Leibniz: Modal Metaphysics
Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) served as the natural end of the rationalist tradition on the European continent, which included Descartes, Spinoza, and Malebranche. His philosophy was one of the major influences on Kant. Although Leibniz had many philosophical and intellectual interests, he was arguably most concerned with reconciling the freedom required for moral responsibility and the determinism that seemed to be entailed by the new sciences being developed at the time. In fact, in several important writings, including the Theodicy, Leibniz refers to “the free and the necessary and their production as it relates to the origin of evil” as one of the “famous labyrinths where our reason very often goes astray.”
To address this labyrinth, Leibniz developed one of the most sophisticated accounts of compatibilism in the early modern period. Compatibilism is the view that freedom and determinism are compatible and not mutually exclusive. Free actions are fully determined, and yet not necessary—they could have been otherwise, were God to have created another possible world instead. According to Leibniz, free actions, whether they be for God or humans, are those that are intelligent, spontaneous, and contingent. He developed a framework of possible worlds that is most helpful in understanding the third and most complex criterion, contingency.
Leibniz’s theory of possible worlds went on to influence some of the standard ways in which modal metaphysics is analyzed in contemporary Anglo-American analytic philosophy. The theory of possible worlds that he developed and utilized in his philosophy was extremely nuanced and had implications for many different areas of his thought, including, but not limited to, his metaphysics, epistemology, jurisprudence, and philosophy of religion. Although Leibniz’s Metaphysics is treated in a separate article, this article is primarily concerned with Leibniz’s modal metaphysics, that is, with his understanding of the modal notions of necessity, contingency, and possibility, and their relation to human and divine freedom. For more specific details on Leibniz’s logic and possible worlds semantics, especially as it relates to the New Essays Concerning Human Understanding and to the Theodicy, please refer to “Leibniz’s Logic.”
Table of Contents
- The Threat of Necessitarianism
- Strategies for Contingency
- Complete Individual Concepts
- The Containment Theory of Truth and Essentialism
- Leibnizian Optimism and the “Best” Possible World
- Compatibilist Freedom
- References and Further Reading
Necessitarianism is the view according to which everything that is possible is actual, or, to put this in the language of possible worlds, there is only one possible world and it is the actual world. Not only is everything determined, but it is also metaphysically impossible anything could be otherwise. In the seventeenth century, Baruch Spinoza was the paradigmatic necessitarian. According to Spinoza, insofar as everything follows from the nature of God with conceptual necessity, things could not possibly be other than they are. For Spinoza, necessitarianism had ethical implications—given that it is only possible for the universe to unfold in one way, we ought to learn to accept the way that the world is so that we can live happily. Happiness, Spinoza thought, is partly and importantly understood to be the rational acceptance of the fully determined nature of existence.
Spinoza’s necessitarianism follows directly from his conception of God and his commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, the thesis that there is a cause or reason why everything is the way it is rather than otherwise. In rejecting the anthropomorphic conception of God, he held instead that God is identical with Nature and that all things are, in some sense, in God. While Leibniz rejected the pantheistic/panentheistic understanding of God that Spinoza held, Leibniz’s view of God nevertheless compelled him to necessitarianism, at least in his early years. This article later reconsiders whether Leibniz’s mature views also commit him to necessitarianism. Consider the following letter that he wrote to Magnus Wedderkopf in 1671. Leibniz writes:
Since God is the most perfect mind, however, it is impossible for him not to be affected by the most perfect harmony, and thus to be necessitated to the best by the very ideality of things…Hence it follows that whatever has happened, is happening, or will happen is best and therefore necessary, but…with a necessity that takes nothing away from freedom because it takes nothing away from the will and the use of reason (A. II. I, 117; L 146).
In this early correspondence, Leibniz reasons that since God’s nature is essentially good, he must, by necessity, only do that which is best. It is impossible for God to do less than the best. After his meeting with Spinoza in 1676, Leibniz’s views related to modality began to shift and became much more nuanced. He went on to develop several strategies for addressing contingency to reject this early necessitarian position. In his mature metaphysics, Leibniz maintained that God acts for the best, but rejected that God acts for the best by necessity. How did he attempt to reconcile these positions though?
Leibniz’s first and arguably most important strategy for maintaining contingency is to argue that worlds are not possible with respect to God’s will; rather, worlds are intrinsically possible or impossible. If they were possible only with respect to God’s will, the argument from the letter to Wedderkopf would still be applicable—since God is committed to the best by his own essential nature, there is only one possible world, the actual world which is best. Instead, Leibniz maintains that worlds by their very nature are either possible or impossible. He writes in a piece dated from 1680 to1682 called On Freedom and Possibility:
Rather, we must say that God wills the best through his nature. “Therefore,” you will say “he wills by necessity.” I will say, with St. Augustine, that such necessity is blessed. “But surely it follows that from this that things exist by necessity.” How so? Since the nonexistence of what God wills to exist implies a contradiction? I deny that this proposition is absolutely true, for otherwise that which God does not will would not be possible. For things remain possible, even if God does not choose them. Indeed, even if God does not will something to exist, it is possible for it to exist, since, by its nature, it could exist if God were to will it to exist. “But God cannot will it to exist.” I concede this, yet, such a thing remains possible in its nature, even if it is not possible with respect to the divine will, since we have defined as in its nature possible anything that, in itself, implies no contradiction, even though its coexistence with God can in some way be said to imply a contradiction (Grua 289; AG 20-21).
According to Leibniz, worlds are possible just in case they are compossible. Possibility is a property of an object when its properties are logically consistent. For example, winged horses are possible because there is nothing self-contradictory about a horse with wings. But a winged wingless horse would be internally incoherent. By contrast, compossibility is a feature of sets of things, like worlds, rather than individual things. So, when Leibniz insists that worlds are possible by their own nature, he means that the things in that world do not conflict with one another. For example, there is nothing self-contradictory about an unstoppable force or an immovable object. But those objects could not exist in the same world together because their natures would be inconsistent with one another—they rule each other out. So, while there is a possible world with an unstoppable force and a possible world with an immovable object, there is no possible world with both an unstoppable force and an immovable object.
