1993a. Evil for Freedom’s Sake. Philosophical Papers 22, 149–72.
  • Lewis, David K. 1993b. Mathematics is Megethology. Philosophia Mathematica 3, 3–23.
  • Lewis, David K. 1994a. Humean Supervenience Debugged. Mind 103, 473–90.
  • Lewis, David K. 1994b. Reduction of Mind. In Samuel Guttenplan (ed.), A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Blackwell, 412–31.
  • Lewis, David K. 1995. Should a Materialist Believe in Qualia? Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73, 140–44.
  • Lewis, David K.1996a. Desire as Belief II. Mind 105, 303–13.
  • Lewis, David K. 1996b. Elusive Knowledge. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549–67.
  • Lewis, David K.1997a. Do We Believe in Penal Substitution? Philosophical Papers 26, 203–09.
  • Lewis, David K. 1997b. Finkish Dispositions. The Philosophical Quarterly 47, 143–58.
  • Lewis, David K. 1998. Papers in Philosophical Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 1999a. Papers on Metaphysics and Epistemology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 1999b. Why Conditionalize? In Lewis 1999a. (Written in 1972.)
  • Lewis, David K. 2000a. Causation as Influence. Journal of Philosophy 97, 182–97.
  • Lewis, David K. 2000b. Papers in Ethics and Social Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lewis, David K. 2002 Tensing the Copula. Mind 111, 1–13.
  • Lewis, David K. 2004. Causation as Influence (extended version). In John Collins, Ned Hall, and L. A. Paul (eds),  Causation and Counterfactuals. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 75–106.
  • Lewis, David K. 2007. Divine Evil. In Louise M. Antony (ed.), Philosophers without Gods: Meditations on Atheism and the Secular Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Armstrong, David M. 1978a. Universals and Scientific Realism, Vol. I: Nominalism and Realism.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1978b. Universals and Scientific Realism, Vol. II: A Theory of Universals. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1983. What Is a Law of Nature? Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Churchland, Paul 1981. Eliminative Materialism and the Propositional Attitudes. Journal of Philosophy 78, 67–90.
  • Fine, Kit 1975. Critical Notice of Counterfactuals. Mind 84, 451–58.
  • Goodman, Nelson 1947. The Problem of Counterfactual Conditionals. Journal of Philosophy 44, 113–28.
  • Goodman, Nelson 1955. Fact, Fiction, and Forecast. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hall, Ned. 2004. Two Concepts of Causation. In John Collins, Ned Hall, and L.A. Paul (eds), Causation and Counterfactuals. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 225–76.
  • Kripke, Saul A. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Nemirow, Laurence 1979. Functionalism and the Subjective Quality of Experience. Doctoral Dissertation, Stanford University.
  • Nemirow, Laurence 1980. Review of Thomas Nagel, Moral Questions. Philosophical Review 89, 475–76.
  • Nemirow, Laurence 1990. Physicalism and the Cognitive Role of Acquaintance. In William G. Lycan (ed.), Mind and Cognition. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Nolan, Daniel 2005. David Lewis. Chesham: Acumen.
  • Quine, William Van Orman. 1969. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Sider, Theodore. 1996. All the World’s a Stage. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 433–53.
  • Sider, Theodore. 2001. Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence and Time. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sider, Theodore. 2011. Writing the Book of the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stalnaker, Robert C. 1968. A Theory of Conditionals. In Nicolas Rescher (ed.), Studies in Logical TheoryAmerican Philosophical Quarterly Monograph Series, Vol. 2. Oxford: Blackwell, 98–112.
  • van Inwagen, Peter. 1990. Material Beings. New York: Cornell University Press.
  • Weatherson, Brian. 2016. David Lewis. In Edward N. Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Woodward, James. 2016. Causation and Manipulability. In Edward N. Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

c. Further Reading

  • Nolan, Daniel 2005. David Lewis. Chesham: Acumen.
  • Jackson, Frank and Graham Priest. 2004. Lewisian Themes: The Philosophy of David K. Lewis. Oxford:   Oxford University Press.
  • Loewer, Barry and Jonathan Schaffer. 2015. A Companion to David Lewis. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Weatherson, Brian. 2016. David Lewis. In Edward N. Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


Author Information

Scott Dixon
Email: ts.dixon@ashoka.edu.in
Ashoka University