Although Leibniz often analyzes compossibility as a logical relation holding between the created essences of any given world, he sometimes treats it as a relation between the created essences and the laws of nature which God has decreed in each world. He writes in his correspondence to Arnauld:
I think there is an infinity of possible ways in which to create the world, according to the different designs which God could form, and that each possible world depends on certain principal designs or purposes of God which are distinctive of it, that is, certain primary free decrees (conceived sub ratione possibilitatis) or certain laws of the general order of this possible universe with which they are in accord and whose concept they determine, as they do also the concepts of all the individual substances which must enter into this same universe (G. II, 51; L 333).
Passages like this suggest that even logically inconsistent sets of objects like the unstoppable force and the immovable object could exist in a world together, so long as there is one set of laws governing them.
Although there are several different ways to analyze Leibniz’s notion of compossibility, there is good reason to think that he believed that preserving the intrinsic nature of the possibility of worlds was crucial to salvaging contingency. At one point he even suggests that contingency would be destroyed without such an account. He writes to Arnauld:
I agree there is no other reality in pure possibles than the reality they have in the divine understanding…For when speaking of possibilities, I am satisfied that we can form true propositions about them. For example, even if there were no perfect square in the world, we would still see that it does not imply a contradiction. And if we wished absolutely to reject pure possibles, contingency would be destroyed; for, if nothing were possible except what God actually created, then what God created would be necessary, in the case he resolved to create anything (G. II, 45; AG 75).
Importantly, the possibility of worlds is outside the scope of God’s will. God does not determine what is possible, any more than he determines mathematical, logical, or moral truths.
Another strategy for understanding necessity and contingency is through Leibniz’s theory of infinite analysis. According to Leibniz, necessity and contingency are not defined in terms of possible worlds in the way that is common in contemporary metaphysics. According to the standard understanding in contemporary metaphysics, a proposition is possible just in case it is true in some possible world, and a proposition is necessary just in case it is true in every possible world. But for Leibniz, a proposition is necessary if and only if it can be reduced to an identity statement in a finite number of steps. Propositions are contingent just in case it would take an infinite number of steps to reduce the statement to an identity statement. He writes in a piece from 1686 called On Contingency:
Necessary truths are those that can be demonstrated through an analysis of terms, so that in the end they become identities, just as in algebra an equation expressing an identity ultimately results from the substitution of values. That is, necessary truths depend upon the principle of contradiction. Contingent truths cannot be reduced to the principle of contradiction; otherwise everything would be necessary and nothing would be possible other than that which actually attains existence (Grua 303; AG 28).
To see how the theory of infinite analysis works, recall that Leibniz holds that every truth is an analytic truth. Every true proposition is one where the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject. One way that to understand this reduction is to ask, “Why is this proposition true?” Since every truth is an analytic truth, every truth is like, “A bachelor is an unmarried male.” So why is it true that a bachelor is an unmarried male? It is true because it is bound up in the essence of the concept of unmarried male that he is identical with a bachelor. A bachelor just is an unmarried male.
How would the theory of infinite analysis work for explaining contingency though? Consider the following propositions:
- Judas is the betrayer of Christ.
The first proposition is a simple mathematical truth that almost everyone in the 17th and 18th centuries would consider to be a necessary truth. For Leibniz, it is a necessary truth because can be reduced to an identity statement in a finite number of steps; that is, we could move from 1+1=2 to 1+1=1+1 in a straightforward manner. We could make a similar move for other mathematical and logical truths that are even more straightforward. The law of identity, that “A is identical to A,” for example, is another example that would take a finite number of steps to reduce to an identity.
The second proposition is an example of a contingent truth because the reduction would take an infinite number of steps to reach an identity statement. To understand how this analysis occurs, consider why it is true that Judas is the betrayer of Christ. This analysis would require reasons for Judas’s nature and his existence. Judas exists because God understood in his infinite wisdom that the best possible world would be one where Judas betrays Christ and Christ suffers. And why is Judas part of the best possible world? The only way to answer that question would be for God to compare the actual world with the infinite plurality of other possible worlds—an analysis that would take an infinite number of steps, even for God. Put simply, the sufficient reason for Judas’s contingent existence is that it is deemed to be best by God.
Importantly, Leibniz holds that not even God could complete the infinite analysis discursively; instead, God completes the analysis intuitively, in one feat of the mind. He writes in On Contingency:
For in necessary propositions, when the analysis is continued indefinitely, it arrives at an equation that is an identity; that is what it is to demonstrate a truth with geometrical rigor. But in contingent propositions one continues the analysis to infinity through reasons for reasons, so that one never has a complete demonstration, though there is always, underneath, a reason for the truth, but the reason is understood completely only by God, who alone traverses the infinite series in one stroke of the mind (Grua 303; AG 28).
Another strategy for salvaging contingency is not at the level of worlds, nor in God’s will, but at the level of God’s wisdom; that is, in the choice to actualize certain substances instead of others. Leibniz holds that we must take the reality of God’s choice seriously. As he writes in the Theodicy, “The nature of things, if taken as without intelligence and without choice, has in it nothing sufficiently determinant” (G. VI, 322; H 350).
Even if the plurality of worlds remain possible in themselves as the first strategy holds, or propositions are contingent because of the infinite analysis theory as the second strategy holds, God’s choice still plays an important role in the causal and explanatory chain of events leading to the actualization of a world. In this way, Leibniz’s modal metaphysics stands again in stark contrast to Spinoza. For Spinoza, the world just is God, and in some sense, all things are in God. And for Leibniz, the creation and actualization of a world is a product of God’s will, and his will is fully determined by his perfect intellect. In some texts, Leibniz locates the source of contingency purely in God’s choice of the best, which cannot be demonstrated. And since the choice of the best cannot be demonstrated, God’s choice is contingent. He writes in On Contingency:
Assuming that the proposition “the proposition that has the greater reason for existing [that is, being true] exists [that is, is true] is necessary, we must see whether it then follows that the proposition that has the greater reason for existing [that is, being true] is necessary. But it is justifiable to deny the consequence. For, if by definition a necessary proposition is one whose truth can be demonstrated with geometrical rigor, then indeed it could be the case that this proposition is demonstrable: “every truth and only a truth has greater reason,” or this: “God always acts with the highest wisdom.” But from this one cannot demonstrate the proposition “contingent proposition A has greater reason [for being true] or “contingent proposition A is in conformity with divine wisdom.” And therefore it does not follow that contingent proposition A is necessary. So, although one can concede that it is necessary for God to choose the best, or that the best is necessary, it does not follow that what is chosen is necessary, since there is no demonstration that it is the best” (Grua 305; AG 30).
Related to God’s choice is the distinction between moral and metaphysical necessity. Moral necessity is used by Leibniz in several different writings, beginning with his earliest jurisprudential writings up to and including his Theodicy. In the 17th century, moral necessity was very often understood in terms of the legal use of “obligation,” a term which Leibniz also applied to God. He writes in the Nova Methodus from 1667:
Morality, that is, the justice or injustice of an act, derives however from the quality of the acting person in relation to the action springing from previous actions, which is described as moral quality. But just as the real quality is twofold in relation to action: the power of acting (potential agendi), and the necessity of acting (necessitas agendi); so also the moral power is called right (jus), the moral necessity is called obligation (obligatio) (A. VI. i. 301).
Leibniz echoes this sentiment into the 1690’s in other jurisprudential writings. In the Codex Juris from 1693, Leibniz insists that “Right is a kind of moral power, and obligation is a moral necessity” (G. III. 386; L 421). In short, Leibniz remarkably held consistent throughout his career that “right” and “obligation” are moral qualities that provide the capacity to do what is just.
Importantly, right and obligation are not just related notions—they have force on each other. As Leibniz writes in the Nova Methodus, “The causes of right in one person are a kind of loss of right in another and it concerns the process of acquiring an obligation. Conversely, the ways of losing an obligation are causes of recovering a right, and can be defined as liberation” (A. VI. vi, 305-306). That a right imposes an obligation cannot be overstated. It is precisely for this reason that we can undergo the theodicean project in the first place. We have proper standing to ask for an explanation for God’s permission of suffering because we have a right to the explanation. And we have a right to the explanation because God is morally necessitated or obligated to create. For a point of comparison, contrast this with God’s response to Job when he demands an explanation for his own suffering. God responds, “Who has a claim against me that I must pay? Everything under heaven belongs to me” (Job 41:11). God does not provide an explanation for Job’s suffering because Job does not have proper standing to request such an explanation.
Leibniz contrasts moral necessity with metaphysical necessity. In the Theodicy, he describes “metaphysical necessity, which leaves no place for any choice, presenting only one possible object, and moral necessity, which obliges the wisest to choose the best” (G. VI, 333; H 367). This distinction becomes important for Leibniz because it allows him to say that God’s choice to create the best of all possible worlds is morally necessary, but not metaphysically necessary. God is morally bound to create the best world due to his divine nature, but since there are other worlds which are possible in themselves, his choice is not metaphysically necessary. Leibniz writes again in the Theodicy, “God chose between different courses all possible: thus, metaphysically speaking, he could have chosen or done what was not the best; but he could not morally speaking have done so” (G. VI, 256; H 271).
Some commentators insist that the dichotomy between metaphysical and moral necessity is illusory. Either it is necessary that God must create the best of all possible worlds, or it is not necessary that God must create the best of all possible worlds. Nevertheless, Leibniz took moral necessity to do both logical and theological work. Only with moral necessity could he preserve both the goodness and wisdom of God. If moral necessity is vacuous, then Leibniz would seem to be committed to necessitarianism.
One final strategy for understanding contingency is to make use of a well-known distinction between absolute and hypothetical necessity. This strategy was most fully utilized in Leibniz’s correspondence with Arnauld in the mid 1680’s. Arnauld was deeply concerned with the implications for freedom because of the theory of complete individual concepts. Since Leibniz held that every individual contains within itself complete truths about the universe, past, present, and future, it seems that there can be no room for freedom. If it is included in Judas’s concept from the moment the universe was created that he would ultimately betray Christ, then it seems as if it was necessary that he do so; Judas could not have done otherwise. Leibniz’s response draws on the distinction between absolute and hypothetical necessity. Consider the following propositions:
- Necessarily, Caesar crosses the Rubicon.
- Necessarily, if Caesar exists, then he crosses the Rubicon.
Leibniz would deny the first proposition, but readily accept the second proposition. He denies the first because it is not a necessary truth that Caesar crosses the Rubicon. The first proposition is not comparable to other necessary truths like those of mathematics and logic which reduce to identity statements and are not self-contradictory. The second proposition is contingent; although it is bound up in Caesar’s essence that he crosses the Rubicon, it does not follow that he necessarily does so. It is only necessary that Caesar crosses the Rubicon on the hypothesis that Caesar exists. And, of course, Caesar might not have existed at all. God might have actualized a world without Caesar because those worlds are compossible, that is, possible in themselves. This is what Leibniz means when he claims that contingent truths are certain, but not necessary. To use a simple analogy, once God pushes over the first domino, it is certain that the chain of dominoes will fall, but God might have pushed over a completely different set of dominos instead. Once a series is actualized, the laws of the series govern it with certainty. And yet the series is not metaphysically necessary since there are other series that God could have actualized instead were it not for his divine benevolence. Leibnitz writes in the Discourse on Metaphysics from 1686:
And it is true that we are maintaining that everything that must happen to a person is already contained virtually in his nature or notion, just as the properties of a circle are contained in its definition; thus the difficulty still remains. To address it firmly, I assert that connection or following is of two kinds. The one whose contrary implies a contradiction is absolutely necessary; this deduction occurs in eternal truths, for example, the truths of geometry. The other is necessary only ex hypothesi and, so to speak, accidentally, but it is contingent in itself, since its contrary does not imply a contradiction. And this connection is based not purely on ideas of God’s simple understanding, but on his free decrees and on the sequence of the universe (A. VI. iv, 1546-1547; AG 45).
Absolute necessity, then, applies to necessary truths that are outside the scope of God’s free decrees, and hypothetical necessity applies to contingent truths that are within the scope of God’s free decrees.
According to Leibniz, one of the basic features of a substance is that every substance has a “complete individual concept” (CIC, hereafter). The CIC is an exhaustive account of every single property of each substance. He writes in the Discourse on Metaphysics, “the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which this notion is attributed” (A. Vi. iv, 1540; AG 41). From this logical conception of substance, Leibniz argues that properties included in the CIC are those of the past, present, and future. The CIC informs what is sometimes referred to as Leibniz’s doctrine of marks and traces. He illustrates this thesis using the example of Alexander the Great in the Discourse, writing:
Thus, when we consider carefully the connection of things, we can say that from all time in Alexander’s soul there are vestiges of everything that has happened to him and marks of everything that will happen to him and even traces of everything that happens in the universe, even though God alone could recognize them all (A. VI. iv, 1541; AG 41).
According to Leibniz, then, in analyzing any single substance, God would be able to understand every other substance in the universe, since every substance is conceptually connected to every other substance. For example, in analyzing the concept of Jesus, God would also be able to understand the concept of Judas. Because it is part of Jesus’s CIC that he was betrayed by Judas, it is also part of Judas’s CIC that he will betray Jesus. Every truth about the universe could be deduced this way as well. If a pebble were to fall off a cliff on Neptune in the year 2050, that would also be included in Jesus’s CIC too. To use one image of which Leibniz is quite fond, every drop in the ocean is connected to every other drop in the ocean, even though the ripples from those drops could only be understood by God. He writes in the Theodicy:
For it must be known that all things are connected in each one of the possible worlds: the universe, whatever it may be, is all of one piece, like an ocean: the least movement extends its effect there to any distance whatsoever, even though this effect become less perceptible in proportion to the distance. Therein God has ordered all things beforehand once for all, having foreseen prayers, good and bad actions, and all the rest; and each thing as an idea has contributed, before its existence, to the resolution that has been made upon the existence of all things; so that nothing can be changed in the universe (any more than in a number) save its essence or, if you will, save its numerical individuality. Thus, if the smallest evil that comes to pass in the world were missing in it, it would no longer be this world; which nothing omitted and all allowance made, was found the best by the Creator who chose it (G. VI. 107-108; H 128).
In addition to describing substances as possessing a CIC, Leibniz also refers to the essential features of a substance as perception and appetition. These features are explained in more detail in an article on Leibniz’s Philosophy of Mind. In short though, Leibniz held that every single representation of each substance is already contained within itself from the moment it is created, such that the change from one representation to another is brought about by its own conatus. The conatus, or internal striving, is what Leibniz refers to as the appetitions of a substance. Leibniz writes in the late Principles of Nature and Grace:
A monad, in itself, at a moment, can be distinguished from another only by its internal qualities and actions, which can be nothing but its perceptions (that is, the representation of the composite, or what is external, in the simple) and its appetitions (that is, its tendencies to go from one perception to another) which are the principles of change (G. VI. 598; AG 207).
Because every perception of the entire universe is contained within each substance, the entire history of the world is already fully determined. This is the case not just for the actual world after the act of creation, but it is true for every possible world. In fact, the fully determined nature of every possible world is what allows God in his infinite wisdom to actualize the best world. God can assess the value of every world precisely because the entire causal history, past, present, and future is already set.
The main article on Leibniz describes his epistemological account in more general terms, but Leibniz’s theory of truth has implications for freedom, so some brief comments bear mentioning. According to Leibniz, propositions are true not if they correspond to the world, but instead based on the relationship between the subject and the predicate. The “predicate in notion principle” (PIN, hereafter), as he describes to Arnauld, is the view according to which “In every true affirmative proposition, whether necessary or contingent, universal or particular, the notion of the predicate is in some way included in that of the subject. Praedicatum inest subjecto; otherwise I do not know what truth is” (G. II, 56; L 337). For example, “Judas is the betrayer of Christ” is true not because there is a Judas who betrays Christ in the actual world, but because the predicate “betrayer of Christ” is contained in the concept of the subject, Judas. Judas’s essence, his thisness, or haecceity, to use the medieval terminology, is partly defined by his betrayal of Christ.
The PIN theory of truth poses significant problems for freedom though. After all, if it is part of Judas’s essence that he is the betrayer of Christ, then it seems that Judas must betray Christ. And if Judas must betray Christ, then it seems that he cannot do otherwise. And if he cannot do otherwise, then Judas cannot be morally responsible for his actions. Judas cannot be blameworthy for the betrayal of Christ for doing something that was part of his very essence. And yet, despite this difficulty, Leibniz maintained a compatibilist theory of freedom, where Judas’s actions were certain, but not necessary.
Since Leibniz holds that every essence can be represented by God as having a complete concept and that every proposition is analytically true, he maintains that every property is essential to a substance’s being. Leibniz, therefore, straightforwardly adopts an essentialist position. Essentialism is the metaphysical view according to which some properties of a thing are essential to it, such that if it were to lose that property, the thing would cease to exist. Leibniz’s essentialism has been a contested issue in the secondary literature during the first few decades of the twenty-first century. The next section of this article highlights three of the more dominant and interesting interpretations of Leibniz’s essentialism in his mature philosophy: superessentialism, moderate essentialism, and superintrinsicalness.
The most straightforward way of interpreting Leibniz’s mature ontology is that he agrees with the thesis of superessentialism. According to superessentialism, every property is essential to an individual substance’s CIC such that if the substance were to lack any property at all, then the substance would not exist. Leibniz often explains his superessentialist position in the context of explaining God’s actions. For example, in one passage he writes, “You will object that it is possible for you to ask why God did not give you more strength than he has. I answer: if he had done that, you would not exist, for he would have produced not you but another creature” (Grua 327).
In his correspondence with Arnauld, Leibniz makes use of the notion of “possible Adams” to explain what looks very much like superessentialism. In describing another possible Adam, Leibniz stresses to Arnauld the importance of taking every property to be part of a substance, or else we would only have an indeterminate notion, not a complete and perfect representation of him. This fully determinate notion is the way in which God conceives of Adam when evaluating which set of individuals to create when a world is actualized. Leibniz describes this perfect representation to Arnauld, “For by the individual concept of Adam I mean, to be sure, a perfect representation of a particular Adam who has particular individual conditions and who is thereby distinguished from an infinite number of other possible persons who are very similar but yet different from him…” (G. II, 20; LA. 15). The most natural way to interpret this passage is along the superessentialist reading such that if there were a property that were not essential to Adam, then we would have a “vague Adam.” Leibniz even says as much to Arnauld. He writes:
We must not conceive of a vague Adam, that is, a person to whom certain attributes of Adam belong, when we are concerned with determining whether all human events follow from positing his existence; rather we must attribute to him a notion so complete that everything that can be attributed to him can be deduced from it (G. II, 42; ag 73.).
The notion of “vague Adams” is further described in a famous passage from the Theodicy. Leibniz describes the existence of other counterparts of Sextus in other possible worlds, that, though complete concepts in their own way, are nevertheless different from the CIC of Sextus in the actual world. Leibniz writes:
I will show you some, wherein shall be found, not absolutely the same Sextus as you have seen (that is not possible, he carries with him always that which he shall be) but several Sextuses resembling him, possessing all that you know imperceptibly, nor in consequence all that shall yet happen to him. You will find in one world a very happy and noble Sextus, in another a Sextus content with a mediocre state, a Sextus, indeed, of every kind and endless diversity of forms (G. VI, 363; H 371).
These passages describing other possible Adams and other possible Sextuses suggest that Leibniz was committed to the very strong thesis of superessentialism. Because every property is essential to an individual’s being, every substance is world-bound; that is, each substance only exists in its own world. If any property of an individual were different, then the individual would cease to exist, but there are also an infinite number of other individuals that vary in different degrees, which occupy different worlds. For example, a Judas who was more loyal and did not ultimately betray Christ would not be the Judas of the actual world. Importantly, one small change would also ripple across and affect every other substance in the universe as well. After all, a loyal Judas who does not betray Christ would also mean that Christ was not betrayed, so it would affect his complete concept and essence as well. Put simply, on the superessentialist interpretation of Leibniz’s metaphysics, due to the complete interconnectedness of all things, if any single property of an individual in the world were different than it is, then every substance in the world would be different as well.
The most important worry that Arnauld had about Leibniz’s philosophy was the way in which essentialism threatens freedom. Arnauld thought that human freedom must entail the ability to do otherwise. In the language of possible worlds, this means that an individual is free if they do otherwise in another possible world. Of course, such a view requires the very same individual to exist in another possible world. According to Arnauld, Judas was free in his betrayal of Christ because there is another possible world where Judas does not betray Christ. Freedom requires the actual ability to do otherwise. But Arnauld worried that according to Leibniz’s superessentialism, since it really was not Judas in another possible world that did not betray Christ but instead a counterpart, an individual very similar in another possible world, then we cannot really say that Judas’s action was truly free. Leibniz anticipates this sort of objection in the Discourse, writing, “But someone will say, why is it that this man will assuredly commit this sin? The reply is easy: otherwise it would not be this man” (A. VI. iv, 1576; AG 61). Leibniz, like most classical compatibilists, argues that the actual ability to do otherwise is not a necessary condition for freedom. All that is required is the hypothetical ability to do otherwise. A compatibilist like Leibniz would insist that Judas’s action is nevertheless free even though he cannot do otherwise. If Judas’s past or the laws of nature were different, then he might not betray Christ. Framing freedom in these hypothetical terms is what allows Leibniz to say that the world is certain, but not necessary.
Leibniz’s motivation for superessentialism is driven partly by theodicean concerns. The basic issue in the classical problem of evil is the apparent incompatibility between a perfectly loving, powerful, and wise God on the one hand with cases of suffering on the other. Why would God permit Jesus to suffer? Leibniz’s answer here as it relates to superessentialism is twofold. First, while Jesus’s suffering is indeed tragic, Leibniz contends that it is better for Jesus to exist and suffer than not to exist at all. Second, because of the complete interconnectedness of all things, without Jesus’s suffering, the entire history of the world would be different. Jesus’s suffering is very much part of the calculus when God is discerning which world is the best. And importantly, God is not choosing that Jesus suffers, but only chose a world in which Jesus suffers. He writes in the Primary Truths from 1689:
Properly speaking, he did not decide that Peter sin or that Judas be damned, but only that Peter who would sin with certainty, though not with necessity, but freely, and Judas who would suffer damnation would attain existence rather than other possible things; that is, he decreed that the possible notion become actual (A. VI. iv, 1646; AG 32).
Despite the evidence to interpret Leibniz as a superessentialist, there is also textual support that superessentialism is simply too strong of a thesis. One reason to adopt a weaker version of essentialism is to be logically consistent with transworld identity, the thesis that individuals can exist across possible worlds. Some commentators like Cover and O’Leary-Hawthorne argue for the weaker essentialist position on the grounds that superessentialism cannot utilize the scholastic difference between essential and accidental properties of which Leibniz sometimes makes use. According to moderate essentialism, Leibniz holds that properties that can be attributed to the species are essential in one way and principles attributed to individuals are essential in a different way.
The weaker thesis of moderate essentialism is the view that only monadic properties are essential to an individual substance, and relational or extrinsic properties should be reducible to monadic properties. The result of this view is that an individual is not “world-bound”; that is, a counterpart of that individual might exist in another possible world, and the essential properties of that individual are what designate it across possible worlds. What follows then is that Jesus, for example, could be said to be free for giving himself up in the Garden of Gethsemane because in another possible world, a counterpart of Jesus did not give himself up. Problematically though, Leibniz explicitly mentions in one of the letters to Arnauld that the laws of nature are indeed a part of an individual’s CIC. Leibniz writes to Arnauld, “As there exist an infinite number of possible worlds, there exists also an infinite number of laws, some peculiar to one world, some to another, and each possible individual contains in the concept of him the laws of his world” (G. II, 40; LA 43).
To reconcile the passages where Leibniz suggests that individuals are world-bound, some commentators argue that it is logically consistent to hold that only the perception or expression of the other substance must exist, but not the substance itself. And since monads are “windowless,” that is, causally isolated, the other substance need not exist at all. In his late correspondence with Des Bosses, Leibniz suggests this very thing, namely, that God could create one monad without the rest of the monads in that world. Leibniz writes:
My reply is easy and has already been given. He can do it absolutely; he cannot do it hypothetically, because he has decreed that all things should function most wisely and harmoniously. There would be no deception of rational creatures, however, even if everything outside of them did not correspond exactly to their experiences, or indeed if nothing did, just as if there were only one mind… (G. II, 496; L 611).
The letter to Des Bosses is compelling for moderate essentialism, but it does not entail it. In fact, conceiving of God’s ability to create only one monad in the actual world with only the expressions of every other substance is perfectly consistent with the superessentialist interpretation. The substances need not actually exist in order to support the claim that every property of a CIC is necessary for that substance. Put differently, if it were part of Peter’s CIC that he denied Christ three times, it need not follow that Christ actually existed for this property to hold, so long as the perceptions of Christ follow from the stores of Peter’s substance.
One final variation of essentialism which we might attribute to Leibniz is called superintrinsicalness. This thesis, defended primarily by Sleigh, states that every individual substance has all its properties intrinsically. This view is distinct from moderate essentialism in a very important way. According to superintrinsicalness, both monadic and extrinsic properties are essential to an individual’s CIC. But, contrary to the superessentialist thesis, the properties that compose an individual’s CIC could be different; that is, some components of a substance’s CIC are necessary, and some are contingent. Leibniz writes in the Discourse:
For it will be found that the demonstration of this predicate of Caesar is not as absolute as those of numbers or of geometry, but that it supposes the sequence of things that God has freely chosen, a sequence based on God’s first free decree always to do what is most perfect and on God’s decree with respect to human nature, following out of the first decree, that man will always do (although freely) that which appears to be best. But every truth based on these kinds of decrees is contingent, even though it is certain; for these decrees do not change the possibility of things, and, as I have already said, even though it is certain that God always chooses the best, this does not prevent something less perfect from being and remaining possible in itself, even though it will not happen, since it is not its impossibility but its imperfection which causes it to be rejected. And nothing is necessary whose contrary is possible (A. VI. iv, 1548; AG 46).
One of the consequences of this view is that a substance’s CIC is contingent on the will of God. For example, on this view, it is a logical possibility that Adam could have had a completely different set of properties altogether. And since a substance could have a completely different CIC and relational properties are part of that CIC, then superintrinsicalness would deny that substances are world-bound. Since Leibniz denies world-bound individuals on this interpretation, he would not need any sort of counterpart theory that comes along with the superessentialist reading. After all, Leibniz’s depiction of counterparts states that there are individuals in other possible worlds that, though they are very similar, are numerically distinct from each other. But on the superintrinsicalness thesis, it may be the case that an individual in another possible world is identical to an individual in the actual world.
There is some textual evidence supporting superintrinsicalness as well. Leibniz writes to Arnauld, “Thus, all human events could not fail to occur as in fact they did occur, once the choice of Adam is assumed; but not so much because of the individual concept of Adam, although this concept includes them, but because of God’s plans, which also enter into the individual concept of Adam” (G. II, 51; LA 57). And yet, if a substance could have had a different CIC, then the notion of a haecceity becomes meaningless. The haecceity serves to individuate substances across possible worlds. If the haecceity could be different than it is, then the concept loses its purpose. We could not pick out the Caesar of this world and another possible world, if the thing that makes Caesar can change.
==And yet, if Leibniz accepted superintrinsicalness, then he would have had an easy response to Arnauld’s worry that the complete concept doctrine diminishes the possibility of freedom. Leibniz could have just responded to Arnauld that Judas freely betrayed Christ because, in another possible world, he did not betray Christ; although his haecceity in the actual world determined that he would betray Christ, the haecceity in another possible world may be different such that he did not betray Christ. But this is not the response that Leibniz gives. Instead, he draws on some of the strategies for contingency in defending a compatibilist view of freedom that were discussed earlier.
To paraphrase Ivan in The Brothers Karamazov, “The crust of the earth is soaked by the tears of the suffering.” Events like the Thirty Years War deeply affected Leibniz. His theodicean project was an attempt at an explanation and justification for God’s permission of such suffering. Why would a perfectly wise, powerful, and good God permit suffering? And even if we were to grant that God must permit suffering to allow for greater goods such as compassion and empathy, why must there be so much of it? Would the world not have been better with less suffering? The crux of Leibniz’s philosophical optimism was that creating this world was the best that God could do—it was metaphysically impossible for the world to be better than it is. And so, God is absolved of responsibility for not creating something better. But how could Leibniz maintain a position in such contrast to our intuitions that the world could be better with less suffering?
Arguably the most famous part of Leibniz’s philosophy is his solution to the problem of evil. The problem of evil is the most significant objection to classical theism, and it is one that Leibniz developed an entire system of possible worlds to address. He argues that God freely created the best of all possible worlds from amongst an infinite plurality of alternatives. Voltaire mocked such optimism in his Candide, suggesting in a best-case scenario that, if this is really the best world that God could create, then God certainly is not worth much reverence and in a worst-case scenario, it implies that God does not exist at all. But what exactly did Leibniz mean by the “best” possible world? And was Voltaire’s criticism warranted? Leibniz has several responses to the problem of evil which draw on his complex theory of possible worlds.
First, the basis for Voltaire’s misinterpretation is grounded upon the false assumption that the actual world is morally best. Instead, Leibniz contends that the world is metaphysically best. But how are these “moral” and “metaphysical” qualifications related to one another? After all, Leibniz sometimes remarks like he does in the Discourse that “God is the monarch of the most perfect republic, composed of all minds, and the happiness of this city of God is his principal purpose” (A. VI. iv, 1586; AG 67). And yet at other times, like in the Theodicy, he contends that “The happiness of rational creatures is one of the aims God has in view; but it is not his whole aim, nor even his ultimate aim” (G. VI, 169-170; H 189). It seems then that Leibniz is, at least on the face of it, unsure how much God is concerned with the happiness of creation. Happiness is a “principal” purpose of God, and yet not an “ultimate aim.”
One way to reconcile these apparently disparate positions is to be clearer about what Leibniz means by happiness. Leibniz often reminds the reader that the actual world is not the best because it guarantees every substance has the most pleasurable existence. Rather, he holds, like he does in the Confessio, that “Happiness is the state of mind most agreeable to it, and nothing is agreeable to a mind outside of harmony” (A. VI. iii, 116; CP 29). Put differently, the best of all possible worlds is metaphysically best because it is the world where rational minds can contemplate the harmonious nature of creation. Leibniz goes into more detail in The Principles of Nature and Grace, writing:
It follows from the supreme perfection of God that in producing the universe he chose the best possible plan, containing the greatest variety together with the greatest order; the best arranged situation, place and time; the greatest effect produced by the simplest means; the most power, the most knowledge, the most happiness and goodness in created things of which the universe admitted (G. VI, 603).
In short, Leibniz holds that while there is concern with the happiness of minds during the act of creation, the kind of happiness that God wishes to guarantee is not physical pleasure or the absence of physical pain, but instead the rational recognition that the actual world is the most harmonious.
Second, Leibniz contends that “best” does not mean “perfect” or even “very good.” While it is true that we oftentimes have no idea why bad things sometimes happen to good people and why good things sometimes happen to bad people, what we can be sure of is that God, as an ens perfectissimum, a most perfect being, chose this world because it was the best. And it is the best because it contains the most variety and plurality of substances governed by the fewest laws of nature. He writes in the Discourse:
One can say, in whatever manner God might have created the world, it would always have been regular and in accordance with a certain general order. But God has chosen the most perfect world, that is, the one which is at the same time the simplest in hypotheses and richest in phenomena (A. VI. Iv, 1538; AG 39).
Even if we were to grant that Leibniz means something particular by “best,” how should we understand the criteria that the “best” world is the one that is richest in phenomena and governed by the simplest laws?
It is critical that Leibniz has more than one criterion for the best possible world. If there were only one criterion, like the concern for the happiness of creatures, for example, then there is a problem of maximization. For whatever world God created, he could have created another world with more happiness. And since God could always create a better world, then he could never act for the best, for there is no best. But since there is a world, either this is not the best of all possible worlds, or there is no maximally perfect being. Malebranche (and Aquinas) held that there was no best world, and Leibniz wished to distance himself from their views. He writes in the Discourse, “They [the moderns like Malebranche] imagine that nothing is so perfect that there is not something more perfect—this is an error” (A. VI. iv, 1534; AG 37).
Rather than maximizing one feature of a world, which would be impossible, Leibniz reasons that God must optimize the competing criteria of richness of phenomena, simplicity of laws, and abundance of creatures. He writes in the Discourse:
As for the simplicity of the ways of God, this holds properly with respect to his means, as opposed to the variety, richness, and abundance, which holds with respect to his ends or effects. And the one must be in balance with the other, as are the costs of a building and the size and beauty one demands of it (A. VI. iv, 1537; AG 39).
God, like an architect with unlimited resources, must nevertheless weigh competing variables to optimize the best creation.
Even if we grant the claim that there God considers competing variables in creating the best world, we might still wonder why those variables are those of concern. Although it is unclear why Leibniz chose variety, richness, and abundance as the criteria, he points to simplicity as a possible overarching principle. Unfortunately, simplicity alone will not do, for it would be simpler to have only one substance rather than an abundance of substances. It seems then that simplicity in conjunction with a world that is worthy of the majesty of God are the underlying criteria for the best of all possible worlds.
The notion of simplicity is critical for Leibniz’s theodicean account. In fact, simplicity is the key concept that sets Leibniz’s account of God’s justice directly in line with his contemporary, Nicolas Malebranche. Leibniz remarks at one point that Malebranche’s theodicean account reduces in most substantial ways to his own. He writes in the Theodicy, “One may, indeed, reduce these two conditions, simplicity and productivity, to a single advantage, which is to produce as much perfection as is possible: thus Father Malebranche’s system in this point amounts to the same as mine” (G. VI, 241; H 257). The similarities of their accounts are readily apparent. Consider Malebranche’s remark that “God, discovering in the infinite treasures of his wisdom an infinity of possible worlds…, determines himself to create that world…that ought to be the most perfect, with respect to the simplicity of the ways necessary to its production or to its conservation” (OCM. V, 28).
Third, Leibniz appeals to intellectual humility and insists that our intuition that this is not the best possible world is simply mistaken. If we had God’s wisdom, then we would understand that this is the best possible world. Part of the appeal to intellectual humility is also the recognition that God evaluates the value of each world in its totality. In just the same way that it would be unfair to judge the quality of a film by looking at a single frame of the reel, Leibniz reasons that it is also unfair to judge the quality of the world by any singular instance of suffering. And given our relatively small existence in the enormous history of the universe, even long periods of suffering should be judged with proper context. World wars, global pandemics, natural disasters, famine, genocide, slavery, and total climate catastrophe are immense tragedies to be sure, but they mean relatively little in the context of the history of the universe.
The recognition that these cases of suffering mean little should not be interpreted to imply that they mean nothing. A perfectly benevolent God cares about the suffering of every part of creation, and yet, God must also weigh that suffering against the happiness and flourishing of the entirety of the universe, past, present, and future. And moreover, Leibniz reasons that every bit of suffering will ultimately lead to a greater good that redeems or justifies the suffering. To use the language in the contemporary literature in philosophy of religion, there is no “gratuitous evil.” Every case of evil ultimately helps improve the value of the entire universe. In a mature piece called the Dialogue on Human Freedom and the Origin of Evil, Leibniz writes:
I believe that God did create things in ultimate perfection, though it does not seem so to us considering the parts of the universe. It’s a bit like what happens in music and painting, for shadows and dissonances truly enhance the other parts, and the wise author of such works derives such a great benefit for the total perfection of the work from these particular imperfections that it is much better to make a place for them than to attempt to do without them. Thus, we must believe that God would not have allowed sin nor would he have created things he knows will sin, if he could derive from them a good incomparably greater than the resulting evil (Grua 365-366; AG 115).
Leibniz was deeply concerned with the way in which to properly understand freedom. In one sense, though, his hands were tied; given his fundamental commitment to the principle of sufficient reason as one of the “great principles of human reason” (G. VI, 602), Leibniz was straightforwardly compelled to determinism. Since the principle of sufficient reason rules out causes which are isolated from the causal series, one of the paradigmatic signs of thoroughgoing Libertarian accounts of free will, the most that Leibniz could hope for was a kind of compatibilist account of freedom. And indeed, Leibniz, like most of his other contemporaries, openly embraced the view that freedom and determinism were compatible.
According to the account of freedom developed in his Theodicy, free actions are those that satisfy three individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions—they must be intelligent, spontaneous, and contingent. He writes in the Theodicy:
I have shown that freedom according to the definition required in the schools of theology, consists in intelligence, which involves a clear knowledge of the object of deliberation, in spontaneity, whereby we determine, and in contingency, that is, in the exclusion of logical or metaphysical necessity (G. VI, 288; H 288).
Leibniz derives the intelligence and spontaneity conditions from Aristotle, but adds contingency as a separate requirement. For an action to be free, Leibniz contends that the agent must have “distinct knowledge of the object of deliberation” (G. VI, 288; H 288), meaning that the agent must have knowledge of their action and also of alternative courses of action. For an action to be spontaneous, the agent’s actions must derive from an internal source and not be externally caused. There is a sense in which every action is spontaneous in that each substance is causally isolated and windowless from every other substance. And finally, actions must be contingent; that is, they must exclude logical or metaphysical necessity.
It was not just human freedom, though, that Leibniz treated as intelligent, spontaneous, and contingent. In fact, one of the most remarkably consistent parts of Leibniz’s thought, going back to his jurisprudential writings in the 1660’s all the way through to his mature views on metaphysics and philosophical theology, is that the gap between humans and God is a difference of degree and not type. There is nothing substantively different between humans and God. It is for precisely this reason that he insists in his natural law theory that we can discern the nature of justice and try to implement it in worldly affairs. Justice for humans ought to mirror the justice of God.
The implication for this theological view is that God is free in the same way that humans are free; God is perfectly free because his actions are also intelligent, spontaneous, and contingent. Since God is omniscient, he has perfect perceptions of the entire universe, past, present, and future. Since God determines his own actions without any external coercion, he is perfectly spontaneous. And since there is an infinite plurality of worlds, possible in themselves, which God could choose, his actions are contingent. Leibniz reasons that since God meets each of these conditions in the highest sense, God is perfectly free. And even though God is invariably led toward the Good, this in no way is an infringement on his freedom. He writes in the Theodicy:
…It is true freedom, and the most perfect, to be able to make the best use of one’s free will, and always to exercise this power, without being turned aside either by outward force or by inward passions, whereof the one enslaves our bodies and the other our souls. There is nothing less servile and more befitting the highest degree of freedom than to be always led towards the good, and always by one’s own inclination, without any constraint and without any displeasure. And to object that God therefore had need of external things is only a sophism (G. VI. 385; H 386).
Even with this mature account of freedom in place, Leibniz may still have the very same problem that he was concerned about prior to his meeting with Spinoza in 1676. If God’s nature requires him to do only the best, and assuming that there is only one uniquely best world, then it follows that the only possible world is the actual world. God’s essential nature and the fact of a uniquely best world entails that God must create the best. And so, we may end up back in the necessitarian position after all, albeit in a somewhat different way than Spinoza. Although Leibniz endorses the anthropomorphic conception of God that Spinoza denies, both philosophers hold that God’s nature necessitates, in some way, that there is only one possible world, the actual world. Ultimately, it is up to us to decide whether the strategies for contingency and the account of human and divine freedom that Leibniz develops over the course of his long and illustrious career are successful enough to avoid the necessitarian threat of which he was so concerned.
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Charles Joshua Horn
University of Wisconsin Stevens Point
U. S. A.